Philosophy of Peace
Peace is notoriously difficult to define, and this poses a special challenge for articulating any comprehensive philosophy of peace. Any discussion on what might constitute a comprehensive philosophy of peace invariably overlaps with wider questions of the meaning and purpose of human existence. The definitional problem is, paradoxically, a key to understanding what is involved in articulating a philosophy of peace. In general terms, one may differentiate negative peace, that is, the relative absence of violence and war, from positive peace, that is, the presence of justice and harmonious relations. One may also refer to integrative peace, which sees peace as encompassing both social and personal dimensions.
Section 1 examines potential foundations for a philosophy of peace through what some of the world’s major religious traditions, broadly defined, have to say about peace. The logic for this is that throughout most of human history, people have viewed themselves and reality through the lens of religion. Sections 2 through 5 take an historical-philosophical approach, examining what key philosophers and thinkers have said about peace, or what might be ascertained for possible foundations for a philosophy of peace from their work. Section 6 examines some contemporary sources for a philosophy of peace.
Sections 7 through 15 are more exploratory in nature. Section 7 examines a philosophy of peace education, and the overlap between this and a philosophy of peace. Sections 8 through 15 examine a range of critical issues in thinking about and articulating a philosophy of peace, including paradoxes and contradictions which emerge in thinking about and articulating a philosophy of peace. Section 16 concludes with how engaging in the practice of philosophy may itself be a key to understanding a philosophy of peace, and indeed a key to establishing peace itself.
Table of Contents
- Religious Sources for a Philosophy of Peace
- Classical Sources for a Philosophy of Peace
- Medieval Sources for a Philosophy of Peace
- Renaissance Sources for a Philosophy of Peace
- Modern Sources for a Philosophy of Peace
- Contemporary Sources for a Philosophy of Peace
- The Philosophy of Peace Education
- The Notion of a Culture of Peace
- The Right to Peace
- The Problem of Absolute Peace
- Peace and the Nature of Truth
- Peace as Eros
- Peace, Empire and the State
- An Existentialist Philosophy of Peace
- Decolonizing Peace
- Concluding Comments: Philosophy and Peace
- References and Further Reading
It is logical that we should examine the theory of peace as set down in the teachings of some of the world’s major religious traditions, given that, for most of human history, people have viewed themselves and the world through the lens of religion. Indeed, the notion of religion as such may be viewed as a modern invention, in that throughout most of human history individuals have seen the spiritual dimension as integrated with the physical world. In discussing religion and peace, there is an obvious problem of the divergence between precept and practice, in that many of those professing religion have often been warlike and violent. Some writers, such as James Aho and René Girard, go further, and see religion at the heart of violence, through the devaluation of the present and through the notion of sacrifice. For the moment, however, we are interested in the teachings of the major world religions concerning peace.
If we examine world religious traditions and peace, it is appropriate that we examine Indigenous spirituality. There are a number of ways that such spirituality may provide grounds for a philosophy of peace, such as the notion of connectedness with the environment, the emphasis on a caring and sharing society, gratitude for creation and the importance of peace within the individual. This is not to deny that Indigenous societies, as with all societies, may be extremely violent at times. This is also not to deny that elements of Indigenous spirituality may be identifiable within other major world religious traditions. Yet many peace theorists look to Indigenous societies and Indigenous spirituality as a reference point for understanding peace.
Judaism enjoys prominence not merely as a world religion in its own right, and arguably the most ancient monotheistic religion in the world, but also as a predecessor faith for Christianity and Islam. Much of the contribution of Judaism towards theorizing on peace comes from the idea of an absolute deity, and the consequential need for radical ethical commitment. Within the Tanakh (Hebrew Scriptures), the Torah (Law) describes peace as an ultimate goal and a divine gift, although at times brutal warfare is authorized; the Nevi’im (Prophetic Literature) develops the notion of the messianic future era of peace, when there will be no more war, war-making or suffering; and the Ketuvim (Wisdom Literature) incorporates notions of inner peace into Judaism, such as the idea that a person can experience peace in the midst of adversity, and the notion that peace comes through experience and reflection.
Hinduism is a group of religious traditions geographically centered on the Indian sub-continent, which rely upon the sacred texts known as the Vedas, the Upanishads, and Bhagavad Gita. There are a number of aspects of Hinduism which intersect with peace theory. Karma is a view of moral causality incorporated into Hinduism, wherein good deeds are rewarded either within this lifetime or the next, and by contrast bad deeds are punished in this lifetime or the next. Karma presents a strong motivation to moral conduct, that is, one should act in accordance with the dharma, or moral code of the universe. A further element within Hinduism relevant to a peace theory is the notion of the family of humankind, and accordingly there is a strong element of tolerance within Hinduism, in that the religion tolerates and indeed envelopes a range of seemingly conflicting beliefs. Hinduism also regards ahimsa, strictly speaking the ethic of doing no harm towards others, and by extension compassion to all living things, as a virtue, and this virtue became central to the Gandhian philosophy of nonviolence.
Buddhism is a set of religious traditions geographically centered in Eastern and Central Asia, and based upon the teachings of Siddharta Gautama Buddha, although the dearth of any specific deity lead some to question whether Buddhism ought to be considered a religion. The significance of Buddhism for peace is the elevation of ahisma, that is, doing no harm to others, as a central ethical virtue for human conduct. It can be argued that the Buddhist ideal of avoidance of desire is also an important peaceful attribute, given that desire of all descriptions is often cited as a cause of war and conflict, as well as being a cause of the accumulation of wealth, which itself arguably runs counter to the creation of a genuinely peaceful and harmonious society.
Christianity is a set of monotheistic religious traditions, arising out of Judaism, and centered on the life and teachings of Jesus of Nazareth. The relationship of Christianity to a philosophy of peace is complex. Christianity has often emerged as a proselytizing and militaristic religion, and thus one often linked with violence. Yet there is also a countervailing undercurrent of peace within Christianity, linked to the teachings of its founder and also linked to the fact that its founder exemplified nonviolence in his own life and death. Forgiveness and reconciliation are also dominant themes in Christian teaching. Some Christian theologians have begun to reclaim the nonviolent element of Christianity, emphasizing the nonviolence in the teaching and life of Jesus.
Islam constitutes a further set of monotheistic religious traditions arising out of Judaism, stressing submission to the will of the creator, Allah, in accordance with the teachings of the Prophet Muhammed, as recorded in sacred texts of the Holy Qur’an. As with Christianity, the relationship of Islam to a philosophy of peace is complex, given that Islam also has a history of sometimes violent proselytization. Yet Islam itself is a cognate word for peace, and Islamic teaching in the Qur’an extols forgiveness, reconciliation, and non-compulsion in matters of faith. Moreover, one of the Five Pillars of Islam, Zakat, is an important marker of social justice, emphasizing giving to the poor.
There is an established scholarly tradition that interprets communism, the theory and system of social organization based upon the writings of Karl Marx and Friedrich Engels, as a form of nontheistic religion. Communist theory promises a peaceful future, through the elimination of inequality, the emergence of an ideal classless society, with a just distribution of resources, no class warfare and no international wars, given war in communist theory is often viewed as the result of capitalist imperialism. Communism envisages an end to what Engels described as social murder, premature deaths within a social class due to exposure to preventable yet lethal conditions.
Yet scholars such as Rudolph Rummel have suggested that communist societies have been the most violent and genocidal in human history. Idealism can be lethal. Others point to examples of peaceful communist societies. Importantly, scholars such as Noam Chomsky argue that, far from reflecting the ideals of Marx and Engels, communist societies of the twentieth century, in practice, betrayed those original ideals. Irrespective of this, the example of mass violence in communist societies suggests that a proper theory of peace must encompass not merely a goal or aspiration, but a way of life.
It is useful to enquire what commonalities we might discern in religious traditions regarding peace, and it seems fair to say that peace is usually viewed as the ultimate goal of human existence. For some religions, this is phrased in eschatological notions such as heaven or paradise, and in other religions this is phrased in terms of an ecstatic state of being. Even in communism, there is an eschatological element, through the creation of a future classless society. There is also an ethical commonality in traditions, in that peaceful existence and actions are set forth as an ethical norm, notwithstanding that there are exceptions to this.
It is in defining and understanding the exceptions that there is a degree of complexity. There is also a common conflict between universalism and particularism within religious traditions, with particularistic emphases, such as in the notion of the Chosen People, arguably embodying the potential for exclusion and violence.
The writings of Plato (428/7-348/7 B.C.E.) would not normally be thought of as presenting a source for a philosophy of peace. Yet there are aspects of Plato’s work, based upon the teaching of Socrates, which may constitute such a source. Within his major work Politeia (Republic), Plato focuses on what makes for justice, an important element in any broad concept of peace. Plato, in effect, presents a peace plan based upon his city-state. This ideal society is essentially static, involving three distinct classes, although it is, nevertheless, a society which provides for at least an internally peaceful polis or state. Plato also develops a theory of forms or ideals, and it is not too difficult to see peace as one of those forms or ideals, and, in contributing to the polis or state, we contribute to the development of that form or ideal. In his work Nomoi (Laws), Plato enunciates the view that the establishment of peace and friendship constitute the highest duty of both the citizen and the legislator, and in the work Symposium, Plato articulates the idea that it is love which brings peace among individuals.
The writings of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) similarly do not present an obvious reference point for a philosophy of peace. Yet there may be such a reference point in his development of virtue ethics, notably in Ethica Nicomachea (Nichomachean Ethics). Virtue ethics may legitimately be linked to a philosophy or ethics of peace. The mean of each of the virtues described by Aristotle may be viewed as qualities conducive to peace. In particular, the mean of the virtue of andreia, usually translated as courage or fortitude, may be seen as similar to the notion of assertiveness, a quality which many writers see as important within nonviolence. Aristotle also identifies justice as a virtue, and many peace theorists emphasize the inter-relationship between peace and justice. Further, some writers have specifically identified peace or peacefulness as a virtue in itself. Interestingly, Aristotle sees the telos or goal of life as eudaimonia, or human flourishing, a concept similar to the ideals set forth in writing on a culture of peace.
Saint Augustine of Hippo (354-430 C.E.) was both a bishop and theologian, and he is widely recognized as capably integrating classical philosophy into Christian thought. His thought is often categorized as late Roman or early medieval. One element of Augustinian thought relevant to a philosophy of peace is his adaptation of the neo-Platonic notion of privation, that evil can be seen as the absence of good. It is an idea which resonates with notions of positive and negative peace. Negative peace can be seen as the absence of positive peace. The notion of privation also suggests that peace ought to be seen as a specific good, and that war is the absence or privation of that good.
The best-known contribution of Augustine to a philosophy of peace, however, is his major work De civitate Dei (The City of God). Within this, Augustine contrasts the temporal human city, which is marked by violent conflict, and the eternal divine city, which is marked by peace. As with many religious writers, the ideal is peace. Augustine is also noteworthy for articulating the notion of just war, wherein Christians may be morally obliged to take up arms to protect the innocent from slaughter. However, this concession is by way of a lament for Augustine, as a mark that Christians are living in a temporal and fallen world. That is a concession which contrasts with the way that others have used just war theory, and in particular the work of Augustine, to justify and glorify war.
Saint Thomas Aquinas (ca.1225-1274) is perhaps best known for his attempt to synthesize faith with reason, for his popularization of Aristotelian thought, and for his focus on virtues. The significant contribution of Aquinas to a philosophy of peace is his major work Summa Theologica (Summary of Theology), and in particular the discussion on ethics and virtues in Part 2 of the work. At Question 29 of Part 2, Aquinas examines the nature of peace, and whether peace itself may be considered a virtue. Aquinas concludes that peace is not a virtue, and further concludes that peace is a work of charity (love). An important qualification, however, is that peace is also described as being, indirectly, a work of justice. We see here the inter-relationship of peace and justice, something taken up by contemporary peace theorists. Aquinas also refined the just war theory, including articulating the requirements of proper authority, just purpose, and just intent when resorting to war.
The Renaissance was a period of a revival of learning in Europe, and it is often identified as a period of transition from the medieval to the modern. The Renaissance is also known for the growth of humanism, that is, an era involving the rediscovery of classical literature, an outlook focusing on human needs and on rational means to solve social problems, and a belief that humankind can shape its own destiny. One central human problem for humanists, and indeed for many thinkers, was and is the phenomenon of war, and Renaissance humanists refused to see war as inevitable and unchangeable. This in itself is an important contribution to a philosophy of peace. Renaissance humanism was not necessarily anti-religious, and indeed most of the humanist writers from this time worked from specifically religious assumptions. It can be argued that in the 21st century we are still part of this humanist project, and an important part of the humanist project is to solve the problem of war and social injustice.
Erasmus of Rotterdam (ca.1466-1536), otherwise known as Desiderius Erasmus, is perhaps the foremost humanist writer of the Renaissance, and arguably also one of the foremost philosophers of peace. In numerous works, Erasmus advocated compromise and arbitration as alternatives to war. The connection between humanism and peace is perhaps best discernable in Erasmus’ 1524 work De libero arbitrio diatribe sive collatio (The Freedom of the Will), where Erasmus points out that if all that we do is predetermined, there is no motivation for improvement. The principle can apply to social dimensions as well. If everything is predetermined, then there is little point in attempting to work for peace. If we say that war and social injustice are inevitable, then there is little motivation to change. Further, saying that war and social injustice are inevitable serves as a self-fulfilling statement, and individuals will tend not to do anything to challenge war and social injustice.
De libero arbitrio is also useful for pondering a philosophy of peace in that the work presents an example of the idea that peace is a means or method, and not merely a goal. Although Erasmus wrote the work in debate with Martin Luther, Erasmus avoids polemics, is reticent to make assertions, strives for moderation, and is anxious to recognize the limitations of his argument. He points out in the Epilogue that parties to disputes will often exaggerate their own arguments, and it is from the conflict of exaggerated views that violent conflict arises. This statement was prophetic, given the religious wars which engulfed Europe following the Protestant Reformation.
However, the best-known peace tract from Erasmus is perhaps the adagium Dolce bellum inexpertis, (War is Sweet to Those Who Have Not Experienced It). Erasmus is quoting from the Greek poet Pindar, and in this adagium he is, in effect, presenting a cultural view of war, namely that war is at least superficially attractive. The implication, although Erasmus does not develop this, is that there is an element to peace which lacks the emotive appeal of war. This is an insight which explains much of the complex relationship between war and peace. Later writers would explore this idea to advocate for a vision of peace which would embrace some of the moral challenges associated with war.
Sir Thomas More (1478-1535) was another leading humanist writer of the Renaissance, and a friend and correspondent of Erasmus. In his 1516 book De optimae rei publicae statu deque nova insula utopia (On the Best Government and on the New Island Utopia), More outlines an ideal society based upon reason and equality. In Book One of Utopia, More articulates his concerns about both internal and external violence. Within Europe, and England in particular, there is senseless capital punishment, for instance in circumstances where individuals are only stealing to find something to eat and thus keep themselves alive. Further, there is a world-wide epidemic of war between monarchs, which debases the countries monarchs seek to lead. Book Two of Utopia provides the solution, with a description of an agrarian equalitarian society; where there is no private property; where the young are educated into pacifism; where war itself only resorted to for defensive reasons or to liberate the oppressed from tyranny; where psychological warfare is preferred to battle; and where there are no massacres nor destruction of cities. This utopian society suggested by More reflects a broad theory of peace. One of the interesting ramifications of More’s vision is whether such a peaceful society, and indeed peace, is ever attainable. The common meaning of the word “utopian” connotes something or a state which is not attainable, although it seems unlikely More would have written his work if he, in common with other humanists of his era and since, did not have at least some belief that the principles he was putting forth were in some way attainable.
Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679) was both a writer and a politician, whose writing was motivated by an overarching concern on how to avoid civil war, and the carnage and suffering resulting from this. He had observed this first-hand in England, and he famously articulated a statist view of peace as a contrast to the anarchy and violence of nature. In his two most noted works, De Civi (The Citizen) and Leviathan, Hobbes articulates a view that human nature is essentially self-interested, and thus the natural state of humankind is one of chaos. Hobbes also sees the essence of war as not merely the action of fighting, but a disposition to fight, and this exists only because there is a dearth of an overarching law-enforcing authority. The only way to introduce a measure of peace is therefore through submission of citizens to a sovereign, or, in more contemporary terminology, the state. Thus, a Hobbesian worldview is often taken to be pessimistic, it holds that the natural condition of humankind is one of violence, and that this violence inevitably predominates where there is no humanizing and civilizing impact of the state. Hobbes raises the important issue of how important is it to have an overarching external authority for lasting peace to exist. If we accept that such an external authority is necessary for peace, then arguably we have the capacity to invent mechanisms to set in place such an external authority.
Baruch or Benedictus de Spinoza (1632-1677) was a Dutch philosopher, of Jewish background, who wrote extensively on a range of philosophical topics. His relevance for a philosophy of peace in general may be found in his advocacy of tolerance in matters of religious doctrine. It is notable also that in his Tractatus Politicus (Political Treatise), written 1675-6 and published after his death, Spinoza asserts: “For peace is not mere absence of war but is a virtue that springs from force of character”. This is a definition of peace that anticipates later expositions, especially those that see peace as a virtue, but also twenty-first century peace theory that differentiates positive from negative peace.
John Locke (1632-1704) is arguably one of the most influential contributors to modern philosophy. Like other philosophers of the time, Locke is important for advancing the notion of tolerance, most clearly in his 1689 Letter Concerning Toleration. The background of this had been the destructive religious wars of the time, and Locke logically suggests that this violence can be avoided through religious tolerance. Within the work of Locke one can also discern elements of the idea of the right to peace. Around 1680, Locke composed his Two Treatises of Government, and, in the second of these at Chapter 2, Locke argues that each individual has a right not to be harmed by another person, that is, a right to life, and it is the role of political authority to protect this right. The right to life and the right not to be harmed arguably anticipate the later notion of the right to peace.
Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778) was a Genevan philosopher of history, and was both a leader and critic of the European Enlightenment. The idea of the noble savage, who lives at peace with his/her fellows and with nature, can be found in many ancient philosophers, although the noble savage is most often associated with the work of Rousseau. In his 1750 Discours sur les sciences et les arts (Discourse on the Sciences and the Arts), Rousseau posited that human morality had been corrupted due to culture; in his 1755 Discours sur l’origine et les fondements de l’inégalité parmi les hommes (Origins of the Inequality of Man), he posits that social and economic developments, especially private property, had corrupted humanity; in his 1762 work Du contrat social (The Social Contract), he posits that authority ultimately rests with the people and not the monarch; and in his 1770 Les Confessions (Confessions), Rousseau extols the peace which comes from being at one with nature. Rousseau anticipates common themes in much peace theory, and especially the counter-cultural and alternative peace movements of the 1960s and 1970s, namely that peace involves a conscious rejection of a corrupting and violent society, a return to a more naturalistic and peaceful existence, and a respect for and affinity with nature. In short, Rousseau suggests that the way to peace is through a more peaceful society, rather than through systems of peace.
Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) is often seen as the modern philosopher who, in his universal ethics and cosmopolitan outlook, has provided what many argue is the most extensive basis for a philosophy of peace. The starting point for the ethics of Kant is the philosophy of duty and an ethics based on duty, and, in particular, the duty to act so that what one does is consistent with what are reasonably desired universal results, what Kant called the categorical imperative. Kant introduced this notion in his 1785 work Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten (Foundation of the Metaphysics of Morals), and developed this in his 1788 Kritik der praktischen Vernunft (Critique of Practical Reason). It has been argued by many, including Kant himself, that we have a duty to peace and that we have a duty to act in a peaceful manner, in that we can only universalize ethics if we consider others, and this at the very least implies a commitment to peace.
A second important Kantian notion is that of das Reich der Zwecke, often translated as the realm or kingdom of ends. In Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten (Foundation of the Metaphysics of Morals), Kant suggests an ethical system wherein persons are ends-in-themselves, and each person is a moral legislator. It is a notion which has important implications for peace, in that the notion implies that each person has an obligation to regard others as ends-in-themselves and thus not engage in violence towards others. In other words, the notion implies that each person has a responsibility to act in a peaceful manner. If all persons acted in this way, it would also mean that the phenomenon of war, wherein moral responsibility is surrendered to the state, would become impossible.
Finally, Kant’s 1795 essay Zum ewigen Frieden (On Perpetual Peace) is the work most often cited in discussing Kant and peace, and this work puts forward what some call the Kantian peace theory. Significantly, in this work Kant suggests more explicitly than elsewhere that there is a moral obligation to peace. For instance, Kant argues in the Second Definitive Article of the work that we have an “immediate duty” to peace. Accordingly, there is also a duty for nation-states to co-operate for peace, and indeed Kant suggests a range of ways that this can be achieved, including republicanism and a league of nations. Importantly, Kant also suggests that the public dimension of actions, which can be understood as transparency, is important for international peace.
The work of Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770-1831) is contentious from the perspective of a philosophy of peace, as he holds what might be called a statist view of morality. Hegel sees human history as a struggle of opposites, from which new entities arise. Hegel sees the state, and by this he means the nation-state, as the highest evolution of human society. Critics, such as John Dewey and Karl Popper, have seen in Hegel a philosophical rationalization of the authoritarian and even totalitarian state. Yet the reliance on the state as an object of stability and peace does not necessarily mean acceptance of bellicose national policies. Further, just as human organization is evolving, one could equally argue that evolution towards a supra-national state with the object of world peace may also be consistent with the organic philosophy of Hegel. It is possible to view Hegel as a source for a philosophy of peace.
William James (1842-1910) was a noted American pragmatist philosopher, and his 1906 essay ‘The Moral Equivalent of War’, originally an oration, was produced at a time when many who had experienced the destruction and loss of life of the American Civil War were still alive. James provides an interesting potential source for a pragmatist philosophy of peace. James argues that it is natural that humans should pursue war, as the exigencies of war provide a unique moral challenge and a unique motivating force for human endeavor. By implication, there is little value in moralizing about war, and moralizing about the need for peace. Rather, what is needed is a challenge which will be seen as an equivalent or counterpoint to war – in other words a moral equivalent of war. The approach of James is consistent with the notion of positive peace, in that peace is seen to be something which embodies, or should embody, cultural challenges.
Mohandas Karamchand Gandhi (1869-1948) is widely regarded as the leading philosopher of nonviolence and intrapersonal peace. Through his life and teaching, Gandhi continually emphasized the importance of nonviolence, based upon the inner commitment of the individual to truth. Thus, Gandhi describes the struggle for nonviolence as truth-force, or satyagraha. Peace is not so much an entity or commodity to be obtained, nor even a set of actions or state of affairs, but a way of life. In Gandhism, peaceful means become united with and indistinguishable from peaceful ends, and thus the call for peace by peaceful means. The thought of Gandhi has been influential in the development of the intrapersonal notion of peace, that peace consists not so much as a set of conditions between those in power, but rather the inner state of a person. Gandhi is also noteworthy in that he linked nonviolence with economic self-reliance.
The philosopher Martin Buber (1878-1965) is well known for emphasizing the importance of authentic dialogue, which comes about when individuals recognize others as persons rather than entities. In his influential 1923 book Ich und Du (I and Thou), Buber suggests that we only exist in relationship, and those relationships are necessarily of two types: personal relationships involving trust and reciprocity, which Buber characterized as Ich-Du, or I-Thou relationships; and instrumental relationships, involving things, which Buber characterized as Ich-Es, or I-It relationships. The book was commenced during the carnage of World War One, and it is not too difficult to see the book as a philosophical reflection on the true nature of peace, in that peace involves dialogue with the other, with war constituting the absence of such dialogue.
There are commonalities between the philosophy of Buber and the ethics of care. Both indicate that we need to see the other as an individual and as a person, that is, we need to see the face of the other. If we recognize the other as human, and engage with them in dialogue, then we are less likely to engage in violence against others, and are more likely to seek for social justice for others. It is also noteworthy that Buber emphasized that all authentic life involves encounter. Thus, if we are not engaging in dialogue with others, then we ourselves do not have peace, at least not in the positive and full construction of the concept.
Martin Luther King Jr. (1929-1968) is perhaps best known as a civil rights campaigner, although he also wrote and spoke extensively on peace and nonviolence. These ideals were also exemplified in his life. One could argue that King did not develop any new philosophy as such, but rather expressed ideas of peace and nonviolence in a uniquely powerful way. Some of the key themes articulated by King were the importance of loving one’s enemies, the duty of nonconformity, universal altruism, inner transformation, the power of assertiveness, the interrelatedness of all reality, the counterproductive nature of hate, the insanity of war, the moral urgency of the now, the necessity of nonviolence in seeking for peace, the importance of a holistic approach to social change, and the notion of evil, especially as evidenced in racism, extreme materialism and militarism.
Gene Sharp (1928-2018) was also an important theorist of nonviolence and nonviolent action, and his work has been widely used by nonviolent activists. Central to his thought are his insights into the power of the state, notably that this power is contingent upon compliance by the subjects of a state. This compliance works through state institutions and through culture. From this, Sharp developed a program of nonviolent action, which works through subverting state power. Critics of Sharp argue that he was in effect a supporter of an American-led world order, especially as his program of nonviolent struggle was generally applied to countries not complying with US geostrategic priorities or with countries not compliant with corporate interests.
Johan Galtung (1930 -) is widely recognized as the leading contemporary theorist on peace, and he is often described as the founder of contemporary peace theory. Galtung has approached the challenge of categorizing peace through describing violence, and specifically through differentiating direct violence from indirect or structural violence. From this distinction, Galtung has developed an integrated typology of peace, comprising: direct peace, where persons or groups are engaged in no or minimal direct violence against another person or group; structural peace, involving just and equitable relationships in and between societies; and cultural peace, where there is a shared commitment to mutual support and encouragement. More recently, a further dimension has been developed, namely, environmental peace, that is, the state of being in harmony with the environment.
The notions of positive and negative peace derive largely from the work of Galtung. Direct peace may be seen as similar to negative peace, in that this involves the absence of direct violence. Structural and cultural peace are similar notions to positive peace, in that these notions invite reflection on wider ideas of what we look for in a peaceful society and in peaceful interactions between individuals and groups. Similarly, an integrated notion of peace, involving personal and social dimensions of peace, derives substantially from Galtung, in that Galtung sees the notions of peace and war as involving more than an absence of violence between nation-states, which is what people often think of when we speak of a time of peace or a time of war.
The value of the various Galtungian paradigms is that these encourage thinking about the complex nature of peace and violence. Yet a problem with the Galtungian approach is that it can be argued as being too all-encompassing, and thus too diffuse. Peace researcher Kenneth Boulding summed up this problem by suggesting, famously, that the notion of structural violence, as developed by Galtung, is, in effect, anything that Galtung did not like. By implication, Galtung’s notion of peace too can be argued to be too general and too diffuse. Interestingly, Galtung has suggested that defining peace is a never-ending task, and indeed articulating a philosophy of peace might similarly be regarded as a never-ending exercise.
In investigating a philosophy of peace, it is useful to examine writing on what might reasonably constitute a philosophy of peace education. The reason is that when defining peace education, we are in effect defining peace, as the encouragement and attainment of peace is the ultimate goal of peace education. Just as peace is increasingly seen as a human right, so too peace education may be thought of as a human right. Thus any philosophy of peace education is very closely linked with what might be seen as a philosophy of peace. For convenience, we can divide approaches to a philosophy of peace education into the deontological and non-deontological.
James Calleja has argued that the philosophical basis for peace education may be found in deontological ethics, that is, we have a duty to peace and a duty to teach peace. Calleja relies strongly on the work of Immanuel Kant in developing this argument, and, in particular, on the Kantian notion of the categorical imperative, and in the subsequent categorical imperative of peace. The first formulation of the categorical imperative from Kant is that one should act in accordance with a maxim that is universal, that is, one should wish for others what one wishes for oneself. In effect, this is can be seen as a philosophical basis for nonviolence and for universal justice, in that as we would wish for security and justice for ourselves, so too we ought to desire this for others.
James Page has developed an alternative philosophical approach to peace education, identifying virtue ethics, consequentialist ethics, conservative political ethics, aesthetic ethics and care ethics as potential bases for peace education. Equally, however, each of the above may also be argued as providing an ethical and philosophical basis for a general theory of peace. For instance, peace may be seen as a settled disposition on the part of the individual, that is, a virtue; peace may be seen as the avoidance of the destruction of war and social inequality; peace may be seen as the presence of just and stable social structures, that is, a social phenomenon; peace may be seen as love for the world and the future, that is, an aesthetic disposition; and peace may be seen as caring for individuals, that is, moral action.
The realization that peace is more than the absence of conflict lies at the heart of the emergence of the notion of a culture of peace, a notion which has been gaining greater attention within peace research in the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries. The notion was implicit within the UNESCO mandate, with the acknowledgment that since wars begin in human minds, it follows that the defense against war needs to be established in the minds of individuals. An extensive expression of this notion was set forth in the United Nations General Assembly resolution 53/243, the Declaration and Programme of Action on a Culture of Peace, adopted unanimously on 13 September 1999, which describes a culture of peace as a set of values, attitudes, traditions and modes of behavior and ways of life. Article 1 of the document indicates that these are based upon a respect for life, ending of violence and promotion and practice of nonviolence through education, dialogue and cooperation.
Any attempt at a philosophy of a culture of peace is complex. One of the challenges is that conflict is a necessary part of human experience and an important element in the emergence of culture. Even if we differentiate violent conflict from mere social conflict, this does not solve the problem entirely, as human culture has still been very much dependent upon the phenomenon of war. A more thorough solution is to admit that war and violence are indeed important factors in human experience and in the formation of human culture, and, rather than denying this, to attempt to seek and foster alternatives to war as a crucial motivating cultural factor for human endeavor, such as William James suggested in his famous essay on a moral equivalent of war.
Another emerging theme in peace theory has been the notion of peace as a human right. There is some logic to the notion of peace as a human right. The emergence of the modern human rights movement arose very much out of the chaos of global war and the emerging consensus that the recognition of human rights was the best way to establish and maintain peace. The right to peace may arguably be found in Article 3 of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, which posits the right to life, sometimes called the supreme right. The right to peace arguably flows from the right to life. This right to peace has been further codified with United Nations General Assembly resolution 33/73, the Declaration on the Preparation of Societies for Life in Peace, adopted on 15 December 1978; with the United Nations General Assembly resolution 39/11, the Declaration of the Right of the Peoples of the World to Peace, adopted on 12 November 1984; and most recently with the United Nations General Assembly resolution 71/189, the Declaration on the Right to Peace, adopted on 19 December 2016.
In a lecture to the International institute of Human Rights in 1970, Karel Vastek famously suggested categorizing human rights in terms of the motto of the French revolution, namely, “liberté, égalité, fraternité.” Following this analysis, first generation rights are concerned with freedoms, second generation rights are concerned with equality, and third generation rights are concerned with solidarity. The right to peace is often characterized as a solidarity or third generation right. Yet one can take a wider interpretation of peace, for instance, that peace implies the right to development and the enjoyment of individual human rights. In this light, peace can be seen as an overarching human right. It is noticeable that there seems to have been such an evolution in thinking about the human right to peace, in that this is gradually being interpreted to include other rights, such as the right to development.
In examining the philosophical foundations for a human right to peace it is useful to examine some of the philosophical bases for human rights generally, namely, interest theory, will theory, and pragmatic theory. Interest theory suggests that the function of human rights is to promote and protect fundamental human interests, and securing these interests is what justifies human rights. What are fundamental human interests? Security is generally identified as being a basic human interest. For instance, John Finnis refers to “life and its capacity for development” as a fundamental human interest, and that “A first basic value, corresponding to the drive for self-preservation, is the value of life” (1980, p. 86). The best chance for self-preservation is that there be a norm for non-harm, which is an important element within a culture of peace. The right to peace therefore serves that basic need for life, both in the sense of protection from violence but also in serving the interests of a good life.
Will theory focuses on the capacity of individuals for freedom of action and the related notion of personal autonomy. For instance, those such as Herbert Hart have argued that all rights stem from the equal right of all individuals to be free. Any right to personal freedom, however, contains an inherent limitation, in that one cannot logically exercise one’s own freedom to impinge upon another person’s freedom. This is captured in the adage that my right to swing my fist ends at another person’s nose. Why is that adage correct? One answer is that within the notion of will theory there is an implicit endorsement of a right to peace, that is, not to harm or do damage to others.
The pragmatic theory of human rights posits that such rights simply constitute a practical way that we can arrive at a peaceful society. For instance, John Rawls suggests that the laws of people, as opposed to the laws of states, is a set of ideals and principles by which people from different backgrounds can agree on how their actions towards each other should be governed and judged, and through which people can establish the conditions of peace. This is not to deny those critics who point out that human rights can function as a rationale for the powerful to engage in collective violence, and that there can be a tension between human rights and national sovereignty. Thus, paradoxically, national sovereignty can sometimes serve to promote and provide peace, and human rights can sometimes be used underscore violence.
The importance of the human right to peace is perhaps best summed up by William Peterfi, who has described peace as a corollary to all human rights, such that “without the human right to peace no other human right can be securely guaranteed to any individual in any country no matter the ideological system under which the individual may live” (1979, p.23). The notion of the human right to peace also changes the nature of discourse about peace, from something to which individuals and groups might aspire, to something which individuals and groups can reasonably demand. The notion of the human right to peace also changes the nature of the responsibility of those in positions of power, from a vague aspiration that those in power need to provide for peace, to the expectation and duty that those in power will provide peace.
Given the challenges of defining peace, the philosophical problem of peace may be phrased in terms of a question: is there any such thing as absolute peace? Or ought we be satisfied with an imperfect peace? For instance, can there ever be a complete elimination of all forms of armed conflict, or at least the elimination of reliance on armed force as the ultimate means of enforcement of will? Similarly, one may ask: is there any such thing as absolute co-operation and harmony between individuals and groups, an absolute sense of well-being within individuals, and an absolute oneness with the external environment?
The philosophical solution to this problem may be to point out that there is always an open-ended dimension to peace, that is, if we take a broad interpretation of peace, we will always be moving towards such a goal. Some might articulate this as the eschatological dimension of peace, suggesting that the contradictions which are raised in any discussion on peace can only be resolved, ultimately, at the end of time. It is relevant to note, however, that peace theorists have pointed out that if we assert that a certain outcome, such as peace, is not attainable, our actions will serve to make this a self-fulfilling prophecy. In other words, if we assert that peace, relative or absolute, is not attainable, then there will be a reduced expectation of this, and a reduced commitment to making this happen.
It is worthwhile looking at the relationship of the theory of peace to the theory of truth. The relationship can be seen to operate at a number of levels. For instance, Mohandas Gandhi described his theory of nonviolence as satyagraha, often translated as truth force. Similarly, Gandhi entitled his autobiography ‘The Story of My Experiments with Truth’. Gandhi saw nonviolence, or ahimsa, as the noblest expression of truth, or sat, and argued there is no way to find truth except through nonviolence. For Gandhi, peace was not merely an ideal, rather it was based on what he saw as the truth of the innate nonviolence of individuals, which the institutions of war and imperialism distorted. Further, peace involves authenticity, a notion related to truth, in that the person involved in advocating peace ought to themselves be peaceful. We thus arrive at the Gandhian dictum that there is no way to peace as such, rather peace is the way, that is, peace is an internal life-style commitment on the part of the individual.
Conversely, war arguably operates as a form of untruth. This was summed up succinctly by Erasmus, in his dictum that war is sweet to those who have not experienced it. IN 1985, Elaine Scarry wrote that the mythology of war obscures what war is actually about, namely, the body in pain. Similarly, Morgan Scott Peck has written about a lack of truthfulness, especially in war, as being the essence of evil. Typically, those advocating war will concede that the recourse to war is not a good option, but suggest that there is no other option, or that war is the least bad option. The empirical history of nonviolence suggests that this is not the case, and that there are almost always alternatives to violence.
If peace is about establishing societies with harmonious and cooperative relationships, then a key component in establishing such societies is arguably knowledge about ourselves, or accepting the truth about ourselves. Without this, it is unlikely that we will be able to establish peaceful societies, as we will not have resolved the inclinations to violence within ourselves. The notion of what constitutes the true self, or the truth about one’s self, is a complex one. Carl Gustav Jung usefully wrote about the shadow or the normally unrecognized side of one’s character. The extent to which the shadow side of our personality can result in participation in and support for violence can be shocking to us. This is not to say that human nature is irretrievably attracted to violence or cruelty. For instance, the Seville Statement on Violence, sponsored by UNESCO, argues that war is a human invention. Yet there is a strong argument that peace involves recognition of the potential within one’s self for violence. Put another way, peace involves peace with one’s self.
In the work of Sigmund Freud, and especially in his 1930 work Das Unbehagen in der Kulture (Civilization and its Discontents), Eros is the life instinct, which includes sexual instincts and the will to live and survive. The nominal opposite of the life instinct is the death instinct, which is the will to death. Later theorists described this as Thanatos. Freud developed his theory of competing drives in his therapeutic dealings with soldiers from World War One, many of whom were suffering from psychological trauma as a result of their war experiences. It is not too difficult to see Eros as a synonym for peace, in that peace involves all that Eros represents. Psychiatrist and peace activist Eric Fromm developed this theme further, writing of biophilia as the love of life, from which all peace comes, and necrophilia, as the love of death and destruction, which is the basis of war.
Even if we acknowledge a link between the death instinct and war, the relationship between the life instinct and the death instinct is not simple. Freud wrote of the basic desire for death seemingly competing with the desire for life. Yet the two instincts may also be viewed as complementary. It is because we are all aware, at least subconsciously, of our impending mortality, that we a driven to risk death, especially in the enterprise we call war. Many writers have explored this complexity. For instance, the psychiatrist Elizabeth Kubler-Ross writes: “Is war perhaps nothing else but a need to face death, to conquer and master it, to come out of it alive—a peculiar form of denial of our own mortality?” (2014, p.13).
If we think of Eros as peace, then a logical extension is to think of human sexuality and the expression of human sexuality as one embodiment of peace. The post-Freudians Herbert Marcuse and Wilhelm Reich both developed this theme, arguing that the origins of war and unjust social organization rested in repressed sexual desire, and that conversely peace implies sexual freedom. This idea was neatly summed up in the 1960s radical slogan, “Make love not war”. An important qualification to the peace-as-sexuality theory is that this always involves consensual sexual relationships. Many writers have identified rape and other exploitative sexual relationships as important components of war and social injustice.
In considering a philosophy of peace, the phenomenon of empire presents a paradox for peace theory. The establishment of an empire may be seen as establishing a form of peace. It is thus common to refer to Pax Romana, as the form of peace which was established by virtue of the Roman Empire, and Pax Britannica, Pax Sovietica, and Pax Americana, referring to later periods of empire. It is true that within empires, it can be argued that there is no war, at least not in the conventional sense. Critics of imperialism, however, point to violence being moved to the periphery of the empire; there is the problem of inter-imperial rivalry; and there is also the problem that empires frequently engage in the violent suppression of minorities within the borders of the empire.
Similarly, the phenomenon of the state presents a paradox for peace theory. The establishment of a stable state generally means that citizens can live and work free from violence, and ideally, at least in democratic states, within a framework of social justice. Yet, as sociologist Max Weber famously pointed out, it is in the very nature of the state that it claims a monopoly over the legitimate use of violence. The legitimate use of violence finds its ultimate expression in the phenomenon of war. Thus, anarcho-pacifists argue if one wants to eliminate war, then one needs to eliminate the state, at least in its current nation-state form.
Existentialism may be defined in philosophical terms as the view that truth cannot be objectified, but rather it can only be experienced. This is not to deny the objective reality of an entity, but rather to say that the limitations of language are such that this cannot be objectified. We can apply this to a philosophical analysis of peace, and suggest that ultimately peace cannot be objectified, but rather it can be experienced. Thus, attempts to specify what peace is are likely to be problematic. Rather we can represent peace by way of illustration, to say that peace involves a set of behaviors and attitudes, and we can represent peace by way of negation, to say that peace is not deliberate violence to other persons. Or we can say, in true existentialist fashion, that we can only know peace through encounter or relationship.
Another way of articulating the idea of existentialist peace is by referring to the metaphysics of peace. The existentialist theologian John Macquarrie writes: “By a metaphysical concept, I mean one the boundaries of which cannot be precisely determined, not because we lack information but because the concept itself turns out to have such depth and inexhaustibility that the more we explore it, the more we see that something further remains to be explored” (1973, p.63), and further: ”If peace … is fundamentally wholeness, and if metaphysics seeks to maximize our perception of wholeness and inter-relatedness, then peace and metaphysics may be more closely linked than is sometimes supposed; while, conversely, the fragmented understanding of life may well be connected with the actual fracturing of life itself, a fracturing which is the opposite of peace. But the true metaphysical dimensions of peace emerge because even to seek a wholeness for human life drives us to ask questions which take us to the very boundaries of understanding. What is finally of value? What is real and what is illusory? What conditions would one need to postulate as making possible the realization of true peace?” (1973, p.64).
Postcolonial theory posits, in general terms, that not only has global colonial history determined the shape of the world as we know it today, but the power relationships implicit in colonialism have determined contemporary thinking. Thus, the powerless tend to be marginalized in contemporary thinking. Some writers, such as Victoria Fountain, have suggested there is a need to decolonize peace theory, including taking into account the everyday experience of ordinary people, transcending liberal peace theory which tends to assume the legitimacy of power, and transcending the view that the Global North needs to come to rescue of the Global South. Thus the discourse on peace, so it is argued, needs to be less Eurocentric. The argument is that the narrative of peace needs to change.
Postcolonial peace theory intersects with much feminist peace theory, represented by writers such as Elizabeth Boulding, Cynthia Enloe, Nel Noddings, and Betty Reardon. The suggestion is often made by such theorists that a feminine or maternal perspective is uniquely personal, caring and peace-oriented. The corollary to this is that a male perspective tends to be less personal, less caring, and more war-centric. Feminist peace theorists have also pointed out that war and militarism work on patriarchal assumptions, such as women need protecting and it is the duty of men to protect women, and that there is no alternative to the current system of security through power and domination. The argument is also made that war and patriarchy are part of the same system.
Postcolonial and feminist peace theory are highly contested. For instance, it can be argued that, as current philosophical discourse has evolved from European origins, articulating peace in terms of concepts articulated by European authors is a merely a matter of utilizing this global language. Similarly, one can argue since it is a historical reality that most influential philosophers in history have hitherto been male, therefore the existing narrative will naturally tend to have more male sources and male voices. One can arguably apply a quota system to some areas such as contemporary politics, but it is more difficult to argue that a quota system ought to be applied to narrative and to discourse. Critics of postcolonial peace theory also allege that postcolonial peace theory tends to avoid universalist statements on human rights, which itself is important, given the key role of human rights in peace, and given the emerging human right to peace itself.
One interesting way to address the issue of a philosophy of peace is to think of war as representing the absence of philosophy, in that war is prosecuted on the assumption that one person or group itself possesses truth, and that the views of that individual or group ought to be imposed, if necessary, by violent force. War may also be seen as the absence of philosophy in that war represents an absence of the love of wisdom. This is not to deny there are philosophies and philosophers who justify war and injustice. Ultimately, however, these philosophies are not sustainable, as war is an institution which involves destruction of both the self and societies. Similarly, social injustice is not sustainable, as within social injustice we find the seeds of war and destruction.
Conversely, it can be argued that philosophy itself represents the presence of peace, in that philosophy generally does not or should not involve assumptions that one person or group by itself uniquely possesses truth, but rather the way to truth is through a process of questioning, sometimes called dialectic. Therefore, philosophy by its essence is or should be a tolerant enterprise, and it is also an enterprise which involves or should involve debate and discussion. Philosophy thus presents a template for a peaceful society, wherein differing viewpoints are considered and explored, and which, through the love of wisdom, encourages thinking and exploring about positive and life-enhancing futures. This means that engaging in philosophy may well be a useful start to a peaceful future.
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