Theological Determinism

Theological determinism is the view that God determines every event that occurs in the history of the world. While there is much debate about which prominent historical figures were theological determinists, St. Augustine, Thomas Aquinas, John Calvin, and Gottfried Leibniz all seemed to espouse the view at least at certain points in their illustrious careers. Contemporary theological determinists also appeal to various biblical texts (for example Ephesians 1:11) and confessional creeds (for example the Westminster Confession of Faith) to support their view. While such arguments from authority carry significant weight within the traditions in which they are offered, another form of argument for theological determinism which has broader appeal draws on perfect being theology, or a kind of systematic thinking through the implications of the claim that God is—in the words of St. Anselmquo maius cogitari non potest: that than which none greater can be conceived. The article below considers three such perfect being arguments for theological determinism, having to do with God’s knowledge of the future, providential governance of creation, and absolute independence. Implications of theological determinism for human freedom and divine responsibility are then discussed.

Reflection on theological determinism is both theoretically interesting and also practically important, especially for the lives of religious believers. On the one hand, for anyone who enjoys a good philosophical puzzle, thinking through the implications of this view offers the opportunity to consider whether various sets of propositions to which people sometimes ascribe—e.g. that God has exhaustive foreknowledge but that some events are not determined, or that God determines all events but that humans are culpable for their own sin—are in fact jointly consistent, and so what sort of systematic metaphysics is possible. On the other hand, whether all events in the world—and, in particular, personally significant events, such as the birth or death of a child, or the gain or loss of employment—are understood to be determined by God or not makes a significant difference to the attitudes that religious believers adopt and the decisions they make in response to such events in their own lives.

Table of Contents

  1. Defining Theological Determinism
  2. Arguments for Theological Determinism
    1. Divine Foreknowledge
    2. Divine Providence
    3. Divine Aseity
  3. Theological Determinism and Human Freedom
    1. Standard Compatibilism
    2. Theological-but-not-Natural Compatibilism
    3. Libertarianism
    4. Hard Determinism
  4. Theological Determinism and Divine Responsibility for Evil
    1. Theodicies and Defenses
    2. Causing vs. Permitting Evil
    3. God not a Moral Agent
    4. Sin not Blameworthy
    5. Skeptical Theism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Defining Theological Determinism

As stated above, theological determinism is the view that God determines every event that occurs in the history of the world. What it means for God to determine an event may need some spelling out. Theological determinism is often associated with Calvinist or Reformed theology, and many proponents of Calvinism put their view in terms of the specificity of God’s decree, the efficaciousness of God’s will, or the extent of God’s providential control. John Feinberg, for example, describes his theological determinist position as that view that “God’s decree covers and controls all things” (2001, p. 504), while Paul Helm, another staunch theological determinist of the Calvinist variety, simply says that God’s providence is “extended to all that He has created” (1993, p. 39). The problem with such characterizations is that they are subject to multiple interpretations, some of whom would be affirmed by theological indeterminists. For instance, a theological indeterminist might say that God’s providence extends to all events, or that even undetermined events are controlled or decreed by God in the sense that God foresees them and allows them to occur and realizes His purposes through them.

Thus one might think it better to define theological determinism in terms of divine causation, as Derk Pereboom does when he characterizes his view as “the position that God is the sufficient active cause of everything in creation, whether directly or by way of secondary causes” (2011, p. 262). The problem here is that some thinkers who seem committed to theological determinism deny that God should be considered a cause at all, at least in any univocal sense as creatures are. Herbert McCabe, for instance, maintains that when we act freely, we are not caused to act by anyone or anything other than ourselves (1987, p. 12). This is not because McCabe thinks that our free actions are undetermined by God, but because he thinks that God is not an “existent among others,” as created causes are (1987, p. 14). Thinkers like McCabe sometimes appeal to Thomas Aquinas’ doctrine of analogy in explaining their view. According to this doctrine, as Austin Farrer explains it, God’s providential activity cannot be conceived in causal terms without “degrade[ing] it to the creaturely level and plac[ing] it in the field of interacting causalities”—the results of which can only be “monstrosity and confusion” (1967, p. 62). If the views of such Thomists are to count as versions of theological determinism, then we need a way of spelling out the view in non-causal terms.

Perhaps, then, theological determinism will have to be defined in terms of God’s decree or will or control after all; but if so, these concepts will have to be defined so as to rule out indeterministic interpretations. We might, for instance, take Feinberg’s definition of an “unconditional” decree as one “based on nothing outside of God that move[s] him to choose one thing or another” (2001, p. 527) and then characterize theological determinism as the view that God unconditionally decrees every event that occurs in the history of the world. Such a view would exclude the possibility that God merely permits some events which He foresees will happen in some circumstances but which He does not Himself determine.

2. Arguments for Theological Determinism

a. Divine Foreknowledge

One of the divine attributes that has been appealed to in arguments for theological determinism is God’s knowledge of future events, or (simple) foreknowledge. Numerous biblical passages support the idea that God knows all that the future holds, including the free choices of human beings. For instance, the New Testament records Jesus’ prophesies that Judas will betray him and that Peter will deny him three times; and in the Hebrew Bible, the psalmist declares to God, “In your book were written all the days that were formed for me, when none of them as yet existed” (Psalm 29). Furthermore, if we assume that there are truths about the future to be known (a question discussed below), then exhaustive divine foreknowledge—that is, God’s foreknowledge of every future event—may be thought to follow from considerations of perfect being theology, since to not know some truth would seem to be an imperfection.

But if God knows the future exhaustively, theological determinists argue, then all future events must be determined, directly or indirectly, by God. The reasoning they offer in support of this argument can be considered in two steps. First is the claim that for a future event e to be known at some time t (say, “in the beginning”), e must be determined at or prior to t. Otherwise, there would be no truth about e to be known at t. The second claim is that if all future events are determined from the beginning of time, they must ultimately be so by God, since nothing else existed in the beginning to determine them. This is not to say that God’s knowledge is causal, in the sense that simply by knowing something, God is the cause of that thing. Rather, proponents of this line of reasoning contend that God cannot know a proposition unless it is true; and the proposition that some event will occur cannot be true at some time, unless that event is determined by that time; but then if God knows that some event will occur when nothing but God exists, it must be God Himself who ultimately determines the event’s occurrence.

Various responses to this sort of argument, for the incompatibility of divine foreknowledge and undetermined events, have been offered in the history of theology. One popular reply first made by Boethius is to deny that God knows anything at some time, since God exists outside of time altogether and knows all things from an eternal perspective. Another response, inspired by William of Ockham, is to grant the possibility of temporal divine knowledge but deny that what God foreknows must be determined by God. Alvin Plantinga (1986), for instance, has argued that creatures can have a sort of counterfactual power over God’s past knowledge, such that they make it the case that God knows what they themselves determine.

One final, more radical response to this argument is to deny that God has exhaustive foreknowledge. Defenders of open theism, who take this route, maintain that God leaves some future events undetermined, and so does not know exactly what the future holds. This is not to say that God is not omniscient. Rather, according to some open theists, propositions about undetermined events are simply not true (or false) before those events occur; or, according to others, there are true propositions about undetermined events, but they are in principle unknowable. Either way, open theists maintain that it is not a real limitation on God not to know what it is impossible to know, and so the denial of exhaustive foreknowledge is compatible with the affirmation that God is a supremely perfect being.

None of these responses to the argument for theological determinism just described are without their critics, however. In reply to the Boethian proposal, questions have been raised about the coherence of the claim that God—a personal being who acts—exists altogether outside of time. Furthermore, the appeal to divine eternality may not even solve the problem, since a parallel argument for theological determinism can be constructed on the assumption that God knows timelessly all that the future—considered from our perspective—holds. Likewise, in reply to the Ockhamist solution, some have questioned whether there is any real distinction between counterfactual power over God’s knowledge of the past and the power to bring about the past, the latter of which seems problematic if not impossible. Finally, many philosophers reject the open theist claim that there are propositions about the future that are neither true nor false, since such a claim requires the denial of the widely accepted principle of bivalence. And the alternative open theist view, that there are true propositions about the future that are unknowable by God, seems to call into question divine omniscience. Furthermore, many theists reject open theism as unorthodox and incompatible with divine sovereignty and providential care of creation—an issue to be discussed below.

b. Divine Providence

In addition to attributing to God exhaustive foreknowledge—or knowledge of all that will happen in the future—many theists are also committed to the claim (explicitly or implicitly, in virtue of other things they believe) that God has exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals, or facts about what would happen if circumstances were different than they in fact are. One famous biblical example of such knowledge is found in the Hebrew Bible, when David consults God about a rumor he has heard:

David said, “O Lord, the God of Israel, your servant has heard that Saul seeks to come to Keilah, to destroy the city on my account. And now, will Saul come down as your servant has heard?…” The Lord said, “He will come down.” Then David said, “Will the men of Keilah surrender me and my men into the hand of Saul?” The Lord said, “They will surrender you.” (1 Samuel 23: 10-12, N.R.S.V.)

Upon hearing this news, David and his men decide to leave Keilah, and thus Saul, learning that David has left, never ends up going there himself, and the men of Keilah never have the chance to surrender David to him. Thus the truths that the Lord revealed to David are of the counterfactual sort: if David had remained in Keilah, Saul would have sought him there; and if Saul had sought him there, the men of Keilah would have surrendered David to Saul.

Some philosophers have argued that exhaustive divine knowledge of such counterfactual conditionals is essential to God’s perfection—in particular, to God’s sovereignty and providential care for creation—and that such knowledge entails theological determinism. The argument has centered on what are called “counterfactuals of freedom,” or those counterfactual conditionals about what a possible created person (who may or may not ever exist) would freely do in a possible circumstance (which may or may not ever occur). The free actions in question are supposed to be libertarian, or those that are not determined, either by a prior state of the world or by God. Luis de Molina considered knowledge of such counterfactuals to be part of God’s scientia media, or middle knowledge, standing in between God’s “natural knowledge,” or knowledge of God’s own nature and the necessary truths that follow from it, and “free knowledge,” or knowledge of God’s will and the contingent truths that follow from it. Molina claimed that, like the propositions included in God’s natural knowledge, counterfactuals of freedom are pre-volitional, or (logically) prior to, and thus independent of, God’s will; though like the propositions included in God’s free knowledge, they are contingent truths.

One way to reconstruct the line of reasoning from divine knowledge of counterfactual conditionals to theological determinism is thus as follows:

  1. If there are any events in the history of the world that are not determined by God, then—contra Molina—God cannot have exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals.
  2. If God lacks exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals, then God take risks with creation.
  3. A God who takes risks with creation is not perfect.
  4. Therefore, since God is perfect, God must determine every event in the history of the world.

Robert Adams has argued in favor of the first premise, focusing in particular on the possibility of God’s knowledge of counterfactuals of freedom. Adams contends that for God to know a proposition, it must have a truth-value; but counterfactuals of freedom lack truth-values, since there is nothing that could ground their truth. While the consequent of a conditional may follow from the antecedent by logical or causal necessity, neither sort of necessity can ground the truth of a conditional about how a person would act if placed in a particular circumstance, if that action is undetermined. And features of a person that do not necessitate her action—such as her particular beliefs and desires—cannot ground the truth of counterfactual conditionals about her action, precisely because such features are non-necessitating. Adams suggests that divine foreknowledge may not face the same grounding problem as middle knowledge, since categorical predictions about undetermined events “can be true by corresponding to the actual occurrence of the event that they predict” (1987, p. 80). But in the case of counterfactual conditionals, there may never be actual events to which the propositions correspond.

Supposing Adams is right that middle knowledge is impossible, what would divine providence look like without it, on the assumption that God does not determine some events in the world? One might think that all God really needs to providentially govern the world is foreknowledge. Yet William Hasker has argued “foreknowledge without middle knowledge—simple foreknowledge—does not offer the benefits for the doctrine of providence that its adherents have sought to derive from it” (1989, p. 19). His reasoning, in brief, is that foreknowledge is about what will actually happen in the world God has created, and so will be useless to God in deciding what to create to begin with or how to arrange events throughout history for the benefit of creatures. Consider, for example, the biblical case discussed above, in which David consults God to determine the best strategy for avoiding capture by Saul. If God had only simple foreknowledge and not middle knowledge, then God could only tell David what he would in fact do, and what Saul’s response would in fact be, and not what better or worse outcomes might result from alternative courses of action. Likewise—and perhaps more worrisome—before creating the world, God could not know without middle knowledge whether, if He gave creatures the libertarian freedom to decide whether to enter a loving relationship with Him and their fellow creatures, any of them would indeed choose to do so. Thus, creating a world with such indeterministic events is risky business for God. In contrast, the view in which God determines all events of the world can be considered a risk-free view of providence.

While Hasker goes on to defend the risky view of providence, others have criticized it as inconsistent with divine perfection. Edwin Curley (2003) has argued that it involves a kind of recklessness inconsistent with the providential wisdom and concern for creatures that is supposed to be characteristic of a perfect Creator. Focusing in particular on indeterminism at the level of human action, Curley points out that a God who gave creatures libertarian freedom without knowing how they would use it would run the risk of their destroying themselves and thwarting God’s purposes for creation. Thomas Flint similarly argues for the superiority of the risk-free view of providence by means of a parental analogy. Imagine, he says, that a parent has two options for her child: under Option One, the child may struggle and seem to be in danger, but the parent will “know with certainty that she will freely develop into a good and happy human being who leads a full and satisfying life”; under Option Two, in contrast, the parent will have no idea how things will turn out for the child, and can only hope for the best. Flint says he would, without hesitation, choose Option One, and that the claim that Option Two is preferable is “just short of absurd” (1998, p. 106). Likewise, he suggests, the claim that a risk-taking God is superior to, or even on par with, a risk-avoiding one is incredible.

If the above line of reasoning is correct, then it follows that a supremely perfect God would not create a world in which events were left undetermined. However, the argument has been questioned on a number of points. With respect to Adams’ argument against the possibility of middle knowledge, at least two assumptions are open to doubt. First, it is unclear whether, for a proposition to have truth-value, there must be something that grounds its truth. Francisco Suárez, an early follower of Molina, seemed to question this claim. Richard Gaskin has as well, maintaining that there is nothing that grounds the truth of any proposition, and that to suppose otherwise “is to slide into a substantial and implausible correspondence theory of truth” (1993, pp. 424-425).

Others, granting that true propositions may need grounding, have proposed possible grounds for counterfactuals of freedom. Alvin Plantinga, for instance, has suggested a parallel between counterfactuals of freedom and propositions about past events. He writes: “Suppose… that yesterday I freely performed some action A. What was or is it that grounded or founded my doing so?… Perhaps you will say that what grounds [the truth of the proposition that I did A] is just that in fact I did A” (1985, p. 378). Plantinga responds that the same kind of answer is available in the case of counterfactuals of freedom; for what grounds such truths is the fact that certain people (actual or possible) are such that if they were put in certain circumstances, they would do certain things.

Other theists who accept that God lacks exhaustive knowledge of counterfactual conditionals question whether this entails that God lacks the sort of providential control over creation essential to His perfection. David Hunt has argued, contra Hasker, that simple foreknowledge can in fact give God a “providential advantage,” allowing Him to “secure results” that He would not be able to secure without such knowledge (2009). If with simple foreknowledge God can thus ensure His central purposes for creation, perhaps the charge that theological indeterminism entails risk-taking with respect to less significant outcomes will not have so much sting.

Alternatively, one may argue with open theists that the risky view of providence involves divine virtues such as experimentation, collaboration, responsiveness, and vulnerability, and that it is the only way to secure the great metaphysical and moral value of creatures with libertarian freedom. One way to put this latter point is in terms of Flint’s parental analogy. After noting that he would of course choose (risk-free) Option One if he could, Flint says, “the fact that we don’t have a choice here, that we as parents are stuck with [risky] Option Two, is one of the things that is especially frustrating (and even terrifying) about being a parent” (1998a, p. 106). An open theist convinced of the impossibility of middle knowledge might respond that this must similarly be what is especially frustrating (and even terrifying!) about being God—that Option One is not available, so that if God wants to create persons with libertarian freedom, He must opt for Option Two. But just as a parent still chooses to give birth to a child, so God still chooses to bring into being such creatures, because of their great value.

c. Divine Aseity

A third argument for theological determinism focuses on the divine attribute of aseity. The word aseity which comes from the Latin phrase a se—“from itself”—refers to God’s absolute independence from anything distinct from Himself. While some have taken divine aseity to be the most fundamental feature of our conception of God, others have suggested that it follows from God’s perfection, since to be dependent on another would seem to be an imperfection (Brower 2011). Closely related to the concept of divine aseity is the medieval conception of God as pure act (actus purus). What medieval thinkers meant by saying that God is pure act is that He is always complete in Himself—always “all that He can be.” In contrast, in created beings there is potentiality and passivity, meaning that they are not all that they can be, but can be changed and acted on by others.

On the basis of considerations of God’s aseity and pure actuality, Reginald Garrigou-Lagrange has offered an argument for theological determinism. For, he says, those who maintain that there are some events that God does not determine—for instance, human choices—must posit “a passivity in the pure Act. If the divine causality is not predetermining with regard to our choice… the divine knowledge is fatally determined by it. To wish to limit the universal causality and absolute independence of God, necessarily brings one to place a passivity in Him” (1936, p. 538). To illustrate his point, Garrigou-Lagrange asks us to imagine that when God gives two men grace to fight temptation, one cooperates with this grace while the other does not, but that the difference between their responses is not determined by God. Supposing that God can foreknow the two men’s responses to His grace, theological indeterminists must admit that “the foreknowledge is passive,” just as a person’s knowledge is passive when she is a mere spectator to some event (1936, pp. 538-539). What Garrigou-Lagrange seems to mean by this suggestive phrasing is that God’s intellect would be passive, in the sense that in coming to know what the two men will do, God’s intellect would be acted upon by something outside of it. Garrigou-Lagrange concludes:

God is either determining or determined, there is no other alternative. His knowledge of free conditional futures is measured by things, or else it measures them by reason of the accompanying decree of the divine will. Our salutary choices, as such, in the intimacy of their free determination, depend upon God, or it is He, the sovereignly independent pure Act, who depends upon us. (1936, p. 546)

In response to this argument for theological determinism, Eleonore Stump contends that the dilemma presented by Garrigou-Lagrange—that God either determines or is determined—is a false one, if determination is taken to be equivalent to causation. She offers examples of both divine and human knowledge in which the knower neither determines what she knows, nor is determined by it. On the human side, a person might know that an animal is a substance, but the human obviously does not determine this truth. And (on Thomas Aquinas’ view of human cognition—which Garrigou-Lagrange would presumably accept) neither is the human rendered passive, or determined in her knowledge of this truth, since the human intellect’s operations are active in the process of deriving it, and nothing acts on the intellect “with causal efficacy” in this process. Likewise, on the divine side, God presumably knows of His own existence without determining that He exists; but neither, presumably, is God determined in His knowledge of this truth (2003, pp. 120-121).

One thing to note about the examples offered by Stump—of a human knowing that an animal is a substance, or of God knowing that He exists—is that the truths known are in both cases necessary. One question that a theological determinist might raise is whether, when it comes to knowledge of contingent events, the indeterminist can likewise maintain that the knower neither determines nor is determined by what she knows. While our coming to know necessary truths on the basis of, say, complex mathematical reasoning would seem to be quite an active process, our coming to know contingent truths on the basis of some very clear and distinct perception—say, that we have hands—would seem to be more passive. If this is right, then the theological determinist might maintain that if God’s knowledge of undetermined future events is quasi-perceptual, then God might indeed be rendered passive by such knowledge. Furthermore, even if the theological indeterminist can defend a conception of divine foreknowledge on which God is not determined by some of what He knows, in the sense that He is not caused to know some truths, it is very hard to see how He would not in some sense be dependent on something outside of Himself for that knowledge. The question for theological indeterminists is whether this sense of dependency is compatible with a conception of God as supremely perfect.

3. Theological Determinism and Human Freedom

So far we have considered arguments that theological determinists have put forward in support of their view of divine providence, as well as some objections raised to these arguments. Critics of theological determinism not only object to the positive reasons offered in favor of the view, but also to certain negative implications. One major issue theological determinists must grapple with is how there can be any creaturely freedom in a world in which all events are determined by God. The claim that at least some creatures are both free and responsible for their actions is a central part of traditional Western theisms—Judaism, Christianity, and Islam—and most contemporary theological determinists affirm this claim, though as we will see, some within these traditions dissent from it. Below, several theological deterministic conceptions of human freedom are discussed.

a. Standard Compatibilism

Perhaps the most common conception of free will espoused by theological determinists is the standard compatibilist one: that determinism of any sort—whether theological (that is, determination by God) or natural (that is, determination by antecedent events in accordance with the laws of nature)–does not automatically rule out free will. Theological determinists espousing this view often appeal to secular theories of freedom and arguments for the compatibility of such freedom with natural determinism to support their claim that theological determinism is also compatible with free will. For instance, according to the classic compatibilist position defended by Thomas Hobbes, a person is free to the extent that she finds no impediment to doing what she wants or wills to do.

Contemporary compatibilists, recognizing the limitations of this position—for example that it allows for actions resulting from brainwashing to be free—have offered various refinements, such as that, in addition to being able to do what one wants or wills to do, one must act with sensitivity to certain rational considerations (the reasons-responsive view), or one must have the will one wants to have (the hierarchical model). One proponent of the latter view is Lynn Rudder Baker. According to Baker, “Person S has compatibilist free will for a choice or action if:

    1. S wills X,
    2. S wants to will X,
    3. S wills X because she wants to will X, and
    4. S would still have willed X even if she (herself) had known the provenance of her wanting to will X.” (2003, p. 467)

Baker notes that her account is compatibilist in the sense that “a person S’s having free will with respect to an action (or choice) A is compatible with A’s being caused ultimately by factors outside of S’s control.” She makes no distinction, with respect to the question of an agent’s freedom, whether the agent’s action is caused “by God or by natural events” (2003, pp. 460-461). More generally, theological determinists point out that on all such contemporary compatibilist accounts of free will, divine determination does not automatically rule out human freedom, since none of these accounts specifies what must be true of the first causes of human volition and action. This lack of specificity, however, is precisely the problem that incompatibilists—those who hold that determinism of any sort is incompatible with free will—find with the compatibilist position. They reason that if either God or events of the distant past are the ultimate causes of our actions, then our actions are not under our control. The debate between compatibilists and incompatibilists has a long history, and is ongoing. See “Free Will for a more in-depth summary.

b. Theological-but-not-Natural Compatibilism

While many theological determinists take the standard compatibilist line, some differentiate between natural and theological determinism, and maintain that only the latter is compatible with free will. Defenders of this position, who might be called “theological-but-not-natural-compatibilists,” appeal to a number of differences between theological and natural determinism to support their view. Hugh McCann, for instance, argues that in contrast to the way in which events that we bring about come to pass, “the manner in which our actions come to pass is not one in which God acts upon us or does anything to us” (2005, p. 145). McCann maintains that God’s causing our actions is like an author’s creating the characters of a novel. He writes: “The author of a novel never makes her creatures do something; she only makes them doing it. It is the same between us and God” (2005, p. 146).

McCann should not be interpreted as denying theological determinism here—that is, as saying that God does not determine what creatures do, but only what they are. Rather, he means that, unlike creatures who can only make other creatures do things, God has the unique ability to make creatures themselves; and rather than first bringing creatures into being, and then making them do certain things, God by one and the same act makes creatures doing the things they do. McCann contends that because of such differences between divine and creaturely causation, theological determinism “does not endanger our freedom” as natural determinism does (2005, p. 146).

However, theological compatibilism, like its natural counterpart, has been criticized by standard incompatibilists. One of the most influential arguments for the incompatibility of causal determinism and human freedom—the Consequence argument—relies on the premise that, in a deterministic world, the ultimate causes of our actions are events of the distant past. The reason why this is considered a problem, though, is simply that such causes lie outside of our control. So if the Consequence argument establishes the incompatibility of free will and natural determinism, a parallel argument appealing to the fact that God’s will, taken as a determining cause, likewise lies outside of our control should establish the incompatibility of free will and theological determinism. To put the point differently, it seems that those who hold that God’s determination of our actions is both causal, and compatible with human freedom, ought to be standard compatibilists about determinism and free will, rather than theological-but-not-natural compatibilists, since the differentiating features of natural determining causes pose no additional threat to free will, once one accepts that God’s determining causation is compatible with human freedom.

c. Libertarianism

While the theological determinists described above, who maintain that theological determinism is compatible with human freedom while natural determinism is not, suggest various differences between divine and natural determination, they still recognize God’s determination as a species of causation. As mentioned already, however, some who seem to espouse theological determinism deny that God should be considered a cause at all, at least in any univocal sense as creatures are. Writing in this tradition, Michael Hoonhout applauds Aquinas for intentionally discussing the doctrine of divine providence twice in his Summa Theologiae—first in the context of “the essence of God” and then in the context of “the nature of creation”—in recognition of “two radically different orders of intelligibility.” He maintains that “double affirmations which seemingly contradict each other are to be expected” if we respect the integrity of each order (2002, pp. 4-6).

The seemingly contradictory “double affirmations” to which Hoonhout refers are that God determines everything that occurs in the world, and that humans have a non-deterministic form of freedom. Thus one finds some theologians who seem clearly committed to theological determinism when considering the order of the Creator, speaking of the possibility of libertarian human freedom in the context of the order of creation. Kathyrn Tanner, for instance, maintains a view of divine causation as absolute in terms of both its range (“all inclusive or universally extensive”) and its efficacy (“cannot be hindered, diverted, or otherwise redirected by creatures”). Tanner claims that since “God does not bring about the human agent’s choice by intervening in the created order as some sort of supernatural cause,” one can “still affirm a very strong libertarian version of the human being’s freedom” (1994, pp. 113, 125, 126).

The trouble with such a view, however, is that it seems to face a dilemma. On the one hand, if the way in which God determines events in the world is really nothing like the way creaturely causes do, such that even fundamental concepts like conditional necessity do not apply to the relationship between God’s causal activity and its effects, then, as Thomas Tracy points out (1994), analogy collapses into equivocation, and we are left without any idea of what theological determinism is supposed to mean. On the other hand, if such fundamental concepts do apply to divine causation in something like the way they apply to creaturely causation, then arguments against the compatibility of theological determinism and human freedom must be considered and responded to, rather than simply dismissed as involving a confusion of categories.

d. Hard Determinism

One final position that theological determinists may adopt on the issue of human freedom is the standard incompatibilist one, admitting that determinism of any sort is incompatible with free will and thus that there can be no creaturely freedom. This view, called hard theological determinism, has historically won few adherents, in part because of the centrality of the belief in human freedom to so much civic and religious life. On the civic side, the assumption of free will has been thought to underwrite reactive attitudes such as resentment, indignation, gratitude, and love, and the moral and legal practices of praise and blame, reward and punishment. On the religious side, human freedom has seemed crucial to the logic of divine commandment and judgment, and to such reactive attitudes and practices as guilt, repentance, and forgiveness.

However, some hard theological determinists have challenged such assumptions about the centrality of free will. Derk Pereboom, for instance, has argued that, while theological determinism is not compatible with the basic sense of desert (that is, deserving praise or blame simply because of the moral status of what one has done) it is compatible with judgments of value (for example, that behavior is good or bad), as well as the reactive attitudes and practices which are most central to traditional theism, and which might seem to presuppose basic desert. For instance, a person without free will might still recognize that she has failed to act according to the principles she believes she should live by, and so experience guilt; or, she might resolve to no longer hold another’s past behavior as a reason to remain at odds with him, and so forgive. Pereboom suggests that God’s commanding and judging, rewarding and punishing may serve the moral formation of creatures even without free will, and so may be justified without it. However, some critics have questioned whether such religiously significant attitudes and practices as repentance and the resolution to amend one’s life can really be secured without a sense of either basic desert or the sort of agential control which hard theological determinists deny. Furthermore, even if hard theological determinism is compatible with such attitudes and practices central to theistic traditions, it is another question whether the denial of free will and moral responsibility in the basic-desert sense is itself compatible with the teachings of these religions. One question that remains for hard Christian determinists, for example, is how to make sense of the many New Testament passages that discuss the freedom found in Christ (cf. Galatians 5:1, 2 Corinthians 3:17).

4. Theological Determinism and Divine Responsibility for Evil

Besides explaining how, on their view, humans can be free and responsible for their own actions (or how the denial of human freedom is compatible with traditional theism), theological determinists must also face questions about God’s moral responsibility for the evil in the world that, on their view, He determines. As with the former issue, their responses to the latter are many and varied. Below a number of distinct responses are discussed.

a. Theodicies and Defenses

Some theists attempt to offer a theodicy, or plausible explanation of why God has created a world in which evil exists. Others, uncertain of what God’s actual reasons are, propose instead a defense, or possible explanation. One historic and popular explanation of why evil exists in a world created by God is the free will defense, first proposed by St. Augustine and developed by Alvin Plantinga (1974). According to this defense, the evil we witness in God’s creation is not in fact God’s doing at all, but the result of humans’ misuse of their own freedom: God created humans to live in harmony with Himself and each other, but they freely chose to rebel against God and to sin against one another. Some proponents of this defense extend it to explain natural as well as moral evil, suggesting that all suffering in the world is ultimately due to sinful choices of fallen creatures, some of which lie behind the destructive natural forces of the world. However, the free will defense seems to assume that it was impossible for God both to create free persons and to determine all of their actions, such that they never do evil. In other words, it seems to assume an indeterministic conception of human freedom incompatible with theological determinism. Thus, the traditional free will defense would not seem to be an option for theological determinists.

Some compatibilists have argued, however, that the free will defense need not presuppose an indeterministic conception of human freedom. Jason Turner, for instance, suggests that if “free actions can be determined but must not be dependent on another’s will”—a view he calls “independent compatibilism”—then the free will defense may still be open to theological determinists (2003, p. 131). On independent compatibilism, whether God could create a world with free persons who were determined in their actions and never committed moral evil depends on whether God would create such a world because the persons never committed evil, or for some other reason. Supposing that the reason God would create a world in which persons who were determined in their actions never committed moral evil was indeed because they never committed evil, their actions would be dependent on God’s will, and so would not be free.

While there thus may be some versions of the free will defense open to the theological determinist, such versions require metaphysical assumptions that may seem implausible—for instance, that events in the causal history of an agent’s action occurring before she was even born may determine whether her (determined) actions are free or not, and that whether an event depends on God’s will in a freedom-undermining way depends on what God’s reasons were for causing it. Still, theological determinists may argue that even the traditional indeterministic version of the free will defense is implausible, and that more plausible explanations of evil are available. John Hick, for instance, contends that, given a modern understanding of evolutionary theory, the claim that humans were created perfect and fell from grace is an incredible one. Inspired by the writings of St. Irenaeus, Hick proposes instead the soul-making theodicy, according to which God created imperfect creatures in a world in which they are prone to suffering and sin. He argues that it is not the freedom of creatures, per se, which is so valuable as to outweigh these evils, but rather their development, morally and spiritually, through struggle, suffering, trial and temptation, and the virtuous characters which result from “the investment of costly personal effort” (2010, p. 256). While Hick is himself committed to theological indeterminism, his basic theodicy is compatible with theological determinism as well.

Two other theodicies that theological determinists have adopted likewise focus on the value of development or process. Eleonore Stump has suggested that a world of sin and suffering is “most conducive” to bringing about both humans’ willingness to receive the gift of salvation from God and also their subsequent sanctification (1985, p. 409). While Stump holds that human freedom is incompatible with theological (and natural) determinism, and that receiving the gift of salvation and undergoing the process of sanctification both require free will, Derk Pereboom contends that “no feature of [her] account demands libertarian freedom, nor even a notion of free will of the sort required for moral responsibility… It is sufficient that this change [the turning to God on the occasion of suffering] is seriously valuable, and that it results in more intimate relationship with God” (2015). Marilyn McCord Adams, likewise, has proposed that participating in evil might facilitate creatures’ identification with Christ and union with God (1999). Such work on theodicy has drawn on specifically Christian conceptions of God and the human good, and advanced them in innovative ways. Yet, these proposals raise many questions about the value of processdeveloping moral character, becoming sanctified, or coming to identify with God—as well as the comparative value of such processes with the disvalue of the sin and suffering that make them possible.

b. Causing vs. Permitting Evil

Even supposing the disvalue of all sin and suffering in the world is outweighed by the value of the moral development of creatures, another concern critics have raised is whether it is morally permissible for God to cause humans to sin in order to realize some good. Peter Byrne, in response to Paul Helm’s deterministic theodicy, asks:

How does it square with the Pauline injunction that one should not do evil that good may come of it? The place of that injunction in traditional moral theology is to set limits to how far we can pursue good by way of doing evil as its precondition. There are some acts that are so heinous that one may not do them for the sake of the bringing about a greater good…. One may not murder that good may come of it. But Helm’s God has precisely planned, purposed, and necessitated acts of murder and instances of other kinds of horrendous wickedness so that good may come of them. (2008, p. 200)

In response, some theological determinists have argued that the difference between God’s causing humans to commit sin for the purpose of realizing some good (the theological determinist’s view), and knowing that humans would sin if they were created in particular circumstances and choosing to create them in those circumstances anyway, for the purpose of realizing some good (the Molinist view), is morally insignificant. Indeed, theological determinists contend, even the open theist’s view, according to which God allows horrendous evil that He could prevent—presumably for the purpose of realizing some good—raises similar questions about God’s moral responsibility for evil. So, they maintain, this concern about divine responsibility should not be a reason to reject theological determinism in favor of such competing views of divine providence.

c. God not a Moral Agent

While some theological determinists offer theodicies or defenses in attempt to demonstrate that there is some actual or possible reason for evil which morally justifies God in creating it, others eschew such explanations altogether. Some argue that they are unnecessary, on the grounds God cannot, in principle, be morally responsible for anything, since He is above or beyond morality altogether. One line of argument for this conclusion is based on the idea that morality depends on God’s will and command, and that God is not Himself subject to the commandments that He establishes. Morality, on this view, only applies to creatures, over which God has ultimate moral authority. One problem facing such a divine command theory of morality is the familiar Euthyphro problem—that if God’s commandments determine the content of morality, then morality is arbitrary, such that what is right might have been wrong and vice versa if God had willed that it be so. Another implication of this argument that many theists find difficult to accept is that, if God cannot in principle be morally blameworthy since He is above morality, then He cannot be morally praiseworthy either.

d. Sin not Blameworthy

An alternative response to the question of how God could not be blameworthy for causing humans to sin is the hard theological determinist one. As discussed above, hard theological determinists maintain that, since God causes all events in creation, humans are not free or morally responsible in the basic desert sense. As Derk Pereboom notes, it follows on this view that since humans are not blameworthy for their actions, God is not the cause of blameworthy actions. Thus, God’s causing human sin is more similar to His causing natural evils, such as animal predation and its associated sufferings, than it is to His causing moral evils, traditionally understood. Since most theists agree that God has control over all such natural forces, the problem of natural evil poses no more difficulty for the theological determinist than for the theological indeterminist. However, this hard deterministic response to the problem of moral evil is compatible with the offering of a theodicy or defense particular to human sin, as well as with the appeal to skeptical theism discussed below.

e. Skeptical Theism

One final response to the problem of evil that theological determinists make is to admit that they are unable to think of reasons that would justify God in creating a world with the sort and extent of evil that we see, but nevertheless to maintain that such an inability should not be taken as good evidence that there is no divine justification for evil. This is the response offered by skeptical theists, so named because of their skepticism about their own ability to discern God’s reasons for creating and governing the world as He does. Several lines of reasoning have been offered for this position, ranging from arguments from analogy, likening the cognitive distance between us and God to that between a very young child and her parents, to arguments focusing on the massive complexity of the causal networks in the world, and our inability to comprehend how actual and possible goods and evils are connected. The view has also been subject to various objections, regarding purported negative implications of the view for theological knowledge and trust in God, and moral deliberation and action. The debate regarding these issues is ongoing, and the interested reader should see Skeptical Theism for more information.

While skeptical theism is a response to the problem of evil available to theological determinists and indeterminists alike, theological determinists who embrace the view must grapple with further issues. Like those offering a theodicy or defense, theological determinists who maintain their justified ignorance of God’s reasons must still come to terms with the fact that, on their view, evil is not merely permitted but determined by God. This would seem to lead to a sort of double-mindedness specifically about the value of moral evil in the world. It is, after all, central to religious practice to strive to see the events in one’s life from God’s perspective, and to value them as God would, in His wisdom and benevolence. Thus, if some horrendous evil—say, severe child abuse—is divinely determined, then one ought to strive to accept, and even embrace it as instrumental to God’s purposes and so for the greater good. Such an attempt, however, would seem to be in serious tension with a teaching central to the traditional theism, that moral evil is opposed by God, and should be opposed by humans as well.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord (1999). Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Contains proposal that experience of evil might facilitate humans’ identification with Christ and union with God.
  • Adams, Robert (1987). “Middle Knowledge and the Problem of Evil.” The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays in Philosophical Theology. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Raises grounding objection against the possibility of middle knowledge.
  • Baker, Lynn Rudder (2003). “Why Christians Should Not Be Libertarians: An Augustinian Challenge.” Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 20 No. 4, pp. 460-478.
    • Argues for compatibilism on the basis of tradition, and offers standard compatibilist account of free will.
  • Basinger, David and Randall Basinger (1986). Predestination and Free Will: Four Views of Divine Sovereignty and Human Freedom. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
    • Contains discussion of how embracing theological determinism might shape one’s personal deliberations and decision-making.
  • Boethius (1969). The Consolation of Philosophy. Trans. V. E. Watts. New York: Penguin Books.
    • Contains proposal of divine timelessness as resolution to the problem of divine foreknowledge and human freedom.
  • Brower, Jeffrey (2011). “Simplicity and Aseity.” The Oxford Handbook of Philosophical Theology. Ed. Flint, Thomas and Michael Rea. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Defines aseity and summarizes argument for theological determinism on the basis of aseity.
  • Byrne, Peter (2008). “Helm’s God and the Authorship of Sin.” Reason, Faith and History: Philosophical Essays for Paul Helm. Ed. M. W. F. Stone. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
    • Raises concern that Helm’s theological determinism commits him to the claim that God “plans, purposes, and values moral evil.”
  • Curley, Edwin (2003). “The Incoherence of Christian Theism.” The Harvard Review of Philosophy, Vol. 11, pp. 74-100.
    • Contains argument that the risky view of providence is incompatible with divine wisdom and care for creation.
  • Farrer, Austin (1967). Faith and Speculation. London: A. and C. Black.
    • Explicates the doctrine of analogy and its implications for the “paradox” of divine agency and human freedom.
  • Feinberg, John S. (2001). No One Like Him. Wheaton, IL: Crossway Books.
    • Defends theological determinism on biblical, theological, and philosophical grounds, and responds to a number of objections to the view.
  • Flint, Thomas (1998). Divine Providence: The Molinist Account. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Contains argument for superiority of the risk-free over the risky view of providence.
  • Gaskin, Richard (1993). “Conditionals of Freedom and Middle Knowledge.” The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 43, No. 173, pp. 412-430.
    • Argues against claim that counterfactuals of freedom need grounds.
  • Garrigou-Lagrange, R. (1936). God, His Existence and His Nature: A Thomistic Solution of Certain Agnostic Antinomies, Vol. 2. Trans. Rose, Dom Bebe. London: B. Herder Book Co.
    • Contains argument for theological determinism on the basis of God’s aseity.
  • Hasker, William (1985). “Foreknowledge and Necessity,” Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 2 No. 2, pp. 121-156.
    • Criticizes Plantinga’s distinction between counterfactual power over the past and the power to bring about the past.
  • Hasker, William (1989). God, Time and Knowledge. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
    • Contains argument that simple foreknowledge is providentially useless to God.
  • Helm, Paul (1993). The Providence of God. Downers Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press.
    • Contains arguments for the “risk-free” view of providence on the basis of divine knowledge and goodness.
  • Hick, John (2010). Evil and the God of Love. New York: Harper and Row.
    • Contains explication and defense of the soul-making theodicy.
  • Hoonhout, Michael (2002). “Grounding Providence in the Theology of the Creator: The Exemplarity of Thomas Aquinas.” The Heythrop Journal, Vol. 43, No. 1, pp. 1-19.
    • Defends Aquinas’ seemingly contradictory “double affirmations” of divine causation and human freedom.
  • Hunt, David (2009). “The Providential Advantage of Divine Foreknowledge.” Arguing about Religion. Ed. Timpe, Kevin. New York: Routledge, pp. 374-385.
    • Argues that simple foreknowledge enables God to secure results that He would not be able to secure without it.
  • McCann, Hugh (2005). “The Author of Sin?” Faith and Philosophy Vol. 22. No. 2, pp. 144-159.
    • Argues that theological determinism does not endanger human freedom, as natural determinism does, and that God cannot do moral wrong, since morality is grounded in divine commands.
  • Pereboom, Derk (2011). “Theological Determinism and Divine Providence.” Molinism: The Contemporary Debate. Ed. Ken Perszyk. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 262-280.
    • Defends compatibility of hard theological determinism and traditional theism.
  • Pereboom, Derk (2015). “Libertarianism and Theological Determinism.” Free Will and Theism: Connections, Contingencies, and Concerns. Ed. Timpe, Kevin and Dan Speak. Under contract with Oxford University Press.
    • Offers response to the problem of evil compatible with hard theological determinism.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1974). God, Freedom, and Evil. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
    • Develops a free will defense.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1985). “Reply to Robert M. Adams.” Alvin Plantinga (Profiles. Vol. 5). Ed. Tomberlin, James and Peter van Inwagen. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 371-382.
    • Contains proposal of possible grounds for counterfactuals of freedom.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1986). “On Ockham’s Way Out.” Faith and Philosophy, Vol. 3 No. 3, pp. 235–269.
    • Defends claim that humans have counterfactual power over God’s past knowledge.
  • Rogers, Katherin (2000). Perfect Being Theology. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
    • Considers implications of the description of God as “that than which none greater can be conceived.”
  • Stump, Eleonore (1985). “The Problem of Evil.” Faith and Philosophy Vol. 2 No. 4, pp. 392-423.
    • Contains proposal that sin and suffering facilitate human acceptance of saving grace and process of sanctification.
  • Stump, Eleonore (2003). Aquinas. New York: Routledge.
    • Contains response to argument for theological determinism on the basis of divine aseity.
  • Tanner, Kathryn (1994). “Human Freedom, Human Sin, and God the Creator.” The God Who Acts: Philosophical and Theological Explorations. Ed. Thomas Tracy. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 111-135.
    • Argues for the compatibility of universal divine causation and libertarian human freedom.
  • Tracy, Thomas (1994). “Divine Action, Created Causes, and Human Freedom.” The God Who Acts: Philosophical and Theological Explorations. Ed. Thomas Tracy. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 77-102.
    • Contains critique of attempt to hold together theological determinism and libertarian human freedom.
  • Turner, Jason (2013). “Compatibilism and the Free Will Defense.” Faith and Philosophy. Vol. 30, No. 2, pp. 125-137.
    • Offers version of free will defense compatible with theological determinism.
  • Vicens, Leigh (2012). “Divine Determinism, Human Freedom, and the Consequence Argument.” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 71:2, pp. 145-155.
    • Argues that if natural determinism is incompatible with human freedom, so is theological determinism.
  • Zagzebski, Linda (2011). “Eternity and Fatalism.” God, Eternity, and Time. Ed. Christian Tapp. Aldershot: Ashgate Press.
    • Argues that appeals to divine timelessness do not solve the problem of how divine foreknowledge is compatible with our ability to do otherwise. A parallel point can be made about the problem of how divine foreknowledge is compatible with indeterminism.


Author Information

Leigh Vicens
Augustana College
U. S. A.