Moral Egalitarianism

Egalitarianism is the position that equality is central to justice. It is a prominent trend in social and political philosophy and has also become relevant in moral philosophy (moral egalitarianism) since the late twentieth century. In social and political philosophy, the main focus of the debate is on two different trends, the Equality-of-What trend and the Why-Equality trend. The authors of the older, first trend focused on the main question, what the goods of distribution are (resources, equality of opportunity for welfare, and so forth) and according to which standard one should distribute the goods. The question, in the late twentieth century is, whether equality is the most or one of the most important part(s) of justice or whether it has no or nearly no importance for the nature of justice at all. Egalitarians believe that justice and equality are closely connected; prioritarians, instead, emphasise that the two concepts are unrelated. This article gives an overview of the main arguments and objections in the Why-Equality debate. These are the by-product objection of equality, the objection of inhumanity, the objection of complexity, the argument of the presumption of equality, and the argument for a pluralistic egalitarianism.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Distinctions
  2. On some Difficulties within the Why-Equality Debate
  3. Objections to Moral Egalitarianism
    1. The By-Product Objection of Equality
    2. The Objection of Inhumanity
      1. The Fault is-Up-to-Them Objection
      2. The Objection of Stigmatizing
      3. The Tutelage Objection
    3. The Objection of Complexity
  4. Two Egalitarian Arguments
    1. The Egalitarians’ Assumption of the Presumption of Equality
    2. Pluralistic Egalitarianism
  5. Reference and Further Reading

1. Preliminary Distinctions

Egalitarianism is the position that equality is central to justice. It is a prominent trend in social and political philosophy and has also become relevant in moral philosophy (moral egalitarianism) since the late twentieth century. The very question is, whether equality is the most or one of the most important part(s) of justice or whether it has no or nearly no importance for the nature of justice at all (‘Why-Equality’). Egalitarians believe that justice and equality are closely connected; prioritarians, instead, emphasise that both concepts are not related.

Egalitarians think, firstly, that unfair life prospects should be equalized. Secondly, that equality is the most or one of the most important irreducible intrinsic or constitutive worth(s) of justice. Thirdly, that welfare should be increased. Fourthly, that justice is comparative. Fifthly, that inequalities are just when otherwise advantages are destroyed in the name of justice. Lastly, that there are certain absolute humanitarian principles like autonomy, freedom or human dignity.

Prioritarians think, firstly, that equality itself cannot be a foundation of justice and that it is no important irreducible aim of justice, it has no intrinsic moral worth (Frankfurt 1997) and it has no or at least no fundamental importance with regard to the justification of justice, it is rather a by-product, although it has some importance as reducible worth (Raz 1986). Secondly, the fulfilment of absolute standards like human dignity, respect, or citizenship are of utmost importance to give people the opportunity to live a human being-worthy life and not a life in miserable circumstances (Walzer 1983; Raz 1986; Frankfurt 1997; Parfit 1998; Anderson 1999). Thirdly, people should have access to food and shelter, basic medical supply, or should have private and political autonomy, and so forth. Fourthly, equality has some importance (i) in being a by-product, or (ii) in being one part among other parts as a comparative factor, (for example, in equality before the law, concerning equal chances, or with regard to the prohibition of discrimination), or (iii) in being a precondition for the fulfilment of certain absolute standards like political autonomy, social affiliation, and liberty of exchange (Krebs 2000, 2003).

2. On some Difficulties within the Why-Equality Debate

The main question, whether egalitarianism or prioritarianism has the most plausible conception of the relation between justice and equality, has not been successfully answered, yet. There had been attacks from both sides, which show that they did not attack the strongest but a weak version of the opponents’ view. A second mistake is the fact that the notions of justice and equality are also discussed – to a great extent – under the heading of questions of distributions, although this had been the main point of the ‘Equality-of-What’ debate, for example, ‘equality of resources’ (Rawls 1971, 1993; Dworkin 1981; Rakowski 1991; van Parijs 1995), ‘equality of opportunity for welfare’ (Arneson 1989; Cohen 1989; Roemer 1996, 1998), or ‘equality of capability to function’ (Sen 1992). This is a misleading focus, especially if one wants to determine the relation between these two important notions with regard to the question of justification. Questions of distributions are just one part of the story. Thirdly, the two most extreme assumptions (i) justice is equality and (ii) justice has nothing to do with equality are unsound, since common sense can easily show that these assumptions are out of sight right from the beginning. The interesting and more appropriated ones are situated right in-between. Equality should not be discussed in socioeconomic circumstances only, but also in the moral and political realm.

3. Objections to Moral Egalitarianism

The main objections against the egalitarians made by the prioritarians are, firstly, the by-product objection of equality (Raz 1986; Frankfurt 1987, 1997; Parfit 1998), secondly, the objection of inhumanity (Anderson 1999) and, thirdly, the objection of complexity (Walzer 1983).

a. The By-Product Objection of Equality

Firstly, the egalitarian view that equality is the central aim or one of the most important aims of justice and should not be seen as a mere by-product had been a mayor point of criticism on the prioritarian side (Raz 1986: 218-221, 227-229; Frankfurt 1987: 32-34 and 1997: 7 and 11; Parfit 1998: 13-15). They think that equality is a mere by-product and it is due to absolute standards like human dignity or respect, and so forth, whereas egalitarian equality is due to relational standards.

Prioritarians argue that in cases of people’s hunger and illness or deficiency of goods they should be helped because hunger, illness, and deficiency of goods are terrible circumstances for every human being and not because other people are in a better condition. The hunger and illness of other people or the deficiency of goods directly put us in the situation to help these people without making any comparison between them and those people who are better off. Frankfurt says that substantial – and not formal – definitions certainly have genuine moral importance and that it depends on human beings who live a good life and not on how their life is with regard to other human beings’ lives (Frankfurt 1997: 6). It seems that prioritarians think that egalitarians worship equality for the sake of equality only. In cases of illness, hunger and deficiency of goods the role of equality is not that simple as prioritarians want to make other people believe. Their objection loses its power, if one acknowledges that people in cases of illness, hunger or deficiency of goods should be treated equally as human beings if they get supply, that means there is no primarily discrimination ongoing. Equality has many faces and impartiality is one of it. There is room for proportional equality in cases of, for instance, deficiency of goods. This is no contradiction within the egalitarian view – proportional equality is part of equality. The idea that equality always means arithmetical equality is not justified.

The second example is Parfit’s ‘levelling down objection’ (Parfit 1998: chapter 4). Given that inequalities as such are bad, their disappearance would be, in one respect, a change to something, which is better. If, says Parfit, the better off people lose all their additional resources by a natural disaster and thus are in the same terrible situation than the other people, it will be something that teleological egalitarians may welcome, though some people lost all of their additional resources and nobody else could profit. Or, in the famous example given by Parfit: ‘Similarly, it would be in one way an improvement if we destroyed the eyes of the sighted, not to benefit the blind, but only to make the sighted blind. These implications can be more plausibly regarded as monstrous, or absurd.’ (Parfit 1998: chapter 4). Parfit knows that this would be not enough to criticize the egalitarians by using this objection, ‘it is not enough to claim that it would be wrong to produce equality by levelling down.’ Therefore he states: ‘Our objection must be that, if we achieve equality by levelling down, there is nothing good about what we have done. Similarly, if some natural disaster makes everyone equally badly off, that is not in any way good news.’ (Parfit 1998: chapter 4). It seems Parfit is thinking of an opponent who does everything for his worshipping of equality – that is, equality for the sake of equality. Plain egalitarians claim that inequalities are justified, if the only means to remove inequality would be to ‘level down’ the better off people to the standard of the badly off people, without any improvement with regard to the badly off people. The destruction of advantages in the name of justice is also unacceptable on the egalitarian view. There is a lot of rhetoric in this kind of objection. Parfit makes a distinction between the teleological and the deontic egalitarianism in this passage. And it is only the teleological egalitarianism, in Parfit’s view, that is open for criticism. The deontic egalitarian, unlike the teleological egalitarian, has no problem with the view that inequality itself is not bad in a way. But, says Parfit, ‘we may find it harder to justify some of our beliefs’ when adopting the deontic view. A sound egalitarianism should incorporate teleological and deontic aspects.

b. The Objection of Inhumanity

The objection of inhumanity, which had been brought into the discussion by Anderson (1999) is one of the main arguments against egalitarianism. Anderson’s version of the argument has three different parts, firstly, the ‘fault is-up-to-them’ objection (Anderson 1999: 295-302; also Barry 1991: 149 and MacLeod 1998: 75p.), secondly, the objection of stigmatizing (Anderson 1999: 302-307; also MacLeod 1998: 106-108), and thirdly, the tutelage objection (Anderson 1999: 310; also Hayek 1960: 85-102).

i. The Fault is-Up-to-Them Objection

The first part is an objection against the (supposed) egalitarian view that people who are responsible for their own terrible situation should be left alone with their problems, no matter what happens to them. The second part is an objection against the kind of reasons egalitarians have in order to help people who are in a terrible situation, which did not arise through their own fault. The third part is an objection against the decision-making of the state – in which category a misery should be placed – and the investigation of the citizens in order to get the relevant information for the state. This would be, in Anderson’s view, a case of putting the citizens under the tutelage of the state and harming their private sphere.

Proponents of luck egalitarianism want to equalize undeserved life prospects, the people should be responsible for their decisions, that means, strictly speaking, they have no justified demands for supply, if they get into a miserable situation on their own fault. Anderson criticises Rakowski’s view (1991), who states that it would be all right to let a guilty car driver die in a hospital, who has no insurance and illegally made a turn over on the street which causes a serious accident. The guilty car driver, so Rakowski, has no legal demands to be kept on the artificial respiration apparatus, any longer. Others argue that society should help people no matter whether they caused their own disaster or not, they are human beings and this is the best reason to give them a helping hand if they lost the right track. This may be seen as a true milestone of the development in human history. To be part of a “real” community means to help those needy people. What about the idea of humanity and charity, the idea to show compassion with members of ones own community, or with the conception of beneficence? To neglect helpless people seems inappropriate for a community which is devoted to the idea of human flourishing – the basic concept of each sound community.

People who lived a jet-set life should not have a (legal) demand to live such a life again, if they caused a disaster and lost everything and the only way to be better off again would be to let society pay for it. This demand seems unsound but they should live a human being worthy life and society has to pay for it, no matter what the price is. And this account does not contradict with a sophisticated version of a pluralistic egalitarianism. On this point, Anderson cites Arneson who thinks that it might be unfair to make people responsible for their actions in all circumstances since responsible decisions are dependent on necessary capacities – foresight, steadfastness, ability to calculate, strong will, self-confidence – which are partly due to one’s genes or the luck to have good parents. Therefore, those people have a demand on a special paternalistic protection by society with regard to their own bad decisions. Arneson thinks that this could be financed by an obligatory social contribution of the people to a pension scheme. Others, so Anderson, hold the view that a strict compensation of welfare should also be modified by paternalistic intervention. That means only paternalistic reasons could make social contributions obligatory and could justify the distribution of a monthly guaranteed income. Anderson disputes the fact that luck egalitarians show the necessary respect for citizens since they state that people, who had hard luck by virtue of their own fault, ‘earn’ it. She seems to be on the wrong path when she criticises other egalitarians who want to help the badly off people by social insurances on paternalistic reasons. These paternalistic reasons – in order to justify obligatory social insurances – are, in her opinion, a sign of taking citizens to be silly and to be unable to organise their own lives. It is hard to see, so Anderson, how one can expect from citizens not to lose their self-esteem by accepting this kind of justification.

Amy Gutmann criticises Anderson on two points, firstly, she states that even egalitarians should be able to argue that there are special cases – like the guilty car driver case – which are so badly that these people should be helped, even if they got into the miserable situation on their own fault. Secondly, paternalism could be an honourable and compelling principle of legislation. Hence, it must not be humiliating for the state to make laws, for instance, on wearing safety belts, insofar the laws are due to a democratic process. Although Anderson shares the intention of these arguments, she states on the first point that the very idea to guarantee special kind of goods would contradict with the spirit of luck egalitarianism. It might be that this line of argument speaks against luck egalitarianism but not against a sophisticated version of a pluralistic egalitarianism. The safety belt case, so Anderson, is not a good example for restricting the citizen’s liberty with regard to cases in which their liberty is restricted to a great amount, like in cases of coercive partaking of social insurances. The society’s justification should be much stronger than the claim that society knows the citizen’s interests better than they do. There should be no problem for citizens to take part in a social insurance when it is reasonable for them. Under the ‘veil of ignorance,’ to take up Rawl’s famous thought-experiment, everybody would agree on a social insurance if the advantages, for instance not to die in a hospital by virtue of having no insurance at all, rule out the disadvantage of coercive partaking. It seems right that just a few people would like to live in a society where people have to die, because they have not got a social insurance, for whatever reasons. And, if the price for it is to take part in a social insurance, even if it is a liability, one should not hesitate to do so. But, if a person decided not to take part and she is the guilty car driver, she should be helped, no matter what the costs are. This is due to human dignity and there is no sound counterargument why pluralistic egalitarians should not be able to integrate this idea in their conception without losing their track. There is, of course, a practical necessity for every society not to pay for everyone; the social insurances of the state could only finance a limited number of people who do not have – for whatever reasons – a social insurance. Hence, it should be in everybody’s interest, in order to relieve society of high extra costs, to pay for one’s own social insurance. Therefore, it is in society’s interest – and this means in the end in the interest of everybody – to force the people by law to have their own social insurances. In this case, nothing speaks against being forced to one’s own luck.

ii. The Objection of Stigmatizing

The objection of stigmatizing is an objection against the kind of reasons egalitarians have in order to help people who are in terrible situations, which did not arise through their own fault (‘bad brute luck’), for instance, disabled people from birth, or people who became disabled by virtue of an illness or an accident, or people with (very) poor natural talents, and so forth. Anderson thinks, firstly, that there is no care for all badly off people, if one looks at the rules, which lay down who belongs to the ‘bad brute luck’ people, and secondly, the reasons to help the ‘bad brute luck’ people are discriminating for them. The reasons offered to distribute extra resources to handicapped people, so Anderson on the egalitarian view, are wrong because ‘[p]eople lay claim to the resources of egalitarian redistribution in virtue of their inferiority to others, not in virtue of their equality to others’ (Anderson 1999: 306). The principles of distribution are based on pity, which is in her view incompatible with the respect for human dignity. Her main question is, whether a theory of justice, which is based on contemptuous pity for the alleged beneficiaries, could serve egalitarian standards, that equal respect of each human being is the basis of justice. She comes to the conclusion that luck egalitarianism disregards the basic requirements, which every sound egalitarian theory should have.

One might argue that the concern of the ‘equality of fortune’-theorists is based on humanitarian compassion and not on contemptuous pity, but even than, so Anderson, one has to keep the distinctions between the two notions in mind: ‘Compassion is based on an awareness of suffering, an intrinsic condition of a person. Pity, by contrast, is aroused by a comparison of the observer’s condition with the condition of the object of pity’ (Anderson 1999: 306p.). In Anderson’s view, ‘compassion’ says that the person in question is badly off and ‘pity’ says that the person in question is worse off than oneself (‘she is sadly inferior to me’). Both can move one to help others, who are in need, ‘but only pity is condescending.’ But, even for the sake of argument, to take ‘humanitarian compassion’ as a starting point, this would be no sound basis for egalitarian principles of distribution, because compassion aims at relieving suffering and not equalizing it. She states, according to Raz (1986: 242), that once people are relieved of their suffering and neediness, compassion could not generate a further need of an equality of condition. The equality of fortune does not express compassion, it is not about the absolute misery of the person in question, it is about the gap between the best off and the worse off people. The better off people – who are guided by the considerations of luck egalitarianism – have a certain kind of feeling of superiority towards people, who are in need and, vice versa, the badly off people are envious and seek for an equal distribution of resources. Their criterion is an envy-free distribution (Anderson 1999: 306p.).

This may have some plausibility on the first sight, but a second glance shows that she mixed up two aspects, which should be sharply divided, the ‘factum’ of equality and the feeling of inferiority. In detail, her claim that pity is incompatible with human dignity is unsound and the only reason why this claim seems to be justified is that her notion of ‘pity’ is of a certain kind. Anderson’s definition of pity rests on her assumption that ‘pity’ is something that is due to a comparison between the conditions of the people involved and the feeling of those people, who help others who are in need, but, there is no necessity that those, who help others who are in need, have a certain kind of feeling, like, ‘she is really inferior to me’. It might be that some people feel like that, but most people would refuse this kind of talk. They would say that one has to help others who are in need because they are human beings, equal to me, and they did not deserve it to be left alone with their handicap. If one were one of them – one might argue – one would not like to be left alone, either. Anderson’s special definition is incompatible with human dignity, but there are other definitions. But even, so Anderson, if one agrees on humanitarian compassion as starting point for an egalitarian distribution, it would not be enough, since ‘compassion’ aims to ‘relieve suffering’ and not to ‘equalize’ it. According to the compassion view there is no ‘moral judgment on those who suffer’ (Anderson 1999: 307) and there is no further distribution in sight if the suffering of the people has been relieved. This is no objection against the compassion view at all. Firstly, there is no necessity to have a certain kind of feeling, like, ‘she is really inferior to me,’ and secondly, if disabled people are cured, there is no further reason to give them extra resources. They are in a good healthy condition again. Anderson’s main point is that luck egalitarianism claim that disabled people get extra resources by virtue of their inferiority and not by virtue of their equality to other people. One has to differentiate between i.) the improper special feeling of certain kind of people, who help others who are in need (‘she is really inferior to me’) and their motivation to help the needy people, and ii.) the ‘true’ reason why, for instance, disabled people should be treated equally and differently at the same time. Differently, because they get extra resources according to proportional equality, and equally, because they are human beings and should be treated morally equal, according to arithmetical equality. All versions of egalitarianism have one main aspect in common and it may be that Anderson overlooks this important aspect in her talk about what the reasons are to help people who are in need.

iii. The Tutelage Objection

The tutelage objection is against the decision-making of the state – in which category a misery should be placed – and the investigation of the citizens in order to get the relevant information for the state’s decision. This would be, in Anderson’s view, a case of putting the citizens under the tutelage of the state and harming their private sphere (Anderson 1999: 310; also Hayek 1960: 85-102). ‘Equality of fortune,’ so Anderson, says ‘that no one should suffer from undeserved misfortune’ (Anderson 1999: 310). But, in order to determine which people are allowed to get special treatment (res. extra resources) the state must make judgments on the people’s moral responsibility concerning their situation to brute or option luck. In citing Hayek (1960: 95-97) who states that ‘(…) in order to lay a claim to some important benefit, people are forced to obey other people’s judgments of what uses they should have made of their opportunities, rather than following their own judgments’ (Anderson 1999: 310) Anderson concludes that such a system would require the state to make ‘grossly intrusive, moralizing judgments of individual’s choices’ (Anderson 1999: 310). Hence, equality of fortune contradicts with citizen’s privacy and liberty. This is in Korsgaard’s view (1993: 61), on which Anderson is affirmatively referring to, a disrespectful behaviour of the state: ‘But it is disrespectful for the state to pass judgment on how much people are responsible for their expensive tastes or their imprudent choices’ (Anderson 1999: 310).

Her objection against the function of the state to decide which people are morally responsible for their situation according to brute or option luck seems plausible. For the sake of argument, let everybody agree on the point to help people, who suffer from undeserved misfortune. The very question is, then, how the state could organise a system, which treats everyone fairly and with respect. It is a practical necessity that the state decides which people get extra resources financed by the social community. And, it should be no problem to say that, if the state is spending public money, someone has to prove the legitimacy of requests. Therefore, the state needs information and this has nothing to do with harming the people’s liberty or private sphere. It is a hard thing to decide how far this gathering of information by the state should go, of course, no one would like to live in a state where Big Brother is watching you all the time, but one must acknowledge the simple fact that the state has to take precautions not to be deceived by social cheaters. If a person wants public money, she should better have a sound reason, if not, she might be a cheater. It is not about ‘expensive tastes’ or ‘imprudent choices’ (Korsgaard 1993), rather it is about the question if one suffers from undeserved misfortune or not. Anderson is right in stating that there are cases, which could be very complex and, for this reason, might ‘undermine’ the system of distribution. Life is not simple and one has also to cope with those extreme cases. But this special problem always appears according to penumbra cases, the only way out is trying to make well-informed decisions. Not to distribute extra resources to people, who are in need by virtue of undeserved misfortune, might be the wrong decision.

c. The Objection of Complexity

The objection of complexity, which had been brought into the discussion by Lucas (1965, 1977) and Rescher (1966), could also be found in the first chapter of Walzer’s book ‘Spheres of Justice. A Defence of Pluralism and Equality’ (1983: 3-30). His criticism is powerful and illuminating. The main point against egalitarianism is his assumption that the ‘spheres of justice’ are much more complicated than egalitarians believe. Their assumption that equality is the only – or most important – aim (res. principle) of justice is a false monism. There are, according to the prioritarians, other principles of distribution like the principle of merit or desert, the principle of efficiency, or the principle of qualification, and so forth. Nearly every sphere of conduct has special principles of distribution.

Not ‘all’ egalitarians pursue an improper account of egalitarianism. A sophisticated account of pluralistic egalitarianism is much more harder to attack as a simple travesty. Walzer’s ‘relevant reasons approach’ (or theory of ‘complex equality’) is very suitable with regard to different spheres of justice because his account considers special circumstances of the subjects in question. The main difference between his account and luck egalitarianism is, according to the ‘relevant reasons approach,’ that equality is only a by-product of the fulfilment of complex standards of justice and not the aim of justice. There seems to be no strong argument to support the extreme view, that egalitarianism is bound to the assumption that equality is the only aim of justice and not also a by-product; it just had been taken for granted since Feinberg’s famous paper ‘Noncomparative Justice’ (1974, for a critical discussion on Feinberg’s account, see Kane 1996: 380pp.). The objection of complexity tells us that there is no possibility for egalitarians to use different kinds of principles of distribution without losing their egalitarian track (for example, Krebs 2000: 28p.). This assumption seems to be wrong. Firstly, pluralistic egalitarians are not bound to one principle, only; they could also integrate other principles like the principle of autonomy, the principle of liberty and so on without betraying themselves. Secondly, the idea of equality is not restricted to a simple version of result equality (Gosepath 2003: 276), rather to a sophisticated version of proportional equality, which covers different kinds of principles. Hence, there seems to be a close connection to Walzer’s theory of ‘complex equality,’ although one would rather say that his theory is a non-egalitarian account.

4. Two Egalitarian Arguments

One of the main arguments with regard to the egalitarian view is the presumption of equality argument (Berlin 1955/56; Tugendhat 1997; Gosepath 2001) and the argument of pluralistic egalitarianism (Gordon 2006).

a. The Egalitarians’ Assumption of the Presumption of Equality

What about the egalitarians’ assumption of ‘the presumption of equality’? Isaiah Berlin stated in his famous paper ‘Equality as an Ideal’ (1955/56) that equality does not need any justification, but only inequality does. He gives the following example to make his assumption plausible: If someone has a cake and there are 10 people to be taken into account, than, there is no need of justification, automatically, if every person is getting a tenth part. But, if the distributor is not acting according to the principle of equal distribution, he has to give some special reasons for his decision.

Even if common sense justifies Berlin’s ‘argument,’ one has to take into account that the equal distribution – in the example given by Berlin – has no moral advantage with regard to the unequal distribution. Although Frankfurt hold the same view as Berlin does – that the cake should be divided into ten equal parts – he gives a different justification concerning this distribution. The important point is, so Frankfurt, that the distributor in this example has no special reasons to divide the cake in equal parts nor to divide the cake in unequal parts. In one word, he does not know, whether the people should be treated equally concerning a special respect, which could justify an equal distribution, or vice versa. The distributor has no relevant information at all. There are just few philosophers who give reasons why equality needs no justification, others – as Berlin does – take it for granted and/or call for common sense or intuitions. The famous German philosopher Ernst Tugendhat (1997) claims that only inequality needs special reasons. According to Tugendhat, egalitarianism in the strict sense is not about material equal distribution, but about the simple fact that all people have equal moral rights (5), albeit their empirical differences (10). Prioritarians think that there are good reasons to restrict equality (14). Egalitarianism and prioritarianism are not on the same level, since egalitarians – unlike prioritarians – claim for a special proposition. Prioritarians, so Tugendhat, are not bound to a special proposition; their accounts are unlimited concerning the variety of different ‘Konfigurationen,’ (that is the description of duties and rights of a certain moral community, Tugendhat 1997: 5) and hence, prioritarianism claims not for a certain proposition (11). This is the background, according to Tugendhat, for having the justified believe that there is a certain presumption of equality with regard to inequality in the moral realm, albeit this presumption is very ‘thin,’ but it doubtlessly exists (11). In more detail: Regarding an unequal distribution one gives always some reasons why the distribution should not be equal; one is not able to do so concerning an equal distribution (13, 14). If one accepts Tugendhat’s assumption that the primacy of equality is, lastly, due to the structure of moral justification – according to Tugendhat (1997), ‘moral justification’ means that it is an equal justification with respect to all people. The only case of a legitimate justification of inequality is the case, which could be justified with regard to all people (18). Every just distribution has to be equal, unless one is able to justify the reasons concerning the unequal distribution to all people (19) – and not due to a false understanding of an apriori or a dark notion of reason, one might come to the conclusion that his explication is sound. Of course, there are other accounts of philosophers (for example, Kant’s kingdom of ends, Bentham’s all count as one, Gewirth’s principle of generic consistency, or Boylan’s argument for the moral rights of basic goods), but Tugendhat’s account is by virtue of several reasons particularly interesting and illuminating: firstly, he states that egalitarianism is about moral rights in the strict sense of the notion, secondly, he argues that egalitarianism and prioritarianism are not on the same level, and thirdly, he holds the assumption that the primacy of equality is due to the structure of moral justification.

b. Pluralistic Egalitarianism

The extreme ‘egalitarian’ view that equality – in the special sense of comparative equality – is the only aim of justice is wrong, but the other extreme ‘prioritarian’ view that equality has nothing to do with justice is also wrong. The truth is somewhere in-between. There are, at least, four different aspects, which show that justice and equality are (closely) connected with each other: Firstly, according to prioritarians equality is important as a by-product for the fulfilment of absolute standards, for instance, human dignity. Secondly, relational (res. comparative) equality is one aspect of justice among others; one need relational equality in order to yield, for example, legal equality, equality of chances, or antidiscrimination laws. Thirdly, equality is indispensable in being a joint starting point with regard to political autonomy, social membership, or liberty of exchange because absolute standards presuppose that people’s life prospects are more or less the same. Fourthly, equality is (also) a result of political autonomy insofar as there seem to exist special cases according to which an equal distribution is rightly demanded (for example, the Norwegian public oil reserves).

It seems that the opposition between philosophers who are egalitarians and philosophers who are prioritarians according to Miller (1990) is a false one, and better be ‘understood as a debate about whether one particular kind of equality – economic equality, say – should be pursued or not’ (Miller 1997: 222). He may be right in stating that ‘there are two different kinds of valuable equality, one connected with justice, and the other standing independently’ (Miller 1997: 224). He suggests a so-called third way: ‘Equality of the first kind is distributive in nature. It specifies that benefits of a certain kind – rights, for instance – should be distributed equally, because justice requires this. The second kind of equality is not in this sense distributive. It does not specify directly any distribution of rights or resources. Instead it identifies a social ideal, the ideal of a society in which people regard and treat one another as equals, in other words a society that is not marked by status divisions such that one can place different people in hierarchically ranked categories, in different classes for instance. We can call this second kind of equality equality of status, or simply social equality.’ (Miller 1997: 224). Miller seems right in saying that the two different notions of equality are not closely enough separated in the debate. According to Nagel (1979: chapter 3-6) everybody think that moral equality – or mutatis mutandis ‘social equality’ in Miller’s words – is something all people acknowledge, but the crux is that the interpretations diverge, for instance, with regard to utilitarians (chapter 4), the position of individual rights (chapter 5), and egalitarians (chapter 6). A plausible social ethics, so Nagel, would be influenced by all three accounts (chapter 7). Miller’s assumption that social equality is something that is not part of justice seems premature. Tugendhat seems right in stating that egalitarianism in the strict sense is about moral rights, hence, social equality as such is one part of justice. If one restricts a person’s moral rights, one better give sound reasons why one does not treat her equally according to others, if one is not able to give a plain justification, one treats her unjustly. This has nothing to do with any kind of distributions, although Miller seems to hold the claim that moral rights could also be distributed. Some egalitarians cite Aristotle’s famous propositions that, firstly, it is just that equal people get equal shares and unequal people get unequal shares, and secondly, it is unjust that equal people get unequal shares and unequal people get equal shares (EN V, 6) to back up their main hypothesis that the presumption of equality follows directly from Aristotle’s account of formal equality. It is apparent that they did not analyse the whole context of these propositions. The argument of ‘the presumption of equality’ should not be based on this passage. Instead, the passage could be turned against the prioritarian view that egalitarians are bound to a form of result equality.

‘And the same equality will exist between the persons and between the things concerned; for as the latter – the things concerned – are related, so are the former; if they are not equal, they will not have what is equal, but this is the origin of quarrels and complaints – when either equals have and are awarded unequal shares, or unequals equal shares. Further, this is plain from the fact that awards should be according to merit; for all men agree that what is just in distribution must be according to merit in some sense, though they do not all specify the same sort of merit, but democrats identify it with the status of freeman, supporters of oligarchy with wealth (or with noble birth), and supporters of aristocracy with excellence.’ (Aristotle EN V, 6 1131a20-1131a29)

Aristotle states that there is always trouble if unequals get equal shares, that means, if equals get unequal shares or unequals get equal shares. But, there is no claim in the cited passage, which says that all people should be treated equally (presumption of equality), rather all people should be treated equally according to a special axia, namely the political virtue. According to Aristotle’s account of justice in Book V of the Nicomachean Ethics one has to acknowledge the fact that the proposition ‘equals should get equal shares’ is due to the principle of proportional equality (distributional justice), and should not be seen under the heading of ‘justice in exchanges’ (Aristotle EN V, 5 1131a) – where the principle of arithmetical equality exists – which is about justice concerned with exchanges according to reciprocity (EN V, 8) and retributive justice (EN V, 7). To put it in a nutshell, the formal principle of equality – equals should get equal shares or in a different formula equal cases should be treated equally – is empty, and the prioritarians, on the one hand, are right in saying that egalitarians are wrong in their assumption that the presumption of equality is due to this formal principle. Aristotle’s approach to fill it is his account of proportional equality. On the other hand, there is hardly any sound argument – with respect to the debate between egalitarians and prioritarians – that would claim for the special proposition that egalitarians are restricted to ‘result equality,’ and not also to ‘proportional equality’ within a sophisticated version of pluralistic egalitarianism (for example, Gosepath 2004). Some prioritarians forget the simple point that there are two ways of taking other people’s condition into account, firstly, by proportional equality, and secondly, by stipulating absolute standards of justice.

Equality as the only aim of justice or as a mere by-product of justice is an unhappy distinction to follow. Justice cannot be reduced to equality alone and the importance of equality is too great to be a mere appendage. The prioritarians are right in their criticism that it would be absurd to strive for equality for its own sake; but they forgot that hardly any sophisticated version of egalitarianism is doing so (or would do so). It seems unsound, when people hold the view that all human beings should be treated equally by virtue of the simple fact that the ideal of equality should be fulfilled for its own sake. Instead, the demand of treating people morally equal may give some hints for equal distributions in other spheres (see also Gosepath 2001). But, as Walzer nicely puts it, nearly each sphere needs its own standard, and therefore, it might be right not to choose between the egalitarian or prioritarian view but to combine both accounts. According to this, Gosepath (2001) suggests that proportional equality could be a good basis for a sound discussion between egalitarian and prioritarian theories of justice.

There is a close connection between justice and equality, firstly, a conceptual connection, and secondly, a normative connection. First, equality is a necessary condition for justice, since one is not able to give a full explication on the notion of justice without taking formal and proportional equality into account (see Aristotle EN V). The stipulation of absolute standards of justice, for instance human dignity, is something, which should be incorporated. But it should be clear that the stipulation of absolute standards is not enough, one should also take the egalitarian model into account. Second, in his famous example of a ruler who fries his subjects in oil and, afterwards, also fries himself Frankena (1962: 1 and 17) is stating that the ruler acts immorally but not against the ideal of equality. This is the reason why formal and proportional justices form a necessary but not a sufficient condition. The normative connection between justice and equality tries to solve this problem and acts as a shield against such and alike cases by providing a standard of normative constraints (for example, human rights).

5. Reference and Further Reading

  • Anderson, E. (1999): “What is the Point of Equality?,” in: Ethics, Vol. 109, 287-337.
  • Aristoteles (1990): Ethica Nicomachea, Bywater, I. (Ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Aristotle (1995): Nicomachean Ethics, Ross, W. D./ Urmson, J. O. (trans.), in: Barnes, J. (Ed.): The Complete Works of Aristotle, Vol. II., Princeton: University Press.
  • Arneson, R. (1989): “Equality and Equal Opportunity for Welfare,” in: Philosophical Studies, Vol. 56, 77-93.
  • Arneson, R. (2000): “Luck Egalitarianism and Prioritarianism,” in: Ethics, Vol. 110, 339-349.
  • Barry, B. (1991): Liberty and Justice, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bentham, J. (1996): “An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation,” in: Burns, J.H., Hart, H.L.A. (Ed.): The Collected Works of Jeremy Bentham, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Berlin, I. (1955/56): “Equality as an Ideal,” in: Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Vol. 61, 301-326.
  • Boylan, M. (2004): A Just Society, Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Cohen, G. (1989): “On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice,” in: Ethics, Vol. 99, 906-944.
  • Cupit, G. (2000): “The Basis of Equality,” in: The Journal of the Royal Institute of Philosophy, Vol. 75, 291, 105-125.
  • Dworkin, R. (1981): “What is Equality? Part 1: Equality of Welfare,” in: Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 10, No. 3, 185-246.
  • Dworkin, R. (1981): “What is Equality? Part 2: Equality of Resources,” in: Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 10, No. 4, 283-345.
  • Feinberg, J. (1963): “Justice and Personal Desert,” in: Friedrich, v./ Chapman, J. (Eds.): Justice, New York: Atherton, 69-97.
  • Feinberg, J. (1974): “Noncomparative Justice,” in: Philosophical Review, Vol. 83, No. 3, 297-338.
  • Frankena, W. (1962): “The Concept of Social Justice,” in: Brandt, R. (Ed.): Social Justice, Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall, 1-29.
  • Frankfurt, H. (1987): “Equality as a Moral Ideal,” in: Ethics, Vol. 98, 21-42.
  • Frankfurt, H. (1997): “Equality and Respect,” in: Social Research, Vol. 64, No. 1, 3-15.
  • Gewirth, A. (1981): Reason and Morality, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Gordon, J.-S. (2006): “Justice or Equality?,” in: Journal for Business, Economics & Ethics, Vol. 7 (2), 183-201
  • Gosepath, S. (2001): “Über den Zusammenhang von Gerechtigkeit und Gleichheit,” in: Wingert, L./ Günther, G. (Eds.): Die Öffentlichkeit der Vernunft und die Vernunft der Öffentlichkeit. Festschrift für Jürgen Habermas, Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp, 403-433.
  • Gosepath, S. (2003): “Verteidigung egalitärer Gerechtigkeit,” in: Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie, Vol. 51, 275-297.
  • Gosepath, S. (2004): Gleiche Gerechtigkeit. Grundlagen eines liberalen Egalitarismus, Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp.
  • Hayek, F. A. von (1960): The Constitution of Liberty, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Kane, J. (1996): “Justice, Impartiality, and Equality. Why the Concept of Justice does not Presume Equality,” in: Political Theory, Vol. 24, No. 3, 375-393.
  • Kant, I. (1999): Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Korsgaard, C. (1993): “Commentary on G. A. Cohen and Amartya Sen,” in: Nussbaum, M./ Sen, A. (Eds.): The Quality of Life, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 54-61.
  • Krebs, A. (2000): “Einleitung,” in: Krebs, A. (Ed.): Gerechtigkeit oder Gleichheit. Texte der neuen Egalitariamuskritik, Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp, 7-37.
  • Krebs, A. (2003): “Warum Gerechtigkeit nicht als Gleichheit zu begreifen ist,” in: Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie, Vol. 51, 235-253.
  • Lucas, J. (1965): “Against Equality,” in: Philosophy, Vol. 40, 296-307.
  • Lucas, J. (1977): “Against Equality Again,” in: Philosophy, Vol. 52, 255-280.
  • MacLeod, C. (1998): Liberalism, Justice, and Markets, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mill, J. S. (1972): Utilitarianism, Acton, H. B. (Ed.), London: Dent.
  • Miller, D. (1990): “Equality,” in: Hunt, G. (Ed.): Philosophy and Politics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 77-98.
  • Miller, D. (1997): “Equality and Justice,” in: Ratio: An International Journal of Analytic Philosophy, Vol. 10, No. 3, 222-237.
  • Nagel, T. (1979): “Equality,” in: Nagel, T. (Ed.): Mortal Questions, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 106-127.
  • Parijs, P. van (1991): “Why Surfers Should Be Fed: The Liberal Case for an Unconditional Basic Income,” in: Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 20, 101-131.
  • Parijs, P. van (1995): Real Freedom for All. What (if Anything) Can Justify Capitalism?, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Parfit, D. (1998): “Equality and Priority,” in: Mason, A. (Ed.): Ideals of Equality, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1-20.
  • Pufendorf, S. (1672/1934): De iure naturae et gentium libri octo, Oldfather, C H./ W. A. (transl.): The Law of Nature and Nations Eight Books, Vol. II., Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Rakowski, E. (1991): Equal Justice, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rawls, J. (1971): A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Rawls, J. (1993): Political Liberalism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Raz, J. (1986): The Morality of Freedom, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Rescher, N. (1966): Distributive Justice. A Constructive Critique of the Utilitarian Theory of Distribution, Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • Roemer, J. (1992): “The Morality and Efficiency of Market Socialism,” in: Ethics, Vol. 102, 448- 464.
  • Roemer, J. (1996): Theories of Distributive Justice, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Roemer, J. (1998): Equality of Opportunity, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Sen, A. (1992): Inequality Reexamined, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Tugendhat, E. (1997): “Gleichheit und Universalität in der Moral,” in: Tugendhat, E. (Ed.): Moralbegründung und Gerechtigkeit, Münster: Lit, 3-28.
  • Walzer, M. (1983): Spheres of Justice. A Defence of Pluralism and Equality, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
Ruhr-University Bochum