René Descartes (1596—1650)

René Descartes is often credited with being the “Father of Modern Philosophy.” This title is justified due both to his break with the traditional Scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy prevalent at his time and to his development and promotion of the new, mechanistic sciences. His fundamental break with Scholastic philosophy was twofold. First, Descartes thought that the Scholastics’ method was prone to doubt given their reliance on sensation as the source for all knowledge. Second, he wanted to replace their final causal model of scientific explanation with the more modern, mechanistic model.

Descartes attempted to address the former issue via his method of doubt. His basic strategy was to consider false any belief that falls prey to even the slightest doubt. This “hyperbolic doubt” then serves to clear the way for what Descartes considers to be an unprejudiced search for the truth. This clearing of his previously held beliefs then puts him at an epistemological ground-zero. From here Descartes sets out to find something that lies beyond all doubt. He eventually discovers that “I exist” is impossible to doubt and is, therefore, absolutely certain. It is from this point that Descartes proceeds to demonstrate God’s existence and that God cannot be a deceiver. This, in turn, serves to fix the certainty of everything that is clearly and distinctly understood and provides the epistemological foundation Descartes set out to find.

Once this conclusion is reached, Descartes can proceed to rebuild his system of previously dubious beliefs on this absolutely certain foundation. These beliefs, which are re-established with absolute certainty, include the existence of a world of bodies external to the mind, the dualistic distinction of the immaterial mind from the body, and his mechanistic model of physics based on the clear and distinct ideas of geometry. This points toward his second, major break with the Scholastic Aristotelian tradition in that Descartes intended to replace their system based on final causal explanations with his system based on mechanistic principles. Descartes also applied this mechanistic framework to the operation of plant, animal and human bodies, sensation and the passions. All of this eventually culminating in a moral system based on the notion of “generosity.”

The presentation below provides an overview of Descartes’ philosophical thought as it relates to these various metaphysical, epistemological, religious, moral and scientific issues, covering the wide range of his published works and correspondence.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Modern Turn
    1. Against Scholasticism
    2. Descartes’ Project
  3. Method
  4. The Mind
    1. Cogito, ergo sum
    2. The Nature of the Mind and its Ideas
  5. God
    1. The Causal Arguments
    2. The Ontological Argument
  6. The Epistemological Foundation
    1. Absolute Certainty and the Cartesian Circle
    2. How to Avoid Error
  7. Mind-Body Relation
    1. The Real Distinction
    2. The Mind-Body Problem
  8. Body and the Physical Sciences
    1. Existence of the External World
    2. The Nature of Body
    3. Physics
    4. Animal and Human Bodies
  9. Sensations and Passions
  10. Morality
    1. The Provisional Moral Code
    2. Generosity
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

René Descartes was born to Joachim Descartes and Jeanne Brochard on March 31, 1596 in La Haye, France near Tours. He was the youngest of the couple’s three surviving children. The oldest child, Pierre, died soon after his birth on October 19, 1589. His sister, Jeanne, was probably born sometime the following year, while his surviving older brother, also named Pierre, was born on October 19, 1591. The Descartes clan was a bourgeois family composed of mostly doctors and some lawyers. Joachim Descartes fell into this latter category and spent most of his career as a member of the provincial parliament.

After the death of their mother, which occurred soon after René’s birth, the three Descartes children were sent to their maternal grandmother, Jeanne Sain, to be raised in La Haye and remained there even after their father remarried in 1600. Not much is known about his early childhood, but René is thought to have been a sickly and fragile child, so much so that when he was sent to board at the Jesuit college at La Fleche on Easter of 1607. There, René was not obligated to rise at 5:00am with the other boys for morning prayers but was allowed to rest until 10:00am mass. At La Fleche, Descartes completed the usual courses of study in grammar and rhetoric and the philosophical curriculum with courses in the “verbal arts” of grammar, rhetoric and dialectic (or logic) and the “mathematical arts” comprised of arithmetic, music, geometry and astronomy. The course of study was capped off with courses in metaphysics, natural philosophy and ethics. Descartes is known to have disdained the impractical subjects despite having an affinity for the mathematical curriculum. But, all things considered, he did receive a very broad liberal arts education before leaving La Fleche in 1614.

Little is known of Descartes’ life from 1614-1618. But what is known is that during 1615-1616 he received a degree and a license in civil and canon law at the University of Poiters. However, some speculate that from 1614-1615 Descartes suffered a nervous breakdown in a house outside of Paris and that he lived in Paris from 1616-1618. The story picks up in the summer of 1618 when Descartes went to the Netherlands to become a volunteer for the army of Maurice of Nassau. It was during this time that he met Isaac Beekman, who was, perhaps, the most important influence on his early adulthood. It was Beekman who rekindled Descartes’ interest in science and opened his eyes to the possibility of applying mathematical techniques to other fields. As a New Year’s gift to Beekman, Descartes composed a treatise on music, which was then considered a branch of mathematics, entitled Compendium Musicae. In 1619 Descartes began serious work on mathematical and mechanical problems under Beekman’s guidance and, finally, left the service of Maurice of Nassau, planning to travel through Germany to join the army of Maximilian of Bavaria.

It is during this year (1619) that Descartes was stationed at Ulm and had three dreams that inspired him to seek a new method for scientific inquiry and to envisage a unified science. Soon afterwards, in 1620, he began looking for this new method, starting but never completing several works on method, including drafts of the first eleven rules of Rules for the Direction of the Mind. Descartes worked on and off on it for years until it was finally abandoned for good in 1628. During this time, he also worked on other, more scientifically oriented projects such as optics. In the course of these inquiries, it is possible that he discovered the law of refraction as early as 1626. It is also during this time that Descartes had regular contact with Father Marin Mersenne, who was to become his long time friend and contact with the intellectual community during his 20 years in the Netherlands.

Descartes moved to the Netherlands in late 1628 and, despite several changes of address and a few trips back to France, he remained there until moving to Sweden at the invitation of Queen Christina in late 1649. He moved to the Netherlands in order to achieve solitude and quiet that he could not attain with all the distractions of Paris and the constant intrusion of visitors. It is here in 1629 that Descartes began work on “a little treatise,” which took him approximately three years to complete, entitled The World. This work was intended to show how mechanistic physics could explain the vast array of phenomena in the world without reference to the Scholastic principles of substantial forms and real qualities, while also asserting a heliocentric conception of the solar system. But the condemnation of Galileo by the Inquisition for maintaining this latter thesis led Descartes to suppress its publication. From 1634-1636, Descartes finished his scientific essays Dioptique and Meteors, which apply his geometrical method to these fields. He also wrote a preface to these essays in the winter of 1635/1636 to be attached to them in addition to another one on geometry. This “preface” became The Discourse on Method and was published in French along with the three essays in June 1637. And, on a personal note, during this time his daughter, Francine, was born in 1635, her mother being a maid at the home where Descartes was staying. But Francine, at the age of five, died of a fever in 1640 when he was making arrangements for her to live with relatives in France so as to ensure her education.

Descartes began work on Meditations on First Philosophy in 1639. Through Mersenne, Descartes solicited criticism of his Meditations from amongst the most learned people of his day, including Antoine Arnauld, Peirre Gassendi, and Thomas Hobbes. The first edition of the Meditations was published in Latin in 1641 with six sets of objections and his replies. A second edition published in 1642 also included a seventh set of objections and replies as well as a letter to Father Dinet in which Descartes defended his system against charges of unorthodoxy. These charges were raised at the Universities of Utrecht and Leiden and stemmed from various misunderstandings about his method and the supposed opposition of his theses to Aristotle and the Christian faith.

This controversy led Descartes to post two open letters against his enemies. The first is entitled Notes on a Program posted in 1642 in which Descartes refutes the theses of his recently estranged disciple, Henricus Regius, a professor of medicine at Utrecht. These Notes were intended not only to refute what Descartes understood to be Regius’ false theses but also to distance himself from his former disciple, who had started a ruckus at Utrecht by making unorthodox claims about the nature of human beings. The second is a long attack directed at the rector of Utrecht, Gisbertus Voetius in the Open Letter to Voetiusposted in 1643. This was in response to a pamphlet anonymously circulated by some of Voetius’ friends at the University of Leiden further attacking Descartes’ philosophy. Descartes’ Open Letter led Voetius to have him summoned before the council of Utrecht, who threatened him with expulsion and the public burning of his books. Descartes, however, was able to flee to the Hague and convince the Prince of Orange to intervene on his behalf.

In the following year (1643), Descartes began an affectionate and philosophically fruitful correspondence with Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia, who was known for her acute intellect and had read the Discourse on Method. Yet, as this correspondence with Elizabeth was beginning, Descartes was already in the midst of writing a textbook version of his philosophy entitled Principles of Philosophy, which he ultimately dedicated to her. Although it was originally supposed to have six parts, he published it in 1644 with only four completed: The Principles of Human Knowledge, The Principles of Material Things, The Visible Universe, and The Earth. The other two parts were to be on plant and animal life and on human beings, but he decided it would be impossible for him to conduct all the experiments necessary for writing them. Elizabeth probed Descartes about issues that he had not dealt with in much detail before, including free will, the passions and morals. This eventually inspired Descartes to write a treatise entitled The Passions of the Soul, which was published just before his departure to Sweden in 1649. Also, during these later years, the Meditations and Principles were translated from Latin into French for a wider, more popular audience and were published in 1647.

In late 1646, Queen Christina of Sweden initiated a correspondence with Descartes through a French diplomat and friend of Descartes’ named Chanut. Christina pressed Descartes on moral issues and a discussion of the absolute good. This correspondence eventually led to an invitation for Descartes to join the Queen’s court in Stockholm in February 1649. Although he had his reservations about going, Descartes finally accepted Christina’s invitation in July of that year. He arrived in Sweden in September 1649 where he was asked to rise at 5:00am to meet the Queen to discuss philosophy, contrary to his usual habit, developed at La Fleche, of sleeping in late,. His decision to go to Sweden, however, was ill-fated, for Descartes caught pneumonia and died on February 11, 1650.

2. The Modern Turn

a. Against Scholasticism

Descartes is often called the “Father of Modern Philosophy,” implying that he provided the seed for a new philosophy that broke away from the old in important ways. This “old” philosophy is Aristotle’s as it was appropriated and interpreted throughout the later medieval period. In fact, Aristotelianism was so entrenched in the intellectual institutions of Descartes’ time that commentators argued that evidence for its the truth could be found in the Bible. Accordingly, if someone were to try to refute some main Aristotelian tenet, then he could be accused of holding a position contrary to the word of God and be punished. However, by Descartes’ time, many had come out in some way against one Scholastic-Aristotelian thesis or other. So, when Descartes argued for the implementation of his modern system of philosophy, breaks with the Scholastic tradition were not unprecedented.

Descartes broke with this tradition in at least two fundamental ways. The first was his rejection of substantial forms as explanatory principles in physics. A substantial form was thought to be an immaterial principle of material organization that resulted in a particular thing of a certain kind. The main principle of substantial forms was the final cause or purpose of being that kind of thing. For example, the bird called the swallow. The substantial form of “swallowness” unites with matter so as to organize it for the sake of being a swallow kind of thing. This also means that any dispositions or faculties the swallow has by virtue of being that kind of thing is ultimately explained by the goal or final cause of being a swallow. So, for instance, the goal of being a swallow is the cause of the swallow’s ability to fly. Hence, on this account, a swallow flies for the sake of being a swallow. Although this might be true, it does not say anything new or useful about swallows, and so it seemed to Descartes that Scholastic philosophy and science was incapable of discovering any new or useful knowledge.

Descartes rejected the use of substantial forms and their concomitant final causes in physics precisely for this reason. Indeed, his essay Meteorology, that appeared alongside the Discourse on Method, was intended to show that clearer and more fruitful explanations can be obtained without reference to substantial forms but only by way of deductions from the configuration and motion of parts. Hence, his point was to show that mechanistic principles are better suited for making progress in the physical sciences. Another reason Descartes rejected substantial forms and final causes in physics was his belief that these notions were the result of the confusion of the idea of the body with that of the mind. In the Sixth Replies, Descartes uses the Scholastic conception of gravity in a stone, to make his point. On this account, a characteristic goal of being a stone was a tendency to move toward the center of the earth. This explanation implies that the stone has knowledge of this goal, of the center of the earth and of how to get there. But how can a stone know anything, since it does not think? So, it is a mistake to ascribe mental properties like knowledge to entirely physical things. This mistake should be avoided by clearly distinguishing the idea of the mind from the idea of the body. Descartes considered himself to be the first to do this. His expulsion of the metaphysical principles of substantial forms and final causes helped clear the way for Descartes’ new metaphysical principles on which his modern, mechanistic physics was based.

The second fundamental point of difference Descartes had with the Scholastics was his denial of the thesis that all knowledge must come from sensation. The Scholastics were devoted to the Aristotelian tenet that everyone is born with a clean slate, and that all material for intellectual understanding must be provided through sensation. Descartes, however, argued that since the senses sometimes deceive, they cannot be a reliable source for knowledge. Furthermore, the truth of propositions based on sensation is naturally probabilistic and the propositions, therefore, are doubtful premises when used in arguments. Descartes was deeply dissatisfied with such uncertain knowledge. He then replaced the uncertain premises derived from sensation with the absolute certainty of the clear and distinct ideas perceived by the mind alone, as will be explained below.

b. Descartes’ Project

In the preface to the French edition of the Principles of Philosophy, Descartes uses a tree as a metaphor for his holistic view of philosophy. “The roots are metaphysics, the trunk is physics, and the branches emerging from the trunk are all the other sciences, which may be reduced to three principal ones, namely medicine, mechanics and morals” (AT IXB 14: CSM I 186). Although Descartes does not expand much more on this image, a few other insights into his overall project can be discerned. First, notice that metaphysics constitutes the roots securing the rest of the tree. For it is in Descartes’ metaphysics where an absolutely certain and secure epistemological foundation is discovered. This, in turn, grounds knowledge of the geometrical properties of bodies, which is the basis for his physics. Second, physics constitutes the trunk of the tree, which grows up directly from the roots and provides the basis for the rest of the sciences. Third, the sciences of medicine, mechanics and morals grow out of the trunk of physics, which implies that these other sciences are just applications of his mechanistic science to particular subject areas. Finally, the fruits of the philosophy tree are mainly found on these three branches, which are the sciences most useful and beneficial to humankind. However, an endeavor this grand cannot be conducted haphazardly but should be carried out in an orderly and systematic way. Hence, before even attempting to plant this tree, Descartes must first figure out a method for doing so.

3. Method

Aristotle and subsequent medieval dialecticians set out a fairly large, though limited, set of acceptable argument forms known as “syllogisms” composed of a general or major premise, a particular or minor premise and a conclusion. Although Descartes recognized that these syllogistic forms preserve truth from premises to conclusion such that if the premises are true, then the conclusion must be true, he still found them faulty. First, these premises are supposed to be known when, in fact, they are merely believed, since they express only probabilities based on sensation. Accordingly, conclusions derived from merely probable premises can only be probable themselves, and, therefore, these probable syllogisms serve more to increase doubt rather than knowledge Moreover, the employment of this method by those steeped in the Scholastic tradition had led to such subtle conjectures and plausible arguments that counter-arguments were easily constructed, leading to profound confusion. As a result, the Scholastic tradition had become such a confusing web of arguments, counter-arguments and subtle distinctions that the truth often got lost in the cracks. (Rules for the Direction of the Mind, AT X 364, 405-406 & 430: CSM I 11-12, 36 & 51-52).

Descartes sought to avoid these difficulties through the clarity and absolute certainty of geometrical-style demonstration. In geometry, theorems are deduced from a set of self-evident axioms and universally agreed upon definitions. Accordingly, direct apprehension of clear, simple and indubitable truths (or axioms) by intuition and deductions from those truths can lead to new and indubitable knowledge. Descartes found this promising for several reasons. First, the ideas of geometry are clear and distinct, and therefore they are easily understood unlike the confused and obscure ideas of sensation. Second, the propositions constituting geometrical demonstrations are not probabilistic conjectures but are absolutely certain so as to be immune from doubt. This has the additional advantage that any proposition derived from some one or combination of these absolutely certain truths will itself be absolutely certain. Hence, geometry’s rules of inference preserve absolutely certain truth from simple, indubitable and intuitively grasped axioms to their deductive consequences unlike the probable syllogisms of the Scholastics.

The choice of geometrical method was obvious for Descartes given his previous success in applying this method to other disciplines like optics. Yet his application of this method to philosophy was not unproblematic due to a revival of ancient arguments for global or radical skepticism based on the doubtfulness of human reasoning. But Descartes wanted to show that truths both intuitively grasped and deduced are beyond this possibility of doubt. His tactic was to show that, despite the best skeptical arguments, there is at least one intuitive truth that is beyond all doubt and from which the rest of human knowledge can be deduced. This is precisely the project of Descartes’ seminal work, Meditations on First Philosophy.

In the First Meditation, Descartes lays out several arguments for doubting all of his previously held beliefs. He first observes that the senses sometimes deceive, for example, objects at a distance appear to be quite small, and surely it is not prudent to trust someone (or something) that has deceived us even once. However, although this may apply to sensations derived under certain circumstances, doesn’t it seem certain that “I am here, sitting by the fire, wearing a winter dressing gown, holding this piece of paper in my hands, and so on”? (AT VII 18: CSM II 13). Descartes’ point is that even though the senses deceive us some of the time, what basis for doubt exists for the immediate belief that, for example, you are reading this article? But maybe the belief of reading this article or of sitting by the fireplace is not based on true sensations at all but on the false sensations found in dreams. If such sensations are just dreams, then it is not really the case that you are reading this article but in fact you are in bed asleep. Since there is no principled way of distinguishing waking life from dreams, any belief based on sensation has been shown to be doubtful. This includes not only the mundane beliefs about reading articles or sitting by the fire but even the beliefs of experimental science are doubtful, because the observations upon which they are based may not be true but mere dream images. Therefore, all beliefs based on sensation have been called into doubt, because it might all be a dream.

This, however, does not pertain to mathematical beliefs, since they are not based on sensation but on reason. For even though one is dreaming, for example, that, 2 + 3 = 5, the certainty of this proposition is not called into doubt, because 2 + 3 = 5 whether the one believing it is awake or dreaming. Descartes continues to wonder about whether or not God could make him believe there is an earth, sky and other extended things when, in fact, these things do not exist at all. In fact, people sometimes make mistakes about things they think are most certain such as mathematical calculations. But maybe people are not mistaken just some of the time but all of the time such that believing that 2 + 3 = 5 is some kind of persistent and collective mistake, and so the sum of 2 + 3 is really something other than 5. However, such universal deception seems inconsistent with God’s supreme goodness. Indeed, even the occasional deception of mathematical miscalculation also seems inconsistent with God’s goodness, yet people do sometimes make mistakes. Then, in line with the skeptics, Descartes supposes, for the sake of his method, that God does not exist, but instead there is an evil demon with supreme power and cunning that puts all his efforts into deceiving him so that he is always mistaken about everything, including mathematics.

In this way, Descartes called all of his previous beliefs into doubt through some of the best skeptical arguments of his day But he was still not satisfied and decided to go a step further by considering false any belief that falls prey to even the slightest doubt. So, by the end of the First Meditation, Descartes finds himself in a whirlpool of false beliefs. However, it is important to realize that these doubts and the supposed falsehood of all his beliefs are for the sake of his method: he does not really believe that he is dreaming or is being deceived by an evil demon; he recognizes that his doubt is merely hyperbolic. But the point of this “methodological” or ‘hyperbolic” doubt is to clear the mind of preconceived opinions that might obscure the truth. The goal then is to find something that cannot be doubted even though an evil demon is deceiving him and even though he is dreaming. This first indubitable truth will then serve as an intuitively grasped metaphysical “axiom” from which absolutely certain knowledge can be deduced. For more, see Cartesian skepticism.

4. The Mind

a. Cogito, ergo sum

In the Second Meditation, Descartes tries to establish absolute certainty in his famous reasoning: Cogito, ergo sum or “I think, therefore I am.” These Meditations are conducted from the first person perspective, from Descartes.’ However, he expects his reader to meditate along with him to see how his conclusions were reached. This is especially important in the Second Meditation where the intuitively grasped truth of “I exist” occurs. So the discussion here of this truth will take place from the first person or “I” perspective. All sensory beliefs had been found doubtful in the previous meditation, and therefore all such beliefs are now considered false. This includes the belief that I have a body endowed with sense organs. But does the supposed falsehood of this belief mean that I do not exist? No, for if I convinced myself that my beliefs are false, then surely there must be an “I” that was convinced. Moreover, even if I am being deceived by an evil demon, I must exist in order to be deceived at all. So “I must finally conclude that the proposition, ‘I am,’ ‘I exist,’ is necessarily true whenever it is put forward by me or conceived in my mind” (AT VII 25: CSM II 16-17). This just means that the mere fact that I am thinking, regardless of whether or not what I am thinking is true or false, implies that there must be something engaged in that activity, namely an “I.” Hence, “I exist” is an indubitable and, therefore, absolutely certain belief that serves as an axiom from which other, absolutely certain truths can be deduced.

b. The Nature of the Mind and its Ideas

The Second Meditation continues with Descartes asking, “What am I?” After discarding the traditional Scholastic-Aristotelian concept of a human being as a rational animal due to the inherent difficulties of defining “rational” and “animal,” he finally concludes that he is a thinking thing, a mind: “A thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, is willing, is unwilling, and also imagines and has sense perceptions” (AT VII 28: CSM II 19). In the Principles, part I, sections 32 and 48, Descartes distinguishes intellectual perception and volition as what properly belongs to the nature of the mind alone while imagination and sensation are, in some sense, faculties of the mind insofar as it is united with a body. So imagination and sensation are faculties of the mind in a weaker sense than intellect and will, since they require a body in order to perform their functions. Finally, in the Sixth Meditation, Descartes claims that the mind or “I” is a non-extended thing. Now, since extension is the nature of body, is a necessary feature of body, it follows that the mind is by its nature not a body but an immaterial thing. Therefore, what I am is an immaterial thinking thing with the faculties of intellect and will.

It is also important to notice that the mind is a substance and the modes of a thinking substance are its ideas. For Descartes a substance is a thing requiring nothing else in order to exist. Strictly speaking, this applies only to God whose existence is his essence, but the term “substance” can be applied to creatures in a qualified sense. Minds are substances in that they require nothing except God’s concurrence, in order to exist. But ideas are “modes” or “ways” of thinking, and, therefore, modes are not substances, since they must be the ideas of some mind or other. So, ideas require, in addition to God’s concurrence, some created thinking substance in order to exist (see Principles of Philosophy, part I, sections 51 & 52). Hence the mind is an immaterial thinking substance, while its ideas are its modes or ways of thinking.

Descartes continues on to distinguish three kinds of ideas at the beginning of the Third Meditation, namely those that are fabricated, adventitious, or innate. Fabricated ideas are mere inventions of the mind. Accordingly, the mind can control them so that they can be examined and set aside at will and their internal content can be changed. Adventitious ideas are sensations produced by some material thing existing externally to the mind. But, unlike fabrications, adventitious ideas cannot be examined and set aside at will nor can their internal content be manipulated by the mind. For example, no matter how hard one tries, if someone is standing next to a fire, she cannot help but feel the heat as heat. She cannot set aside the sensory idea of heat by merely willing it as we can do with our idea of Santa Claus, for example. She also cannot change its internal content so as to feel something other than heat–say, cold. Finally, innate ideas are placed in the mind by God at creation. These ideas can be examined and set aside at will but their internal content cannot be manipulated. Geometrical ideas are paradigm examples of innate ideas. For example, the idea of a triangle can be examined and set aside at will, but its internal content cannot be manipulated so as to cease being the idea of a three-sided figure. Other examples of innate ideas would be metaphysical principles like “what is done cannot be undone,” the idea of the mind, and the idea of God.

Descartes’ idea of God will be discussed momentarily, but let’s consider his claim that the mind is better known than the body. This is the main point of the wax example found in the Second Meditation. Here, Descartes pauses from his methodological doubt to examine a particular piece of wax fresh from the honeycomb:

It has not yet quite lost the taste of the honey; it retains some of the scent of flowers from which it was gathered; its color shape and size are plain to see; it is hard, cold and can be handled without difficulty; if you rap it with your knuckle it makes a sound. (AT VII 30: CSM II 20)

The point is that the senses perceive certain qualities of the wax like its hardness, smell, and so forth. But, as it is moved closer to the fire, all of these sensible qualities change. “Look: the residual taste is eliminated, the smell goes away, the color changes, the shape is lost, the size increases, it becomes liquid and hot” (AT VII 30: CSM II 20). However, despite these changes in what the senses perceive of the wax, it is still judged to be the same wax now as before. To warrant this judgment, something that does not change must have been perceived in the wax.

This reasoning establishes at least three important points. First, all sensation involves some sort of judgment, which is a mental mode. Accordingly, every sensation is, in some sense, a mental mode, and “the more attributes [that is, modes] we discover in the same thing or substance, the clearer is our knowledge of that substance” (AT VIIIA 8: CSM I 196). Based on this principle, the mind is better known than the body, because it has ideas about both extended and mental things and not just of extended things, and so it has discovered more modes in itself than in bodily substances. Second, this is also supposed to show that what is unchangeable in the wax is its extension in length, breadth and depth, which is not perceivable by the senses but by the mind alone. The shape and size of the wax are modes of this extension and can, therefore, change. But the extension constituting this wax remains the same and permits the judgment that the body with the modes existing in it after being moved by the fire is the same body as before even though all of its sensible qualities have changed. One final lesson is that Descartes is attempting to wean his reader from reliance on sense images as a source for, or an aid to, knowledge. Instead, people should become accustomed to thinking without images in order to clearly understand things not readily or accurately represented by them, for example, God and the mind. So, according to Descartes, immaterial, mental things are better known and, therefore, are better sources of knowledge than extended things.

5. God

a. The Causal Arguments

At the beginning of the Third Meditation only “I exist” and “I am a thinking thing” are beyond doubt and are, therefore, absolutely certain. From these intuitively grasped, absolutely certain truths, Descartes now goes on to deduce the existence of something other than himself, namely God. Descartes begins by considering what is necessary for something to be the adequate cause of its effect. This will be called the “Causal Adequacy Principle” and is expressed as follows: “there must be at least as much reality in the efficient and total cause as in the effect of that cause,” which in turn implies that something cannot come from nothing (AT VII 40: CSM II 28). Here Descartes is espousing a causal theory that implies whatever is possessed by an effect must have been given to it by its cause. For example, when a pot of water is heated to a boil, it must have received that heat from some cause that had at least that much heat. Moreover, something that is not hot enough cannot cause water to boil, because it does not have the requisite reality to bring about that effect. In other words, something cannot give what it does not have.

Descartes goes on to apply this principle to the cause of his ideas. This version of the Causal Adequacy Principle states that whatever is contained objectively in an idea must be contained either formally or eminently in the cause of that idea. Definitions of some key terms are now in order. First, the objective reality contained in an idea is just its representational content; in other words, it is the “object” of the idea or what that idea is about. The idea of the sun, for instance, contains the reality of the sun in it objectively. Second, the formal reality contained in something is a reality actually contained in that thing. For example, the sun itself has the formal reality of extension since it is actually an extended thing or body. Finally, a reality is contained in something eminently when that reality is contained in it in a higher form such that (1) the thing does not possess that reality formally, but (2) it has the ability to cause that reality formally in something else. For example, God is not formally an extended thing but solely a thinking thing; however, he is eminently the extended universe in that it exists in him in a higher form, and accordingly he has the ability to cause its existence. The main point is that the Causal Adequacy Principle also pertains to the causes of ideas so that, for instance, the idea of the sun must be caused by something that contains the reality of the sun either actually (formally) or in some higher form (eminently).

Once this principle is established, Descartes looks for an idea of which he could not be the cause. Based on this principle, he can be the cause of the objective reality of any idea that he has either formally or eminently. He is formally a finite substance, and so he can be the cause of any idea with the objective reality of a finite substance. Moreover, since finite substances require only God’s concurrence to exist and modes require a finite substance and God, finite substances are more real than modes. Accordingly, a finite substance is not formally but eminently a mode, and so he can be the cause of all his ideas of modes. But the idea of God is the idea of an infinite substance. Since a finite substance is less real than an infinite substance by virtue of the latter’s absolute independence, it follows that Descartes, a finite substance, cannot be the cause of his idea of an infinite substance. This is because a finite substance does not have enough reality to be the cause of this idea, for if a finite substance were the cause of this idea, then where would it have gotten the extra reality? But the idea must have come from something. So something that is actually an infinite substance, namely God, must be the cause of the idea of an infinite substance. Therefore, God exists as the only possible cause of this idea.

Notice that in this argument Descartes makes a direct inference from having the idea of an infinite substance to the actual existence of God. He provides another argument that is cosmological in nature in response to a possible objection to this first argument. This objection is that the cause of a finite substance with the idea of God could also be a finite substance with the idea of God. Yet what was the cause of that finite substance with the idea of God? Well, another finite substance with the idea of God. But what was the cause of that finite substance with the idea of God? Well, another finite substance . . . and so on to infinity. Eventually an ultimate cause of the idea of God must be reached in order to provide an adequate explanation of its existence in the first place and thereby stop the infinite regress. That ultimate cause must be God, because only he has enough reality to cause it. So, in the end, Descartes claims to have deduced God’s existence from the intuitions of his own existence as a finite substance with the idea of God and the Causal Adequacy Principle, which is “manifest by the natural light,” thereby indicating that it is supposed to be an absolutely certain intuition as well.

b. The Ontological Argument

The ontological argument is found in the Fifth Meditation and follows a more straightforwardly geometrical line of reasoning. Here Descartes argues that God’s existence is deducible from the idea of his nature just as the fact that the sum of the interior angles of a triangle are equal to two right angles is deducible from the idea of the nature of a triangle. The point is that this property is contained in the nature of a triangle, and so it is inseparable from that nature. Accordingly, the nature of a triangle without this property is unintelligible. Similarly, it is apparent that the idea of God is that of a supremely perfect being, that is, a being with all perfections to the highest degree. Moreover, actual existence is a perfection, at least insofar as most would agree that it is better to actually exist than not. Now, if the idea of God did not contain actual existence, then it would lack a perfection. Accordingly, it would no longer be the idea of a supremely perfect being but the idea of something with an imperfection, namely non-existence, and, therefore, it would no longer be the idea of God. Hence, the idea of a supremely perfect being or God without existence is unintelligible. This means that existence is contained in the essence of an infinite substance, and therefore God must exist by his very nature. Indeed, any attempt to conceive of God as not existing would be like trying to conceive of a mountain without a valley – it just cannot be done.

6. The Epistemological Foundation

a. Absolute Certainty and the Cartesian Circle

Recall that in the First Meditation Descartes supposed that an evil demon was deceiving him. So as long as this supposition remains in place, there is no hope of gaining any absolutely certain knowledge. But he was able to demonstrate God’s existence from intuitively grasped premises, thereby providing, a glimmer of hope of extricating himself from the evil demon scenario. The next step is to demonstrate that God cannot be a deceiver. At the beginning of the Fourth Meditation, Descartes claims that the will to deceive is “undoubtedly evidence of malice or weakness” so as to be an imperfection. But, since God has all perfections and no imperfections, it follows that God cannot be a deceiver. For to conceive of God with the will to deceive would be to conceive him to be both having no imperfections and having one imperfection, which is impossible; it would be like trying to conceive of a mountain without a valley. This conclusion, in addition to God’s existence, provides the absolutely certain foundation Descartes was seeking from the outset of the Meditations. It is absolutely certain because both conclusions (namely that God exists and that God cannot be a deceiver) have themselves been demonstrated from immediately grasped and absolutely certain intuitive truths.

This means that God cannot be the cause of human error, since he did not create humans with a faculty for generating them, nor could God create some being, like an evil demon, who is bent on deception. Rather, humans are the cause of their own errors when they do not use their faculty of judgment correctly. Second, God’s non-deceiving nature also serves to guarantee the truth of all clear and distinct ideas. So God would be a deceiver, if there were a clear and distinct idea that was false, since the mind cannot help but believe them to be true. Hence, clear and distinct ideas must be true on pain of contradiction. This also implies that knowledge of God’s existence is required for having any absolutely certain knowledge. Accordingly, atheists, who are ignorant of God’s existence, cannot have absolutely certain knowledge of any kind, including scientific knowledge.

But this veridical guarantee gives rise to a serious problem within the Meditations, stemming from the claim that all clear and distinct ideas are ultimately guaranteed by God’s existence, which is not established until the Third Meditation. This means that those truths reached in the Second Meditation, such as “I exist” and “I am a thinking thing,” and those principles used in the Third Meditation to conclude that God exists, are not clearly and distinctly understood, and so they cannot be absolutely certain. Hence, since the premises of the argument for God’s existence are not absolutely certain, the conclusion that God exists cannot be certain either. This is what is known as the “Cartesian Circle,” because Descartes’ reasoning seems to go in a circle in that he needs God’s existence for the absolute certainty of the earlier truths and yet he needs the absolute certainty of these earlier truths to demonstrate God’s existence with absolute certainty.

Descartes’ response to this concern is found in the Second Replies. There he argues that God’s veridical guarantee only pertains to the recollection of arguments and not the immediate awaRenéss of an argument’s clarity and distinctness currently under consideration. Hence, those truths reached before the demonstration of God’s existence are clear and distinct when they are being attended to but cannot be relied upon as absolutely certain when those arguments are recalled later on. But once God’s existence has been demonstrated, the recollection of the clear and distinct perception of the premises is sufficient for absolutely certain and, therefore, perfect knowledge of its conclusion (see also the Fifth Meditation at AT VII 69-70: CSM II XXX).

b. How to Avoid Error

In the Third Meditation, Descartes argues that only those ideas called “judgments” can, strictly speaking, be true or false, because it is only in making a judgment that the resemblance, conformity or correspondence of the idea to things themselves is affirmed or denied. So if one affirms that an idea corresponds to a thing itself when it really does not, then an error has occurred. This faculty of judging is described in more detail in the Fourth Meditation. Here judgment is described as a faculty of the mind resulting from the interaction of the faculties of intellect and will. Here Descartes observes that the intellect is finite in that humans do not know everything, and so their understanding of things is limited. But the will or faculty of choice is seemingly infinite in that it can be applied to just about anything whatsoever. The finitude of the intellect along with this seeming infinitude of the will is the source of human error. For errors arise when the will exceeds the understanding such that something laying beyond the limits of the understanding is voluntarily affirmed or denied. To put it more simply: people make mistakes when they choose to pass judgment on things they do not fully understand. So the will should be restrained within the bounds of what the mind understands in order to avoid error. Indeed, Descartes maintains that judgments should only be made about things that are clearly and distinctly understood, since their truth is guaranteed by God’s non-deceiving nature. If one only makes judgments about what is clearly and distinctly understood and abstains from making judgments about things that are not, then error would be avoided altogether. In fact, it would be impossible to go wrong if this rule were unwaveringly followed.

7. Mind-Body Relation

a. The Real Distinction

One of Descartes’ main conclusions is that the mind is really distinct from the body. But what is a “real distinction”? Descartes explains it best at Principles, part 1, section 60. Here he first states that it is a distinction between two or more substances. Second, a real distinction is perceived when one substance can be clearly and distinctly understood without the other and vice versa. Third, this clear and distinct understanding shows that God can bring about anything understood in this way. Hence, in arguing for the real distinction between mind and body, Descartes is arguing that 1) the mind is a substance, 2) it can be clearly and distinctly understood without any other substance, including bodies, and 3) that God could create a mental substance all by itself without any other created substance. So Descartes is ultimately arguing for the possibility of minds or souls existing without bodies.

Descartes argues that mind and body are really distinct in two places in the Sixth Meditation. The first argument is that he has a clear and distinct understanding of the mind as a thinking, non-extended thing and of the body as an extended, non-thinking thing. So these respective ideas are clearly and distinctly understood to be opposite from one another and, therefore, each can be understood all by itself without the other. Two points should be mentioned here. First, Descartes’ claim that these perceptions are clear and distinct indicates that the mind cannot help but believe them true, and so they must be true for otherwise God would be a deceiver, which is impossible. So the premises of this argument are firmly rooted in his foundation for absolutely certain knowledge. Second, this indicates further that he knows that God can create mind and body in the way that they are being clearly and distinctly understood. Therefore, the mind can exist without the body and vice versa.

The second version is found later in the Sixth Meditation where Descartes claims to understand the nature of body or extension to be divisible into parts, while the nature of the mind is understood to be “something quite simple and complete” so as not to be composed of parts and is, therefore, indivisible. From this it follows that mind and body cannot have the same nature, for if this were true, then the same thing would be both divisible and not divisible, which is impossible. Hence, mind and body must have two completely different natures in order for each to be able to be understood all by itself without the other. Although Descartes does not make the further inference here to the conclusion that mind and body are two really distinct substances, it nevertheless follows from their respective abilities to be clearly and distinctly understood without each other that God could create one without the other.

b. The Mind-Body Problem

The famous mind-body problem has its origins in Descartes’ conclusion that mind and body are really distinct. The crux of the difficulty lies in the claim that the respective natures of mind and body are completely different and, in some way, opposite from one another. On this account, the mind is an entirely immaterial thing without any extension in it whatsoever; and, conversely, the body is an entirely material thing without any thinking in it at all. This also means that each substance can have only its kind of modes. For instance, the mind can only have modes of understanding, will and, in some sense, sensation, while the body can only have modes of size, shape, motion, and quantity. But bodies cannot have modes of understanding or willing, since these are not ways of being extended; and minds cannot have modes of shape or motion, since these are not ways of thinking.

The difficulty arises when it is noticed that sometimes the will moves the body, for example, the intention to ask a question in class causes the raising of your arm, and certain motions in the body cause the mind to have sensations. But how can two substances with completely different natures causally interact? Pierre Gassendi in the Fifth Objections and Princess Elizabeth in her correspondence with Descartes both noted this problem and explained it in terms of contact and motion. The main thrust of their concern is that the mind must be able to come into contact with the body in order to cause it to move. Yet contact must occur between two or more surfaces, and, since having a surface is a mode of extension, minds cannot have surfaces. Therefore, minds cannot come into contact with bodies in order to cause some of their limbs to move. Furthermore, although Gassendi and Elizabeth were concerned with how a mental substance can cause motion in a bodily substance, a similar problem can be found going the other way: how can the motion of particles in the eye, for example, traveling through the optic nerve to the brain cause visual sensations in the mind, if no contact or transfer of motion is possible between the two?

This could be a serious problem for Descartes, because the actual existence of modes of sensation and voluntary bodily movement indicates that mind and body do causally interact. But the completely different natures of mind and body seem to preclude the possibility of this interaction. Hence, if this problem cannot be resolved, then it could be used to imply that mind and body are not completely different but they must have something in common in order to facilitate this interaction. Given Elizabeth’s and Gassendi’s concerns, it would suggest that the mind is an extended thing capable of having a surface and motion. Therefore, Descartes could not really come to a clear and distinct understanding of mind and body independently of one another, because the nature of the mind would have to include extension or body in it.

Descartes, however, never seemed very concerned about this problem. The reason for this lack of concern is his conviction expressed to both Gassendi and Elizabeth that the problem rests upon a misunderstanding about the union between mind and body. Though he does not elaborate to Gassendi, Descartes does provide some insight in a 21 May 1643 letter to Elizabeth. In that letter, Descartes distinguishes between various primitive notions. The first is the notion of the body, which entails the notions of shape and motion. The second is the notion of the mind or soul, which includes the perceptions of the intellect and the inclinations of the will. The third is the notion of the union of the soul with the body, on which depend the notion of the soul’s power to move the body and the body’s power to cause sensations and passions in the soul.

The notions entailed by or included in the primitive notions of body and soul just are the notions of their respective modes. This suggests that the notions depending on the primitive notion of the union of soul and body are the modes of the entity resulting from this union. This would also mean that a human being is one thing instead of two things that causally interact through contact and motion as Elizabeth and Gassendi supposed. Instead, a human being, that is, a soul united with a body, would be a whole that is more than the sum of its parts. Accordingly, the mind or soul is a part with its own capacity for modes of intellect and will; the body is a part with its own capacity for modes of size, shape, motion and quantity; and the union of mind and body or human being, has a capacity for its own set of modes over and above the capacities possessed by the parts alone. On this account, modes of voluntary bodily movement would not be modes of the body alone resulting from its mechanistic causal interaction with a mental substance, but rather they would be modes of the whole human being. The explanation of, for example, raising the arm would be found in a principle of choice internal to human nature and similarly sensations would be modes of the whole human being. Hence, the human being would be causing itself to move and would have sensations and, therefore, the problem of causal interaction between mind and body is avoided altogether. Finally, on the account sketched here, Descartes’ human being is actually one, whole thing, while mind and body are its parts that God could make exist independently of one another.

However, a final point should be made before closing this section. The position sketched in the previous couple of paragraphs is not the prevalent view among scholars and requires more justification than can be provided here. Most scholars understand Descartes’ doctrine of the real distinction between mind and body in much the same way as Elizabeth and Gassendi did such that Descartes’ human being is believed to be not one, whole thing but two substances that somehow mechanistically interact. This also means that they find the mind-body problem to be a serious, if not fatal, flaw of Descartes’ entire philosophy. But the benefit of the brief account provided here is that it helps explain Descartes’ lack of concern for this issue and his persistent claims that an understanding of the union of mind and body would put to rest people’s concerns about causal interaction via contact and motion.

8. Body and the Physical Sciences

a. Existence of the External World

In the Sixth Meditation, Descartes recognizes that sensation is a passive faculty that receives sensory ideas from something else. But what is this “something else”? According to the Causal Adequacy Principle of the Third Meditation, this cause must have at least as much reality either formally or eminently as is contained objectively in the produced sensory idea. It, therefore, must be either Descartes himself, a body or extended thing that actually has what is contained objectively in the sensory idea, or God or some creature more noble than a body, who would possess that reality eminently. It cannot be Descartes, since he has no control over these ideas. It cannot be God or some other creature more noble than a body, for if this were so, then God would be a deceiver, because the very strong inclination to believe that bodies are the cause of sensory ideas would then be wrong; and if it is wrong, there is no faculty that could discover the error. Accordingly, God would be the source of the mistake and not human beings, which means that he would be a deceiver. So bodies must be the cause of the ideas of them, and therefore bodies exist externally to the mind.

b. The Nature of Body

In part II of the Principles, Descartes argues that the entire physical universe is corporeal substance indefinitely extended in length, breadth, and depth. This means that the extension constituting bodies and the extension constituting the space in which those bodies are said to be located are the same. Here Descartes is rejecting the claim held by some that bodies have something over and above extension as part of their nature, namely impenetrability, while space is just penetrable extension in which impenetrable bodies are located. Therefore, body and space have the same extension in that body is not impenetrable extension and space penetrable extension, but rather there is only one kind of extension. Descartes maintains further that extension entails impenetrability, and hence there is only impenetrable extension. He goes on to state that: “The terms ‘place’ and ‘space,’ then, do not signify anything different from the body which is said to be in a place . . .” (AT VIIIA 47: CSM I 228). Hence, it is not that bodies are in space but that the extended universe is composed of a plurality or plenum of impenetrable bodies. On this account, there is no place in which a particular body is located, but rather what is called a “place” is just a particular body’s relation to other bodies. However, when a body is said to change its place, it merely has changed its relation to these other bodies, but it does not leave an “empty” space behind to be filled by another body. Rather, another body takes the place of the first such that a new part of extension now constitutes that place or space.

Here an example should prove helpful. Consider the example of a full wine bottle. The wine is said to occupy that place within the bottle. Once the wine is finished, this place is now constituted by the quantity of air now occupying it. Notice that the extension of the wine and that of the air are two different sets of bodies, and so the place inside the wine bottle was constituted by two different pieces of extension. But, since these two pieces of extension have the same size, shape and relation to the body surrounding it, that is, the bottle, it is called one and the same “place” even though, strictly speaking, it is made up of two different pieces of extension. Therefore, so long as bodies of the same shape, size and position continue to replace each other, it is considered one and the same place.

This assimilation of a place or space with the body constituting it gives rise to an interesting philosophical problem. Since a place is identical with the body constituting it, how does a place retain its identity and, therefore, remain the “same” place when it is replaced by another body that now constitutes it? A return to the wine bottle example will help to illustrate this point. Recall that first the extension of the wine constituted the place inside the bottle and then, after the wine was finished, that place inside the body was constituted by the extension of the air now occupying it. So, since the wine’s extension is different from the air’s extension, it seems to follow that the place inside the wine bottle is not the exactly same place but two different places at two different times. It is difficult to see how Descartes would address this issue.

Another important consequence of Descartes’ assimilation of bodies and space is that a vacuum or an empty space is unintelligible. This is because an empty space, according to Descartes, would just be a non-extended space, which is impossible. A return to the wine bottle will further illustrate this point. Notice that the place inside the wine bottle was first constituted by the wine and then by air. These are two different kinds of extended things, but they are extended things nonetheless. Accordingly, the place inside the bottle is constituted first by one body (the wine) and then by another (air). But suppose that all extension is removed from the bottle so that there is an “empty space.” Now, distance is a mode requiring extension to exist, for it makes no sense to speak of spatial distance without space or extension. So, under these circumstances, no mode of distance could exist inside the bottle. That is, no distance would exist between the bottle’s sides, and therefore the sides would touch. Therefore, an empty space cannot exist between two or more bodies.

Descartes’ close assimilation of body and space, his rejection of the vacuum, and some textual issues have lead many to infer an asymmetry in his metaphysics of thinking and extended things. This asymmetry is found in the claim that particular minds are substances for Descartes but not particular bodies. Rather, these considerations indicate to some that only the whole, physical universe is a substance, while particular bodies, for example, the wine bottle, are modes of that substance. Though the textual issues are many, the main philosophical problem stems from the rejection of the vacuum. The argument goes like this: particular bodies are not really distinct substances, because two or more particular bodies cannot be clearly and distinctly understood with an empty space between them; that is, they are not separable from each other, even by the power of God. Hence, particular bodies are not substances, and therefore they must be modes. However, this line of reasoning is a result of misunderstanding the criterion for a real distinction. Instead of trying to understand two bodies with an empty space between them, one body should be understood all by itself so that God could have created a world with that body, for example, the wine bottle, as its only existent. Hence, since it requires only God’s concurrence to exist, it is a substance that is really distinct from all other thinking and extended substances. Although difficulties also arise for this argument from Descartes’ account of bodily surfaces as a mode shared between bodies, these are too complex to address here. But, suffice it to say that the textual evidence is also in favor of the claim that Descartes, despite the unforeseen problem about surfaces, maintained that particular bodies are substances. The most telling piece of textual evidence is found in a 1642 letter to Gibeuf:

From the simple fact that I consider two halves of a part of matter, however small it may be, as two complete substances . . . I conclude with certainty that they are really divisible. (AT III 477: CSMK 202-203

These considerations in general, and this quotation in particular, lead to another distinct feature of Cartesian body, namely that extension is infinitely divisible. The point is that no matter how small a piece of matter, it can always be divided in half, and then each half can itself be divided in half, and so on to infinity. These considerations about the vacuum and the infinite divisibility of extension amount to a rejection of atomism. Atomism is a school of thought going back to the ancients, which received a revival in the 17th century most notably in the philosophy and science of Pierre Gassendi. On this account, all change in the universe could be explained by the movements of very small, indivisible particles called “atoms” in a void or empty space. But, if Descartes’ arguments for rejecting the vacuum and the infinite divisibility of matter are sound, then atomism must be false, since the existence of indivisible atoms and an empty space would both be unintelligible.

c. Physics

Descartes devised a non-atomistic, mechanistic physics in which all physical phenomena were to be explain by the configuration and motion of a body’s miniscule parts. This mechanistic physics is also a point of fundamental difference between the Cartesian and Scholastic-Aristotelian schools of thought. For the latter (as Descartes understood them), the regular behavior of inanimate bodies was explained by certain ends towards which those bodies strive. Descartes, on the other hand, thought human effort is better directed toward the discovery of the mechanistic causes of things given the uselessness of final causal explanations and how it is vain to seek God’s purposes. Furthermore, Descartes maintained that the geometric method should also be applied to physics so that results are deduced from the clear and distinct perceptions of the geometrical or quantifiable properties found in bodies, that is, size, shape, motion, determination (or direction), quantity, and so forth.

Perhaps the most concise summary of Descartes’ general view of the physical universe is found in part III, section 46 of the Principles:

From what has already been said we have established that all the bodies in the universe are composed of one and the same matter, which is divisible into indefinitely many parts, and is in fact divided into a large number of parts which move in different directions and have a sort of circular motion; moreover, the same quantity of motion is always preserved in the universe. (AT VIIIA 100: CSM I 256)

Since the matter constituting the physical universe and its divisibility were previously discussed, a brief explanation of the circular motion of bodies and the preservation of motion is in order. The first thesis is derived from God’s immutability and implies that no quantity of motion is ever added to or subtracted from the universe, but rather quantities of motion are merely passed from one body to another. God’s immutability is also used to support the first law of motion, which is that “each and everything, in so far as it can, always continues in the same state; and thus what is once in motion always continues in motion” (AT VIIIA 62-63: CSM I 241). This principle indicates that something will remain in a given state as long as it is not being affected by some external cause. So a body moving at a certain speed will continue to move at that speed indefinitely unless something comes along to change it. The second thesis about the circular motion of bodies is discussed at Principles, part II, section 33. This claim is based on the earlier thesis that the physical universe is a plenum of contiguous bodies. On this account, one moving body must collide with and replace another body, which, in turn, is set in motion and collides with another body, replacing it and so on. But, at the end of this series of collisions and replacements, the last body moved must then collide with and replace the first body in the sequence. To illustrate: suppose that body A collides with and replaces body B, B replaces C, C replaces D, and then D replaces A. This is known as a Cartesian vortex.

Descartes’ second law of motion is that “all motion is in itself rectilinear; and hence any body moving in a circle always tends to move away from the center of the circle which it describes” (AT VIIIA 63-64: CSM I 241-242). This is justified by God’s immutability and simplicity in that he will preserve a quantity of motion in the exact form in which it is occurring until some created things comes along to change it. The principle expressed here is that any body considered all by itself tends to move in a straight line unless it collides with another body, which deflects it. Notice that this is a thesis about any body left all by itself, and so only lone bodies will continue to move in a straight line. However, since the physical world is a plenum, bodies are not all by themselves but constantly colliding with one another, which gives rise to Cartesian vortices as explained above.

The third general law of motion, in turn, governs the collision and deflection of bodies in motion. This third law is that “if a body collides with another body that is stronger than itself, it loses none of its motion; but if it collides with a weaker body, it loses a quantity of motion” (AT VIIIA 65: CSM I 242). This law expresses the principle that if a body’s movement in a straight line is less resistant than a stronger body with which it collides, then it won’t lose any of its motion but its direction will be changed. But if the body collides with a weaker body, then the first body loses a quantity of motion equal to that given in the second. Notice that all three of these principles doe not employ the goals or purposes (that is, final causes) utilized in Scholastic-Aristotelian physics as Descartes understood it but only the most general laws of the mechanisms of bodies by means of their contact and motion.

d. Animal and Human Bodies

In part five of the Discourse on Method, Descartes examines the nature of animals and how they are to be distinguished from human beings. Here Descartes argues that if a machine were made with the outward appearance of some animal lacking reason, like a monkey, it would be indistinguishable from a real specimen of that animal found in nature. But if such a machine of a human being were made, it would be readily distinguishable from a real human being due to its inability to use language. Descartes’ point is that the use of language is a sign of rationality and only things endowed with minds or souls are rational. Hence, it follows that no animal has an immaterial mind or soul. For Descartes this also means that animals do not, strictly speaking, have sensations like hunger, thirst and pain. Rather, squeals of pain, for instance, are mere mechanical reactions to external stimuli without any sensation of pain. In other words, hitting a dog with a stick, for example, is a kind of input and the squeal that follows would be merely output, but the dog did not feel anything at all and could not feel pain unless it was endowed with a mind. Humans, however, are endowed with minds or rational souls, and therefore they can use language and feel sensations like hunger, thirst, and pain. Indeed, this Cartesian “fact” is at the heart of Descartes’ argument for the union of the mind with the body summarized near the end of part five of the Discourseand laid out in full in the Sixth Meditation.

Yet Descartes still admits that both animal and human bodies can be best understood to be “machine[s] made of earth, which God forms.” (AT XI 120: CSM I 99). The point is that just as the workings of a clock can be best understood by means of the configuration and motion of its parts so also with animal and human bodies. Indeed, the heart of an animal and that of a human being are so much alike that he advises the reader unversed in anatomy “to have the heart of some large animal with lungs dissected before him (for such a heart is in all respects sufficiently like that of a man), and be shown the two chambers or cavities which are present in it” (AT VI 47: CSM I 134). He then goes on to describe in some detail the motion of the blood through the heart in order to explain that when the heart hardens it is not contracting but really swelling in such a way as to allow more blood into a given cavity. Although this account goes contrary to the (more correct) observation made by William Harvey, an Englishman who published a book on the circulation of the blood in 1628, Descartes argues that his explanation has the force of geometrical demonstration. Accordingly, the physiology and biology of human bodies, considered without regard for those functions requiring the soul to operate, should be conducted in the same way as the physiology and biology of animal bodies, namely via the application of the geometrical method to the configuration and motion of parts.

9. Sensations and Passions

In his last published work, Passions of the Soul, Descartes provides accounts of how various motions in the body cause sensations and passions to arise in the soul. He begins by making several observations about the mind-body relation. The whole mind is in the whole body and the whole in each of its parts but yet its primary seat is in a little gland at the center of the brain now known as the “pineal gland.” Descartes is not explicit about what he means by “the whole mind in the whole body and the whole in each of its parts.” But this was not an uncommon way of characterizing how the soul is united to the body at Descartes’ time. The main point was that the soul makes a human body truly human; that is, makes it a living human body and not merely a corpse. Given Descartes’ unexplained use of this phrase, it is reasonable to suppose that he used it in the way his contemporaries would have understood it. So the mind is united to the whole body and the whole in each of its parts insofar as it is a soul or principle of life. Accordingly, the body’s union with the soul makes it a living human body or a human body, strictly speaking (see letter to Mersenne dated 9 February 1645). But, the “primary seat”, that is, the place where the soul performs its primary functions, is the point where the mind is, in some sense, affected by the body, namely the pineal gland.

Descartes maintains further that all sensations depend on the nerves, which extend from the brain to the body’s extremities in the form of tiny fibers encased by tube-like membranes. These fibers float in a very fine matter known as the “animal spirits.” This allows these fibers to float freely so that anything causing the slightest motion anywhere in the body will cause movement in that part of the brain where the fiber is attached. The variety of different movements of the animals spirits cause a variety of different sensations not in the part of the body originally affected but only in the brain and ultimately in the pineal gland. So, strictly speaking, pain does not occur in the foot when a toe is stubbed but only in the brain. This, in turn, may cause the widening or narrowing of pores in the brain so as to direct the animals spirits to various muscles and make them move. For example, the sensation of heat is produced by the imperceptible particles in the pot of boiling water, which caused the movement of the animal spirits in the nerves terminating at the end of the hand. These animal spirits then move the fibers extending to the brain through the tube of nerves causing the sensation of pain. This then causes various pores to widen or narrow in the brain so as to direct the animals spirits to the muscles of the arm and cause it to quickly move the hand away from the heat in order to remove it from harm. This is the model for how all sensations occur.

These sensations may also cause certain emotions or passions in the mind. However, different sensations do not give rise to different passions because of the difference in objects but only in regards to the various ways these things are beneficial, harmful or important for us. Accordingly, the function of the passions is to dispose the soul to want things that are useful and to persist in this desire Moreover, the same animal spirits causing these passions also dispose the body to move in order to attain them. For example, the sight of an ice cream parlor, caused by the movement of the animal spirits in the eye and through the nerves to the brain and pineal gland, might also cause the passion of desire to arise. These same animal spirits would then dispose the body to move (for example, toward the ice cream parlor) in order to attain the goal of eating ice cream thereby satisfying this desire. Descartes goes on to argue that there are only six primitive passions, namely wonder, love, hatred, desire, joy and sadness. All other passions are either composed of some combination of these primitives or are species of one of these six genera. Much of the rest of parts 2 and 3 of the Passions of the Soul is devoted to detailed explications of these six primitive passions and their respective species.

10. Morality

a. The Provisional Moral Code

In Part 3 of the Discourse on Method, Descartes lays out a provisional moral code by which he plans to live while engaged in his methodological doubt in search of absolute certainty. This code of “three or four” rules or maxims is established so that he is not frozen by uncertainty in the practical affairs of life. These maxims can be paraphrased as follows:

  1. To obey the laws and customs of my country, holding constantly to the Catholic religion, and governing myself in all other matters according to the most moderate opinions accepted in practice by the most sensible people.
  2. To be as firm and decisive in action as possible and to follow even the most doubtful opinions once they have been adopted.
  3. Try to master myself rather than fortune, and change my desires rather than the order of the world.
  4. Review the various professions and chose the best (AT VI 23-28: CSM I 122-125).

The main thrust of the first maxim is to live a moderate and sensible life while his previously held beliefs have been discarded due to their uncertainty. Accordingly, it makes sense to defer judgment about such matters until certainty is found. Presumably Descartes defers to the laws and customs of the country in which he lives because of the improbability of them leading him onto the wrong path while his own moral beliefs have been suspended. Also, the actions of sensible people, who avoid the extremes and take the middle road, can provide a temporary guide to action until his moral beliefs have been established with absolute certainty. Moreover, although Descartes does seems to bring his religious beliefs into doubt in the Meditations, he does not do so in the Discourse. Since religious beliefs can be accepted on faith without absolutely certain rational justification, they are not subject to methodological doubt as employed in the Discourse. Accordingly, his religious beliefs can also serve as guides for moral conduct during this period of doubt. Therefore, the first maxim is intended to provide Descartes with guides or touchstones that will most likely lead to the performance of morally good actions.

The second maxim expresses a firmness of action so as to avoid the inaction produced by hesitation and uncertainty. Descartes uses the example of a traveler lost in a forest. This traveler should not wander about or even stand still for then he will never find his way. Instead, he should keep walking in a straight line and should never change his direction for slight reasons. Hence, although the traveler may not end up where he wants, at least he will be better off than in the middle of a forest. Similarly, since practical action must usually be performed without delay, there usually is not time to discover the truest or most certain course of action, but one must follow the most probable route. Moreover, even if no route seems most probable, some route must be chosen and resolutely acted upon and treated as the most true and certain. By following this maxim, Descartes hopes to avoid the regrets experienced by those who set out on a supposedly good course that they later judge to be bad.

The third maxim enjoins Descartes to master himself and not fortune. This is based on the realization that all that is in his control are his own thoughts and nothing else. Hence, most things are out of his control. This has several implications. First, if he has done his best but fails to achieve something, then it follows that it was not within his power to achieve it. This is because his own best efforts were not sufficient to achieve that end, and so whatever effort would be sufficient is beyond his abilities. The second implication is that he should desire only those things that are within his power to obtain, and so he should control his desires rather than try to master things beyond his control. In this way, Descartes hopes to avoid the regret experienced by those who have desires that cannot be satisfied, because this satisfaction lies beyond their grasp so that one should not desire health when ill nor freedom when imprisoned.

It is difficult to see why the fourth maxim is included. Indeed, Descartes himself seems hesitant about including it when he states at the outset that his provisional moral code consists of “three or four maxims.” Although he does not examine other occupations, Descartes is content with his current work because of the pleasure he receives from discovering new and not widely known truths. This seems to imply the correct choice of occupation can ensure a degree of contentedness that could not be otherwise achieved if one is engaged in an occupation for which one is not suited. Descartes also claims that his current occupation is the basis of the other three maxims, because it is his current plan to continue his instruction that gave rise to them. He concludes with a brief discussion of how his occupational path leads to the acquisition of knowledge, which, in turn, will lead to all the true goods within his grasp. His final point is that learning how best to judge what is good and bad makes it possible to act well and achieve all attainable virtues and goods. Happiness is assured when this point is reached with certainty.

b. Generosity

After the Discourse of 1637, Descartes did not take up the issue of morality in any significant way again until his correspondence with Princess Elizabeth in 1643, which culminated in his remarks about generosity in part 3 of the Passions of the Soul. Given the temporal distance between his main reflections on morality, it is easy to attribute to Descartes two moral systems – the provisional moral code and the ethics of generosity. But Descartes’ later moral thinking retains versions of the second and third maxim without much mention of the first and fourth. This indicates that Descartes’ later moral theory is really an extension of his earlier thought with the second and third maxims at its core. At Passions, part 3, section 153, Descartes claims that the virtue of generosity “causes a person’s self-esteem to be as great as it may legitimately be” and has two components. First is knowing that only the freedom to dispose volitions is in anyone’s power. Accordingly, people should only be praised or blamed for using one’s freedom either well or poorly. The second component is the feeling of a “firm and constant resolution” to use one’s freedom well such that one can never lack the will to carry out whatever has been judged to be best.

Notice that both components of generosity relate to the second and third maxim of the earlier provisional moral code. The first component is reminiscent of the third maxim in its acknowledgment of people’s freedom of choice and the control they have over the disposition of their will or desire, and therefore they should be praised and blamed only for those things that are within their grasp. The second component relates to the second maxim in that both pertain to firm and resolute action. Generosity requires a resolute conviction to use free will correctly, while the second maxim is a resolution to stick to the judgment most likely to lead to a good action absent a significant reason for changing course. However, a difference between these two moral codes is that the provisional moral code of the Discourse focuses on the correct use and resolute enactment of probable judgments, while the later ethics of generosity emphasizes a firm resolution to use free will correctly. Hence, in both moral systems, the correct use of mental faculties, namely judgment and free will, and the resolute pursuit of what is judged to be good is to be enacted. This, in turn, should lead us to a true state of generosity so as to legitimately esteem ourselves as having correctly used those faculties through which humans are most in the likeness of God.

11. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Descartes, René, Oeuvres de Descartes, eds. Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Vrin, originally published 1987-1913.
    • This is still the standard edition of all of Descartes’ works and correspondence in their original languages. Cited in the text as AT volume, page.
  • Descartes, René, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch and Anthony Kenny, Cambridge: Cambridge Universiety Press, 3 vols.1984-1991.
    • This is the standard English translation of Descartes philosophical works and correspondence. Cited in the text as CSM or CSMK volume, page.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ariew, Roger, Marjorie GRené, eds., Descartes and His Contemporaries: Meditations, Objections, and Replies, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1995.
    • This is a collection of essays by prominent scholars about various issues raised in the Meditations, objections to them and the adequacy or inadequacy of Descartes’ replies.
  • Broughton, Janet, Descartes’s Method of Doubt, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2003.
    • A study of Descartes’ method and its results.
  • Dicker, Georges, Descartes: An Analytical and Historical Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A clear and concise introduction to Descartes’ philosophy.
  • Frankfurt, Harry, Demons, Dreamers and Madmen: the Defense of Reason in Descartes’ Meditations, Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1970.
    • A classic examination of Descartes’ Meditations.
  • Garber, Daniel, Descartes’ Metaphysical Physics, Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
    • Provides a detailed account of Cartesian science and its metaphysical foundations.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen, Descartes: An Intellectual Biography, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
    • Though somewhat technical, this is a very good biography of Descartes’ intellectual development emphasizing his early years and his interests in mathematics and science.
  • Kenny, Anthony, Descartes: A Study of His Philosophy, New York: Random House, 1968.
    • A classic study of Descartes’ philosophy through the Meditations.
  • Marshall, John, Descartes’s Moral Theory, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 1998.
    • One of the few book length explications of Descartes’ moral theory.
  • Rodis-Lewis, Genevieve, Descartes: His Life and Thought, trans. Jane Marie Todd, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 1998
    • This is a very readable and enjoyable biography.
  • Rozemond, Marleen, Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998.
    • Provides an interpretation of the real distinction between mind and body, their causal interaction and theory of sensation within the context of late Scholastic theories of soul-body union and sensation.
  • Secada, Jorge, Cartesian Metaphysics: The Late Scholastic Origins of Modern Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
    • An at times technical, though readable, account of the whole of Descartes’ metaphysics from within the context of late Scholasticism.
  • Skirry, Justin, Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature, London: Thoemmes-Continuum Press, 2005.
    • Provides an account of Descartes’ theory of mind-body union and how it helps him to avoid the mind-body problem.
  • Verbeek, Theo, Descartes and the Dutch: Early Reactions to Cartesian Philosophy 1637-1650,Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1994.
    • Provides a history and account of the controversies at Utrecht and Leiden.
  • Williston, Byron and Andre Gomby, eds., Passion and Virtue in Descartes, New York: Humanity Books, 2003.
    • An anthology of essays by many noted scholars on Descartes’ theory of the passions and aspects of his later moral theory.
  • Williams, Bernard, Descartes: The Project of Pure Enquiry, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1978.
    • Classic account of Descartes’ philosophy in general.
  • Wilson, Margaret, Descartes, London and Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1978.
    • A classic in Descartes scholarship covering the whole of his philosophy as expressed in the Meditations.

Author Information

Justin Skirry
Nebraska-Wesleyan University
U. S. A.