Wang Bi (226—249 C.E.)

Wang Bi (Wang Pi), styled Fusi, is regarded as one of the most important interpreters of the classical Chinese texts known as the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching) and the Yijing (I Ching). He lived and worked during the period after the collapse of the Han dynasty in 220 C.E., an era in which elite interest began to shift away from Confucianism toward Daoism. As a self-identified Confucian, Wang Bi wanted to create an understanding of Daoism that was consistent with Confucianism but which did not fall into what he considered to be the errors of then-popular Daoist sectarian groups.  He understood his main task to be the restoration of order and a sense of direction to Chinese society after the turbulent final years of the Han, and offered the ideal of establishing the “true way” (zhendao) as the solution.  Although he died at the age of twenty-four, his interpretations of Daoism became influential for several reasons.  The edition of the Daodejing that he used in his commentary on that work has been the basis for almost every translation into a Western language for nearly two centuries.  Moreover, his interpretations of Daoist material did not undermine Confucianism, making them palatable to later Confucian thinkers.  Finally, Wang Bi’s work provided a way of talking about indigenous Chinese beliefs that made them seem compatible with the introduction of Indian Buddhist texts and ideas in the decades to follow.

Table of Contents

  1. The Context of Wang Bi’s Work
  2. Wang Bi’s Commentaries
    1. On the Analects
    2. On the Yijing
    3. On the Daodejing
  3. Central Ideas in Wang Bi’s Writings
    1. On Language
    2. On Non-Being
    3. On “The One”
    4. On Wuwei
    5. On Ziran
  4. Wang Bi’s Influence on Chinese Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Context of Wang Bi’s Work

Wang Bi lived and worked during the period after the collapse of the Han dynasty in 220 C.E., an era in which elite interest began to shift toward Daoism. A brief explanation of this transformation of intellectual interests in early medieval China is necessary in order to understand Wang Bi’s thought in its original context.

Beginning with the reign of Emperor Wu (c. 140-187 B.C.E.), the Han state embraced Confucianism as its official ideology. Training in the Confucian classics became mandatory for all officials, and there was an active program of suppression of alternative thought, including the persecution of Prince Liu An of Huainan, a prominent Daoist supporter. Nevertheless, Daoism did not disappear. By the first century C.E., Daoist texts began to reappear in political discussion, and during the following century, sectarian Daoist movements such as the tianshi (Celestial Masters) became active. Although Confucian scholars were still needed by the rulers of post-Han states such as the Wei because of their knowledge and experience in state rituals and administrative matters, by Wang Bi’s time Daoism was “in the air” and exercising a powerful influence on the thinking of commoner and aristocrat alike.

Accordingly, the interests of some members of the educated elite turned toward Daoism. They labored to create a renaissance in Daoist thought, but one that directly avoided following the religious beliefs and practices of the Celestial Masters and the various permutations of Daoism that had rapidly developed. These thinkers are generally gathered loosely under the title of xuanxue (Dark Learning, Mysterious Learning or Profound Learning), sometimes called Neo-Daoism. The term xuanxue was derived from a line in the first chapter of the Daodejing, according to which the dao (Way) is xuan zhi you xuan (darker than dark). Among the principal xuanxue figures were Zhong Hui (225-264 C.E.), Xiang Xiu (c. 223-300 C.E.), Guo Xiang (d. 312 C.E.), and Wang Bi.

A Confucian rather than a sectarian Daoist, Wang Bi wanted to create an understanding of Daoism that was consistent with Confucianism but which did not fall into what he considered to be the errors of the Celestial Masters and their popular religious practices. He understood his main task to be the restoration of order and a sense of direction to Chinese society after the turbulent final years of the Han. He offered the ideal of establishing the “true way” (zhendao) as the solution. Undoubtedly, his ultimate goal was to examine the mysterious knowledge of creation and translate it into a viable political and social program. Due to his untimely death, however, he had very little impact on the politics of his day. Nevertheless, through his commentarial work and the way in which his ideas were regarded as congenial to early Chinese Buddhism, his philosophical influence was profound.

2. Wang Bi’s Commentaries

Wang Bi’s best known commentaries are those on the Daodejing and Yijing. What is often overlooked is that he also wrote a commentary on the Confucian Analects (Lunyu Shiyi), some fragments of which still survive. His writings have been collected and annotated in two volumes entitled Wang Bi ji jiaoshi (Critical Edition of Wang Bi’s Collected Works). The bibliography below lists this work and other English translations of his major commentaries (see References and Further Reading).

a. On the Analects

What we know about the Analects commentary is that it was written as a criticism of the texts that Wang’s mentor He Yan (Ho Yen, d. 249 B.C.E.) considered to be most important. Wang’s approach, as far as we can tell from what remains of the commentary, was to focus on those passages that stress the limited capacity of language, especially with respect to the inability to define in language the nature of the sage. His selection of passages and remarks sets up a substantial rapprochement between Confucianism and his version of Daoism by basically providing him with a kind of hermeneutical license. His commentaries are in the zhangju (“chapter and verse”) format, in which a great deal of emphasis is placed on individual words and images in the “verses” and the meaning that lies behind them, carefully avoiding any sort of approach that regards philosophical concepts as referential.

b. On the Yijing

Wang’s commentary on the Yijing, a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, cross-annotates it with the Daodejing. In this way, he transforms the interpretive tradition concerned with the Yijing by setting aside what he regards as an over-reliance on mathematical and symbolic readings of the text (typical of Han scholars) and exposing what he takes to be its xuanxue.For example, while Han thinkers such as Ma Rong (79-106 C.E.) tried to make textual images referential, Wang avoided this consistently. Alan Chan specifically mentions Ma’s explanation of the Yi jing comment, “the number of the great expansion is fifty, but use is made only of forty-nine.” Ma claims that “fifty” refers to the polestar, the two forms of yin and yang, the sun and moon, the four seasons, the five elements (wuxing), the twelve months, and the twenty-four calendar periods. In Ma’s interpretation, because the polestar does not move, it is not used, and thus the number is forty-nine, not fifty. In contrast to this approach, Wang looks behind the language for underlying principles or xuanxue meanings.

Wang’s commentary on the hexagrams draws heavily from passages in the Daodejing and Zhuangzi . He uses major Daoist ideas to interpret the Yijing, culminating in his theory that change and dao are unified and his position that Laozi’s ideas are already contained in the Yijing. He appropriates the notions of being (you) and nothingness (wu) from the Daodejing and uses them in his interpretation of divination.

c. On the Daodejing

Many of Wang’s most basic ideas concerning the Daodejing are discussed below. But with respect to his commentary on this work, he is probably as well known for the text that was transmitted with the commentary as he is famed for the commentary itself. This text became the basis, first for Chinese scholarship on the Daodejing, and later for translations of the text into Western languages. In his A Chinese Reading of the Daodejing: Wang Bi’s Commentary on the Laozi with Critical Text and Translation, the best-known Western scholar of Wang Bi, Rudolf Wagner, provides a careful study of Wang’s work on the text.

The recent translation of the Daodejing by Roger Ames and David Hall is based on a conflation of the two Mawangdui (MWD) versions of the text, supplemented by that of Wang Bi. Mawangdui is the name of a site near Changsha in Hunan province in which some early Han tombs containing texts were discovered in 1972. These discoveries include two incomplete editions of the Daodejing on silk scrolls, now simply called “A”and “B.” Ames and Hall believe that Wang was actually working from a textual source that was closer to their own conflated version of the MWD materials than the received text that he had put in his own commentary (Ames and Hall, 76). In contrast, another recent translator of the Daodejing, P.J. Ivanhoe, believes that although the MWD versions offer help with how one might translate certain passages, there is nothing in them that fundamentally conflicts with or alters our understanding of the core philosophical notions of the Wang Bi text.

Wang’s version of the Daodejing contains eighty-one chapters that are divided into two books, but the actual division of the text into two books predates the Wang Bi edition. Later versions of the text built upon that of Wang and added book and chapter titles. In Wang’s edition, Book One consists of chapters 1 through 37, and later it came to be called the dao half of the text. Book Two consists of chapters 38 to 81 and is known as the de half. One of the principal differences between the MWD versions and that of Wang Bi is that the order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the MWD versions. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu: Te-tao Ching.

3. Central Ideas in Wang Bi’s Writings

a. On Language

A substantial part of Wang’s interpretive philosophy is rooted in his view of language. His view of language is consistent with that of the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. Both works teach that words are inadequate for the expression of truth. As Daodejing 1 says, “The way that can be spoken of is not the constant way. The name that can be named is not the true name.” For Wang, this means that the dao lies beyond language He goes further, however, holding that words must always be distinguished from their underlying meaning. Indeed, Wang claims that taking words referentially is an obstacle to xuanxue — that words must be forgotten in order to penetrate into the world of meaning. He finds support for this view in classical Daoist texts. Specifically, he makes use of the Zhuangzi’s teaching about “forgetfulness” (chs. 4, 12, 24). This view of language gives Wang the freedom to uncover what he believes to be the profound meaning that lies behind the words of the classical texts of Daoism, which in turn makes it easier for him to tie them to the Yijing and even to the Confucius of the Analects. It also allows him to offer a construction of Daoist ideas that can be distinguished sharply from that of the sectarian Daoism of his day.

b. On Non-Being

Wang’s commentary on the Daodejing centers around his interpretation of the concept of “nothing” (wu) or “non-being” as that out of which the ten thousand things (e.g., all phenomena) arise. He believes that “nothing” is pointed to in the text by means of its fundamental analogies: valley, canyon, bowl, door, window, pitcher, and hub of a wheel. There can be no doubt that Wang regards “nothing” as the dao. When he explains the first sentence of Daodejing 6 (“The spirit of the valley never dies; it is called the obscure female”), he says, “The spirit of the valley is the Non-Being found in the center of a valley. The Non-Being has neither form, nor shadow; it conforms completely to what surrounds it….Its form is invisible: it is the Supreme Being.”

c. On “The One”

In articulating his understanding of the dao, Wang appeals directly to the Daodejing’s comments on cosmogony, according to which the dao gives birth to One, One gives birth to two, two to three, and three to the ten thousand things. Yet Wang does not believe that the One is a being. On the contrary, it is the mysterious center of things, like the hub of a wheel. The dao is Non-Being. Dao is not an agent. It does not have a will. To say that it lies at the “beginning” is not to make a temporal statement, but a metaphysical one. On Daodejing 25, Wang writes, “It is spoken of as ‘Dao’ insofar as there is thus something [for things] to come from.” Interpreting the fifty-first chapter, he writes, “The Dao—this is where things come from.” Wang makes his views clearer when he offers a commentary on the word “One.” Han thinkers took the One referentially and identified it with the North Star. But Wang takes a radically different approach. For him, the One is not used referentially in terms of some external thing, nor is it a number. It is that on which numbers depend.

The idea that the One underlies and unites all phenomena is also vigorously stressed in Wang’s commentary on the Yijing. In this work, Wang makes it clear just how it is that dao as Non-Being is related to the world of Being. The Yijing consists of hexagrams made up of six broken lines (representing the yin cosmic force) and unbroken lines (representing the yang cosmic force). Since ancient times, the text has been used as a tool for divination. In Wang’s day, the typical interpretation of a hexagram associated it with a specific external event, but Wang uses his theory of language to put forward the view that the hexagram’s meaning lies in identifying the general principle (li) behind all particular objects. Wang thinks that the principle is discoverable in one of the six lines of a hexagram, so that the other five become secondary. These principles constitute the fiber of the One.

d. On Wuwei

Wang Bi’s views on the sage reveal his understanding of wuwei (effortless action). He believes that the sage rises above all distinctions and contradictions. According to Wang, although the sage remains in the midst of human affairs, he accomplishes things by taking no unnatural action. Thus, the sage’s conduct is an example of wuwei. Wang is clear that this does not mean that the sage “folds his arms and sits in silence in the midst of some mountain forest.” It means that the sage acts naturally. To such a sage, all life transformations are the same and one must not impose value judgments on them. In making decisions, the sage should have “no deliberate mind of his own” (wuxin) but instead should respond to life events spontaneously, without any discrimination. In short, this means that the sage puts aside desires because they are corrupting and destructive. Strictly speaking, the sage’s wuwei is not a strategy to diminish desire; it is evidence of the absence of desire — emptiness, or Non-Being. In Wang’s view, Confucius was such a sage because his life had broadened the dao. (Analects 15.29) Such interpretations created fertile ground in which Buddhism could take root, thereby entering the Chinese intellectual stream through Daoism.

e. On Ziran

The Daoist concept of ziran (usually translated as “spontaneity” or “naturalness”) is interpreted by Wang Bi to mean “the real.” Likewise, in his commentary on the Daodejing, de is not a reference to virtue (as it usually is understood), or even less to specific virtues, but to that which persons obtain from dao (see ch. 51). Yet, for Wang, the text teaches that dao moves spontaneously and accomplishes its tasks. Providing for all, “nothing is done, but no thing is left undone.” Thus, Wang thinks that humans have created disorder by their thought and action. If they return to dao in wuwei, then de will become available as ziran. De will not be the result of human action, politics, or contrivance. If the ruler becomes a sage and embraces wuwei, he will transform the people and broaden the dao, just as Confucius (not Laozi) did.

4. Wang Bi’s Influence on Chinese Philosophy

Wang Bi’s metaphysics has influenced the development of Chinese philosophy in at least two important respects.

First, after Wang Bi, some Chinese literati began to distinguish “philosophical” Daoism (daojia) from “religious” Daoism (daojiao), a distinction that was reinforced by the geographical relocation of the tianshi movement and elite attempts to devalue it as a legitimate extension of classical Daoist thought. This distinction has persisted throughout the history of Chinese thought, but it is an unfortunate one, and moreover one without any basis in the historical practice of Daoist communities (Kirkland, 2). In constructing his interpretive framework, Wang avoided sectarian Daoism and did not take seriously the philosophical roots of tianshi thought. He made no serious attempt to consider how Daoism was practiced before the Han. Thus, Wang’s typology of Daoism laid the groundwork for what is arguably not only the most influential, but also the most systematically misleading, way of thinking about the development of Chinese philosophy.

Second, Wang’s commentary on the Daodejing was crucial for the process by which the Mahayana Buddhist dharma (doctrine, teaching) began to gain a foothold in China. The most obvious example of Wang’s influence can be seen in the way the Mahayana notion of emptiness was assimilated into Chinese thought. According to Wang, the Daodejing (ch. 40) asserts that being comes from nonbeing, and that nonbeing is the ultimate substance of being. As we have seen, he exploited the Daodejing’s analogies for emptiness, reading their meaning in terms of xuanxue. As Buddhist texts such as the Prajnaparamita (Transcendental Wisdom) Sutra were translated, clear connections were made between its teaching that all forms are empty and Wang’s reading of the dao. So, it became widely believed, or at least widely proclaimed, by early Chinese Buddhists that Laozi and Buddha had both taught the need for a return to non-being. Wang’s commentarial work played a strategic role in making this interpretation more convincing.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger and David L. Hall, trans. Daodejing — Making This Life Significant: A Philosophical Translation. New York: Ballantine Books, 2003.
  • Chan, Alan. Two Visions of the Way: A Study of the Wang Pi and Ho-shang Kung Commentaries on the Lao-tzu. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Chang, Chung-yue. “Wang Pi on the Mind.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 9 (1982): 77-106.
  • Henricks, Robert, trans. Lao-Tzu: Te-Tao Ching. New York: Ballantine, 1989.
  • Ivanhoe, P.J., trans. The Daodejing of Laozi. New York: Seven Bridges, 2002.
  • Kirkland, Russell. “Understanding Taoism.” In Kirkland, Taoism: The Enduring Tradition (New York and London: Routledge, 2004), 1-19.
  • Kohn, Livia. Early Chinese Mysticism: Philosophy and Soteriology in the Taoist Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Lin, Paul, trans. A Translation of Lao-tzu’s Tao-te-ching and Wang Pi’s Commentary. Ann Arbor, MI: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan, 1977.
  • Lou, Yu lie. Wang Bi ji jiaoshi (Critical Edition of Wang Bi’s Collected Works). 2 vols. Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1980.
  • Lynn, Richard, trans. The Classic of Changes: A New Translation of the I Ching as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
  • Lynn, Richard, trans. The Classic of the Way and Virtue; A New Translation of the Tao-te Ching of Laozi as Interpreted by Wang Bi. New York: Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Rump, Arian and Wing-tsit Chan, trans. Commentary on the Lao-tzu by Wang Pi. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 1979. .
  • Wagner, Rudolf. The Craft of the Chinese Commentator: Wang Bi on the Laozi. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2000.
  • Wagner, Rudolf, trans. A Chinese Reading of the Daodejing: Wang Bi’s Commentary on the Laozi with Critical Text and Translation. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Wagner, Rudolf. Language, Ontology, and Political Philosophy in China: Wang Bi’s Scholarly Exploration of the Dark (Xuanxue). Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2003.

Author Information

Ronnie Littlejohn
Belmont University
U. S. A.