Help Sheet for Subject Area Editors

The primary tasks for IEP subject area editors are:

  1. maintaining a list of desired articles in their area,
  2. recruiting authors for articles,
  3. coordinating peer evaluation of articles submitted,
  4. keeping accurate records of which articles are in which phase of production, and
  5. assuring that final manuscripts comply with the author guidelines.

Although the General Editors regularly recruit new authors, subject area editors should recruit independently of these efforts. Area editors have the responsibility for evaluating submissions in their respective areas, regardless of who recruited the article, and accepting or rejecting the article. Area editors normally are not involved in copyediting, formatting and posting the finished articles, but they are welcome to learn how to do this if they wish. The appointment term of subject area editors is open-ended; however the general editors will make periodic reviews of both the effectiveness of the editors themselves and also the continued need for specific area editorships that have run their course. Subject area editors themselves may request removal from their assigned positions at any time.

The information below aims to provide more detailed guidance for area editors. Editors with limited computer experience should not feel required to engage in the more complex computer activities; the General Editors assume those responsibilities.

Table of Contents

  1. List of Most Needed Articles
  2. Recruiting Authors
  3. Updating the Reserved Article List
  4. Late Submissions
  5. Peer Review of Submissions
  6. Time Table for Peer Review Process
  7. Statement of Scholarly Standards
  8. Miscellaneous Information about the IEP
    1. Production: Copy Editing, Formatting, and Posting
    2. Indexing in WordPress
    3. Copyright Violations
    4. Broken Links and Search Engine
    5. ISSN Number
    6. Responsibilities of the General Editors

1. List of Most Needed Articles

Each subject area editor should compile a list of currently needed articles in his/her area. Area editors should post their list on their own university’s web server, which will enable convenient updating. The area lists will require updating and expanding as authors are successfully recruited. The General Editors maintain a list of 100 Most Desired Articles which is derived in part from the area editors’ lists. Subject area editors are encouraged to make suggestions about revising this list.

2. Recruiting Authors

Recruiting authors for articles is an ongoing task for subject area editors. While the General Editors will engage in some recruiting efforts, area editors will still need to act on their own. It is noteworthy that younger scholars are typically more receptive than older ones to requests to create an article. There are a few recruiting methods that have proven successful. (1) Send advertisements to specialized organizations, newsletters, mailing lists or discussion groups. The website lists some of these organizations by topic. Here is an example of a recruiting advertisement that editors may use. (2) Make contact with colleagues at conferences. (3) Actively seek out specialists through the “Dissertation Abstracts” database (available online through most university libraries within the “First Search” electronic database). This is the most effective way of locating a specialist for a specific topic, and thus filling important gaps. If you use “Dissertation Abstracts” to search for specialist on Descartes, for example, it may help to restrict your search to dissertations on Descartes within the past five years. Once you have selected an author, you will need to find his/her email address. First, try searching the “look up a member” feature on APA website (, in the “APA Member Services” section. Second, try a general web search (typing in the author’s name plus the word “philosophy” often helps). Third, try contacting the author’s Ph.D. institution and request a recent e-mail address. When contacting authors directly, editors may use this letter of request for an article. When an author agrees to write an article, our list of “reserved articles” needs to be updated (see below) and so does the list of desired articles if the article is on that list.

3. Updating the Reserved Article List

The IEP has an online spreadsheet by which we reserve articles for authors. Before reserving a new article and sending the relevant information to a general editor, make sure that we do not already have an article on that topic currently posted in the IEP. The General Editor making the reservation in our database of reserved articles will double check that the title is not already reserved for another author. Subject area editors who would also like to perform the tasks of adding to and removing articles from the database of reserved articles can contact the General Editors for access information and training.

Within that database, there are three areas: (1) Adding new articles: When adding a new article to the reserved list, just fill in the appropriate fields as indicated. (2) Selecting articles to edit: From time to time you’ll need to modify the information regarding an article that you oversee, such as changing the due date, or inserting a newer email address, or deleting the article because it has been posted or has been rejected. The second area of the page enables you to do that. (3) Viewing the reserved list: The third area of the page is the complete list of reserved articles, with all the information on the author. You can display the contents based on (a) the article title (the default display), (b) the due date, or (c) the area editor. Just click at the top of the column. The last of these is particularly helpful since it will cluster together all of the articles under your specific jurisdiction. Note also that all overdue articles have a yellow tint to them.

4. Late Submissions

Many authors will not meet their initial deadlines, and their item could languish on the reserved list for years. It is thus vital that subject area editors keep track of the due dates of expected submissions. Contact authors who are overdue, and assign a new due date in the reserved list. When writing authors, it is more time efficient for you to simply propose a new due date of six months, rather than asking the author to suggest one. In many cases the author will not have begun writing the article. A simple note like this is sufficient:

According to our records, your article submission on “The Virtue of Punctuality” for the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy is overdue. Are you still interested in authoring the article for us? If so, let me know, and I’ll put you down for a new due date of six months from now, which is our usual submission time frame. If you have not done so yet, please look over our author guidelines ( If you no longer plan to write the article, please let me know so that we can free up the topic for someone else.

When updating the due date on the reserved list, please replace the old due date with the new one so that the entry will no longer have the “overdue” yellow tint, which will make it easier to quickly spot items that are truly overdue. Also, in the “notes” section of the entry, write the word “extended” if the author needs more time. If the author requires yet another extension some time later, place a “(2)” after the world “extended” so we know it is the second extension. When articles are finally submitted to the IEP, do two things. First, in the “notes” section of the entry on the reserved list write “submitted”. Second, change the due date to six months in the future from when you received it. This keeps it from having the “overdue” yellow tint for a reasonable amount of time while the article is reviewed, revised, copy edited, and posted.

5. Peer Review of Submissions

All articles submitted to the IEP should be peer reviewed by one or two specialists on the article’s topic. Reviewed articles are subject to one of four decisions:

  1. acceptance in its current form with no revisions;
  2. acceptance contingent on some revisions;
  3. rejection with an invitation to revise and resubmit;
  4. rejection with no invitation to resubmit.

If an article receives a somewhat negative review that is not bad enough to warrant outright rejection, then it would be best to help the author map out a reasonable plan for revision. With journals, authors have the option of resubmitting rejected articles to countless other places. Not so with encyclopedia articles, and we need to be respectful of that. However, merely by agreeing to make the required revisions and then turning in a new draft is not sufficient to guarantee publication. The new version must still pass the referee process.

It is up to the subject area editor to decide how much of the referee comments are made available to the author.  We recommend two referees for an article, but area editors themselves may review articles within his/her area of expertise, and then decide how many additional referees, if any, are needed. Area editors may use this sample letter recruiting a referee.

Referees are not told the name of the author, nor vice versa.  Virtually all manuscript submissions and referee reports are in MS Word. As it turns out, MS Word documents usually have hidden author-identification. For the sake of keeping our review process private or double-blind, make sure to remove these identifications. Depending on the version of Word, inspect the document for identifying information at File | Check for Issues | Inspect Document. You have the option of removing identifying information. It is best to do a re-inspection after you make changes. To change the default identifying information for all articles created by your version of Word, go to FILE | OPTIONS | GENERAL.

While your authors are writing their articles, mention to them our guidelines for authors so that the article you receive follows the IEP house style and format. The most commonly overlooked items involve manuscript missing an opening summary or the summary being too short (it should be 200-500 words), a mismatch between headings in the table of contents and headings in the body of the article, and use of footnotes or endnotes, which are not permitted. When authors do not follow these guidelines, copy editors and formatters must either fix these problems themselves or send the article back to the area editor or author to fix the problems, which creates extra work and delays.

6. Time Table for Peer Review Process

Subject area editors should coordinate the peer review process of article submissions in a timely fashion, which, under normal circumstances will include the following timetables:

  • Area editors should contact an initial reviewer (or reviewers) within two weeks of submission, and allow that reviewer one week to respond before the area editor sends a follow up request. If the reviewer declines the request, the area editor should contact another possible reviewer within one week.
  • Reviewers should complete their tasks within six weeks; area editors should include the following statement in their email request to the reviewer: “The review itself is due in six weeks, which is the standard IEP time frame. If you can’t review by then, but could with additional time, please suggest an alternate deadline, and we’ll go from there.”
  • When each of the reviews is received, the area editor should make an acceptance decision within one week and contact the author accordingly. If revisions are required, then the author should be asked to complete the changes and resubmit within two months.
  • When the revised article is received, the area editor should make an acceptance decision within one week. If the area editor seeks further input from the reviewer, the area editor should request that reviewer provide input within two weeks.

7. Statement of Scholarly Standards

IEP authors are occasionally asked by their university administrators to clarify the scholarly nature of the IEP; to that end, we have devised a statement of IEP Scholarly Standards.

8. Miscellaneous Information about the IEP

The information in the remaining portion of this help sheet is optional for area editors since these functions are currently assumed by the General Editors and volunteer staff. Area editors, though, may wish to read through this information as a means of satisfying their curiosity, or for better informing their authors of our production process.

a. Production: Copy Editing, Formatting, and Posting

Once area editors have approved the article for publication, the next step is to send it to a general editor to have it copy edited (which is primarily for proofreading), as described in the Copy Editing Help Sheet. When that phase is completed, the next step is the html formatting of the copy edited article, which involves copying over the MS Word document into our WordPress interface, then tweaking the html code in various ways. Currently, only the General Editors have access to the WordPress interface for posting or revising articles, images, and pages. Area editors who also would like direct access to assist in this process should contact the general editors for login information and training. When the article is posted, this is a provisional process of about ten days, giving the author time to request changes in their article before the Google web crawler detects a change in the IEP and updates its search engine with information about the author’s new article.

b. Indexing in WordPress

The IEP’s index pages (the pages listing articles that begin with the letter “A” and with the letter “B,” and so forth) are edited as “pages” in WordPress (as opposed to “posts”). If you do have access to our WordPress site, then to add an article to an index page, log into the WordPress interface, open the index page (under “Pages” on the left), and follow the format already used in the page. Make sure that dates do not appear in the index. That is, it is OK for an article’s title to be “al-Shahrastani (450-39 BCE)” on the article’s own web page, but make sure that in the A index all one sees is “al-Shahrastani.” Here is how to cross index an article in Word Press, that is, to have one article appear in two places in the IEP index. Follow the previous procedure, but open the index page for the letter you want to use for cross-indexing and then add the information there as well, except remember to change the title so that it begins with the proper letter of the alphabet. Note: It is IEP policy to have an article usually not be cross-indexed, but if it is cross-indexed, this should occur only once. Do not allow an article to appear three places within the index.

c. Copyright Violations

If you become aware of other web sites that are violating our copyright by posting more than five percent of one of our articles, feel free to contact that site and ask that our material be removed. Or have the IEP author contact the site. Or the general editors will be happy to do this, too. Please cc one of the general editors if you do make such a request. Here is a draft of a letter you might consider using for that purpose. We suggest that you do not demand an apology from the administrator; the offending post may have been placed there in good faith that it was copyright-free material. If the offending site does not solve the problem, contact the general editors, who will take stronger action.

Dear administrator of the site _________________:

It has come to our attention that your site contains copyrighted material from The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy at The material on your site is located at: _____________ and the copyright material it is taken from is located at: _______________. We request that you remove your material and instead link to the corresponding material on our site. If you have further questions, please contact me or the general editors of the Encyclopedia:

James Fieser at or Bradley Dowden at

Sincerely yours,

Your name

Your position (for example, subject area editor for ______)

d. Broken Links and Search Engine

To check the entire Encyclopedia for the presence of any broken links, our URL can be submitted for testing to If some search using the IEP’s own search box is problematic, contact the general editors. There may be ways to improve the search.

e. ISSN Number

The IEP is registered as a serial publication with the Library of Congress and has accordingly been issued an ISSN number, as indicated in the following letter which specifies that number and how to display it:

This is your official notification that the following ISSN assignment(s) have been made under the auspices of the U.S. ISSN Center at the Library of Congress. Please print or save this notification for your records.

The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy ISSN 2161-0002

Please note that a separate ISSN is needed for each medium version (e.g., print, CD-ROM, online) you publish. For your convenience, we have reported the ISSN of all medium versions of this title we have in our database even if not all were assigned at this time.The preferred locations for displaying the ISSN on a printed serial are the upper right-hand corner of the cover, or the masthead, or another prominent place. The ISSN should always be printed with the letters ISSN preceding the number as we have listed it above. The preferred location for display of the ISSN on an online publication is the title screen or home page. If you publish a title in both print and online versions, please print both ISSN together on each version, filling in the blanks in the example below with the digits of your ISSN:

ISSN _ _ _ _- _ _ _ _ (print) ISSN _ _ _ _- _ _ _ _ (online)

An ISSN remains valid as long as the title remains unchanged. Please inform us in advance of any planned changes in your title so we can determine if a new ISSN is needed. Attached to the email version of this message are documents about uses and benefits of the ISSN, how to present and title your serial, and your Copyright obligations. Our web site at includes these documents as well as additional ISSN information and an ISSN application form that you can download for future ISSN requests. If you have any questions or if we may be of additional assistance, please feel free to contact us.

f. Responsibilities of the General Editors

The primary tasks for IEP general editors are:

1. Setting a unified vision for the IEP,
2. Preserving the IEP as a freely accessible and not-for-profit resource,
3. Maintaining the IEP website,
4. Selecting and Supervising the IEP subject area editors,
5. Making final decisions about the publication, revision or removal of all articles.

In the interest of setting a unified vision for the IEP and dealing with its operational challenges, the General Editors have ultimate authority to veto all decisions made by the editorial staff. This includes the power to remove articles that have already been published.  The General Editors have the right to create areas for editors and to appoint subject area editors, remove them, or assign an additional editor to an area. The General Editors have the right to contact any author or potential author for whatever reason, in a personal or mass email, without giving prior notice to the editorial staff.

9. Publicity materials:

Flyer, size 6 by 4 inches.
Back of the above flyer.
Poster, size 8.5 x 11 inches.
Poster, size A3, 11.7 x 16.5 inches.
Banner, size 6 by 2 feet.

An encyclopedia of philosophy articles written by professional philosophers.