Robert Nozick: Political Philosophy 

NozickAlthough Robert Nozick did not consider himself to be primarily a political philosopher, he is best known for his contributions to it. Undoubtedly, Nozick’s work in epistemology and metaphysics (especially with respect to free will and the “closest continuer” theory of personal identity) has had a significant impact on those fields. However, it was the publication of his first book, Anarchy, State and Utopia (1974) that revitalized the political right-wing and set off a firestorm of critical replies and commentaries. While Nozick’s accomplishments reach far beyond the confines of political philosophy, it is safe to say that most recognize him for his work on attempting to provide a justification for the state, setting the limits of government, and trying to convince us that accepting his minimal state could foster a framework for a constellation of communities constituting a sort of utopia.

Anarchy, State and Utopia can also be seen as a critical response to John Rawls’ Theory of Justice, which was published just three years earlier and was considered to be the most robust and sophisticated defense of liberal egalitarianism. Although many credit Rawls for single-handedly rekindling interest in political philosophy, this is likely overstated praise. There is little doubt that Nozick’s systematic criticism of Rawls’ theory of justice and establishment of a rival political theory in Anarchy, State and Utopia also played a major role in bring significant attention back to political philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Libertarianism versus Conservatism and Nozick’s Appeal to Capitalists
  3. Anarchy, State and Utopia
    1. An Invisible Hand Justification of the State
    2. Individual Rights and the Nature of the Minimal State
    3. Self-Ownership Argument
    4. Separateness of Persons
    5. The Three Principles of Justice
    6. The Wilt Chamberlain and “Sunset/Yacht Lover” Examples
    7. The Experience Machine
    8. The Lockean Proviso
    9. Utopia
  4. Later Thought on Libertarianism
  5. References and Future Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Robert Nozick was born of Jewish immigrants in Brooklyn, New York in 1938 and died in 2002 of stomach cancer. He was a philosopher of wide-ranging interests who worked in metaphysics, epistemology, decision theory, political philosophy, and value theory more generally. Early in his career, Nozick taught at Princeton and Rockefeller Universities, but he spent the vast majority of his career on the faculty at Harvard. Nozick was unique in his approach to philosophy. While he is most properly thought of as an analytic philosopher, throughout his career he increasingly resisted the usual tactic in the discipline to argue from sure premises to a definite conclusion. Instead, Nozick tried to detail plausible explanatory theories to properly describe phenomena and to provide viable alternatives to conventional wisdom. He thought that the aim of philosophy shouldn’t necessarily be to convince opponents that a particular theory is true. Instead, Nozick saw philosophy as an exploratory venture of making connections between ideas and explaining how things could be as they are. This does not mean that he shirked the responsibility of engaging in rigorous analysis of concepts and when warranted he used technical arguments to make highly sophisticated points. It is also noteworthy that Nozick used work from several disciplines outside of philosophy to enhance his scholarship within it. He incorporated insights from economics, evolutionary biology, Buddhism, and moral psychology to clarify his theoretical work and sometimes ground it in empirical studies.

With respect to political philosophy, Nozick was a right-libertarian, which in short means he accepted the idea that individuals own themselves and have a right to private property. While he argued that the state is legitimate, he thought that only a very scaled-down version that provides security to individuals and protects private property can be justified. Nozick’s version of legitimate government is sometimes called the “nightwatchman” state which underscores what he saw as its essential function: to protect individuals and their private property. This means that to properly respect contracts and resolve property disputes, a judiciary is necessary and with respect to protecting persons and their property, a police force and a military are legitimate and citizens may justifiably be taxed to support these basic functions. However, no more expansive function of the state can be justified according to Nozick, which means that taxation aimed at building funds to be redistributed for welfare purposes (for example, health care, education, poverty relief) are all illegitimate. This is very different from the political theory of his one time Harvard colleague John Rawls. Rawls argued that in addition to protecting the basic liberties, it is legitimate for the state to use its coercive powers (via redistributive taxation) to maximize the position of the least well-off.

2. Libertarianism versus Conservatism and Nozick’s Appeal to Capitalists

What Nozick did share with Rawls is that he was part of the liberal political tradition, which places a premium on the individual and opposes the idea that the state’s function is to make its citizens moral. Instead, for liberals in political theory such as both Rawls and Nozick, the state exists to provide the appropriate conditions for individuals to define the good life for themselves (just so long as they don’t impede the ability of others to do the same). Notice that the labels are a bit confusing here. For political theorists “liberal” refers to the political tradition of Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and Kant. This is different from what “liberal” means in party politics in America (where “liberal” is associated with the Democratic Party).

Once more, while Nozick has been held up as a champion of conservatives in party politics (especially among fiscal ones) at the time of its publication, Anarchy, State and Utopia is best thought of specifically as a right-libertarian tract. In fact, Nozick’s political ideas diverge quite radically from those thought of as “conservative” in political theory. For example, the usual markings of conservatism in political theory include veneration of custom, trust of long standing traditions, and skepticism of wholesale political reform. Conservative political thinkers also usually insist that authority is crucial because it yields societal stability. However, none of these could plausibly be construed as traits of a Nozickian state. Nozick’s political philosophy does not explicitly refer to custom or tradition at all. In fact, if the result of individuals making consensual decisions happens to lead to radical breaks with the customs and traditions of culture, so much the worse for that culture. There would be nothing illegitimate about these consequences in Nozick’s view.

Nozick’s arguments for merely a “nightwatchman” state suggest that there is nothing particularly interesting about authority in his political theory except as it allows for security of citizens and their property. However, if authority is used to curtail individual freedoms in order to fit some pre-ordained set of societal norms, Nozick would have been vehemently opposed to such intrusion of the state into private lives. He was opposed to any sort of paternalistic legislation. For example, Nozick would have criticized laws prohibiting or restricting the riding of motorcycles without helmets on the ground that the state should not have the right to interfere with an individual’s choice to risk serious injury from accidents. Furthermore, Nozick opposed what might be called the “legislation of morality.” For instance, he would have thought it wrongful for the state to interfere with homosexual couples who want to marry and wish to exercise property rights and provisions with respect to domestic partnerships.

Yet, even with that said, it is clear why Nozick appeals to those who are classified as part of the right in party politics (especially in the United States). Again, there is some confusion to be cleared up with respect to labels. Nozick’s views are amenable to some conservatives as they are called in party politics (that is, those members of the Republican Party in the United States who call themselves fiscal conservatives). First of all, Nozick thought that we have robust property rights and borrowing from John Locke he endorsed the notion that we own ourselves. As Nozick famously asserts, “Individuals have rights, and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights)” (Nozick, 1974, ix). Capitalists and/or free market supporters will find this attractive since it means that we can sell our labor to whomever we wish and (more importantly) buy it from whoever will consent. Self-ownership, thought Nozick, means that we own our labor. This also allows for legitimate transfer of goods as we own ourselves and through our actions with other items in the world we justifiably come to own them as well. While Nozick doesn’t use this particular argument, his position is consistent with the capitalist idea that our use and manipulation of properly acquired raw materials also seems to confer value onto these items. Free market advocates endorse much of Locke’s theory of just property acquisition and Nozick, despite recognizing some possible criticisms of this position seems to end up implicitly accepting important components of it.

Furthermore, Nozick’s insistence that one may legitimately transfer her property any way she wishes just so long as no one is coerced or defrauded is very friendly to the views of free market economists. It is significant to note that Nozick thought these transfers to be legitimated without any consideration of whether the recipients deserve the acquisition of goods. While it is true that free market advocates tend to proclaim the idea that entrepreneurs have an additional claim to profits because they deserve them due to effort, contribution to society, and acceptance of risk, they still share with Nozick the fundamental principle that property owners possess absolute property rights. In sum, the implication of robust property rights – that freedom has a great deal to do with what one may do with his or her property without state interference – is a strongly shared notion of Nozick and capitalists.

Another area of agreement between capitalists and Nozick continues the theme of the limited role of governmental action, this time involving a disavowal of redistributive taxation. Nozick thinks individual rights are so strong that his theory will require significant constraints on state action vis-à-vis individuals. For him, the state’s proper purview is protection of persons and their assorted property rights. However, the state is not justified in forced takings of holdings (that is, via taxation) in order to serve the welfare needs of the poor.

In fact, Nozick is both supported (most notably by Edward Feser (2000)) and criticized (most notably by Brian Barry (1975, 332)) for comparing taxation with forced labor. “Taxation of earnings from labor,” argues Nozick, “is on a par with forced labor” (1974, 169).” He adds that “Seizing the results from someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities. If people force you to do certain work, or unrewarded work, for a certain period of time, they decide what you are to do and what purposes your work is to serve apart from your decisions. This process whereby they take this decision from you makes them a part-owner of you; it gives them a property right in you. Just as having such partial control and power of decision, by right, over an animal or inanimate object would be to have a property right in it” (1974, 172).

3. Anarchy, State and Utopia

a. An Invisible Hand Justification of the State

In Anarchy, State and Utopia, Nozick first accepted the task of evaluating of whether government is necessary at all. Notice that Nozick is not merely addressing Rawls in writing Anarchy, State and Utopia. Part of the reason that Nozick became a libertarian was as a result of his discussion while a graduate student with Murray Rothbard. Rothbard not only convinced him of the plausibility of libertarianism, but also of the strength of challenges from anarchists to the idea that any state could be legitimate. Thus, Nozick took anarchist doubts about the legitimacy of the state seriously and thought these concerns needed to be addressed. Additionally, since Nozick commenced with the assertion that individuals have rights, he needed to see if the very notion of a state is compatible with these rights. It is important to note that Nozick believed in Lockean natural rights, and thus he had to show that a legitimate state could arise without the violation of them. What some commentators on Nozick disagree about is why Nozick did not use a social contract type argument (that is, in the tradition of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau) for how a legitimate state could arise.

Some commentators (most forcefully Ralf Bader) do not believe Nozick avoided using a social contract approach to showing how a state could arise because he somehow worried that such an approach is problematic. On this interpretation, Nozick’s goal was not to show how an actual state came about, but that he simply wanted to give a plausible explanatory account of how a legitimate state could come to be (Bader, 2010, 29-30).  Bader notes that Nozick gives what he calls a fundamental potential explanation. A fundamental potential explanation is, as Nozick put it, “an explanation that would explain the whole realm under consideration were it the actual explanation” (Nozick, 1974, 8). But it would also do so with appealing to the realm itself. What this means is that Nozick tried to give an explanation of the political realm in non-political terms. He went to say that an adequate theory of the state of nature would describe “how a state arises from that state of nature will serve our explanatory purposes, even if no actual state arose in that way” (Nozick, 1974, 7). Since Nozick had this explanatory goal, this is part of the reason why he didn’t use a consent-based approach to showing the formation of the state. Using the consent approach, on this interpretation, would be a trivial case because it doesn’t explain the justification of the state in non-political terms and thus would not qualify as a fundamental potential explanation. Nozick didn’t want to simply show that people could agree to form a state, he wanted to reveal that even without their intention, the actions of people would lead to the establishment of a state.

However, other commentators on Nozick’s work (such as Jeffrey Paul) contend that as a natural rights libertarian, Nozick also knew that any argument he made for the justification of the state could not proceed from the approach that there is a social contract to which individuals would need to consent. There are two reasons for this. First of all, the state created via the social contract monopolizes protective services and thus constrains the property rights of those of succeeding generations who were not involved with the negotiations of the original contract. Secondly, in the social contract approach, the state would transfer the power to tax to the majority, which would bind subsequent generations to that power, and thereby would seem to violate Lockean property rights. On this interpretation, while Nozick still desired to give a fundamental potential explanation, he did so because it fits well in addressing anarchist complaints. For all of these substantive reasons, Paul believes that Nozick needed to take an approach that does not follow from social contract theory (J. Paul, 1981, 68).

No matter which interpretation is endorsed, most agree that in effect Nozick proposed a new solution to the very old problem of political legitimacy. His starting point was still a state of nature (just as it was for Locke, Hobbes and Rousseau), understood as the condition people find themselves in when no political authority exists. Nozick began with the question of whether there are any methods of efficient administration of justice within the state of nature. One of his original contributions to the debate over this question was to offer an account of how such a method could arise. In fact, Nozick thought that the method will inevitably result in the creation of a state despite the fact that no one intends to create one. This is known as an invisible hand justification of the state. Nozick proposed that individuals, simply via their pursuit of improving their own conditions will perform actions that will lead to a minimal state. Again, this result comes without anyone intending to found (or perhaps even conceive of) one. Additionally, and perhaps more importantly, Nozick argued that such a conclusion could be reached without violation of anyone’s property rights.

How did Nozick think he answered the anarchists who insist that no state could be legitimate because such an entity inherently violates individual rights? First, we have to more fully understand how he envisioned the anarchists’ main objection to the justifiable formation of a state. The anarchist objection as Nozick saw it involves the idea that the state by its nature monopolizes coercive power and then proceeds to punish those who violate this monopoly. When this notion is combined with the idea that states provide protection for all within a specific geographical area by coercing some to finance the protection of others, there is a violation of “side constraints” that come in the form of natural rights. Therefore, since these actions are performed by the state, and these actions are immoral, the state is immoral. Of course, anarchists think the criticism goes even deeper than this. They complain that these actions flow from what they see as the main, inherent function of the state, not merely as the result of any particular state that happens to violate the rights of individuals.

How exactly did Nozick think the state arises through his invisible hand approach? We have to imagine that we are in a free market state of nature, where individuals possess natural rights. Generally speaking, these individuals are moral actors. However, if some do not act morally (as some likely won’t on some occasions) we would enter into what Nozick called mutual protection agencies. These agencies sell security packages like a free market economic good that individuals in a state of nature would surely buy for self and property protection.

Mutual protection agencies will eventually develop into dominant protection agencies, which are basically the pre-eminent mutual protection agencies within their respective territories. In turn, dominant protection agencies will ultimately become ultra minimal states. An ultra minimal state is a dominant protection agency where protection is still purchased as an economic good but where the agency also has a monopoly on force in the region. The ultra minimal state will evolve into the minimal state, when in addition to having the two factors of the ultra minimal state also makes a “redistribution” of protection to some independents (non-clients of the ultra minimal state) within its territorial boundaries at the cost of the ultra minimal state’s clients.

Nozick regarded this evolution of protection agencies into states as significant because it would provide a moral justification for state legitimacy. First, he believed he had given an account of the legitimacy for the state using only an invisible hand explanation. Notice that for each step, individuals are voluntarily consenting to arrangements that are not necessarily designed to develop a state. Alternatively, private protection agencies are simply negotiating arrangements between its clients and independents in order to keep the peace. Second, Nozick thought this explanation qualifies as a fundamental potential explanation. That is, the invisible hand explanation explains the formation of the state in a nonpolitical way. In sum, Nozick proposed that the state is justified if it can be explained with a fundamental potential explanation that makes use of an invisible hand explanation without making any morally impermissible steps.

To show how this argument is supposed to run, we need to reflect on the right to self-defense, which in Nozick’s view is presumably a natural right that all have. More specifically, however, everyone has a right to resist if others try to enforce upon them unreliable or unfair procedures of justice. Individuals can elect to transfer this right to the dominant protection agency given that they have purchased the proper protection policy. On these grounds the dominant protection agency thereby can acquire the right to intervene and prohibit independents from trying to exact punishment on their clients. So, in cases where individuals consent to transfer these rights to their dominant protection agency, the dominant protection agency has this right and legitimately monopolizes force. At this point the dominant protection agency in effect becomes an ultra minimal state.

It is significant to notice that Nozick believed that clients of dominant protection agencies presumably do not have to show actual violations of their rights by independents to justify punishment of independents who try to enforce unreliable procedures of justice. In turn, he thought that the dominant protection agency, working on behalf of its clients, could legitimately prohibit independents who use unreliable procedures of justice. This is because when independents try to use unreliable procedures of justice they are effectively risking rights violations. In other words, this riskiness alone is all the justification the dominant protection agency needs in order to prevent independents from punishing their clients.

However, Nozick did realize that this transition from the dominant protection agency to the ultra minimal state places those independents in its territory at a disadvantage. In effect, independents are being prohibited from defending themselves or enforcing their right to punish wrongdoing. It seems that if one is disadvantaged by being prohibited from committing a risky action (that is, is kept from committing the potentially risky activity of applying a procedure of justice that is unreliable) he or she must be compensated for the said disadvantage. This compensation can come in the form of money or “in kind” services. In this case, Nozick thought it would be most feasible for the ultra minimal state to simply offer services instead of money to those disadvantaged by its monopoly of force. At this stage when the ultra minimal state provides protective services to the disadvantaged it thereby transforms into a minimal state.

In order to try to buttress his position for the legitimacy of the minimal state, Nozick provides a second strand of argument. He sets out to explain why, if the client of the ultra minimal state is actually guilty of violating the rights of an independent, the independent still doesn’t have a legitimate case for exacting punishment on the client of the ultra minimal state. After all, everyone else appears to have the right to punish wrongdoers when actual rights violations occur, so why shouldn’t the independent also have this right? In essence, Nozick had to try to justify the dominant protection agency’s prohibition of victims of rights violations by their clients from defending themselves and using their rights of punishment.

Again recall that Nozick thought no one has the right to use an unreliable procedure (or at least one of unproven reliability) to determine whether or not to punish anyone. He contended that it doesn’t matter whether we say a person does not have a right to do something in the absence of appropriate knowledge of wrongdoing or that she has the right but does wrong by using it in the absence of such knowledge. As it turns out, Nozick opts to use the latter expression which allows him to put forth what he calls the Epistemic Principle of Border Crossing. Nozick described this principle as the idea that if someone knows that doing act A would violate Q’s rights unless condition C obtained, he may not do A if he has not ascertained that C obtains through being in the best feasible position for ascertaining this.

Nozick believed that anyone may punish those who violate this principle, just so long as she does not violate the principle herself in the process. With this said, the independent who is being prohibited from exercising punishment ought to be prohibited because she is about to use a procedure that has not been proven reliable. That is, condition C has not been fulfilled and by attempting to exact punishment would be in violation of the Epistemic Principle of Border Crossing. So, in this way, the dominant protection agency is justified in opposing the action of the independent or in punishing the independent if she does carry on punishing its (admittedly guilty) client. Also notice that Nozick tries to deflect the charge from anarchists that granting independents protection regardless of the ability to pay is a form of redistribution of resources and hence a rights violation. Nozick is careful to point out that this action is a form of compensation to independents for effectively disallowing them the right to punish.

b. Individual Rights and the Nature of the Minimal State

As noted earlier, Nozick begins Anarchy, State and Utopia with the assertion that “individuals have rights.” He never defended this proposition, but its intuitive appeal is supposed to be widely shared. Nozick even admitted that he didn’t have a bedrock foundation for individual rights. Once more, he surveyed a number of candidate reasons for why individuals possess rights and found them, taken individually anyhow, to be wanting. He noted that moral agency, free will, and rationality in themselves are not sufficient to ground rights and serve as the moral foundation for his theory. For instance, he explained that the possession of free will, by itself, doesn’t imply that a being ought to act freely.

While Nozick had no structured argument for the notion that individuals possess rights, he did still think that there are reasons in favor of it. He concluded that some combination of the characteristics above constitute something closer to a moral ground for rights. He attempted to ground the intuition that individuals have rights in the idea that each individual has unique value. Only humans have the rational capacity to choose, devise, and pursue projects unlike non-human animals and commodities.

It bears mentioning that what it means to respect people as equals for Nozick draws on the work of Immanuel Kant. Kant thought that we show proper respect for persons when we treat them as ends in themselves. That is, we should treat others as having goals and projects of their own and we mustn’t use them merely as instruments to get what we want. Humans can deliberate about which behaviors will allow them to reach their goals and can only be used in a way that respects that rational capacity. This also means that people cannot be used in any way without their consent.

The individual rights that people possess amount to moral side constraints on what can be done to them. The only condition that could allow for the violations of such side constraints would be if this were the only way to “avoid catastrophic moral horror.” Barring such a dramatic condition, this means that the rights of individuals are not to be ‘traded in’ even if this means gains for the entire society. But why it is so important that individual rights to self and property are not violated could be further explained by the idea that individuals need the space to make their lives meaningful: “I [Nozick] conjecture that the answer [to the question as to what grounds rights] is connected with that elusive and difficult notion: the meaning of life.” Nozick went on to say that the ability of one to shape his life in accordance with some sort of life plan is the very way one brings meaning to his life. This offers another perspective from which we can understand why human life is uniquely valuable. Only beings with the rational capacity to shape their own lives can have or even pursue a meaningful life.

c. Self-Ownership Argument

Nozick attempted to demonstrate the intuition that only free market exchanges respect persons as equals. To do this Nozick developed his “entitlement theory of justice.” To make this clear, we have to start with what might be called his self-ownership argument. Nozick’s self-ownership argument essentially goes like this. 1) People own themselves. This is based on the intuition Nozick supplies above. 2) The world and its objects are originally unowned. 3) One can acquire an absolute right to a disproportionate share of the world if this doesn’t worsen the material condition of others. Furthermore, since Nozick thought each owns herself, each will also own her talents. He reasoned that this also translates into ownership of the products of those talents. The entity that owns and is owned is the same entity, the whole person. With this stipulation, Nozick understood individuals as having absolute property rights over themselves, and once more, absolute property rights over the resources they acquire. 4) It is relatively easy to acquire property rights over a disproportionate amount of the world. 5) Therefore, once private property has been appropriated, a free market in goods and resources is morally required.

d. Separateness of Persons

An important related strand that runs in various ways throughout all of Anarchy, State and Utopia is the “separateness of persons.” As noted earlier, Nozick used Kant as an inspiration and borrowed Kant’s idea that individuals are ends in themselves. But, in order to be different “ends-in-themselves,” Kant observed that people must be separate entities. The idea is the each of us is a distinct individual, each mattering from a moral point of view. This view that individuals, like distinct atoms, are self-contained entities in some ways evokes Hobbes’ metaphysical picture of human existence. An implication of the notion that individuals matter morally is that benefits to some supposed larger entity, such as the “greater society,” cannot be used as a justification for violating individuals as persons. Consider what is often called “the common good.” Nozick challenged the idea that any such entity could really exist. In his view, there are merely individuals, and the common good can only really be the good of these individuals added together. While it is true that some individuals might make sacrifices of some of their interests in order to gain benefits for some other of their interests, society can never be justified in sacrificing the interests of some individuals for the sake of others.

The separateness of persons doctrine is important to Nozick insofar as he thought it supports the existence of moral side-constraints that individuals possess. Moral side constraints set the boundaries for what can permissibly be done to people (whether by other individuals or the state). Violations of such side constraints are wrongful because this treats individuals who suffer the violations merely as means or as instruments to the ends of other people. Notice that these side constraints are supposed to be understood as absolute prohibitions on what can permissibly be done to individuals. That is, even if we thought that violation of the moral side-constraint of just one person could be to the benefit of many others within the society, such a violation could not be justified.

In trying to describe what exactly moral side constraints are perhaps the most obvious prohibition that would follow from them would be any sort of physical aggression. But the very existence of a state seems to suggest coercion of individuals is permissible in some circumstances. As a consequence, Nozick needed to carefully argue that at least one possible function of the state, redistributive taxation, is a form of coercion that is not legitimate for a state to exercise.

e. The Three Principles of Justice

Nozick argued that there are three principles of just distribution. These principles make up the basic framework of his entitlement theory.

The first is the principle of just acquisition. Under this principle, individuals may acquire any property they wish just so long as it is previously unowned and is not taken by theft, coercion or fraud. The second is the principle of just transfer whereby property may be exchanged just so long as the transfer is not executed (again) by theft, force or fraud. These two principles constitute the legitimate means of acquiring and transferring goods. All valid transactions come from repeated actions on these two principles. While Nozick did not explicitly define what is now known as his third principle, he described its function. This third principle – just rectification – works, as the name suggests, to rectify violations of the first two principles.

What actions on these three principles reflect is what Nozick calls a “historical” theory of justice. He thought there was no way, simply by looking at the patterns of distribution that we could tell whether or not these distributions of goods are just. Nozick emphasized that we have to know exactly how the distribution came about. If somewhere in the chain of transactions theft, coercion or fraud occurred, then we could safely say that the property involved is unjustly held. The three principles of just distribution thereby regulate proper property acquisition and exchange.

As alluded to earlier, the entitlement theory of justice does not depend on the concept of just desert (reward) in order to validate the acquisition or transfer of property. For example, consider the principle of just transfer. One implication of this principle is that inheritance is perfectly legitimate. It is irrelevant from the perspective of the entitlement theory that the scions of billionaires may not have worked hard or contributed in any way to their parents’ fortunes. Moreover, it is not germane to the entitlement theorist that the benefactor of the inheritance is morally upstanding or somehow has made great contributions to society. Finally, it doesn’t matter that the scion’s being a part of billionaire family is morally arbitrary – that there is no sense of thinking that he is somehow undeserving of inheritance because he didn’t “make his way” into the family . If the billionaire wishes to gift the family fortune to the ne’er-do-well son, the son is entitled to that inheritance. The idea that just holdings for Nozick are not dependent on desert is an important consideration given that many free market advocates have tried to justify accumulation of enormous amounts of wealth based on the desert of those acquiring it. Common notions of desert appeal to the concepts of effort, innovation, contribution or merit in attempting to justify why some should have more than others. But Nozick saw the strained arguments used for the justification of property holdings on the basis of desert. For Nozick, desert is beside the point. But more importantly, desert theory cannot be justified as the basis for the justification of property holdings on his view because it is a patterned theory (more on this below).

The state then can be seen as an institution that serves to protect private property rights and the transactions that follow from them regardless of our thoughts of some people deserving more or less than they have. This function is fulfilled via preservation of the three principles of distribution. This means that the state functions to secure individuals’ safety and their goods, which presumably could be threatened by forces within or from outside of one’s territory. For security within the state, this necessitates a civil police force. For security from threats outside of the territory, the need is for a standing army. Provisions for these functions are legitimate concerns of the Nozickian state. In addition, given the third principle of distributive justice in Nozick’s scheme, there will need to be a judiciary. This is due to the practical matter that there will likely be disagreements over the status of contracts, whether they have been enacted properly, and whether allegations of personal or property rights violations have occurred. Somebody needs to adjudicate these conflicts, and the most effective means (according to Nozick) is through tort law proceedings. Also, the courts are to function in perhaps a more obvious way given the principle of rectification – to ensure that holdings are restored to their rightful owners in cases where justice in acquisition and justice in transfer principles are violated. An implication of all of this is that the state is within its right to demand tax monies to support these functions.

f. The Wilt Chamberlain and “Sunset/Yacht Lover” Examples

Nozick devises an imaginative example using an actual former professional basketball player (Wilt Chamberlain) to criticize what he calls “patterned” theories of justice. Patterned theories of justice are those whereby the distribution of holdings is considered to be just when there is some purpose or goal reached. For example, radical egalitarians argue that the most just distribution of goods and resources is one in which these items are equally shared across a society. Utilitarianism is another example of a patterned theory since all goods are justly distributed when they maximize the overall good of a society. Finally, John Rawls’ theory of justice would be considered to be a patterned theory because goods may only be distributed in the case that transfers benefit the least well-off members of society. What all of these theories share is that distributions of goods will only be declared just when they conform to a pattern stipulated by a favored principle of justice.

To argue against patterned theories of just distribution, Nozick wanted to show that patterns can only be imposed by either disallowing acts that disrupt the pattern (or as Nozick puts it, to “forbid capitalist acts between two adults”) or to constantly redistribute goods in order to reset the pattern. Nozick tried to demonstrate the truth of two propositions. The first is that if individuals have acquired their holdings justly, then the free exchange of them with others (provided no theft, fraud or coercion are involved) are just. The second proposition is supposed to result from the first. It holds that free exchanges will always conclude in disrupting alleged patterns of just distribution. But it seems that if we have ownership of property legitimately, we can dispose of it in any way we wish no matter what distribution of goods results. Nozick certainly realized that allowing individuals to exchange their goods without any patterning principle would lead to extreme inequalities of resources. However, he thought any measures to “correct” for such inequalities by governmental intervention would be unjust.

In the Wilt Chamberlain example, Nozick has us imagine a society that has the reader’s favorite distribution of resources. For the sake of argument, we’ll say that there are one million and one members and all have equal shares – we’ll call this distribution D1. We are also to imagine that Wilt signs a contract with a team with the stipulation that for each home game he gets 25 cents from the price of every ticket sold. As the season goes on, imagine that each person in the society gladly contributes 25 cents to see Wilt perform. After a million fans come to see him play, he has made $250,000. Therefore, there will be a new distribution, D2, in which Wilt has his original resources plus $250,000. Excluding all other transactions, we can assume that all others in society have much less than Wilt. Nozick asks if there is anything unjust about this example and if there is anything unjust, what could be the reason? Since each person agreed to D1, each person should be entitled to his or her share. This also means that each individual may choose to do with his resources what he likes and many have decided to give some to Wilt. Obviously D1 and D2 are not the same. However, D2 came from what we agreed was a just distribution plus a number of free exchanges. So, D2 is just, but D2 violates the pattern in D1 in which each is supposed to remain on the same level of resources.

Nozick’s first point is that allowing individuals the liberty to exchange their goods as they wish, given that they have fully consented to the transfers will clearly (and continually) disrupt the pattern of holdings. Notice that if you agree with Nozick that no injustice is done in the steps of forming the new set of holdings in D2, there is nothing unjust about D2. But what if one wants to re-establish D1? Notice what Nozick thinks would have to happen in this case. In order to realign the pattern of holdings, some entity (most likely the state) would need to intervene. That is, if D1 was that all had equal holdings and now at D2 we realize we want to revert to D1, we would have to take a portion of the holdings from those who have more to give to those who have less. But, here is the problem: What if those who have greater holdings in D2 do not want to give up their holdings, protesting that they had acquired them justly? If the state takes a portion of holdings away, how is this different from Robin Hood doing the same thing? Isn’t this merely a form of theft?

With the Wilt Chamberlain example in place, this provided Nozick with the opportunity to bolster his argument against patterned theories. He emphasized the point that preserving patterns will often necessitate redistributing goods through taxation from those who have to those who have not and that this is not an innocuous result. In effect, this redistribution results in forced labor. After all, Nozick pointed out, what do taxes represent? Certainly, money is taken, but Nozick argued that “seizing the results of someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities.” In essence, Nozick thought that this is tantamount to forcing someone to work for an amount of time for proposes he has not chosen. Patterned principles in effect give some people a claim to the labor of other people. Nozick believed this translates into a transgression of self-ownership as the enforceable claim of some on the labor of others amounts to the partial ownership of some people by others.

There is another problem here as well. Nozick also worried that the degree of interference in peoples’ lives will vary depending on their different chosen lifestyles in a way that is discriminatory against certain people. He wondered why people shouldn’t have the right to choose their own lifestyles provided that they are not making others worse off than they would have been in a state of nature? Nozick objected that individuals who have more materialistic interests are required to work longer hours than those with more aesthetic lifestyles. He questioned why the person who wishes to “see a movie” must be required (since he must earn money for the movie ticket) to provide “money for the needy” while those who prefer to look at sunsets (who don’t need to earn money to enjoy them) do not? The point Nozick was trying to make is that if owning a luxury yacht is what makes me happy, I will have to work much longer than someone who simply likes sunsets. The person who likes sunsets doesn’t need money to enjoy them – he can pursue his happiness and meet his tax obligations to the state with limited labor time. However, I may need to work six extra months to have enough to purchase the yacht and meet my tax obligations to the state. Not only do I need the principle amount of money for the purchase, I am also taxed to provide for social programs. In this scenario, Nozick wonders why the yacht lover, simply because of his lifestyle, has to work six months to acquire what he wants and pay his taxes, as opposed to the sunset lover, who needs to work much less to achieve these same ends.

g. The Experience Machine

While the Wilt Chamberlain and sunset/yacht lover examples may take aim at any sort of patterned theory (though it was most likely targeted at Rawls’ theory of justice), Nozick uses yet another creative example to argue against classical utilitarianism. He has us imagine a machine developed by “super duper neuropsychologists” into which one could enter and have any sort of experience she desires. A person’s brain could be stimulated so she would think and feel that she was reading a book, writing a great novel, or climbing Mt.Everest. But all of the time the person would simply be floating in a tank with electrodes attached to her head. If one worries that she would get bored by a life of pleasant circumstances, there is nothing that disallows her from simply having problematic events programmed in to keep things interesting. As this is a thought experiment, and Nozick doesn’t want readers to be distracted by details that don’t force them to test their intuitions, we are to imagine that the machine is reliable, in fact unbreakable, so these would not be technical or trivial reasons to fail to enter. Nozick asks the reader if she would enter the machine.

Nozick thought we would not enter, concluding that people would follow his intuition that such programmed experiences are not real. He argued that people don’t merely want to experience certain actions, but that they want to actually do them. Nozick suspects that we wouldn’t enter the machine because we don’t merely wish to experience being famous, but we want to be certain types of people who do certain types of thing. For example, I don’t merely want to experience that I am a great novelist, I want to genuinely be a great novelist.

In what way is the intuition we are supposed to gain from the experience machine a criticism of classical utilitarianism? The idea is the fundamental value underlying utilitarianism as classically described by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill is that happiness is the highest and only intrinsic good. That is, happiness is the good for whose sake all other goods are pursued. Presumably the initial allure of entering into Nozick’s machine would be the promise of acquiring pleasure. However, the unwillingness to ultimately enter seems to signify that we want something else beyond happiness in our lives, whether that is reality or genuineness. Hence, it appears that happiness is not the highest good. Though this appears to strike a significant blow against classical utilitarianism, it doesn’t seem to affect other forms of utilitarianism such as preference utilitarianism. Preference utilitarians could claim that people might not go into the machine not because they care about values other than happiness more, but because they prefer to experience happiness only via some means that involve actively pursuing happiness and not merely experiencing it. Furthermore, they might see happiness in a complex way whereby they don’t merely desire “brute” pleasure, but want a nuanced sort of happiness.

h. The Lockean Proviso

Are there any limits to how many more resources some may own over others assuming that the distribution of holdings came about in a just way, even on Nozick’s view? There is one (albeit loose) constraint – the Lockean Proviso. While Nozick did not accept the entire Lockean theory of property, he does utilize components of it and retrofits them for his own use in his theory of entitlement. One of the famous constraints on property accumulation from Locke; is that one may own property just so long as he has left “enough and as good” for others. This prevents the monopolization of goods that are necessary for life. For instance, owning the only remaining water well would not be permitted under the terms of the proviso.

However, Nozick re-interprets the proviso to mean that if the initial acquisition fails to make anyone worse off who was using the resource before, then it is justly acquired. That is, in Nozick’s interpretation of the proviso, the position of others after the acquisition cannot be made worse off than they were when the property in question was unowned. Of course, this rendering of the proviso means that someone could appropriate all of a good, just so long as they allowed access to it to those who were using the resource before and that this appropriation does not make them worse off materially than they were before. This alternative rendering of the Lockean proviso leaves only an extremely limited constraint on the accumulation of resources. Hence, it would seem that even with the amended Lockean proviso adding some qualification to the acquisition of resources, Nozick’s entitlement theory would still allow for rather dramatic inequality of holdings throughout a libertarian society.

i. Utopia

The third and final part of Anarchy, State and Utopia deals with the topic of utopia and is generally thought to be the section of the book that receives the least amount of attention. Many scholars have noted that this section seems to serve as Nozick’s attempt to make what seems to be a very bleak picture of property rights (in which the poor are left being aided only by the discretion of private benefactors) into a potentially inspiring political model. But a second purpose of this section is likely to provide an independent argument for the minimal state.

Nozick begins the section by noting that we could use two different methods for figuring out what is the best sort of society to live in. One method he calls a “design” method and the other he dubs a “filter” method. By a design method Nozick had in mind the idea of people brainstorming about what the best sort of society might be (for example, Rawls’ method in A Theory of Justice). Then, the group could pattern a single society based on the desiderata arising from these deliberations. However, Nozick was skeptical about the viability of this model to yield successful results. He didn’t think that it is possible for there to be just one best form of society for everyone. Human beings are complex, with lots of different ideas about what traits would adhere to the best possible world. To make this point, Nozick has us imagine a bevy of different historical figures (including Beethoven, Wittgenstein, Henry Ford, Thoreau, Elizabeth Taylor, and Moses). Nozick challenges us to consider whether there could really be any one ideal world for all of these very different individuals. In the least, Nozick says that it is highly unlikely that even if there were one ideal society for all, that it could be determined in “an a priori fashion.”

Instead, he turns to the possibility of using a filtering device and promotes the idea of a sort of meta-utopia. In this filtering method, people consider many different societies and critique them, eliminating some and modifying others. In this process, we can imagine people trying out societies as a sort of experiment, leaving those they find hopeless or altering those they could find acceptable with some tinkering. As we might expect, some communities will simply be abandoned, others will flourish, and some will continue on but not without struggles. So, this meta-utopia would serve as a framework or platform for many diverse experimental communities. These would all be formed as voluntary communities, whereby no one would have the right to impose one utopian vision on the others. This effectively disallows “imperialistic” communities that may take as their mission to gain control of other communities for its own expansion. Some commentators have likened this anti-imperialistic clause in Nozick’s framework of utopia to a version of cultural relativism.

The point of Nozick’s framework for utopia is that consenting citizens could band together into political subunits and voluntarily select from any number of different societies to join. For example, those sympathetic with trade unionists could elect to develop a community where ownership groups consisted only of workers. In fact, Nozick was surprised that this sort of arrangement had not already evolved from vocal members of the political left who argue that the only just notion of property is one held by all in a classless society. A different subgroup which collectively decides that a strong welfare safety net is essential could vote to tax themselves at a high level in order to redistribute goods to help out the least fortunate via extensive rights to health care, child care, unemployment assistance, and so forth.

Nozick thought that following his political principles could lead to a vast array of different political entrepreneurships. All that is required is that one (or many) recruit fellow members to join into an association of likeminded citizens who all voluntarily agree to follow the stipulations of their new community. Notice that there is no violation of rights here. Just so long as all agree to the rules of the group, they could agree to form a society that looks much like the social democracies of Scandinavia. Likewise, it seems possible that individuals could join to form quite illiberal communities. The minimal requirements involve the idea that no one can be forced or deceived into joining. Additionally, if one is disenchanted with his/her current political association, he or she must have a right to exit.

Some commentators have thought that for the sake of clarity, it would be best to think of Nozick’s utopian vision here in a federalist fashion. The minimal state would serve as a replacement for the federal government. Smaller political entities, such as states or provinces could be developed which would consist of groups of citizens who voluntarily (but unanimously) agree to their own separate sets of political ideals. Additionally, reflecting on the best method for allowing individuals to achieve their own utopian aspirations leads us to a separate argument for the minimal state. For if we agree with Nozick that the filtering method is the best way for individuals to realize their utopian dreams, they should endorse his conception of a minimal state. After all, what is the framework for utopia but a minimal state? Notice that in the final section of Anarchy State and Utopia, the minimal state is not justified on the grounds of individual rights. Instead, the minimal state here provides a political framework that respects diversity and allows different individuals to pursue their own conceptions of the good. Nozick thinks that this should be considered as a major advantage to endorsing libertarian principles as a platform or framework for political organization.

4. Later Thought on Libertarianism

Famously, Nozick largely abandons work in political philosophy after the publication of Anarchy, State and Utopia. He mentions in Socratic Puzzles that he had no interest in defending his libertarian views in political theory from its critics by writing “Son of Anarchy, State and Utopia” or “Return of the Son of Anarchy.” However, in The Examined Life, Nozick did indicate that he had strayed away from libertarianism. On the other hand, the details for this turn are thin and somewhat mysterious. Nozick said that he did not mean to work out his own alternative to libertarianism later in life and only points out what he viewed as a major failure of the theory

He notes that libertarianism is seriously inadequate, partially because the theory does not “fully knit the humane considerations and joint cooperative activities it left room for more closely into its fabric” (that is, a communitarian or Aristotelian analysis). Apparently he also thought that somehow the theory did not take into account sufficiently the “symbolic” importance of some collective actions. He acknowledges that there are some goals citizens wish to achieve through the means of government as an expression of our human solidarity and perhaps of human respect in itself. Some commentators have noted that we shouldn’t interpret these reservations as a wholesale abdication of libertarianism. In an interview late in his life Nozick explained that his turn away from libertarianism was largely exaggerated, adding that he still endorsed the theory but was no longer a “hard core” follower.

5. References and Future Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
  • Nozick, Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1981.
  • Nozick, Robert. Socratic Puzzles. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1997.
  • Nozick, Robert. The Examined Life. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1989.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Althan, J.E.J. Review of Anarchy, State and Utopia. Philosophy. Vol. 52, no. 199 (1977), pp. 102-105.
  • Bader, Ralf. Robert Nozick. London, Continuum Press, 2010.
  • Bakaya, Santosh. The Political Theory of Robert Nozick. Delhi, India: Gyan Books, 2006.
  • Barry, Brian. Review of Anarchy, State and Utopia by Robert Nozick. Political Theory, Vol. 3, No. 3 (1975), pp. 331-336.
  • Brighouse, Harry. Justice. Cambridge, U.K.: Polity Press, 2004.
  • Cohen, G.A. Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality. (Cambridge, U.K.: CambridgeUniversity Press, 1995.
  • Exdell, John. Distributive Justice: Nozick on Property Rights. Ethics, Vol. 87, No. 2 (1977), pp. 142-149.
  • Feser, Edward. Taxation, Forced Labor, and Theft. The Independent Review, Vol. 2, No. 2 (2000), pp. 219-235.
  • Fried, Barbara. Wilt Chamberlain Revisited: Nozick’s ‘Justice in Transfer’ and the Problem of Market-Based Distribution. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 24, No. 3 (1995), pp. 226-245.
  • Hailwood, Simon A. Exploring Nozick. Aldershot, UK: Avebury, 1996.
  • Holmes, Robert. Nozick on Anarchism. Political Theory, Vol. 5, No.2 (1977), pp. 247-256.
  • Lacey, A.R. Robert Nozick. Princeton, NJ: PrincetonUniversity Press, 2001.
  • Litan, Robert. On Rectification in Nozick’s Minimal State. Political Theory, Vol. 5, no. 2 (1977), pp. 233-246.
  • Kearl, J.R. Do Entitlements Imply that Taxation is Theft? Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 7, no. 1 (1977), pp. 74-81.
  • Kymlicka, Will. Contemporary Political Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Machan, Tibor. Some Recent Work in Human Rights Theory. American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 17, No. 2 (1980), pp. 103-115.
  • Murray, Dale. Nozick, Autonomy and Compensation. London: Continuum Press, 2007.
  • Otsuka, Michael. Self-Ownership and Equality: A Lockean Reconciliation. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 27, no.1 (1998), pp. 65-92.
  • Paul, Ellen Frankel. Natural Rights Liberalism from Locke to Nozick. Cambridge, UK: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2005.
  • Paul, Jeffrey. Reading Nozick. Totawa, NJ: Rowman & Littlefield, 1981.
  • Rigterink, Roger. Robert Nozick: Anarchy, State and Utopia. (Unpublished essay, 2007).
  • Sandel, Michael. Liberalism and its Critics. New York: New YorkUniversity Press, 1984.
  • Scanlon, Thomas. Nozick on Rights, Liberty, and Property. Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 6, No. 1 (1976), pp. 3-25.
  • Schmidtz, David. Robert Nozick. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2002.
  • Sterba, James. Recent Work on Alternative Conceptions of Justice. American Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 23, No. 1 (1986), pp. 1-22.
  • Wolff, Jonathan. Robert Nozick: Property, Justice, and the Minimal State. Stanford, CA: StanfordUniversity Press, 1991.

Author Information

Dale Murray
University of Wisconsin-Baraboo/Sauk County
University of Wisconsin-Richland
U. S. A.