Logical Paradoxes

paradox_logicalA paradox is generally a puzzling conclusion we seem to be driven towards by our reasoning, but which is highly counterintuitive, nevertheless. There are, among these, a large variety of paradoxes of a logical nature which have teased even professional logicians, in some cases for several millennia. But what are now sometimes isolated as “the logical paradoxes” are a much less heterogeneous collection: they are a group of antinomies centered on the notion of self-reference, some of which were known in Classical times, but most of which became particularly prominent in the early decades of last century. Quine distinguished amongst paradoxes such antinomies. He did so by first isolating the “veridical” and “falsidical” paradoxes, which, although puzzling riddles, turned out to be plainly true, or plainly false, after some inspection. In addition, however, there were paradoxes which “produce a self-contradiction by accepted ways of reasoning,” and which, Quine thought, established “that some tacit and trusted pattern of reasoning must be made explicit, and henceforward be avoided or revised.” We will first look, more broadly, and historically, at several of the main conundrums of a logical nature which have proved difficult, some since antiquity, before concentrating later on the more recent troubles with paradoxes of self-reference. They will all be called “logical paradoxes.”

Table of Contents

  1. Classical Logical Paradoxes
  2. Moving to Modern Times
  3. Some Recent Logical Paradoxes
  4. Paradoxes of Self-Reference
  5. A Contemporary Twist
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Classical Logical Paradoxes

The four main paradoxes attributed to Eubulides, who lived in the fourth century BC, were “The Liar,” “The Hooded Man,” “The Heap,” and “The Horned Man” (compare Kneale and Kneale 1962, p114).

The Horned Man is a version of the “When did you stop beating your wife?” puzzle. This is not a simple question, and needs a carefully phrased reply, to avoid the inevitable come-back to “I have not.” How is one to understand this denial, as saying you continue to beat your wife, or that you once did but do so no longer, or that you never have, and never will? It is a question of what the “not,” or negation means, in this case. If “stopped beating” means “beat before, but no longer,” then “not stopped beating” covers both “did not beat before” and “continues to beat.” And in that case “I haven’t” is an entirely correct answer to the question, if you in fact did not beat your wife. However, your audience might still need to be taken slowly through the alternatives before they clearly see this. Likewise with the Horned Man, which arises if someone wants to say, for instance, “what you have not lost you still have.” In that case they will maybe have to accept the unwelcome conclusion “I still have horns,” if they admit “I have not lost any horns.” Here, if “lost” means “had, but do not still have” then “not lost” would cover the alternative “did not have in the first place” as well as “do still have” — in which case what you have not lost you do not necessarily still have.

The Heap is nowadays commonly referred to as the Sorites Paradox, and concerns the possibility that the borderline between a predicate and its negation need not be finely drawn. We would all say that a man with no hairs on his head was bald, and that a man with, say, 10,000 hairs on his head was hirsute, that is not bald, but what about a man with only 1,000 hairs on his head, which are, say, evenly spread? It is not too clear what we should say, although maybe some would still want to say positively “bald,” while others would want to say “not bald.” The learned treatment of this issue, in recent years, has been very extensive, with “the lazy solution” not being the only one favoured, by any means. The lazy solution says that any lack of certainty about what to say is merely a matter of us not having yet decided upon, or even having the need to make up our mind about, a “precisification” of the concept of baldness. There are objectors to this “epistemic” way of seeing the matter, some of whom would prefer to think, for instance (see, e.g. Sainsbury 1995), that there was something essentially “fuzzy” about baldness, so it is a “vague predicate” by the nature of things, instead of just through lack of effort, or need. (For recent work in this area, see, for instance, Williamson 1994, and Keefe 2001).

The Hooded Man is about the concept of knowledge, and in other versions has again been much studied in recent years, as we shall see. In its original version the problem is this: maybe you would be prepared to say that you know your brother, yet surely someone might come in, who was in fact your brother, but with his head covered, so you did not know who it was. One aspect of this paradox is that the verb “know” is ambiguous, and in fact is translated by two separate terms in several other languages than English — French, for instance, has “connâitre” and “savoir.” There is the sense of “being acquainted with,” in other words, and the sense of “knowing a fact about something.” Perhaps these two senses are inter-related, but distinguishing them provides one way out of the Hooded Man. For we can distinguish being acquainted with your brother from knowing that someone is your brother. Although you do not know it, you are certainly acquainted with the hooded man, since he is your brother, and you are acquainted with your brother. But that does not entail that you know that the hooded man is your brother, indeed, evidently you do not. We could also say, in that case, that you did not recognize your brother, for the notion of recognition is close to that of knowledge. And that points to another aspect of the problem, and another way of resolving the paradox — showing, in addition, that there needn’t just be one solution, or way out. Thus you might well be able to recognise your brother, but that does not require you can always do so, it merely means you can do better at this than those people who cannot do so. If we re-phrase the case: “you can recognise your brother, but you did not recognise him when he had his head covered,” then there is not really a paradox.

The last of Eubulides’ paradoxes mentioned above was The Liar, which is perhaps the most famous paradox in the “self-reference” family. The basic idea had several variations, even in antiquity. There was, for instance, The Cretan, where Epimenides, a Cretan, says that all Cretans are liars, and The Crocodile, where a crocodile has stolen someone’s child, and says to him “I will return her to you if you guess correctly whether I will do so or not” — to which the father says “You will not return my child”! Indeed a whole host of complications of The Liar have been constructed, especially in the last century, as we shall see. Now in The Cretan there is no real antinomy — it may simply be false that all Cretans are liars; but if someone says just “I am lying,” the situation is different. For if it is true that he is lying then seemingly what he says is false; but if it is false that he is lying then what he is saying may seem to be true. A pedant might say that “lying” was strictly not telling an untruth, but telling merely what one believes to be an untruth. In that case there is not the same difficulty with the person’s remark being true: maybe he is indeed lying, although he does not believe it. The pedant, however, misses the point that his verbal nicety can be circumvented, and the paradox re-constructed in another, indeed many other forms. We shall look in more detail later at the paradox here, in some of its more complicated versions.

Before leaving the ancients, however, we can look at Zeno’s Paradoxes, which not only have a logical interest in their own right, but also have a very close bearing on some paradoxes which appeared later, to do with infinity, and infinitesimals. Zeno’s Paradoxes are primarily about the possibility of motion, but more generally they are about the possibility of specifying the units, or atomic parts, of which either space or time, or indeed any continuum may be thought to be composed.

For, Zeno argued (see, for instance, Owen 1957, and Salmon 1970), if there were such units then they would either have a size, or not have a size. But if they had a size we would have the paradox of The Stadium, while if they had no size we would have the paradox of The Arrow. Thus if runners A and B are approaching one another both at unit speed, then, supposing the units have a finite size, after one time unit they will have each moved one space unit relative to the stadium. But they will have moved two space units relative to each other, which implies that there was a time unit in between when they were just one space unit apart. So the time unit must be divisible after all. On the other hand, if the units of division have no size, then, at any given time, an arrow in flight must occupy a space just equal to itself — for it cannot move within that time. But if so then it is at rest, and the arrow never moves.

That would seem to mean that space and time are divided without limit. But Zeno argued that if space and time were in themselves divided without limit then we would have the paradox of Achilles and the Tortoise. A runner, before he gets to the end of his race would have to get to the half-way point, but then also to the half-way point beyond that, that is the three-quarter-way point, and so on. There would be no limit to the sequence of points he would have to get to, and so there would always be a bit more to be run, and he could never get to the end. Likewise in a competitive race, even, say, between the super-speedy Achilles and a tortoise: Achilles would not be able to catch the tortoise up — so long as the tortoise was given a start. For Achilles has first to get to the tortoise’s original position, but by then the tortoise will be, however fractionally, further on. Now Achilles must always reach the tortoise’s previous position before catching him up. Hence he never catches it up.

Aristotle had a way of resolving Zeno’s Paradoxes which convinced most people until more recent times. Aristotle’s resolution of Zeno’s Paradoxes involved distinguishing between space and time being in themselves divided into parts without limit, and simply being divisible (by ourselves, for instance) without limit. No continuous magnitude, Aristotle thought, is actually composed of parts, since, although it may be divisible into parts without limit, the continuum is given before any such resulting division into parts. In particular, Aristotle denied that there could be any non-finite parts, and so is often called a “Finitist”: non-finite “parts” cannot be parts of space or time, he thought, since no magnitude can be composed of what has no extension. This view came to be challenged later, since it means that an arrow can only be “at rest” if it is at the same place at two separate times — for Aristotle both rest and motion can only be defined over a finite increment of time. But later the notion of an instantaneous velocity came to be accepted, and that includes the case where the velocity is zero.

The puzzle about non-finite parts may remind one of the question which occupied many scholastic theologians in the Middle Ages: how many angels can sit upon a pin? And it is perhaps no accident that the theorist who gave the currently received answer to the general question of how many things without any extension make up a whole which has such an extension was a fervent believer in God. Certainly Aristotle’s Finitism only stayed generally persuasive until the latter end of the nineteenth century, when the theorist in question, Cantor, specified the number of non-finite points in a continuum to most learned people’s satisfaction.

2. Moving to Modern Times

Between the classical times of Aristotle and the late nineteenth century when Cantor worked, there was a period in the middle ages when paradoxes of a logical kind were considered intensively. That was during the fourteenth century. Notable individuals were Paul of Venice, living towards the end of that century, and John Buridan, born just before it. As models of the care, and clarity which is required to extricate oneself from the above kind of difficulties with problem propositions each of these writers will surely stand forever. As an illustration, Buridan discusses “No change is instantaneous” in the following way (Scott 1966, p178):

I prove it, because every change is either in an indivisible instant or it is in a divisible time. But none is in an indivisible instant, since an indivisible instant cannot be given in time, as is always supposed. Hence every change is in divisible time, and every such must be called temporal and not instantaneous.

The opposite is argued, because at least the creation of our intellective soul is instantaneous. For since it is indivisible, it must be made altogether at once, not one part after another. And such creation we call instantaneous. Therefore.

Buridan also discusses “You know the one approaching,” which resembles Eubulides’ Hooded Man (Scott 1966, p178):

I posit the case that you see your father coming from a distance, in such a way that you do not discern whether it is your father or another.Then it is proved, because you do indeed know your father, and he is the one approaching; hence, you know the one approaching. Likewise, you know him who is known by you, but the one approaching is known by you; hence, you know the one approaching. I prove the minor, because your father is known by you and your father is the one approaching; hence, the one approaching is known by you.

The opposite is argued, because you do not know him of whom, if you are asked who he is, you will answer truly “I do not know.” But concerning the one approaching you say this; hence etc.

These two cases are “sophisms” in Buridan’s book on such, Sophismata, and amongst these, in chapter 8, are the “insolubles,” which are the ones involving some form of self-reference. Broadly speaking, that is to say, Buridan made a distinction similar to that mentioned before, between general paradoxes of a logical nature, and “the logical paradoxes.” Thus in his chapter 8 Buridan discusses Eubulides’ Liar Paradox in several forms, for instance as it arises with “Every proposition is false” in the following circumstances (Scott 1966, p191): “I posit the case that all true propositions should be destroyed and false ones remain. And then Socrates utters only this proposition: ‘Every proposition is false’.”

Extended discussion of such cases may seem somewhat academic, but between Buridan’s period, and more recent times, one notable figure started to bring out something of the larger importance of these issues. Indeed, quite generally, sophisms about the nature of change and continuity, about knowledge and its objects, and the ones about the notion of self-reference, amongst many others, have attracted a great deal of very professional attention, once their significance was realised, with techniques of analysis drawn from developments in formal logic and linguistic studies being added to the careful and clear expression, and modes of argument found in the best writers before. The pace of change started to quicken in the later nineteenth century, but the one earlier thinker who will also be mentioned here is Bishop Berkeley, who was active in the early eighteenth. For a history of this period, in connection with the issues which concerned Berkeley, see, for instance, Grattan-Guinness 1980. Berkeley’s argument was with Newton about the foundations of the calculus; he took, amongst other things, a sceptical line about the possibility of instantaneous velocities.

It will be remembered that in the calculation of a derivative the following fraction is considered:

f(x + δx) – f(x) / δx,

where δx is a very small quantity.In the elementary case where f(x) = x2, for instance, we get

(x + δx)2 – x2 / δx,

and the calculation goes first to

2xδx+ δx2/ δx,

and then to 2x + δx, with δx being subsequently set to zero to get the exact derivative 2x.Berkeley objected that only if δx was not zero could one first divide through by it, and so one was in no position, with the result of that operation, to then take δx to be zero.If it took δx to be zero Newton’s calculus, it seemed, required the impossible notion of an instantaneous velocity, which, of course, Aristotle had denied in connection with his analysis of Zeno’s Paradoxes.The point was appreciated to some extent elsewhere.For the association between the derivative and motion, initiated by Newton’s use of the term “fluxion,” was largely confined to England, and on the Continent, Leibniz’ cotemporaneous development of the calculus had more hold.And that involved the idea that the increment δx was never zero, but merely remained a still finite “infinitesimal.”

One way of putting Aristotle’s Finitism is to say that he believed that infinities, such as the possible successive divisions of a line, were only “potential,” not “actual” — an actual infinite division would end up with non-extensional, and so non-finite points. Leibniz, however, had no problem with the notion of an actual infinite division of a line — or with the idea that the result could be a finite quantity. However, while Leibniz introduced finite infinitesimals instead of fluxions, this idea was also questioned as not sufficiently rigorous, and both ideas lost ground to definitions of derivatives in terms of limits, by Cauchy and Weierstrass in the nineteenth century. Leibniz’ notion of finite infinitesimals in fact has been given a more rigorous definition since that time, by Abraham Robinson, and other proponents of “non-standard analysis,” but it was on the previous, nineteenth century theory of real numbers that Cantor worked, before he came to formulate his theory of infinite numbers. Leibniz would not have thought it too sensible to ask how many of his infinitesimals made up the line, but Cantor made much more precise the answer “infinitely many.”

It is necessary to get some idea about the theory of real numbers before we can understand the next logical paradoxes which emerged in this tradition: Russell’s Paradox, Burali-Forti’s Paradox, Cantor’s Paradox, and Skolem’s Paradox. We will look at those in the next section, which will then lead us into twentieth century developments in the area of self-reference. But before all that it should be mentioned how recent discussions of knowledge and its objects, for instance, has become very professionalised, since developed discussion of issues to do with Eubulides’ Hooded Man has been just as dominant in this period.

These issues, it will be remembered, centred on the problem of non-recognition, and in various ways two central cases of this have been given close attention since the end of the nineteenth century. A great deal of other relevant discussion has also gone on, but these two cases are perhaps the most important, historically (see, for example, Linsky 1967). First must be mentioned Frege’s interest in the difficulty of inferring someone believes something about the Evening Star so long as they believe that thing about the Morning Star. In fact the Morning Star is the same as the Evening Star, we now realise, but this was not always recognised, and indeed it is now realised that even the term “star” is a misnomer, both objects being the planet Venus. Still someone ignorant of the astronomical identity, it may be thought, might accept “The Evening Star is in the sky,” but reject “The Morning Star is in the sky.” Quine produced another much discussed case of a similar sort, concerning Bernard J. Ortcutt, a respectable man with grey hair, once seen at the beach. In one location he was taken to be not a spy, in another place he was taken to be a spy, as one might say; but is that quite the best way the situation should be described? Maybe one who does not recognise him can have beliefs about the man at the beach without thereby having those beliefs about the respectable man with grey hair — or even Bernard J. Ortcutt. Certainly Quine thought so, which has not only caused a large scale controversy in itself; it has also led to, or been part of much broader discussions about identity in similar, but non-personal, intensional notions, like modality. Thus, as Quine pointed out, it would not seem to be necessary that the number of the planets is greater than 4, although it is necessary that 9 is greater than 4, and 9 is the number of the planets. A branch of formal logic, Intensional Logic, has been developed to enable a more precise analysis of these kinds of issue.

3. Some Recent Logical Paradoxes

It was developments in other parts of mathematics which were integral to the discovery of the next logical paradoxes to be considered. These were developments in the theory of real numbers, as was mentioned before, but also in Set Theory, and Arithmetic. Arithmetic is now taken to be concerned with a “denumerable” number of objects — the natural numbers — while real numbers are “non-denumerable.” Sets of both infinite sizes can be formed, it is now thought, which is the basis on which Cantor was to give his precise answer “two to the aleph zero” to the question of how many points there are on a line.

The tradition up to the middle of the nineteenth century did not look at these matters in this kind of way. For the natural numbers arise in connection with counting, for instance counting the cows in a field. If there are a number of cows in the field then there is a set of them: sets are collections of such individuals. But with the beef in the field we do not normally talk in these terms: “beef” is a mass noun not a count noun, and so it does not individuate things, merely name some stuff, and, as a result, a number can be associated with the beef in the field only given some arbitrary unit, like a pound, or a kilogram. When there is just some F then there isn’t a number of F’s, although there might be a number of, say, pieces of F. It is the same with continua like space and time, which we can divide into yards, or seconds, or indeed any finite quantity, and that is perhaps the main fact which supports Aristotle’s view that any division of such a continuum is merely potential rather than actual, and inevitably finite both in the unit used and in the number of them in a whole.

But continua from Cantor onwards have been seen as composed of non-finite individuals. And not only that is the change. For also the number of individuals in some set of individuals — whether cows, or the non-finite elements in beef — has been taken to be possibly non-finite, with a whole containing those individuals being then still available: the infinite set of them. We now commonly have the idea that there may be infinite sets first of finite entities, which will then be “countable” or “denumerable,” but also there will be sets of non-finite, infinitesimal entities, which will be “uncountable,” or “non-denumerable.”

It is important to appreciate the grip that these new ideas had on the late nineteenth century generation of mathematicians and logicians, since it came to seem, as a result of these sorts of changes, that everything in mathematics was going to be explainable in terms of sets: Set Theory looked like it would become the entire foundation for mathematics. Only once one has appreciated this expectation, which the vanguard of theorists uniformly had, can one realise the very severe jolt to that society which came with the discovery of Russell’s Paradox, and several others at much the same time, around the turn of the century. For Russell’s Paradox showed that not everything could be a set.

If we write “x is F” as “Fx”—as came to be common in this same period—then the set of F’s is written


and to say a is F, that is Fa, would then seem to be to say that a belonged to this set, that is

a ∈ {x|Fx},

where the symbol “∈” represents “is a member of.”

It therefore seems plausible to enunciate this as a general principle,

for all y: y ∈ {x|Fx} if and only if Fy,

which is symbolised in contemporary logic,

(y)(y ∈ {x|Fx} iff Fy).

But if the result held for all predicates “F” then we could say, for any “F”

there is a z such that: (y)(y ∈ z iff Fy),

which is now formalised

(∃>z)(y)(y ∈ z iff Fy).

In the foundations of Arithmetic which Frege described in his major logical works Begriffsschrift, and Grundgesetze, this principle is a major axiom (Kneale and Kneale 1962, Ch 8), but Russell found it was logically impossible, since if one takes for “Fy” the specific predicate “y does not belong to y,” that is “¬ y ∈ y” then it requires

(∃>z)(y)(y ∈ z iff ¬ y ∈ y),

wherefrom, given the above meanings of “(∃>z)” and “(y)”, we get the contradiction

z ∈ z iff ¬ z ∈ z,

that is z is a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself. As a result of this paradox which Russell discovered, the theory of sets was considerably altered, and limits were put on Frege’s axiom, so that, for instance, either it defined merely subsets of known sets (Zermelo’s theory), or allowed one to discriminate sets from other entities — usually called “proper classes” (von Neumann’s theory). In the latter case those things which are not members of themselves form a proper class but not a set, and proper classes cannot be members of anything.

But there were other reasons why it came to be realised that sets could not always be formed, following the discovery of Burali-Forti’s and Cantor’s Paradoxes. Burali-Forti’s Paradox is about certain sets called “ordinals,” because of their connection with the ordinals of ordinary language, that is “first,” “second,” “third,” etc. The sets which are ordinals are so ordered that each one is a member of all the following ones, and so, with no limit envisaged to the sets which could be formed, it seemed possible to prove that any succession of such ordinals would themselves be members of a further ordinal – which would have to be distinct from each of them. The trouble came in considering the totality of all ordinals, since that would mean that there would have to be a further distinct ordinal not in this totality, and yet it was supposed to be the totality of all ordinals. A very similar contradiction is reached in Cantor’s Paradox.

For, for finite sets of finite entities it is easy to prove Cantor’s Theorem, namely that the number of members of a set is strictly less than the number of its subsets. If one forms a set of the subsets of a given set then one produces the “power set” of the original set, so another way of stating Cantor’s Theorem is to say that the number of members of a set is strictly less than the number of members of its power set. Cantor extended this theorem to his infinite sets as well – although there was at least one such set he realised it obviously could not apply to, namely the set of everything, sometimes called the universal set. For the set of its subsets clearly could not have a greater number than the number of things in the universal set itself, since that contained everything. This was Cantor’s Paradox, and his resolution of it was to say that such an infinity was “inconsistent,” since it could not be consistently numbered. He thought, however, that only the size of infinite sets had to be limited, assuming that lesser infinities could be consistently numbered, and nominating, for a start, “aleph zero” as the number, or more properly the “power” of the natural numbers (Hallett 1984, p175). In fact an earlier paradox about the natural numbers had suggested that even they could not be consistently numbered: for they could be put into 1 to 1 correlation with the even numbers, for one thing, and yet there were surely more of them, since they included the odd numbers as well. This paradox Cantor took to be avoided by his definition of the power of a set (N.B. not the power set of a set): his definition merely required two sets to be put into 1 to 1 correlation in order for them to have the same power. Thus all infinite sequences of natural numbers have the same power, aleph zero.

But the number of points in a line was not aleph zero, it was two to the aleph zero, and Cantor produced several proofs that these were not the same. The most famous was his diagonal argument which seems to show that there must be orders of infinity, and specifically that the non-denumerably infinite is distinct from the denumerably infinite. For belief in real numbers is equivalent to belief in certain infinite sets: real numbers are commonly understood simply in terms of possibly-non-terminating decimals, but this definition can be derived from the more theoretical ones (Suppes 1972, p189). But can the decimals between, say, 0 and 1 be listed? Listing them would make them countable in the special sense of this which has been adopted, which amongst other things does not require there to be a last item counted. The natural numbers are countable in this sense, as before, and any list, it seems, can be indexed by the ordinal numbers. Suppose, however, that we had a list in which the n-th member was of this form:

an = 0.an1an2an3an4…,

where ani is a digit between 0 and 9 inclusive.Then that list would not contain the “diagonal” decimal am defined by

amn = 9 – ann,

since for n = m this equation is false, if only whole digits are involved. This seems to show that the totality of decimals in any continuous interval cannot be listed, which implies that there are at least two separate orders of infinity.

Of course, if there were no infinite sets then there would be no infinite numbers, countable or uncountable, and so an Aristotelian would not accept the result of this proof as a fact. Discrete things might, at the most, be potentially denumerable, for him. But the difficulty with the result extends even to those who accept that there are infinite sets, because of another paradox, Skolem’s Paradox, which shows that all theories of a certain sort must have a countable model, that is must be true in some countable domain of objects. But Set Theory is one such theory, and in it, supposedly, there must be non-countable sets. In fact a denumerable model for Set Theory has recently been specified, by Lavine (Lavine 1994), so how can Cantor’s diagonal proof be accommodated? Commonly it is accommodated by saying that, within the denumerable model of Set Theory, non-denumerability is represented merely by the absence of a function which can do the indexing of a set, that is produce a correlation between the set and the ordinal numbers. But if that is the case, then maybe the difficulty of listing the real numbers in an interval is comparable. Certainly given a list of real numbers with a functional way of indexing them, then diagonalisation enables us to construct another real number. But maybe there still might be a denumerable number of all the real numbers in an interval without any possibility of finding a function which lists them, in which case we would have no diagonal means of producing another. We seem to need a further proof that being denumerable in size means being listable by means of a function.

4. Paradoxes of Self-Reference

The possibility that Cantor’s diagonal procedure is a paradox in its own right is not usually entertained, although a direct application of it does yield an acknowledged paradox: Richard’s Paradox. Consider for a start all finite sequences of the twenty six letters of the English alphabet, the ten digits, a comma, a full stop, a dash and a blank space. Order these expressions according, first, to the number of symbols, and then lexicographically within each such set. We then have a way of identifying the n-th member of this collection. Now some of these expressions are English phrases, and some of those phrases will define real numbers. Let E be the sub-collection which does this, and suppose we can again identify the n-th place in this, for each natural number n. Then the following phrase, as Richard pointed out, would seem to define a real number which is not defined in the collection: “The real number whose whole part is zero, and whose n-th decimal place is p plus 1 if the n-th decimal of the real number defined by the n-th member of E is p, and p is neither 8 or 9, and is simply one if this n-th decimal is eight or nine.” But this expression is a finite sequence of the previously described kind.

One significant fact about this paradox is that it is a semantical paradox, since it is concerned not just with the ordered collection of expressions (which is a syntactic matter), but also their meaning, that is whether they refer to real numbers. It is this which possibly makes it unclear whether there is a specifiable list of expressions of the required kind, since while the total list of expressions can certainly be straightforwardly ordered, whether some expression defines a real number is maybe not such a clear cut matter. Indeed, it might be concluded, just from the very fact that a paradox ensues, as above, that whether some English phrase defines a real number is not always entirely settleable. In Borel’s terms, it cannot be decided effectively (Martin-Löf 1970, p44). Another very similar semantical paradox with this same aspect is Berry’s Paradox, about “the least integer not nameable in fewer than nineteen syllables.” The problem here is that that very phrase has less than nineteen syllables in it, and yet, if it names an integer, that integer would have to be not nameable in less than nineteen syllables. So is there a definite set of English expressions which name integers not nameable in less than nineteen syllables?

If some sort of fuzziness was the case then there would be a considerable difference between such paradoxes and the previous paradoxes in logical theory like Russell’s, Burali-Forti’s and Cantor’s, for instance. Indeed it has been common since Ramsey’s discussion of these matters, in the 1920s, to divide the major logical paradoxes into two: the semantic or linguistic on the one hand, and the syntactic or mathematical on the other. Mackie disagreed with Ramsey to a certain extent, although he was prepared to say (Mackie 1973, p262):

The semantical paradoxes…can thus be solved in a philosophical sense by demonstrating the lack of content of the key items, the fact that various questions and sentences, construed in the intended way, raise no substantial issue. But these are comments appropriate only to linguistic items; one would expect that this method would apply only to the semantic paradoxes, and not to “syntactic” ones like Russell’s class paradox, which are believed to involve only (formal) logical and mathematical elements.

Russell himself opposed the distinction, formulating his famous “Vicious Circle Principle” which, he held, all the paradoxes of self-reference violated. Specifically he held that statements about all the members of certain collections were nonsense (compare Haack 1978, p141):

Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of a collection, or, conversely, if, provided a certain collection had a total it would have members only definable in terms of that total, then the said collection has no total.

But this, seemingly, would rule out specifying, for instance, a man as the one with the highest batting average in his team, since he is then defined in terms of a total of which he is a member. It effectively imposes a ban on all forms of self-reference, and so Russell’s uniform solution to the paradoxes is usually thought to be too drastic. Some might say “this may be using a cannon against a fly, but at least it stops the fly!”; but it also devastates too much else in the vicinity.

A more recent theorist to oppose Ramsey’s distinction has been Priest. In fact he has tried to prove that all the main paradoxes of self-reference have a common structure using a further insight of Russell’s, which he calls “Russell’s Schema” (Priest 1994, p27). This pre-dates Russell’s attachment to the Vicious Circle Principle, but Priest has shown that, when adapted and applied to all the main paradoxes, it matches the reasoning which leads to the contradiction in each one of them. This approach, however, presumes that semantical notions, like definability, designation, truth, and knowledge can be construed in terms of mathematical sets, which seems to be really the very supposition which Ramsey disputed.

Grelling’s Paradox also makes this supposition questionable. It is a self-referential, semantical paradox resembling, to some extent, Russell’s Paradox, and concerns the property which an adjective has if it does not apply to itself. Thus

“large” is not large,
“multi-syllabled” is multi-syllabled,
“English” is English,
“French” is not French.

Let us use the term “heterological” for the property of being non-self-applicable, so we can say that “large” and “French” are heterological, for instance, and we can write as a general definition

“x” is heterological if and only if “x” is not x.

But clearly, substituting “heterological” for “x” produces a contradiction. Does this contradiction mean there is no such concept as heterologicality, just as there is no such set as the Russell set? Goldstein has recently argued that this is so (Goldstein 2000, p67), following a tradition Mackie calls “the logical proof approach” (Mackie 1973, p254f), to which Ryle was a notable contributor (Ryle 1950-1). The point is made even more plausible given the very detailed logical analysis which Copi provided (Copi 1973, p301).

Copi first introduces the definition

Hs =df (∃>F)(sDesF&(P)(sDesP iff P=F) & ¬Fs),

in which “¬” abbreviates “not”, and “Des” refers to the relation between a verbal expression and the property it designates. Thus “sDesF” reads: s designates F. Copi’s proof of the contradiction then goes in the following way. First, H”H” entails in turn

(∃>F)(“H”DesF&(P)(“H”DesP iff P=F)&¬F”H”) – by substitution in the definition,

“H”DesF&(P)(“H”DesP iff P=F)&¬F”H” – by taking the case thus said to exist,

(“H”DesH iff H=F)&¬F”H” – by substitution in the “for all P”,

H=F&¬F”H” – by assuming “H” designates H,

Then ¬H”H” entails in turn

(F)¬(“H”DesF&(P)(“H”DesP iff P=F)&¬F”H”) – since “¬(∃>F)” is equivalent to “(F)¬”,¬(H”DesH&(P)(“H”DesP iff P=H)&¬H”H”) – substituting “H” for “F”,

¬((P)(“H”DesP iff P=H)&¬H”H”) – assuming “H” designates H,

H”H” – assuming (P)(“H”DesP iff P=H).

To get the contradiction

H”H” iff ¬H”H”,

therefore, one has to be assured that there is one and only one property which “H” designates. And Copi gives no proof of this.

The Liar Paradox is a further self-referential, semantical paradox, perhaps the major one to come down from antiquity. And one may very well ask, with respect to

What I am now saying is false,

for instance, whether this has any sense, or involves a substantive issue, as Mackie would have it (see also Parsons 1984). But there is a well known further paradox which seems to block this dismissal. For if we allow, as well as “true” and “false” also “meaningless,” then it might well seem that The Strengthened Liar arises, which, in this case, could be expressed

What I am now saying is false, or meaningless.

If I am saying nothing meaningful here, then seemingly what I say is true, which seems to imply that it does have meaning, after all.

Let us, therefore, look at some other notable ways of trying to escape even the Unstrengthened Liar. The Unstrengthened Liar comes in a whole host of variations, for instance:

This very sentence is false,


Some sentence in this book is false,

if that sentence is the only sentence in a book, say in its preface. It also arises with the following pair of sentences taken together:

The following sentence is false,The previous sentence is true;

and in a case of Buridan’s,

What Plato is saying is false,What Socrates is saying is true,

if Socrates says the first, while Plato says the second. There are many other variations, some of which we shall look at later.

The semantical concepts in these paradoxes are truth and falsity, and the first major contribution to our understanding of these, in the twentieth century, was by Tarski. Tarski took truth and falsity to be predicates of sentences, and discussed at length the following example of his famous “T-scheme”:

“snow is white” is true if and only if snow is white.

He believed that

Ts iff p,

holds, quite generally, if “s” is some phrase naming, or referring, to the sentence “p” — for instance, as above, that same sentence in quotation marks, or a number in some system of numbering, which was the way Gödel handled such matters. Tarski’s analysis of truth involved denying that there could be “semantic closure” that is the presence in a language of the semantic concepts relating to expressions in that language (Tarski 1956, p402):

The main source of the difficulties met with seems to lie in the following: it has not always been kept in mind that the semantical concepts have a relative character, that they must always be related to a particular language. People have not been aware that the language about which we speak need by no means coincide with the language in which we speak. They have carried out the semantics of a language in that language itself and, generally speaking, they have proceeded as though there was only one language in the world. The analysis of the antinomies mentioned shows, on the contrary, that the semantical concepts simply have no place in the language to which they relate, that the language which contains its own semantics, and within which the usual laws of logic hold, must inevitably be inconsistent.

This conclusion, which requires that any consistent language be incomplete, Tarski derived directly by considering The Liar, since “This is false” seems to provide a self-referential “s” for which

s = “¬Ts”,

hence, substituting in the following example of the T-scheme

T”¬Ts” iff ¬Ts,

we get

Ts iff ¬Ts.

To block this conclusion Tarski held that the self-reference seemingly available in the identity

s = “¬Ts”

was just not consistently available, and specifically that, if one used the sentence “this is false” then the referent of “this” should not be that very sentence itself – on pain of the evident contradiction. Using “this is false” coherently meant speaking about an object language, but in another, higher, language – the meta-language. Of course the semantical concepts applicable in this meta-language likewise could not be sensibly defined within it, so generally there was supposed to be a whole hierarchy of languages.

It seems difficult to apply this kind of stratification of languages to the way we ordinarily speak, however. Indeed, to assert that truth can attach to indexical sentences, like “What I am now saying is false,” would seem to be flying in the face of a very clear truth (Kneale 1972, p234f). Consider, further, this variation of the Plato-Socrates case above (compare Haack 1978, p144), where Jones says

All of Nixon’s utterances about Watergate are false,

and Nixon says

All of Jones’ utterances about Watergate are true.

If, following Tarski, we were to try to assign levels of language to this pair of utterances, then how could we do it? It would seem that Jones’ utterance would have to be in a language higher, in Tarski’s hierarchy, than any of Nixon’s; yet, contrariwise, Nixon’s would have to be higher than any of Jones’.

Martin has produced a typology of solutions to the Liar which locates Tarski’s way out as one amongst four possible, general diagnoses (Martin 1984, p4). The two principles which Martin takes to categorise the Liar we have just seen, namely

(S) There is a sentence which says of itself only that it is not true,


(T) Any sentence is true if and only if what it says is the case.

Tarski, in these terms, took claim (S) to be incorrect. But one also might claim that (T) is incorrect, maybe because there are sentences without a truth value, being meaningless, or lacking in content in some other way, as is held by the theorists mentioned before. A third general diagnosis claims that both (S) and (T) are correct, and indeed incompatible, but proceeds to some “rational reconstruction” of them so that the incompatibility is removed. Fourthly it is possible to argue that (S) and (T) are correct, but really compatible. Martin sees this happening as a result of some possible ambiguity in the terms used in the two principles.

We can isolate a further, fifth option, although Martin does not consider it. That option is to hold that both (S) and (T) are incorrect, as is done by the tradition which holds that it is not sentences which are true or false. One cannot say, for instance, that the sentence “that is white” is true, in itself, since what is spoken of might vary from one utterance of the sentence to another. Following the second world war, because of this sort of thing, it became more common to think of semantical notions as attached not to sentences and words, but to what such sentences and words mean (Kneale and Kneale 1962, p601f). On this understanding it is not specifically the sentence “that is white” but what is expressed by this sentence, that is the statement or proposition made by it, which may be true. But it was shown by Thomason, following work by Montague, that the same sorts of problems can be generated even in this case. We can create self-referential paradoxes to do with statements and propositions which again cannot be obviously escaped (Thomason 1977, 1980, 1986). And the problems are not just confined to the semantics of truth and falsity, but also arise in just the same way with more general semantical notions like knowledge, belief, and provability. In recent years, the much larger extent of the problems to do with self-reference has, in this way, become increasingly apparent.

Asher and Kamp sum up (Asher and Kamp 1989, p87):

Thomason argues that the results of Montague (1963) apply not only to theories in which attitudinal concepts, such as knowledge and belief, are treated as predicates of sentences, but also to “representational” theories of the attitudes, which analyse these concepts as relations to, or operations on (mental) representations. Such representational treatments of the attitudes have found many advocates; and it is probably true that some of their proponents have not been sufficiently alert to the pitfalls of self-reference even after those had been so clearly exposed in Montague (1963)… To such happy-go-lucky representationalists, Thomason (1980) is a stern warning of the obstacles that a precise elaboration of their proposals would encounter.

Thomason mentions specifically Fodor’s “Language of Thought” in his work; Asher and Kamp themselves show that modes of argument similar to Thomason’s can be used even to show that Montague’s Intensional Semantics has the same problems. Asher and Kamp go on to explain the general method which achieves these results (Asher and Kamp 1989, p87):

Thomason’s argument is, at least on the face of it, straightforward. He reasons as follows: Suppose that a certain attitude, say belief, is treated as a property of “proposition-like” objects – let us call them “representations” – which are built up from atomic constituents in much the way that sentences are. Then, with enough arithmetic at our disposal, we can associate a Gödel number with each such object and we can mimic the relevant structural properties of and relations between such objects by explicitly defined arithmetical predicates of their Gödel numbers. This Gödelisation of representations can then be exploited to derive a contradiction in ways familiar from the work of Gödel, Tarski and Montague.

The only ray of hope Asher and Kamp can offer is (Asher and Kamp 1989, p94): “Only the familiar systems of epistemic and doxastic logic, in which knowledge and belief are treated as sentential operators, and which do not treat propositions as objects of reference and quantification, seem solidly protected from this difficulty.” But see on these, for instance, Mackie 1973, p276f, although also Slater 1986.

Gödel’s famous theorems in this area are, of course, concerned with the notion of provability, and they show that if this notion is taken as a predicate of certain formulas, then in any standard formal system which has enough arithmetic to handle the Gödel numbers used to identify the formulas in the system, certain statements can be constructed which are true, but are not provable in the system, if it is consistent. What is also true, and even provable in such a system is that, if it is consistent then (a) a certain specific self-referential formula is not provable in the system, and (b) the consistency of the system is not provable in the system. This means the consistency of the system cannot be proved in the system unless it is inconsistent, and it is commonly believed that the appropriate systems are consistent. But if they are consistent then this result shows they are incomplete, that is there are truths which they cannot prove.

The paradoxical thing about Gödel’s Theorems is that they seem to show that there are things we can ourselves prove, in the natural language we use to talk about formal systems, but which a formal system of proof cannot prove. And that fact has been fed into the very large debate about our differences from, even superiority over mechanisms (see e.g. Penrose 1989). But if we consider the way many people would argue about, for instance,

this very sentence is unprovable,

then our abilities as humans might not seem to be too great. For many people would argue:

If that sentence is provable then it is true, since provability entails truth; but that makes it unprovable, which is a contradiction. Hence it must be unprovable. But by this process we seem to have proved that it is unprovable – another contradiction!

So, unless we can extricate ourselves from this impasse, as well as the many others we have looked at, we would not seem to be too bright. Or does this sort of argument show that there is, indeed, no escape? Some people, of course, might want to follow Tarski, and run from “natural language” in the face of these conclusions. For Gödel had no reason to conclude, from his theorems, that the formal systems he was concerned with were inconsistent. However, his formal arguments differ crucially from that just given, since there is no proof within his systems that “provability” entails “truth.” There is no doubt that what we have been dealing with are real paradoxes!

The intractability of the impasse here, and the failure of many great minds to make headway with it, has lead some theorists to believe that indeed there is no escape. Notable amongst these is Priest (compare Priest 1979), who believes we must now learn to accept that some contradictions can be true, and adjust our logic accordingly. This is very much in line with the expectation we initially noted Quine had, that maybe “some tacit and trusted pattern of reasoning must be made explicit and henceforward be avoided or revised.” (Quine 1966, p7)  The particular law which “paraconsistent” logicians mainly doubt is “ex impossibile quodlibet”, that is “from an impossibility anything follows,” or

(p&¬p) ⊢ q.

It is thought that, if this traditional rule were removed from logic then, at least, any true contradictions we find, e.g. anything of the form “p&¬p” which we deduce from some paradox of self-reference, will not have the wholesale repercussions that it otherwise would have in traditional logic. Objectors to paraconsistency might say that the premise of this rule could not arise, so its “explosive” repercussions would never eventuate. But there is the broader, philosophical question, as well, about whether a switch to a different logic does not just change the subject, leaving the original problems unattacked. That depends on how one views “deviant logics.” There are reasons to believe that deviant logics are not rivals of traditional logic, but merely supplementary to, or extensions of it (Haack, 1974, Pt 1, Ch1). For if one drops the above rule then hasn’t one merely produced a new kind of negation? Are “p” and “¬p” still contradictory, if they can, somehow, both be true? And if “p” and “¬p” are not contradictory, then what is contradictory to “p”, and couldn’t we formulate the previous paradoxes in terms of it? It seems we may have just turned our backs on the real difficulty.

5. A Contemporary Twist

There have been developments, in the last few years, which have shown that the previous emphasis on paradoxes involving self-reference was to some extent misleading. For a family of paradoxes, with similar levels of intractability, have been discovered, which are not reflexive in this way.

It was mentioned before that a form of the Liar paradox could be derived in connection with the pair of statements

What Plato is saying is false,

What Socrates is saying is true,

when Socrates says the former, and Plato the latter. For, if what Socrates is saying is true, then, according to the former, what Plato is saying is false, but then, according to the latter, what Socrates is saying is false. On the other hand, if what Socrates is saying is false then, according to the former, what Plato is saying is true, and then, according to the latter, what Socrates is saying is true. Such a paradox is called a “liar chain”; they can be of any length; and with them we are already out of the really strict “self-reference” family, although, by passing along through the chain what Socrates is saying, it will eventually come back to reflect on itself.

It seems, however, that, if one creates what might be called “infinite chains” then there is not even this attenuated form of self-reference (though see Beall, 2001). Yablo asked us to consider an infinite sequence of sentences of which the following is representative (Yablo 1993):

(Si) For all k>i, Sk is untrue.

Sorensen’s “Queue Paradox” is similar, and can be obtained by replacing “all” by “some” here, and considering the series of thoughts of some students in an infinite queue (Sorensen 1998). Suppose that, in Yablo’s case, Sn is true for some n. Then Sn+1 is false, and all subsequent statements; but the latter fact makes Sn+1 true; giving a contradiction. Hence for no n is Sn true. But that means that S1 is true, S2 is true, etc; in fact it means every statement is true, which is another contradiction. In Sorensen’s case, if some student thinks “some of the students behind me are now thinking an untruth” then this cannot be false, since then all the students behind her are thinking the truth – although that means that some student behind her is speaking an untruth, a contradiction. So no student is thinking an untruth. But if some student is consequently thinking a truth, then some student behind them is thinking an untruth, which we know to be impossible. Indeed every supposition seems impossible, and we are in the characteristic impasse.

Gaifman has worked up a way of dealing with such more complex paradoxes of the Liar sort, which can end up denying the sentences in such loops, chains, and infinite sequences have any truth value whatever. Using “GAP” for “recognised failure to assign a standard truth value” Gaifman formulates what he calls the “closed loop rule” (Gaifman 1992, pp225, 230):

If, in the course of applying the evaluation procedure, a closed unevaluated loop forms and none of its members can be assigned a standard value by any of the rules, then all of its members are assigned GAP in a single evaluation step.

Goldstein has formulated a comparable process, which he thinks improves upon Gaifman in certain details, and which ends up labelling certain sentences “FA”, meaning that the sentence has made a “failed attempt” at making a statement (Goldstein 2000, p57). But the major question with such approaches, as before, is how they deal with The Strengthened Liar. Surely there remain major problems with

This sentence is false, or has a GAP,


This sentence makes a false statement, or is a FA.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Asher, N. and Kamp, H. 1986, “The Knower’s Paradox and Representational Theories of Attitudes,” in J. Halpern (ed.) Theoretical Aspects of Reasoning about Knowledge, San Mateo CA, Morgan Kaufmann.
  • Asher, N. and Kamp, H. 1989, “Self-Reference, Attitudes and Paradox” in G. Chierchia, B.H. Partee, and R. Turner (eds.) Properties, Types and Meaning 1.
  • Beall, J.C., 2001, “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?,” Analysis 61.3.
  • Copi, I.M., 1973, Symbolic Logic 4th ed. Macmillan, New York.
  • Gaifman, H. 1992, “Pointers to Truth,” The Journal of Philosophy, 89, 223-61.
  • Goldstein, L. 2000, “A Unified Solution to Some Paradoxes,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 100, pp53-74.
  • Grattan-Guinness, I. (ed.) 1980, From the Calculus to Set Theory, 1630-1910, Duckworth, London.
  • Haack, S. 1974, Deviant Logic, C.U.P., Cambridge.
  • Haack, S. 1978, Philosophy of Logics, C.U.P., Cambridge.
  • Hallett, M. 1984, Cantorian Set Theory and Limitation of Size, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Keefe, R. 2001, Theories of Vagueness, C.U.P. Cambridge.
  • Kneale, W. 1972, “Propositions and Truth in Natural Languages,” Mind, 81, pp225-243.
  • Kneale, W. and Kneale M. 1962, The Development of Logic, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Lavine, S. 1994, Understanding the Infinite, Harvard University Press, Cambridge MA.
  • Linsky, L. 1967, Referring, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1973, Truth, Probability and Paradox, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Martin, R.L. (ed.) 1984, Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Martin-Löf, P. 1970, Notes on Constructive Mathematics, Almqvist and Wiksell, Stockholm.
  • Montague, R. 1963, “Syntactic Treatments of Modality, with Corollaries on Reflection Principles and Finite Axiomatisability,” Acta Philosophica Fennica, 16, pp153-167.
  • Owen, G.E.L. 1957-8, “Zeno and the Mathematicians,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 58, 199-222.
  • Parsons, C. 1984, “The Liar Paradox” in R.L.Martin (ed.) Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Penrose, R. 1989, The Emperor’s New Mind, O.U.P., Oxford.
  • Priest, G.G. 1979, “The Logic of Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8, pp219-241.
  • Priest, G.G. 1994, “The Structure of the Paradoxes of Self-Reference,” Mind, 103, pp25- 34.
  • Quine, W.V.O. 1966, The Ways of Paradox, Random House, New York.
  • Ryle, G. 1950-1, “Heterologicality,” Analysis, 11, pp61-69.
  • Sainsbury, M. 1995, Paradoxes, 2nd ed., C.U.P. Cambridge.
  • Salmon, W.C. (ed.) 1970, Zeno’s Paradoxes, Bobbs-Merrill, Indianapolis.
  • Scott, T.K. 1966, John Buridan: Sophisms on Meaning and Truth, Appleton-Century- Crofts, New York.
  • Slater, B.H. 1986, “Prior’s Analytic,” Analysis, 46, pp76-81.
  • Sorensen, R. 1998, “Yablo’s Paradox and Kindred Infinite Liars,” Mind, 107, 137-55.
  • Suppes, P. 1972, Axiomatic Set Theory, Dover, New York.
  • Tarski, A. 1956, Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics: Papers from 1923 to 1938, trans. J.H. Woodger, O.U.P. Oxford.
  • Thomason, R. 1977, “Indirect Discourse is not Quotational,” The Monist, 60, pp340-354.
  • Thomason, R. 1980, “A Note on Syntactical Treatments of Modality,” Synthese, 44, pp391-395
  • Thomason, R. 1986, “Paradoxes and Semantic Representation,” in J.Halpern (ed.) Theoretical Aspects of Reasoning about Knowledge, San Mateo CA, Morgan Kaufmann.
  • Williamson, T. 1994, Vagueness, London, Routledge.
  • Yablo, S. 1993, “Paradox without Self-Reference,” Analysis, 53, 251-52.

For more discussion of the logical paradoxes, see the following articles within this encyclopedia:

Author Information

Barry Hartley Slater
Email: slaterbh@cyllene.uwa.edu.au
University of Western Australia