Plato: Organicism

PlatoOrganicism is the position that the universe is orderly and alive, much like an organism. According to Plato, the Demiurge creates a living and intelligent universe because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life. It is the perfect animal.  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the universe, the world, is necessarily alive and intelligent. And mortal organisms are a microcosm of the great macrocosm.

Although Plato is most famous today for his theory of Forms and for the utopian and elitist political philosophy in his Republic, his later writings promote an organicist cosmology which, prima facie, conflicts with aspects of his theory of Forms and of his signature political philosophy. The organicism is found primarily in the Timaeus, but also in the Philebus, Statesman, and Laws.

Because the Timaeus was the only major dialogue of Plato available in the West during most of the Middle Ages, during much of that period his cosmology was assumed by scholars to represent the mature philosophy of Plato, and when many Medieval philosophers refer to Platonism they mean his organicist cosmology, not his theory of Forms. Despite this, Plato’s organicist cosmology is largely unknown to contemporary philosophers, although many scholars have recently begun to show renewed interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato
    2. Greek Organicism
  2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology
    1. Creation of the World Animal
    2. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm
    3. Creation as Procreation
    4. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos
  3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy
    1. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics
    2. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics
    3. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy
    4. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine
    5. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms
  4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology
    1. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism
    2. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

a. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato

In his 1927-28 Gifford Lectures, Whitehead (1978) makes the startling suggestion that Plato’s philosophy is akin to a philosophy of organism. This is surprising to many scholars because Plato’s signature doctrine, the theory of Forms, would seem to be as far removed from a philosophy of organism as possible. On the usual understanding of the theory of Forms, reality is divided into a perfect, eternal, unchanging, world of  Forms or universals, and a separate, finite, imperfect world of perceptible particulars, where the latter is an image of the former and is, in some obscure way, unreal, or less real, than the Forms.  Since living things requires growth and change, and since, according to the theory of Forms, these are mere images of the only genuine realities, the Forms, it would seem there can be no fundamental place for living organisms in Plato’s ontology.

The case for Whitehead’s thesis is based on Plato’s Timaeus, where he  compares the kosmos to a living organism, but also, to a lesser degree, on the Laws, Statesman, Philebus and Critias.   Since the Timaeus is concerned with the temporal world, generally thought to be denigrated by the “other-worldly” Plato, its relevance to Plato’s philosophy has been doubted.   First, the cosmology of the Timaeus is not even presented by Socrates, but by Timaeus, a 5th century Pythagorean.   Second, the Timaeus represents its organicist cosmology as a mere probable story.    Third, although Plato employs myths in most of his dialogues, these are generally combined with discursive argument, but the Timaeus is “myth from beginning to end” (Robin, 1996).   For these reasons, many scholars hold that the Timaeus represents a digression into physical speculations that have more to do with the natural sciences per se than they do with philosophy proper (Taylor, 1928).    Russell (1945) allows that the Timaeus deserves to be studied because it has had such great influence on the history of ideas, but holds that “as philosophy it is unimportant.”  The case is further complicated by the controversy over the longstanding view that the Timaeus is a later period dialogue.  For a discussion of these stylometric and chronological disputes see Kraut (1992), Brandwood (1992), and Meinwald (1992).

It is worth remembering, however, that throughout most of the Middle Ages, the Timaeus was the only Platonic dialogues widely available in the West and most scholars at that time assumed that it represents Plato’s mature views (Knowles, 1989).   Second, the dialogue in the Timaeus appears to take up where that of the Republic leaves off, suggesting that Plato himself saw a continuity between the views in the two works.  It is also worth pointing out that some physicists, such as Heisenberg (1958),  have claimed that the Timaeus provided inspiration for their rejection of the materialism of Democritus in favor of the mathematical forms of Plato and the Pythagoreans (see also Brisson and Meyerstein, 1995).   For these and other reasons, a growing number of scholars have, despite the controversies, begun to return to the Timaeus with renewed philosophical interest (Vlastos, 1975; Ostenfield, 1982; Annas, 1999; Sallis, 1999; Carone, 2000; and so forth.).

b. Greek Organicism

In his introduction to Plato’s works, Cairns (1961)  points out that the Greek view, as far back as we have records, is that the world is orderly and alive.  From this perspective, the failure to appreciate Plato’s organicism is part and parcel of a failure to appreciate Greek organicism more generally. For example, whereas modern scholars view the Milesians as forerunners of modern materialism (Jeans, 1958), the Milesians held that matter is alive (Cornford, 1965; Robin, 1996).  Similarly, Anaximenes did not hold that air is the basis of all things in the same sense, or for the same reasons, that a modern materialist might hold such a view.  He views air as breath and sees air as the basis of all things because he sees the world as a living thing and therefore “wants it to breath” (Robin, 1996; Cornford, 1966). Pythagoras too, who exerted great influence on Plato, saw the world as a living breathing being (Robinson, 1968).    Cornford (1966) notes that Plato’s description in the Timaeus of his world animal as a “well rounded sphere” has been seen by some scholars as the best commentary on Parmenides’ comparison of his One Being to a perfect sphere (raising the possibility of a Parmenidean organicism).    Finally, by stressing that fire is the basis of all things, Heraclitus did not mean that fire is the material out of which all things are made.  His fire is an “ever living” fire (Burnet, 1971).  Similar points could be made about other pre-Socratic philosophers.   The Greek tendency to view the world as a living thing is rooted in the fact that the early Greek notion of nature, physis, was closer in meaning to life than to matter (Cornford, 1965).   This is why, as far back as Hesiod, procreation plays such a prominent role in Greek creation stories, as it does in the Timaeus (Section 2c.).   From this perspective, it is not surprising that Plato develops an organicist cosmology.    It would be surprising if he did not have one.

2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology

a. Creation of the World Animal

The Timaeus describes the world (kosmos) as a created living being.  The world is created by the “Demiurge  [ho demiourgos]” who follows an “eternal pattern” reminiscent of Plato’s Forms (Carone, 2000).  The materials out of which the kosmos is fashioned are already present.    The eternal patterns or Forms, the Demiurge himself, and the materials, all pre-exist the creation.  Thus, Plato’s Demiurge is not omnipotent, but is more like a craftsman, limited both by the eternal patterns and by the prior matter.  The creative act consists in putting “intelligence in soul and soul in body” in accord with the eternal patterns.  The soul in the Timaeus and Laws is understood as the principle of self-motion.

The pre-existing materials are described as “chaos.”   By “chaos” Plato does not mean the complete absence of order, but a kind of order, perhaps even a mechanical order, opposed to Reason.   This “chaotic” tendency survives the imposition of Form and is always threatening to break out and undermine the rational order of the world.   For this reason Plato’s kosmos exhibits a dynamical quality quite alien to modern thought.

The Demiurge creates a living and intelligent world because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life.  It is “the perfect animal.”  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the world is necessarily alive and intelligent.

The Timaeus identifies three different kinds of souls, the rational (eternal) soul, the spirited soul, and the plantlike soul capable of sensation but not of genuine self-motion.   The world-animal possesses the highest and most perfect kind of soul, the rational soul, but it also shares in the two lower types of soul as well.  The world may be the perfect animal, but it is not a perfect being because it possesses the lower types of soul.  The presence of these lower types of soul helps to explain the imperfection in the world.

The Timaeus holds that the world is “solitary.”   The Demiurge only creates one world, not because he is stingy, but because he can only create the best and there can only be one best world.   Since it is solitary, there is nowhere for it to go and nothing for it to perceive.   The perfect-animal has, therefore, no external limbs or sense organs.

The Demiurge gives the world the most suitable shape, that is, it is a sphere with each point on the circumference equidistant from the center.   Since it has no need of sense organs or limbs, it is perfectly smooth.  Although the pre-existing visible body is also a sphere, it turns out that a sphere is also the most suitable choice of shape for the perfect animal (Sect. 4c).  The Demiurge imposes an order on that pre-existing material sphere that makes it suitable for the introduction of a soul.    Thus, Plato does not deny that there are material or mechanical conditions for life and mind.  He only insists that these are subordinated in the world to the more basic rule by reason (McDonough, 1991).

The Demiurge makes the perfect animal in the shape of a sphere since a sphere “is the most like itself of all figures” and that makes for the most beautiful figure.  Unlike the modern view that values are a subjective coloring imposed by the human mind (Putnam, 1990), Plato’s kosmos is intrinsically beautiful and good.   Plato’s science of nature does not seek to strip things of value in order to see them “objectively”, but, rather, to describe the intrinsic values writ large in the perfect visible cosmic organism (Sect. 3a-3c).

The Demiurge puts the soul in the center of the sphere, but it “diffuses” throughout the entire sphere.   The Demiurge synchronizes the two spheres “center to center.”  Thus, Plato distinguishes between the organism’s spiritual center and its bodily center, and holds that these must be made, by the Demiurge, to correspond with each other.  This is an early version of the “correlation thesis” (Putnam, 1981), the view that there must be a correspondence between the mental and material states of the organism.   That which is produced directly by intelligence may only have a teleological explanation, while that caused by matter not controlled by intelligence may have only a physical explanation, but that which is produced by the informing of matter by intelligence admits of both a teleological and a physical explanation.   In that case, the teleological and physical “spheres” must correspond with each other.  The world-animal is One in the sense that it possesses an organic unity by virtue of its central order-imposing soul.

Since the kosmos is a perfect animal,  and since an animal has parts, the world is ”a perfect whole of perfect parts.”   The kosmos is a whole of parts because it is “the very image of that whole of which all the animals and their tribes are portions.”  The “whole” of which the kosmos is an image is called “the Form of the Intelligible Animal.”

The Form of the Intelligible Animal contains “all intelligible beings, just as this [visible] world contains all other visible creatures.”  The perfect animal must embrace all possible species of “intelligible beings.”   Thus, Plato’s world-animal is actually a whole ecosystem of interrelated animals.    It should not, however, be assumed that the cosmic animal is not also a single organism.   Although the human body is, in one sense, a single organism, it is, in another sense, a whole system of interrelated organisms (the individual cells of the body), which combine to form one more perfect organism.

The view that the Form of the intelligible animal contains all intelligible beings suggests that only animals are intelligible.   Matter as such is not intelligible.  A material thing is only intelligible because it instantiates a Form.  The Timaeus suggests that the total recipe for the instantiation of the Forms is a living organism.  The ideas that only living things are intelligible and that matter per se is unintelligible are foreign to the modern mind.   Nonetheless, Plato sees a close connection between life and intelligibility.

Since there is nothing outside the perfect animal, it exists “in itself.”  Since it exists “in itself,” it is self sufficient in the visible world.  It does depend on the Forms, but it does not depend on anything more basic in the perceptible world.   Since it moves, but is an image of the self-sufficient Forms, it moves in the most self-sufficient way, that is, it is self- moving.   Since there is nothing outside it, it can only move “within its own limits,”  that is, it can only rotate around its own axis. The circular motion of the perfect animal is the best perceptible image of the perfection and self-sameness of the eternal Forms.

Since the perfect animal is intelligent, it thinks.   Since it is self-moving, it is a self-moving thinker.   Since it is self-sufficient in the visible world, it is, in that realm, absolute spontaneity.   Plato’s characterization of the perfect animal as a “sensible God” expresses the fact that it possesses these divine qualities of self-sufficiency, self movement, and absolute spontaneity deriving from its participation in an eternal pattern.

The Timaeus presents a  complex mathematical account, involving the mixing of various types of being, in various precise proportions, of the creation of the “spherical envelope to the body of the universe,” that is, the heavens.  The more orderly movements of the heavenly bodies are better suited than earthly bodies to represent the eternal patterns, but they are not completely ordered.   In addition to the perfect circular movements of the stars, there is also the less orderly movement of the planets.  Plato distinguishes these as “the same” and “the different.”   Whereas the stars display invariable circular movements, the planets move in diverse manners, a different motion for each of the seven planets.   Thus, the movement of the stars is “undivided,” while that of  the plants is divided into separate diverse motions.   Since the former is superior, the movements of the different are subordinated to those of “the same.”  The entirely regular movement of “the same” is the perfect image of the eternal patterns, while the movement of  “the different” is a manifestation of the imperfect material body of the kosmos.   Nevertheless, since “the different” are in the heavens, they are still much more orderly than the “chaotic” movements of bodies on earth.   Although this account is plainly unbelievable, it sheds light on his concept of an organism and his views about intelligence.

To take one example, Plato invokes the dichotomy of “the same” and “the different” to explain the origins of knowledge and true belief.   Because the soul is composed of both “the same” and “the different,” she is capable of recognizing the sameness or difference in anything that “has being.”  Both knowledge and true opinion achieve truth, for “reason works with equal truth whether she is in the sphere of the diverse or of the same,” but intelligence and knowledge, the work of “the same,” are still superior to true belief, the work of “the different.”   Insofar as the heavens display the movements of “the same,” the world animal achieves intelligence and knowledge, but  insofar as “the circle of the diverse” imparts the “intimations of sense” to the soul mere true belief is achieved.    Plato is, in effect, describing a kind of celestial mechanism to explain the origins of the perfect animal’s knowledge on the one hand and true belief on the other.   His view implies that an organism must  be imperfect if it is to have true beliefs about a corporeal world and that these imperfections must be reflected in its “mechanism” of belief.

Because of their perfect circular motions, the heavens are better suited than earthly movements to measure time.    Thus, time is “the moving image of eternity.”  This temporal “image of eternity” is eternal and “moves in accord with number” while eternity itself “rests in unity.”  But time is not a representation of just any Form.  It is an image of the Form of the Intelligible Animal.   Since time is measured by the movement of the perfect bodies in the heavens, and since that movement constitutes the life of the perfect animal, time is measured by the movement of the perfect life on display in the heavens, establishing a connection between time and life carried down to Bergson (1983).

b. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm

The Demiurge creates the world-animal, but leaves the creation of mortal animals to the “created gods,” by which Plato may mean the earth (female) and the sun (male).  Since the created gods imitate the creator, mortal animals are also copies of the world-animal.   Thus, man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, a view that extends from the pre-Socratics (Robinson, 1968), through Scholastic philosophy (Wulf, 1956) and the Renaissance (Cassirer, 1979), to Leibniz (1968), Wittgenstein (1966), Whitehead (1978), and others.

Although plants and the lesser animals are briefly discussed in the Timaeus, the only mortal organism described in detail is man.  Since imperfections are introduced at each stage of copying, man is less perfect than the cosmic-animal, the lesser animals are less perfect than man, and plants are less perfect than the lesser animals.  This yields a hierarchy of organisms, a “great chain of being,” arranged from the most perfect world-animal at the top to the least perfect organisms at the bottom (Lovejoy, 1964).

Since an ordinary organism is a microcosm of the macrocosm, the structure of a mortal organism parallels that of the macrocosm.  Since the structure of the macrocosm is the structure of the heavens (broadly construed to include the earth at the center of the heavenly spheres), one need not rely on empirical studies of ordinary biological organisms.  Since the Timaeus holds that the archetype of an organism is “writ large” in the heavens, the science of astronomy is the primary guide to the understanding of living things. In this respect, our modern view owes more to Aristotle, who accorded greater dignity to the empirical study of ordinary living things (Hamilton, 1964, p. 32).

Since the macrocosm is a sphere with the airy parts at the periphery and the earth at the center, ordinary organisms also have a spherical structure with the airy parts at the periphery and the heavier elements at the center.   Since an ordinary organism is less perfect than the world animal, its spherical shape is distorted.   Although there are three kinds of souls, these are housed in separate bodily spheres.   The rational, or immortal, soul is located in the sphere of the head.  The two mortal souls are encased in the sphere of the thorax and the sphere of the abdomen.   The division of the mortal soul into two parts is compared with the division of a household into the male and female “quarters.”

The head contains the first principle of life.  The soul is united with the body at its center.  Since Plato uses “marrow” as a general term for the material at the center of a seed, the head contains the brain “marrow” suited to house the most divine soul.  There are other kinds of “marrows” at the centers of the chest and abdomen.    The sphere is the natural shape for an animal because the principle of generation takes the same form as a seed, and most seeds are spherical.  The head is a “seed” that gives birth to immortal thoughts.  The thorax and abdomen are “seeds” that give birth to their own appropriate motions.

The motions in the various organic systems imitate the circular motions of the heavens.   Respiration is compared to “the rotation of a wheel.”    Since there can be no vacuum, air taken in at one part forces the air already there to move out of its place, which forces the air further down to move, and so on.  Plato gives a similar account of the circulatory system.  The blood is compelled to move by the action of the heart in the center of the chest.  “[T]he particles of the blood … which are contained within the frame of the animal as in a sort of heaven, are compelled to imitate the motion of the universe.”    The blood circulates around the central heart just as the stars circulate around the central earth.   Similar accounts are given of ingestion and evacuation.   The action of the lungs, heart, and so forth, constitutes the bodily mechanism that implements the organic telos.    In the Phaedo and Laws, Plato compares the Earth, the “true mother of us all,” to an organism with its own circulatory systems of subterranean rivers of water and lava.  The organic model of the heavens is the template for an organic model of the geological structure of the earth.

Since the perfect animal has no limbs or sense organs, “the other six [the non-circular] motions were taken away from him.”  Since there is no eternal pattern for these chaotic motions associated with animal life, they are treated as unintelligible.  There is, for Plato, no science of chaos.  His remarks are consistent with the view that there can be a mechanics of the non-circular bodily motions, but since such a mechanics cannot give the all- important reason for the motion it so does not qualify as a science in Plato’s sense.

Since the rise of the mechanistic world view in the 18th century, it has been impossible for modern thinkers to take Plato’s cosmology seriously.  It cannot, however, be denied that it is a breathtaking vision.   If nothing else, it is a startling reminder how differently ancient thinkers viewed the universe.   According to the Timaeus, we on earth live at the center of one unique perfect cosmic organism, in whose image we have been created, and whose nature and destiny has been ordained by imperceptible transcendent forces from eternity.  When we look up at the night sky, we are not seeing mere physical bodies moving in accord with blind mechanical laws, but, rather, are, quite literally, seeing the radiant airy periphery of that single perfect cosmic life, the image of our own (better) selves, from which we draw our being, our guidance, and our destiny.

Finally, Plato is, in the Timaeus, fashioning important components of our concept of an organism, a concept which survives even when his specific quaint theories, do not.  For example, biologists have noted that animals, especially those, like Plato’s perfect animal, that have no need of external sense organs or limbs, tend towards a spherical shape organized around a center (Buchsbaum, 1957).  Indeed, central state materialism, the modern view that the intelligence is causally traceable to the neural center, is, arguably, a conceptual descendent of Plato’s notion of an organism organized around a center.

c. Creation as Procreation


Whereas in his earlier dialogues Plato had distinguished Forms and perceptible objects, the latter copies of the former,  the Timaeus announces the need to posit yet another kind of being, “the Receptacle,” or “nurse of all generation.”  The Receptacle is like the Forms insofar as it is a “universal nature” and is always “the same,” but it must be “formless” so that it can “take every variety of form.”   The Receptacle is likened to “the mother” of all generation, while “the source or spring” of generation, the Demiurge, is likened to the father.   In the Timaeus, the creation of the world is not a purely intellectual act, but, following the sexual motif in pre-Socratic cosmogony, it is modeled on sexual generation.

Plato’s argument for positing the Receptacle is that since visible objects do not exist in themselves, and since they do not exist in the Forms, they must exist “in another,” and the Receptacle is this “other” in which visible objects exist, that is, the argument for positing the Receptacle is premised on the ontologically  dependent status of visible objects.

Since the perfect motion is circular, generation too moves in a circle.  This is true of the generation of the basic elements, earth, air, fire, and water, out of each other, but it is also true of animal generation.  Since the parents of a certain type only generate offspring of the same type, the cycle of procreation always returns, in a circular movement, to the same point from which it started    It is only in creating a copy of themselves, which then go on to do that same, that mortal creatures partake of the eternal (Essentially the same picture is found in Plato’s Symposium and in Aristotle’s Generation of Animals).  Since the sexual act presupposes the prior existence of the male and female principles, the procreation model also explains why Plato’s Demiurge does not create from nothing.

Plato identifies the Receptacle with space, but also suggests that the basic matters, such as fire, are part of its nature, so it cannot be mere space.   Although Plato admits that it somehow “partakes of the intelligible,” he also states that it “is hardly real” and that we only behold it “as in a dream.”   Despite the importance of this view in the Timaeus, Plato is clearly puzzled, and concludes that the Receptacle is only apprehended by a kind of “spurious reason.”   Given his comparison of the receptacle to the female principle, he may think that visible objects are dependent on “another” in something like the sense in which a foetus is dependent on the mother’s womb.  On the other hand, Plato admits that these are murky waters and it is doubtful that the sexual imagery can be taken literally.

d. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos

The Western intellectual tradition begins, arguably, with the cosmogony in Hesiod’s Theogony, according to which the world emerges from chaos.  A similar story is found in Plato’s creation story in the Timaeus, where, in the beginning, everything is in “disorder” and any “proportion” between things is accidental.   None of the kinds, such as fire, water, and so forth, exist.  These had to be “first set in order” by God, who then, out of them, creates the cosmic animal.   Since the root meaning of the Greek “kosmos” is orderly arrangement, the Timaeus presents a classic picture of the emergence of order out of chaos.

The doctrine of emergent evolution, associated with Bergson (1983), Alexander (1920), and Morgan (1923), is the view that the laws of nature evolve over time (Nagel, 1979).   Since, in the Timaeus, the laws of nature are not fixed by the conditions in the primordial “chaos,” but only arise, under the supervision of the Demiurge, in a temporal process, Plato’s cosmology appears to anticipate these later views.  Mourelatos (1986) argues that emergentism is present in the later pre-Socratic philosophers.  Although emergentism has been out of fashion for some time, it has recently been enjoying a revival (See Kim, Beckermann, and Flores, 1992; McDonough, 2002; Clayton and Davies, 2006, and so forth).

3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy

a. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics

Since reason dictates that the best creation is the perfect animal, the living kosmos is the most beautiful created thing.   Since the perfect animal is a combination of soul and body, these must be combined in the right proportion.   The correct proportion of these constitutes the organic unity of the organism.   Thus, the beauty of an organism consists in its organic unity.   Since other mortal organisms are microcosms of the macrocosm, the standard of beauty for a mortal organism is set by the beauty of the kosmos.   The beauty of a human being is, in effect, modeled on the beauty of a world.

There is a link between beauty and pleasure, but pleasure is derivative.  Since beauty is a matter of  rational proportion, a rational person naturally finds the sight of beauty pleasurable.   Thus, a rational person finds a well proportioned organism beautiful, where the relevant proportions include not merely physical proportions but the most basic proportion between body and soul.   Finally, since an organism has an organic unity, rationality, beauty, health and virtue can only occur together.    Thus, Plato’s aesthetics shades into his ethics, his view of medicine, and his conception of philosophy itself.

b. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics

Perhaps the most basic objection to Plato’s ethics is the charge that his view that the Forms are patterns for conduct is empty of content.   What can it mean for a changeable, corporeal, mortal, living creature to imitate a non-living immaterial, eternal, unchanging, abstract object?   Plato’s organicist cosmology addresses this gap in his ethical theory.

Since the kosmos is copied from the Form of the Intelligible Animal, and since man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, there is a kinship between the rational part of man and the cosmic life on display in the heavens.   There is a close link, foreign to the modern mind, between ethics and astronomy (Carone, 2000).  This explains why, in the Theaetetus, Socrates states that the philosopher spends their time “searching the heavens.”

Specifically, the ethical individual must strive to imitate the self-sufficiency of the kosmos.  Since the most fundamental dimension of self-sufficiency is self-movement, the ethical individual must strive to be self-moving (like the heavenly bodies).  Since the eternal soul is the rational soul, not the animal or vegetable soul, the ethical individual aims at the life of self-moving rational contemplation.  Since the highest form of the rational life is the life of philosophy, the ethical life coincides with the life of philosophy.

As self-moving, the ethical individual is not moved by external forces, but by the “laws of destiny.”  One must not interpret this in a modern sense.  Plato’s ethical individual is not a cosmic rebel.   The ethical individual does not have their own individualistic destiny.  Since a mortal living being is a microcosm of the macrocosm, it shares in the single law of destiny of the kosmos.  Socrates had earlier stated the analogous view in the Meno that “all nature is akin.”  There is a harmony between man’s law of destiny and that of the kosmos.   Because of their corrupt bodily nature, human beings have fallen away from their cosmic destiny.   Thus, the fundamental ethical imperative is that human beings must strive to reunite with the universal cosmic life from which they have fallen away, the archetype of which is displayed in the heavens.   The ethical law for man is but a special case of the universal law of destiny that applies to all life in the universe.

The bad life is the unbalanced life.   A life is unbalanced when it falls short of the ideal organic unity.   Thus, evil is a kind of disease of the soul.   Since the body is the inferior partner in the union of soul and body, evil results from the undue influence of the body on the soul  Since body and soul are part of an organic unity, and since the soul does not move without the body and vice versa, the diseases of the soul are diseases of the body and vice versa.  Due regard must be given to the bodily needs, but since the soul is the superior partner in that union, the proper proportion is achieved when the rational soul rules the body.   The recipe for a good life is the same as the recipe for a healthy organism.   Thus, the ethics of the Timaeus shades into an account of health and medicine (Sect. 3c).   Since the ethical individual is the philosopher, the account of all of these shades in to account of the philosopher as well.   The ethical individual, the healthy individual, the beautiful individual, and the philosopher are one and the same.

The cosmology of the Timaeus may also serve to counterbalance the elitism in Plato’s earlier ethical views.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, it is implied that goodness and wisdom are only possible for the best human beings (philosophers), the Timaeus suggests the more egalitarian view that since human life is a microcosm of the macrocosm, ethical salvation is possible for all human beings (Carone, 2000).

Plato’s organicism also suggests a more optimistic view of ethical life than is associated with orthodox Platonism.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, the ethical person is represented to be at the mercy of an evil world, and unlikely to be rewarded for their good efforts, the Timaeus posits a “cosmic mechanism” in which virtue is its own reward (Carone, 2000).   Although Socrates may be victimized by unjust men, the ultimate justice is meted out, not in the human law courts, but in the single universal cosmic life.

On the more negative side, Plato’s celestial organicism does commit him to a kind of astrology:  The Demiurge “assigned to each soul a star, and having there placed them as in a chariot, he … declared to them the laws of destiny.”  Taken literally, this opens Plato to easy caricature, but taken symbolically, as it may well be intended, it is a return to the Pythagorean idea that ethical salvation is achieved, not by setting oneself up in individual opposition to the world, but by reuniting with the cosmic rhythm from which one has fallen away (Allen, 1966).   Although this may look more like a cult or religion to modern thinkers, it is worth noting that it does anticipate the criticism of  the human-centered vision of ethics by the modern “deep ecology” movement (Naess, 1990).

c. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy

Since Plato sees an analogy between the polis and the kosmos (Carone, 2000), and since the kosmos is a living organism, Plato’s concept of organism illuminates his account of the polis.   Just as the kosmos is a combination of Reason (Nous) and Necessity (chaos), so too is the polis.   Just as Demiurge brings the kosmos into being by making the primordial chaos submit to Reason, so too, the Statesman brings the polis into being by making the chaos of human life submit to reason.  Carone (2000) suggests that politics, for Plato, is itself is a synthesis of Reason and Necessity.   It is, in this connection, significant, that in Greek, the word “Demiurge” can mean magistrate (Carone, 2000). See Plato’s Political Philosophy.

d. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine

Since an organism is an organic whole, beauty, virtue, wisdom, and health must occur together.   Just as Plato’s organicism issues in an aesthetics and an ethics, it also issues in an account of medicine.   Health is a state of orderly bodily motions induced by the soul, while disease is a state of disorder induced by the chaos of the body.   The diseases of the soul, such as sexual intemperance, are caused by the undue influence of the body on the soul, with the consequence that a person who is foolish is not so voluntarily.

Since an organism is an organic whole, one does not treat the heart in order to cure the person.  One treats the whole person in order to cure the heart.   Since the union of body and soul is fundamental, health requires the correct proportion between them.  Since the enemy of health is the chaos of the body, health is achieved by imitating the rational pattern of the heavens.   Since the heavens are self-moving, that motion is the best which is self-produced.   Thus, a self-imposed “regimen” of rational discipline and gymnastic, including the arts and all philosophy, is the optimal way to manage disease.

Unfortunately, most professors of medicine fail to see that disease is a natural part of life.  Although mortal organisms live within limits, professors of medicine are committed to the impossible task of contravening these limits by external force, medications, surgery, and so forth.  By ignoring an organism’s inherent limits, they fail to respect the inner laws of harmony and proportion in nature.   Just as self-movement is, in general, good, movement caused by some external agency is, in general, bad.   Since an organism is a self-moving rational ordering with its own inherent limits, the best course is to identify the unhealthy habits that have led to the malady and institute a “regimen” to restore the organism to its natural cycles.   In a concession to common sense, however, Plato does allow that intervention by external force may be permissible when the disease is “very dangerous.”

Plato’s view of medicine may seem quaint, but since, on his view, beauty, health, virtue, and wisdom are aspects of (or, perhaps, flow from) a fundamental condition of organic unity, his views on medicine shed light on his aesthetics, ethics, and his conception of philosophy.   Health is, in various Platonic dialogues (Republic 444c-d, Laws, 733e, and so forth.), associated with the philosophical and virtuous life.  The fact that the Timaeus’ recipe for health includes a strong dose of “all philosophy” betokens Plato’s view that health, like wisdom and virtue, are specific states of an organism that derive, and can only derive, from a certain central unifying power of the philosophic soul.

e. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms

Although it may seem that Plato’s organicism is irrelevant to his theory of Forms, or even that it is incompatible with it, it is arguable that it supplements and strengthens the theory of Forms.  The three main tenets of the theory of Forms are that (1) the world of Forms is separate from the world of perceptible objects (the two-world view), (2)  perceptible objects are images or copies of the Forms, and (3)  perceptible objects are unreal or “less real” than the Forms.

With regard to the first thesis, there appears to be a tension between Plato’s organicism and the two-world view.  f the kosmos is perfect and beautiful, not infer that the Forms are not separate from the kosmos but are present in it?   On the other hand, since Aristotle says in the Metaphysics that Plato never abandoned the two-world theory, it is prudent to leave the first thesis unchanged.  Even if Plato’s organicism undercuts some of the original motivations for the two-world view, it does not require its rejection (Sect. 4b).

Although Plato’s organicism does not require a rejection of the second thesis, the view that perceptible objects are images of the Forms, it puts it in a different light. Rather, it suggests that perceptible objects are not images of Forms in the sense in which a photograph is an image of a man, but in something like the sense in which a child is an image of its parents (Sect. 2c).   From this perspective, the orthodox reading of Plato relies on a one-sided view of the image-model and thereby makes Plato’s theory of Forms appear to denigrate the perceptible world more than it really must do (Patterson, 1985).

Plato’s organicism also puts the third thesis, the view that perceptible objects are less real than the Forms, in a new light.   Since most philosophers see the picture of degrees of reality as absurd, Plato’s views are open to easy ridicule.   However, Plato’s organicism suggests that this objection is based on a confusion.     On this view, when Plato states or implies that some items are less real than others, he is arranging them in a hierarchy based on to the degree in which they measure up to a certain ideal of organic unity.  On this scale, a man has more “being” than a tomato because a man has a higher degree of organic unity than a tomato.    That has nothing to do with the absurd view that tomatoes do not exist or that they only exist to a lesser degree.   The view that Plato is committed to these absurd ideas derives from an equivocation of Plato’s notion of “being” (roughly organic unity) with the notion of existence denoted by the existential quantifier.

Rather than being either irrelevant to Plato’s philosophy or incompatible with it, Plato’s organicism provides new interpretations of certain concepts in those theories.   Indeed, it suggests that some of the standard criticisms of Plato’s views are based on equivocations.

4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology

a. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism

Although Plato’s organicism does seem to be consistent with a theory of Forms, it does not come without a price for that theory.  The theory of Forms had been posited to act as causes, as standards, and as objects of knowledge (Prior, 1985), and Plato’s organicism does undermine some of the original motivations for the theory of Forms.  For example, Plato’s argument that the Forms are needed as standards requires a depreciation of the perceptible world. If living organisms are not merely an image of perfection and beauty, but are themselves perfect and beautiful, then these can act as intelligible standards and there is no special need to posit another separate world of superior intelligible existence. Similar arguments can be extended to the view that Forms are needed as causes and as objects of knowledge.  If one enriches the perceptible world by populating it with intelligible entities, that is, living organisms possessed of their own internal idea, there is no need to look for intelligible standards, causes, or objects of knowledge, in a separate Platonic realm.  In that case, positing a world of separate Forms is an unnecessary metaphysical hypothesis.  This is precisely the direction taken by Aristotle.

Aristotle follows Plato in speaking of form and matter, but, unlike Plato, he does not separate the form from the perceptible objects. Aristotle holds that what is real are substances, roughly, individual packages of formed matter. However, not just any perceptible entity is a substance.  In the Metaphysics (1032a15-20), Aristotle states that “animals and plants and things of that kind” are substances “if anything is.”   On this view, part of the importance of the Timaeus is that it is intermediary between Plato’s orthodox theory of Forms and Aristotle’s theory substance (Johansen, 2004), a point which is lost if the Timaeus is dismissed as a mere literary work with no philosophical significance.  See Sellars (1967), Furth (1987), and McDonough (2000) for further discussions of Aristotle’s organicism.

b. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy


Since Plato’s organicist cosmology includes many plainly unbelievable views (Russell, 1945), the question arises why modern philosophers should take it seriously. Several important points of importance for contemporary philosophy have emerged.  First, Plato’s organicist cosmology is relevant to the interpretation of his theory of Forms by providing new interpretations of key terms in that pivotal theory, and it may even provide an escape from some of the standard objections of that theory (Sect. 4b). Second, Plato’s organicism is intimately linked to his notion of man as the microcosm, a view which appears again in Whitehead’s process philosophy, Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, and others. Third, Plato’s organicism illuminates his ethical views (Sect. 3.2). Fourth, since Plato conceives of the polis on analogy with an organism, it sheds light on his political philosophy (Sect. 3d). Fifth, Plato’s organicism illuminates his account of health and medicine (Sect. 3d), which, in turn, is the classical inspiration for modern holistic views of health and medicine. Sixth, the concept of an organism as, roughly, a sphere organized around a causal center, of which modern “central state materialism is a conceptual descendent,  traces, arguably, to Plato’s Timaeus (Sect. 2b).  Seventh, the Timaeus deserves to be recognized for its contribution to the history of emergentism, which has again become topical in the philosophy of mind (Sect. 2d). Eighth, Aristotle’s theory of substance bears certain conceptual and historical connections to Plato’s organicism (Sect. 4b).  To the degree that these views are important to contemporary philosophy, and history of philosophy, Plato’s organicism is important as well.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. 1951.  Metaphysics. Trans. W.D. Ross. The Basic Works of Aristotle. Ed.Richard McKeon.  Pp. 689-933.
  • Aristotle.  1953. Generation of Animals. A.L. Peck, Trans. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press & London, England: William Heinemann, Ltd.
  • Plato. 1968. Republic. Trans.,  Alan Bloom. New York and London: Basic Books.
  • Plato. 1969. Apology. Hugh Tredennick, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp.3-26.
  • Plato.  1969.  Phaedo. Hugh Tredennick, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 40-98.
  • Plato.  1969.  Gorgias.  W.D. Woodhead, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 229-307.
  • Plato. 1969.   Protagoras.   W.K.C. Guthrie, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 308-352.
  • Plato.  1969.  Theaetetus.  F.M. Cornford, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 957-1017.
  • Plato.  1969.  Sophist.  F.M. Cornford, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 845-919.
  • Plato.  1969.  Philebus.   R. Hackforth, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1086-1150.
  • Plato.   1969.   Timaeus.   Benjamin Jowett, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1151-1211.
  • Plato.  1969.  Laws.  A.E. Taylor, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1225-1516.
  • Plato.  1997.  Symposium.  Alexander Nehamas and Paul Woodruff, Trans.  Plato: Complete Works.  John Cooper, Ed.  Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett. Pp. 457-505.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Reginald E.  1966.  Introduction to Greek Philosophy: Thales to Aristotle.  Ed. Reginald E. Allen.  New York: The Free Press.  Pp. 1-23.
  • Alexander, S. I.  1920.  Space, Time, and Deity, 2 vols. London: Macmillan.
  • Bergson, Henri.  1983.  Creative Evolution.  A. Mitchell, Trans.  Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Brandwood, Leonard.  1992.  “Stylometry and Chronology.”  The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 90-120.
  • Brisson,  Luc, and Meyerstein, F. Walter.    1995.  Inventing the Universe: Plato’s Timaeus, the Big Bang, and the Problem of Scientific Knowledge. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Buchsbaum, Ralph.  1957.  Animals Without Backbones. Vol. I.  Middlesex, England: Penguin Books.
  • Burnet, John.  1971.  Early Greek Philosophy.   London: Adam and Charles Black.
  • Cairns, Huntington.  1961.  Introduction to The Collected Dialogues of Plato.  Princeton: Princeton University Press. Pp. xiii-xxv.
  • Cassirer, Ernst.  1979.  The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy.  Trans. Mario Domandi.  Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1965.   From Religion to Philosophy:  A Study in the Origins of Western Speculation.  New York: Harper and Row.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1966.  Plato’s Cosmology:  The Timaeus of Plato.  The Liberal Arts Press.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1997.  Introduction to Plato:  Timaeus.  Indianapolis: Hackett.  Pp. ix-xv.
  • Carone, Gabriela Roxana.  2005.  Plato’s Cosmology and its Ethical Dimensions.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Clayton, Philip, and Davies, Paul., Ed’s.  2006.   The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Furth, Montgomery.  1988.  Substance, Form, and Psyche: An Aristotelian Metaphysics.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hamilton, Edith.  1964.  The Greek Way.  New York: The W.W. Norton Co.
  • Heisenberg, Werner.  1958.  Physics and Philosophy.   London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Johansen, Thomas Kjeller.  2004.  Plato’s Natural Philosophy: A Study of the Timaeus-Critias.   Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kim,  Jaegwon, Beckermann, Angsar, and Flores, Hans, Ed’s.  1992.  Emergence or Reduction? Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Knowles, David.  1989.  Evolution of Medieval Thought.  United Kingdom: Longman.
  • Kraut, Richard.  1992.  “Introduction to the Study of Plato.”   The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 1-50.
  • Leibniz, G.W.  1968.  “Principles of Nature and Grace.”  Leibniz: Philosophical Writings.  Trans, Mary Morris.  New York: Dutton & London: Dent.  Pp. 21-31.
  • Lovejoy, A.O.  1964.  The Great Chain of Being.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • McDonough, Richard.  1991. “Plato’s not to Blame for Cognitive Science.”  Ancient Philosophy. Vol. 11.  1991.  Pp. 301-314.
  • McDonough, Richard.  2000.  “Aristotle’s Critique of Functionalist Theories of  Mind.”  Idealistic Studies.  Vol. 30.  No. 3.  pp. 209-232.
  • McDonough, Richard.  2002.  “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom” (including a discussion with the editor).  In Creativity, Cognition and Knowledge.  Terry Dartnall, Ed.  London:  Praeger.  Pp. 283-320.
  • Meinwald, Constance C.  1992.  “Goodbye to the Third Man.”  The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 365-396.
  • Morgan, Lloyd.  1923.  Emergent Evolution. London: Williams and Norgate, 1923.
  • Mourelatos,  A.  1986.  “Quality, Structure, and Emergence in Later Pre-Socratic Philosophy.”  Proceedings of the Boston Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy.  2,  Pp. 127-194.
  • Muirhead, John H.  1931.  The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy.  New York: The Macmillan Company & London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Naess, Arne.  1990.  Ecology, Community, Lifestyle: Outelines of an Ecosophy.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nagel, Ernst.  1979.  The Structure of Science.  Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Patterson, Richard.  1985.  Image and Reality in Plato’s Metaphysics.  Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Prior, William J.  1985.  The Unity and Development of Plato’s Metaphysics.  LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1981.  Reason, Truth, and History.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary.  1990.  Realism with a Human Face.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Robin, Leon.  1996.  Greek Thought and the Origins of the Scientific Spirit.  London and New York: Routledge.
  • Robinson, John Mansley.  1968.  An Introduction to Early Greek Philosophy.  Houghton Mifflin College Division.
  • Russell, Bertrand.  1945.  A History of Western Philosophy.  New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • Sallis, John.   1999.  Chorology:  On Beginning in Plato’s Timaeus.  Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid.  1967.  “Raw Materials, Subjects, and Substrata.”   Philosophical Perspectives.   Springfield, Illinois:  Charles C. Thomas, Publisher.  Pp. 137-152.
  • Taylor, A.E.  1928.  A Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. 1975.  Plato’s Universe.  Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Whitehead, A. N.  1978.  Process and Reality (Corrected Edition).   New York: Macmillan and London: Collier Macmillan.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig.  1966.  Tractatus-logico-philosophicus.  Trans, D F. Pears and B. F. McGuiness.  New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul Ltd.
  • Wulf, Maurice De.  1956.  Scholastic Philosophy.   New York: Dover Publications.

Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium Academy and James Cook University