Bertrand Russell: Ethics
This article confines itself to Bertrand Russell’s conversion from ethical cognitivism (similar to G. E. Moore) to ethical non-cognitivism (similar to Ayer). Russell’s conversion is not only historically important, as it contributes to the rise of metaethics, but it also clarifies the central issues between cognitivism and non-cognitivism.
Traditionally, ethics has been understood as a branch of philosophy that focuses on normative value in human conduct; it is the search for a rationally defensible view concerning what things are good (worth aiming at), which actions are right, and why. However, the tradition took a peculiar turn in the context of 20th century analytic philosophy. Here, philosophers began to focus on the meanings of ethical terms and claims, rather than on the elements of right conduct. This was the birth of what we nowadays call “metaethics,” over against which the focus on normative theory—the mainstream of Western philosophical ethics from Aristotle to G. E. Moore—has come to be called “normative ethics. Current fashion divides ethics into three sub branches: normative ethics, metaethics and applied ethics. This distinction became necessary after the rise of metaethics in the first half of the twentieth century. Unlike normative ethics, metaethics mainly concentrates on the meanings of fundamental ethical terms, and on ethical method.
The first mature exposition of Russell’s ethical views is found in his essay “The Elements of Ethics” (1910). “The Elements” expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore’s Principia Ethica. When he wrote it, Russell was, like Moore, a cognitivist in ethics. That is to say, he believed that ethical statements such as “X is good”, express propositions that have truth-value (that is, are either true or false) independent of our opinions and emotions. However, the cognitivist phase of Russell’s thinking did not last long. Soon he moved from ethical cognitivism to ethical non-cognitivism, which denies that ethical statements have truth-value. The change was mainly brought about by Santayana’s criticism of “The Elements” in his book Winds of Doctrine (1913).
An exposition of Russell’s ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science (1935). This was published one year before A. J. Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic, which was to become the most famous exposition of ethical non-cognitivism in the first half of the twentieth century. There are two aspects of Russell’s ethical ideas as expressed in Religion and Science: (1) that ethical statements are not fact-stating though they seem to be so when expressed in indicative mood, and (2) they are optative or desire expressing.
Russell’s final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954), which might be regarded as Russell’s most important ethical writing. In Human Society, Russell adopts as his guiding principle David Hume’s maxim, “Reason is, and ought, only to be the slave of the passions.”
Table of Contents
- Writings on Ethics
- Russell’s Concept of Ethics
- Evolution of Russell’s Ethical Ideas
- Russell, Ayer and Subsequent Ethics
- References and Further Reading
Bertrand Russell was a prolific writer. He wrote on different branches of philosophy, including logic, epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, social and political philosophy, philosophy of religion and philosophy of mathematics. His three most important ethical writings are “The Elements of Ethics” (1910), Religion and Science (1935), and Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954). In “The Elements” Russell expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore’s Principia Ethica. An exposition of Russell’s ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science, whereas Russell’s final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics, which might be regarded as his most important ethical writing. Russell had originally intended to include the discussion on ethics in his Human Knowledge, but he decided not to do so because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as “knowledge.”
Apart from the works mentioned above, What I Believe (1925), An Outline of Philosophy (1927), “Reply to Criticism” in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell (1946) and Bertrand Russell Speaks His Mind (1960) contain valuable material on Russell’s ethics.
Except for a short time as a cognitivist under the influence of G. E. Moore, Russell was consistently an ethical non-cognitivist. That is to say, he did not believe that there is any such thing as objective ethical facts: “When we assert that this or that has ‘value’”, says Russell, “we are giving expression to our own emotions, not to a fact which would still be true if our personal feelings were different.” (Russell 1949, 230-31) This perspective has important implications for his concept of Ethics as a philosophical sub-discipline, and as a purported field of knowledge. In both cases, Russell thinks Ethics fails to qualify.
In his An Outline of Philosophy, Russell begins his discussion of ethics with the following words: “Ethics is traditionally a department of philosophy, and that is my reason for discussing it. I hardly think myself that it ought to be included in the domain of philosophy, but to prove this would take as long as to discuss the subject itself, and would be less interesting.” (180) Russell’s reasons for excluding ethics from the domain of philosophy become clearer in his Religion and Science. Because of his non-cogntivism, Russell thinks that questions as to “values”—that is to say, as to what is good or bad on its own account, independently of its effects—lie outside the domain of science. From this, Russell draws the further conclusion that questions about “values” lie wholly outside the domain of knowledge. And this in turn has implications for the place of Ethics in philosophy.
Russell regarded philosophy as a kind of incomplete science, a search for certainty in the sphere where certain knowledge is not yet achieved but remains possible. However, since Russell rejects the existence of ethics facts, ethical knowledge (certain or otherwise) is not even possible. Therefore, while Russell regarded the argument proving the impossibility of ethical knowledge as part of philosophy, normative theory—the traditional business of philosophical ethics—was excluded from philosophy proper. Thus, although Russell originally intended to include his Human Society in Ethics and Politics in his book Human Knowledge, as he says in the preface to the former, he decided not to do so because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as “knowledge.”
In his “Reply to Criticism” in The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, Russell reaffirms this view, repeating that he would like to exclude all value judgments from philosophy “except that this would be too violent a breach with usage, ” (719), and insisting that the only matter concerned with ethics that can be “properly” regarded as belonging to philosophy is the argument that ethical propositions should be expressed in optative mood, not in the indicative.
The main shift in his ethical thinking was from ethical cognitivism (similar to G. E. Moore) to non-cognitivism (similar to Ayer), but Russell’s ethical ideas did not remain the same throughout his philosophical career.
In his youth, Russell took the utilitarian view that the “happiness of mankind should be the aim of all actions” (Russell 1978, 39) to be so obviously true that he was surprised to find, upon entering Cambridge, that there were alternative ethical theories. At this stage, he took “the greatest happiness of the greatest number” as his ideal.
Russell moved away from his youthful utilitarianism because of what he calls “moral experience.” (Russell 1978, 161)
According to Russell, circumstances are apt to generate perfectly concrete moral convictions, and it is often impossible to judge beforehand what one’s moral opinion of a fact will be.
In a letter written to Gilbert Murray in 1902, Russell says, “what first turned me away from utilitarinism was the persuasion that I myself ought to pursue philosophy, although I had (and have still) no doubt that by doing economics and the theory of politics I could add more to human happiness.” It appeared to Russell that the dignity of which human existence is capable is not attainable by “devotion to the mechanism of life”, and that unless the contemplation of “eternal things” is preserved, humankind will become “no better than well-fed pigs.” However, Russell did not believe that such contemplation overall tends to happiness. As he says, “it gives moments of delight, but these are outweighed by years of effort and depression.” (Russell 1978, 161)
The first mature exposition of Russell’s ethical views is found in “The Elements of Ethics,” an essay in his book Philosophical Essays (1910). In “The Elements” Russell expounds an ethics largely based on G. E. Moore’s Principia Ethica.
He believed that (1) “good” is the most fundamental ethical concept and (2) that “good” is indefinable. He further maintained that we know a priori certain propositions about the kind of things that are good on their own account. In addition, that when we make a statement such as “X is good”, we make a statement like “this table is round”, which is either true or false, and whose truth or falsity is independent of our opinions and emotions. So, at the time of writing “The Elements” Russell was, like Moore, a cognitivist in ethics.
According to Moore, the pleasure of human intercourse and the enjoyment of beautiful objects are the most valuable things we know or imagine. Russell, on the other hand, gives no such list of things which are good in themselves, since he holds that his readers are competent to judge what things are good and what bad.
Roughly speaking, Russell’s conception of “right” in “The Elements” is also the same as that of Moore’s conception of right or duty. Irrespective of details, both Moore and Russell regard consequences or results as of vital importance for judging an action as right or wrong. In other words both are teleologists or consequentialists, like the utilitarians.
Russell, however, also allows for what he calls a “subjective” sense of “right.” According to Russell, if a person asks himself, “what ought I to do?” and then acts on his answer, that is to say, what he or she judges to be right after an appropriate amount of candid thought—the appropriate amount of thought being dependent on the difficulty and importance of the decision—then he may be regarded as acting rightly in the subjective sense, even if his action is not objectively right. An action is called “objectively right” by Russell when “of all that are possible it is the one which will probably have the best results.” Moore, on the other hand, makes no such distinction between right in the subjective sense and right in the objective sense.
The cognitivist phase of Russell’s thinking did not last long. Soon he started moving from ethical cognitivism to ethical non-cognitivism. The change was mainly brought about by Santayana’s criticism of Russell’s “The Elements” in the former’s book Winds of Doctrine (1913). The main thrust of Santayana’s criticism was that “good” cannot be totally independent of human interests and feelings; and that propositions about intrinsic goodness—if they can be called propositions at all—cannot be true or false in a manner in which propositions in physical sciences are, because they are not statements about certain objective state of affairs but are only expressions of “preferences we feel.” As he says, “to speak of the truth of an ultimate good would be a false collocation of terms; an ultimate good is chosen, found or aimed at; it is not opined.” (Santayana 1913, 143-44)
Santayana is also at pains to emphasize that “good” cannot be totally independent of human interests and feelings. As he says, “For the human system whiskey is truly more intoxicating than coffee, and the contrary opinion would be an error; but what a strange way of vindicating this real, though relative distinction to insist that whiskey is more intoxicating in itself, without reference to any animal; that it is pervaded, as it were, by an inherent intoxication, and stands dead drunk in its bottle!” (Jager 1972, 473)
Another factor, apart from Santayana’s criticism, which stimulated the change in Russell’s ethical thinking, was the impact of the First World War, which Russell passionately opposed. The war forced him to think afresh on a number of fundamental questions. For instance, Russell was forced to revise his views on human nature. As he says in his Autobiography, in his endeavour to understand popular feelings about war, he arrived at a view of human passions similar to that of psychoanalysts. Russell started believing that fundamental facts “in all ethical questions are feelings”, (Russell 1917, 19) and that impulse has more effect in moulding human lives than conscious purpose.
The second published work to discuss Russell’s ethics in some detail is What I Believe (1925). In this small book, included in The Basic Writings of Bertrand Russell, Russell clearly says that ethical disagreements about the good life are amenable to argument only when men differ as to the means to achieve a given end. But when there is a real difference as to ends, no argument is possible. “I cannot, therefore,” says Russell, “prove that my view of the good life is right; I can only state my view, and hope that as many as possible will agree.” (Egner and Dennon 1961, 372)
Russell’s view is that the good life is one inspired by love and guided by knowledge. According to Russell, neither love without knowledge nor knowledge without love can produce a good life; but love is in a sense more fundamental, since it will lead intelligent people to seek knowledge in order to find out how to benefit those whom they love.
Russell clarifies that by “knowledge” he does not mean “ethical knowledge.” (In fact, he did not believe that there is, strictly speaking, any such knowledge.) By “knowledge” Russell means “scientific knowledge and knowledge of particular facts.” (374) He considers such knowledge important, because if we desire to achieve some end, knowledge may show us the means, and this knowledge, according to Russell, may loosely pass as “ethical.” “Given an end to be achieved,” says Russell, “it is a question for science to discover how to achieve it. All moral rules must be tested by examining whether they tend to realize ends that we desire.”(374)
So, Russell is already linking “good” with the desired, a theme to which, as we shall see, he returns again and again. He says emphatically “outside human desires there is no moral standard.” (375)
In An Outline of Philosophy, Russell approaches the problem of ethics with the question, “What is meant when a person says ‘You ought to do so-and-so’ or ‘ I ought to do so-and-so’?” and gives the reply that “primarily a sentence of this sort has an emotional content”; it means “this is the act towards which I feel the emotion of approval.” However, Russell notes, “we do not wish to leave the matter there; we want to find something more objective and systematic and constant than a personal emotion.” (181)
Russell points out that when the ethical teacher says, “you ought to approve acts of such-and-such kinds,” he generally gives reasons for his view, and proceeds to examine “what sorts of reasons are possible.” (181)
In this context, Russell refers to the utilitarian doctrine that happiness is the good and we ought to act so as to maximize the balance of happiness over unhappiness in the world, and says: “I should not myself regard happiness as an adequate definition of the good, but I should agree that conduct ought to be judged by its consequences.” According to Russell, “right conduct” is not an autonomous concept, but means “conduct calculated to produce desirable results.” This leads him to ask, “How can we discover what constitutes the ends of right conduct?”
At this point Russell, first, refers to the fact that on this issue he earlier held views similar to those of G. E. Moore, which he was led to abandon “partly by Mr. Santayana’s Winds of Doctrine.” And then he declares, “I now think that good and bad are derivative from desire.” He points out that there is a conflict between desires of different men and incompatible desires of the same man and says that good is “mainly a social concept, designed to find an issue from this conflict.”(183-84)
Thus, two things are clear. First, Russell, when he wrote What I Believe and An Outline of Philosophy had ceased to be a cognitivist. Second, he had now started moving towards the view that good was a social concept derived from desire. However, in these two books we find only a rough outline of a new theory that is emerging. We find an exposition of Russell’s non-cognitivism in more developed form in Religion and Science.
An exposition of Russell’s ethical non-cognitivism in its developed form is found in Religion and Science (1935), which was published one year before A. J. Ayer’s exposition of the emotivist theory of ethics in Language, Truth and Logic. Russell retains his view from “The Elements” that defining “good” is the fundamental problem of ethics. According to him, once “good” is defined, the rest of ethics follows: we ought to act in the way we believe most likely to create as much good as possible, and as little of its correlative evil. In other words, once we define “good”, framing of moral rules is a matter for science.
However, Russell argues that when we try to be definite as to what we mean by “good”, we land ourselves in great difficulties, because—unlike with scientific questions—there is no factual evidence about value. Disputants can only appeal to their own emotions, and employ rhetorical devices to rouse similar emotions in others. According to Russell, when we assert that this or that has value, we are giving expression to our emotions, not to a fact which would still be true if our personal feelings were different. When a person says “this is good in itself,” he seems to be making a statement like “this is square” or “this is sweet.” Nevertheless, what he really means, according to Russell, is “I wish everybody to desire this” or “Would that everybody desire this.” (235) The first of these sentences, which may be true or false, does not, says Russell, belong to ethics but to psychology or biography. The second sentence which does belong to ethics, expresses a desire for something, but asserts nothing; and since it asserts nothing it is logically impossible that there should be evidence for or against it, or for it to possess either truth or falsehood.
In sum, there are two main aspects to Russell’s metaethical views in Religion and Science. First, ethical statements are not fact-stating (though they seem to be so when expressed in indicative mood). Second, they are instead optative, or desire-expressing. This link between “good” and desire is already familiar from An Outline of Philosophy. Prima facie, according to Russell, anything we all desire is good and anything we all dread is bad. If we all agreed in our desires, says Russell, the matter could be left there, but in fact, desires of human beings conflict. In this conflict each tries to enlist allies by showing that his own desires harmonize with those of other people. Therefore, ethics, according to Russell, is closely related to politics: it is an attempt to bring the collective desires of group to bear upon individuals and, conversely, it is an attempt by an individual to cause his desires to become those of his group. In this way, according to Russell, ethics contains no statement whether true or false, but consists of desires of a certain general kind, namely, such as are concerned with desires of humankind in general.
Russell’s final ethical views are to be found in Human Society in Ethics and Politics (1954), which might be regarded as his most important ethical work. As he says in the preface of the Human Society, he originally intended to include the discussion of ethics in his book Human Knowledge, but he decided not to do so, because he was uncertain as to the sense in which ethics can be regarded as “knowledge.” The book, Russell claimed, has two purposes: first, to set forth an undogmatic ethic; and second, to apply this ethic to various current political problems.
Russell adopts as his guiding principle David Hume’s maxim that “Reason is, and ought, only to be the slave of the passions.” According to Russell, desires, emotions or passions are the only possible causes of action. Reason is not a cause of action but only a regulator. “The world that I should wish to see,” says Russell, ‘is one where emotions are strong but not destructive, and where, because they are acknowledged, they lead to no deception either of oneself or of others. Such a world would include love and friendship and the pursuit of art and knowledge.” (11)
In effect, what Russell says in Human Society, is not very different from what he says in Religion and Science; when an ethical disagreement is about means for achieving certain ends, it can be resolved by the use of reason; but when the disagreement is about ends reason is of no help, because what ends we pursue depends ultimately on our desires.
As in Religion and Science, Russell is also at pains to emphasize that our desires are not “irrational” just because we cannot give any reason for them. According to Russell, a desire cannot, in itself, be either rational or irrational. We may desire A because it is a means to B, but in the end, when we have done with mere means we must come to something, which we desire for no reasons. Nevertheless, the desire cannot be called irrational merely because no reasons can be given for feeling it.
However, Russell’s dissatisfaction with his own theory of ethics, which earlier finds an expression in “Reply to Criticism” (1946) reappears in Human Society and we find him wondering once again whether there is such a thing as ethical knowledge. In an important passage he says: “It may be that there is some … way of arriving at objectivity in ethics; if so, since it must involve appeal to the majority, it will take us from personal ethics into the sphere of politics, which is, in fact, very difficult to separate from ethics.”(26-27)
Russell sums up his efforts to arrive at an objective ethics in the following fundamental propositions and definitions:
(1) Surveying the acts which arouse emotions of approval or disapproval, we find that, as a general rule, the acts which are approved of are those believed likely to have, on the balance, effects of certain kinds while opposite effects are expected from acts that are disapproved of.
(2) Effects that lead to approval are defined as “good” and those leading to disapproval are as “bad.”
(3) An act of which, on the available evidence, the effects are likely to be better than those of any other act that is possible in the circumstances, is defined as “right”; any other act is “wrong.” What we “ought” to do is, by definition, the act which is right.
(4) It is right to feel approval of a right act and disapproval of a wrong act. (115-16)
According to Russell, these definitions and propositions, if accepted, provide a coherent body of ethical propositions, which are true (or false) in the same sense as if they were propositions of science. He admits that different societies in different ages have given approval to a wide diversity of acts; but, argues Russell, the difference between ourselves and other ages in these respects is attributable to a difference between our beliefs and theirs as to the effects of actions. Thus, Russell is led to the conclusion that there is more agreement among humankind as to the effects that we should aim than as to the kinds of acts that are approved. “I think”, he says, ” the contention of Henry Sidgwick, that acts which are approved of are those that are likely to bring happiness or pleasure, is, broadly speaking, true.” (117)
If it is admitted, Russell points out, that the great majority of approved acts are such as are believed to have certain effects, and it is found, further, that exceptional acts, which are approved without having this character, tend to be no longer approved when their exceptional character is realized; then it becomes possible, in a certain sense, to speak of ethical error. We may say, according to Russell, that it is “wrong” to approve of such exceptional acts, meaning that such approval does not have the effects which mark the great majority of approved acts.
Although on the above theory, ethics contains statements, which are true or false, and not merely optative or imperative, Russell points out that its basis is still one of emotion and feeling. The emotion of approval is involved in the definition of “right” and “wrong” and the feeling of enjoyment or satisfaction is involved in the definition of “good” or “intrinsic value.” Thus, according to Russell, the appeal upon which we depend for the acceptance of our ethical theory is not the appeal to the facts of perception, but to emotions and feelings, which have given rise to the concepts of “right” and “wrong”, “good” and “bad.”
Interestingly, in his Autobiography, Russell summarizes his conclusion in Human Society in Ethics and Politics in the following manner: “The conclusion that I reach is that ethics is never an independent constituent, but is reducible to politics in the last analysis.” (523) He reiterates that there is no such thing as ethical knowledge, and that “reason is, and ought only to be, the slave of the passions.” An ethical opinion, maintains Russell, can only be defended by an ethical axiom, but if the axiom is not accepted, there is no way of reaching a rational conclusion.
There is, according to Russell, one approximately rational approach to ethics, which he calls “the doctrine of compossibility.” Russell defines “compossible desires” as desires which can be satisfied together, that is, those which do not conflict with one another. According to the doctrine of compossibility, the person who wishes to be happy should try to guide his life by the largest possible set of compossible desires. Similarly, a world in which the aims of different individuals or groups is compossible is likely to be happier than one in which they are conflicting. Therefore, says Russell, it should be part of a wise social system to encourage compossible purposes and discourage conflicting ones, by means of education and social systems designed to this end. However, Russell feels that from a theoretical point of view this doctrine affords no ultimate solution, because it assumes that happiness is better than unhappiness, which, according to him, is an ethical principle incapable of proof.
Two things emerge out of this survey of Russell’s ethical thinking: (i) Russell’s concept of “right” remains largely the same throughout his career, and that concept is, broadly speaking, utilitarian: right action is that action which leads to good results; (ii) though Russell consistently regards “good” as the most fundamental ethical concept, his view of what good is or whether we can know at all what good is changes over time. However, his final ethical views on this issue are much closer to utilitarianism than to any other classical ethical theory, as is shown by his approval of Sidgwick’s contention that “acts which are approved of are those that are likely to bring happiness or pleasure.” In place of classical utilitarianism’s “happiness”, Russell prefers to speak of “satisfaction of desires.” In Human Society itself, for example, Russell defines “good” as “satisfaction of desire.” According to him, this definition is more consonant with the ethical feelings of the majority of humankind than any other theoretically defensible definition.
As we have seen, the main shift in Russell’s ethical thinking was from cognitivism to non-cognitivism. Russell shares this non-cognitivist perspective with ethical thinkers such as A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, R. M Hare and P. H. Nowell-Smith. The common core of non-cognitivism is the denial that ethical claims have factual contents and corresponding truth-values. However, when non-cogntivists turn from telling us what ethical statements are not to telling us what they are, they frequently differ from one another in many of the details. Russell’s non-cogntivism differs from other versions in several ways.
First, Russell’s positive account of ethical statements focuses mainly on desires. Therefore, his analysis of ethical terms is more appropriately described as optative than, for example, emotive (Ayer, Stevenson) or prescriptive (Hare).
Second, Russell’s optative analysis of ethical terms applies mainly to “good” (as an end), which Russell regarded as the most fundamental ethical term. As far as the analysis of “right” is concerned, Russell was a consequentialist throughout his philosophical career.
Third, Russell shows a greater awareness than many non-cognitivists of his era of the social importance or social function of ethical concepts. For example, he clearly says in An Outline of Philosophy that “good” is mainly a social concept “designed to find an issue” [that is, an outcome, a resolution] from conflict of desires—between desires of different persons, and incompatible desires of the same person. He also adds that the primary use of “good” is to label things we individually desire, but, since language is a social institution, “good” gradually comes to apply to things desired by the whole social group.
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