Medieval Theories of Aesthetics

The term ‘aesthetics’ did not become prominent until the eighteenth century in Germany; however, this fact does not prevent principles of aesthetics from being present in the Middles Ages. Developments in the Middles Ages paved the way for the future development of aesthetics as a separate discipline. Building on notions from antiquity (most notably Plato and Aristotle) through Plotinus, the medieval thinkers extended previous concepts in new ways, making original contributions to the development of art and theories of beauty.

Certain topics, such as proportion, light, and symbolism, played important roles in medieval aesthetics, and they will be given prominence in this article. Proportion was particularly important for architecture, which is apparent in the cathedrals. Medieval thinkers were also interested in the concept of light: what it is and how it affects everything, especially color. Symbolism was based on the view that the creation revealed God; therefore, symbolic meaning could be communicated through artwork, in particular to those who are illiterate.

Three philosophers, St. Augustine, Pseudo-Dionysius and St. Thomas Aquinas, provided significant contributions to aesthetic theory during the Middle Ages. These three philosophers employed the two predominant approaches to philosophy in the Middle Ages. Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius were mainly influenced by Plato and Neoplatonism, while Thomas was mostly influenced by Aristotle. Due to their impact on the history of philosophy (in particular, aesthetics), these philosophers will be given more detailed treatment.

Table of Contents

  1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
    3. Plotinus
  2. Topics in Aesthetics
    1. Proportion
    2. Light and Color
    3. Symbolism
  3. Individuals on Aesthetics
    1. St. Augustine
    2. Pseudo-Dionysius
    3. St. Thomas Aquinas
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Influences on the Medieval Philosophers

a. Plato

Plato’s philosophy enjoyed a noticeable presence during the medieval period, especially in the writings of Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius. The doctrine of the Forms was particularly salient.  According to Plato, there is a perfect Form of Beauty in which beautiful things participate.  For thinkers such as Augustine and Pseudo-Dionysius, platonic forms (including the form of Beauty) are in fact ideas in the mind of God, and the world is but a shadow of the divine image.  On this view, all beautiful things participate not in some abstract universal, but in God’s beauty.  Given Plato’s obvious influence on subsequent theories of aesthetics, further consideration of his views would be helpful.

Plato’s most prominent contribution to aesthetics is his notion of mimesis (imitation). Mimesis derives from the idea that beautiful things are mere replicas of Beauty itself. So conceived, beautiful things participate in the Forms by means of imitation. Moreover, Plato thought that the artist could only imitate sensible objects (or actions) which are themselves imitations of some form. On his view, such imitation results from a lack of knowledge of the Forms, the true essences of which artistic representations are but deficient approximations. Therefore, such representation is “far removed from the truth” (Plato, Republic, 598b5).  Plato famously illustrates this point through the example of a bed (Plato, Republic, 597b ff.). There is a perfect Form of a bed, which exists as the nature of a bed. Then, a carpenter makes a bed. Lastly, a painter paints a picture of the bed that the carpenter constructed. The painter’s imitation is three times removed from the true nature (or Form) of the bed.

A further aspect of imitation that concerned Plato was its socially corrosive influence. The concern is raised most notably in connection to poetry and staged tragedies. For example, if the youth see evil men prosper in plays, then the youth will be more inclined to become evil. “For that reason, we must put a stop to such stories, lest they produce in the youth a strong inclination to do bad things” (Republic 391e). Plato’s concern with how art affects people is also a concern for the medieval philosophers. Mimetic arts were forbidden from Plato’s ideal city, even those that would attempt to imitate the virtues. Plato allowed only those works of art that would perform some didactic function. The Catholic Church, during the medieval period, also used art to perform a didactic function, especially to communicate the faith to the illiterate.

b. Aristotle

Although Plato’s influence, in most areas of philosophy, was initially stronger, Aristotle’s system of logic dominated medieval philosophy. Eventually, through the writings of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas, the  balance of Aristotle’s philosophy achieved greater respect than it had in the eyes of Christian philosophers and theologians. Of particular interest is Aristotle’s metaphysics. The concept of form, especially in terms of formal causality, provided a ground for later theories of beauty, which connected the beauty of an object to its form. In other words, an object’s form is the cause of its beauty. The main difference between Aristotle’s notion of form and Plato’s notion of the Forms is that Aristotle thought the form of the object was constituted by the essential or species-defining properties inhering in the object.  Plato maintained that the Forms of each thing existed in a realm that transcended physical things.

Another concept relevant for medieval aesthetics is found in the Metaphysics (see III.3), where Aristotle presented the foundation for the medieval notion of transcendentals. He specifically highlighted the interchangeable relationship between being and one. Though Aristotle never called them transcendentals, he prompted this conception by claiming that the notions “being” and “one” are the same. “[Being and unity] are implied in one another as principle and cause are.” (Metaphysics, 1003b23). Transcendentals transcend traditional Aristotelian categories. They are interchangeable with each other, and they are inseparable in terms of their ontological status. Transcendentals (more in subsection 3.c St. Thomas Aquinas) were particularly important to such thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Avicenna, and Averroes.

Aristotle’s Poetics also contains several ideas that were important for medieval aesthetics. First, consider Aristotle’s notion of imitation. He writes, “A tragedy, then, is the imitation of an action that is serious and also, having magnitude, complete in itself; in language with pleasurable accessories, each kind brought in separately in the parts of the work; in a dramatic, not in narrative form; with incidents arousing pity and fear, wherewith to accomplish its catharsis of such emotions” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1449b25). Aristotle’s notion of mimesis is similar to the view of Plato, since they both claim that art imitates nature. However, Aristotle does not think that nature imitates the realm of the Forms. While Plato thinks that imitations are deficient replicas of real essences, Aristotle believes that imitation is natural and can also be used to educate (Poetics 1448b7).

Second, consider the notion of catharsis, developed in connection to Aristotle’s definition of tragedy. Aristotle uses this word twice in the Poetics (1449b7; 1455b15); it seems that he believed a tragedy could cleanse negative emotions such as fear and pity.

Finally, Aristotle emphasized some characteristics that art requires in order to be good. “Beauty is a matter of size and order” (Aristotle, Poetics, 1450b37). Size is important because something too small or too large is beyond one’s capacity to perceive the whole, which specifically related to the length of plays. Order concerns the relationship of the parts with each other and with the whole, which was also very important to medieval philosophers and artisans.

c. Plotinus

The Neoplatonic philosopher Plotinus provided two main contributions to guide medieval thinking on aesthetics. First, Plotinus made it clear that beauty chiefly applies to the sense of sight and hearing (Plotinus I.6.1), which was maintained in the Middle Ages. This notion is not only a contribution to a theory of beauty, but it delineates two senses as having primacy over the others for the acquisition of knowledge. And beauty, for the medieval philosophers, was frequently connected with knowledge.

Second, Plotinus argued against the notion that proportion is the primary component of beauty. “Almost everyone declares that symmetry of parts towards each other and towards a whole, with, besides, a certain charm of color, constitutes the beauty recognized by the eye, that in visible things, as indeed in all else, universally, the beautiful thing is essentially symmetrical, patterned” (Plotinus I.6.1). Plotinus proceeds to argue that simple things could not be beautiful, if symmetry was the only component of beauty. In other words, only compound things could be beautiful in a proper sense, if beauty depended on symmetry. Moreover, only the whole object would be beautiful, not its parts. The problem, for Plotinus, is that if something is beautiful, it must be composed of beautiful parts. If the parts are not symmetrical in themselves, then they could not be beautiful. This fact leads to an absurd conclusion, according to Plotinus; namely, a beautiful object could be composed of ugly parts. Plotinus does not suggest that symmetry is irrelevant or unnecessary for beauty; his point is that symmetry cannot be the only standard by which to measure an object’s beauty.

2. Topics in Aesthetics

a. Proportion

Proportion was very important to the medieval artisans, especially for architecture and music. In architecture, the primacy of proportion is most clearly seen in the cathedrals. Some cathedrals, from an aerial viewpoint, were in the shape of a cross. This shape also created a balance when viewed from within the cathedral. Paintings  had to exhibit balance in their compositions and it was important for music to exhibit harmony, in order for it to be beautiful.

The Pythagoreans are credited as being the first to study the relationships between numbers and sounds. They discovered certain pitches and proportions to be more pleasing to people than others, and these discoveries were propagated in the middle ages. Boethius writes in De Musica, “Nothing is more proper to human nature than to abandon oneself to sweet modes and to be vexed by modes that are not” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 62). Harmony has its origin in God; and therefore, music designed to bring one closer to God must be harmonious. The psychological effect of various musical modes was an important part of the theories of music. For example, some rhythms were considered to lead people more easily into lustful sins, while other rhythms were deemed appropriate for the education of young people. The earliest example of the effects of music was the story of Pythagoras allegedly calming a drunk adolescent simply by making the youth listen to a certain melody (in Hypophrygian mode). Music could influence the soul of human beings; therefore, the type of music people could hear had to be the sort that would positively influence them.

“The proportions that govern the dimensions of Greek temples, the intervals between the columns or the relationships between the various parts of the façade, correspond to the same ratios that govern musical intervals” (Eco, 2004, 64). The same principles of harmony and proportion applied to all the arts, although there were differences in the way they were applied. The numerical ratios, however, were the same because mathematical values are immutable. For example, the Golden Section, considered to be the most aesthetically pleasing proportion, was often the basis of proportions in architecture and painting.  Even though they were concerned with form, it should be stressed that the medievals were not advocates of form over function. The purpose of the building or painting was the most important thing for an artisan to consider. The form was manipulated in such a way to fulfill the purpose of the work.

b. Light and Color

Medieval scientists, such as Robert Grosseteste, were interested in discovering the nature of light. Grosseteste’s treatise, On Light, blends Neoplatonist theories of emanation and aspects of Aristotle’s cosmology. The effects of light became more important to the medieval artisans, particularly in architecture, and they frequently associated light with their theories of color. Light and color affected the thoughts of medieval thinkers on certain characteristics of beauty, such as radiance and clarity.

One of the motivations for the medieval philosophers to pursue the notion of light developed from the belief that God is Light. Though Plotinus was not a Christian, the seeds of this idea that God is Light can be seen in his writings. “The simple beauty of a color is derived from a form that dominates the obscurity of matter and from the presence of an incorporeal light that is reason and idea” (Plotinus, I.6). The incorporeal light, for the Christians, is God’s light and gives splendor to the whole of creation. Light is what allows the beauty of objects, especially their color, to become illuminated, in order to display their beauty to the fullest. Pseudo-Dionysius follows up on these thoughts, “And what of the sun’s rays? Light comes from the Good, and light is an image of this archetypal Good. Thus the Good is also praised by the name ‘Light’, just as an archetype is revealed in its image” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 74). The light of the sun is a mere reflection and symbol of the divine light. The sun illuminates the universe, but the sun’s light is not used up. Light, for the medieval philosophers, is an important condition for there to be beauty.

Light illuminates the colors, which led the medieval thinkers to construct theories about color. Hugh of Saint Victor wrote, “With regard to the color of things there is no lengthy discussion, since sight itself demonstrates how much Beauty it adds to nature, when this last is adorned by many different colors” (quoted in Eco, 2004, 125). There is a sense in which color causes beauty, since everything has color. Hence, more radiant colors will cause the object to be more radiant and, therefore, more beautiful.

c. Symbolism

Symbolism was employed, first, as a tool to give meaning to artworks, and, second, it was used in a hermeneutical sense, to discover the deeper meaning of texts (especially the Bible). Medieval symbolism derives from a particular view of the world. Umberto Eco explains, “Firstly there was metaphysical symbolism, related to the philosophical habit of discerning the hand of God in the beauty of the world. Secondly there was universal allegory; that is, perceiving the world as a divine work of art, of such a kind that everything in it possesses moral, allegorical, and analogical meanings in addition to its literal meaning” (Eco, 1986, 56). The main idea is that the universe revealed God, its author or creator, through its beauty. As Pseudo-Dionysius wrote, “Any thinking person realizes that the appearances of beauty are signs of an invisible loveliness” (The Celestial Hierarchy, I.3). This belief was influenced by the Platonic notion that things on earth are shadows of things from the realm of Forms. Therefore, medieval artists wanted to construct their art in a symbolic manner, which would, likewise, help point to God.

Symbolism has connotations in the realm of hermeneutics, which is based on this notion that beauty in nature reflects God’s beauty. To put it differently, God revealed Himself to human beings through general revelation (nature) and special revelation (the Bible). For Aquinas, all knowledge about God begins in the material realm through the senses (ST I.88.3). People who did not have access to the Bible, because of cultural differences or illiteracy, could still receive God’s truth through nature, if they sought it. Therefore, medieval artists tried to create art for those who did not have literary access to the Bible by using symbols.

3. Individuals on Aesthetics

a. St. Augustine

Augustine set the stage for medieval Christian philosophers, drawing heavily from the Platonist and Neo-Platonist traditions. As a result, Platonic philosophy dominated the Christian medieval thought until Thomas Aquinas helped to popularize the writings of Aristotle. Augustine made a sharp distinction between the creation of God (ex nihilo) and the creation of artists (ex materia). Hence, God’s creation was not related to the notion of mimesis, which was perceived to be the goal of the arts. Even natural beauty, which was made by God, is like a shadow of God’s beauty, rather than fully actualized beauty. In a sense, God’s beauty emanates out to natural things through His act of creation. The framework for this idea had its source in Neoplatonic philosophers, particularly Plotinus. God created matter, which was initially formless, “without any beauty” (Augustine, Confessions, Bk. 12.3). The earth occupies the lowest form of beauty, and things become more beautiful as they possess more form, and less of the void. God is supremely beautiful, since only God possesses perfect form. Augustine, therefore, believes in a hierarchy of beautiful things, based on how much form they possess or lack.

Augustine developed ideas about rhythm that are pertinent to his aesthetic theory, especially the belief that rhythm originates with God. This idea of rhythm is expounded in Augustine’s De Musica. For Augustine, rhythm is immutable and eternal because its source is God. Augustine demonstrates this by pointing out how people through usage can change how certain words are pronounced, since pronunciation is conventional. However, mathematical truths cannot be determined by convention; they have already been determined. They can only be discovered by human beings. Augustine then claims that rhythm is like math; it can only be discovered by people. Rhythm is already determined in God, and human beings cannot invent it. The way Augustine describes this process of discovery is reminiscent of, though not identical with, Plato’s theory of recollection. In other words, rhythm can be discovered through a questioner (or investigation), like Socrates’ questioning of the servant boy in the Meno.

Unity, equality, number, proportion, and order are the main elements in Augustine’s theory of beauty (Beardsley, 93ff.). Beardsley points out that Augustine does not systematically present these characteristics of beauty, but they can be found, often in relation to one another, throughout his writings. First, everything exists as a separate whole unit; therefore, each thing has unity. Simply put, something cannot have the potential to be beautiful, unless it exists. And if it has existence, it will also be a unified whole. Thus, unity is a necessary element of beauty. Further, the more unified something is the more beautiful it will be. Second, concerning equality (or likeness), Beardsley writes, “The existence of individual things as units, the possibility of repeating them and comparing groups of them with respect to equality or inequality, gives rise to proportion, measure, and number” (Beardsley, 94). Third, “Number, the base of rhythm, begins from unity” (De Musica, xvii. 56). Number, for Augustine, measures rhythm. Since rhythm is based on number, which Augustine believes is immutable, then it follows that rhythm is likewise immutable. Fourth, “in all the arts it is symmetry [or proportion] that gives pleasure, preserving unity and making the whole beautiful” (Of True Religion, xxx. 55). Fifth, Augustine asserts, “everything is beautiful that is in due order” (Of True Religion, xli. 77). Moreover, Augustine says, “Order is the distribution which allots things equal and unequal, each to its own place” (City of God, XIX, xiii). In other words, the degree to which things are in their proper place is the degree in which they are beautiful.

b. Pseudo-Dionysius

About the sixth century, the writings of the anonymous author Pseudo-Dionysius, emerged and influenced philosophers, most notably Thomas Aquinas. His main work that has relevance for aesthetics is The Divine Names, in which he refers to God as Beautiful. For Pseudo-Dionysius, “beautiful” refers to something that participates in beauty, while “beauty” refers to that ingredient that makes things beautiful. In the Cause (God), “beautiful” and “beauty” have no distinction because the Cause gathers everything back into Itself. The beautiful, which is God, is unchangeably beautiful; therefore, the beautiful cannot cease to be beautiful. This immutable beauty would have to truly exist, if the beautiful is the source of all beauty. Pseudo-Dionysius explains, “For beauty is the cause of harmony, of sympathy, of community. Beauty unites all things and is the source of all things” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77). Further, he claims, “This – the One, the Good, the Beautiful – is in its uniqueness the Cause of the multitudes of the good and the beautiful” (Pseudo-Dionysius, 77).  Two main points can be taken from these statements. First, beauty is the cause of any beautiful thing that exists; and, second, the beautiful and the good are the same. Since beauty is the source of all things that exist, everything has a degree of beauty. Accordingly, everything has a desire and drive to move back toward the Beautiful and Good, that is, the source of the beauty of everything. This cyclical process is evident throughout Pseudo-Dionysius’ thought and illustrates Plotinus’ influence. It also prefigures Thomas’ belief that God is the source of all beauty, and the final end of human beings is the beatific vision, where people see God in His glory.

c. St. Thomas Aquinas

In terms of aesthetics, Thomas Aquinas focused his comments mostly on the notion of beauty. However, he did not say enough to have a detailed system; his views are extracted from what he did say. The discussion here will deal with his definition of beauty, the standards of beauty, and the question of whether beauty is a transcendental.

Thomas’ definition of beauty is as follows: beauty is that which gives pleasure when seen (ST I-II, 27. 1). This definition, at first glance, seems to suggest a subjective understanding of beauty for Thomas. The ambiguity comes from this word ‘seen,’ which has a different implication than it might seem in English. One might be tempted to equate seen with glance or notice; however, these possibilities are incomplete because they imply a passive account of seeing. The notion of ‘seen’ is more closely associated with the activity of contemplation. Jacques Maritain offers some helpful explanation,

Beauty is essentially the object of intelligence, for what knows in the full meaning of the word is the mind, which alone is open to the infinity of being. The natural site of beauty is the intelligible world: thence it descends. But it falls in a way within the grasp of the senses, since the senses in the case of man serve the mind and can themselves rejoice in knowing: ‘the beautiful relates only to sight and hearing of all senses, because these two are maxime cognoscitivi’(Maritain, 23).

Knowing beauty is not the result of a discursive process, nevertheless it is an activity of the mind. Knowledge in general, for Thomas, occurs when the form of an object, without its matter, exists in the mind of the knower (De Trinitate, q. 5, a. 2). For example, suppose someone is gazing at a flower. The same form, which is immaterial, of the flower in extra-mental reality is received by the senses and begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Then, the knower can contemplate the form of the object and discover its beauty. This process could transpire quickly. The knower (or beholder) receives data from the sensible world through the senses, but the senses do not recognize something as beautiful. The mind is responsible for recognizing the beauty of a given object. Consequently, knowledge has two aspects: passive and active. The passive aspect receives data from extra-mental reality; the active aspect gives the abstracted forms new existence in the mind of the knower. The details of this process are not relevant here; it is mainly important to see that the form of the object in reality begins to exist in the mind of the knower. Since beauty, for Thomas, is caused by the form of the object, then this process explains how the apprehension of beauty is the result of cognition.

More specifically, the senses of sight and hearing are those through which the beholder receives the form of the object. For Thomas, these senses are the most important ones for cognition; therefore, they are the ones employed in perceiving the beautiful. Thomas maintains the objectivity of beauty, in the sense that beauty resides in the object. In other words, beauty is not a concept in the mind of the beholder imposed onto a given object. If beauty is objective, then there must be some criteria by which we discover whether something is in fact beautiful.

The criteria of beauty are not precise formulae for discovering or labeling beautiful things with absolute certainty. These criteria are more like guideposts to help finite minds apprehend beauty. They do not have to all be present for an object to be considered beautiful, and the presence of one does not guarantee that the object is beautiful. For Thomas, beauty has four primary standards: actuality, proportion, radiance, and integrity (ST, I.39.8c). The original context of this list is centered on the relationship of the three persons of the trinity, specifically in reference to the Son. The Son has integrity insofar as he “has in Himself truly and perfectly the nature of the Father.” The Son has proportion “inasmuch as He is the express Image of the Father.” Lastly, the third property [radiance, brightness, or clarity] is found in the Son, as the Word, “which is the light and splendor of the intellect.” Since Thomas did not specifically expound on these properties in relationship to art, modern commentators and interpreters have tried to fill in this gap. Therefore, the exposition of the properties below comes largely from Armand Maurer, Umberto Eco, and Etienne Gilson.

Actuality. Actuality is not mentioned in Thomas’ list of the characteristics of beauty. However, for Thomas, everything has its ultimate source in actuality (or being); therefore, actuality (or being) is the basis of beauty. According to Maurer, actuality is used in three ways when referring to beauty: existence, form, and action (Maurer, 6ff.). Beauty is grounded in the actual existence of the object. For Thomas, everything that has being will also have a degree of beauty, regardless of how small that degree appears. In other words, an object must exist, in some sense, in order for it to be beautiful; otherwise, it would be nothing. Therefore, actuality is the ground of beauty. Maurer explains, “Whatever actuality a being has over and above its existence, it owes to its existence. For without existence there is no being; there is simply nothing. So the actuality of existence is the source and origin of the whole being, including its beauty” (Maurer, 7).

The second aspect of actuality is form. Form separates the existence of different things. For example, a dog and a tree both exist, but the dog exists as a dog and the tree exists as a tree. “As each thing has its own form, so it has its own distinctive beauty. In the words of St. Thomas, ‘Everything is beautiful in proportion to its own form’” (Maurer, 8). This interpretation of Thomas can be gleaned from his account of the relationship between goodness and form (ST I.5.5). To summarize this passage, everything is what it is because of its form; therefore, a thing has more goodness [and beauty] when it achieves a higher level of perfection in its form. A tree is beautiful to the degree in which it perfectly attains to the form of a tree and, likewise, a dog would be beautiful according to the form of a dog.

The third aspect of actuality is action. “Action completes the actuality of existence and form” (Maurer, 8). A clear illustration of the notion of action is a dancer. A dancer sitting and drinking coffee is still a dancer, in the sense that she possesses the skill required for dancing. Yet she is most completely a dancer when she performs the act of dancing. Strictly speaking, actuality is not a characteristic of beautiful things; more precisely, it is the necessary condition for grounding beauty in anything.

Proportion. Plotinus had already dismissed the notion of proportion (or symmetry or harmony) as the only qualification of beauty; however, the medieval philosophers still believed proportion had some importance for beauty. “We have only to think of the symmetry of the petals of an orchid, the balance of a mathematical equation, the mutual adaptation of the parts of a work of art, to realize how important the factor of harmony is in beauty” (Maurer, 10-11). The object may actually be symmetrical, but it is more important that it is well-balanced. The parts of the whole are in harmony with one another. Proportion is mentioned in this quote from Thomas’ Summa:

Proportion is twofold. In one sense it means a certain relation of one quantity to another, according as double, treble and equal are species of proportion. In another sense every relation of one thing to another is called proportion. And in this sense there can be a proportion of the creature to God, inasmuch as it is related to Him as the effect of its cause, and as potentiality to its act; and in this way the created intellect can be proportioned to know God (ST I.12.1).

Following Eco, proportion, according to this statement, could be reduced to relationships of quantity and relationships of quality (Eco, 1988, 82). Relationships of quantity are more mathematical, while those of quality are considered more ‘habitual’, which Eco explains as a relation of “mutual reference  or analogy, or some kind of agreement between them which subjects both to a common criterion or rule” (Eco, 1988, 82). This second relationship could be one of matter to form, cause to effect, and Creator to created (SCG II.16.8; II.80-81.7).

Radiance. “Radiance belongs to being considered precisely as beautiful: it is, in being, that which catches the eye, or the ear, or the mind, and makes us want to perceive it again” (Gilson, 2000, 35). Radiance is a bit more difficult to pinpoint than the other standards. Radiance signifies the luminosity that emanates from a beautiful object, which initially seizes the attention of the beholder. This trait is closely related to the medieval notions concerning light. For example, in terms of natural light, there is a sense in which the paintings in a gallery lose some of their beauty when the lights are turned off because they are no longer being perceived. However, Thomas also connects beautiful things with the divine light. “All form, through which things have being, is a certain participation in the divine clarity [or light]. And this is what [Dionysius] adds, that particulars are beautiful because of their own nature – that is, because of their form” (Thomas, Commentary on the Divine Names, IV.6). This quote provides another account of Thomas connecting all beauty to the beauty of God, as the cause of all beauty.

Wholeness. The last standard of beauty for Thomas is wholeness or integrity. “The first meaning of this term, for St. Thomas, is existential: it expresses the primal perfection of a thing, which is found in its existence (esse). In a second sense a thing is integral when it is perfect in its operation. Wholeness, in short, demands perfection in being and action” (Maurer, 29). If some particular thing was perfectly beautiful, then it would have to be completely actualized, lacking nothing essential to its nature. In other words, anything that is imperfect in some way is lacking some thing or ability necessary for its completion. Thomas speaks about wholeness [or integrity] in the context perfection: “The ‘first’ perfection is that according to which a thing is substantially perfect, and this perfection is the form of the whole; which form results from the whole having its parts complete” (ST I.73.1).

Whether or not beauty is a transcendental property of being will be the last topic in this entry. As a starting point, something is considered a transcendental if it “can be predicated of being as such and therefore of every being” (Koren, 48). The notion of transcendentals has its origins in Aristotle, specifically the Metaphysics. Aristotle claimed, as quoted earlier, that being and unity are implied in one another (Metaphysics, 1003b23). From this beginning, the medieval philosophers developed a broader notion of transcendentals; the three most mentioned transcendentals are one, true, and good. Aquinas’ main presentation of the transcendentals is found in his Questiones Disputatae de Veritate, Question 1. In this text, Aquinas claims that being is the first thing conceived by the intellect because “every reality is essentially a being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). Yet, Aquinas writes, “some predicates may be said to add to being inasmuch as they express a mode of being not expressed by the term being” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1).

A predicate can add to being in two ways. First, the predicate may express a special mode of being. For example, in itself expresses a special mode of being, namely a substance, but it fails to be a transcendental because it does not apply to being as such. It applies only to individual beings. Second, a predicate may express a mode of being that is common to every being in general. This second mode can be understood in two ways: (1) absolutely – referring to a being as it relates to itself; (2) relatively – referring to a being as it relates to other beings.

A predicate can express being in reference to itself (or being-absolutely) either affirmatively or negatively. Affirmatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate thing is a transcendental, since each being is a unified whole. Negatively, Aquinas claims that the predicate one is a transcendental, since each being is undivided with reference to itself.

Moving to the predicates that express a relative mode of being, Aquinas claims that there are two ways. The first way refers to the idea that each being is separate from all other beings, so Aquinas refers to something (or otherness) as a transcendental property of being. The second way is based on the correspondence that one being has with another, which also has two facets. As a precondition, Aquinas writes, “This is possible only if there is something which is such that it agrees with every being. Such a being is the soul, which, as is said in The Soul, ‘in some way is all things.’ The soul, however, has both knowing and appetitive powers” (Disputed Questions on Truth, Q.1). In terms of the knowing power, true is a transcendental property because all knowing is an assimilation of the thing known by the knower. In terms of the appetitive power, good is a transcendental because the good is “that which all desire” (referring to Aristotle’s Ethics).

To summarize, transcendentals are properties of being as such (that is, every being). Each transcendental is convertible with being. In other words, the transcendentals are present wherever being is present. However, just like being can be found in varying degrees, the transcendentals can also be found in degrees. For example, every being is not perfectly or completely good, but every being is good to a degree. So, Aquinas’ list of transcendentals consists of the following: thing, one, something, true, and good. But is this list necessarily exhaustive? Could other things, such as beauty, be transcendentals?

Some interpreters of Aquinas’ thought have claimed that beauty is not a transcendental; so, Aquinas left it off his list intentionally. Jan Aertsen, toward arguing that beauty is not a transcendental, attempts to clarify what it means for something to be a transcendental. He writes, “If the beautiful is a transcendental, then it must participate in the two features of transcendentals: because of their universal extension they are really identical, but they differ from one another conceptually” (Aertsen, 71). Aertsen concedes the first feature in reference to beauty; beauty is identical to the other transcendentals, particularly the good. However, he rejects the idea that beauty is conceptually different from the good, which, if correct, would prevent beauty from being counted among the transcendentals. Considering beauty as a kind of sub-category of the good is probably the main reason for rejecting it as a transcendental.

Contrary to Aertsen, Jacques Maritain (and others, like Etienne Gilson and Umberto Eco) maintains that beauty is a transcendental. The main problem with this view is that Aquinas did not include beauty in his list. Concerning this problem, an accepted explanation does not exist. Like Aertsen, Maritain claims that beauty is identical with the other transcendentals. But, contrary to Aertsen, Maritain asserts that Aquinas makes it clear that beauty and goodness are conceptually distinct. Specifically, Maritain refers to a passage in the Summa Theologia where Aquinas writes,

They [beauty and goodness] differ logically, for goodness properly relates to the appetite (goodness being what all things desire); and therefore it has the aspect of an end (the appetite being a kind of movement towards a thing). On the other hand, beauty relates to the cognitive faculty; for beautiful things are those which please when seen. Hence beauty consists in due proportion; for the senses delight in things duly proportioned, as in what is after their own kind-because even sense is a sort of reason, just as is every cognitive faculty. Now since knowledge is by assimilation, and similarity relates to form, beauty properly belongs to the nature of a formal cause (ST I.5.4).

Aquinas asserts in this passage that beauty and goodness differ logically. Maritain and others use this passage to show that Aquinas claimed that beauty and goodness were conceptually different, yet metaphysically identical. If Maritain, and others, are correct, then beauty could count as a transcendental property of being.

As this last section on transcendentals illustrates, while medieval philosophers did not develop a system of aesthetics they do provide an interesting entry point to the study of aesthetics. Ideas concerning the beautiful are spread throughout their writings,  gathered and developed by later philosophers.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle. 2 Vols. Edited by Jonathan Barnes. Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Augustine. Of True Religion. Translated by J. H. S. Burleigh. Chicago:Henry Regnery Company, 1968.
  • Baird, Forrest E. and Walter Kaufmann. Medieval and Renaissance Philosophy. 5th ed. Upper Saddle River: Pearson Prentice Hall, 2008.
  • Hofstadter, Albert and Richard Kuhns, ed. Philosophies of Art and Beauty: Selected Readings in Aesthetics from Plato to Heidegger. The University of Chicago Press, 1964 (This book was primarily used for its selections from Augustine).
  • Plato. Complete Works. Edited by John M. Cooper. Indianapolis, Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Plotinus. The Enneads. Translated by Stephen MacKenna. Burdett: Larson Publications, 1992.
  • Pseudo-Dionysius. The Complete Works. Translated by Colm Luibheid. New York: Paulist Press, 1987.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Theologiae (ST). Translated by Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics, 1981.
  • Thomas Aquinas. Summa Contra Gentiles (SCG). 5 Volumes. University of Notre Dame Press, 1975.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Aertsen, Jan A. “Beauty in the Middle Ages: A Forgotten Transcendental?” Medieval Philosophy and Theology. Vol. 1. (1991), 68-97.
  • Beardsley, Monroe. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present: A Short History. Tuscaloosa: University of Alabama Press, 1966.
  • Coomaraswamy, Ananda K. Christian and Oriental Philosophy of Art. New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1956.
  • Eco, Umberto. Art and Beauty in the Middle Ages. Translated by Hugh Bredin. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1986.
  • Eco, Umberto. The Aesthetics of Thomas Aquinas. Translated by Hugh Bredin. Harvard University Press, 1988.
  • Eco, Umberto. Ed. History of Beauty. Translated by Alastair McEwen. New York: Rizzoli, 2004.
  • Gilson, Etienne. The Arts of the Beautiful. Dalkey Archive Press, 2000.
  • Gilson, Etienne. Painting and Reality. New York: Pantheon Books, 1957.
  • Koren, Henry. An Introduction to the Science of Metaphysics. St. Louis: B. Herder Book Company, 1955.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Art and Scholasticism. Translated by J. F. Scanlan. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1930.
  • Maurer, Armand. About Beauty: A Thomistic Interpretation. Houston: Center for Thomistic Studies, 1983.

Author Information

Michael R. Spicher
Massachusetts College of Art and Design
U. S. A.