Guidelines for Authors

Authors should follow these guidelines before submitting their final draft. Avoid using a large number of references as you would if you were writing a definitive book on your topic. It is fine to say Smith said such and such in the 1960s while not providing a citation. Your intended audience is not professional researchers.

Here are some noteworthy stylistic points that are different from those in journal articles:

    • Do not use Latin abbreviations such as “etc.”
    • Do not use contractions such as “don’t.”
    • Do not use the words “recent” or “now” or “currently” since they likely will be inapplicable fifty years in the future.
    • Do not cite forthcoming articles.
    • Use no footnotes or endnotes.
    • Before the table of contents, include  an opening summary of 200-500 words that tells the reader what is coming.
  1. General
    1. Author Copyright and Licensing Agreement
    2. Length
    3. Article’s Purpose
  2. Content
    1. Level of Sophistication
    2. Opening Summary
    3. Structure of Articles on People
    4. Structure of Articles on Topics
  3. Style
    1. Formal Style
    2. Simple Style
    3. No Footnotes or Endnotes
    4. Minimize Citations and Quotations
    5. Other Stylistic Conventions
  4. Format
    1. Table of Contents and Section Headings
    2. References & Bibliographies
    3. Hyperlinks
    4. Graphics, Photos, & Charts
    5. Foreign Language Terms
    6. Description of Author
    7. Acknowledgments
  5. Miscellaneous
    1. Authors Who Are Non-Native English Speakers
    2. Editing after Acceptance
    3. Editing after Posting
    4. Atypical Review and Publication Delays

1. General

In submitting your article to be refereed, remove information that will identify you, but do give this information to your editor, who will add it back into the final version to be formatted. Microsoft Word is the preferred program to use in writing your article, although we accept articles initially in any format, including pdf.  Once your article is accepted for publication, you need to submit it in Word format or LaTeX. Turn off right justification; right justification will be added during our formatting process. Authors who are non-native English speakers have the responsibility to submit articles in standard English; many of our foreign authors make use of English-speaking proofreaders before submitting their articles.

a. Author Copyright and Licensing Agreement

The author should know that he or she enters into an agreement with the IEP such that:

  1. The author grants an exclusive and perpetual license to the IEP to use and distribute the article through Internet media.
  2. This license covers the present version/edition of the IEP, all future versions/editions of the IEP, and all derivations of the IEP in the present media format as well as other possible formats such as new IEP sites, printed works, DVD, and CD ROM.
  3. The author receives no financial payment for his/her article from the IEP.
  4. Authors retain copyright to their article and the right to publish the article in a format that does not compete with the IEP in nature and scope. IEP articles cannot be posted elsewhere on the internet where there is public access; those websites should link to our articles instead. The IEP has an interest in preventing the dilution of this resource that can occur when IEP articles are copied and posted on external sites. The IEP also has an interest in assuring that only the most recently updated versions of its articles are on the internet, and external duplication compromises this interest. With some types of password-protected websites, reproducing complete articles may be allowable. With printed publications, authors must inform the IEP general editors of any secondary publishing opportunity and also inform the secondary publisher about the author’s prior agreement with the IEP.  You, as the author, can use all or any part of your IEP article elsewhere in printed formats. However, you need to be careful that you do not accidentally sign over the copyrights of that material to your publisher whose standard contract may say that none of your material be published elsewhere. If this happens, then the IEP could have to remove your article. The best way to avoid that is by including an acknowledgment somewhere in your new article or book that says that the passages in question are revised versions of articles in the IEP and appear in your book by permission of the IEP.
  5. The IEP reserves the right to grant permission to reprint articles at the request of third parties (such as universities or book publishers), particularly when the third-party publication is in keeping with the nonprofit and educational mission of the IEP; for-profit requests will be deferred to the author.
  6. The IEP routinely re-evaluates posted articles for their academic rigor, currentness, readability, length, intended audience, and placement within the overall vision of the IEP. The IEP reserves the right to discontinue using a posted article. To assist in such re-evaluations, the editors may solicit post-publication peer reviews of articles and contact authors for needed revisions. In some cases, if an author is not able to revise an article as requested by the IEP editors, it may be removed and replaced with one on the same topic by a different author. In other cases, an article topic itself may fall outside the evolving vision of the IEP and may be removed without replacement. In either case, the licensing agreement with the author will terminate, and the author will regain full copyrights to the article, including the right to publish it elsewhere on the Internet.

b. Length

Most articles on the IEP are 8,000 – 15,000 words. Articles on minor topics should be at least 8,000 words in length, not counting bibliographical material. Those on the most important topics should be between 10,000 and 15,000 words, although there are no space restrictions, and authors are encouraged to err on the side of being too long rather than too short. Articles about major philosophers may require a series of articles to adequately cover the scope of their contributions; see for example the set of articles on Aristotle and the set on Hume. You might consider writing a new member of either series.

c. Article’s Purpose

The purpose of your article is to present information accepted by colleagues working in the subject area. An encyclopedia article is not the place to defend an original thesis. Your article should explain the topic in language the reader can understand, and it should present the important distinctions, the main results, and the main points of view on controversial issues. Your article should call attention to related topics and should provide some references in case the reader wishes to read further on your topic.

2. Content

a. Level of Sophistication

The Encyclopedia’s articles should be written with the intention that most of the article can be understood by advanced undergraduates majoring in philosophy and by other scholars who are not working in the field covered by that article. The IEP articles are written by experts but not for experts, in analogy to the way the Scientific American magazine is written by scientific experts but not primarily for scientific experts. For topics that are unavoidably technical, such as an article on Einstein’s General Theory of Relativity or on Ramsey sentences in logic, the goal should be to make the early parts easy-going so that the technically unsophisticated reader will still profit from reading much of the article.

b. Opening Summary

Preceding the table of contents, the beginning of each article should contain a summary of the article in 200 to 500 words. The purpose of the summary is to give readers a quick overview of your topic. See the article on Substance as an excellent example. You have three goals to achieve simultaneously: (1) to convey some understanding of your topic to those readers who will read the summary with no intention of reading the entire article, (2) to say something intriguing that will make readers want to continue reading beyond the summary, and (3) to give readers who do intend to read the full article some idea of the territory ahead. Think of the opening summary as functioning as a brief entry that might appear in a philosophy dictionary. The vast majority of our readers (one million per month) will read only your opening summary. Because of the opening summary’s critical role, the IEP staff may revise these either prior to or after publication for purposes of clarity or uniformity.

Here is what not to do in the opening summary. Do not focus primarily on saying your topic or your philosopher is influential and important. Do not spend time saying how your article is not comprehensive. Do not mention yourself. Instead, add more information about what philosophical contributions are made and how. Put yourself in the shoes of a reader who probably will not be reading your full article but only its opening summary and who wants to learn something about what issues are covered and in what manner. For an article on an individual philosopher, focus on what theses the philosopher defended, and on their style of doing philosophy—for example, that she is a post-Kantian German idealist.

In the opening summary, it would be preferable not to include any quotations nor any citations and to make your points in your own words. The more detailed quotations and citations can be included later in the main body of your article.

c. Structure of Articles on People

The body of the article should begin with a biography of the philosopher. The bulk of the article will consist of a discussion of the philosopher’s main philosophical contributions; in most cases, a topical presentation of this material is preferred over a strictly chronological presentation. The discussion might include influences on the philosopher, traditional criticisms of the philosopher, and the impact of the philosopher on later philosophers. See the article on Francis Bacon as an example.  As in the Bacon article, you are encouraged to include a copyright-free picture with your own article.

d. Structure of Articles on Topics

The opening sentence of the summary paragraph should be a general definition of the term being used, such as, “The term ‘category’ means ultimate or fundamental division.” The opening of the article body should say something about the origin of the term, the context in which the term is used, or alternative definitions of the term. The article will typically consist of a chronological survey of philosophical theories relating to the term. Where appropriate, include traditional criticisms of the theories in question. Please see the article on Logical Paradoxes as an example.

3. Style

The IEP prefers American English, but other dialects such as British, South African, Australian, and Indian are acceptable. Just be consistent throughout the article.  Regarding citations, the IEP prefers articles written according to the Chicago Manual of Style, but other coherent documentation styles are acceptable.

a. Formal Style

All articles should be written in a formal, yet simple style, such as that used in the Encyclopedia Britannica, the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, or the Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Avoid slang.  Avoid reference to yourself, as in “I find this argument to be unconvincing,” or “As I’ve shown in the previous paragraph….”

b. Simple Style

Avoid technical jargon, especially technical terms that are unexplained. Articles should be written in a straightforward style that is accessible to intelligent but general readers. Although the IEP is regularly visited by professional philosophers, many users of the IEP are philosophy students or philosophically curious web surfers. To best serve the interests of these latter users, authors should minimize unnecessary technical vocabulary.

c. No Footnotes or Endnotes

Although footnotes and endnotes are common in journal articles and books, they are not allowed in our encyclopedia articles.

d. Minimize Citations and Quotations

Minimize the number of citations. You are not writing a treatise for researchers but rather a popularization. An in-line (in a paragraph) citation might include only an author’s name, or it might include the author plus a book or journal title. A fuller citation with page numbers, year, and publisher can be given in the final section called “References and Further Reading” or simply be omitted, so long as you are confident that you could give the citation to the referee if you were asked for it. The expectation is that authors will paraphrase and interpret the published material in their subject area; and for that reason, the number of citations can be minimized.

e. Other Stylistic Conventions

When starting a new paragraph, do not indent the first word; instead, skip to a new line.

Avoid using underlining or boldface; use italics instead. Underlines or boldface look too emphatic.

Minimize the use of in-text references such as “…as shown in section (4) second paragraph below and also in section (6b, 3rd paragraph).”

Avoid the use of most Latin abbreviations. Here are the English replacements:

cf. | compare
et. al. | and others
etc. | and so forth
e.g. | for example
i.e. | that is
NB | note
viz. | namely

It is OK to use “ibid.” and “op. cit.” and to use Latin quotations and names of Latin books.

Refer to articles within the encyclopedia as articles, not entries.

Every article must end with the author information, and not be followed by any other text or diagram.

4. Format

Turn off right justification, and let words wrap naturally to the next line.

Do not number your pages or your items in the section on References and Further Reading

a. Table of Contents and Section Headings

When your article has been accepted by the editor and is being formatted, the sections headings in the body of the article will be generated automatically from your table of contents, not from whatever section headings you have within the body of your article, so be very careful about the accuracy of your table of contents.

Do not include page numbers within the table of contents. When creating your table of contents, do not use the Word macro that automatically produces a table of contents at References | Table of Contents. This creates a table of contents with extraneous page numbers and dots that cannot be edited or accepted by the IEP’s formatting program.

For typical articles, please use between five and twenty section headings. Less than five will make the article look too simple, and readers with specific topics in mind will find it difficult to locate their topic. More than twenty will make the contents list too complex and, in most cases, make some of the sections too short and thus be visually awkward. Do not mention the opening summary in the table of contents. Use capitals and small case, not all capitals.  Capitalize verbs, nouns and adjectives, not Use of subheadings is optional.  That is, the table of contents can either be flat or hierarchical.

Use the following numbering and lettering conventions:

Opening Summary
Table of Contents

  1. Heading One
    1. Subheading One
      1. Subsubheading One
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
      2. Subsubheading Two
        1. Subsubsubheading One
        2. Subsubsubheading Two
    2. Subheading Two
  2. Heading Two
  3. Heading Three
  4. References and Further Reading

Although a hierarchical table of contents may have up to four levels, we encourage you to restrict yours to at most three levels for visual elegance. The final heading of any article must be called “References and Further Reading.”

b. References and Bibliographies

Every article’s final section must be called “References and Further Readings.” This is to be followed by the author information, namely the author’s name, email address, university affiliation, and country.

Bibliographies and lists of citations and references should be brief at around 20 entries. Do not exceed 50 entries except in special cases with approval from the general editors. Whenever possible, the IEP prefers bibliographies that are annotated with a short sentence describing the nature of the work cited; see Fallibilism for an example. The rationale for these policies is that long, unannotated lists will confuse casual readers, and will not be needed by professional researchers who already will have more extensive lists available from elsewhere.

We suggest that you follow the Chicago Manual of Style regarding document style, but other formats such as MLA (Modern Language Association) or APA (American Psychological Association) or other coherent and consistent styles are acceptable. The heading for the bibliography must be “References and Further Reading,” but it may contain subheadings.  Typical subheadings are “Primary Sources” and “Secondary Sources.”  Italicize all names of books and journals; do not use underlining.  Do not use dashes in place of author names, although this is commonly done in journals. The IEP does not allow references to forthcoming publications.

c. Hyperlinks

When appropriate, include hyperlinks in your article to other IEP articles. However, do not include any hyperlinks to non-IEP web sites unless these are stable sites that are very unlikely to be changed during the next forty years. Here is what we mean by “stable”: URLs of journals, professional organizations, and encyclopedias would be fine, but an individual’s website or blog is not.

The IEP aims at being a self-contained resource, rather than a link list. Also, because external links require continual updating, we hope to avoid this time-consuming task. It is our policy not to include links to translations of your article.

Avoid hyperlinks in the opening summary; use them in the main body of the article.

d. Graphics, Photos, and Charts

Authors are encouraged to include graphics in their articles, provided they do not infringe on copyrights. See the article on Francis Bacon as an example. The graphics (including photos, charts and tables) need to be submitted as separate files in either .jpg or .gif or .png format. The IEP staff cannot create graphics, but we can crop a graphic and make simple adjustments to a graphic’s size.

e. Foreign Language Terms

Authors should minimize the use of italics with foreign language terms. Regarding diacritical marks, use those that have html codes. Replace other diacritical marks with ordinary letters. Please see our helpsheets on Chinese and Indian languages.

f. Description of Author

When you send your article to be refereed, do not include information about yourself. However, when you are submitting your final draft after acceptance, then do include your name, email address, your university’s name, and your country.  Do not include your title (for example, “associate professor”), your department name (for example “Department of Humanities and Philosophy”), your university’s street address, or your personal webpage address.

g. Acknowledgments

Do not include dedications and acknowledgments to colleagues who provided input on your article, nor to institutions that provided you with funding. Do all this privately.

5. Miscellaneous

a. Authors Who Are Non-Native English Speakers

Authors who do not speak English as their primary language must have their articles revised by a native English speaker, or equivalent, prior to submission.

b. Editing after Acceptance

After your article has been accepted for publication, send the final version to your subject area editor or to the general editors as an e-mail attachment. Use separate attachments for all the graphics, photos, and charts. The editors will then reformat the article to fit the standard IEP design and layout. If you submit your article with a photograph or graphic to be used in your article, indicate who owns the copyright or indicate that it is in the public domain and so is no longer under copyright. More details of the acceptance process for articles is described in the page on the Submissions Page.

After acceptance, the IEP staff copy edits the article before publication. Normally these are minor stylistic changes that are intended not to affect the article’s content. Unlike the case with journal articles, the author is not sent proofs. Instead, the changes are made, and the article is provisionally posted in the Encyclopedia; then in the early days of the publication (before Google and other search engines re-index the IEP site to include our new articles), the author is notified and encouraged to read the article and request changes. If an author wishes to see the final version before publication, it is the author’s responsibility to request this.

The general editors have the right to final acceptance of all articles. In carrying out a unified plan for the entire IEP, the general editors may solicit additional peer reviews of submitted articles and request that authors make additional changes including changes to content, style, and length. At any time the general editors may also alter article titles and revise the opening summary of articles.

c. Editing after Posting

After your article is published, feel free to come back and request further changes, including changes of content. You may make any minor content changes you wish. Major changes in content should be approved by the subject area editor. Examples of major changes would be the elimination of a section and its subheading in the table of contents, or the addition of a lengthy discussion of a new topic, or a reorganization that requires addition or deletion of a heading or subheading in the table of contents. A minor change is one that improves the presentation of a point and that does not involve the alteration or removal of a heading or subheading.

When telling us what to change, do not send a revision of the Word document that you originally sent before the article was posted. That removes all the improvements made by the copy editor and by the formatter. Instead, do one of the following:

(1) If you have only a small number of changes, then send a numbered list of desired changes within an email or an attached Word document. Indicate where in the posted article each change is to be made by giving the section number and the paragraph number such as:

Section 4b, 3rd paragraph. Change its second sentence from “Kant said 1 + 1 = 3” to “Kant said 1 + 1 = 2.”

Do not mention page numbers because page numbers on your own computer are different than those on IEP staff computers.

(2) Save your article as an html document, then edit it with an html editor and send the result. Accompany this with a second document giving some explanation of the kinds of changes you are making.

(3) Capture the content of your online article as a Word document, indicate changes in red font in the Word document, and send that.

d. Atypical Review and Publication Delays

Authors should contact their subject area editor if, after submission, there is an unusually long delay at a particular juncture in the process from the article’s initial submission to its final appearance on the IEP website. Each submission typically passes through five hands (subject area editor, reviewer, general editor, copy editor, formatter). While we strive to maintain an efficient production process, occasionally there are unexpected delays as a result of scheduling issues with our all-volunteer staff. In the rare event that this occurs, the author should send a follow-up email if there is a delay of more than one month at any given stage.

An encyclopedia of philosophy articles written by professional philosophers.