Josiah Royce (1855—1916): Overview

Josiah Royce was one of the most influential philosophers of the period of classical American philosophy, the late nineteenth century through the early twentieth century. Although often identified as an exponent of Absolute Idealism, which is a philosophical view explored by Royce particularly in his Gifford Lectures, Royce was a thinker of widely diverse interests and talents. He made major contributions to psychology including a textbook in the field and was, in fact, elected President of the American Psychological Association. He wrote a history of California, considered today a forerunner of contemporary historiography in its attention to the role of women and minority groups. He explored social ethics, developing many ideas on the social grounding of the self, some of which were later expanded upon by George Herbert Mead. Furthermore, Royce wrote on pressing social and political problems of the day including race relations. W.E.B. Dubois was one of his students. He wrote literary criticism and can be considered the founder of the Harvard school of logic, Boolean algebra, and the foundation of mathematics. Among his students at Harvard were Clarence Irving Lewis who went on to pioneer modal logic, Edward V. Huntington, the first to axiomatize Boolean algebra, and Henry M. Sheffer, known for the eponymous Sheffer stroke. Royce has recently been cited as a proto-cybernetic thinker; another of his students was Norbert Wiener, the father of cybernetics. Royce also wrote on issues in the philosophy of science.

In addition to these many philosophical achievements, Royce made major contributions to the Philosophy of Religion, writing on the problem of evil, and Christian community and presenting a phenomenological study of the religious experience of ordinary people. Royce also wrote throughout his career on ethical theory and on the conditions for creating both genuine and supportive communities as well as creative, unique, ethical individuality. At the end of his life he turned to the development of a world community through a process of mediation and interpretation.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thought and Works
    1. Royce’s Philosophy of Community
    2. Royce’s Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty
    3. Religion
    4. The Problem of Evil
    5. Logic
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Published Editions
    3. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Josiah Royce was a Californian by birth, born on 20 November, 1855, in Grass Valley, the son of Josiah (1812-1888) and Sarah Eleanor (Bayliss) Royce (1819-1891), whose families were recent emigrants from England, and who sought their fortune in moving west in 1849. His pioneer mother Sarah was a central figure in forging a new social and political community in Grass Valley. She was the center of much musical activity with her melodeon, the first brought to California. She also helped found a church and served as a teacher of the young, including young Josiah. Under his mother’s tutelage, Josiah developed his love of literature, reading Milton and other literary works; made his acquaintance with the Bible and religious experience; was given an introduction to music and its beauty; and experienced the joys of a warm, loving community, his family, and particularly his mother and sisters. Young Josiah began his literary career with a delightful story of the travels of Pussy Blackie, a “Huckleberry Finn cat,” who runs away from home; gets bitten by a dog; is captured by an eagle; travels on a railroad car; lives in the house of a rich family; finds a cat companion with whom Pussy exchanges stories; discusses social issues such as the contrast between the rich and the poor, as well as the treatment of the less fortunate and moral questions such as honesty, shame, killing, and war. In 1866, the Royce family moved to San Francisco where Royce first attended the Lincoln School. Royce also attended San Francisco Boys’ High School where he had as a classmate the (later famous) physicist, Albert Michelson. Continuing his pioneer trek, Royce entered, at age fourteen, an infant University of California, later becoming one of its first graduates, thus participating in the beginnings of higher education in the state. After receiving his degree in Classics in 1875, Royce traveled to Germany to study philosophy for one year. He mastered the language while attending lectures in Heidelberg, Leipzig, and Göttingen. On his return, he entered the Johns Hopkins University in Baltimore and in 1878, was awarded one of its first four doctorates.

Josiah Royce returned to the University of California, Berkley from 1878-1882. He taught composition, and literature, published numerous philosophical articles and his Primer of Logical Analysis. He married Katherine Head in 1880; the couple had three sons (Christopher, 1882; Edward, 1886; Stephen, 1889) and remained married until Josiah’s death. Royce felt isolated in California, so far from the intellectual life of the East Coast, and he sought an academic post elsewhere. William James, Royce’s friend and philosophical antagonist, secured the opportunity for Royce to replace James at Harvard when James took a one-year sabbatical. In 1882, Royce accepted the position at half of James’ salary and brought his wife and newborn son across the continent to Cambridge, Massachusetts.

At Harvard, Royce began to develop his interest in a number of different areas. In 1885, he published his first major philosophical work, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, proposing the idea that in order for our ordinary concepts of truth and error to have meaning, there must be an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” who encompasses the totality of actual truths and possible errors. That same year, Royce received a permanent appointment as assistant professor at Harvard, where he continued to teach for thirty years. Among his students were such notables as T.S. Eliot, George Santayana, W.E.B. Dubois, Norbert Wiener, and C.I. Lewis, the logician.

Royce was a prolific writer as well as much demanded on the public lecture circuit. In 1886, he published his History of California; he followed this with a published novel in 1887. In 1892, Royce was appointed Professor of the History of Philosophy at Harvard, and he served as Chair of the Department of Philosophy from 1894-1898. During these years Royce established himself as a leading figure in American academic philosophy with his many reviews, lectures and books, including The Spirit of Modern Philosophy, (1892), The Conception of God (1897), and Studies in Good and Evil (1898).

In 1899, and 1900, Royce delivered the prestigious Gifford Lectures at the University of Aberdeen, taking this opportunity to consolidate his thoughts on metaphysics. The result was his two-volume opus, The World and the Individual (1899-1901). This point appeared to be the culmination of Royce’s work. His public reputation was at a high and at 45 years old, Royce was elected President of the American Psychological Association in 1902, and President of the American Philosophical Association in 1903. Reviewers of The World and the Individual praised Royce’s philosophical acumen but there were serious objections to his conclusions. Sparked by these and the criticisms of his logic by Charles Sanders Peirce, Royce began reconsideration of his arguments as well as extensive study in mathematical logic. He also returned to his earlier concerns with philosophy as a means to understand human life, the nature of human society, of religious experience, ethical action, suffering and the problem of evil. His major work on ethics, The Philosophy of Loyalty appeared in 1908, but his concern with ethical issues and the “art” of loyalty continued until his death. He published a collection of essays, Race Questions, Provincialisms, and Other American Problems in 1908 and another, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, appeared in 1911.

In 1912, while recovering from a stroke, Royce published The Sources of Religious Insight, in which he sought an explanation for the phenomena of ordinary religious faith as experienced by ordinary religious communities and individuals. He considered this a correction to James’ The Varieties of Religious Experience (The Gifford Lectures, 1901-1902), which, in Royce’s judgment, put too much emphasis on extraordinary and individualistic religious experiences. Drawing on the semiotic of Peirce and other sources, in 1913, Royce published his opus on religious community, The Problem of Christianity, a work which Yale philosopher, John E. Smith identified as “one of the finest works in the philosophy of religion ever to appear on the American scene” (Smith 1982 &1992, 122). In place of the earlier “Absolute Knower,” Royce presents the concept of an infinite community of interpretation, guided by a shared spirit of truth-seeking and community building. The Universal Community constitutes reality, and its understanding increases over time, through its members’ continual development of meaning. Royce’s concern for building a universal or “Beloved Community” is exemplified in two later works focused on building peace and a world community: War and Insurance (1914) and The Hope of the Great Community (1916). In the 1914 book, Royce made a daring political and economic proposal to use the economic power of insurance to mediate hostilities among nations, and reduce the attraction of war in the future.

Royce died September 14, 1916, before he could develop fully his new philosophical insights. Unfortunately, Royce’s works were ignored until recently and now are being revisited by theologians and philosophers interested in not only metaphysics, but also practical and theoretical ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of self and of community.

2. Thought and Works

Royce’s major works include The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885), The World and the Individual (1899-1901), The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892), The Philosophy of Loyalty (1908), and The Problem of Christianity (1913). In his early works, Royce presented a novel defense of idealism, the “argument from error,” and arrived at the concept of an actual infinite mind, an “Absolute Knower,” that encompasses all truths and possible errors. The correspondence theory of truth requires that if an idea or judgment is true it must correctly represent its object; when an idea does not correctly represent its object, it is an error. Royce begins with the fact that the human mind often makes such errors and yet, argued Royce, the mind “intends” or “points to” the idea’s true object. Thus, the occurrence of these errors indicates that the true object of any idea must exist, in a fully determinate state, in some actual infinite mind; this actual infinite “Mind” is the “Absolute Knower.” Royce continued to pursue this move toward Idealism in The World and the Individual. Here we find Royce agreeing with Kantian critical rationalism that a true idea is one that may be fulfilled or validated by a possible experience, but he argued that such a possibility of experience required the existence of an actual being, whose nature was to be the true object of the experience. In this work, Royce engages in criticism of three major views of metaphysics, Realism, Mysticism, and Kant’s Critical Rationalism. He finds valuable points in all three views, but also critical weaknesses. He advocates a “Fourth Conception of Being,” a view of the totality of Being as an actual Infinite, timeless, and encompassing all valid past, present, and future possible experience of fact including the facts of all finite beings.

Royce continued to develop his thoughts spurred by various criticisms and particularly the friendly but longstanding dispute with William James known as “The Battle of the Absolute.” In addition, he struggled with the problem of community and the relations of the individual and community both philosophically and practically, the latter concern evidenced in his writings on the history of California, the land disputes in California, various public problems and his deep concern for a solid theory of ethics. In answer to Charles Sanders Peirce, he turned to a deep exploration of logic, mathematics, and semiotics. In his later works, Royce dispenses with the “Absolute Mind/Knower” of previous works and develops a metaphysical view which characterizes reality as a universe of ideas or signs which occur in the process of being interpreted by an ongoing, infinite community of minds. These minds and the community they constitute also become signs for further interpretation. In The Problem of Christianity he sees representation no longer as a static, one-time experience, but as having creative, synthetic and selective aspects and knowledge is now more than accurate and completed perception of an object, or complete conception of an idea, it is a process of interpretation. This new metaphysical view is reflected in Royce’s work on ethics, philosophy of religion, philosophy of community, social philosophy and logic.

a. Royce’s Philosophy of Community

Royce was concerned about the impact of an extreme individualism and particularly with the “heroic individualism” associated with Walt Whitman, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and William James. Though inspiring as ethical visions, Royce believed these views eventually proved unsatisfactory for ethical life. While affirming the “individual” as a “most fundamental phenomenon,” he sought to address the problem of forming satisfactory communities and dealing with competing forms of community. In his later metaphysics Royce affirms the full-fledged reality of both individuals and community. In the practical social and political realm, Royce tackled the dual issues of “enlightened/genuine individualism,” and “true/genuine community.” He recognized that the task of building authentic individuality and encouraging the growth of fulfilling, moral communities were inextricably bound together—worthwhile individuality and community arising out of their mutual interaction in a creative, ongoing, infinite process.

Thus, Royce develops the following claims: (1) individuals are inextricably rooted in the social context and true individuality is forged out of that context. An individual is both self-made and a social product and the worthiness of the end result, the individual self, is the responsibility of both individual and community; (2) community is a social product, but true community is created by the hard work of free, self-conscious, self-committed, self-creative moral individuals; (3) the task of the individual is both to fashion a “beautiful life” and to build a “beautiful” community, while the obligation of community is to build a harmony of wills while also fostering the development of true individuals; (4) individuals are finite, sinful and fallible and need to extend self to develop morality and overcome error. Furthermore, individuals crave harmony and relationship. Individuals keep communities alive, moral, and sane by keeping them from stagnating into inveterate habit, moving toward exclusivity and intolerance, or degenerating into mob madness. In other words, stress must be equally on the individual and the community. For Royce, “individuals without community are without substance, while communities without individuals are blind.”

In light of the strong individualistic emphasis in philosophy today, it is striking that for Royce communities are logically prior to individuals. For Royce, there is no personal identity unless there are communities of persons that provide causes and social roles for individuals to embrace. Royce declares: “My life means nothing, either theoretically or practically, unless I am a member of a community” (Royce 2001 [1913], 357). And community is more than any association or collection of individuals; communities can only exist, in Royce’s view, where individual members are in communication with one another and there exists to some relevant way a congruence of feeling, thought and will among them. A community is for Royce, as is the human self, a temporal being. He speaks of a community of memory and ac community of hope. Each of the community’s members accepts, as part of his/her own individual life and self, some past events and the same expected future events. And, like human selves, communities are “plans of action” engaged in purposive activity in the world and constituting a will and a spirit and, for Royce, also, like human selves, morally responsible for its communal actions.

b. Royce’s Ethics: The Philosophy of Loyalty

At the center of Royce’s ethics is his contention that to lead a morally significant life, one’s actions must express a self-consciously asserted will; the self is a plan of action, a plan of life created by an individual out of the chaos of many conflicting personal desires and impulses. Such a plan is forged when one finds a cause, or causes which require a program or programs of implementation that extend through time and requires the contributions of many individuals for their advancement and fulfillment. When an individual finds a cause judged worthwhile, his/her will becomes focused and defined in terms of that cause and furthermore, the individual becomes allied with a community of others who are also committed to that same cause. Royce calls this commitment “loyalty” and thus the moral life of an individual is understood in terms of the multiple loyalties that a person embraces. “There is only one way to be an ethical individual. That is to choose your cause, and then to serve it” (Royce 1995 [l908], 47).

According to Royce’s careful definition of loyalty, “genuine” loyalty is intended to rule out loyalty to morally evil causes and communities that serve them. Royce fully recognized that many of the worst deed in human history have involved a high degree of loyalty, but, argued Royce, these loyalties were directed exclusively to a particular group and expressed in the destruction of the conditions for others’ loyal actions, Royce describes the difference between true loyalty and vicious or “predatory” loyalty as follows:

A cause is good, not only for me, but for mankind, in so far, as it is essentially a “loyalty to loyalty,” that is, an aid, and a furtherance of loyalty in my fellows. It is an evil cause in so far as, despite the loyalty that it arouses in me, it is destructive of loyalty in the world of my fellows (Royce 1995 {1908}, 56).

Communities defined by true loyalty, or adherence to a cause that exemplifies the universal ideal of “loyalty to loyalty” are referred to by Royce as “genuine communities.” Again, the degenerate communities are those that tend toward the destruction of other’s causes and possibilities of loyalty. While every community works for the accomplishment of its central cause, Royce places significant emphasis on the idea of loyalty to a “lost cause.” A lost cause is not a hopeless cause but rather one that cannot be fulfilled within the actual lifetime of any of its members. These causes are those that are “lost” simply in virtue of their scope and magnitude and these are precisely the causes that establish ideals capable of evoking our highest hope and moral commitment. “Lost causes” are indispensable, in Royce’s view, as the source of absolute norms for any community and its members.

For Royce, chief among such causes is the full attainment of truth, the complete determination of the nature of reality through inquiry and interpretation. Thus, the formula of “loyalty to loyalty” demands that one’s moral and intellectual sphere become ever broader and remain critical at all levels. In this connection, Royce reframed two central ideas or principles of pragmatism. Following James in his essay, “The Will to Believe,” Royce agreed that any philosophical view is essentially an expression of individual volition. We must first decide how we are to approach the world and then develop our philosophical theories accordingly. For Royce, the essential attitude of will that one must adopt toward the world is “loyalty to the ideal of an ultimate truth.” Secondly, Royce adopted the pragmatist view of truth, that is, truth is the property possessed by those ideas that succeed in the long run. And, following Peirce, Royce argues that to define truth using any conception of “the long run, short of the ideal end of inquiry, is self-refuting.” Having adopted these pragmatic principles, Royce referred to his own position as “Absolute Pragmatism.”

Returning to the principles of “loyalty to loyalty,” it becomes clear that, for Royce, all communities we actually know, inhabit, or identify with, are finite and to varying degrees “predatory.” Roycean loyalty requires one to scrutinize the aims and actions of our communities and those of others and to work to reform the disloyal aspects. The philosophy of loyalty calls upon us to create and embrace more cosmopolitan and inclusive communities. However, any human community, however, inclusive and committed to loyalty to loyalty, will fall short of perfect loyalty. Each community must constantly engage in critical scrutiny and actions of reform. For Royce, there is no expectation that the high ideals of perfect loyalty, truth, and reality will ever be fully realized. The process of building community is an ongoing, infinite process.

Finally, for Royce, beyond the actual communities that we directly encounter in life there is the ideal “Beloved Community” of all those who would be fully dedicated to the cause of loyalty, truth, and reality itself. This is the ultimate goal and cause. Furthermore, the sharing of individuals’ feeling, thoughts and wills in a community (including the Beloved Community) is never, for Royce, a mystical blurring or annihilation of personal identities. Individuals remain individuals, but in forming a community they build or attain a second order life that extends beyond any of their individuals lives. This life is a life coordinated through a cause and extended over time, a super-human personality at work, a community united by an “interpreting spirit.” Again, communities are more than their individual members and individuals are always unique and not lost in their communities; individuals and communities need each other.

c. Religion

Through the strong influence of his mother, Sarah Royce, and the early education she provided him and his sisters, Royce was well acquainted with the Christian Protestant world view and his writings exhibited a consistent familiarity with Scripture and with religious themes. Royce, in his own life did not embrace organized Christianity, and he was critical of many historical churches, believing that they had lost sight of the “spirit” of community that ought to guide them. He identified many “communities of grace,” genuine communities of loyalty, that were non-Christian or not self-consciously religious. Royce had a great respect for Buddhism and he even learned Sanskrit to study religious texts in this language. Although Royce maintained a strong interest in logic, science, evolutionary theory, and natural philosophy throughout his career, religious concerns did figure prominently in a number of his works beginning with his first major publication, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy as well as in his last two major works, The Sources of Religious Insight and The Problem of Christianity. The Sources was Royce’s response to the Gifford Lectures delivered by William James in 1901-1902 and published as The Varieties of Religious experience. James’ lectures were a popular and academic success and remain so even today. Royce, however, believed that James placed too much emphasis on the extraordinary religious experience of extraordinary individuals and thus failed to capture the religious experiences of the ordinary individual. Furthermore, Royce believed that religion was a central phenomenon of human experience that could not be ignored by philosophers. In The Problem of Christianity Royce works out his own religious thought and his full-blown theory of community. He maintains that the Christian model of the “loyal community,” properly understood, successfully combined the true spirit of universal interpretation with an appreciation of the “infinite worth” of the individual as a unique member of the ideal Beloved Community, the Kingdom of Heaven (Royce 2001[1913], 193). It is in this book that Royce also brings to fruition his thought and concern with the problem of evil.

Royce’s approach to religion was empirical, historical and phenomenological as well as concerned with philosophical reflection. Thus, in a 1909 essay, “What is Vital in Christianity?,” Royce approaches religion with a historic-empirical approach akin to modern anthropology. He views the religion as it has developed within human history. He writes: “any religion presents itself as a more or less connected group: (1) of religious practices, such as prayers, ceremonies, festivals, rituals and other observance, and (2) of religious ideas, the ideas taking the form of traditions, legends, and beliefs about the gods or spirits” (Royce 1911 [1909], 101). The term “vital,” says Royce, is metaphoric, such as the “vital” features of an organism. If these changed the organism would not necessarily be destroyed but would be an essentially different type of organism. Royce illustrates with the features, gill breathing” and “lung breathing.” But “vital,” also connotes “alive” for the persons who are followers of the religion and this usage is similar to Paul Tillich’s understanding of religious symbols as alive or dying. Furthermore, this term means also “primary” in practice. Thus, Royce says his first question is: “What is more vital about a religion: its religious practices, or its religious ideas, beliefs, and spiritual attitudes?” In this essay, in a humorous passage about pigeons in the Harvard Yard observing the habits of humans who feed them and concluding to the existence of a benevolent creator, Royce critiques the causal approach to God, represented in many of the proofs for God’s existence.

Royce again approaches religion through a historical-philosophical analysis in an encyclopedia article entitled “Monotheism.” After briefly reviewing monotheism as a doctrine in contrast to polytheism and pantheism, Royce makes the following claim: “…from the historical point of view, three different ways of viewing the divine being have been of great importance both for religious life and for philosophical doctrine” (Royce 1916, 818). The three ways to which Royce refers are three forms of monotheism, which were established in India, Greece, and Israel.

Royce then discusses, what in his view, are the essential features of monotheism as developed in these three cultural contexts. From Israel, we have “the ethical monotheism of the Prophets of Israel,” and “God,” in this religious context is defined as “the righteous Ruler of the world,” as the “Doer of justice,” or as the one “whose law is holy” or “who secures the triumph of the right”(Royce, 1916). Turning to Greece and to “Hellenistic monotheism,” God is defined as the “source, of the explanation, or the correlate, or the order, or the reasonableness of the world” (Royce, 1916). The third type of monotheism is labeled “Hindu pantheism.” Royce notes that this understanding had many different historical origins and appeared, in fact, as part of the Neo-Platonic philosophy and the philosophy of Spinoza. This type of monotheism insists not only upon the “sole” reality of God, but also asserts the “unreality of the world” (Royce, 1916).

In an interesting move, Royce argues that the “whole history of Christian monotheism depends upon an explicit effort to make a synthesis of the ethical monotheism of Israel and the Hellenic form of monotheism (Royce, 1916) This effort, however, says Royce, has proven especially difficult. The Hellenic tradition with its intellectualistic emphasis on the Logos was in favor of defining the unity of the divine being and the world as the essential feature of monotheism, whereas ethical monotheism dwells upon the contrast between the righteous Ruler and the sinful world, and between divine grace and fallen man. Royce, then, concludes:

Therefore, behind many of the conflicts between the so-called pantheism in Christian tradition and the doctrines of “divine transcendence” and “divine personality,” there has lain the conflict between intellectualism and voluntarism, between an interpretation of the world in terms of order and an interpretation of the world in terms of the conflict between good and evil, righteousness and unrighteousness (Royce, 1916, 819).

This history is made even more complex, says Royce, due to the influence of the Indic type of God. This concept influenced mysticism and, of course, Neo-platonic philosophy which, in turn, influenced Christian philosophy and theology. Augustine is a prime example of this influence. Furthermore, within Christianity, the mystics have often pointed to the failure to resolve the conflict with the moral and intellectual interests. Royce writes:

The mystics…have always held that the results of the intellect are negative and lead to no definite idea of God which can be defended against the skeptics, while…to follow the law of righteousness, whether or not with the aid of divine grace, does not lead, at least in the present life, to the highest type of knowledge of God (Royce, 1916).

Then, Royce, with his respect for the experiential in religion, writes: “Without this third type of monotheism, and without this negative criticism of the work of the intellect, and this direct appeal to immediate experience, Christian doctrine, in fact, would not have reached some of its most characteristic forms and expressions, and the philosophy of Christendom would have failed to put on record some of its most fascinating speculations” (Royce, 1916).

Royce then reviews the history of the so-called “proofs for God’s existence,” generally an expression of the Hellenistic influence in Christianity, and says that there is some basis in the claim that these efforts to grasp the divine nature via the intellect leads to results remote “from the vital experience upon which religious monotheism, and in particular, Christian monotheism must rest, if such…is permanently to retain the confidence of a man who is at once critical and religious (Royce, 1916).

Finally, it is not surprising that Royce argues that whatever answers to the questions about the nature of the world – is it real, rational, ethical? – that are developed must not put exclusive emphasis on any one characteristic. For, “as we have seen, the problem of monotheism requires a synthesis of all the three ideas of God,” thus any attempt to address these three questions must be an answer that does adequate justice to the three ideas and the three problems (Royce, 1916). Royce’s own efforts were aimed at achieving this synthesis and providing an answer to these three questions. Thus, he sought in his conceptions of God to give an account of the nature of reality that would satisfy the “moral insight,” “the theoretic insight,” and the “religious insight.” And the three Conceptions of Being addressed in The World and the Individual embody aspects of the three ideas of God and address the three questions.

Turning now to The Sources of Religious Insight, as indicated earlier, it is a parallel to The Varieties of Religious Experience by William James, yet it transcends that work in a number of ways. First, it explores religious experience common to much of mankind rather than the special, genius cases that are the subject of James’ work. Second, it studies both individual and communal religious experience whereas James’ work focuses on the experiences of extraordinary individuals. Third, The Sources is solidly based in the empirical and experiential. Royce writes: “The issue will be one regarding the facts of living experience” (Royce, 1912). James, in his work seeks to explain man’s religious need in terms of an experience that wells up from the subliminal self, from the soundless depths of our own subconscious. Royce, on the other hand, asserts that, “the principal religious motives are indeed perfectly natural human motives” (Royce, 1912,41-42). Man’s religious experience is, as a natural process, an incident in the history of his sensitive life, of his personal interpretation of the world, and of his more or less creative effort to fulfill his needs, and to respond in his own way to the universe. Religious experience, then, for Royce, is natural and profoundly personal and social – it is the experience of a human self in the history of his own life, set in the material, historical, social, and cultural context of that individual history and life.

Beginning then with human experience and needs, Royce seeks to get at the heart of “religious experience.” He states that the “central and essential postulate” of every religion is that “man needs to be saved” (Royce 2001[1912], 8-9). Salvation is necessary, for Royce, for two reasons: (1) There is some aim or end of human life which is more important than all other aims; and (2) Man, as he now is, or is naturally, is always in great danger of missing this highest aim and thus to render his whole life “a senseless failure” (Royce 2001 [1912], 12). This salvation must come in the form of guidance about understanding and achieving the highest aim of life so far as one is able. But given the limitations and fallibility of the human perspective, which hardly extends “beyond one’s nose,” Royce contends that this needed guidance must come from some super-human source. Religion, then, is the sphere of life in which finite human beings are able to get in touch with this source. It is interesting that in seeking to demonstrate the validity of his postulate he reviews the essentials of Buddhism, the writings of Plato in The Republic, and various literary sources. He believes that these examples show that the search for salvation belongs to no “one type of piety or of poetry or of philosophy” (Royce, 1912, 15).

The next major question is “what are the sources of insight?” Royce will consider seven sources, beginning with the human self, viewed first as uniquely individual and then as social. These are the basic and most elementary. However, Royce will find individual life and social life insufficient to meet the religious need for salvation. He then turns to five other sources. These are all dependent on the first two sources but will develop, strengthen, correct and transform in some way these. The five are: reason as a synthesizing power; the will or the volitional; loyalty; the religious mission of sorrow, and the unified community of the spirit.

In turning to the individual alone with his problem of salvation and with his efforts to know the divine that can save, Royce asserts that the individual can be in touch with a genuine source of insight, one of value, although also a source with limits. There are, says Royce, three objects which individual experience, as a source of religious insight, can reveal: The Ideal, the Need, and the Deliverer. The Ideal is, of course, the standard in terms of which the individual estimates the sense and value of his personal life. The Need for salvation is that degree to which he falls short of attaining his ideal and is sundered from this Ideal by evil fortune, his own paralysis of will, or by his inward baseness. The Deliverer is that presence, that power, that light, that truth, that great companion who helps the individual and saves him from his need.

We as humans are creatures of wavering and conflicting motives and, although we strongly desire a unity that makes life meaningful, we, on our own, cannot find this unity; we always miss our mark. Furthermore, we have glimpses of what would fulfill us, what would meet our need: a life “infinitely richer than our own.” As James, argues, we want to get in touch with something that will give us a “new dimension” to our lives. We want something more. Furthermore, for Royce, our need and desire are crucial. Royce writes: “Unless you have inwardly felt the need of salvation and learned to hunger and thirst after spiritual unity and self-possession, all the rest of religious insight is to you a sealed book” (Royce 1912, 33).

However, the individual alone cannot achieve what is needed. Thus we must turn to the social and to shared human life to attain a broader religious insight. Royce writes: “…no one who remains content with his merely individual experience of the presence of the divine and of his deliverer, has won the whole of any true insight. For as a fact, we are all members one of another; and I can have no insight into the way of my salvation unless I thereby learn of the way of salvation for all my brethren. And there is no unity of the spirit unless all men are privileged to enter it whenever they see it and know it and love it” (Royce, 1912, 34). Here is Royce’s emphasis on the need for social expansion of the self, as loyalty to loyalty demands expansion of the perspective of the community. Indeed, Royce argues that one of the principal sources of our need for salvation is our narrowness of view and especially of the meaning of our own purposes and motives. The social world, as Royce has constantly argued, broadens our outlook; an individual corrects his own narrowness by trying to share his fellow’s point of view. Social responsibilities can set limits to our fickleness; social discipline can keep us from indulging all our caprices; human companionship may steady our vision. The social world may bring us in touch with our public, great self, wherein we may find our “soul and its interests writ large” (Royce, 1912, 55). Social life is a source of religious insight and the insight it can bring is knowledge of “salvation through the fostering of human brotherhood” (Royce, 1912, 58).

Another avenue to religious insight, for Royce, is the experience of moral suffering, of the deep sense of guilt accompanied by the belief that one is an outcast from human sympathy and is hopelessly alone. He illustrates this with two literary examples: “The Ancient Mariner” and Raskolnikov in Crime and Punishment. The central conception in these two literary pieces is of salvation as reconciliation both with the social and the divine order, an escape from the wilderness of lonely guilt to the realm where men can understand one another.

This brings us directly to the “religious mission of sorrow.” Sorrows are defined by Royce as evils that we can assimilate. These become part of a constructive process, which involves growth rather than destruction, a passage to a new life. We takes these sorrows up into our plan of life, give them new meaning as they become part of a new whole. This was Royce’s emphasis in his essays on the problem of evil as well as in Religious Aspect and The Spirit. This will be discussed more in the section on the Problem of Evil.

The stage is now set for The Problem of Christianity. Christianity is viewed as a “philosophy of life,” and the question Royce asks is “In what sense, if any, can the modern man consistently be, in creed, a Christian?” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 62). In focusing on “creed,” however, Royce is clear that he is not concerned here with dogma or with particular theological beliefs. Rather he seeks the essentially “vital” and living ideas that will find expression in communal practices and religious-moral living and that will speak to all humanity. Royce will focus on living religious experience as was expressed in the early Pauline Christian communities. Royce’s focus is on the incarnation of the Spirit in the living Church, it is the Church, rather than the person of the founder that is the central idea of Christianity. For Royce, the essence of Christianity is its stress on the “saving community.” Royce writes: “The thesis of this book is that the essence of Christianity, as the Apostle Paul stated that essence, depends upon regarding the being which the early Christian Church believed itself to represent, and the being which I call…the ‘Beloved Community,’ as the true source, through loyalty, of the salvation of man” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 45).

It is indeed the “community” which allows us to understand more fully the teachings of the Master. Of Jesus’ teaching, Royce found two ideas especially crucial: his preaching of love and the “Kingdom of Heaven.” Both were mysterious and in need of interpretation. Thus, “love” is a mystery for although we know we are to love God and our neighbor, the question is how. How can I be practically useful in meeting my neighbor’s needs? Anyone who has tried to be benevolent or to meet the needs of others knows that there can be a huge crevice between your interpretation of what that person needs and their belief in that matter. It is the interpretation of Jesus’ teachings in the letters of Paul that make the difference for Royce. That which can make the loving of our neighbor less mysterious and difficult is community, for a community “when united by an active developing purpose is an entity more concrete, and, in fact, less mysterious than any individual man (Royce, 2001 [1913] 94). In community, we can come to know each other, to see what each other’s needs are. I need not ask “who is my neighbor?” for my neighbor and I are both members of one and the same community.

The essence of Christianity, for Royce, is contained in three ideas. The first of these is that the source and means of salvation is the community of believers. Community is also the basis of the ethic of love taught by Jesus. The other two essential ideas are: “the moral burden of the individual and “atonement.” These are addressed in the section on evil.

d. The Problem of Evil

Josiah Royce struggled with the problem of evil throughout his life, exploring it from various approaches, and asserting that it could neither be avoided nor dismissed by either the philosopher or the ordinary person. Thus, unlike some philosophers, he did not believe the problem of evil could be solved as a practical problem that only required improving social conditions. As a native Californian, a historian, and a social observer of the development of early California, Royce explored ways in which evil manifested itself in social relations among persons, in social bodies infected with racism, greed, and in a variety of harmful prejudices, in expressions of hate and in mob violence. Ultimately, Royce embraced a theistic process metaphysics that recognizes evil as a real force and suffering as an irreducible fact of experience. In his 1897 essay, “The Problem of Job,” Royce presents a fairly succinct overview of the problem of evil, various solutions and his own view on a possible solution. In the Job story, we have a traditional view of God as wise, omnipotent, all powerful, and all good and the situation of Job, namely, a universal situation of unearned ill-fortune, a seeming persecution of a righteous person and a reigning down of evils on a good man. For Royce, Job represents the fundamental psychological fact about the problem of evil, namely, the universal experience of unearned ill-fortune. This, asserts Royce, is the experience of every person, the kind of evil that all persons can see for themselves every day if they choose. This is the fundamental experiential and psychological fact that grounds Royce’s own answers to the problem of evil and also his dismissal of the various traditional answers to the problem of evil. Thus, for example there is the view that the purpose of the world is “soul making,” that pain teaches us the ways of the world and helps us develop our higher potentialities. Royce believes this answer is inadequate because it presupposes a greater evil, namely a world which allows evils as the only way to reach given goals. Such an answer Royce believes is unacceptable to a sufferer of evil and undeserved ills.

Another answer to the problem of evil is the infinite worth of agents with free will. Royce finds value in this view in that it acknowledges evil as a logically necessary part of a perfect moral order, but he believes this answer ultimately fails. A major problem is Job’s situation, namely, the innocent sufferer. Such unearned ills may be partly due to the free will that partly caused them, but, asserts Royce, the unearned ills are also due to God who declines to protect the innocent.

Royce believes that as long as one views God as an external power, as Job did, the problem of evil cannot be solved. Rather, one must recognize God as internally present to us and as suffering with us to produce the higher good. When we suffer, our sufferings are God’s sufferings and this is the case because without suffering, evil, and tragedy, God’s life could not be perfected. Furthermore, asserts Royce, personal overcoming evil is the essence of the moral life. Persons are instruments of God’s triumph. Thus, in The Sources of Religious Insight, Royce presents man as a destroyer of evil, a being who uses every effort to get rid of evil. Conquering evils and oppressions provide man’s greatest opportunities for loyalty and here is the source of religious insight and spiritual triumph. The encounter of human selves with the problem of evil is, for Royce, the most important moral aspect of the world. One must see the problematic situation into which human selves are immersed as part of the atoning process which tends toward an ultimate reconciliation of finite conflicts. Confronted with evils, one needs to trust within one’s limited view that the Spirit of the Universal Community reconciles.

Ultimately, Royce sees evil as an eternal part of both human and divine consciousness and the most important moral fact of the universe the human conquering of evil step by step. In addressing the doctrine of atonement in The Problem, Royce sets out in detail how the loyal community can best respond to human evil. The highest transgression in an ethics of loyalty is treason, or the willful betrayal of one’s own cause and the community of people who serve it. Such a betrayal is moral suicide for it threatens to destroy the network of purposes and social relationships that define the traitor’s self. The traitor is in what Royce calls “the hell of the irrevocable” (Royce, 2001 [1913], 162). Royce seeks an explanation of atonement which acknowledges this irrevocable nature of the deed that has been done, and which changes everything for the sinner and the community that has been harmed. None of the tradition Christian accounts of atonement are satisfactory. The answer, for Royce, is that the act of atonement can only be accomplished by the community, or on the behalf of the community, through the steadfast “loyal servant who acts, so to speak, as the incarnation of the spirit of the community itself” (Royce, 2011 [1913], 180). This person serves as a mediating party between the traitor and the betrayed community and through the atoning act genuine community is restored and all the individuals may emerge as wiser, more commitment servants of their common cause. Things are not the same as before the treason but, in fact, transformed and better. Royce then states what he believes to be the central postulate of the highest form of human spirituality, namely, that “No baseness or cruelty of treason so deep or so tragic shall enter our human world, but that loyal love shall be able in due time to oppose to just that deed of treason its fitting deed of atonement” (Royce 2001 [1913], 186). In the spirit of James, Royce asserts that this postulate cannot be proven true, but human communities can assert it and act upon it as it is were true.

e. Logic

Royce pursued his interest in logic, mathematics and science throughout his career. His first published book was a Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, written for his students in California in 1881. His own proposal for a system of formal logic was published as “The Relation of the Principles of Logic to the Foundations of Geometry” in 1905, a work later extended in 1914. Among his last writings were a series of encyclopedia articles on logical topics: Axiom, Error and Truth, Mind, Negation, and Order (all reprinted in Robinson, 1951).

In addition to his discussion of science in The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, The World and the Individual, and in The Problem of Christianity, Royce published a series of articles on scientific method:” The Mechanical, Historical and the Statistical,” “The Social Character of Scientific Inquiry,” (in Josiah Royce’s Late Writings); Hypotheses and Leading Ideas,” and Introduction to H. Poincaré, The Foundations of Science (reprinted in Robinson). Like Peirce, Royce argued for the self-corrective nature of the scientific method; the necessity of experience as the starting point of inquiry; an emphasis on scientific instinct and imaginative judgment in forming hypotheses; the requirement of a proper motive – the search for truth and not fame or profit – as a necessary condition, along with the correct method, for the success of science and essence of science, the notion of science as a communal endeavor, dependent on the contributions of many others, past, present and future, and finally for the thoroughly human and fallible nature of science.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Royce, Josiah, Primer of Logical Analysis for the Use of Composition Students, San Francisco, California: A.L. Bancroft and Co., 1881.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy: A critique of the Bases of Conduct and Faith, Boston, New York: Houghton Mifflin & Co., 1885.
  • Royce, Josiah, California from the Conquest in 1846 to the Second Vigilance Committee in San Francisco [1856]: A Study of American Character, Boston and New York: Houghton, Mifflin and Co. 1886.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Spirit of Modern Philosophy: An Essay in the Form of Lectures, Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 1892.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Conception of God: A Philosophical Discussion Concerning the Nature of the Divine Idea as a Demonstrable Reality, New York: The Macmillan Co, 1897. This includes commentary by Joseph LeConte, George Holmes Howison, and Sidney Edward Mezes.
  • Royce, Josiah, Studies in Good and Evil, New York, Appleton, 1898.
  • Royce, Josiah, The World and the Individual, 2 vols., New York: Macmillan, 1899.
  • Royce, Josiah, Outlines of Psychology: An Elementary Treatise with Some Practical Applications, New York: Macmillan, 1903.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Philosophy of Loyalty, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, Race Questions, Provincialism, and Other American Problems, New York: Macmillan, 1908.
  • Royce, Josiah, William James and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Life, New York: Macmillan, 1911.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Sources of Religious Insight, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913]. Also at
  • Royce, Josiah, The Problem of Christianity, Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 2001 [1913].
  • Royce, Josiah, War and Insurance, New York: Macmillan, 1914.
  • Royce, Josiah, The Hope of the Great Community, New York: Macmillan, 1916.

b. Published Editions

  • Robinson, D.S., ed. Royce’s Logical Essays: Collected Logical Essays of Josiah Royce, Dubuque, Iowa: W. C. Brown, 1951.
  • McDermott, J.J., ed. The Basic Writings of Josiah Royce, New York: Fordham University Press, 2 vols., 2005 [1969].
  • Clendenning, J., Ed. The Letters of Josiah Royce, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1970.
  • Oppenheim, F., ed. Josiah Royce’s Late Writings: A Collection of Unpublished and Scattered Works, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2 vols.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Auxier, R, ed., Critical Responses to Josiah Royce, 1885-1916, Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 3 vols., 2000.
  • Auxier, R, Time, Will, and Purpose: Living Ideas From the Philosophy of Josiah Royce, Open Court, 2011.
  • Clendenning, The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, revised and expanded ed., Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1999.
  • Kegley, J., Genuine Individuals and Genuine Communities: A Roycean Public Philosophy, Nashville, Tennessee, 1997.
  • Kegley, J. Josiah Royce in Focus, Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 2008.
  • Kiklick, B., Josiah Royce: An Intellectual Biography, Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1985.
  • Marcel, G., Royce’s Metaphysics, trans. V. and G. Ringer, Chicago: Henry Regnery Company, 1956. This was originally published as La Mėtaphysique de Royce, Paris, 1945.
  • Oppenheim, F.M. Royce’s Voyage Down Under: A Journey of the Mind, Lexington: University of Kentucky Press, 1980.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Philosophy of Religion, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Royce’s Mature Ethics, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
  • Oppenheim, F.M., Reverence for the Relations of Life: Re-examining Pragmatism via Josiah Royce’s Interactions with Peirce, James, and Dewey, Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 2005.
  • Smith, J.E. Royce South Infinite: The Community of Interpretation, Hamden, Conn.: Archon Books, 1969.
  • Tunstall, Dwayne, Yes, but Not Quite: Encountering Josiah Royce’s Ethico-Religious Insight, New York: Fordham University Press, 2009.
  • Trotter, G., On Royce, Belmont, California: Wadsworth, 2001.

Author Information

Jacquelyn Ann K. Kegley
California State University Bakersfield
U. S. A.