Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716)

Widely hailed as a universal genius, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz was one of the most important thinkers of the late 17th and early 18th centuries. A polymath and one of the founders of calculus, Leibniz is best known philosophically for his metaphysical idealism; his theory that reality is composed of spiritual, non-interacting “monads,” and his oft-ridiculed thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds. Though these ideas may make his philosophy seem exceedingly abstract, Leibniz had keen interest in less abstract fields, such as empirical physics and jurisprudence. He also made great contributions to logic, with some considering him the greatest logician since Aristotle.

Due to his belief in a rationally ordered universe, his commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, and his acceptance of innate ideas, Leibniz is rightly ranked along with Descartes and Spinoza as one of the seminal early modern rationalists. Leibniz stands out in this tradition, however, for his novel efforts to find compatibility between classical and modern thought. He retained ancient and scholastic notions such as substantial form and final cause, while at the same time attempting to improve upon the mechanical philosophies of Hobbes, Spinoza, and Descartes. He also hoped his comprehensive philosophical system would serve as a common ground for uniting the determinedly divided Christian denominations in Europe. Such irenic pursuits make Leibniz a unique transitional figure in the history of philosophy. He has been called both the last in the lineage of great Christian Platonists and the first thinker to tackle the intellectual problems of modern Europe. After an introduction to his life and works, this article examines the key elements of Leibniz’s ambitious philosophical program.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writings
  2. Key Principles
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Substantial Forms
    2. Substance as Complete Concept
    3. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony
    4. Idealism
    5. The Nature of Body
    6. Efficient and Final Causality
  4. Theodicy
    1. Leibniz’s Project
    2. God
    3. Possible Worlds and Optimism
    4. Freedom and Necessity
  5. Epistemology
    1. Ideas and Knowledge
    2. Innate Ideas
    3. Petites Perceptions
    4. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood
  6. Ethics
    1. Intellect and Will
    2. Justice and Charity
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Introductory Texts
      2. More Advanced Studies
      3. Collected Essays

1. Life and Writings

Leibniz was born on 1 July 1646, during the waning years of the Thirty Years’ War, in the Lutheran town of Leipzig. His father, Friedrich, was professor of moral philosophy at the University in Leipzig. His mother, Catherina Schmuck, was the daughter of a law professor. Leibniz grew up in an educated, and by all accounts, orthodox Lutheran environment. Between the books of his father, those of his maternal grandfather, and the contributions of Friedrich’s bookselling former father-in-law, Leibniz had access to an impressive library. At a young age, he gained a love for classical literature and the writings of the Church Fathers.

From 1661-63, Leibniz pursued university studies in Leipzig, with a brief stay at the university in Jena in 1663. At the time, the curriculum at these universities was still largely scholastic with some pedagogical practices bearing traces of the Ramist encyclopedic tradition. Leibniz’s main teachers, Jakob Thomasius in Leipzig and Erhard Weigel in Jena, were Aristotelians with eclectic interests. Leibniz had his own eclectic interests, having gained some, mostly second-hand, familiarity with modern mechanical philosophy. Later in his life, he recounted a fateful stroll through the Rosental in Leipzig in which he debated the respective merits of scholastic and modern thinking. “Mechanism finally prevailed,” he recalled, “and led me to apply myself to mathematics” (G III, 606). Though steeped in classical and scholastic learning, Leibniz at quite a young age fashioned himself a man of the times.

Leibniz went on to pursue a degree in law, earning his doctorate from the University in Altdorf in 1666. His writings from his student years include his bachelor’s dissertation, A Metaphysical Disputation on the Principle of Individuation, an early work in combinatorial logic titled A Dissertation on the Art of Combinations, and works on legal theory.

After short stints in Nuremburg and Frankfurt, Leibniz took his first major employment in the Catholic court of the Prince-Archbishop of Mainz, Johann Philipp von Schӧnborn in 1668. Leibniz was tasked with reforming legal codes and statutes. During his time in Mainz, Leibniz struck up an important relationship with Baron Johann Christian von Boineburg, the central statesman in the Mainz court. Boineburg appreciated Leibniz’s considerable talents and set before him the task of solving the day’s most pressing philosophical and theological questions. Through his association with Boineburg, Leibniz began to see the challenges modern philosophy, especially the materialism of Gassendi and Hobbes, posed to belief in the immortality of the soul, to belief in God and natural law, and to both Catholic and Lutheran understandings of the Eucharist. Leibniz thus from 1668-70 began working on a number of preliminary studies meant to be part of a comprehensive work entitled Catholic Demonstrations. Though this dreamed-of magnum opus never materialized, Leibniz never abandoned his goal of developing a modern philosophy congenial to Christian theology. In addition to his Catholic Demonstrations writings, Leibniz’s Elements of Natural Law, written between 1669 and 1671, also contributed to these efforts. Furthermore, during this period Leibniz intensified his interest in physics, writing the Theory of Abstract Motion and the New Physical Hypothesis, and penning an unanswered letter to Thomas Hobbes on the Englishman’s physical theory as it relates to the philosophy of mind. Leibniz in hindsight found these youthful physical works unimpressive, but they attest to the diversity of his interests.

Mainz opened Leibniz to an extraordinarily broad range of philosophical concerns; his most intense period of intellectual development soon followed. In 1672, Leibniz was dispatched to Paris on a diplomatic mission as well as on personal business for Boineburg. Paris exposed Leibniz to learning, resources, and interlocutors the likes of which he had never seen. He had access to the unpublished writings of Descartes and Pascal. He met with leading Parisian intellectuals Antoine Arnauld and Nicholas Malebranche. He studied mathematics under the Dutch mathematician Christiaan Huygens. He twice visited London, in 1673 and 1676, meeting with the mathematicians and physicists of the Royal Society. Leibniz’s friend Walther von Tschirnhaus, though forbidden from showing Leibniz an advanced copy, apprised Leibniz of many of the contents of Spinoza’s Ethics. This led Leibniz, upon leaving Paris in 1676, to make an excursion to The Hague to visit Spinoza.

Paris and London offered Leibniz the opportunity to establish himself as a rising star in the European intellectual orbit and Leibniz did not squander his chance. By 1675 he had developed the infinitesimal calculus, only three years after he started the serious study of contemporary mathematics. He also continued to write on a wide range of philosophical topics. His Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3 was his first response to the problem of evil and to the question of determinism. His most important collection of metaphysical papers from the period, De summa rerum, contains some of Leibniz’s early responses to Spinoza’s monism, with budding reflections on the relationship between mind and body, on the nature of the continuum, and on universal harmony.

In 1676, Leibniz accepted a position in the court of Duke Johann Friedrich of Hanover, employed mainly to serve as court librarian and to consult on engineering projects in the Harz mines. After his taste of the intellectual scenes in Paris and London, Leibniz found life in Hanover a disappointment. Despite his lack of professional prospects, Leibniz would in the ensuing decade sharpen his intellectual vision. He published a number of important essays on mathematics, epistemology, and physics in the new journal Acta Eruditorum. In 1686, while it snowed in the Harz, Leibniz composed “a little discourse on metaphysics.” Now published without the diminutive “little,” the Discourse on Metaphysics is widely considered Leibniz’s first mature philosophical statement. Leibniz sent a summary of the Discourse to Arnauld, sparking an extended and illuminating correspondence between them on issues of freedom, causality, and occasionalism.

In 1689, Leibniz travelled to Italy on official business, researching possible ancestral ties to the Guelf Dukes of Hanover. Leibniz, never one to let official duties interfere with his own intellectual agenda, used the opportunity to pitch his metaphysics to leading Catholic intellectuals. He also wrote works on cosmology in efforts to exonerate the Copernican system from Vatican censure.

Leibniz returned in 1690 to Hanover, which remained his home base until his death. Leibniz continued to write prodigiously and we can mention here only a small sample of his works. 1695 saw the publication of the first part of his Specimen of Dynamics and his New System of Nature. The former work included Leibniz’s reflections on the nature of force, and in many ways was developed in response to Newton’s Principia Mathematica; the latter was Leibniz’s first public presentation of his theory of pre-established harmony. In 1703, Leibniz began work on The New Essays on Human Understanding, a book-length dialogue in response to Locke’s Essay on Human Understanding. The only book Leibniz published during his lifetime, the Theodicy, was released in 1710. In this work, Leibniz defends his thesis that we live in best of all possible worlds and defends the reasonableness of Christianity against the fideism and skepticism of Pierre Bayle. In 1714, Leibniz wrote the Monadology, the last comprehensive summary statement of his philosophical views.

Throughout his years in Hanover, Leibniz maintained a stunning number of epistolary correspondents. Notable among these were Samuel Clark, Burchard de Volder, Johann Bernoulli, Bartholomew Des Bosses, and Christian Wolff. Leibniz also corresponded and often met with Sophie, Electress of Hanover, and her daughter Sophie Charlotte, Queen of Prussia. These women encouraged, and in many ways made possible, Leibniz’s philosophical pursuits while employed at the court.

Leibniz’s final years were clouded by charges that he stole ideas from the papers of Isaac Newton when developing the calculus in the 1670s. Leibniz has been cleared of the charges and it is now accepted that the two men developed the calculus independently. Leibniz died on 14 November 1716 after struggles with gout and arthritis.

Unlike the other major philosophical lights of his era, and despite having written more than any of them, Leibniz produced no magnum opus. He seemed most at home in dialogue, in correspondence, and in controversy. The Discourse on Metaphysics and Monadology are his most commonly studied works in metaphysics. Scholars disagree about the extent to which the two works are in accord, but they together provide a solid grounding in Leibniz’s thought. The Theodicy is a classic of philosophical theology and the New Essays provides the fullest account of Leibniz’s epistemology. This article will summarize Leibniz’s philosophy mainly as it is presented in these works. It would be a mistake, however, to think that one can get a full picture of Leibniz’s interests from these works and the reader is encouraged to consult the many excellent edited selections of Leibniz’s texts.

2. Key Principles

Several key principles form the core of Leibniz’s philosophy. Though Leibniz never lists these serially in the manner of, for instance, the axioms of Spinoza’s Ethics, the principles nonetheless shape Leibniz’s thinking and ground his major claims. He refers to them throughout his writings and we shall refer to them throughout our discussion. Though each of these principles merits further analysis in its own right, we introduce them only briefly here. Truly unique to Leibniz is not so much these principles in themselves as the use to which he collectively puts them.

In the Monadology, Leibniz writes that we reason “based on two great principles” (M 30). The first of these is the principle of contradiction, which deems every contradiction to be false. Classically stated, the principle of contradiction holds that something cannot be both “x” and “not x” at the same time and in the same respect. Aristotle claimed that all logic and reasoning presupposes the principle of contradiction and Leibniz sees no reason to think otherwise.

The second great principle of reason is the principle of sufficient reason, “by virtue of which we consider that we can find no true or existent fact, no true assertion, without there being a sufficient reason why it is thus and not otherwise, although most of these reasons cannot be known to us” (M 31). The classical statement of the principle of sufficient reason is nihil sine ratione: there is nothing without reason or cause. Leibniz holds that every state of affairs has an explanation, even if we must admit that we often do not have sufficient information to provide an explanation. The principle of sufficient reason assumes great prominence in Leibniz’s philosophy, most notably in his accounts of substance, causality, freedom, and optimism.

Closely related to the principle of sufficient reason is the principle of the best. This principle holds that rational beings always choose, and act for, the best. In this way, reason is teleologically ordered towards goodness. On Leibniz’s thinking, if reason did not opt for what is best, it would act arbitrarily; it would not have a sufficient reason for choosing one option over another, thus violating reason’s second great principle. Goodness provides the sufficient reason for rational choice. The principle of the best manifests itself differently in the cases of God and created minds. God, whom Leibniz considers “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1), and who thus knows what is best, always acts in the best way. Created minds, who have a finite degree of perfection and thus limited knowledge of what is best, always act according to what seems the best from their limited perspectives.

The predicate-in-notion principle provides Leibniz’s notion of truth: praedicatum inest subjecto. In any true, affirmative proposition the predicate is contained in the subject. In order for the proposition, “Leibniz is a mathematician,” to be true, the idea “mathematician” must somehow be included in the idea “Leibniz.” Leibniz’s interpretation of the predicate-in-notion principle, we shall see, has far-reaching consequences for his metaphysics. Somewhat relatedly, Leibniz affirms the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, which states that any two objects sharing all properties are in fact the same, identical object. Each individual object contains some individuating characteristic. Important for Leibniz, this individuating characteristic must be something intrinsic to the individual, and not simply a separation in space and time, which Leibniz considers purely extrinsic denominations. The principle of the identity of indiscernibles is tied closely to the predicate-in-notion principle insofar as the latter makes intrinsic properties the basis of all truth and the former makes such properties the basis for identity and individuation.

A final key principle worth noting is the principle of continuity. “Nothing takes place suddenly, and it is one of my great principles that nature never makes leaps,” Leibniz writes in the New Essays. “I call this the Law of continuity” (NE 56). All change is continuous; there is never a leap, but rather a series of intervening stages. This principle is especially germane to Leibniz’s development of the infinitesimal calculus, but relevant too to his metaphysics and epistemology.

3. Metaphysics

a. Substantial Forms

One of the earliest intellectual projects Leibniz set for himself was to determine the proper relationship between the Aristotelian philosophy taught at his university in Leipzig and the new, mechanical philosophy espoused by thinkers like Galileo, Descartes, and Hobbes. Leibniz embraces modern, mechanical physics as the proper method for investigating nature, yet he is distinctive among 17th century thinkers for the depths of his efforts to retain several key metaphysical concepts of ancient and medieval philosophy. Chief among these concepts is the Aristotelian idea of substantial form. Though Leibniz does not adopt the traditional understanding of substantial form in its details, his grappling with the legitimacy of this notion sets the trajectory for much of his metaphysics.

Aristotle, with the medieval scholastics following him, argues that any individual thing consists of a substantial form, which determines the kind of thing it is, and matter, which individuates the thing and makes it numerically distinct from other like substances. So, a particular squirrel consists of the universal form “squirrel” shaping and directing particular material stuff. In the 17th century, the idea that substantial forms should enter into physical accounts of nature becomes especially odious. Citing “squirrelness,” the moderns maintain, tells us nothing regarding the activity of a squirrel. For thinkers such as Hobbes and Descartes, substantial forms are useless fictions, at best superfluous and at worst misleading. The mathematically-based, mechanical laws governing matter in motion suffice to explain the whole of nature, with no need to take into account the kind of thing under investigation. What counts in describing the behavior of a squirrel is not its “squirrelness,” but the forces its limbs exert on one another, the pressure differentials in its circulatory system, and other quantifiable data. This approach makes it possible to have a single method for investigating all natural phenomena.

Leibniz agrees that substantial forms have no use in physics, but he insists metaphysical accounts of reality require something like substantial forms. Mechanical explanation adequately addresses the activity of the physical world, but not its underlying nature. For Leibniz, the corporeal world its very essence depends on incorporeal principles. Both Hobbes’ purely materialist metaphysics and the strict substance-dualism of Descartes fail to properly appreciate nature’s dependence on purely metaphysical entities. Ultimately, Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms provides the first step in the development of his idealist metaphysics.

Leibniz offers several defenses of substantial forms, in which he tries not to revive Aristotle’s notion of form wholesale, so much as to prove the existence of irreducible, incorporeal entities. One argument turns on the principle of sufficient reason: the fact that the corporeal world itself cannot offer any explanation for its particular features. Why does a given body occupy so much space, have a particular shape, or move in just this way? By limiting oneself to mechanical explanation, one can either say that body A’s features were caused by body B, or one can say that body A has had its particular constitution from eternity. The former approach leads to an infinite regress in explanation, which is to say it never arrives at an explanation at all. There is always yet another body requiring explanation. The latter approach, for Leibniz, likewise offers no real explanation. Citing eternity as a reason, he feels, amounts to answering the question “Why is A, x?” with “Simply because A is x and always has been x,” dodging the question. Since the corporeal world does not contain sufficient explanation for its own features, Leibniz concludes that the cause of such features lies in incorporeal principles.

In a second defense of incorporeal substantial principles, Leibniz denies the Cartesian distinction between the primary qualities of bodies and secondary qualities such as color and temperature (DM 12). Descartes, anticipating Locke, argues that the secondary qualities of bodies are relative to the perceiving subject. For instance, as we observe in cases of color-blindness, one person perceives an object as red and another person the same object as green. Color, the argument goes, is thus not a property of the body itself, but depends on the interaction between object and perceiver. Descartes holds, however, that size, shape, and motion are not relative properties, but constitute the essence of body itself. Leibniz, believing that space and time are relative, counters that these primary properties which depend on space and time, and also include something relative to perception. No perceived material quality, therefore, accounts for what a body essentially is. It follows that incorporeal principles must be the real metaphysical building blocks of reality.

A third argument for substantial forms comes in Leibniz’s treatment of force. Descartes had confused force with what we would call momentum. He measured force by multiplying mass by velocity, not by acceleration, or the square of velocity. For Leibniz, this error on the part of Descartes points to an important fact about reality. Motion, measured by mv, is relative. When several objects change positions, one cannot with certainty attribute motion to one object or another. Force, however, has more reality. We have sufficient reason to attribute it to one body over others. In other words, we have more certainty which body in a system is the proximate cause of changes in other bodies. Force, therefore, has more reality than motion, and yet force is not corporeal in the way both mass and velocity are since force is not extended. Though Descartes’ confusion seems simply an error in calculation, in it Leibniz sees additional indication that the realities grounding corporeal objects are not themselves corporeal.

b. Substance as Complete Concept

Though his defense of incorporeal substances allows Leibniz to partially reconcile pre-modern and modern thought, Leibniz still needs to articulate his own account of the nature of these substances. In §8 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz takes up the task of defining individual substance. He begins with Aristotle’s definition, which states that when many things are said of a subject, yet it is said of nothing else, this subject is rightly called an individual substance. So, for instance, we say of Alexander the Great that he is Macedonian and ambitious, but we do not say of anything else that it is Alexander the Great. Thus, Alexander is an individual substance.

Leibniz deems this Aristotelian definition of substance merely logical. It tells us something about the structure of thought and language, but does not provide a metaphysical account of substance. To move to a proper metaphysical understanding, Leibniz believes we must look more closely at the nature of predication. “All true predication,” he writes, “has some basis in the nature of things.” Here, Leibniz shows his belief that there is isomorphism between metaphysics and logic. All true propositions have an ontological basis. All we can truly say of Alexander the Great is included in Alexander’s nature.

The idea that each substance includes all the predicates which belong to it is, Leibniz takes it, simply a metaphysical restatement of the predicate-in-notion principle. On the basis of this principle, Leibniz arrives at his notion of substance as a complete concept:

The nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which the notion is attributed. (DM 8)

Leibniz’s thought is essentially this: if one had a sufficiently powerful intellect, one could deduce from the idea of any individual substance all that could ever be said of it, in just the same way that if one has a clear and distinct idea of a circle, one can deduce all the properties of a circle. From the very concept of Alexander the Great, the infinite intellect of God can deduce all Alexander’s qualities, including that he is the vanquisher of Darius. To be a substance, then, is to have such a corresponding complete concept. Every substance, as it were, includes its biography.

Beginning in the 1690s, “monad” becomes Leibniz’s preferred term for a complete, incorporeal, individual substance. The term monad derives from the Greek mónos, meaning alone or solitary. Leibniz introduces the term to underscore the fact that individual substances are not only complete, but also simple. As Leibniz’s defense of substantial forms showed, the material realm needs grounding in something incorporeal. Matter, however, can be infinitely divided. Leibniz therefore reasons that there must be infinite simple monads populating the world at even the most infinitesimal levels. Leibniz likens the fullness and complexity of the monadic universe to “nested” ponds and gardens.

Each portion of matter can be conceived as a garden full of plants, and as a pond full of fish. But each branch of a plant, each limb of an animal, each drop of its humors, is still another such garden or pond. (M 67)

Monads are thus “spiritual atoms,” the incorporeal building blocks of all reality. They are the complete entities which merit the designation “substance.”

It is in the nature of each monad to have its own internal principle of activity. As Leibniz writes, “activity is of the essence of substance in general” (NE 65). Beginning in the 1690s, Leibniz refers to the internal activity of substances as their primitive active forces. Defining substance in terms of activity is important to Leibniz for several reasons. For one, this position is of a piece with his contention that the activity of corporeal entities is grounded in that of incorporeal entities. In order to play this role, incorporeal monads must themselves be active. More importantly, Leibniz broaches the discussion of substance in the Discourse on Metaphysics with the goal of differentiating the actions of God from those of creatures. In arguing that each substance has its own primitive active force, Leibniz distances himself both from Spinoza’s monism and Malebranche’s occasionalism, the former holding that individual things are not themselves substances but rather modes of a single divine substance, and the latter invoking God’s power to explain the ordinary doings of creatures. To Leibniz, each of these positions insufficiently appreciates that each substance is complete and active in itself. For, were created substances to lack activity, there would be no distinction between actual, created substances and the possible yet uncreated substances in God’s mind, a modal distinction central to Leibniz’s theodicy.

c. Causality and Pre-Established Harmony

If each substance is complete in itself and requires no other substance to be understood, it follows that every finite substance is causally independent of all save God. Each created substance is, as Leibniz says, “like a world apart” (DM 14). But how can this be? How can Alexander defeat Darius without being related to, and thus in a sense dependent on, Darius? More broadly, how can Leibniz square his “world apart” language with our experience of living in a world with a plethora of cause and effect relationships between substances?

Leibniz responds to these questions by offering a unique theory of causal interaction, which he calls at different points either the theory of pre-established harmony or the hypothesis of concomitance. The theory holds that although no two substances directly influence each other, they can express each other, that is, the activity of one can be reflected in the concept of the other. Alexander, we typically say, caused Darius’ death. Leibniz does not object to this kind of causal attribution, but insists that at the metaphysical level, what we call causality amounts to no more than this: it is in the nature of Alexander to be he who defeats Darius and it is likewise in the nature of Darius to be him defeated by Alexander. These two independent substances, as Leibniz puts it, “mirror” each other, so that at the exact moment it can be predicated of Alexander that he is the vanquisher of Darius, it can likewise be predicated of Darius that he is the victim of Alexander.

Hence, although each substance is “like a world apart,” substances form a common world by mirroring, or expressing, one another. God ordains at the moment of creation—in Leibniz’s terms he “preestablishes”—that the perceptions of all creatures in the world harmonize with one another, that there is strict alignment so that at the moment I perceive myself as tapping my friend on the shoulder, she perceives herself as being tapped. Leibniz is fond of likening the relationship between substances to that between two perfectly synchronized clocks which remain aligned despite never touching each other. Causal interaction is no more than what we find in these clocks, the harmonized activity of independent entities. Leibniz famously describes independent monads as “windowless,” neither letting in any outside influence nor issuing any influence (M 7). This is the Leibnizian universe: windowless monads in pre-established harmony.

The theory of pre-established harmony includes the rather strong claim that each substance is harmonized with all other substances in the world. This must be the case if the substances are to form a common world with a common history, since mutual expression is the only possible relation between independent substances. Does this mean that my concept expresses the nature of even a fish living thousands of years ago? In a word, yes. Though Alexander and Darius express each other much more distinctly than I express the ancient fish, my concept must bear traces of the existence of that fish since we are members of a common world. This might seem fantastical, even absurd, but if one considers how much one’s own experience reflects the activities and efforts of one’s predecessors, and how much their activities were constrained by their natural environment, then perhaps one can begin to appreciate Leibniz’s insight that every single substance bears traces of, or faintly expresses, the whole universe, past, present, and future.

Leibniz’s explanation of causality via pre-established harmony and mutual expression has led some commentators to accuse Leibniz of what they call the “mirroring problem.” They object that if substance A expresses the essence of all others, yet these in turn express substance A, then the world is like a hall of mirrors which reflect one another but no concrete images. In this scenario, the concept of any given substance is not complete, as Leibniz would hold, but empty. Although this line of objection points to some of the complexities and potential difficulties in the theory of pre-established harmony, it merits mention that Leibniz sees each substance as fundamentally mirroring God. “It can even be said that every substance bears in some way the character of God’s infinite wisdom and omnipotence and imitates him as much as it is capable” (DM 9). Stating that each substance reflects God’s essence, while also mirroring all other substances, does not directly respond to the mirroring problem. Noting that each substance reflects God’s essence by virtue of its own internal individuating activity perhaps provides a more satisfying response, and it is likely that Leibniz’s solution to the mirroring problem lies in this direction.

d. Idealism                                                                      

Leibniz’s defense of incorporeal monads as the foundation of the physical world, his notion of substance as a complete concept, and his account of causality via pre-established harmony all contribute to Leibniz’s brand of idealism. By idealism, we mean the thesis that nothing exists in the world but minds and their ideas. As Leibniz summarizes his idealism: “There is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181).

By perception, Leibniz means the “passing state which involves and represents a multitude in the unity or in the simple substance” (M 14). Since each substance is metaphysically complete in itself and “like a world apart,” all changes in its state arise spontaneously, that is, without the intervention of other substances. Yet since each substance mirrors all others, it must contain a multiplicity of representations within itself. The sequence of spontaneous representations is what Leibniz calls perception. Importantly, Leibniz posits that all beings in the world perceive. This is yet another consequence of the fact that mutual representation is the only relation between monads in pre-established harmony. What distinguishes rational, conscious minds from all other substances is not perception, but apperception, or the ability to reflect on their mental processes.

Of appetite, Leibniz writes: “The action of the internal principle which brings about the change or passage from one perception to another can be called appetition; it is true that the appetite cannot always completely reach the whole perception toward which it tends, but it always obtains something of it. And reaches new perceptions” (M 15). The best analogy here is perhaps a mathematical function, where appetite is the analogue to the function equation, or the law of the series, and where each perception represents a discrete value. Leibniz’s point is that each substance has an orientation which defines it and which governs the transition between perceptions. This does not mean that each individual can fully choose or determine the sequence of its perceptions, since it is constrained by the need to faithfully represent the activity of other substances. Appetite does indicate, however, that there is a striving or tendency unique to each substance which shapes the manner in which it reflects the world. Hence Leibniz describes substances as so many distinct “viewpoints” on the universe (DM 14; M 57).

In composite substances, such as living animals whose various parts contribute to the well-being of the entire organism, simple monads unite under the direction of a dominant monad (M 70). Each monad retains its substantial independence, but living organisms display an especially high level of intermonadic harmony. Though Leibniz does not define in detail the operations of dominant monads, these monads must at least subsume others under their own internal principles or appetites. The activity of subordinate monads thereby serves the goals of the dominant monad. Conversely, subordinate monads must have particularly strong bearing on the perceptions of dominant monads, being, as it were, extensions of it. “There is nothing in the world but simple substances, and in them perception and appetite” may sound like a simple statement, but its simplicity should not mask the manifold degrees of coordination between the perceptions and appetites of monads.

e. The Nature of Body

It follows from Leibniz’s idealism that bodies are phenomenal. In other words, the physical world is the perception of perceiving monads. Leibniz is at pains, however, to insist that his system makes bodies “well-founded phenomena” (phenomena bene fundata). By this Leibniz means that bodies are not arbitrary perceptions lacking veracity. The pre-established harmony among all substances establishes a common realm of truth. Our perceptions thus provide us with knowledge of reality and serves as the starting point for empirical science.

Although “well-founded phenomena” might seem an empty expression within an idealist framework, it gains meaning from Leibniz’s commitment to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, the principle that nothing happens without reason or cause. For Leibniz, God’s rational ordering of creation certifies the reliability of sense perception, since God—the most rational of all minds—cannot do anything without having a reason for doing so. It would be arbitrary of God to give me this particular set of perceptions instead of some other set if it were not the case that my perceptions have some basis in other existing substances (NE 56). The thoroughgoing rational design of the world ensures that my perceptions indeed reflect the true order of things.

Defining bodies as “well-founded phenomena” leaves open the question of the relation of an individual’s mind to his own body. After all, my experience of my body seems qualitatively different than my perception of other things in the world. My arm, for example, moves upwards when I wish to remove my hat. Other bodies do not respond to my will in a like manner. Leibniz again invokes his theory of pre-established harmony to explain this apparent interaction between one’s mental and bodily states.

When I wish to raise my arm, it is precisely at the moment when everything is arranged in the body so as to carry this out, in such a manner that the body moves by virtue of its own laws; although it happens through the admirable but unfailing harmony between things that these things conspire towards that end precisely at the moment when the will is inclined to it, since God took it into consideration in advance, when he made his decision about the succession of all things in the universe. (LA 92)

Leibniz explains that God has arranged the world such that one’s mind and body do not directly influence each other, but nevertheless correspond perfectly at all moments. Leibniz is at pains to emphasize that the mind does not directly move the body because he wants to preserve the integrity of physics. Modern physics, relying on the principles of inertia and the conservation of force, requires that the motion of bodies be explained by other bodies. If minds directly influenced bodies, force could be added to the world at any time, and neither the principle of inertia nor the principle of conservation would hold. What causes the motion of my arm are the electrical impulses and synapses of my nervous system. The parallels between our desires and our bodily movements are instances not of interaction, but of harmony.

It is important to note that Leibniz sees the pre-established harmony between mind and body as following from his general theory of substance. Since minds are substantial and bodies phenomenal, my body is in one sense just a particularly distinct perception of my mind. In this sense, one’s perception of one’s body is not qualitatively different from one’s experience of other phenomena. Taking up Leibniz’s description of monads as various “viewpoints” on the universe, perhaps we can liken the body to one’s viewfinder, one’s lens on the universe, so long as we do not take the metaphor too literally by treating the body as an independent substance.

Though Leibniz adopts the language of “well-founded phenomena” to characterize bodies, scholars have debated the extent to which Leibniz’s idealism entails phenomenalism. The debate, put one way, is whether Leibniz makes bodies so “well-founded” that they have more reality than the term phenomena suggests. There is some consensus around the idea that Leibniz does not fully reduce bodies to perceptions, à la Berkeley, since bodies are aggregates of substantially real monads. Less certain is whether the substantial reality of monads makes labeling Leibniz a phenomenalist less apt. Given Leibniz’s insistence that “there is nothing in the world but [incorporeal] simple substances and in them perception and appetite” (AG 181) and his own use of the term phenomena, it seems most likely that Leibniz did not wish to accord bodies of aggregated monads the same metaphysical status as the monads comprising them. In short, monads are substantial, bodies are phenomenal, and Leibnizian idealism entails phenomenalism.

f. Efficient and Final Causality

Leibniz’s retrieval of the notion of substantial form blossomed into his idealist, monadic metaphysics and theory of pre-established harmony. Pre-established harmony mandates that the activity of bodies be explained by other bodies, not by minds. In explaining the activities of bodies, Leibniz makes a second major effort at reconciling ancient and modern thought. He mounts a defense of the utility of final causes in physics.

Aristotle distinguished between four causes, or four ways of accounting for the being of a thing. Philosophers of the 17th century found particularly objectionable the idea of final cause. The final cause of something indicates its purpose or goal. For instance, one might claim that the final cause of a tree is to grow upwards and reproduce. Thinkers such as Descartes, Hobbes, and Spinoza rejected the utility of final causes in explanations of the physical world, much as they rejected the utility of formal causes, or substantial forms. They restricted physics to the study of efficient causes, mechanical accounts of bodies in motion. We explain the growth of tree by looking to nutrient transfer from roots to branches, the exchange of compounds in respiration, the means of reproduction. To the moderns, any mention of tree’s purpose belongs to poetry, not physics.

Leibniz is as committed to mechanical explanation as his contemporaries, yet he bucks the 17th century trend of discrediting final causes outright. He reconciles the two approaches by offering a doctrine of double explanation. For Leibniz, events in nature are subject to explanation by either efficient or final causes. Leibniz does not adhere strictly to the Aristotelian notion of final cause any more than he adheres to the Aristotelian notion of substantial form. What Leibniz realizes, however, is that consideration of the end state of a physical process can often have as much predictive power as consideration of the motive forces involved. In §22 of the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz cites Fermat’s proof of the refraction law for light. Fermat derived the law by noting that light takes the easiest path, or the path of least resistance. In this sense, Fermat took note of the end or goal light rays achieve. By contrast, Descartes proved the same law solely by examining efficient causes, likening the refraction of light to bouncing tennis balls, and considering factors such as speed and mass. The refraction of light, Leibniz observes, can be explained and predicted under two separate causal paradigms.

Leibniz’s development of the calculus aids him greatly in his defense of final causes. Using what we would today call the variational calculus, Leibniz can show that change in nature happens at optimal points where the derivative vanishes. Systems thus tend towards certain end states and analyzing these states can furnish us with significant predictive power. Calculus permits Leibniz to tie discussions of final cause to mathematics, not poetics.

Although Leibniz finds both efficient and final causal explanations acceptable, he insists that they be kept separate. We ought not to invoke discussions of purpose simply when we lack a sufficient mechanical explanation. Final causes do not fill the gaps in our understanding of efficient causes; they provide another method of investigation entirely. Leibniz favors explanations by efficient causes, to be sure, as they open up great possibilities for engineering. Still, he considers either method a legitimate account of the world. Efficient causes, Leibniz likes to say, show us God’s power; final causes, by bringing to light the directedness and efficiency of nature, reveal God’s wisdom.

4. Theodicy

a. Leibniz’s Project

Leibniz ranks peace of mind as “the greatest cause of [his] philosophizing” (L 148). Central to Leibniz’s efforts to secure peace of mind is the thesis that we live in the best of all possible worlds, a position now commonly called Leibnizian optimism. Leibniz reasons that if we can assure ourselves that God acts in the best of all possible ways, then we can trust God’s justice and have true peace of mind. Of course, it is by no means self-evident that our world, which includes suffering and evil, is compatible with divine justice, nor is it self-evident what criteria could certify the world as “the best of all possible.” Leibniz thus devotes much argument to defending divine justice and coins the term “theodicy”—from the Greek words for God (theós) and justice (díkē)—to describe this project.

b. God

The thesis that God acts in the best of all possible ways follows from the notion of God as “an absolutely perfect being” (DM 1). Leibniz accepts Descartes’ ontological proof for the existence of God, which proves the existence of God by way of our idea of perfection, with one caveat. To Leibniz, Descartes leaves his proof open to the objection that God does not exist because God cannot exist. “An absolutely perfect being,” this objection posits, is a logical impossibility. So, Leibniz sets out to demonstrate that a single being can possess all perfections in a logically consistent manner. He bolsters the ontological proof by grounding the demonstration for God’s actuality in a demonstration of God’s possibility.

Leibniz clarifies what he means by “perfection” by stipulating that those properties incapable of a highest degree do not qualify as perfections. The “greatest of all numbers” is a contradiction, as is the “greatest of all figures,” since number and magnitude are infinitely continuous quantities. However, there is nothing inherently contradictory in “the highest degree of knowledge” or “the highest degree of power,” so omniscience and omnipotence are rightly considered divine perfections (DM 1). We can say a being possesses limitless knowledge and power without predicating meaningless, impossible attributes of God. Importantly for the purposes of an ontological proof, existence qualifies as perfection under Leibniz’s definition.

Leibniz argues for the compatibility of all perfections by further stipulating that by “perfection” he means a simple, positive quality (L 167). Once we recognize that perfections are simple qualities, Leibniz believes we easily arrive at the conclusion that there is nothing inherently contradictory in the idea of a perfect being. For, were two perfections incompatible, this fact would be evident either immediately or through an analysis of the perfections in question. In the case of perfections like knowledge and power, no immediate incompatibility presents itself. Yet, because these qualities are simple, they cannot be broken down into components which might be shown incompatible. Since the incompatibility of perfections can be shown neither in itself, nor through demonstration, Leibniz concludes that God is a logically possible being. And—following the logic of the ontological proof—if possible, God is necessary.

Leibniz does not disallow other, a posteriori proofs for God’s existence. To the contrary, he employs several such proofs in his writings. Since it turns so much on the idea of perfection, however, his defense of the ontological proof holds a special place in his theodicy and thus in his philosophy as a whole.

c. Possible Worlds and Optimism

As an absolutely perfect being, God acts in the most perfect fashion. To understand what this means for an account of creation and a defense of God’s justice, Leibniz turns to the idea of possible worlds. A possible world is any set of possible substances whose attributes are mutually consistent, or compatible, with one another. Monads whose mutual existence would not entail contradictions are said to be compossible and thus potential members of a common world. God, in his omniscience, surveys an infinite number of compossible sets of substances and chooses to create the optimal, or best possible, world

What characterizes the best possible world? By what criteria does God make his selection? In the Discourse on Metaphysics, Leibniz writes that God selects that world which most effectively balances simplicity of means with richness of effects (DM 5). He likens God to a skilled architect who best employs the space and resources available to him, or a skilled geometer who finds the most elegant solution to a problem. Simplicity of means requires that there be order, efficiency, continuity, and intelligibility in the world. Richness of effects requires the maximization of both metaphysical and moral goodness. Metaphysical goodness denotes the amount of essence or perfection in the world, in short, the extent to which various creatures in the world imitate God’s inexhaustible essence. Maximizing metaphysical goodness therefore requires, at the very least, the creation of a great variety of creatures. Moral goodness refers to the happiness of rational beings, particularly the perfection and advancement of their rational faculties.

Much scholarship is devoted to determining precisely how Leibniz sees richness and simplicity coinciding in the best possible world. The task of interpretation gains complexity from the fact that Leibniz also speaks of God optimizing beauty and harmony, and even at times suggests that the best possible world progresses continually in perfection over time. Despite the difficulties in interpretation, it is clear that at the very least rational beings must inhabit an intelligible world. The perfections of rational beings interfere with one another least and thus are maximally compossible. Rarely does the knowledge and virtue of one person prevent or disallow the knowledge and virtue of another. By contrast, the beauty of a mountain range does preclude the beauty of plains at a given space and time. Because rational beings are capable of knowing God and entering into relationship with him, they are most responsible for maximizing metaphysical and moral goodness in the world. The intelligible order of creation aids them in this by making knowledge of various phenomena accessible through simple hypotheses.

Crucially, the existence of suffering does not count as proof against our world as being the best possible. By Leibniz’s lights, the goodness of the world as a whole does not require that each aspect of the world be choice worthy in itself. Pain and suffering find their place in the best possible world as “necessary evils” in maximizing its overall goodness. Here, the question of God’s justice arises and the true importance of possible worlds for Leibniz’s theodicy comes to light. How can God will to create pain and suffering? Does creating these not compromise divine justice? Leibniz responds that the divine will desires only what is good. The divine intellect takes, as it were, this desire for the good and determines how best to actualize it. The construction of the best possible world is the work of the divine intellect, and no more a matter of God’s will than the solution to an algebra equation depends on my will. God, Leibniz asserts, antecedently wills the good and consequently wills the best. God never wills evils in themselves, and never compromises his perfection, goodness, or justice. He accepts evil and suffering only insofar as they contribute to the overall goodness of the best possible world.

The distinction between what follows from the divine will and what follows from the divine intellect ultimately provides Leibniz with a means of upholding God’s perfection, despite the imperfections of creation. Were the conditions of the optimal world determined not by the divine intellect, but rather by arbitrary fiat, God would be no more than a despot and we would have no objective standard by which to judge his actions best. Were pain and suffering objects of the divine will per se, God would be cruel and unworthy of love. In other words, Leibniz believes he safeguards divine perfection by explaining that God is neither injudicious in thought nor vicious in will in creating the world as it is. Thus, assuring ourselves of God’s goodness and perfection is vital because “one cannot love God without knowing his perfections” (T 54) and loving God provides more happiness and peace of mind than any other activity. “To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy” (L 134).

Leibniz insists that his optimism provides grounds for true joy and peace of mind, not simply the kind of disaffected, “grin and bear it” acquiescence commonly associated with the Stoics and—as Leibniz sees it—championed by Spinoza and Descartes. God does not what he must, but what is best. Whether or not Leibniz offers any greater consolation than the Stoics is an open question. Yet Leibniz believes that even if one cannot see the purpose of suffering, one can gain some measure of joy by contemplating, and advancing in knowledge of, God’s perfection.

Furthermore, because the theory of pre-established harmony among substances requires that all monads be created or destroyed collectively, Leibniz defends the immortality of monads. What we consider “life” is an active state of perception and appetite; what we consider “death” is simply dormancy. Leibniz, not unlike other Christian thinkers before him, maintains the hope that God will compensate for evils suffered by individuals over the full course of their existence, even if the purpose of those evils is not evident during their natural lifespans.

d. Freedom and Necessity

Leibniz’s theodicy raises two weighty sets of questions regarding freedom. The first concerns God’s freedom in creating. If the divine intellect objectively determines the design of the best possible world, should we not conclude that God is determined to create just this world? Is the notion of the divine will not meaningless, compromising the theological concept of grace? The second set of questions concerns human freedom. Since each individual substance contains all that can ever be predicated of it, and since God surveys the activity and interrelations of all monads in selecting the best possible world, it would seem that the entire course of history is set before the creation of the world. Does this mean that the idea of free will—and along with it theological concepts such as sin and redemption—is meaningless?

Leibniz takes these questions seriously throughout his career. His reflections trace at least to his Confession of a Philosopher of 1672-3. Section 13 of 1686’s Discourse on Metaphysics, which explores freedom and necessity, spurs his lengthy correspondence with Antoine Arnauld. And in the Theodicy of 1710, Leibniz calls the “labyrinth of freedom and necessity” one of the most perplexing questions facing humankind.

Though far from the first thinker to confront this “labyrinth,” Leibniz’s original contribution lies in his distinction between two kinds of necessity. Truths whose contraries imply a contradiction Leibniz calls “necessary per se.” Among these truths governed by the principle of non-contradiction, Leibniz includes the laws of arithmetic, geometry, and logic. Because these truths cannot be otherwise, not even to the divine intellect, Leibniz posits that they hold in all possible worlds. He thus refers to propositions necessary per se as “eternal verities.”

Truths which are certain, but whose contrary does not imply contradiction, Leibniz terms “necessary ex hypothesi.” The sequence of events in the world is necessary in this way. It is logically possible to conceive of the world being otherwise than it is. We create fictionalized accounts of reality in novels and dramas all the time; these accounts are entirely consistent in themselves. Because events in the world can be imagined otherwise, Leibniz believes they are in themselves contingent (contingent per se). Nevertheless, events in the world necessarily happen as they do on the presumption of (ex hypothesi) God’s selection of the best possible world. While the created world could be otherwise than it is, the optimal world could not be. Truths necessary ex hypothesi are governed by the principle of sufficient reason: God has a reason, a cause for creating the world in this way, namely, his desire for the best.

Leibniz locates a second method of distinguishing truths necessary per se from truths contingent per se in their respective manners of demonstration. The truth of a claim necessary per se, Leibniz writes, can be demonstrated a priori in a finite analysis, a proof with a finite number of steps. Think of Euclid’s demonstrations of the principles of geometry. Proving the truth of a contingent proposition, by contrast, requires an infinite analysis. To explain a priori why a given proposition about the world is true, one would have to take into account its harmony with all the other substances in the world, as well as account for why this set of substances was chosen out of the infinite number of possible worlds. Explanation would literally proceed ad infinitum. This is not to say that contingent truths are unknowable. God’s infinite intellect can presumably handle an infinite analysis and we know contingent truths a posteriori through experience. Infinitude of an analysis is a formal property of certain demonstrations, one Leibniz thinks suffices to distinguish necessary ex hypothesi from necessary per se truths.

With the distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz attempts to maintain meaningful notions of both divine and human freedom. Since God has infinitely many options among possible worlds, he cannot be said to be required in creating. One might object that God’s benevolent nature constrains and determines his action by forcing God to select the best world his intellect can design. Leibniz, however, counters that acting in accord with one’s nature and for the sake of the best is true freedom. One is only determined when constrained by outside forces. That God’s own nature leads him to create the best from among possible worlds makes him all the more free and worthy of praise.

Whether Leibniz is licensed to speak of human freedom is a thornier issue. Kant, in his Critique of Practical Reason, famously scoffs that Leibniz grants human beings nothing more than “the freedom of a turnspit” which, “once it is wound up, also accomplishes its movements of itself” (I.3; 5:97). Kant reasons that Leibniz’s monads, like any good machine, simply execute what they are programmed to do. To an extent, Kant is right. Leibniz does not entertain a notion of “free will,” if by this one means arbitrary and completely undetermined choice. The principle of sufficient reason banishes arbitrary choice. Human beings act in accord with their own natures, choosing what they deem best. My individual essence provides the reason for what I do

Yet while rejecting a voluntarist conception of free will, Leibniz nevertheless speaks of human freedom. We might reconstruct Leibniz’s reasoning in three steps. First, with the modal distinction between the two kinds of necessity, Leibniz insists that human choices are not necessary in the strong sense. Each truth about monads and their history is logically contingent. Leibniz, therefore, is not a logical determinist. He is however, an ontological determinist, insofar as all events are necessary given the composition of the world. Nevertheless—and this is the second step—the fact that each substance is causally independent of all other created substances makes each monad spontaneous. Spontaneity, to reiterate, refers to the fact that each state of a created substance follows from its preceding state without the direct influence of other substances; in this sense, each substance is “free.” Still, spontaneity is not what most people mean by human freedom. Human freedom—step three—comes with the fact that rational beings can gain knowledge of the causal principles governing the sequence of events in the world. Acting with knowledge does not make one less determined, but does make one less passive. One feels less at the mercy of inalterable forces when one understands these forces and can appreciate the principles of God’s design. The idea that increased activity and knowledge make an individual free owes much more to the conception of freedom developed by the Stoics and revived in the 17th century by Spinoza than it owes to voluntarist and Protestant conceptions of free will. As Leibniz sees it, his is the only conception of freedom compatible with divine perfection and worldly optimism.

5. Epistemology

a. Ideas and Knowledge

Leibniz’s epistemology begins with the distinction between clear and obscure ideas. An idea is clear when it allows one to recognize the thing represented, obscure when it does not. For example, one may have seen a gerbil and thus have an idea of what a gerbil is. However, if the next time she encounters a small rodent she cannot tell whether it is a gerbil or a hamster, then she possesses only an obscure idea of “gerbil.” By contrast, when one’s idea suffices to reliably distinguish one kind of object from others, then the idea is clear.

Leibniz divides clear ideas into two classes: confused and distinct. A clear idea is also distinct when one can catalogue all the marks, or criteria, distinguishing that idea from others. The animal physiologist can differentiate and enumerate those characteristics common to all rodents and those unique to gerbils. A child with a pet gerbil might not be able to do so and thus would have a clear but confused idea. Leibniz believes our sensory ideas, such as those of color, are clear and confused. Though we reliably distinguish blue from red, we cannot necessarily spell out the marks or causes which make one object blue and another red. We perceive colors without explaining them.

Leibniz proceeds to further classify clear and distinct ideas as either adequate or inadequate. If possessing an adequate idea, one has clear and distinct knowledge not only of the idea in question, but also of all its component parts. One has clear and distinct knowledge “all the way down” to the primitive concepts which compose the idea. Leibniz admits that he is unsure if any human being possesses an adequate idea, but believes our arithmetical knowledge most nearly approaches adequacy. In all other cases, where one cannot carry out comprehensive analyses down to primitive concepts, one has clear, distinct, yet inadequate ideas.

At its highest reaches, knowledge is not only adequate, but also intuitive. Intuitive knowledge is both adequate and non-discursive. That is, one clearly and distinctly knows all the ingredients of an idea and grasps these simultaneously. As is the case with all adequate knowledge, intuitive knowledge seems more suited to divine knowers than to human knowers, as the latter cannot think about all the components of a complex concept at once.

One consequence of Leibniz’s taxonomy of knowledge is that it provides Leibniz with a means of explaining sense perception. Given Leibniz’s idealism, all that exists in the world are monads and their mental states. Bodies are phenomenal and therefore not sources of knowledge. What, then, is sense perception? Is there any real difference between sensation and intellection if all ideas follow spontaneously from a monad’s own concept, with no interaction between monads? Leibniz answers such questions by noting that what we commonly experience as sense perceptions are simply confused ideas. Even if they are clear, sense perceptions are necessarily confused. Though these perceptions arise spontaneously in the perceiving subject, they express the harmony between a given monad and all others; it is therefore impossible to enumerate all the contributing factors to any given sense perception, most of which fall below the threshold of consciousness (DM 33). With the category of clear and confused ideas, Leibniz can meaningfully retain the distinction between sensation and intellection without compromising the basic tenets of his idealism.

Leibniz’s approach to ideas and knowledge separates him in some key respects from his fellow 17th century rationalists. The division between distinctness and adequacy leads Leibniz to differentiate between nominal and real definitions. Nominal definitions include distinct knowledge; they sufficiently identify the defining marks of a concept. Yet they do not ensure that the concept is possible. It could be that a concept is internally inconsistent, a fact which would be revealed if one had adequate knowledge of all its parts. Real definitions account for the possibility of a thing, either by citing experience or through a priori demonstration. In his discussion of definition, Leibniz seeks to modify Hobbes’ strong nominalism in which all truth is dependent on the relationship between names and definitions. There is a higher level of knowledge than that contained in nominal definitions, one which accounts for possible existence in reality.

Hobbes is not Leibniz’s only rationalist target. Leibniz believes he improves upon Descartes’ maxim that all clearly and distinctly perceived ideas are true by delineating better criteria for clarity and distinctness. To Leibniz, Descartes construes clarity and distinctness as something like immediately perceived qualities, ripe for misevaluation.

b. Innate Ideas

In the New Essays on Human Understanding, Leibniz takes aim at Locke’s depiction of the mind as a tabula rasa, or blank tablet, needing external impressions to furnish it with the contents of its reasoning. In opposition to this conception of the mind and cognition, Leibniz affirms the existence of innate ideas. In one sense, Leibniz’s theory of substance obviously commits him to some conception of innate ideas. If monads have no “windows” through which they interact with other substances, then of course all their ideas must have an internal, innate origin.

But Leibniz does not rest his defense of innate ideas on his theory of substance. Rather, he advances fairly traditional epistemological arguments regarding the nature of deductive, a priori truths. Empirical knowledge can show that something is the case but cannot show that something is necessarily the case. The human mind, however, has knowledge of necessary truths, such as the laws of arithmetic and geometry. These necessary truths, which Leibniz calls “truths of reason,” are ideas whose opposite is impossible. They are the eternal truths which obtain in all possible worlds. Because truths of reason are known solely through the principle of non-contradiction and require no empirical data, Leibniz concludes that they are innate to the mind. Leibniz contrasts innate ideas with “truths of fact,” contingent truths whose opposite is possible and knowledge of which requires experience.

The theory of innate ideas does not imply that all minds have equal awareness of the truths of reason. Ideas are innate in us not as actualities, but “as inclinations, dispositions, tendencies, or natural potentialities” (NE 52). Accessing truths of reason requires effort. Yet the presence of innate ideas does incline us towards their discovery. In one particularly apt metaphor, Leibniz claims that rational minds are not like blank tablets, but like veined pieces of marble, disposed to be cut and polished in determinate ways.

c. Petites Perceptions

One of the more original elements of Leibniz’s epistemology is his theory of petites perceptions.

There are hundreds of indications leading us to conclude that at every moment there is in us an infinity of perceptions, unaccompanied by awareness or reflection; that is, of alterations in the soul itself, of which we are unaware because these impressions are either too minute and too numerous, or else too unvarying, so that they are not sufficiently distinctive on their own. But when they are combined with others they do nevertheless have their effect and make themselves felt, at least confusedly, within the whole. (NE 53)

Leibniz posits that at any given time, the mind has not only the thoughts of which it is aware, but also innumerable small, insensible perceptions, which he calls petites perceptions.

Leibniz wagers that there are “hundreds of indications” pointing to existence of petites perceptions. Regardless of whether this is hyperbole, there are at least a few good reasons Leibniz includes these perceptions in his theory. For one, petites perceptions follow from the theory of pre-established harmony, both the harmony between all substances and the harmony between mind and body. Each monad mirrors the activity of all others at all moments. This mirroring takes place via mutual representation. Since no mind, at any given moment, has conscious awareness of all other substances, mutual representation must be taking place at insensible levels via petites perceptions. Moreover, the pre-established harmony between mind and body requires that mental activity express and run parallel to bodily activity. However, one is often insensitive to one’s bodily processes. In order to maintain the perfect parallelism between body and mind, therefore, we must conclude that the mind has petites perceptions of the body’s activity.

Even more fundamentally, the existence of petites perceptions follows from Leibniz’s understanding of substance. It is of a piece with the thesis that “there is nothing in the world but simple substances and in them perception and appetite.” Activity, more specifically perception, is the mark of any substance. That the mind has petites perceptions explains how it remains active and substantial even in dreamless sleep or after death.

Petites perceptions also help to explain the workings of appetite. Appetite determines the transition from one perception to the next, a transition which oftentimes seems sudden and episodic. For instance, one might jump immediately from thinking of one’s mother to thinking of Beethoven’s fifth symphony. On its face, this transition violates the principle of continuity, which states that no discontinuous change occurs. Nature—including rational nature—makes no leaps, has no gaps. The theory of petites perceptions accounts for apparent leaps in perception. What appears a discontinuous change in thought is actually determined by the continuous workings and interactions of infinitely many insensible perceptions.

Finally, petites perceptions help to explain what is confused in a confused idea, particularly in sense perceptions. The difficulty in explaining all the marks of a sensation comes from the many petites perceptions which contribute to it. “These minute perceptions…constitute that je ne sais quoi, those flavors, those images of sensible qualities, vivid in the aggregate but confused as to the parts; those impressions which are made on us by the bodies around us and which involve the infinite; that connection each of us has with the rest of the universe” (NE 54-5).

d. Reflection, Memory, Selfhood

All substances are incorporeal and perceptive. For this reason, Leibniz understands all substances on analogy to human minds or souls. Leibniz reserves the proper use of the term “soul,” however, for higher order substances with particular cognitive capacities. Souls not only perceive, but also apperceive. That is, they not only perceive objects, but also think about and reflect on themselves. They have the added capacity to remember past perceptions. These abilities to reflect and remember provide souls with a sense of self, an understanding of the “I.” As a result, souls have moral identities. Moral identity goes beyond the substantial identity over time that all monads have; moral identity requires that one can remember his past actions, recognize himself as the selfsame individual over time, and therefore assume responsibility for his character.

Reflection and memory make souls not just moral beings, but intellectual beings as well. Leibniz observes that self-reflection serves as the starting point for all metaphysical and philosophical thinking. Each soul is, as it were, its own principal innate idea. Studying one’s own nature leads one to form and investigate fundamental metaphysical ideas. “In thinking of ourselves, we think of being, of substance, of the simple and the composite, of the immaterial, and of God himself, by conceiving that that which is limited in us is limitless in him. And these reflective acts furnish the principle objects of our reasonings” (M 30).

Because of their moral and intellectual capacities, Leibniz likens souls to “little divinities” (M 30). Leibniz expresses the near divinity of rationality rather poignantly in the Theodicy:

This portion of reason which we possess is a gift of God and consists in the natural light that has remained with us in the midst of corruption; thus it is in accordance with the whole, and it differs from that which is in God only as a drop of water differs from the ocean, or rather as the finite from the infinite. (T 169)

Though every substance reflects God and his plan for the cosmos, rational souls are mirrors of God in a heightened way, being able to understand the nature of things, reflect on God’s works, and ultimately enter into relationship with him (M 83-84).

6. Ethics

Of the traditional major content areas of philosophy, ethics is perhaps the only one to which Leibniz is generally not considered to have made significant contribution. Certainly he does not share the reputation as an ethicist enjoyed by early modern thinkers Spinoza, Hume, and Kant, nor does he share the influence in political philosophy had by Locke and Hobbes. Leibniz himself, however, took great interest in the ethical dimensions of his thought. He engaged in central debates of the day regarding the foundations of justice and the possibility of altruistic love. Furthermore, all his thinking has a clear ethical bent, with the peace of mind sought by his optimism a prime example of this. While Leibniz’s ethical contributions do not match his metaphysics in scope or originality, when it comes to a thinker as singular as Leibniz, this fact alone should not discourage inquiry into his ethics.

a. Intellect and Will

Leibniz’s approach to ethics is, broadly speaking, intellectualist in nature. That is, Leibniz sees moral goodness as increasing in line with knowledge. He defines will as “the inclination to do something in proportion to the good it contains” (T 139). Hence, the more knowledge one has of the goodness of a particular object or act, the better one’s will is directed. Loving and desiring the right kinds of things follows from proper understanding. Perfecting the intellect, in short, accomplishes the perfection of the will.

Perfecting the intellect also brings about happiness. “It is obvious,” Leibniz writes, “that the happiness of mankind consists in two things—to have the power, as far as permitted, to do what it wills and to know what, from the nature of things, ought to be willed. Of these, mankind has almost achieved the former; as to the latter, it has failed in that it is particularly impotent with respect to itself” (L130). Despite Leibniz’s dour diagnosis of humanity’s understanding of perfection, his prognosis is encouraging. He does not see happiness as particularly difficult to achieve. One need only pursue and acquire knowledge of the nature of things.

The close alliance Leibniz sees between intellect and will has the further consequence of ruling out indifference of equipoise, a topic of much debate in the 17th century At issue in discussions of this “indifference” is the question of whether one’s will can be in complete suspension when faced with two or more options, without inclination one way or another. The purported phenomenon of indifference of equipoise was taken at the time as evidence of the will’s independence from the intellect and even of its capacity for free, uncaused choice.

Leibniz rejects indifference of equipoise on grounds of the principle of sufficient reason. Uncaused events are incomprehensible; all events, including acts of the will, have some explanation. Here the deeper significance of Leibniz’s account of the will comes to light: one’s knowledge of the goodness of things provides the reason the will chooses as it does. Still, one might ask, could not the will be in equilibrium when faced with two objects of equal goodness? No. Per the principle of the identity of indiscernibles, each substance in the world has a unique complete concept which mirrors God and creation in a unique way; no two substances, no two states of affairs, are equivalent in goodness. One’s intellect and will therefore cannot respond identically to two different options. Though we may sometimes feel completely indifferent and unable to articulate the reasons for a choice, Leibniz insists that it would be a mistake to think of the choice as uncaused or of the will as uninclined. Infinitely many petites perceptions are at work in one’s mind at all times; much like machines, our movements are the result of all the tendencies and inclinations within us, even those of which we are unaware. Thus, we should not champion arbitrary choice by citing indifference of equipoise, but rather become freer, more self-aware moral beings through progress in knowledge.

b. Justice and Charity

Leibniz sees the study of justice as an a priori science of the good. There is, that is, an objective, rational basis for justice. Though Leibniz wrote much regarding the positive laws of states, he does not see positive law as the foundation of justice. He rejects the position that justice has no firmer foundation than the fiat of those in power, a position Leibniz often mentions in conjunction with Thrasymachus from Plato’s Republic but more pointedly associates with Samuel von Pufendorf and Thomas Hobbes. Taken to its logical conclusion, this position results in divine command theory: certain principles are just simply because God, the most powerful of all legislators, has posited they be so. For Leibniz, this line of thinking violates God’s perfection. God acts in the most perfect way and thus acts with good reason, not by arbitrary fiat. He is perfect not only in power, but also in wisdom. God’s perfect will follows upon his perfect intellect no less than the will of any rational being follows upon her intellect. The a priori, eternal standard of justice to which God himself adheres provides the basis for a theory of natural law.

Leibniz defines justice as the charity of the wise person. Though this may seem unique, or even odd, to those accustomed to seeing justice and charity contrasted, what is truly original in Leibniz’s rooting justice in charity is his very definition of charity, or love. In the 17th C., there were a series of debates regarding the possibility of disinterested love. Each creature, it would seem, acts to preserve and advance its own being. Hobbes and Spinoza employed the term conatus to refer to the striving each being has to persist in its own being and made it the foundation of their respective psychologies. On this view, one loves what one finds pleasing, that is, what one finds conducive to his own persistence. Love is reduced to a kind of egoism which, even where benevolent, nevertheless lacks an altruistic component.

Leibniz attempts to obviate the tension between egoism and altruism by defining love as taking pleasure in the happiness, or perfection, of another. With this definition, Leibniz does not deny the fundamental drive all creatures have for pleasure and self-interest, but ties it to altruistic concern for the well-being of others. The coincidence of altruism and self-interest defines love and captures the essence of justice. Justice is the charity of the wise person and the wise person, Leibniz goes on to say, loves all. Leibniz’s basic contention is that to be just is to show the love attended by insight that God shows. Ethics involves seeking the good of all in a prudent way, such that the good of each individual is pursued only insofar as it is compatible with the whole. One cannot love all when obtaining the happiness of one person at the expense of another’s, nor would this be desirable, since Leibniz believes we find more pleasure in harmony than discord. The kind of universal love demanded by Leibniz’s definition of justice is nurtured by reflection on the universal harmony between all things. Leibniz believes that appreciating the harmonious order of the cosmos can lead individuals to find pleasure in increasing the perfection and happiness of all who share in that order.

Leibniz’s definition of love also entails that loving God is the highest end of rational beings. If love is finding pleasure in the perfection of another, then loving an infinitely perfect being affords the greatest possible pleasure and happiness.

To love is to find pleasure in the happiness of another. We love God himself above all things because the pleasure which we experience in contemplating the most beautiful being of all is greater than any conceivable joy. (L 134)

Since the harmony of the world mirrors God’s perfection, Leibniz’s conception of justice does not place love of God at odds with love of others. We should take pleasure in perfection wherever we discern it. Justice as the charity of the wise person means that love of God and love of neighbor are one. By identifying justice with love of God and harmony between all, Leibniz brings to fruition the ethical implications of his metaphysical inquiries into God’s perfection and pre-established harmony. Ethics and metaphysics are, for Leibniz, never far apart.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources: Leibniz Texts and Translations

The standard critical edition of Leibniz’s writings is G.W. Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin: Academy Verlag, 1923- ). The Akademie edition is still in production. Other useful editions of Leibniz’s writings in their original languages are those of C. I. Gerhardt (Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. 7 vols. 1875-1890) and Ludovici Dutens (Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Opera Omnia. Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag, 1989).

References in this article to Leibniz’s works use the following abbreviations and translations:

AG     G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.

DM      Discourse on Metaphysics, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Discourse are cited by section number.

G         Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin. 7 vols. 1875-1890.

L        G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited and translated by Leroy E. Loemker. 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1989.

LA      The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1967.

M        Monadology, as translated by Ariew and Garber in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Essays. Passages from the Monadology are cited by section number.

NE       New Essays on Human Understanding. Edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathan Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

T          Theodicy: Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Problem of Evil. Translated by E.M. Huggard. BiblioBazaar, 2007.

Other helpful collections of Leibniz’s writings in English include:

  • The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence. Edited by H.G. Alexander. New York: Philosophical Library, 1956.
  • The Labyrinth of the Continuum: Writings on the Continuum Problem, 1672-1686. Edited by Richard W. T. Arthur. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2002.
  • The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence. Edited by Brandon C. Look and Donald Rutherford. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2007.
  • Leibniz: Logical Papers. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1966.
  • De Summa Rerum: Metaphysical Papers, 1675-1676. Edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1992.
  • Leibniz: Political Writings. Edited by Patrick Riley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Confessio Philosophi: Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671-1678. Edited by Robert C. Sleigh, Jr. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005.
  • Leibniz and the Two Sophies: The Philosophical Correspondence. Edited by Lloyd Strickland. Toronto: Iter, Inc., 2011.
  • Leibniz’s ‘New System’ and Associated Contemporary Texts. Edited by R.S. Woolhouse and Richard Francks. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997.

b. Secondary Sources

i. Introductory Texts

  • Antognazza, Maria Rosa. Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
  • Arthur, Richard T.W. Leibniz. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas. Leibniz. New York: Routledge, 2005.
  • Perkins, Franklin. Leibniz: A Guide for the Perplexed. New York: Continuum, 2007.
  • Savile, Anthony. Routledge Guidebook to Leibniz and the Monadology.New York: Routledge, 2000.

ii. More Advanced Studies

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. New York: Oxford University Press,  1994.
  • Garber, Daniel. Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
  • Ishiguro, Hidé. Leibniz’s Philosophy of Logic and Language. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1975.
  • Mercer, Christia. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Parkinson, G.H.R. Logic and Reality in Leibniz’s Metaphysics. Cambridge: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Rescher. Nicholas. Leibniz’s Metaphysics of Nature. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1981.
  • Riley, Patrick. Leibniz’s Universal Jurisprudence: Justice as the Charity of the Wise. Harvard University Press, 1996.
  • Rutherford, Donald. Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Sleigh, Robert C. Leibniz and Arnauld: A Commentary on their Correspondence. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1990.
  • Smith, Justin E.H. Divine Machines: Leibniz and the Sciences of Life. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011.
  • Strickland, Lloyd. Leibniz Reinterpreted. London: Continuum, 2006.
  • Wilson, Catherine. Leibniz’s Metaphysics: A Historical and Comparative Study. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989.

iii. Collected Essays 

  • Brown, Stuart, ed. The Young Leibniz and his Philosophy (1646-76). Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1999.
  • Jorgensen and Newlands, eds. New Essays on Leibniz’s Theodicy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
  • Jolley, Nicholas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Leibniz. edited by Nicholas Jolley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Rutherford and Cover, eds. Leibniz: Nature and Freedom. New York: Oxford University Press, 2005.


Author Information

Edward W. Glowienka
Carroll College
U. S. A.