Act and Rule Utilitarianism

Utilitarianism is one of the best known and most influential moral theories. Like other forms of consequentialism, its core idea is that whether actions are morally right or wrong depends on their effects. More specifically, the only effects of actions that are relevant are the good and bad results that they produce. A key point in this article concerns the distinction between individual actions and types of actions. Act utilitarians focus on the effects of individual actions (such as John Wilkes Booth’s assassination of Abraham Lincoln) while rule utilitarians focus on the effects of types of actions (such as killing or stealing).

Utilitarians believe that the purpose of morality is to make life better by increasing the amount of good things (such as pleasure and happiness) in the world and decreasing the amount of bad things (such as pain and unhappiness). They reject moral codes or systems that consist of commands or taboos that are based on customs, traditions, or orders given by leaders or supernatural beings. Instead, utilitarians think that what makes a morality be true or justifiable is its positive contribution to human (and perhaps non-human) beings.

The most important classical utilitarians are Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832) and John Stuart Mill (1806-1873). Bentham and Mill were both important theorists and social reformers. Their theory has had a major impact both on philosophical work in moral theory and on approaches to economic, political, and social policy. Although utilitarianism has always had many critics,  there are many 21st century thinkers that support it.

The task of determining whether utilitarianism is the correct moral theory is complicated because there are different versions of the theory, and its supporters disagree about which version is correct. This article focuses on perhaps the most important dividing line among utilitarians, the clash between act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism. After a brief overall explanation of utilitarianism, the article explains both act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism, the main differences between them, and some of the key arguments for and against each view.

Table of Contents

  1. Utilitarianism: Overall View
    1. What is Good?
    2. Whose Well-being?
      1. Individual Self-interest
      2. Groups
      3. Everyone Affected
    3. Actual Consequences or Foreseeable Consequences?
  2. How Act Utilitarianism and Rule Utilitarianism Differ
  3. Act Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons
    1. Arguments for Act Utilitarianism
      1. Why Act utilitarianism Maximizes Utility
      2. Why Act Utilitarianism is Better than Traditional, Rule-based Moralities
      3. Why Act Utilitarianism Makes Moral Judgments Objectively True
    2. Arguments against Act Utilitarianism
      1. The “Wrong Answers” Objection
      2. The “Undermining Trust” Objection
      3. Partiality and the “Too Demanding” Objection
    3. Possible Responses to Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism
  4. Rule Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons
    1. Arguments for Rule Utilitarianism
      1. Why Rule Utilitarianism Maximizes Utility
      2. Rule Utilitarianism Avoids the Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism
        1. Judges, Doctors, and Promise-makers
        2. Maintaining vs. Undermining Trust
        3. Impartiality and the Problem of Over-Demandingness
    2. Arguments against Rule Utilitarianism
      1. The “Rule Worship” Objection
      2. The “Collapses into Act Utilitarianism” Objection
      3. Wrong Answers and Crude Concepts
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Classic Works
    2. More Recent Utilitarians
    3. Overviews
    4. J. S. Mill and Utilitarian Moral Theory
    5. Critics of Utilitarianism
    6. Collections of Essays

1. Utilitarianism: Overall View

Utilitarianism is a philosophical view or theory about how we should evaluate a wide range of things that involve choices that people face. Among the things that can be evaluated are actions, laws, policies, character traits, and moral codes. Utilitarianism is a form of consequentialism because it rests on the idea that it is the consequences or results of actions, laws, policies, etc. that determine whether they are good or bad, right or wrong. In general, whatever is being evaluated, we ought to choose the one that will produce the best overall results. In the language of utilitarians, we should choose the option that “maximizes utility,” i.e. that action or policy that produces the largest amount of good.

Utilitarianism appears to be a simple theory because it consists of only one evaluative principle: Do what produces the best consequences. In fact, however, the theory is complex because we cannot understand that single principle unless we know (at least) three things: a) what things are good and bad;  b) whose good (i.e. which individuals or groups) we should aim to maximize; and c) whether actions, policies, etc. are made right or wrong by their actual consequences (the results that our actions actually produce) or by their foreseeable consequences (the results that we predict will occur based on the evidence that we have).

a. What is Good?

Jeremy Bentham answered this question by adopting the view called hedonism. According to hedonism, the only thing that is good in itself is pleasure (or happiness). Hedonists do not deny that many different kinds of things can be good, including food, friends, freedom, and many other things, but hedonists see these as “instrumental” goods that are valuable only because they play a causal role in producing pleasure or happiness. Pleasure and happiness, however, are “intrinsic” goods, meaning that they are good in themselves and not because they produce some further valuable thing. Likewise, on the negative side, a lack of food, friends, or freedom is instrumentally bad because it produces pain, suffering, and unhappiness; but pain, suffering and unhappiness are intrinsically bad, i.e. bad in themselves and not because they produce some further bad thing.

Many thinkers have rejected hedonism because pleasure and pain are sensations that we feel, claiming that many important goods are not types of feelings. Being healthy or honest or having knowledge, for example, are thought by some people to be intrinsic goods that are not types of feelings. (People who think there are many such goods are called pluralists or“objective list” theorists.) Other thinkers see desires or preferences as the basis of value; whatever a person desires is valuable to that person. If desires conflict, then the things most strongly preferred are identified as good.

In this article, the term “well-being” will generally be used to identify what utilitarians see as good or valuable in itself. All utilitarians agree that things are valuable because they tend to produce well-being or diminish ill-being, but this idea is understood differently by hedonists, objective list theorists, and preference/desire theorists. This debate will not be further discussed in this article.

b. Whose Well-being?

Utilitarian reasoning can be used for many different purposes. It can be used both for moral reasoning and for any type of rational decision-making. In addition to applying in different contexts, it can also be used for deliberations about the interests of different persons and groups.

i. Individual Self-interest

(See egoism.) When individuals are deciding what to do for themselves alone, they consider only their own utility. For example, if you are choosing ice cream for yourself, the utilitarian view is that you should choose the flavor that will give you the most pleasure. If you enjoy chocolate but hate vanilla, you should choose chocolate for the pleasure it will bring and avoid vanilla because it will bring displeasure. In addition, if you enjoy both chocolate and strawberry, you should predict which flavor will bring you more pleasure and choose whichever one will do that.

In this case, because utilitarian reasoning is being applied to a decision about which action is best for an individual person, it focuses only on how the various possible choices will affect this single person’s interest and does not consider the interests of other people.

ii. Groups

People often need to judge what is best not only for themselves or other individuals but alsowhat is best for groups, such as friends, families, religious groups, one’s country, etc. Because Bentham and other utilitarians were interested in political groups and public policies, they often focused on discovering which actions and policies would maximize the well-being of the relevant group. Their method for determining the well-being of a group involved adding up the benefits and losses that members of the group would experience as a result of adopting one action or policy. The well-being of the group is simply the sum total of the interests of the all of its members.

To illustrate this method, suppose that you are buying ice cream for a party that ten people will attend. Your only flavor options are chocolate and vanilla, and some of the people attending like chocolate while others like vanilla. As a utilitarian, you should choose the flavor that will result in the most pleasure for the group as a whole. If seven like chocolate and three like vanilla and if all of them get the same amount of pleasure from the flavor they like, then you should choose chocolate. This will yield what Bentham, in a famous phrase, called “the greatest happiness for the greatest number.”

An important point in this case is that you should choose chocolate even if you are one of the three people who enjoy vanilla more than chocolate. The utilitarian method requires you to count everyone’s interests equally. You may not weigh some people’s interests—including your own—more heavily than others. Similarly, if a government is choosing a policy, it should give equal consideration to the well-being of all members of the society.

iii. Everyone Affected

While there are circumstances in which the utilitarian analysis focuses on the interests of specific individuals or groups, the utilitarian moral theory requires that moral judgments be based on what Peter Singer calls the “equal consideration of interests.” Utilitarianism moral theory then, includes the important idea that when we calculate the utility of actions, laws, or policies, we must do so from an impartial perspective and not from a “partialist” perspective that favors ourselves, our friends, or others we especially care about. Bentham is often cited as the source of a famous utilitarian axiom: “every man to count for one, nobody for more than one.”

If this impartial perspective is seen as necessary for a utilitarian morality, then both self-interest and partiality to specific groups will be rejected as deviations from utilitarian morality. For example, so-called “ethical egoism,” which says that morality requires people to promote their own interest, would be rejected either as a false morality or as not a morality at all. While a utilitarian method for determining what people’s interests are may show that it is rational for people to maximize their own well-being or the well-being of groups that they favor, utilitarian morality would reject this as a criterion for determining what is morally right or wrong.

c. Actual Consequences or Foreseeable Consequences?

Utilitarians disagree about whether judgments of right and wrong should be based on the actual consequences of actions or their foreseeable consequences. This issue arises when the actual effects of actions differ from what we expected. J. J. C. Smart (49) explains this difference by imagining the action of a person who, in 1938,saves someone from drowning. While we generally regard saving a drowning person as the right thing to do and praise people for such actions, in Smart’s imagined example, the person saved from drowning turns out to be Adolf Hitler. Had Hitler drowned, millions of other people might have been saved from suffering and death between 1938 and 1945. If utilitarianism evaluates the rescuer’s action based on its actual consequences, then the rescuer did the wrong thing. If, however, utilitarians judge the rescuer’s action by its foreseeable consequences (i.e. the ones the rescuer could reasonably predict), then the rescuer—who could not predict the negative effects of saving the person from drowning—did the right thing.

One reason for adopting foreseeable consequence utilitarianism is that it seems unfair to say that the rescuer acted wrongly because the rescuer could not foresee the future bad effects of saving the drowning person. In response, actual consequence utilitarians reply that there is a difference between evaluating an action and evaluating the person who did the action. In their view, while the rescuer’s action was wrong, it would be a mistake to blame or criticize the rescuer because the bad results of his act were unforeseeable. They stress the difference between evaluating actions and evaluating the people who perform them.

Foreseeable consequence utilitarians accept the distinction between evaluating actions and evaluating the people who carry them out, but they see no reason to make the moral rightness or wrongness of actions depend on facts that might be unknowable. For them, what is right or wrong for a person to do depends on what is knowable by a person at a time. For this reason, they claim that the person who rescued Hitler did the right thing, even though the actual consequences were unfortunate.

Another way to describe the actual vs. foreseeable consequence dispute is to contrast two thoughts. One (the actual consequence view) says that to act rightly is to do whatever produces the best consequences. The second view says that a person acts rightly by doing the action that has the highest level of “expected utility.” The expected utility is a combination of the good (or bad) effects that one predicts will result from an action and the probability of those effects occurring. In the case of the rescuer, the expected positive utility is high because the probability that saving a drowning person will lead to the deaths of millions of other people is extremely low, and thus can be ignored in deliberations about whether to save the drowning person.

What this shows is that actual consequence and foreseeable consequence utilitarians have different views about the nature of utilitarian theory. Foreseeable consequence utilitarians understand the theory as a decision-making procedure while actual consequence utilitarians understand it as a criterion of right and wrong. Foreseeable consequence utilitarians claim that the action with the highest expected utility is both the best thing to do based on current evidence and the right action. Actual consequence utilitarians might agree that the option with the highest expected utility is the best thing to do but they claim that it could still turn out to be the wrong action. This would occur if unforeseen bad consequences reveal that the option chosen did not have the best results and thus was the wrong thing to do.

2. How Act Utilitarianism and Rule Utilitarianism Differ

Both act utilitarians and rule utilitarians agree that our overall aim in evaluating actions should be to create the best results possible, but they differ about how to do that.

Act utilitarians believe that whenever we are deciding what to do, we should perform the action that will create the greatest net utility. In their view, the principle of utility—do whatever will produce the best overall results—should be applied on a case by case basis. The right action in any situation is the one that yields more utility (i.e. creates more well-being) than other available actions.

Rule utilitarians adopt a two part view that stresses the importance of moral rules. According to rule utilitarians, a) a specific action is morally justified if it conforms to a justified moral rule; and b) a moral rule is justified if its inclusion into our moral code would create more utility than other possible rules (or no rule at all). According to this perspective, we should judge the morality of individual actions by reference to general moral rules, and we should judge particular moral rules by seeing whether their acceptance into our moral code would produce more well-being than other possible rules.

The key difference between act and rule utilitarianism is that act utilitarians apply the utilitarian principle directly to the evaluation of individual actions while rule utilitarians apply the utilitarian principle directly to the evaluation of rules and then evaluate individual actions by seeing if they obey or disobey those rules whose acceptance will produce the most utility.

The contrast between act and rule utilitarianism, though previously noted by some philosophers, was not sharply drawn until the late 1950s when Richard Brandt introduced this terminology. (Other terms that have been used to make this contrast are “direct” and “extreme” for act utilitarianism, and “indirect” and “restricted” for rule utilitarianism.) Because the contrast had not been sharply drawn, earlier utilitarians like Bentham and Mill sometimes apply the principle of utility to actions and sometimes apply it to the choice of rules for evaluating actions. This has led to scholarly debates about whether the classical utilitarians supported act utilitarians or rule utilitarians or some combination of these views. One indication that Mill accepted rule utilitarianism is his claim that direct appeal to the principle of utility is made only when “secondary principles” (i.e. rules) conflict with one another. In such cases, the “maximize utility” principle is used to resolve the conflict and determine the right action to take. [Mill, Utilitarianism, Chapter 2]

3. Act Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons

Act utilitarianism is often seen as the most natural interpretation of the utilitarian ideal. If our aim is always to produce the best results, it seems plausible to think that in each case of deciding what is the right thing to do, we should consider the available options (i.e. what actions could be performed), predict their outcomes, and approve of the action that will produce the most good.

a. Arguments for Act Utilitarianism

i. Why Act utilitarianism Maximizes Utility

If every action that we carry out yields more utility than any other action available to us, then the total utility of all our actions will be the highest possible level of utility that we could bring about. In other words, we can maximize the overall utility that is within our power to bring about by maximizing the utility of each individual action that we perform. If we sometimes choose actions that produce less utility than is possible, the total utility of our actions will be less than the amount of goodness that we could have produced. For that reason, act utilitarians argue, we should apply the utilitarian principle to individual acts and not to classes of similar actions.

ii. Why Act Utilitarianism is Better than Traditional, Rule-based Moralities

Traditional moral codes often consist of sets of rules regarding types of actions. The Ten Commandments, for example, focus on types of actions, telling us not to kill, steal, bear false witness, commit adultery, or covet the things that belong to others. Although the Biblical sources permit exceptions to these rules (such as killing in self-defense and punishing people for their sins), the form of the commandments is absolute. They tell us “thou shalt not do x” rather than saying “thou shalt not do x except in circumstances a, b, or c.”

In fact, both customary and philosophical moral codes often seem to consist of absolute rules. The philosopher Immanuel Kant is famous for the view that lying is always wrong, even in cases where one might save a life by lying. According to Kant, if A is trying to murder B and A asks you where B is, it would be wrong for you to lie to A, even if lying would save B’s life (Kant).

Act utilitarians reject rigid rule-based moralities that identify whole classes of actions as right or wrong. They argue that it is a mistake to treat whole classes of actions as right or wrong because the effects of actions differ when they are done in different contexts and morality must focus on the likely effects of individual actions. It is these effects that determine whether they are right or wrong in specific cases. Act utilitarians acknowledge that it may be useful to have moral rules that are “rules of thumb”—i.e., rules that describe what is generally right or wrong, but they insist that whenever people can do more good by violating a rule rather than obeying it, they should violate the rule. They see no reason to obey a rule when more well-being can be achieved by violating it.

iii. Why Act Utilitarianism Makes Moral Judgments Objectively True

One advantage of act utilitarianism is that it shows how moral questions can have objectively true answers. Often, people believe that morality is subjective and depends only on people’s desires or sincere beliefs. Act utilitarianism, however, provides a method for showing which moral beliefs are true and which are false.

Once we embrace the act utilitarian perspective, then every decision about how we should act will depend on the actual or foreseeable consequences of the available options. If we can predict the amount of utility/good results that will be produced by various possible actions, then we can know which ones are right or wrong.

Although some people doubt that we can measure amounts of well-being, we in fact do this all the time. If two people are suffering and we have enough medication for only one, we can often tell that one person is experiencing mild discomfort while the other is in severe pain. Based on this judgment, we will be confident that we can do more good by giving the medication to the person suffering extreme pain. Although this case is very simple, it shows that we can have objectively true answers to questions about what actions are morally right or wrong.

Jeremy Bentham provided a model for this type of decision making in his description of a “hedonic calculus,” which was meant to show what factors should be used to determine amounts of pleasure and happiness, pain and suffering. Using this information, Bentham thought, would allow for making correct judgments both in individual cases and in choices about government actions and policies.

b. Arguments against Act Utilitarianism

i. The “Wrong Answers” Objection

The most common argument against act utilitarianism is that it gives the wrong answers to moral questions. Critics say that it permits various actions that everyone knows are morally wrong. The following cases are among the commonly cited examples:

  • If a judge can prevent riots that will cause many deaths only by convicting an innocent person of a crime and imposing a severe punishment on that person, act utilitarianism implies that the judge should convict and punish the innocent person. (See Rawls and also Punishment.)
  • If a doctor can save five people from death by killing one healthy person and using that person’s organs for life-saving transplants, then act utilitarianism implies that the doctor should kill the one person to save five.
  • If a person makes a promise but breaking the promise will allow that person to perform an action that creates just slightly more well-being than keeping the promise will, then act utilitarianism implies that the promise should be broken. (See Ross)

The general form of each of these arguments is the same. In each case, act utilitarianism implies that a certain act is morally permissible or required. Yet, each of the judgments that flow from act utilitarianism conflicts with widespread, deeply held moral beliefs. Because act utilitarianism approves of actions that most people see as obviously morally wrong, we can know that it is a false moral theory.

ii. The “Undermining Trust” Objection

Although act utilitarians criticize traditional moral rules for being too rigid, critics charge that utilitarians ignore the fact that this alleged rigidity is the basis for trust between people. If, in cases like the ones described above, judges, doctors, and promise-makers are committed to doing whatever maximizes well-being, then no one will be able to trust that judges will act according to the law, that doctors will not use the organs of one patient to benefit others, and that promise-makers will keep their promises. More generally, if everyone believed that morality permitted lying, promise-breaking, cheating, and violating the law whenever doing so led to good results, then no one could trust other people to obey these rules. As a result, in an act utilitarian society, we could not believe what others say, could not rely on them to keep promises, and in general could not count on people to act in accord with important moral rules. As a result, people’s behavior would lack the kind of predictability and consistency that are required to sustain trust and social stability.

iii. Partiality and the “Too Demanding” Objection

Critics also attack utilitarianism’s commitment to impartiality and the equal consideration of interests. An implication of this commitment is that whenever people want to buy something for themselves or for a friend or family member, they must first determine whether they could create more well-being by donating their money to help unknown strangers who are seriously ill or impoverished. If more good can be done by helping strangers than by purchasing things for oneself or people one personally cares about, then act utilitarianism requires us to use the money to help strangers in need. Why? Because act utilitarianism requires impartiality and the equal consideration of all people’s needs and interests.

Almost everyone, however, believes that we have special moral duties to people who are near and dear to us. As a result, most people would reject the notion that morality requires us to treat people we love and care about no differently from people who are perfect strangers as absurd.

This issue is not merely a hypothetical case. In a famous article, Peter Singer defends the view that people living in affluent countries should not purchase luxury items for themselves when the world is full of impoverished people. According to Singer, a person should keep donating money to people in dire need until the donor reaches the point where giving to others generates more harm to the donor than the good that is generated for the recipients.

Critics claim that the argument for using our money to help impoverished strangers rather than benefiting ourselves and people we care about only proves one thing—that act utilitarianism is false. There are two reasons that show why it is false. First, it fails to recognize the moral legitimacy of giving special preferences to ourselves and people that we know and care about. Second, since pretty much everyone is strongly motivated to act on behalf of themselves and people they care about, a morality that forbids this and requires equal consideration of strangers is much too demanding. It asks more than can reasonably be expected of people.

c. Possible Responses to Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism

There are two ways in which act utilitarians can defend their view against these criticisms. First, they can argue that critics misinterpret act utilitarianism and mistakenly claim that it is committed to supporting the wrong answer to various moral questions. This reply agrees that the “wrong answers” are genuinely wrong, but it denies that the “wrong answers” maximize utility. Because they do not maximize utility, these wrong answers would not be supported by act utilitarians and therefore, do nothing to weaken their theory.

Second, act utilitarians can take a different approach by agreeing with the critics that act utilitarianism supports the views that critics label “wrong answers.”  Act utilitarians may reply that all this shows is that the views supported by act utilitarianism conflict with common sense morality. Unless critics can prove that common sense moral beliefs are correct the criticisms have no force. Act utilitarians claim that their theory provides good reasons to reject many ordinary moral claims and to replace them with moral views that are based on the effects of actions.

People who are convinced by the criticisms of act utilitarianism may decide to reject utilitarianism entirely and adopt a different type of moral theory. This judgment, however, would be sound only if act utilitarianism were the only type of utilitarian theory. If there are other versions of utilitarianism that do not have act utilitarianism’s flaws, then one may accept the criticisms of act utilitarianism without forsaking utilitarianism entirely. This is what defenders of rule utilitarianism claim. They argue that rule utilitarianism retains the virtues of a utilitarian moral theory but without the flaws of the act utilitarian version.

4. Rule Utilitarianism: Pros and Cons

Unlike act utilitarians, who try to maximize overall utility by applying the utilitarian principle to individual acts, rule utilitarians believe that we can maximize utility only by setting up a moral code that contains rules. The correct moral rules are those whose inclusion in our moral code will produce better results (more well-being) than other possible rules. Once we determine what these rules are, we can then judge individual actions by seeing if they conform to these rules. The principle of utility, then, is used to evaluate rules and is not applied directly to individual actions. Once the rules are determined, compliance with these rules provides the standard for evaluating individual actions.

a. Arguments for Rule Utilitarianism

i. Why Rule Utilitarianism Maximizes Utility

Rule utilitarianism sounds paradoxical. It says that we can produce more beneficial results by following rules than by always performing individual actions whose results are as beneficial as possible. This suggests that we should not always perform individual actions that maximize utility. How could this be something that a utilitarian would support?

In spite of this paradox, rule utilitarianism possesses its own appeal, and its focus on moral rules can sound quite plausible. The rule utilitarian approach to morality can be illustrated by considering the rules of the road. If we are devising a code for drivers, we can adopt either open-ended rules like “drive safely” or specific rules like “stop at red lights,” “do not travel more than 30 miles per hour in residential areas,” “do not drive when drunk,” etc. The rule “drive safely”, like the act utilitarian principle, is a very general rule that leaves it up to individuals to determine what the best way to drive in each circumstance is.  More specific rules that require stopping at lights, forbid going faster than 30 miles per hour, or prohibit driving while drunk do not give drivers the discretion to judge what is best to do. They simply tell drivers what to do or not do while driving.

The reason why a more rigid rule-based system leads to greater overall utility is that people are notoriously bad at judging what is the best thing to do when they are driving a car. Having specific rules maximizes utility by limiting drivers’ discretionary judgments and thereby decreasing the ways in which drivers may endanger themselves and others.

A rule utilitarian can illustrate this by considering the difference between stop signs and yield signs. Stop signs forbid drivers to go through an intersection without stopping, even if the driver sees that there are no cars approaching and thus no danger in not stopping. A yield sign permits drivers to go through without stopping unless they judge that approaching cars make it dangerous to drive through the intersection. The key difference between these signs is the amount of discretion that they give to the driver.

The stop sign is like the rule utilitarian approach. It tells drivers to stop and does not allow them to calculate whether it would be better to stop or not. The yield sign is like act utilitarianism. It permits drivers to decide whether there is a need to stop. Act utilitarians see the stop sign as too rigid because it requires drivers to stop even when nothing bad will be prevented. The result, they say, is a loss of utility each time a driver stops at a stop sign when there is no danger from oncoming cars.

Rule utilitarians will reply that they would reject the stop sign method a) if people could be counted on to drive carefully and b) if traffic accidents only caused limited amounts of harm. But, they say, neither of these is true. Because people often drive too fast and are inattentive while driving (because they are, for example, talking, texting, listening to music, or tired), we cannot count on people to make good utilitarian judgments about how to drive safely. In addition, the costs (i.e. the disutility) of accidents can be very high. Accident victims (including drivers) may be killed, injured, or disabled for life. For these reasons, rule utilitarians support the use of stop signs and other non-discretionary rules under some circumstances. Overall these rules generate greater utility because they prevent more disutility (from accidents) than they create (from “unnecessary” stops).

Rule utilitarians generalize from this type of case and claim that our knowledge of human behavior shows that there are many cases in which general rules or practices are more likely to promote good effects than simply telling people to do whatever they think is best in each individual case.

This does not mean that rule utilitarians always support rigid rules without exceptions. Some rules can identify types of situations in which the prohibition is over-ridden. In emergency medical situations, for example, a driver may justifiably go through a red light or stop sign based on the driver’s own assessment that a) this can be done safely and b) the situation is one in which even a short delay might cause dire harms. So the correct rule need not be “never go through a stop sign” but rather can be something like “never go through a stop sign except in cases that have properties a and b.” In addition, there will remain many things about driving or other behavior that can be left to people’s discretion. The rules of the road do not tell drivers when to drive or what their destination should be for example.

Overall then, rule utilitarian can allow departures from rules and will leave many choices up to individuals. In such cases, people may act in the manner that looks like the approach supported by act utilitarians. Nonetheless, these discretionary actions are permitted because having a rule in these cases does not maximize utility or because the best rule may impose some constraints on how people act while still permitting a lot of discretion in deciding what to do.

ii. Rule Utilitarianism Avoids the Criticisms of Act Utilitarianism

As discussed earlier, critics of act utilitarianism raise three strong objections against it. According to these critics, act utilitarianism a) approves of actions that are clearly wrong; b) undermines trust among people, and c) is too demanding because it requires people to make excessive levels of sacrifice. Rule utilitarians tend to agree with these criticisms of act utilitarianism and try to explain why rule utilitarianism is not open to any of these objections.

1. Judges, Doctors, and Promise-makers

Critics of act utilitarianism claim that it allows judges to sentence innocent people to severe punishments when doing so will maximize utility, allows doctors to kill healthy patients if by doing so, they can use the organs of one person to save more lives, and allows people to break promises if that will create slightly more benefits than keeping the promise.

Rule utilitarians say that they can avoid all these charges because they do not evaluate individual actions separately but instead support rules whose acceptance maximizes utility. To see the difference that their focus on rules makes, consider which rule would maximize utility: a) a rule that allows medical doctors to kill healthy patients so that they can use their organs for transplants that will save a larger number of patients who would die without these organs; or b) a rule that forbids doctors to remove the organs of healthy patients in order to benefit other patients.

Although more good may be done by killing the healthy patient in an individual case, it is unlikely that more overall good will be done by having a rule that allows this practice. If a rule were adopted that allows doctors to kill healthy patients when this will save more lives, the result would be that many people would not go to doctors at all. A rule utilitarian evaluation will take account of the fact that the benefits of medical treatment would be greatly diminished because people would no longer trust doctors. People who seek medical treatment must have a high degree of trust in doctors. If they had to worry that doctors might use their organs to help other patients, they would not, for example, allow doctors to anesthetize them for surgery because the resulting loss of consciousness would make them completely vulnerable and unable to defend themselves. Thus, the rule that allows doctors to kill one patient to save five would not maximize utility.

The same reasoning applies equally to the case of the judge. In order to have a criminal justice system that protects people from being harmed by others, we authorize judges and other officials to impose serious punishments on people who are convicted of crimes. The purpose of this is to provide overall security to people in their jurisdiction, but this requires that criminal justice officials only have the authority to impose arrest and imprisonment on people who are actually believed to be guilty. They do not have the authority to do whatever they think will lead to the best results in particular cases. Whatever they do must be constrained by rules that limit their power. Act utilitarians may sometimes support the intentional punishment of innocent people, but rule utilitarians will understand the risks involved and will oppose a practice that allows it.

Rule utilitarians offer a similar analysis of the promise keeping case. They explain that in general, we want people to keep their promises even in some cases in which doing so may lead to less utility than breaking the promise. The reason for this is that the practice of promise-keeping is a very valuable. It enables people to have a wide range of cooperative relationships by generating confidence that other people will do what they promise to do. If we knew that people would fail to keep promises whenever some option arises that leads to more utility, then we could not trust people who make promises to us to carry them through. We would always have to worry that some better option (one that act utilitarians would favor) might emerge, leading to the breaking of the person’s promise to us.

In each of these cases then, rule utilitarians can agree with the critics of act utilitarianism that it is wrong for doctors, judges, and promise-makers to do case by case evaluations of whether they should harm their patients, convict and punish innocent people, and break promises. The rule utilitarian approach stresses the value of general rules and practices, and shows why compliance with rules often maximizes overall utility even if in some individual cases, it requires doing what produces less utility.

2. Maintaining vs. Undermining Trust

Rule utilitarians see the social impact of a rule-based morality as one of the key virtues of their theory. The three cases just discussed show why act utilitarianism undermines trust but rule utilitarianism does not. Fundamentally, in the cases of doctors, judges, and promise-keepers, it is trust that is at stake. Being able to trust other people is extremely important to our well-being. Part of trusting people involves being able to predict what they will and won’t do. Because act utilitarians are committed to a case by case evaluation method, the adoption of their view would make people’s actions much less predictable. As a result, people would be less likely to see other people as reliable and trustworthy. Rule utilitarianism does not have this problem because it is committed to rules, and these rules generate positive “expectation effects” that give us a basis for knowing how other people are likely to behave.

While rule utilitarians do not deny that there are people who are not trustworthy, they can claim that their moral code generally condemns violations of trust as wrongful acts. The problem with act utilitarians is that they support a moral view that has the effect of undermining trust and that sacrifices the good effects of a moral code that supports and encourages trustworthiness.

3. Impartiality and the Problem of Over-Demandingness

Rule utilitarians believe that their view is also immune to the criticism that act utilitarianism is too demanding. In addition, while the act utilitarian commitment to impartiality undermines the moral relevance of personal relations, rule utilitarians claim that their view is not open to this criticism. They claim that rule utilitarianism allows for partiality toward ourselves and others with whom we share personal relationships. Moreover, they say, rule utilitarianism can recognize justifiable partiality to some people without rejecting the commitment to impartiality that is central to the utilitarian tradition.

How can rule utilitarianism do this? How can it be an impartial moral theory while also allowing partiality in people’s treatment of their friends, family, and others with whom they have a special connection?

In his defense of rule utilitarianism, Brad Hooker distinguishes two different contexts in which partiality and impartiality play a role. One involves the justification of moral rules and the other concerns the application of moral rules. Justifications of moral rules, he claims, must be strictly impartial. When we ask whether a rule should be adopted, it is essential to consider the impact of the rule on all people and to weigh the interests of everyone equally.

The second context concerns the content of the rules and how they are applied in actual cases. Rule utilitarians argue that a rule utilitarian moral code will allow partiality to play a role in determining what morality requires, forbids, or allows us to do. As an example, consider a moral rule parents have a special duty to care for their own children. (See Parental Rights and Obligations.) This is a partialist rule because it not only allows but actually requires parents to devote more time, energy, and other resources to their own children than to others. While it does not forbid devoting resources to other people’s children, it allows people to give to their own. While the content of this rule is not impartial, rule utilitarians believe it can be impartially justified. Partiality toward children can be justified for several reasons. Caring for children is a demanding activity. Children need the special attention of adults to develop physically, emotionally, and cognitively. Because children’s needs vary, knowledge of particular children’s needs is necessary to benefit them. For these reasons, it is plausible to believe that children’s well-being can best be promoted by a division of labor that requires particular parents (or other caretakers) to focus primarily on caring for specific children rather than trying to take care of all children. It is not possible for absentee parents or strangers to provide individual children with all that they need. Therefore, we can maximize the overall well-being of children as a class by designating certain people as the caretakers for specific children. For these reasons, partiality toward specific children can be impartially justified.

Similar “division of labor” arguments can be used to provide impartial justifications of other partialist rules and practices. Teachers, for example have special duties to students in their own classes and have no duty to educate all students. Similarly, public officials can and should be partial to people in the jurisdiction in which they work. If the overall aim is to maximize the well-being of all people in all cities, for example, then we are likely to get better results by having individuals who know and understand particular cities focus on them while other people focus on other cities.

Based on examples like these, rule utilitarians claim that their view, unlike act utilitarianism, avoids the problems raised about demandingness and partiality. Being committed to impartialist justifications of moral rules does not commit them to rejecting moral rules that allow or require people to give specific others priority.

While rule utilitarians can defend partiality, their commitment to maximizing overall utility also allows them to justify limits on the degree of partiality that is morally permissible. At a minimum, rule utilitarians will support a rule that forbids parents to harm other people’s children in order to advance the interests of their own children. (It would be wrong, for example, for a parent to injure children who are running in a school race in order to increase the chances that their own children will win.) Moreover, though this is more controversial, rule utilitarians may support a rule that says that if parents are financially well-off and if their own children’s needs are fully met, these parents may have a moral duty to contribute some resources for children who are deprived of essential resources.

The key point is that while rule utilitarianism permits partiality toward some people, it can also generate rules that limit the ways in which people may act partially and it might even support a positive duty for well off people to provide assistance to strangers when the needs and interests of people to whom we are partial are fully met, when they have surplus resources that could be used to assist strangers in dire conditions, and when there are ways to channel these resources effectively to people in dire need.

b. Arguments against Rule Utilitarianism

i. The “Rule Worship” Objection

Act utilitarians criticize rule utilitarians for irrationally supporting rule-based actions in cases where more good could be done by violating the rule than obeying it. They see this as a form of “rule worship,” an irrational deference to rules that has no utilitarian justification (J. J. C. Smart).

Act utilitarians say that they recognize that rules can have value. For example, rules can provide a basis for acting when there is no time to deliberate. In addition, rules can define a default position, a justification for doing (or refraining from) a type of action as long as there is no reason for not doing it. But when people know that more good can be done by violating the rule then the default position should be over-ridden.

ii. The “Collapses into Act Utilitarianism” Objection

While the “rule worship” objection assumes that rule utilitarianism is different from act utilitarianism, some critics deny that this is the case. In their view, whatever defects act utilitarianism may have, rule utilitarianism will have the same defects. According to this criticism, although rule utilitarianism looks different from act utilitarianism, a careful examination shows that it collapses into or, as David Lyons claimed, is extensionally equivalent to act utilitarianism.

To understand this criticism, it is worth focusing on a distinction between rule utilitarianism and other non-utilitarian theories. Consider Kant’s claim that lying is always morally wrong, even when lying would save a person’s life. Many people see this view as too rigid and claim that it fails to take into account the circumstances in which a lie is being told. A more plausible rule would say “do not lie except in special circumstances that justify lying.” But what are these special circumstances? For a utilitarian, it is natural to say that the correct rule is “do not lie except when lying will generate more good than telling the truth.”

Suppose that a rule utilitarian adopts this approach and advocates a moral code that consists of a list of rules of this form. The rules would say something like “do x except when not doing x maximizes utility” and “do not do x except when doing x maximizes utility.” While this may sound plausible, it is easy to see that this version of rule utilitarianism is in fact identical with act utilitarianism. Whatever action x is, the moral requirement and the moral prohibition expressed in these rules collapses into the act utilitarian rules “do x only when not doing x maximizes utility” or “do not do x except when doing x maximizes utility.” These rules say exactly the same thing as the open-ended act utilitarian rule “Do whatever action maximizes utility.”

If rule utilitarianism is to be distinct from act utilitarianism, its supporters must find a way to formulate rules that allow exceptions to a general requirement or prohibition while not collapsing into act utilitarianism. One way to do this is to identify specific conditions under which violating a general moral requirement would be justified. Instead of saying that we can violate a general rule whenever doing so will maximize utility, the rule utilitarian code might say things like “Do not lie except to prevent severe harms to people who are not unjustifiably threatening others with severe harm.” This type of rule would prohibit lying generally, but it would permit lying to a murderer to prevent harm to the intended victims even if the lie would lead to harm to the murderer. In cases of lesser harms or deceitful acts that will benefit the liar, lying would still be prohibited, even if lying might maximize overall utility.

Rule utilitarians claim that this sort of rule is not open to the “collapses into act utilitarianism” objection. It also suggests, however, that rule utilitarians face difficult challenges in formulating utility-based rules that have a reasonable degree of flexibility built into them but are not so flexible that they collapse into act utilitarianism. In addition, although the rules that make up a moral code should be flexible enough to account for the complexities of life, they cannot be so complex that they are too difficult for people to learn and understand.

iii. Wrong Answers and Crude Concepts

Although rule utilitarians try to avoid the weaknesses attributed to act utilitarianism, critics argue that they cannot avoid these weaknesses because they do not take seriously many of our central moral concepts. As a result, they cannot support the right answers to crucial moral problems. Three prominent concepts in moral thought that critics cite are justice, rights, and desert. These moral ideas are often invoked in reasoning about morality, but critics claim that neither rule nor act utilitarianism acknowledge their importance. Instead, they focus only on the amounts of utility that actions or rules generate.

In considering the case, for example, of punishing innocent people, the best that rule utilitarians can do is to say that a rule that permits this would lead to worse results overall than a rule that permitted it. This prediction, however, is precarious. While it may be true, it may also be false, and if it is false, then utilitarians must acknowledge that intentionally punishing an innocent person could sometimes be morally justified.

Against this, critics may appeal to common sense morality to support the view that there are no circumstances in which punishing the innocent can be justified because the innocent person is a) being treated unjustly, b) has a right not to be punished for something that he or she is not guilty of, and c) does not deserve to be punished for a crime that he or she did not commit.

In responding, rule utilitarians may begin, first, with the view that they do not reject concepts like justice, rights, and desert. Instead, they accept and use these concepts but interpret them from the perspective of maximizing utility. To speak of justice, rights, and desert is to speak of rules of individual treatment that are very important, and what makes them important is their contribution to promoting overall well-being. Moreover, even people who accept these concepts as basic still need to determine whether it is always wrong to treat someone unjustly, violate their rights, or treat them in ways that they don’t deserve.

Critics object to utilitarianism by claiming that the theory justifies treating people unjustly, violating their rights, etc. This criticism only stands up if it is always wrong and thus never morally justified to treat people in these ways.  Utilitarians  argue that moral common sense is less absolutist than their critics acknowledge. In the case of punishment, for example, while we hope that our system of criminal justice gives people fair trials and conscientiously attempts to separate the innocent from the guilty, we know that the system is not perfect. As a result, people who are innocent are sometimes prosecuted, convicted, and punished for crimes they did not do.

This is the problem of wrongful convictions, which poses a difficult challenge to critics of utilitarianism. If we know that our system of criminal justice punishes some people unjustly and in ways they don’t deserve, we are faced with a dilemma. Either we can shut down the system and punish no one, or we can maintain the system even though we know that it will result in some innocent people being unjustly punished in ways that they do not deserve. Most people will support continuing to punish people in spite of the fact that it involves punishing some people unjustly. According to rule utilitarians, this can only be justified if a rule that permits punishments (after a fair trial, etc.) yields more overall utility than a rule that rejects punishment because it treats some people unfairly. To end the practice of punishment entirely—because it inevitably causes some injustice—is likely to result in worse consequences because it deprives society of a central means of protecting people’s well-being, including what are regarded as their rights. In the end, utilitarians say, it is justice and rights that give way when rules that approve of violations in some cases yield the greatest amount of utility.

5. Conclusion

The debate between act utilitarianism and rule utilitarianism highlights many important issues about how we should make moral judgments. Act utilitarianism stresses the specific context and the many individual features of the situations that pose moral problems, and it presents a single method for dealing with these individual cases. Rule utilitarianism stresses the recurrent features of human life and the ways in which similar needs and problems arise over and over again. From this perspective, we need rules that deal with types or classes of actions: killing, stealing, lying, cheating, taking care of our friends or family, punishing people for crimes, aiding people in need, etc. Both of these perspectives, however, agree that the main determinant of what is right or wrong is the relationship between what we do or what form our moral code takes and what is the impact of our moral perspective on the level of people’s well-being.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Classic Works

  • Jeremy Bentham.  An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, available in many editions, 1789.
    • See Book I, chapter 1 for Bentham’s statement of what utilitarianism is; chapter IV for his method of measuring amounts of pleasure/utility; chapter V for his list of types of pleasures and pains, and chapter XIII for his application of utilitarianism to questions about criminal punishment.
  • John Stuart Mill. Utilitarianism, available in many editions and online, 1861.
    • See especially chapter II, in which Mill tries both to clarify and defend utilitarianism. Passages at the end of chapter suggest that Mill was a rule utilitarian. In chapter V, Mill tries to show that utilitarianism is compatible with justice.
  • Henry Sidgwick. The Methods of Ethics, Seventh Edition, available in many editions, 1907.
    • Sidgwick is known for his careful, extended analysis of utilitarian moral theory and competing views.
  • G. E. Moore. Principia Ethica, 1903.
    • Moore criticizes aspects of Mill’s views but support a non-hedonistic form of utilitarianism.
  • G. E. Moore. Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1912.
    • Mostly focused on utilitarianism, this book contains a combination of act and rule utilitarian ideas.

b. More Recent Utilitarians

  • J. J. C. Smart. “An Outline of a System of Utilitarian Ethics” in J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • Smart’s discussion combines an overview of moral theory and a defense of act utilitarianism. It is followed by Bernard Williams’, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” a source of many important criticisms of utilitarianism.
  • Richard Brandt. Ethical Theory. Prentice Hall, 1959. Chapter 15.
    • Brandt, who coined the terms “act” and “rule” utilitarianism, explains and criticizes act utilitarianism and tentatively proposes a version of rule utilitarianism.
  • Richard Brandt. Morality, Utilitarianism, and Rights. Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Brandt developed and defended rule utilitarianism in many papers. This book contains several of them as well as works in which he applies rule utilitarian thinking to issues like rights and the ethics of war.
  • R. M. Hare. Moral Thinking. Oxford University Press, 1981.
    • An interesting development of a form of rule utilitarianism by an influential moral theorist.
  • John C. Harsanyi. “Morality and the Theory of Rational Behavior.” in Social Research 44.4 (1977): 623-656. (Reprinted in Amartya Sen and Bernard Williams, eds., Utilitarianism and Beyond, Cambridge University Press, 1982).
    • Harsanyi, a Nobel Prize economist, defends rule utilitarianism, connecting it to a preference theory of value and a theory of rational action.
  • John Rawls. “Two Concepts of Rules.” In Philosophical Review LXIV (1955), 3-32.
    • Before becoming an influential critic of utilitarianism, Rawls wrote this defense of rule utilitarianism.
  • Brad Hooker.  Ideal Code, Real World: A Rule-consequentialist Theory of Morality. Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • In this 21st century defense of rule utilitarianism, Hooker places it in the context of more recent developments in philosophy.
  • Peter Singer. Writings on an Ethical Life. HarperCollins, 2000.
    • Singer, a prolific, widely read thinker, mostly applies a utilitarian perspective to controversial moral issues (for example, euthanasia, the treatment of non-human animals, and global poverty) rather than discussing utilitarian moral theory. This volume contains selections from his books and articles.
  • Peter Singer. “Famine, Affluence, and Morality” in Philosophy and Public Affairs 1 (1972), 229-43. Reprinted in Peter Singer. Writings on an Ethical Life. Harper Collins, 2000.
    • This widely reprinted article, though it does not focus on utilitarianism, uses utilitarian reasoning and has sparked decades of debate about moral demandingness and moral impartiality.
  • Robert Goodin. Utilitarianism as a Public Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • In a series of essays, Goodin argues that utilitarianism is the best philosophy for public decision-making even if it fails as an ethic for personal aspects of life.
  • Derek Parfit.  On What Matters. Oxford University Press, 1991.
    • In a long, complex work, Parfit stresses the importance of Henry Sidgwick as a moral philosopher and argues that rule utilitarianism and Kantian deontology can be understood in a way that makes them compatible with one another.

c. Overviews

  • Tim Mulgan. Understanding Utilitarianism. Acumen, 2007.
    • This is a very clear description of utilitarianism, including explanations of arguments both for and against. Chapter 2 discusses Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick while chapter 6 focuses on act and rule utilitarianism.
  • Julia Driver, “The History of Utilitarianism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This article gives a good historical account of important figures in the development of utilitarianism.
  • Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, “Consequentialism,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • This very useful overview is relevant to utilitarianism and other forms of consequentialism.
  • William Shaw. Contemporary Ethics: Taking Account of Utilitarianism. Blackwell, 1999.
    • Shaw provides a clear, comprehensive discussion of utilitarianism and its critics as well as defending utilitarianism.
  • John Troyer. The Classical Utilitarians: Bentham and Mill. Hackett, 2003.
    • Troyer’s introduction to this book of selections from Mill and Bentham is clear and informative.
  • Ben Eggleston and Dale Miller, eds. The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism. Cambridge University Press, 2014.
    • This collection contains sixteen essays on utilitarianism, including essays on historical figures as well as  discussion of 21st century issues, including both act and rule utilitarianism.

d. J. S. Mill and Utilitarian Moral Theory

  • J. O. Urmson. “The Interpretation of the Moral Philosophy of J. S. Mill,” in Philosophical Quarterly (1953) 3, 33-9.
    • This article generated renewed interest in both Mill’s moral theory and rule utilitarianism.
  • Roger Crisp. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Mill on Utilitarianism. Routledge, 1997.
  • A clear discussion of Mill’s Utilitarianism with chapters on key topics as well as on Mill’s On Liberty and The Subjection of Women.
  • Henry. R. West, ed. The Blackwell Guide to Mill’s Utilitarianism. Blackwell, 2006.
    • This contains the complete text of Mill’s Utilitarianism   preceded by three essays on the background to Mill’s utilitarianism and followed by five interpretative essays and four focusing on contemporary issues.
  • Henry R. West. An Introduction to Mill’s Utilitarian Ethics. Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A clear discussion of Mill; Chapter 4 argues that Mill is neither an act nor a rule utilitarian. Chapter 6 focuses on utilitarianism and justice.
  • Dale Miller. J. S. Mill. Polity Press, 2010.
    • Miller, in Chapter 6, argues that Mill was a rule utilitarian.
  • Stephen Nathanson. “John Stuart Mill on Economic Justice and the Alleviation of Poverty,” in Journal of Social Philosophy, XLIII, no. 2.
    • Drawing on Mill’s Principles of Political Economy, Nathanson claims that Mill was a rule utilitarian and provides an interpretation of Mill’s views on economic justice.
  • Wendy Donner, “Mill’s Utilitarianism” in John Skorupski, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Mill. Cambridge University Press, 1998, 255–92.
    • A discussion of Mill’s views and some recent interpretations of them.
  • David Lyons. Rights, Welfare, and Mill’s Moral Theory. Oxford, 1994.
    • In this series of papers, Lyons defends Mill’s view of morality against some critics, differentiates Mill’s views from  both act and rule utilitarianism, and criticizes Mill’s attempt to show that utilitarianism can account for justice.

e. Critics of Utilitarianism

  • David Lyons.  Forms and Limits of Utilitarianism. Oxford, 1965.
    • Lyons argues that at least some versions of rule utilitarianism collapse into act utilitarianism.
  • David Lyons. “The Moral Opacity of Utilitarianism” in Brad Hooker, Elinor Mason, and Dale Miller, eds. Morality, Rules, and Consequences. Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
    • In a challenging essay, Lyons raises doubts about whether there is any coherent version of utilitarianism.
  • Judith Jarvis Thomson. “The Trolley Problem.” Yale Law Journal 94 (1985), 1395-1415. Reprinted in Judith Jarvis Thomson. Rights, Restitution and Risk. Edited by William Parent. Harvard University Press, 1986; Chapter 7.
    • An influential rights-based discussion in which Jarvis Thomson uses hypothetical cases to show, among other things, that utilitarianism cannot explain why some actions that cause killings are permissible and others not.
  • Bernard Williams, “A Critique of Utilitarianism,” In J. J. C. Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against. Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • Williams’ contribution to this debate contains arguments and examples that have played an important role in debates about utilitarianism and moral theory.

f. Collections of Essays

  • Michael D. Bayles, ed. Contemporary Utilitarianism. Garden City: Doubleday, 1968.
    • Ten essays that debate act vs. rule utilitarianism as well as whether a form of utilitarianism is correct.
  • Samuel Gorovitz, ed. John Stuart Mill: Utilitarianism, With Critical Essays. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, 1971.
    • This includes Mill’s Utlitarianism plus a rich array of twenty-eight (pre-1970) articles interpreting, defending, and criticizing utilitarianism.
  • Brad Hooker, Elinor Mason, and Dale Miller, eds. Morality, Rules, and Consequences. Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
    • Thirteen essays on utilitarianism, many focused on issues concerning rule utilitarianism.
  • Samuel Scheffler. Consequentialism and Its Critics. Oxford, 1988.
    • This contains a dozen influential articles, mostly by prominent critics of utilitarianism and other forms of consequentialism.
  • Amartya Sen, and Bernard Williams, eds. Utilitarianism and Beyond. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • This contains fourteen articles, including essays defending utilitarianism by R. M. Hare and John Harsanyi, As the title suggests, however, most of the articles are critical of utilitarianism.


Author Information

Stephen Nathanson
Northeastern University
U. S. A.

Immanuel Kant

kant2At the foundation of Kant’s system is the doctrine of “transcendental idealism,” which emphasizes a distinction between what we can experience (the natural, observable world) and what we cannot (“supersensible” objects such as God and the soul). Kant argued that we can only have knowledge of things we can experience. Accordingly, in answer to the question, “What can I know?” Kant replies that we can know the natural, observable world, but we cannot, however, have answers to many of the deepest questions of metaphysics.

Kant’s ethics are organized around the notion of a “categorical imperative,” which is a universal ethical principle stating that one should always respect the humanity in others, and that one should only act in accordance with rules that could hold for everyone. Kant argued that the moral law is a truth of reason, and hence that all rational creatures are bound by the same moral law. Thus in answer to the question, “What should I do?” Kant replies that we should act rationally, in accordance with a universal moral law.

Kant also argued that his ethical theory requires belief in free will, God, and the immortality of the soul. Although we cannot have knowledge of these things, reflection on the moral law leads to a justified belief in them, which amounts to a kind rational faith. Thus in answer to the question, “What may I hope?” Kant replies that we may hope that our souls are immortal and that there really is a God who designed the world in accordance with principles of justice.

In addition to these three focal points, Kant also made lasting contributions to nearly all areas of philosophy. His aesthetic theory remains influential among art critics. His theory of knowledge is required reading for many branches of analytic philosophy. The cosmopolitanism behind his political theory colors discourse about globalization and international relations. And some of his scientific contributions are even considered intellectual precursors to several ideas in contemporary cosmology.

This article presents an overview of these and other of Kant’s most important philosophical contributions. It follows standard procedures for citing Kant’s works. Passages from Critique of Pure Reason are cited by reference to page numbers in both the 1781 and 1787 editions. Thus “(A805/B833)” refers to page 805 in the 1781 edition and 833 in the 1787 edition. References to the rest of Kant’s works refer to the volume and page number of the official Deutsche Akademie editions of Kant’s works. Thus “(5:162)” refers to volume 5, page 162 of those editions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Metaphysics and Epistemology
    1. Pre-Critical Thought
    2. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift
    3. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations
    4. Transcendental Idealism
      1. The Ideality of Space and Time
      2. Appearances and Things in Themselves
    5. The Deduction of the Categories
    6. Theory of Experience
    7. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics
      1. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)
      2. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)
      3. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)
  3. Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. Natural Science
    1. Physics
    2. Other Scientific Contributions
  5. Moral Theory
    1. The Good Will and Duty
    2. The Categorical Imperative
    3. Postulates of Practical Reason
  6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History
    1. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment
    2. Political Theory
    3. Perpetual Peace
  7. Theory of Art and Beauty
    1. The Beautiful and the Sublime
    2. Theory of Art
    3. Relation to Moral Theory
  8. Pragmatic Anthropology
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Kant was born in 1724 in the Prussian city of Königsberg (now Kaliningrad in Russia). His parents – Johann Georg and Anna Regina – were pietists. Although they raised Kant in this tradition (an austere offshoot of Lutheranism that emphasized humility and divine grace), he does not appear ever to have been very sympathetic to this kind of religious devotion. As a youth, he attended the Collegium Fridericianum in Königsberg, after which he attended the University of Königsberg. Although he initially focused his studies on the classics, philosophy soon caught and held his attention. The rationalism of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754) was most influential on him during these early years, but Kant was also introduced to Isaac Newton’s (1642-1727) writings during this time.

His mother had died in 1737, and after his father’s death in 1746 Kant left the University to work as a private tutor for several families in the countryside around the city. He returned to the University in 1754 to teach as a Privatdozent, which meant that he was paid directly by individual students, rather than by the University. He supported himself in this way until 1770. Kant published many essays and other short works during this period. He made minor scientific contributions in astronomy, physics, and earth science, and wrote philosophical treatises engaging with the Leibnizian-Wolffian traditions of the day (many of these are discussed below). Kant’s primary professional goal during this period was to eventually attain the position of Professor of Logic and Metaphysics at Königsberg. He finally succeeded in 1770 (at the age of 46) when he completed his second dissertation (the first had been published in 1755), which is now referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation.

Commentators divide Kant’s career into the “pre-critical” period before 1770 and the “critical” period after. After the publication of the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant published hardly anything for more than a decade (this period is referred to as his “silent decade”). However, this was anything but a fallow period for Kant. After discovering and being shaken by the radical skepticism of Hume’s empiricism in the early 1770s, Kant undertook a massive project to respond to Hume. He realized that this response would require a complete reorientation of the most fundamental approaches to metaphysics and epistemology. Although it took much longer than initially planned, his project came to fruition in 1781 with the publication of the first edition of Critique of Pure Reason

The 1780s would be the most productive years of Kant’s career. In addition to writing the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783) as a sort of introduction to the Critique, Kant wrote important works in ethics (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 1785, and Critique of Practical Reason, 1788), he applied his theoretical philosophy to Newtonian physical theory (Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science, 1786), and he substantially revised the Critique of Pure Reason in 1787. Kant capped the decade with the publication of the third and final critique, Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790).

Although the products of the 1780s are the works for which Kant is best known, he continued to publish philosophical writings through the 1790s as well. Of note during this period are Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason (1793), Towards Perpetual Peace (1795), Metaphysics of Morals (1797), and Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798). The Religion was attended with some controversy, and Kant was ultimately led to promise the King of Prussia (Friedrich Wilhelm II) not to publish anything else on religion. (Kant considered the promise null and void after the king died in 1797.) During his final years, he devoted himself to completing the critical project with one final bridge to physical science. Unfortunately, the encroaching dementia of Kant’s final years prevented him from completing this book (partial drafts are published under the title Opus Postumum).

Kant never married and there are many stories that paint him as a quirky but dour eccentric. These stories do not do him justice. He was beloved by his friends and colleagues. He was consistently generous to all those around him, including his servants. He was universally considered a lively and engaging dinner guest and (later in life) host. And he was a devoted and popular teacher throughout the five decades he spent in the classroom. Although he had hoped for a small, private ceremony, when he died in 1804, age 79, his funeral was attended by the thousands who wished to pay their respects to “the sage of Königsberg.”

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

The most important element of Kant’s mature metaphysics and epistemology is his doctrine of transcendental idealism, which received its fullest discussion in Critique of Pure Reason (1781/87). Transcendental idealism is the thesis that the empirical world that we experience (the “phenomenal” world of “appearances”) is to be distinguished from the world of things as they are in themselves. The most significant aspect of this distinction is that while the empirical world exists in space and time, things in themselves are neither spatial nor temporal. Transcendental idealism has wide-ranging consequences. On the positive side, Kant takes transcendental idealism to entail an “empirical realism,” according to which humans have direct epistemic access to the natural, physical world and can even have a priori cognition of basic features of all possible experienceable objects. On the negative side, Kant argues that we cannot have knowledge of things in themselves. Further, since traditional metaphysics deals with things in themselves, answers to the questions of traditional metaphysics (for example, regarding God or free will) can never be answered by human minds.

This section addresses the development of Kant’s metaphysics and epistemology and then summarizes the most important arguments and conclusions of Kant’s theory.

a. Pre-Critical Thought

Critique of Pure Reason, the book that would alter the course of western philosophy, was written by a man already far into his career. Unlike the later “critical period” Kant, the philosophical output of the early Kant was fully enmeshed in the German rationalist tradition, which was dominated at the time by the writings of Gottfried Leibniz (1646-1716) and Christian Wolff (1679-1754). Nevertheless, many of Kant’s concerns during the pre-critical period anticipate important aspects of his mature thought.

Kant’s first purely philosophical work was the New Elucidation of the First Principles of Metaphysical Cognition (1755). The first parts of this long essay present criticisms and revisions of the Wolffian understanding of the basic principles of metaphysics, especially the Principles of Identity (whatever is, is, and whatever is not, is not), of Contradiction (nothing can both be and not be), and of Sufficient Reason (nothing is true without a reason why it is true). In the final part, Kant defends two original principles of metaphysics. According to the “Principle of Succession,” all change in objects requires the mutual interaction of a plurality of substances. This principle is a metaphysical analogue of Newton’s principle of action and reaction, and it anticipates Kant’s argument in the Third Analogy of Experience from Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f below). According to the “Principle of Coexistence,” multiple substances can only be said to coexist within the same world if the unity of that world is grounded in the intellect of God. Although Kant would later claim that we can never have metaphysical cognition of this sort of relation between God and the world (not least of all because we can’t even know that God exists), he would nonetheless continue to be occupied with the question of how multiple distinct substances can constitute a single, unified world.

In the Physical Monadology (1756), Kant attempts to provide a metaphysical account of the basic constitution of material substance in terms of “monads.” Leibniz and Wolff had held that monads are the simple, atomic substances that constitute matter. Kant follows Wolff in rejecting Leibniz’s claim that monads are mindlike and that they do not interact with each other. The novel aspect of Kant’s account lies in his claim that each monad possesses a degree of both attractive and repulsive force, and that monads fill determinate volumes of space because of the interactions between these monads as they compress each other through their opposed repulsive forces. Thirty years later, in the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786), Kant would develop the theory that matter must be understood in terms of interacting attractive and repulsive forces. The primary difference between the later view and the earlier is that Kant no longer appeals to monads, or simple substances at all (transcendental idealism rules out the possibility of simplest substances as constituents of matter; see 2gii below).

The final publication of Kant’s pre-critical period was On the Form and Principles of the Sensible and the Intelligible World, also referred to as the Inaugural Dissertation (1770), since it marked Kant’s appointment as Königsberg’s Professor of Logic and Metaphysics. Although Kant had not yet had the final crucial insights that would lead to the development of transcendental idealism, many of the important elements of his mature metaphysics are prefigured here. Two aspects of the Inaugural Dissertation are especially worth noting. First, in a break from his predecessors, Kant distinguishes two fundamental faculties of the mind: sensibility, which represents the world through singular “intuitions,” and understanding, which represents the world through general “concepts.” In the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant argues that sensibility represents the sensible world of “phenomena” while the understanding represents an intelligible world of “noumena.” The critical period Kant will deny that we can have any determinate knowledge of noumena, and that knowledge of phenomena requires the cooperation of sensibility and understanding together. Second, in describing the “form” of the sensible world, Kant argues that space and time are “not something objective and real,” but are rather “subjective and ideal” (2:403). The claim that space and time pertain to things only as they appear, not as they are in themselves, will be one of the central theses of Kant’s mature transcendental idealism.

b. Dogmatic Slumber, Synthetic A Priori Knowledge, and the Copernican Shift

Although the early Kant showed a complete willingness to dissent from many important aspects of the Wolffian orthodoxy of the time, Kant continued to take for granted the basic rationalist assumption that metaphysical cognition was possible. In a retrospective remark from the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), Kant says that his faith in this rationalist assumption was shaken by David Hume (1711-1776), whose skepticism regarding the possibility of knowledge of causal necessary connections awoke Kant from his “dogmatic slumber” (4:260). Hume argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between causes and effects because such knowledge can neither be given through the senses, nor derived a priori as conceptual truths. Kant realized that Hume’s problem was a serious one because his skepticism about knowledge of the necessity of the connection between cause and effect generalized to all metaphysical knowledge pertaining to necessity, not just causation specifically. For instance, there is the question why mathematical truths necessarily hold true in the natural world, or the question whether we can know that a being (God) exists necessarily.

The solution to Hume’s skepticism, which would form the basis of the critical philosophy, was twofold. The first part of Kant’s solution was to agree with Hume that metaphysical knowledge (such as knowledge of causation) is neither given through the senses, nor is it known a priori through conceptual analysis. Kant argued, however, that there is a third kind of knowledge which is a priori, yet which is not known simply by analyzing concepts. He referred to this as “synthetic a priori knowledge.” Where analytic judgments are justified by the semantic relations between the concepts they mention (for example, “all bachelors are unmarried”), synthetic judgments are justified by their conformity to the given object that they describe (for example, “this ball right here is red”). The puzzle posed by the notion of synthetic a priori knowledge is that it would require that an object be presented to the mind, but not be given in sensory experience.

The second part of Kant’s solution is to explain how synthetic a priori knowledge could be possible. He describes his key insight on this matter as a “Copernican” shift in his thinking about the epistemic relation between the mind and the world. Copernicus had realized that it only appeared as though the sun and stars revolved around us, and that we could have knowledge of the way the solar system really was if we took into account the fact that the sky looks the way it does because we perceivers are moving. Analogously, Kant realized that we must reject the belief that the way things appear corresponds to the way things are in themselves. Furthermore, he argued that the objects of knowledge can only ever be things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Appealing to this new approach to metaphysics and epistemology, Kant argued that we must investigate the most basic structures of experience (that is, the structures of the way things appear to us), because the basic structures of experience will coincide with the basic structures of any objects that could possibly be experienced. In other words, if it is only possible to have experience of an object if the object conforms to the conditions of experience, then knowing the conditions of experience will give us knowledge – synthetic a priori knowledge in fact – of every possible object of experience. Kant overcomes Hume’s skepticism by showing that we can have synthetic a priori knowledge of objects in general when we take as the object of our investigation the very form of a possible object of experience. Critique of Pure Reason is an attempt to work through all of the important details of this basic philosophical strategy.

c. The Cognitive Faculties and Their Representations

Kant’s theory of the mind is organized around an account of the mind’s powers, its “cognitive faculties.” One of Kant’s central claims is that the cognitive capacities of the mind depend on two basic and fundamentally distinct faculties. First, there is “sensibility.” Sensibility is a passive faculty because its job is to receive representations through the affection of objects on the senses. Through sensibility, objects are “given” to the mind. Second, there is “understanding,” which is an active faculty whose job is to “think” (that is, apply concepts to) the objects given through sensibility.

The most basic type of representation of sensibility is what Kant calls an “intuition.” An intuition is a representation that refers directly to a singular individual object. There are two types of intuitions. Pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time themselves (see 2d1 below). Empirical intuitions are a posteriori representations that refer to specific empirical objects in the world. In addition to possessing a spatiotemporal “form,” empirical intuitions also involve sensation, which Kant calls the “matter” of intuition (and of experience generally). (Without sensations, the mind could never have thoughts about real things, only possible ones.) We have empirical intuitions both of objects in the physical world (“outer intuitions”) and objects in our own minds (“inner intuitions”).

The most basic type of representation of understanding is the “concept.” Unlike an intuition, a concept is a representation that refers generally to indefinitely many objects. (For instance, the concept ‘cat’ on its own could refer to any and all cats, but not to any one in particular.) Concepts refer to their objects only indirectly because they depend on intuitions for reference to particular objects. As with intuitions, there are two basic types of concepts. Pure concepts are a priori representations and they characterize the most basic logical structure of the mind. Kant calls these concepts “categories.” Empirical concepts are a posteriori representations, and they are formed on the basis of sensory experience with the world. Concepts are combined by the understanding into “judgments,” which are the smallest units of knowledge. I can only have full cognition of an object in the world once I have, first, had an empirical intuition of the object, second, conceptualized this object in some way, and third, formed my conceptualization of the intuited object into a judgment. This means that both sensibility and understanding must work in cooperation for knowledge to be possible. As Kant expresses it, “Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind” (A51/B75).

There are two other important cognitive faculties that must be mentioned. The first is transcendental “imagination,” which mediates between sensibility and understanding. Kant calls this faculty “blind” because we do not have introspective access to its operations. Kant says that we can at least know that it is responsible for forming intuitions in such a way that it is possible for the understanding to apply concepts to them. The other is “reason,” which operates in a way similar to the understanding, but which operates independently of the senses. While understanding combines the data of the senses into judgments, reason combines understanding’s judgments together into one coherent, unified, systematic whole. Reason is not satisfied with mere disconnected bits of knowledge. Reason wants all knowledge to form a system of knowledge. Reason is also the faculty responsible for the “illusions” of transcendent metaphysics (see 2g below).

d. Transcendental Idealism

Transcendental idealism is a theory about the relation between the mind and its objects. Three fundamental theses make up this theory: first, there is a distinction between appearances (things as they appear) and things as they are in themselves. Second, space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, and hence they pertain only to appearances, not to things in themselves. Third, we can have determinate cognition of only of things that can be experienced, hence only of appearances, not things in themselves.

A quick remark on the term “transcendental idealism” is in order. Kant typically uses the term “transcendental” when he wants to emphasize that something is a condition on the possibility of experience. So for instance, the chapter titled “Transcendental Analytic of Concepts” deals with the concepts without which cognition of an object would be impossible.  Kant uses the term “idealism” to indicate that the objects of experience are mind-dependent (although the precise sense of this mind-dependence is controversial; see 2d2 below). Hence, transcendental idealism is the theory that it is a condition on the possibility of experience that the objects of experience be in some sense mind-dependent.

i. The Ideality of Space and Time

Kant argues that space and time are a priori, subjective conditions on the possibility of experience, that is, that they are transcendentally ideal. Kant grounds the distinction between appearances and things in themselves on the realization that, as subjective conditions on experience, space and time could only characterize things as they appear, not as they are in themselves. Further, the claim that we can only know appearances (not things in themselves) is a consequence of the claims that we can only know objects that conform to the conditions of experience, and that only spatiotemporal appearances conform to these conditions. Given the systematic importance of this radical claim, what were Kant’s arguments for it? What follows are some of Kant’s most important arguments for the thesis.

One argument has to do with the relation between sensations and space. Kant argues that sensations on their own are not spatial, but that they (or arguably the objects they correspond to) are represented in space, “outside and next to one another” (A23/B34). Hence, the ability to sense objects in space presupposes the a priori representation of space, which entails that space is merely ideal, hence not a property of things in themselves.

Another argument that Kant makes repeatedly during the critical period can be called the “argument from geometry.” Its two premises are, first, that the truths of geometry are necessary truths, and thus a priori truths, and second, that the truths of geometry are synthetic (because these truths cannot be derived from an analysis of the meanings of geometrical concepts). If geometry, which is the study of the structure of space, is synthetic a priori, then its object – space – must be a mere a priori representation and not something that pertains to things in themselves. (Kant’s theory of mathematical cognition is discussed further in 3b below.)

Many commentators have found these arguments less than satisfying because they depend on the questionable assumption that if the representations of space and time are a priori they thereby cannot be properties of things in themselves. “Why can’t it be both?” many want to ask. A stronger argument appears in Kant’s discussion of the First and Second Antinomies of Pure Reason (discussed below, 2g2). There Kant argues that if space and time were things in themselves or even properties of things in themselves, then one could prove that space and time both are and are not infinitely large, and that matter in space both is and is not infinitely divisible. In other words, the assumption that space and time are transcendentally real instead of transcendentally ideal leads to a contradiction, and thus space and time must be transcendentally ideal.

ii. Appearances and Things in Themselves

How Kant’s distinction between appearances and things in themselves should be understood is one of the most controversial topics in the literature. It is a question of central importance because how one understands this distinction determines how one will understand the entire nature of Kantian idealism. The following briefly summarizes the main interpretive options, but it does not take a stand on which is correct.

According to “two-world” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in metaphysical and ontological terms. Appearances (and hence the entire physical world that we experience) comprise one set of entities, and things in themselves are an ontologically distinct set of entities. Although things in themselves may somehow cause us to have experience of appearances, the appearances we experience are not things in themselves.

According to “one-world” or “two-aspect” interpretations, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves is to be understood in epistemological terms. Appearances are ontologically the very same things as things in themselves, and the phrase “in themselves” simply means “not considered in terms of their epistemic relation to human perceivers.”

A common objection against two-world interpretations is that they may make Kant’s theory too similar to Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism (an association from which Kant vehemently tried to distance himself), and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in terms of different epistemic standpoints. And a common objection against one-world interpretations is that they may trivialize some of the otherwise revolutionary aspects of Kant’s theory, and they seem to ignore Kant’s frequent characterization of the appearance/thing in itself distinction in seemingly metaphysical terms. There have been attempts at interpretations that are intermediate between these two options. For instance, some have argued that Kant only acknowledges one world, but that the appearance/thing in itself distinction is nevertheless metaphysical, not merely epistemological.

e. The Deduction of the Categories

After establishing the ideality of space and time and the distinction between appearances and things in themselves, Kant goes on to show how it is possible to have a priori cognition of the necessary features of appearances. Cognizing appearances requires more than mere knowledge of their sensible form (space and time); it also requires that we be able to apply certain concepts (for example, the concept of causation) to appearances. Kant identifies the most basic concepts that we can use to think about objects as the “pure concepts of understanding,” or the “categories.”

There are twelve categories in total, and they fall into four groups of three:


The task of the chapter titled “Transcendental Deduction of the Categories” is to show that these categories can and must be applied in some way to any object that could possibly be an object of experience. The argument of the Transcendental Deduction is one of the most important moments in the Critique, but it is also one of the most difficult, complex, and controversial arguments in the book. Hence, it will not be possible to reconstruct the argument in any detail here. Instead, Kant’s most important claims and moves in the Deduction are described.

Kant’s argument turns on conceptions of self-consciousness (or what he calls “apperception”) as a condition on the possibility of experiencing the world as a unified whole. Kant takes it to be uncontroversial that we can be aware of our representations as our representations. It is not just that I can have the thoughts ‘P’ or ‘Q’; I am also always able to ascribe these thoughts to myself: ‘I think P’ and ‘I think Q’. Further, we are also able to recognize that it is the same I that does the thinking in both cases. Thus, we can recognize that ‘I think both P and Q’. In general, all of our experience is unified because it can be ascribed to the one and same I, and so this unity of experience depends on the unity of the self-conscious I. Kant next asks what conditions must obtain in order for this unity of self-consciousness to be possible. His answer is that we must be able to differentiate between the I that does the thinking and the object that we think about. That is, we must be able to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in our experience. If we could not make such a distinction, then all experience would just be so many disconnected mental happenings: everything would be subjective and there would be no “unity of apperception” that stands over and against the various objects represented by the I. So next Kant needs to explain how we are able to differentiate between the subjective and objective elements of experience. His answer is that a representation is objective when the subject is necessitated in representing the object in a certain way, that is, when it is not up to the free associative powers of my imagination to determine how I represent it. For instance, whether I think a painting is attractive or whether it calls to mind an instance from childhood depends on the associative activity of my own imagination; but the size of the canvas and the chemical composition of the pigments is not up to me: insofar as I represent these as objective features of the painting, I am necessitated in representing them in a certain way. In order for a representational content to be necessitated in this way, according to Kant, is for it to be subject to a “rule.” The relevant rules that Kant has in mind are the conditions something must satisfy in order for it to be represented as an object at all. And these conditions are precisely the concepts laid down in the schema of the categories, which are the concepts of an “object in general.” Hence, if I am to have experience at all, I must conceptualize objects in terms of the a priori categories.

Kant’s argument in the Deduction is a “transcendental argument”: Kant begins with a premise accepted by everyone, but then asks what conditions must have been met in order for this premise to be true. Kant assumed that we have a unified experience of the many objects populating the world. This unified experience depends on the unity of apperception. The unity of apperception enables the subject to distinguish between subjective and objective elements in experience. This ability, in turn, depends on representing objects in accordance with rules, and the rules in question are the categories. Hence, the only way we can explain the fact that we have experience at all is by appeal to the fact that the categories apply to the objects of experience.

It is worth emphasizing how truly radical the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction is. Kant takes himself to have shown that all of nature is subject to the rules laid down by the categories. But these categories are a priori: they originate in the mind. This means that the order and regularity we encounter in the natural world is made possible by the mind’s own construction of nature and its order. Thus the conclusion of the Transcendental Deduction parallels the conclusion of the Transcendental Aesthetic: where the latter had shown that the forms of sensibility (space and time) originate in the mind and are imposed on the world, the former shows that the forms of understanding (the categories) also originate in the mind and are imposed on the world.

f. Theory of Experience

The Transcendental Deduction showed that it is necessary for us to make use of the categories in experience, but also that we are justified in making use of them. In the following series of chapters (together labeled the Analytic of Principles) Kant attempts to leverage the results of the Deduction and prove that there are transcendentally necessary laws that every possible object of experience must obey. He refers to these as “principles of pure understanding.” These principles are synthetic a priori in the sense defined above (see 2b), and they are transcendental conditions on the possibility of experience.

The first two principles correspond to the categories of quantity and quality. First, Kant argues that every object of experience must have a determinate spatial shape and size and a determinate temporal duration (except mental objects, which have no spatial determinations). Second, Kant argues that every object of experience must contain a “matter” that fills out the object’s extensive magnitude. This matter must be describable as an “intensive magnitude.” Extensive magnitudes are represented through the intuition of the object (the form of the representation) and intensive magnitudes are represented by the sensations that fill out the intuition (the matter of the representation).

The next three principles are discussed in an important, lengthy chapter called the Analogies of Experience. They derive from the relational categories: substance, causality, and community. According to the First Analogy, experience will always involve objects that must be represented as substances. “Substance” here is to be understood in terms of an object that persists permanently as a “substratum” and which is the bearer of impermanent “accidents.” According to the Second Analogy, every event must have a cause. One event is said to be the cause of another when the second event follows the first in accordance with a rule. And according to the Third Analogy (which presupposes the first two), all substances stand in relations of reciprocal interaction with each other. That is, any two pieces of material substance will effect some degree of causal influence on each other, even if they are far apart.

The principles of the Analogies of Experience are important metaphysical principles, and if Kant’s arguments for them are successful, they mark significant advances in the metaphysical investigation of nature. The First Analogy is a form of the principle of the conservation of matter: it shows that matter can never be created or annihilated by natural means, it can only be altered. The Second Analogy is a version of the principle of sufficient reason applied to experience (causes being sufficient reasons for their effects), and it represents Kant’s refutation of Hume’s skepticism regarding causation. Hume had argued that we can never have knowledge of necessary connections between events; rather, we can only perceive certain types of events to be constantly conjoined with other types of events. In arguing that events follow each other in accordance with rules, Kant has shown how we can have knowledge of necessary connections between events above and beyond their mere constant conjunction. Lastly, Kant probably intended the Third Analogy to establish a transcendental, a priori basis for something like Newton’s law of universal gravitation, which says that no matter how far apart two objects are they will exert some degree of gravitational influence on each other.

The Postulates of Empirical Thinking in General contains the final set of principles of pure understanding and they derive from the modal categories (possibility, actuality, necessity). The Postulates define the different ways to represent the modal status of objects, that is, what it is for an object of experience to be possible, actual, or necessary.

The most important passage from the Postulates chapter is the Refutation of Idealism, which is a refutation of external world skepticism that Kant added to the 1787 edition of the Critique. Kant had been annoyed by reviews of the first edition that unfavorably compared his transcendental idealism with Berkeley’s immaterialist idealism. In the Refutation, Kant argues that his system entails not just that an external (that is, spatial) world is possible (which Berkeley denied), but that we can know it is real (which Descartes and others questioned). Kant’s argumentative strategy in the Refutation is ingenious but controversial. Where the skeptics assume that we have knowledge of the states of our own minds, but say that we cannot be certain that an external world corresponds to these states, Kant turns the tables and argues that we would not have knowledge of the states of our own minds (specifically, the temporal order in which our ideas occur) if we were not simultaneously aware of permanent substances in space, outside of the mind. The precise structure of Kant’s argument, as well as the question how successful it is, continues to be a matter of heated debate in the literature.

g. Critique of Transcendent Metaphysics

One of the most important upshots of Kant’s theory of experience is that it is possible to have knowledge of the world because the world as we experience it conforms to the conditions on the possibility of experience. Accordingly, Kant holds that there can be knowledge of an object only if it is possible for that object to be given in an experience. This aspect of the epistemological condition of the human subject entails that there are important areas of inquiry about which we would like to have knowledge, but cannot. Most importantly, Kant argued that transcendent metaphysics, that is, philosophical inquiry into “supersensible” objects that are not a part of the empirical world, marks a philosophical dead end. (Note: There is a subtle but important difference between the terms “transcendental” and “transcendent” for Kant. “Transcendental” describes conditions on the possibility of experience. “Transcendent” describes unknowable objects in the “noumenal” realm of things in themselves.)

Kant calls the basic concepts of metaphysical inquiry “ideas.” Unlike concepts of the understanding, which correspond to possible objects that can be given in experience, ideas are concepts of reason, and they do not correspond to possible objects of experience. The three most important ideas with which Kant is concerned in the Transcendental Dialectic are the soul, the world (considered as a totality), and God. The peculiar thing about these ideas of reason is that reason is led by its very structure to posit objects corresponding to these ideas. It cannot help but do this because reason’s job is to unify cognitions into a systematic whole, and it finds that it needs these ideas of the soul, the world, and God, in order to complete this systematic unification. Kant refers to reason’s inescapable tendency to posit unexperienceable and hence unknowable objects corresponding to these ideas as “transcendental illusion.”

Kant presents his analysis of transcendental illusion and his critique of transcendent metaphysics in the series of chapters titled “Transcendental Dialectic,” which takes up the majority of the second half of Critique of Pure Reason. This section summarizes Kant’s most important arguments from the Dialectic.

i. The Soul (Paralogisms of Pure Reason)

Kant addresses the metaphysics of the soul – an inquiry he refers to as “rational psychology” – in the Paralogisms of Pure Reason. Rational psychology, as Kant describes it, is the attempt to prove metaphysical theses about the nature of the soul through an analysis of the simple proposition, “I think.” Many of Kant’s rationalist predecessors and contemporaries had thought that reflection on the notion of the “I” in the proposition “I think” would reveal that the I is necessarily a substance (which would mean that the I is a soul), an indivisible unity (which some would use to prove the immortality of the soul), self-identical (which is relevant to questions regarding personal identity), and distinct from the external world (which can lead to external-world skepticism). Kant argues that such reasoning is the result of transcendental illusion.

Transcendental illusion in rational psychology arises when the mere thought of the I in the proposition “I think” is mistaken for a cognition of the I as an object. (A cognition involves both intuition and concept, while a mere thought involves only concept.) For instance, consider the question whether we can cognize the I as a substance (that is, as a soul). On the one hand, something is cognized as a substance when it is represented only as the subject of predication and is never itself the predicate of some other subject. The I of “I think” is always represented as subject (the I’s various thoughts are its predicates). On the other hand, something can only be cognized as a substance when it is given as a persistent object in an intuition (see 2f above), and there can be no intuition of the I itself. Hence although we cannot help but think of the I as a substantial soul, we can never have cognition of the I as a substance, and hence knowledge of the existence and nature of the soul is impossible.

ii. The World (Antinomies of Pure Reason)

The Antinomies of Pure Reason deal with “rational cosmology,” that is, with metaphysical inquiry into the nature of the cosmos considered as a totality. An “antinomy” is a conflict of reason with itself. Antinomies arise when reason seems to be able to prove two opposed and mutually contradictory propositions with apparent certainty. Kant discusses four antinomies in the first Critique (he uncovers other antinomies in later writings as well). The First Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that the universe is both finite and infinite in space and time. The Second Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that matter both is and is not infinitely divisible into ever smaller parts. The Third Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that free will cannot be a causally efficacious part of the world (because all of nature is deterministic) and yet that it must be such a cause. And the Fourth Antinomy shows that reason seems to be able to prove that there is and there is not a necessary being (which some would identify with God).

In all four cases, Kant attempts to resolve these conflicts of reason with itself by appeal to transcendental idealism. The claim that space and time are not features of things in themselves is used to resolve the First and Second Antinomies. Since the empirical world in space and time is identified with appearances, and since the world as a totality can never itself be given as a single appearance, there is no determinate fact of the matter regarding the size of the universe: It is neither determinately finite nor determinately infinite; rather, it is indefinitely large. Similarly, matter has neither simplest atoms (or “monads”) nor is it infinitely divided; rather, it is indefinitely divisible.

The distinction between appearances and things in themselves is used to resolve the Third and Fourth Antinomies. Although every empirical event experienced within the realm of appearance has a deterministic natural cause, it is at least logically possible that freedom can be a causally efficacious power at the level of things in themselves. And although every empirical object experienced within the realm of appearance is a contingently existing entity, it is logically possible that there is a necessary being outside the realm of appearance which grounds the existence of the contingent beings within the realm of appearance. It must be kept in mind that Kant has not claimed to demonstrate the existence of a transcendent free will or a transcendent necessary being: Kant denies the possibility of knowledge of things in themselves. Instead, Kant only takes himself to have shown that the existence of such entities is logically possible. In his moral theory, however, Kant will offer an argument for the actuality of freedom (see 5c below).

iii. God (Ideal of Pure Reason)

The Ideal of Pure Reason addresses the idea of God and argues that it is impossible to prove the existence of God. The argumentation in the Ideal of Pure Reason was anticipated in Kant’s The Only Possible Argument in Support of the Existence of God (1763), making this aspect of Kant’s mature thought one of the most significant remnants of the pre-critical period.

Kant identifies the idea of God with the idea of an ens realissimum, or “most real being.” This most real being is also considered by reason to be a necessary being, that is, something which exists necessarily instead of merely contingently. Reason is led to posit the idea of such a being when it reflects on its conceptions of finite beings with limited reality and infers that the reality of finite beings must derive from and depend on the reality of the most infinitely perfect being. Of course, the fact that reason necessarily thinks of a most real, necessary being does not entail that such a being exists. Kant argues that there are only three possible arguments for the existence of such a being, and that none is successful.

According to the ontological argument for the existence of God (versions of which were proposed by St. Anselm (1033-1109) and Descartes (1596-1650), among others), God is the only being whose essence entails its existence. Kant famously objects that this argument mistakenly treats existence as a “real predicate.” According to Kant, when I make an assertion of the form “x is necessarily F,” all I can mean is that “if x exists, then x must be F.” Thus when proponents of the ontological argument claim that the idea of God entails that “God necessarily exists,” all they can mean is that “if God exists, then God exists,” which is an empty tautology.

Kant also offers lengthy criticisms of the cosmological argument (the existence of contingent beings entails the existence of a necessary being) and the physico-theological argument, which is also referred to as the “argument from design” (the order and purposiveness in the empirical world can only be explained by a divine creator). Kant argues that both of these implicitly depend on the argumentation of the ontological argument pertaining to necessary existence, and since it fails, they fail as well.

Although Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic that we cannot have cognition of the soul, of freedom of the will, nor of God, in his ethical writings he will complicate this story and argue that we are justified in believing in these things (see 5c below).

3. Philosophy of Mathematics

The distinction between analytic and synthetic judgments (see 2b above) is necessary for understanding Kant’s theory of mathematics. Recall that an analytic judgment is one where the truth of the judgment depends only on the relation between the concepts used in the judgment. The truth of a synthetic judgment, by contrast, requires that an object be “given” in sensibility and that the concepts used in the judgment be combined in the object. In these terms, most of Kant’s predecessors took mathematical truths to be analytic truths. Kant, by contrast argued that mathematical knowledge is synthetic. It may seem surprising that one’s knowledge of mathematical truths depends on an object being given in sensibility, for we surely don’t arrive at mathematical knowledge by empirical means. Recall, however, that a judgment can be both synthetic yet a priori. Like the judgments of the necessary structures of experience, mathematics is also synthetic a priori according to Kant.

To make this point, Kant considers the proposition ‘7+5=12’. Surely, this proposition is a priori: I can know its truth without doing empirical experiments to see what happens when I put seven things next to five other things. More to the point, ‘7+5=12’ must be a priori because it is a necessary truth, and empirical judgments are always merely contingent according to Kant. Yet at the same time, the judgment is not analytic because, “The concept of twelve is by no means already thought merely by my thinking of that unification of seven and five, and no matter how long I analyze my concept of such a possible sum I will still not find twelve in it” (B15).

If mathematical knowledge is synthetic, then it depends on objects being given in sensibility. And if it is a priori, then these objects must be non-empirical objects. What sort of objects does Kant have in mind here? The answer lies in Kant’s theory of the pure forms of intuition (space and time). Recall that an intuition is a singular, immediate representation of an individual object (see 2c above). Empirical intuitions represent sensible objects through sensation, but pure intuitions are a priori representations of space and time as such. These pure intuitions of space and time provide the objects of mathematics through what Kant calls a “construction” of concepts in pure intuition. As he puts it, “to construct a concept means to exhibit a priori the intuition corresponding to it” (A713/B741). A mathematical concept (for example, ‘triangle’) can be thought of as a rule for how to make an object that corresponds to that concept. Thus if ‘triangle’ is defined as ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then I construct a triangle in pure intuition when I imagine three lines coming together to form a two-dimensional figure. These pure constructions in intuition can be used to arrive at (synthetic, a priori) mathematical knowledge. Consider the proposition, ‘The angles of a triangle sum to 180 degrees’. When I construct a triangle in intuition in accordance with the rule ‘three-sided, two-dimensional shape’, then the constructed triangle will in fact have angles that sum to 180 degrees. And this will be true irrespective of what particular triangle I constructed (isosceles, scalene, and so forth.). Kant holds that all mathematical knowledge is derived in this fashion: I take a concept, construct it in pure intuition, and then determine what features of the constructed intuition are necessarily true of it.

4. Natural Science

In addition to his work in pure theoretical philosophy, Kant displayed an active interest in the natural sciences throughout his career. Most of his important scientific contributions were in the physical sciences (including not just physics proper, but also earth sciences and cosmology). In Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790) he also presented a lengthy discussion of the philosophical basis of the study of biological entities.

In general, Kant thought that a body of knowledge could only count as a science in the true sense if it could admit of mathematical description and an a priori principle that could be “presented a priori in intuition” (4:471). Hence, Kant was pessimistic about the possibility of empirical psychology ever amounting to a true science. Kant even thought it might be the case that “chemistry can be nothing more than a systematic art or experimental doctrine, but never a proper science” (4:471).

This section focuses primarily on Kant’s physics (4a), but it also lists several of Kant’s other scientific contributions (4b).

a. Physics

Kant’s interest in physical theory began early. His first published work, Thoughts on the True Estimation of Living Forces (1749) was an inquiry into some foundational problems in physics, and it entered into the “vis viva” (“living forces”) debate between Leibniz and the Cartesians regarding how to quantify force in moving objects (for the most part, Kant sided with the Leibnizians). A few years later, Kant wrote the Physical Monadology (1756), which dealt with other foundational questions in physics (see 2a above.)

Kant’s mature physical theory is presented in its fullest form in Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786). This theory can be understood as an outgrowth and consequence of the transcendental theory of experience articulated in Critique of Pure Reason (see 2f above). Where the Critique had shown the necessary conceptual forms to which all possible objects of experience must conform, the Metaphysical Foundations specifies in greater detail what exactly the physical constitution of these objects must be like. The continuity with the theory of experience from the Critique is implicit in the very structure of the Metaphysical Foundations. Just as Kant’s theory of experience was divided into four sections corresponding to the four groups of categories (quantity, quality, relation, modality), the body of the Metaphysical Foundations is also divided along the same lines.

Like the theory of the Physical Monadology, the Metaphysical Foundations presents a “dynamical” theory of matter according to which material substance is constituted by an interaction between attractive and repulsive forces. The basic idea is that each volume of material substance possesses a brute tendency to expand and push away other volumes of substance (this is repulsive force) and each volume of substance possesses a brute tendency to contract and to attract other volumes of substance (this is attractive force). The repulsive force explains the solidity and impenetrability of bodies while the attractive force explains gravitation (and presumably also phenomena such as magnetic attraction). Further, any given volume of substance will possess these forces to a determinate degree: the matter in a volume can be more or less repulsive and more or less attractive. The ratio of attractive and repulsive force in a substance will determine how dense the body is. In this respect, Kant’s theory marks a sharp break from those of his mechanist predecessors. (Mechanists believed that all physical phenomena could be explained by appeal to the sizes, shapes, and velocities of material bodies.) The Cartesians thought that there is no true difference in density and that the appearance of differences in density could be explained by appeal to porosity in the body. Similarly, the atomists thought that density could be explained by differences in the ratio of atoms to void in any given volume. Thus for both of these theories, any time there was a volume completely filled in with material substance (no pores, no void), there could only be one possible value for mass divided by volume. According to Kant’s theory, by contrast, two volumes of equal size could be completely filled in with matter and yet differ in their quantity of matter (their mass), and hence differ in their density (mass divided by volume). Another consequence of Kant’s theory that puts him at odds with the Cartesians and atomists was his claim that matter is elastic, hence compressible: a completely filled volume of matter could be reduced in volume while the quantity of matter remained unchanged (hence it would become denser). The Cartesians and atomists took this to be impossible.

At the end of his career, Kant worked on a project that was supposed to complete the connection between the transcendental philosophy and physics. Among other things, Kant attempted to give a transcendental, a priori demonstration of the existence of a ubiquitous “ether” that permeates all of space. Although Kant never completed a manuscript for this project (due primarily to the deterioration of his mental faculties at the end of his life), he did leave behind many notes and partial drafts. Many of these notes and drafts have been edited and published under the title Opus Postumum. 

b. Other Scientific Contributions

In addition to his major contributions to physics, Kant published various writings addressing different issues in the natural sciences. Early on he showed a great deal of interest in geology and earth science, as evidenced by the titles of some of his shorter essays: The question, Whether the Earth is Ageing, Considered from a Physical Point of View (1754); On the Causes of Earthquakes on the Occasion of the Calamity that Befell the Western Countries of Europe Towards the End of Last Year (1756); Continued Observations on the Earthquakes that Have been Experienced for Some Time (1756); New Notes to Explain the Theory of the Winds, in which, at the Same Time, He Invites Attendance to his Lectures (1756).

In 1755, he wrote the Succinct Exposition of Some Meditations on Fire (which he submitted to the university as a Master’s Thesis). There he argued, against the Cartesian mechanists, that physical phenomena such as fire can only be explained by appeal to elastic (that is, compressible) matter, which anticipated the mature physics of his Metaphysical Foundations (see 4a above).

One of Kant’s most lasting scientific contributions came from his early work in cosmology. In his Universal Natural History and Theory of the Heavens (1755), Kant gave a mechanical explanation of the formation of the solar system and the galaxies in terms of the principles of Newtonian physics. (A shorter version of the argument also appears in The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God from 1763.) Kant’s hypothesis was that a single mechanical process could explain why we observe an orbital motion of smaller bodies around larger ones at many different scales in the cosmos (moons around planets, planets around stars, and stars around the center of the galaxy). He proposed that at the beginning of creation, all matter was spread out more or less evenly and randomly in a kind of nebula. Since the various bits of matter all attracted each other through gravitation, bodies would move towards each other within local regions to form larger bodies. The largest of these became stars, and the smaller ones became moons or planets. Because everything was already in motion (due to the gravitational attraction of everything to everything), and because all objects would be pulled towards the center of mass of their local region (for example, the sun at the center of the solar system, or a planet at the center of its own smaller planetary system), the motion of objects within that region would become orbital motions (as described by Newton’s theory of gravity). Although the Universal Natural History was not widely read for most of Kant’s lifetime (due primarily to Kant’s publisher going bankrupt while the printed books remained in a warehouse), in 1796 Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) proposed a remarkably similar version of the same theory, and this caused renewed interest in Kant’s book. Today the theory is referred to as the “Kant-Laplace Nebular Hypothesis,” and a modified version of this theory is still held today.

Finally, in the second half of Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), Kant discusses the philosophical foundations of biology by way of an analysis of teleological judgments. While in no way a fully worked out biological theory per se, Kant connects his account of biological cognition in interesting ways to other important aspects of his philosophical system. First, natural organisms are essentially teleological, or “purposive.” This purposiveness is manifested through the organic structure of the organism: its many parts all work together to constitute the whole, and any one part only makes sense in terms of its relation to the healthy functioning of the whole. For instance, the teeth of an animal are designed to chew the kind of food that the animal is equipped to hunt or forage and that it is suited to digest. In this respect, biological entities bear a strong analogy to great works of art. Great works of art are also organic insofar as the parts only make sense in the context of the whole, and art displays a purposiveness similar to that found in nature (see section 7 below). Second, Kant discusses the importance of biology with respect to theological cognition. While he denies that the apparent design behind the purposiveness of organisms can be used as a proof for God’s existence (see 2g3 above), he does think that the purposiveness found in nature provides a sort of hint that there is an intelligible principle behind the observable, natural world, and hence that the ultimate purpose of all of nature is a rational one. In connection with his moral theory and theory of human history (see sections 5 and 6 below), Kant will argue that the teleology of nature can be understood as ultimately directed towards a culmination in a fully rational nature, that is, humanity in its (future) final form.

5. Moral Theory

Kant’s moral theory is organized around the idea that to act morally and to act in accordance with reason are one and the same. In virtue of being a rational agent (that is, in virtue of possessing practical reason, reason which is interested and goal-directed), one is obligated to follow the moral law that practical reason prescribes. To do otherwise is to act irrationally. Because Kant places his emphasis on the duty that comes with being a rational agent who is cognizant of the moral law, Kant’s theory is considered a form of deontology (deon– comes from the Greek for “duty” or “obligation”).

Like his theoretical philosophy, Kant’s practical philosophy is a priori, formal, and universal: the moral law is derived non-empirically from the very structure of practical reason itself (its form), and since all rational agents share the same practical reason, the moral law binds and obligates everyone equally. So what is this moral law that obligates all rational agents universally and a priori? The moral law is determined by what Kant refers to as the Categorical Imperative, which is the general principle that demands that one respect the humanity in oneself and in others, that one not make an exception for oneself when deliberating about how to act, and in general that one only act in accordance with rules that everyone could and should obey.

Although Kant insists that the moral law is equally binding for all rational agents, he also insists that the bindingness of the moral law is self-imposed: we autonomously prescribe the moral law to ourselves. Because Kant thinks that the kind of autonomy in question here is only possible under the presupposition of a transcendentally free basis of moral choice, the constraint that the moral law places on an agent is not only consistent with freedom of the will, it requires it. Hence, one of the most important aspects of Kant’s project is to show that we are justified in presupposing that our morally significant choices are grounded in a transcendental freedom (the very sort of freedom that Kant argued we could not prove through mere “theoretical” or “speculative” reason; see 2gii above).

This section aims to explain the structure and content of Kant’s moral theory (5a-b), and also Kant’s claims that belief in freedom, God, and the immortality of the soul are necessary “postulates” of practical reason (5c). (On the relation between Kant’s moral theory and his aesthetic theory, see 7c below.)

a. The Good Will and Duty

Kant lays out the case for his moral theory in Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (1785), Critique of Practical Reason (also known as the “Second Critique”; 1788), and the Metaphysics of Morals (1797). His arguments from the Groundwork are his most well-known and influential, so the following focuses primarily on them.

Kant begins his argument from the premise that a moral theory must be grounded in an account of what is unconditionally good. If something is merely conditionally good, that is, if its goodness depends on something else, then that other thing will either be merely conditionally good as well, in which case its goodness depends on yet another thing, or it will be unconditionally good. All goodness, then, must ultimately be traceable to something that is unconditionally good. There are many things that we typically think of as good but that are not truly unconditionally good. Beneficial resources such as money or power are often good, but since these things can be used for evil purposes, their goodness is conditional on the use to which they are put. Strength of character is generally a good thing, but again, if someone uses a strong character to successfully carry out evil plans, then the strong character is not good. Even happiness, according to Kant, is not unconditionally good. Although all humans universally desire to be happy, if someone is happy but does not deserve their happiness (because, for instance, their happiness results from stealing from the elderly), then it is not good for the person to be happy. Happiness is only good on the condition that the happiness is deserved.

Kant argues that there is only one thing that can be considered unconditionally good: a good will. A person has a good will insofar as they form their intentions on the basis of a self-conscious respect for the moral law, that is, for the rules regarding what a rational agent ought to do, one’s duty. The value of a good will lies in the principles on the basis of which it forms its intentions; it does not lie in the consequences of the actions that the intentions lead to. This is true even if a good will never leads to any desirable consequences at all: “Even if… this will should wholly lack the capacity to carry out its purpose… then, like a jewel, it would still shine by itself, as something that has its full worth in itself” (4:393). This is in line with Kant’s emphasis on the unconditional goodness of a good will: if a will were evaluated in terms of its consequences, then the goodness of the will would depend on (that is, would be conditioned on) those consequences. (In this respect, Kant’s deontology is in stark opposition to consequentialist moral theories, which base their moral evaluations on the consequences of actions rather than the intentions behind them.)

b. The Categorical Imperative

If a good will is one that forms its intentions on the basis of correct principles of action, then we want to know what sort of principles these are. A principle that commands an action is called an “imperative.” Most imperatives are “hypothetical imperatives,” that is, they are commands that hold only if certain conditions are met. For instance: “if you want to be a successful shopkeeper, then cultivate a reputation for honesty.” Since hypothetical imperatives are conditioned on desires and the intended consequences of actions, they cannot serve as the principles that determine the intentions and volitions of an unconditionally good will. Instead, we require what Kant calls a “categorical imperative.” Where hypothetical imperatives take the form, “if y is desired/intended/sought, do x,” categorical imperatives simply take the form, “do x.” Since a categorical imperative is stripped of all reference to the consequences of an action, it is thereby stripped of all determinate content, and hence it is purely formal. And since it is unconditional, it holds universally. Hence a categorical imperative expresses only the very form of a universally binding law: “nothing is left but the conformity of actions as such with universal law” (4:402). To act morally, then, is to form one’s intentions on the basis of the very idea of a universal principle of action.

This conception of a categorical imperative leads Kant to his first official formulation of the categorical imperative itself: “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (4:421). A maxim is a general rule that can be used to determine particular courses of actions in particular circumstances. For instance, the maxim “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble” can be used to determine the decision to lie about an adulterous liaison. The categorical imperative offers a decision procedure for determining whether a given course of action is in accordance with the moral law. After determining what maxim one would be basing the action in question on, one then asks whether it would be possible, given the power (in an imagined, hypothetical scenario), to choose that everyone act in accordance with that same maxim. If it is possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, then the action under consideration is morally permissible. If it is not possible to will that everyone act according to that maxim, the action is morally impermissible. Lying to cover up adultery is thus immoral because one cannot will that everyone act according to the maxim, “I shall lie when it will get me out of trouble.” Note that it is not simply that it would be undesirable for everyone to act according to that maxim. Rather, it would be impossible. Since everyone would know that everyone else was acting according to that maxim, there would never be the presupposition that anyone was telling the truth; the very act of lying, of course, requires such a presupposition on the part of the one being lied to. Hence, the state of affairs where everyone lies to get out of trouble can never arise, so it cannot be willed to be a universal law. It fails the test of the categorical imperative.

The point of Kant’s appeal to the universal law formulation of the categorical imperative is to show that an action is morally permissible only if the maxim on which the action is based could be affirmed as a universal law that everyone obeys without exception. The mark of immorality, then, is that one makes an exception for oneself. That is, one acts in a way that they would not want everyone else to. When someone chooses to lie about an adulterous liaison, one is implicitly thinking, “in general people should tell the truth, but in this case I will be the exception to the rule.”

Kant’s first formulation of the categorical imperative describes it in terms of the very form of universal law itself. This formal account abstracts from any specific content that the moral law might have for living, breathing human beings. Kant offers a second formulation to address the material side of the moral law. Since the moral law has to do with actions, and all actions are by definition teleological (that is, goal-directed), a material formulation of the categorical imperative will require an appeal to the “ends” of human activity. Some ends are merely instrumental, that is, they are sought only because they serve as “means” towards further ends. Kant argues that the moral law must be aimed at an end that is not merely instrumental, but is rather an end in itself. Only rational agents, according to Kant, are ends in themselves. To act morally is thus to respect rational agents as ends in themselves. Accordingly, the categorical imperative can be reformulated as follows: “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (4:429). The basic idea here is that it is immoral to treat someone as a thing of merely instrumental value; persons have an intrinsic (non-instrumental) value, and the moral law demands that we respect this intrinsic value. To return to the example of the previous paragraphs, it would be wrong to lie about an adulterous liaison because by withholding the truth one is manipulating the other person to make things easier for oneself; this sort of manipulation, however, amounts to treating the other as a thing (as a mere means to the comfort of not getting in trouble), and not as a person deserving of respect and entitled to the truth.

The notion of a universal law provides the form of the categorical imperative and rational agents as ends in themselves provide the matter. These two sides of the categorical imperative are combined into yet a third formulation, which appeals to the notion of a “kingdom of ends.” A kingdom of ends can be thought of as a sort of perfectly just utopian ideal in which all citizens of this kingdom freely respect the intrinsic worth of the humanity in all others because of an autonomously self-imposed recognition of the bindingness of the universal moral law for all rational agents. The third formulation of the categorical imperative is simply the idea that one should act in whatever way a member of this perfectly just society would act: “act in accordance with the maxims of a member giving universal laws for a merely possible kingdom of ends” (4:439). The idea of a kingdom of ends is an ideal (hence the “merely possible”). Although humanity may never be able to achieve such a perfect state of utopian coexistence, we can at least strive to approximate this state to an ever greater degree.

c. Postulates of Practical Reason

In Critique of Pure Reason, Kant had argued that although we can acknowledge the bare logical possibility that humans possess free will, that there is an immortal soul, and that there is a God, he also argued that we can never have positive knowledge of these things (see 2g above). In his ethical writings, however, Kant complicates this story. He argues that despite the theoretical impossibility of knowledge of these objects, belief in them is nevertheless a precondition for moral action (and for practical cognition generally). Accordingly, freedom, immortality, and God are “postulates of practical reason.” (The following discussion draws primarily on Critique of Practical Reason.)

We will start with freedom. Kant argues that morality and the obligation that comes with it are only possible if humans have free will. This is because the universal laws prescribed by the categorical imperative presuppose autonomy (autos = self; nomos = law). To be autonomous is to be the free ground of one’s own principles, or “laws” of action. Kant argues that if we presuppose that humans are rational and have free will, then his entire moral theory follows directly. The problem, however, lies in justifying the belief that we are free. Kant had argued in the Second Analogy of Experience that every event in the natural world has a “determining ground,” that is, a cause, and so all human actions, as natural events, themselves have deterministic causes (see 2f above). The only room for freedom of the will would lie in the realm of things in themselves, which contains the noumenal correlate of my phenomenal self. Since things in themselves are unknowable, I can never look to them to get evidence that I possess transcendental freedom. Kant gives at least two arguments to justify belief in freedom as a precondition of his moral theory. (There is a great deal of controversy among commentators regarding the exact form of his arguments, as well as their success. It will not be possible to adjudicate those disputes in any detail here. See Section 10 (References and Further Readings) for references to some of these commentaries.)

In the Groundwork, Kant suggests that the presupposition that we are free follows as a consequence of the fact that we have practical reason and that we think of ourselves as practical agents. Any time I face a choice that requires deliberation, I must consider the options before me as really open. If I thought of my course of action as already determined ahead of time, then there would not really be any choice to make. Furthermore, in taking my deliberation to be real, I also think of the possible outcomes of my actions as caused by me. The notion of a causality that originates in the self is the notion of a free will. So the very fact that I do deliberate about what actions I will take means that I am presupposing that my choice is real and hence that I am free. As Kant puts it, all practical agents act “under the idea of freedom” (4:448). It is not obvious that this argument is strong enough for Kant’s purposes. The position seems to be that I must act as though I am free, but acting as though I am free in no way entails that I really am free. At best, it seems that since I act as though I am free, I thereby must act as though morality really does obligate me. This does not establish that the moral law really does obligate me.

In the Second Critique, Kant offers a different argument for the reality of freedom. He argues that it is a brute “fact of reason” (5:31) that the categorical imperative (and so morality generally) obligates us as rational agents. In other words, all rational agents are at least implicitly conscious of the bindingness of the moral law on us. Since morality requires freedom, it follows that if morality is real, then freedom must be real too. Thus this “fact of reason” allows for an inference to the reality of freedom. Although the conclusion of this argument is stronger than the earlier argument, its premise is more controversial. For instance, it is far from obvious that all rational agents are conscious of the moral law. If they were, how come no one discovered this exact moral law before 1785 when Kant wrote the Groundwork? Equally problematic, it is not clear why this “fact of reason” should count as knowledge of the bindingness of the moral law. It may just be that we cannot help but believe that the moral law obligates us, in which case we once again end up merely acting as though we are free and as though the moral law is real.

Again, there is much debate in the literature about the structure and success of Kant’s arguments. It is clear, however, that the success of Kant’s moral project stands or falls with his arguments for freedom of the will, and that the overall strength of this theory is determined to a high degree by the epistemic status of our belief in our own freedom.

Kant’s arguments for immortality and God as postulates of practical reason presuppose that the reality of the moral law and the freedom of the will have been established, and they also depend on the principle that “‘ought’ implies ‘can’”: one cannot be obligated to do something unless the thing in question is doable. For instance, there is no sense in which I am obligated to single-handedly solve global poverty, because it is not within my power to do so. According to Kant, the ultimate aim of a rational moral agent should be to become perfectly moral. We are obligated to strive to become ever more moral. Given the “ought implies can” principle, if we ought to work towards moral perfection, then moral perfection must be possible and we can become perfect. However, Kant holds that moral perfection is something that finite rational agents such as humans can only progress towards, but not actually attain in any finite amount of time, and certainly not within any one human lifetime. Thus the moral law demands an “endless progress” towards “complete conformity of the will with the moral law” (5:122). This endless progress towards perfection can only be demanded of us if our own existence is endless. In short, one’s belief that one should strive towards moral perfection presupposes the belief in the immortality of the soul.

In addition to the “ought implies can” principle, Kant’s argument about belief in God also involves an elaboration of the notion of the “highest good” at which all moral action aims (at least indirectly). According to Kant, the highest good, that is, the most perfect possible state for a community of rational agents, is not only one in which all agents act in complete conformity with the moral law. It is also a state in which these agents are happy. Kant had argued that although everyone naturally desires to be happy, happiness is only good when one deserves to be happy. In the ideal scenario of a morally perfect community of rational agents, everyone deserves to be happy. Since a deserved happiness is a good thing, the highest good will involve a situation in which everyone acts in complete conformity with the moral law and everyone is completely happy because they deserve to be. Now since we are obligated to work towards this highest good, this complete, universal, morally justified happiness must be possible (again, because “ought” implies “can”). This is where a puzzle arises. Although happiness is connected to morality at the conceptual level when one deserves happiness, there is no natural connection between morality and happiness. Our happiness depends on the natural world (for example, whether we are healthy, whether natural disasters affect us), and the natural world operates according to laws that are completely separate from the laws of morality. Accordingly, acting morally is in general no guarantee that nature will make it possible for one to be happy. If anything, behaving morally will often decrease one’s happiness (for doing the right thing often involves doing the uncomfortable, difficult thing). And we all have plenty of empirical evidence from the world we live in that often bad things happen to good people and good things happen to bad people. Thus if the highest good (in which happiness is proportioned to virtue) is possible, then somehow there must be a way for the laws of nature to eventually lead to a situation in which happiness is proportioned to virtue. (Note that since at this point in the argument, Kant takes himself to have established immortality as a postulate of practical reason, this “eventually” may very well be far in the future). Since the laws of nature and the laws of morality are completely separate on their own, the only way that the two could come together such that happiness ends up proportioned to virtue would be if the ultimate cause and ground of nature set up the world in such a way that the laws of nature would eventually lead to the perfect state in question. Therefore, the possibility of the highest good requires the presupposition that the cause of the world is intelligent and powerful enough to set nature up in the right way, and also that it wills in accordance with justice that eventually the laws of nature will indeed lead to a state in which the happiness of rational agents is proportioned to their virtue. This intelligent, powerful, and just cause of the world is what traditionally goes by the name of “God.” Hence God is a postulate of practical reason.

6. Political Theory and Theory of Human History

Kant’s ethical theory emphasized reason, autonomy, and a respect for the humanity of others. These central aspects of his theory of individual moral choice are carried over to his theories of humanity’s history and of ideal political organization. This section covers Kant’s teleological history of the human race (6a), the basic elements of his political theory (6b), and his theory of the possibility of world peace (6c).

a. Human History and the Age of Enlightenment

Kant’s socio-political philosophy must be understood in terms of his understanding of the history of humanity, of its teleology, and in terms of his particular time and place: Europe during the Enlightenment.

In his short essay “Idea for a Universal History with a Cosmopolitan Purpose” (1784), Kant outlines a speculative sketch of humanity’s history organized around his conception of the teleology intrinsic to the species. The natural purpose of humanity is the development of reason. This development is not something that can take place in one individual lifetime, but is instead the ongoing project of humanity across the generations. Nature fosters this goal through both human physiology and human psychology. Humans have no fur, claws, or sharp teeth, and so if we are to be sheltered and fed, we must use our reason to create the tools necessary to satisfy our needs. More importantly, at the cultural level, Kant argues that human society is characterized by an “unsocial sociability”: on the one hand, humans need to live with other humans and we feel incomplete in isolation; but on the other, we frequently disagree with each other and are frustrated when others don’t agree with us on important matters. The frustration brought on by disagreement serves as an incentive to develop our capacity to reason so that we can argue persuasively and convince others to agree with us.

By means of our physiological deficiencies and our unsocial sociability, nature has nudged us, generation by generation, to develop our capacity for reason and slowly to emerge from the hazy fog of pre-history up to the present. This development is not yet complete. Kant takes stock of where we were in his day, in late 18th c. Prussia) in his short, popular essay: “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” (1784). To be enlightened, he argues, is to determine one’s beliefs and actions in accordance with the free use of one’s reason. The process of enlightenment is humanity’s “emergence from its self-incurred immaturity” (8:35), that is, the emergence from an uncritical reliance on the authority of others (for example, parents, monarchs, or priests). This is a slow, on-going process. Kant thought that his own age was an age of enlightenment, but not yet a fully enlightened age.

The goal of humanity is to reach a point where all interpersonal interactions are conducted in accordance with reason, and hence in accordance with the moral law (this is the idea of a kingdom of ends described in 5b above). Kant thinks that there are two significant conditions that must be in place before such an enlightened age can come to be. First, humans must live in a perfectly just society under a perfectly just constitution. Second, the nations of the world must coexist as an international federation in a state of “perpetual peace.” Some aspects of the first condition are discussed in 6b, and of the second in 6c.

b. Political Theory

Kant fullest articulation of his political theory appears in the “Doctrine of Right,” which is the first half of Metaphysics of Morals (1797). In line with his belief that a freedom grounded in rationality is what bestows dignity upon human beings, Kant organizes his theory of justice around the notion of freedom: “Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law, or if on its maxim the freedom of choice of each can coexist with everyone’s freedom in accordance with a universal law” (6:230). Implicit in this definition is a theory of equality: everyone should be granted the same degree of freedom. Although a state, through the passing and enforcing of laws, necessarily restricts freedom to some degree, Kant argues that this is necessary for the preservation of equality of human freedom. This is because when the freedoms of all are unchecked (for example, in the state of nature, which is also a condition of anarchy), the strong will overpower the weak and infringe on their freedoms, in which case freedoms will not be distributed equally, contrary to Kant’s basic principle of right. Hence a fair and lawful coercion that restricts freedom is consistent with and required by maximal and equal degrees of freedom for all.

Kant holds that republicanism is the ideal form of government. In a republic, voters elect representatives and these representatives decide on particular laws on behalf of the people. (Kant shows that he was not free of the prejudices of his day, and claims, with little argument, that neither women nor the poor should be full citizens with voting rights.) Representatives are duty-bound to choose these laws from the perspective of the “general will” (a term Kant borrows from Rousseau), rather than from the perspective of the interests of any one individual or group within society. Even though the entire population does not vote on each individual law, a law is said to be just only in case an entire population of rational agents could and would consent to the law. In this respect, Kant’s theory of just law is analogous to his universal law formulation of the categorical imperative: both demand that it be possible in principle for everyone to affirm the rule in question (see 5b above).

Among the freedoms that ought to be respected in a just society (republican or otherwise) are the freedom to pursue happiness in any way one chooses (so long as this pursuit does not infringe the rights of others, of course), freedom of religion, and freedom of speech. These last two are especially important to Kant and he associated them with the ongoing enlightenment of humanity in “What is Enlightenment?” He argues that it “would be a crime against human nature” (8:39) to legislate religious doctrine because doing so would be to deny to humans the very free use of reason that makes them human. Similarly, restrictions on what Kant calls the “public use of one’s reason” are contrary to the most basic teleology of the human species, namely, the development of reason. Kant himself had felt the sting of an infringement on these rights when the government of Friedrich Wilhelm II (the successor to Frederick the Great) prohibited Kant from publishing anything further on matters pertaining to religion.

c. Perpetual Peace

Kant elaborates the cosmopolitan theory first proposed in “Idea for a Universal History” in his Towards Perpetual Peace (1795). The basic idea is that world peace can be achieved only when international relations mirror, in certain respects, the relations between individuals in a just society. Just as people cannot be traded as things, so too states cannot be traded as though they were mere property. Just as individuals must respect others’ rights to free self-determination, so too, “no state shall forcibly interfere in the constitution and government of another state” (8:346). And in general, just as individuals need to arrange themselves into just societies, states, considered as individuals themselves, must arrange themselves into a global federation, a “league of nations” (8:354). Of course, until a state of perpetual peace is reached, wars will be inevitable. Even in times of wars, however, certain laws must be respected. For instance, it is never permissible for hostilities to become so violent as to undermine the possibility of a future peace treaty.

Kant argued that republicanism is especially conducive to peace, and he argued that perpetual peace would require that all states be republics. This is because the people will only consent to a war if they are willing to bear the economic burdens that war brings, and such a cost will only be worthwhile when there is a truly dire threat. If only the will of the monarch is required to go to war, since the monarch will not have to bear the full burden of the war (the cost will be distributed among the subjects), there is much less disincentive against war.

According to Kant, war is the result of an imbalance or disequilibrium in international relations. Although wars are never desirable, they lead to new conditions in international relations, and sometimes these new conditions are more balanced than the previous ones. When they are more balanced, there is less chance of new war occurring. Overall then, although the progression is messy and violent along the way, the slow march towards perpetual peace is a process in which all the states of the world slowly work towards a condition of balance and equilibrium.

7. Theory of Art and Beauty

Kant’s most worked out presentation of his views on aesthetics appears in Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), also known as the “Third Critique.” As the title implies, Kant’s aesthetic theory is cashed out through an analysis of the operations of the faculty of judgment. That is, Kant explains what it is for something to be beautiful by explaining what goes into the judgment that something is beautiful. This section explains the structure of aesthetic judgments of the beautiful and the sublime (7a), summarizes Kant’s theory of art and the genius behind art (7b), and finally explains the connection between Kant’s aesthetic theory and his moral theory (7c).

a. The Beautiful and the Sublime

Kant holds that there are three different types of aesthetic judgments: judgments of the agreeable, of the beautiful, and of the sublime. The first is not particularly interesting, because it pertains simply to whatever objects happen to cause us (personally) pleasure or pain. There is nothing universal about such judgments. If one person finds botanical gin pleasant and another does not, there is no disagreement, simply different responses to the stimulus. Judgments of the beautiful and the sublime, however, are more interesting and worth spending some time on.

Let us consider judgments of beauty (which Kant calls “judgments of taste”) first. Kant argues that all judgments of taste involve four components, or “moments.” First, judgments of taste involve a subjective yet disinterested enjoyment. We have an appreciation for the object without desiring it. This contrasts judgments of taste from both cognitions, which represent objects as they are rather than how they affect us, and desires, which represent objects in terms of what we want. Second, judgments of taste involve universality. When we judge an object to be beautiful, implicit in the judgment is the belief that everyone should judge the object in the same way. Third, judgments of taste involve the form of purposiveness, or “purposeless purposiveness.” Beautiful objects seem to be “for” something, even though there is nothing determinate that they are for. Fourth, judgments of taste involve necessity. When presented with a beautiful object, I take it that I ought to judge it as beautiful. Taken together, the theory is this: when I judge something as beautiful, I enjoy the object without having any desires with respect to it, I believe that everyone should judge the object to be beautiful, I represent some kind of purposiveness in it, but without applying any concepts that would determine its specific purpose, and I also represent myself as being obligated to judge it to be beautiful. Judgments of beauty are thus quite peculiar. On the one hand, when we say an object is beautiful, it is not the same sort of predication as when I say something is green, is a horse, or fits in a breadbox. Yet it is not for that reason a purely subjective, personal judgment because of the necessity and intersubjective universality involved in such judgments.

A further remark is in order regarding the “form of purposiveness” in judgments of taste. Kant wants to emphasize that no determinate concepts are involved in judgments of taste, but that the “reflective” power of judgment (that is, judgment’s ability to seek to find a suitable concept to fit an object) is nevertheless very active during such judgments. When I encounter an unfamiliar object, my reflective judgment is set in motion and seeks a concept until I figure out what sort of thing the object is. When I encounter a beautiful object, the form of purposiveness in the object also sets my reflecting judgment in motion, but no determinate concept is ever found for the object. Although this might be expected to lead to frustration, Kant instead claims that it provokes a “free play” (5:217) between the imagination and understanding. Kant does not say as much about this “free play” as one would like, but the idea seems to be that since the experience is not constrained by a determinate concept that must be applied to the object, the imagination and understanding are free to give in to a lively interplay of thought and emotion in response to the object. The experience of this free play of the faculties is the part of the aesthetic experience that we take to be enjoyable.

Aside from judgments of taste, there is another important form of aesthetic experience: the experience of the sublime. According to Kant, the experience of the sublime occurs when we face things (whether natural or manmade) that dwarf the imagination and make us feel tiny and insignificant in comparison. When we face something so large that we cannot come up with a concept to adequately capture its magnitude, we experience a feeling akin to vertigo. A good example of this is the “Deep Field” photographs from the Hubble Telescope. We already have trouble comprehending the enormity of the Milky Way, but when we see an image containing thousands of other galaxies of approximately the same size, the mind cannot even hope to comprehend the immensity of what is depicted. Although this sort of experience can be disconcerting, Kant also says that a disinterested pleasure (similar to the pleasure in the beautiful) is experienced when the ideas of reason pertaining to the totality of the cosmos are brought into play. Although the understanding can have no empirical concept of such an indeterminable magnitude, reason has such an idea (in Kant’s technical sense of “idea”; see 2g above), namely, the idea of the world as an indefinitely large totality. This feeling that reason can subsume and capture even the totality of the immeasurable cosmos leads to the peculiar pleasure of the sublime.

b. Theory of Art

Both natural objects and manmade art can be judged to be beautiful. Kant suggests that natural beauties are purest, but works of art are especially interesting because they result from human genius. The following briefly summarizes Kant’s theory of art and genius.

Although art must be manmade and not natural, Kant holds that art is beautiful insofar as it imitates the beauty of nature. Specifically, a beautiful work of art must display the “form of purposiveness” (described above, 7a) that can be encountered in the natural world. What makes great art truly great, though, is that it is the result of genius in the artist. According to Kant, genius is the innate talent possessed by the exceptional, gifted individual that allows that individual to translate an intangible “aesthetic idea” into a tangible work of art. Aesthetic ideas are the counterparts to the ideas of reason (see 2g above): where ideas of reason are concepts for which no sensible intuition is adequate, aesthetic ideas are representations of the imagination for which no concept is adequate (this is in line with Kant’s claim that beauty is not determinately conceptualizable).  When a genius is successful at exhibiting an aesthetic idea in a beautiful work of art, the work will provoke the “free play” of the faculties described above (7a).

Kant divides the arts into three groups: the arts of speech (rhetoric and poetry), pictorial arts (sculpture, architecture, and painting), and the art of the play of sensations (music and “the art of colors”) (5:321ff.). These can, of course, be combined together. For instance opera combines music and poetry into song, and combines this with theatre (which Kant considers a form of painting). Kant deems poetry the greatest of the arts because of its ability to stimulate the imagination and understanding and expand the mind through reflection. Music is the most successful if judged in terms of “charm and movement of the mind” (5:328), because it evokes the affect and feeling of human speech, but without being constrained by the determinate concepts of actual words. However, if the question is which art advances culture the most, Kant thinks that painting is better than music.

One consequence of Kant’s theory of art is that the contemporary notion of “conceptual art” is a contradiction in terms: if there is a specific point or message (a determinate concept) that the artist is trying to get across, then the work cannot provoke the indeterminate free play that is necessary for the experience of the beautiful. At best, such works can be interesting or provocative, but not truly beautiful and hence not truly art.

c. Relation to Moral Theory

A final important aspect of Kant’s aesthetic theory is his claim that beauty is a “symbol” of morality (5:351ff.), and aesthetic judgment thereby functions as a sort of “propaedeutic” for moral cognition. This is because certain aspects of judgments of taste (see 7a above) are analogous in important respects to moral judgments. The immediacy and disinterestedness of aesthetic appreciation corresponds to the demand that moral virtue be praised even when it does not lead to tangibly beneficial consequences: it is good in itself. The free play of the faculties involved in appreciation of the beautiful reminds one of the freedom necessary for and presupposed by morality. And the universality and necessity involved in aesthetic judgments correspond to the universality and necessity of the moral law. In short, Kant holds that a cultivated sensitivity to aesthetic pleasures helps prepare the mind for moral cognition. Aesthetic appreciation makes one sensitive to the fact that there are pleasures beyond the merely agreeable just as there are goods beyond the merely instrumental.

8. Pragmatic Anthropology

Together with a course on “physical geography” (a study of the world), Kant taught a class on “pragmatic anthropology” almost every year of his career as a university teacher. Towards the end of his career, Kant allowed his collected lecture notes for his anthropology course to be edited and published as Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1789). Anthropology, for Kant, is simply the study of human nature. Pragmatic anthropology is useful, practical knowledge that students would need in order to successfully navigate the world and get through life.

The Anthropology is interesting in two very different ways. First, Kant presents detailed discussions of his views on issues related to empirical psychology, moral psychology, and aesthetic taste that fill out and give substance to the highly abstract presentations of his writings in pure theoretical philosophy. For instance, although in the theory of experience from Critique of Pure Reason Kant argues that we need sensory intuitions in order to have empirical cognition of the world, he does not explain in any detail how our specific senses—sight, hearing, touch, taste, smell—contribute to this cognition. The Anthropology fills in a lot of this story. For instance, we learn that sight and hearing are necessary for us to represent objects as public and intersubjectively available. And we learn that touch is necessary for us to represent objects as solid, and hence as substantial. With respect to his moral theory, many of Kant’s ethical writings can give the impression that emotions and sentiments can only work against morality, and that only pure reason can incline one towards the good. In the Anthropology Kant complicates this story, informing us that nature has implanted sentiments of compassion to incline us towards the good, even in the absence of a developed reason. Once reason has been developed, it can promote an “enthusiasm of good resolution” (7:254) through attention to concrete instances of virtuous action, in which case desire can work in cooperation with reason’s moral law, not against it. Kant also supplements his moral theory through pedagogical advice about how to cultivate an inclination towards moral behavior.

The other aspect of the Anthropology (and the student transcripts of his actual lectures) that makes it so interesting is that the wealth and range of examples and discussions gives a much fuller picture of Kant the person than we can get from his more technical writings. The many examples present a picture of a man with wide-ranging opinions on all aspects of the human experience. There are discussions of dreams, humor, boredom, personality-types, facial expressions, pride and greed, gender and race issues, and more. We even get some fashion advice: it is acceptable to wear yellow under a blue coat, but gaudy to wear blue under a yellow coat. There has been a great deal of renewed interest in Kant’s anthropological writings and many commentators have been appealing to these often neglected texts as a helpful resource that provides contextualization of Kant’s more widely studied theoretical output.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Literature

The best scholarly, English translations of Kant’s work are published by Cambridge University Press as the Cambridge Editions of the Works of Immanuel Kant. The following are from that collection and contain some of Kant’s most important and influential writings.

  • Critique of Pure Reason, trans. Paul Guyer and Allen Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Practical Philosophy, ed. Mary Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. (Contains most of Kant’s ethical writings, including Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, Critique of Practical Reason, and Metaphysics of Morals.)
  • Critique of the Power of Judgment, trans. Paul Guyer and Eric MatthewsCambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, ed. David Walford. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. (Contains most of Kant’s “pre-critical” writings in theoretical philosophy.)
  • Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, eds. Henry Allison and Peter Heath. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002 (Contains Kant’s mature writings in theoretical philosophy, including Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics and Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science.)
  • History, Anthropology, and Education, eds. Günter Zöller and Robert Louden. . Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. (Contains, among other writings, Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View.)

b. Secondary Literature

  • Ernst Cassirer (Kant’s Life and Thought, tr. by James Haden. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1983 (originally written in 1916)) and Manfred Kuehn (Kant: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002) both offer intellectual biographies that situate the development of Kant’s thought within the context of his life and times.
  • For comprehensive discussions of the metaphysics and epistemology of Critique of Pure Reason, see Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987), Henry Allison (Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, Second Edition. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004), and Graham Bird (The Revolutionary Kant: A Commentary on the Critique of Pure Reason. Chicago: Open Court Press, 2006).
  • For treatments of Kant’s ethical theory, see Allen Wood (Kant’s Ethical Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999), Christine Korsgaard (Creating the Kingdom of Ends. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), and Onora O’Neill (Constructions of Reason: Explorations of Kant’s Practical Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).
  • For analyses of Kant’s aesthetic theory (as well as other issues from the Third Critique), see Rachel Zuckert (Kant on Beauty and Biology: An Interpretation of the ‘Critique of Judgment’. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), Paul Guyer (Kant and the Claims of Taste. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), and Henry Allison (Kant’s Theory of Taste: A Reading of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • For studies of Kant’s anthropology and theory of human nature, see Patrick Frierson (What is the Human Being? London: Routledge, 2013) and Alix Cohen (Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology and History. London: Palgrave Macmillan, 2009).


Author Information

Tim Jankowiak
Towson University
U. S. A.

The Meaning of Life: Early Continental and Analytic Perspectives

The question of the meaning of life is one that interests philosophers and non-philosophers alike. The question itself is notoriously ambiguous and possibly vague. In asking about the meaning of life, one may be asking about the essence of life, about life’s purpose, about whether and how anything matters, or a host of other things.

Not everyone is plagued by questions about life’s meaning, but some are. The circumstances in which one does ask about life’s meaning include those in which: one is well off but bothered by either a sense of dissatisfaction or the prospect of bad things to come; one is young at heart and has a sense of wonder; one is perplexed by the discordant plurality of things and wants to find some unity in all the diversity; or one has lost faith in old values and narratives and wants to know how to live in order to have a meaningful life.

We may read our ancestors in such a way that warrants the claim that the meaning of life has been a human concern from the beginning. But it was only early in the nineteenth century that writers began to write directly about “the meaning of life.” The most significant writers were: Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy. Schopenhauer ended up saying that the meaning of life is to deny it; Kierkegaard, that the meaning of life is to obey God passionately; Nietzsche, that the meaning of life is the will to power; and Tolstoy, that the meaning of life lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called “faith.”

In the twentieth century, in the Continental tradition, Heidegger held that the meaning of life is to live authentically or (alternatively) to be a guardian of the earth.  Sartre espoused the view that life is meaningless but urged us nonetheless to make a free choice that would give our lives meaning and responsibility. Camus also thought that life is absurd and meaningless. The best way to cope with this fact, he held, is to live life with passion, using everything up, and with an attitude of revolt, defiance, or scorn.

In the Anglo-American tradition, William James held that life is meaningful and worth living because of a spiritual order in which we should believe, or else that it is meaningful when there is a marriage of ideals with pluck, will, and the manly virtues; Bertrand Russell argued that to live a meaningful life one must abandon private and petty interests and instead cultivate an interest in the eternal; Moritz Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found in play; and A. J. Ayer asserted that the question of the meaning of life is itself meaningless.

All of these set the table for a veritable feast of philosophical writing on the meaning of life that began in the 1950s with Kurt Baier’s essay “The Meaning of Life,” followed in 1970 by Richard Taylor’s influential essay on the same topic, followed shortly by Thomas Nagel’s important 1971 essay on “The Absurd.” See “Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective” for more on the course of the debate in analytic philosophy about the meaning of life.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
    1. The Origin of the English Expression “the Meaning of Life”
    2. Questions about the Meaning of Life
    3. The Broader Historical Background
  2. Nineteenth Century Philosophers
    1. Schopenhauer
    2. Kierkegaard
    3. Nietzsche
    4. Tolstoy
    5. Some Common Aspects of the Lives of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy
  3. Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers
    1. Heidegger
    2. Sartre
    3. Camus
  4. Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers
    1. James
    2. Russell
    3. Schlick
    4. Tagore
    5. Ayer
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Background

a. The Origin of the English Expression “the Meaning of Life”

The English term “meaning” dates back to the fourteenth century C.E. Its origins, according to the Oxford English Dictionary (OED), lie in the Middle English word “meenyng” (also spelled “menaynge,” “meneyng,” and “mennyng”).

In its earliest occurrences, in English original compositions as well as in English translations of earlier works, meaning is most often what, on the one hand, sentences, utterances, and stories, and, on the other hand, dreams, visions, signs, omens, and rituals have or might have. One asks about the meaning of some puzzling utterance, or of the writing on the wall, or of the vision that appeared to somebody in the night, or of the ritual performed on a hallowed occasion. Meaning is often conceived of as something non-obvious and somewhat secretive, discernible only by a seer granted with special powers.

It is much later that life is spoken of as something that might, or might not, have meaning in this sense. Such speech would have to wait upon the development of the concept of life as something like a word, a linguistic utterance, a narrative, a story, a gesture, a puzzling episode, a sign, a dream, a vision, or a surface phenomenon that points to some deep inner essence, to which it would be proper to inquire into its meaning, or to apply epithets like “meaningful” or “meaningless.” One of the earliest instances of the occurrence of the concept “life” as such a thing, as signifying something that might or might not have something like meaning, appears in Shakespeare’s Macbeth (c. 1605), where Macbeth characterizes life as “a tale told by an idiot, full of sound and fury, signifying nothing.” But notice that even here the words “meaning” and “life” are not linked.

The OED‘s definition of “meaning” in something like our sense is “The significance, purpose, underlying truth, etc., of something.” Further elaboration of early uses of the word gives us, “That which is indicated or expressed by a (supposed) symbol or symbolic action; spec. a message, warning, idea, etc., supposed to be symbolized by a dream, vision, omen, etc.” A bit later, in one of its senses, meaning takes on the sense in which it is the “signification; intention; cause, purpose; motive, justification,” . . . “[o]f an action, condition, etc.” Finally we get the sense that most nearly concerns us here: “Something which gives one a sense of purpose, value, etc., esp. of a metaphysical or spiritual kind; the (perceived) purpose of existence or of a person’s life. Freq. in the meaning of life.” (All this is from the OED.)

The first English use of the expression “the meaning of life” appeared in 1834 in Thomas Carlyle’s (1795-1881) Sartor Resartus II. ix, where Teufelsdrockh observes, “our Life is compassed round with Necessity; yet is the meaning of Life itself no other than Freedom.” The usage shortly caught on, and over the next century and a half the phrase “the meaning of life” became common. The adjective “meaningful” did not appear until 1852, the noun “meaningfulness” until 1904.

b. Questions about the Meaning of Life

The most familiar form of the question(s) about the meaning of life is simply, “What is the meaning of life?” Although the form of the question is one, when it is asked, any one (or more) of several different senses may be intended. Here are some of the more common of them.

(1) In some cases, what the seeker seeks is the kernel, the inner reality, the core, or the essence, underlying some phenomenon. Thus one might ask what his essence, his true self is, and then feel that he has found the meaning of his life if he discovers that true self.

(2) In other cases, the question is about the point, aim, object, purpose, end, or goal of life, typically one’s own. Here, in some cases, the question is about some pre-existing purpose that the questioner might (or might not) discover; in other cases, the question might be about some end or purpose the agent might invent or create and give her life. The latter questioner, when she is successful, may believe that her life has a meaning because she herself has given it one.

(3) In yet other cases, the question of the meaning of life is that of whether our lives, and anything we do within them, matter, or have any sort of importance. If one can show that they matter, and in virtue of what they do, one will have provided a substantive answer to the question of the meaning of life. A common, but not universal, assumption on this score is that our lives have significance and importance only if they issue in some lasting achievement the ravages of time will not destroy.

(4) In still other cases, what bothers the questioner is the discord, plurality, and chaotic nature of his apparent empirical life as it is actually lived. He can make no sense of it; there is no rhyme or reason to it. The drive here, one might well think, is to see one’s life as intelligible, as something that makes sense. The discovery or invention of some kind of unity in his life would amount to an answer to his question, “What is the meaning of life?”

(5) Yet another thing the question about the meaning of life can be is a request for a narrative or picture, a way of seeing life (perhaps a metaphorical one) that enables one to make sense of it and achieve a sense of meaning while living it. And so we get “Life is a bowl of cherries” and various and sundry religious narratives.

(6) Sometimes what the questioner is really wondering is whether it makes sense to go on and his question is “Is life worth living?” He may actually be contemplating suicide. His predicament has to do with meaning if he is assuming that it makes sense to continue living only if (his) life has a suitable meaning, something which, at the moment, he can’t see it as having.

(7) Finally, the question of the meaning of life can be the question of how one should live in order to have a meaningful life, or, if such a life is impossible, then what the best way to live meaninglessly is.

The seven questions just distinguished may be, but need not be, discrete and self-contained. A given seeker may very well be interested in several of them at once and see them as intimately connected. For example, a person may be interested in his core or essence because he thinks that knowledge of that may reveal the goal or purpose of his life, a purpose that makes his life seem important and intelligible, and gives him a reason for going on, as well as insight into how he must live in order to have a meaningful life. It is commonly the case that several of the questions press themselves on the seeker all at the same time.

One or more of these questions were of concern to the philosophers discussed below. Some were concerned with nearly all of them. Distinct from all the above are second-order, analytic, conceptual questions of the sort that dominate current philosophical discussion of the issue in analytic circles. These questions are not so much about the meaning of life as about the meaning of “the meaning of life” and its component concepts (“meaning,” “life”), or related ones (“meaningfulness,” “meaninglessness,” “vanity,” “absurdity,” and so forth).

c. The Broader Historical Background

Although nineteenth century thinkers were the first in the West to put the question precisely in the form “What is the meaning of life?” concern with questions in what may be called “the meaning-of-life family,” that is, ultimate questions about life, the world, existence, and its purpose may be found, in the East and the West alike, almost as far back as we can trace human thought about anything. Thus Gilgamesh (c. 2000 B.C.E.) asked why he must die; the composers of The Rig Veda (c. 1200 B.C.E.) wondered where everything came from; Job (c. 500 B.C.E.) asked why he must suffer; the ancient Taoists (Laozi c. 500 B.C.E. and Zhuangzi c. 300 B.C.E.) asked what the origin or principle of everything is, and how one must live to be in accord with it; ancient Upanishadic seekers (500-300 B.C.E.) were much vexed with the nature of the true self and its end or goal; the Buddha (c. 500 B.C.E.), before he became the Buddha, sought an understanding of life that would enable one to overcome suffering; the author of The Bhagavad Gita (c. 200 B.C.E.) was concerned, as other Indian thinkers tended to be, with the identity and nature of the true self, and also with the question of how to live; the ancient Greeks of the classical period (c. 430-320 B.C.E.) talked about the goal or end of life and how to reach it; Epicurus (341-270 B.C.E.) followed suit and developed his own unique take on these matters; Qoheleth, the author of Ecclesiastes (c. 200 B.C.E.), was struck by the vanity or futility of everything and wondered how to deal with it; Greek and Roman Hellenistic philosophers (c. 300 B.C.E. – 250 C.E.)—Epicurean, Stoic, Cynic, Skeptic, and Neo-Platonist—wondered about the good and how to achieve it; Marcus Aurelius (121-180 C.E.) mused on his cosmic insignificance.

The Christian-dominated medieval period did not produce thinkers who asked in any radical way about the meaning of life, because everyone already had a perfectly good answer, the one provided by the Christian story. Still, even in medieval times, there was room for at least three questions in the meaning-of-life family. First, there was occasion for the questions when things ran counter to the Christian story, or to what one expected. Thus Boethius (480-525) was perplexed by the deep questions when, after a life of honor, piety, and power, he fell into disgrace, had everything stripped from him unaccountably and unjustly, and found himself faced with imprisonment that lead eventually to his execution. Second, though the great Christian philosopher-theologians thought they knew the meaning of life in outline, they still asked and answered questions about the details of the final or highest good of man. Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274), for example, who accepted with unblinking assurance the general answer supplied by Christianity, found himself wondering about the exact nature of the summum bonum (the highest good) and about how to square the Christian view of it with that of Aristotle. Third, other Christian believers, medieval ones as well as present-day ones with medieval outlooks, committed to an overall view of what is going on, may be vexed by the question of what God intends for them specifically and may worry about their “calling,” the particular purpose, role, or plan God has especially for them. Hence we find confirmed believers worried deeply about the question, “What is the meaning of my life?”

In any event, since the early modern period, there has been a resurgence of interest in fundamental meaning-of-life questions. Writers as diverse as Shakespeare (1564-1616), Pascal (1623-1662), Dr. Johnson (1709-84), Kant (1724-1804), and Hegel (1770-1831) have asked, in different forms, questions about life’s ultimate point, goal, or purpose, and they are just a few of the many religious, philosophical, and literary figures who have raised and (sometimes) answered ultimate questions in the meaning-of-life family prior to Schopenhauer’s work early in the nineteenth century. There have been philosophers too since Schopenhauer’s time who have addressed the big questions, but not explicitly in terms of “the meaning of life.” This article will confine itself largely to those philosophers who have explicitly put their concerns in those terms.

The standard explanation of the rise of questions about life’s meaning in the early modern period points to three or four distinct but related things: (1) the scientific revolution; (2) the Protestant Reformation; (3) voyages and travels of exploration and discovery, in which were encountered peoples with very different outlooks on the nature of the universe and the meaning of life; and (4), as a result of all of these, the evaporation of a widely held, firmly believed Christian conception of the nature of things.

2. Nineteenth Century Philosophers

Let us turn now to the story of what philosophers from Schopenhauer in the early 1800s to Ayer and Camus in the 1940s have had to say about the meaning of life.

a. Schopenhauer

The first Western philosopher to link the ideas of life and meaning, and to ask expressly “What is the meaning of life?” was the great German pessimist Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860). At least he was the first to ask the question and get it noticed by other philosophers. Schopenhauer, a contemporary of Carlyle, wrote in German, in which “the meaning of life” is “der Sinn des Lebens.” Profoundly influencing the thought of both Nietzsche and Tolstoy, Schopenhauer’s work may be regarded as the springboard that launched modern Western philosophical inquiry into the problem of the meaning of life. Here is the passage in which Schopenhauer explicitly asked the question:

Since a man does not alter, and his moral character remains absolutely the same all through his life; since   he must play out the part which he has received, without the least deviation from the character; since   neither experience, nor philosophy, nor religion can effect any improvement in him, the question arises, What is the meaning of life at all? (1860b) [emphasis added]

The circumstances under which concern with the problem of the meaning of life were, in Schopenhauer’s case, not merely academic but real and personal. Well off financially, but struggling with personal misery and a sense of loneliness and isolation, he felt driven to find some understanding of himself and of the world around him that seemed so bleak and senseless.

Schopenhauer’s philosophy begins with a metaphysical structure he inherited from Kant and more or less simply decrees. There is a difference between the thing-in-itself and the phenomenal world of appearances. The thing-in-itself is the will to live, or, more simply, the will. It is the fundamental power and reality that underlies all things. The world we know and live in, with its stupendous abundance of things and forms, is merely the phenomena of the will, the objectification of it, its mirror, something not entirely real, or not real at all. (There is also a pure, will-less subject of knowledge whose metaphysical status is unclear: sometimes it seems to be in the very realm of the will, the realm of true reality, of things-in-themselves; at other times it seems to be something like the first creation and objectification of the will.)

The will itself just wills. It is pretty nasty, perhaps demonic. It is a blind striving, craving, and grasping, aiming at nothing in the end, except to go on willing and aggrandizing itself. It has in itself an inner contradiction, manifest in the constant struggle and strife between the billions of individual objectifications of itself in the phenomenal world. I am one such objectification; you are another. My true self, my inner essence, is the will; the same is true of you: my essence and yours are one and the same. When we fight (as we usually do), the will is engaged in a battle with itself.

The phenomenal world is an awful place. It is full of misery, pain, suffering. Little happiness is found anywhere. The twin poles of human life are pain (want, desire, stress) and boredom. Almost everyone lives a life that, from without, is meaningless and insignificant and, from within, dull and senseless.

But what is the meaning of life? The question is appropriate because life as we know it is something like Macbeth’s tale told by an idiot, a “farce.” If the question is about life’s inner essence, Schopenhauer’s answer is simply “the will-to-live.” The meaning of life is the will.

Another way of taking the question “What is the meaning of life?” is to construe it as a question about the goal, point, aim, end, or purpose of life. When Schopenhauer explicitly asks the question (in On Human Nature), it is this sense of it he appears to have in mind. His answer is depressing. The point or purpose of life is to suffer. We are being punished for the crime of being born, punished for who we are, namely, the nasty thoroughly egoistic will. The meaning of life in this sense, then, is to suffer, to be punished for our sin.

Schopenhauer suggests a number of ways of thinking about our phenomenal, experienced life. All of them are pretty bleak. He recommends that we look upon our life: as an unprofitable episode interrupting the blessed calm of nothingness; as on the whole a disappointment, nay, a cheat; as Hell, in which on the one hand men are the tormented souls and on the other the tormenting devils; as a place of atonement, a sort of penal colony; as some kind of mistake; and as a process of disillusionment. Any or all of these could be taken as answers to the question “What is the meaning of life?” (or to the question “What is life?”)

If we ask what we should do, how we can give our lives worth and meaning, Schopenhauer does have an answer. “Salvation” lies in the total denial of the will. Knowledge of the will and its horrific phenomena can and should function as a quieter of the will, bringing it to a state in which it stops willing and effectively abolishes itself. Thinking in this vein, a Schopenhauerian might say that the meaning of life is to deny, quiet, and eventually abolish the will to live that is essentially oneself.

One naturally wants to know whether this is not just suicide—whether the cessation of willing simply means that one passes into a state of nothingness. Schopenhauer’s answer is “No.” The state of the will-less individual after death seems to be nothing to us; but our present state would seem to be nothing to him. His state is wonderful and blessed, but what it is like is inconceivable to us.

In our current state, when one denies the will in herself, she does not literally commit suicide. Suicide doesn’t work because it is itself a powerful act of willing. Instead, she practices self-denial and asceticism, cultivates detachment, stops wanting and pursuing the things most people go for; and although there is still some struggle with the dying will in her, on the whole her life becomes full of peace and joy. The will is quieted and eventually abolishes itself in the individual. Very few people are capable of doing this heroic thing, Schopenhauer says, but he himself does not claim to be one of these people.

For all the darkness of his philosophy, the moral for all of us—even those of us who are not prepared to totally deny the will—which Schopenhauer derives in the end is very much in the Christian/Buddhist vein. We should not be competitive or grasping or villainous, but rather we should show compassion and kindness to everyone, since everyone is always having a bad day in this hell we are all living in, and what we all need above all are love, compassion, help, and consideration. The fundamental principle of morality, which you should follow, is: Don’t hurt anyone; help everyone you can. Following this principle, one can achieve, short of complete denial of the will, a kind of half-way salvation.

Another of Schopenhauer’s points about meaning in life should be mentioned. It is that the meaningfulness of one’s life depends not on one’s outer circumstances but rather on the way one looks at life. People look at life differently, and so the meaningfulness of her life varies considerably from person to person. To one person life is barren, dull, and superficial; to another rich, interesting, and full of meaning.

b. Kierkegaard

A major nineteenth century European philosopher who continued the tradition of thought on the meaning of life was the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855). Kierkegaard was not an academic. The sources of his interest in problems of meaning seem to have been his not having to work for a living, his personal demons, his Nordic gloom, his congenital tendencies toward guilt, depression, anxiety, and dread, his awareness of increasing doubt all around him of the teachings of his inherited Christianity, and his agonizing failure to live up to his own Christian ideals, primarily because of his embodiment and its concomitant proclivity for the things of the flesh, especially sensuousness and sex.  Out of all that emerged what appears to be a severe case of self-loathing, which in turn prompted serious inquiry into the meaning of (his) life.

It is difficult to determine what Kierkegaard’s own views were on just about everything because he constantly used humor, satire, paradox, and irony, and even more because he spoke in different voices and wrote from different perspectives under different pseudonyms.

Nonetheless, the standard view is that Kierkegaard was fundamentally a Christian. He claimed that one’s life can be meaningful and worth living only if one believes genuinely and passionately in the Christian God.

And then there is the leap. Christian belief goes beyond rational evidence, and even conflicts with it. One must make a leap from knowledge to Christian faith—the only thing in which one can find true meaning—a leap over the confines of common sense and reason. One is to accept Christian faith even if (or just because?) it is absurd. For it is the only adequate source of the kind of meaning a human being has to have to keep on going with a sense that life is worthwhile.

Another way to describe Kierkegaard’s overall philosophy is to characterize it in terms of his three stages or levels of life. One should make an ascent from the lowest stage, the aesthetic (sensuous, even sensual), through the higher ethical stage, and on to the highest stage of all, the religious, which somehow baptizes and incorporates the two lower stages into itself. Only one who has reached the religious stage can have a truly meaningful life and thus a life worth living.

Whatever Kierkegaard’s own view was, we can make the following observations about things Kierkegaard (or one or other of his pseudonymous authors) said about the meaning of life.

(1) One thing is that life can seem meaningless. In the early work, Either/Or (1843), we find this passage: “How empty and meaningless life is.” Elsewhere in Either/Or we get similar thoughts and questions, for instance, “What, if anything, is the meaning of this life?” and “My life is utterly meaningless.” Perhaps, though, the idea is that, though life is often meaningless, it need not be so, and, when it is, it is because of some kind of failure of the liver (of the life, not the organ).

(2) A second interesting idea in Kierkegaard is that meaning has something to do with unity. In a meaningful life all the diverse aspects of it come together to form some kind of coherent whole. One pursues some one goal, to which everything in one’s life is subordinated.

(3) A third point, an important one, is that, though meaning is a good thing, it is possible for there to be too much meaning in one’s life, or in its parts. Kierkegaard observes:

 No part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he cannot forget it any moment he wants to; on the other hand, every single part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he can     remember it at any moment. (Either/Or)

To have one’s life full of meaning to the brim, to regard life and everything one does in it as infinitely significant, brings with it so much pressure and stress that one’s life becomes unbearable.

To me [says Kierkegaard] it seems . . . that to be known in time by God makes life enormously strenuous. Everywhere where he is present each half hour is of infinite importance. Yet to live like that for sixty years is unsupportable. It is difficult enough putting up even with the three years’ hard study for an examination, and those are still not as strenuous as half an hour like this. (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(4) A fourth idea about meaning in Kierkegaard is the idea that one can give one’s life meaning, or that one can acquire meaning in life, by doing something like devoting oneself to something. Of Antigone he says, “her life acquires meaning for her in its devotion to showing him [her father, after his death] the last honors daily, almost hourly, by her unbroken silence.” (Either/Or)

(5) Meaning does not come from abstract, objective knowledge of any kind, whether philosophical, or scientific, or historical, or even theological. It comes from some kind of faith, a faith that is passionately acquired and lived daily.

(6) One twentieth century approach to the problem of the meaning of life is to see, accept, and bask more or less happily in the absurdity of life. Kierkegaard anticipated this approach prophetically in his characterization of the “humorist.” Kierkegaard writes: “Weary of time and its endless succession, the humorist runs away and finds humorous relief in stating the absurd.” (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(7) Kierkegaard’s humorist also at one point expresses a view which is surprisingly rare, namely, the view that one’s life may have a meaning, but one doesn’t know what it is. Kierkegaard writes: “[L]et a humorist say what he has in mind and he will speak, for example, as follows: What is the meaning of life? Yes, good question. How should I know?” (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)

(8) Although Kierkegaard himself was a Christian who viewed meaning as ultimately grounded in religious faith, in one’s personal relation to a supernatural God, yet, paradoxically perhaps, and certainly in an admirable spirit of non-exclusivity, he said:

It is possible both to enjoy life and to give it meaning and substance outside Christianity, just as the most    famous poets and artists, the most eminent of thinkers, even men of piety, have lived outside Christianity (Concluding Unscientific Postscript).

(9) One finds in Kierkegaard the idea that life has meaning only insofar as it is related in some way to the Infinite. Nothing finite can supply the meaning of life.

On the whole, if for no other reason, Kierkegaard’s work is valuable because of its suggestiveness. Under one pseudonym or another, Kierkegaard made many important points which were taken up, or unfortunately overlooked, by subsequent philosophers concerned with the meaning of life.

c. Nietzsche

Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) cut his philosophical teeth on Schopenhauer and devoted himself in his later works—from 1883 up to the onset of insanity in January 1889—to struggle with, among other things, the meaning of life.

Nietzsche’s grand project was the revaluation of all values. Part of this project was that of giving to life a new meaning. Nietzsche’s interest in the matter was not merely academic. Coming up with new values and giving life a new meaning was a project that involved a total transformation of Nietzsche’s own self, early versions of which he became dissatisfied with. One thing Nietzsche wanted to do was to produce an affirmative philosophy of life to replace Schopenhauer’s pessimistic, life-denying philosophy.

Nietzsche rejected Schopenhauer’s picture of life as suffering, or punishment for one’s sin, together with its ethic of compassion toward the poor and the sick. Such a picture belonged to a weak, sick, decadent, nay-saying mode of being in decline. Nietzsche himself wanted to produce a positive, healthy, life-affirming philosophy, one suitable for life in the ascendant.

Sometimes, particularly early in his writings, Nietzsche seemed to think some end or other is required to make things meaningful. At times, both early and late, Nietzsche spoke as though the very concept of the meaning of something is the concept of its end, object, or goal.

In other places, however, Nietzsche spoke as if the meaning of life lies in freedom from, not in the achievement of, ends. Perhaps this should be construed as the rejection of given ends to be discovered, not in the rejection of all ends, particularly those one creates. Moritz Schlick—whose thought we will consider in more detail later—claimed that Nietzsche saw that life has no meaning so long as it stands wholly under the domination of purposes. In Nietzsche’s Zarathustra, “Sir Hazard,” expressing Nietzsche’s own considered view, says, “I have saved them from the slavery of ends.” (Klemke, 3rd ed., 63).

Nietzsche sometimes spoke as if life, before he came into it, or before he revaluated all values, had no meaning: “Sombre is human life, and as yet without meaning: a buffoon may be fateful to it” (Thus Spake Zarathustra, 1883). There is no meaning “out there” to be discovered, no meaning in the essences of things, apart from human will, desire, perspective. In fact, apart from perspective, there is no world out there at all, no “thing-in-itself,” no “facts-in-themselves.” But a psychologically strong person can do without things in themselves and meaning (already there) to be discovered in them. That is because he can organize a small part of the world himself and thus create meaning. In The Will to Power, Nietzsche speaks of “the creative strength to create meaning,” and he says:

It is a measure of the degree of strength of will to what extent one can do without meaning in things, to what extent one can endure to live in a meaningless world because one organizes a small portion of it oneself. (The Will to Power)

Whatever the meaning of life is, or is to be, it is terrestrial, not celestial. Meaning must not be placed in some fabricated “true world” but in this very earth in which we live and have our being. And the meaning of life is to be created, not discovered.

Still, somehow, man is not the meaning and measure of all things, though he has posited himself as such.

All the values by means of which we have tried so far to render the world estimable for ourselves and which then proved inapplicable and therefore devaluated the world—all these values are, psychologically considered, the results of certain perspectives of utility, designed to maintain and increase human constructs of domination—and they have been falsely projected into the essence of things. What we find here is still the hyperbolic naiveté of man: positing himself as the meaning and measure of the value of things. (The Will to Power)

The mistake lies in projecting our own values onto reality, in thinking that our meaning and values are present in things as such. But our meaning does not lie in “things-in-themselves.” It is created by us. If we then give things out there such and such a meaning, we should recognize that it is not a meaning we have found in the things themselves, but rather one that we have given them.

We can still ask, What is the meaning of life? What is the meaning we shall give to life? Nietzsche gives two different answers. One is that the meaning of life is the Übermensch (sometimes translated as ‘Superman’), Nietzsche’s post-human creator of meaning, affirmer of life, and bearer of values.

I want to teach men the sense of their existence, which is the Superman, the lightning out of the dark cloud—man. (Thus Spake Zarathustra)

The Superman is the meaning of the earth. Let your will say: The Superman SHALL BE the meaning of the earth! (Thus Spake Zarathustra)

The other answer is that the meaning of life is the will to power.

All meaning is will to power. (The Will to Power)

On the surface these two answers are different. But perhaps they are consistent. Perhaps what the will to power generates is the Superman, or what the Superman represents is the will to power. Again, perhaps the will to power is the meaning of life in the sense of its kernel or essence, while the Superman is its meaning in the sense of its end or goal.

Nietzsche’s view has some aspects or consequences that should be noted. One consequence of Nietzsche’s view is that the meaning of life is absent in the old and the sick. He acknowledged the fact. Another consequence (or perhaps component) of Nietzsche’s view is that nihilism, the denial of all value, is a transitional stage, not the finale. Yet another consequence is that the meaning of life is not about the predominance of pleasure over pain. Concern with that evidences only nihilism. Finally, it may be conjectured that Nietzsche would probably regard with scorn those of us in the current debate among academic philosophers about the meaning of life. He would consider us “minute” philosophers:

The study of the minute philosophers is only interesting for the recognition that they have reached those stages in the great edifice of philosophy where learned disquisitions for and against, where hair-splitting objections and counter-objections are the rule: and for that reason they evade the demand of every great philosophy to speak sub specie aeternitatis. (Nietzsche, 1874)

d. Tolstoy

One of the next thinkers in the Western intellectual tradition to ask seriously the question, “What is the meaning of life?” was the great Russian novelist and moralist Count Leo Tolstoy (1828-1910). He asked the question and offered part of an answer in A Confession, written in Russian in 1879, circulated in 1882, and translated and published in 1884. Tolstoy’s reflections on the question stimulated a great deal of subsequent debate on the issue.

Although characters in his earlier works, such as War and Peace, sometimes talked about the meaning of life and felt the problem deeply, Tolstoy himself raised serious questions about it only as part of a psychological crisis he underwent in the mid to late 1870s. Despite having everything anyone could ever want—wealth, fame, status, love, physical strength, and so forth—Tolstoy found himself severely disturbed. His symptoms were depression, psychological paralysis, obsession with suicide, and the continual recurrence in his head of the question of the meaning of life.

Tolstoy put his question about the meaning of life in several different ways. Here are some of them, listed in order of their occurrence in his Confession:

What is it for? What does it lead to? Why? What then? What for? But what does it matter to me? What of it? Why go on making any effort? How go on living? What will come of what I am doing today or shall do tomorrow? What will come of my whole life? Why should I live, why wish for anything, or do anything? Is there any meaning in my life that the inevitable death awaiting me does not destroy? What am  I, with my desires? Why do I live? What must I do? What is the meaning of my life? Why do I exist?

Several of these seem to be quite different questions, but Tolstoy regarded them all as the same question put in different ways.

Tolstoy said explicitly that his question was not about the composition, origin, and fate of the universe, nor again about the question, “What is the life of the whole?” That question, Tolstoy said, is unanswerable for a single man, and it is “stupidity” to think an individual must first answer the question about the meaning of the universe or the whole of humanity before he can answer the question of the meaning of his own life.

Tolstoy came to think that he should not expect to find the answers to his questions in philosophy. The legitimate task of philosophy is merely to ask the question and perhaps refine and clarify it, not to answer it, which it cannot do.

This view of philosophy as incapable of providing answers to the questions of life must have been one Tolstoy came to some way into his crisis. At another point, apparently earlier, Tolstoy did try to find answers in philosophy (as well as in the mathematical, physical, biological, and social sciences). The philosophers he studied were Socrates, the Buddha, “Solomon” (the author of Ecclesiastes), and Schopenhauer.

All of these he interpreted as providing a negative answer. The gist of Socrates’ thought is that the true philosopher seeks death, because the life of the body, with all its ailments and desires, is an impediment to what he is really all about, namely, the quest for truth. The individual life of the physically discrete individual is pretty meaningless, something one would rather do without. The Buddha, as Tolstoy read him, teaches that life is the greatest of evils and works as hard as he can to free himself from it. “Solomon” teaches that it’s all “vanity.” And Schopenhauer, as Tolstoy understood him, wishes for, and advocates, annihilation.

In a nutshell, Tolstoy’s problem was this: since I will suffer, die, be forgotten, and make no difference (leave no trace) in the long run, how does my life, or anything I do, have any meaning? It was a problem he felt deeply. He had to have an answer to go on living. Tolstoy’s concern with the issue was not merely theoretical.

The solution to the problem that Tolstoy eventually came to was one he thought had been known all along by the unlearned peasants. The solution lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called “faith.” Faith is faith in God, and lived faith involves some kind of relation to the Infinite. Meaning is found in the appropriate relationship to God, the Infinite. Tolstoy’s solution bears obvious resemblances to Kierkegaard’s and is very much in the same spirit.

Tolstoy spent the rest of his life working out the details of, or variations on, this solution. The progress of his thought can be traced in What I Believe and On Life, as well as in his late short fiction (The Death of Ivan Ilych, Father Sergius, and so forth). To the end Tolstoy held that faith in God, work, service to others, unselfishness, and love are essential parts of a meaningful life. He taught that the things ordinarily pursued by many—wealth, status, power, fame—contribute nothing to the meaningfulness of life.

e. Some Common Aspects of the Lives of Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy

Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy all had lives which rendered them virtual breeding grounds for problems with the meaning of life. (1) All of them were well off and did not have to work for a living; there is no evidence that any of them ever felt a real threat of, say, homelessness or starvation. Nietzsche was the one that wasn’t exactly wealthy, but in his case his early retirement (in his late twenties) provided him with a pension for life sufficient to meet his material needs and free him up for a life of thought and writing. (2) All of them suffered from psychological illness of one sort or another—at the very least, a sense of gloom or melancholy, and in some cases a sense of worthlessness and a preoccupation with suicide, or feelings of dread and anxiety, or the encroachment of outright madness. (3) All of them grew up in religious environments, the tenets of which they lost faith in when they reached adulthood, and the lack of which they struggled with throughout their lives (eventually regaining, in the cases of Kierkegaard and Tolstoy, some portion of what they had lost). (4) None of them was a professional academician, except for Nietzsche in his youth.

From these four, and from our own experiences of life, we have inherited, to the extent that we have it, our preoccupation with the meaning of life.

3. Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers

In the early twentieth century questions about the meaning of life continued to be of interest to leading European or “Continental” philosophers.   

a. Heidegger

The great German philosophy professor Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) was certainly concerned with the meaning of life. He presented two different outlooks, which we may call “early Heidegger” and “later Heidegger.”

For early Heidegger (that is, the Heidegger of Being and Time, 1927), the question of the meaning of life is the question how we can live an “authentic” life, one that is our life, not just the life for us that has been fixed by the community we live in. His answer is that to live a meaningful life is to live a life of authenticity. To live a life authenticity is to live a life that one oneself chooses, not the life that is prescribed for one by one’s social situation. To live a life of authenticity, one must have a plan, something that unifies one’s life into an organic whole. This is one’s own plan. So a meaningful life is one of focused authenticity. “Authenticity is Heidegger’s accounted of what it is to live a meaningful life.”

Living authentically, it turns out, is a matter of living in a way that is true to your heritage. “Being true to heritage is being true to your own, deepest self.” In the end, the content of authenticity is not something you freely choose ex nihilo, but rather something you discover in the conjunction of heritage and facticity.

Early Heidegger’s thought seems to be a kind of pantheism, and it is possible that Heidegger subscribed to some such view all his life.

Later Heidegger proposes a somewhat different view. In this philosophy of his, we are given the task, in which our meaning lies, of being “guardians of the world.” The world is a holy place. To understand and appreciate that fact is to exhibit not just a certain intellectual and practical stance toward the world, but to live with an attitude of respect and reverence toward the world, toward the natural world especially. Later Heidegger saw exploitation of the natural world, as in mining and highway-building, as deplorable, as contrary to the very meaning of life. The meaning of life is guardianship of the world.

b. Sartre

The French philosopher Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) changed his views over the course of his life. In his work Being and Nothingness (1943), advocated an outlook from which life is absurd. We more or less seriously pursue goals which, from a detached standpoint, we can see don’t really matter. But we continue to act as though they do, and hence our lives are absurd. The Sartrean project is to overcome this detached standpoint, or to incorporate it into our lives.

The problem is other people. They insist on their own reality. They tend to get in the way of our pursuit of our own goals.

Later on, Sartre espoused a somewhat different view. On this new view, “our fundamental goal in life is to overcome our ‘contingency’,” to become the foundation of our own being. The main obstacle (again) is other people who, on the one hand, pursue their own (different) goals and, on the other, propose a real (military) threat to one’s way of life and one’s homeland.

In his 1944 play, No Exit, there is the famous line: “Hell is other people.” Other people do not cooperate with my projects, and I do not cooperate with theirs. The result is war, in something like Schopenhauer’s sense. People are always at war, or at least at odds, with each other.

In both his early and his later thought, Sartre ends up being pretty pessimistic and depressing. Life is meaningless. We can, by our free choice, give life some meaning or other. But the decision to do so is itself a matter of ungrounded free choice, which is such that it doesn’t matter whether that decision or some other one is made.

c. Camus

Albert Camus (1913-1960), a Frenchman born in Algeria, was one of the leading existentialists (though he himself disowned the label) and one of the more influential writers of the first half of the twentieth century. He was familiar with the work of Nietzsche, and greatly influenced by it.

On our theme, Camus’s starting point was the perception of the absurd. Human life, he felt, was absurd, meaningless, and senseless. The way in which it is, or the reason it is, lies in an inevitable clash between the needs and aspirations of human beings and the cold, meaningless world.

This clash has at least four facets. First, we seek—demand, even—a rational understanding of things, some way of seeing the world as familiar to us. But the world does not cooperate: to us, it is ultimately unintelligible. Second, we long for some kind of unity underlying and organizing the manifest diversity we find all around us. But again, the world is heedless of our longings. The world that presents itself to our senses is nothing but disjointed plurality. Third, we long for a higher reality (a God, for example), something transcendent, some cosmic meaning of everything. But no such meaning can be discerned. Fourth, we strive for continued life, or at least to achieve something permanent in the end. But our efforts are pointless, everything will come to nothing, and all that lies ahead is death and oblivion.

Our situation is like that of the mythical Greek of old, Sisyphus. We are condemned, as it were, to pushing a rock up a hill, over and over only to see it roll back down again, every time, when it reaches the top. Pointless labor is Sisyphus’ lot, and ours too.

The pointlessness and absurdity of life raise the question of suicide. Should we kill ourselves? Camus’s answer is that, no, we should not. Suicide is escapist. To kill yourself is to give in, to lose. If we were prisoners of war—which is something like what we are—our captor and tormentor would want us to do exactly that—confess that things are too much for us and kill ourselves. That would be his ultimate victory, which would bring him a chuckle, or perhaps even a hearty guffaw.

How then should we live? The first thing to do is to insist that life is better if there is no meaning. That would really irritate our tormentor. Second, we should cultivate a mindset of honesty and lucidity. We should not indulge in denial, or evasion, or imaginings of an eventual escape into an afterlife where everything will be put right. We should acknowledge that life is awful—but then, perhaps, add “and I love it” or “all is well.” Third, we should take up an attitude of revolt, defiance, and scorn. Camus observes, “There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn.” Surely such an attitude would vex our hypothetical tormentor beyond measure. Fourth, we should live for now, stop worrying about the future, stop striving to achieve future goals. Nothing is going to come of anything we do in the long run anyway. Fifth, we should “use everything up”: work hard, play hard, approach everything with zest and passion, expend energy to the human limit. This amounts to a kind of perverse “Yes!” to life. Finally, we may ask why anyone would want to live like this? Is it something that would appeal only to the French? What are the advantages of such an attitude toward life?

Camus has answers to these queries, three in fact. First, living as he recommends is a way of salvaging our dignity, and it is a way to which a certain majesty adheres. Second, surprisingly perhaps, such a way of living brings with it a “curious joy.” Third, it is the way of freedom. Camus’s scornful existentialism is the best conception we have of a truly free human being, one who does not allow himself to be shaped and determined by the mindless, meaningless world that surrounds him.

4. Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers

 Anglo-American philosophers in the very late eighteenth and early twentieth centuries continued to be interested in problems of the meaning of life as well.

a. James

The American pragmatist philosopher William James (1842-1910), a Harvard professor, wrote a couple of interesting essays on our theme in the late 1890s. Both essays were written as addresses to be delivered to live audiences. They demand some discussion and consideration.

In “Is Life Worth Living?” (1895), James reveals deep, probably first-person, familiarity, with the existential source of concern with the issues of the meaning and worthwhileness of life. He calls it the “profounder bass-note of life” and suggests that it is to be found, or heard, somewhere in all of us: “In the deepest heart of all of us there is a corner in which the ultimate mystery of things works sadly.” (1895: 32)

Some people are so naturally optimistic and in love with life that they are constitutionally incapable of being much bothered by the bass-note and pay it little attention. James’s example of such a person is Walt Whitman; and one thinks of the English. James finds no fault—intellectual, moral, or otherwise—with such people. It is rare good fortune to be blessed with such a temperament. If everyone were, the question of the worthwhileness of life would never arise.

But for every Whitman, there is a suicide, and a thinker of the dreary constitution of the poet James Thomson, author of “The City of Dreadful Night.”

In his address, James imagines himself in discussion with a would-be suicide whom he tries to persuade to take up his burden and see life through to its natural end. James acknowledges that some of these suicides—perhaps the majority of them—are too far gone to have anything said to them, for instance, those whose suicidal impulses are due to insanity or sudden fits of frenzy. It is to the class of reflective would-be suicides—those disposed to kill themselves because of their thinking, reading, and brooding on the darker side of life—that James directs his remarks. It is these he wants to cheer up (or comfort) and keep alive.

James speaks of two stages of recovery from suicidal illness. The first stage includes three elements, three palliatives, for the suicidal condition. First, there is the thought, “You can end it whenever you will.” This strikes one as a strange thought to recommend to one contemplating suicide. But James thinks the thought can be a comfort. It means there’s no particular guilt or stigma attached to suicide. It means one won’t have to put up with this miserable world forever; one can opt out whenever one wants. It may delay the act by encouraging the thought, “Why kill myself today when I can always do it tomorrow?” Second, James points out, there is in human beings a natural sense of curiosity. It is worth hanging around a while longer in order to see the headlines of tomorrow’s newspaper. Third, there is a certain fighting instinct in human beings. James thinks the normal man has a reason to go on, even if the whole thing is worthless and meaningless, as long as there is some injustice to be put right, some villain to be put down, or some evil to overcome in the little corner of the universe he inhabits. The three things just mentioned all lie in the first stage of recovery, one that is partial and inferior to what lies in the second stage.

The second stage is one of full recovery. It is the religious stage. It gives one assurance of a fully worthwhile and meaningful life.

James’s injunction is to believe—to believe in a supernatural, spiritual order of things which overcomes and makes right the deficiencies of the natural order as we know it. We do not have rational or evidential proof that such a supernatural order exists. But Kant proved that natural science cannot prove that such an order does not exist. To make one’s life worthwhile and meaningful, all one has to do is to posit faith in such an order, to believe that there is a spiritual realm in which all the wrongs of the natural order are righted. In that case, one will view the natural order as an inadequate representation of the spiritual, or as a veil through which the true and wonderful nature of the spiritual is hidden or obscured.

One need have little conception of what the spiritual realm is like. The content of the belief in it can be quite minimal. All one needs to affirm is that there is such a realm and that its reality makes life worthwhile. James draws on two of the tenets of his pragmatism to support such an approach to the meaning and worthwhileness of life.  One is the right to believe what we need to believe, even though it goes beyond belief warranted by empirical and rational evidence. His classic case for the right of such belief is in his essay, “The Will to Believe.”

Another tenet of pragmatism on which James draws is the idea that belief is a matter of action. To believe something is not so much to have a certain mental state as to act in a certain way. Whatever is in one’s mind, to act as though life is worthwhile and has meaning is to believe that it does

In “What Makes a Life Significant” (1899), James expressly addressed the question of the significance or meaning of life. What he said in this essay was rather different from what he had said in the previous one. The essay was in part a response to the deification of the uneducated, hard-working peasants in Tolstoy’s Confession. James admired Tolstoy a great deal but felt he went a bit overboard in his praise of peasant life and in his tendency to identify it as the very locus of meaning. James held that the lives of Tolstoy’s peasants were full of one ingredient necessary for a meaningful life—toil, struggle, pluck, will, suffering, manly virtues—but that they lacked the other necessary ingredient for a fully meaningful life, namely, what James called “ideals.”

Toward the end of the essay, James gives his own view. He states it in two or three different ways, the sense of which seems to be the same. “[I]deal visions” must be backed “with what the laborers have, the sterner stuff of manly virtue.”

[T]o redeem life from insignificance, [c]ulture and refinement all alone are not enough. . . . Ideal aspirations are not enough, when uncombined with pluck and will. . . . There must be some sort of fusion, some chemical combination among these principles, for a life objectively and thoroughly significant to result. (1899: 877)

The solid meaning of life is always the same eternal thing,—the marriage, namely, of some unhabitual ideal, however special, with some fidelity, courage, and endurance; with some man’s or woman’s pains.—And, whatever or wherever life may be, there will always be the chance for that marriage to take place. (1899: 878)

James is rather vague about what the “ideals” are, or even what they are like. In at least some cases they have something to do with culture and refinement, but it seems that they can and will vary from person to person, and may reside in some form in the uncultured and unrefined. In any event, it is noteworthy that James does not bring up the subject of religion. There is no suggestion that belief in God or a spiritual world is necessary for a fully meaningful life. An ideal wedded to manly virtue is enough.

b. Russell

The British philosopher Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) is often portrayed as one of those early twentieth century analytic philosophers who had no patience for big questions, such as that of the meaning of life. The portrayal is often reinforced by the famous story of Russell and the cab-driver, to whom Russell had nothing to say about the meaning of life.

It is true that Russell sometimes expressed a dismissive attitude toward the question: to Hugh Moorhead he said, “Unless you assume a God, the question (of life’s meaning) is meaningless” (Metz 2013b: 23), and to the taxi-driver he had indeed nothing to say about the meaning of life. But elsewhere he seems to have taken the question very seriously.

In “A Free Man’s Worship,” he begins with a fairly gloomy, despairing picture of the world science reveals to us, the only world there is, really. It is purposeless, void of meaning. The causes that produced us had no prevision of the end they were achieving. We ourselves, and everything precious to us, are the outcome of the accidental collocations of atoms. There is no life for the individual beyond the grave. The existence of our very species, along with all its achievements, will eventually be extinguished in the death of the solar system and “buried beneath the debris of a universe in ruins.”

But the thing for us to do is to maintain our ideals against the hostile universe. That universe knows the value of raw power, and not much else. Let us not worship it, as did Nietzsche. In exalting the will to power, Nietzsche was failing to maintain the highest human ideals in the face of the cruel world; he was, in a sense, giving in, capitulating, prostrately submitting to evil, sacrificing his best to Moloch.

Let us be clear-sighted and honest. Let us recognize that the facts are often bad, that in the world we know there are many things that would have been better otherwise, that our ideals are not in fact realized in the world.

But, again, in our minds and hearts, even though the whole business may be futile, let us tenaciously cling to our ideals, loving truth and beauty. Let us renounce power. Let us worship only the God created by our own love of the good. Let us live constantly in the vision of the good.

One trap we must guard against falling into is that which (Russell would think) Camus fell into some decades later. We should not cultivate and live in a spirit of fiery revolt, of fierce hatred of the senseless universe. Why not? Because indignation is still a kind of bondage, for it compels our thoughts to be occupied with the evil world. Give up the indignation so that your thoughts can be free. From freedom of thought comes art, philosophy, and the vision of beauty.

To achieve this we must develop a kind of detachment from our own personal happiness, must learn to free ourselves from the burden of concern for petty things and personal goods.

To abandon the struggle for private happiness, to expel all eagerness of temporary desire, to burn with passion for eternal things–this is emancipation, and this is the free man’s worship. (Russell 1903: 61)

In The Conquest of Happiness Russell makes a couple of remarks about the meaning of life that are worthy of note. The first is this:

The habit of looking to the future and thinking that the whole meaning of the present lies in what it will bring forth is a pernicious one. There can be no value in the whole unless there is value in the parts. Life is not to be conceived on the analogy of a melodrama in which the hero and heroine go through incredible misfortunes for which they are compensated by a happy ending. (1930: 29)

The second is odd but interesting, perhaps not the kind of thought that would occur to most people:

the human heart as modern civilisation has made it is more prone to hatred than to friendship. And it is prone to hatred because it is dissatisfied, because it feels deeply, perhaps even unconsciously, that it has somehow missed the meaning of life, that perhaps others, but not we ourselves, have secured the good things which nature offers man’s enjoyment. (1930: 75)

The thought seems to be that people hate each other because they think others have achieved (or know?) the meaning of life and they don’t. If that is true, one should be careful not to let on that he knows the meaning of life, even if he does.

Several writers have advocated focus and have thought of a life organized by one big project or goal as the paradigm case of a meaningful one. Russell rejects the idea.

All our affections are at the mercy of death, which may strike down those whom we love at any moment. It is therefore necessary that our lives should not have that narrow intensity which puts the whole meaning and purpose of our life at the mercy of accident. For all these reasons the man who pursues happiness wisely will aim at the possession of a number of subsidiary interests in addition to those central ones upon which his life is built. (1930: 177)

Finally, in “The Place of Science in a Liberal Education,” Russell makes the now familiar point that the meaning of life must come not from without but from within.

The search for an outside meaning that can compel an inner response must always be disappointed: all “meaning” must be at bottom related to our primary desires, and when they are extinct no miracle can restore to the world the value which they reflected upon it. (Mysticism and Logic, ch. 2, “The Place of Science in a Liberal Education”)

That is not to say that the meaning of life is created or chosen as opposed to discovered. For our primary desires are something largely given, something (if we are lucky) we simply find in ourselves.

c. Schlick

Moritz Schlick (1882-1936) was one of the central figures of the logical positivist movement. Thinkers in the movement are commonly said to have been dismissive of such “metaphysical” questions as that of the meaning of life. Yet Schlick for one was in no way dismissive. He described himself as a seeker of the meaning of life and wrote an extremely interesting essay on the topic in 1927.

Schlick’s contribution to the debate is (to some) one of the most appealing writings in the whole of the literature. Schlick was aware of Schopenhauer’s musings and was concerned to escape his dire conclusions. Schlick found his answer in (his interpretation of) Nietzsche’s Thus Spake Zarathustra. The answer is that life can be meaningful only if it is freed from its subjugation to ends and purposes. The suggestion is radical: a life has meaning only if it does not have some end or purpose to which everything is subordinated.

Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found not in work but in play. Work, in the philosophical sense, is always something done not for its own sake but for the sake of something else, some end or purpose that is to be achieved.  Most often that end is the survival and perpetuation of life—that is, more work functioning only to perpetuate the life of the species. But it is absurd to take the meaning of life to lie in the continued survival of the species, or in the work required to make that survival possible. The meaning of life must lie in the content of existence, not in bare existence as such.

What then is the meaning of life? One candidate that suggests itself is feelings of pleasure and happiness. But Schlick rejects that candidate, partly on the grounds that pleasure is likely only to lead to the satiety and boredom which Schopenhauer so vividly made us aware of. Schlick also rejects the ideal of happiness as the meaning of life by way of the observation that man is essentially an active creature for which a life of idle pleasure is by no means suitable. What Schlick ends up saying is that the meaning of life is to be found in play, that is, in activity engaged in for its own glorious sake and not for the furtherance of some further end or goal. Doing something only in order to produce some further end or goal is work, and work cannot be the meaning of life. Of course, work is necessary for human existence and thriving, but it is meaningful only if it can—and it can be—turned into play, something one would do with delight even if nothing came of it in the end.

Schlick backs off from saying that the meaning of life is play. Instead, he says that the meaning of life is youth, since youth is the period of life in which play predominates. A nice consequence of this position is the fact that a life cut short in its infancy or youth is a meaningful life. If you are killed when you are ten years old, it is likely that you lived a life full of meaning.

One other aspect of Schlick’s view should be mentioned. It is that youth is not literally a matter of how long one has lived on this earth. If an old fellow turns his work into play, if he performs it primarily for the sake of the sheer joy of doing it, then he is young in the sense that matters. The key to a fully meaningful life would be to stay forever young.

d. Tagore

The Bengali Indian poet, short-story writer, novelist, dramatist, artist, sage, and philosopher Rabindranath Tagore (1861-1941), often credited with a major role in the cross-fertilization of East and West, won the Nobel Prize in literature in 1919. He wrote in English (sometimes). He knew the works of Einstein, Yeats, Wordsworth, and a host of other Western thinkers. In 1930 he delivered the Hibbert Lectures at Oxford, published the next year as The Religion of Man (1931), a remarkable volume containing much reflection on the meaning of life. This article will limit itself to consideration of a couple of points in that book.

Tagore is interesting because his interest in the question of the meaning of life did not arise out of anything like the circumstances which seemed to create the interest in so many Western thinkers. Tagore was not well-off and bored, he did not suffer from depression and existential angst, he did not worry about the importance of his personal life in the vast scheme of things, he was not a professional academic philosopher.

Tagore’s tendency was to view the question of the meaning of life as the question, “What is man?” or “What am I?” His answer seems to have been that the true human is the universal self, or the true Man represented by the life of the species, or even by the life of all beings.

If he had a problem, it lay in the chaotic, hodgepodge nature of this everyday life. Not exactly seeking for a solution to the predicament, one came to him on an ordinary day on which he was just living his everyday life in east India. He gives a gripping and poetic account of it in chapter six of The Religion of Man. He writes:

Suddenly I became conscious of a stirring of soul within me. My world of experience in a moment seemed to become lighted, and the facts that were detached and dim found a great unity of meaning. The feeling which I had was like that which a man, groping through a fog without knowing his destination, might fee when he suddenly discovers that he stands before his own house. (Tagore 1931, 95)

One thing that is noteworthy in this is that Tagore felt he had seen the meaning of life, not when he realized that his life really mattered, or added up to something sub specie aeternitatus, nor when he came up with a view of things that rid him of his angst and depression, but rather when he found that his life was part of a great unity of meaning. He saw meaning when everything, including his individual life, was one unified whole.

A second feature of Tagore’s conception of the meaning of life is the role he gives to detachment. The detachment that is relevant seems to be something like non-attachment to the petty concerns of one’s own individual life. It is not a lack of concern for anything and everything. It is lack of concern for how one’s own individual, personal life fares. The appropriately detached person places his interest in how Man as the eternal being, or beings of any sort ultimately fare. (There is an admirable concern for all life, not just human life in the thought of Tagore.) The appropriately detached man loses concern for his personal triumphs and failures and cultivates an enlivening interest in the life of the whole, with which, instead of his personal life, he identifies himself. The result is a vast increase in the sense of meaningfulness in his own life.

e. Ayer

A very different approach to the problem of the meaning of life was taken by the prominent logical positivist English philosopher A. J. Ayer (1910-1989).

Ayer argued, in an important 1947 paper, that “there is no sense in asking what is the ultimate purpose of our existence, or what is the real meaning of life” (Ayer 1947: 201). His argument is that there is no reason to believe in anything like a God who created us and intended us for a specific purpose. And even if there were such a God, his purposes could not give life meaning unless we agreed with them and accepted them. Thus the meaning of life always comes back to what we as individuals purpose, value, and aim at. There is no meaning out there to be discovered.

Ayer insists that the meaninglessness of life is nothing to cry about. One’s life has whatever meaning one gives it. It just doesn’t make sense to ask about the meaning of life because there is not, and could not be, such a thing. The question “What is the meaning of life?” is illogical and unanswerable. But a person can give his life a meaning, and if he does, it will be meaningful to him. It will come down to the value judgments the person makes. And these are a matter of personal choice and preference. There is no sense in saying that one person’s value judgments are true and another’s false. Give your life a meaning, and that’s the meaning it will have.

5. Conclusion

The dismissal of the question about the meaning of life which was characteristic of Ayer and his generation, and Camus’s idea that meaninglessness doesn’t matter, may be what ironically sparked the recent interest in the question. The natural philosophical response is that surely the question of the meaning of life is meaningful and important: in light of the remarks of Ayer, Camus, and their ilk, how is that so? A sense that the meaning of life must be a philosophical problem that matters has motivated work on the question of what the question of the meaning of life is all about, if we do not take Ayer’s dismissive attitude and Camus’s stance toward it. The work of Richard Taylor, Robert Nozick, Thomas Nagel, Joel Feinberg, Harry Frankfurt, Susan Wolf, Thaddeus Metz, Joshua Seachris, Julian Young, John Cottingham, David Benatar, and Garrett Thomson (among others) are attempts to answer this question.

The preceding survey brings us up to around 1950, just before a veritable explosion of works on the meaning of life took place in philosophy, especially in the Anglo-analytic tradition. Those interested in this explosion should begin by consulting the excellent overviews in Thaddeus Metz’s article in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Metz 2013) and Joshua Seachris’s article in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Seachris 2012)

6. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. “The Claims of Philosophy.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, 3rd Ed.. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 199-202. (Originally published in 1947)
  • Baier, K. “The Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 81-117. (Originally published in 1947.)
  • Camus, A. “The Myth of Sisyphus.” J. O’Brien (tr.). Reprinted in part in Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Steve Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 244-255. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
  • Carlyle, T. 1834. Fraser’s Magazine. available online at Project Gutenberg.
  • Heidegger, M. Being and Time. J. Macquarrie and J. Robinson (trs.). Oxford: Blackwell, 1973. (Originally published in German in 1927.)
  • James, W. “Is Life Worth Living?.” in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, New York: Dover Publications, 1956: 32-62. (Originally published in 1895.)
  • James, W. “What Makes a Life Significant?.” in On Some of Life’s Ideals. New York: Henry Holt and Company, 1899: 49–94. Reprinted in William James: Writings 1878-1899. New York: The Library of America, 1992: 861-80.
  • Kierkegaard, S. Concluding Unscientific Postscript. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1846.)
  • Kierkegaard, S. Either/Or: A Fragment of Life. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1843.)
  • Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. New York: Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. 2nd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Klemke, E. D. & Cahn, S. (eds.). The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Metz, T. “The Meaning of Life.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition). Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Nagel, T. “The Absurd,” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 151-161. (Originally published in 1971.)
  • Nietzsche, F. Ecce Homo. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1889.)
  • Nietzsche, F. On the Genealogy of Morals. Ian Johnston (tr.). 2009.
  • Nietzsche, F. Thus Spake Zarathustra. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1883-1885.)
  • Nietzsche, F. Twilight of the Idols. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1899.)
  • Nietzsche, F. The Will to Power. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in German in 1901-1911.)
  • The Oxford English Dictionary. Oxford: Oxford University Press: 2014.
  • Russell, B. “A Free Man’s Worship.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 55-62. (Originally published in 1903.)
  • Russell, B. The Conquest of Happiness. London: Liveright, 1930.
  • Sartre, J. P. Being and Nothingness. H. E. Barnes (tr.). New York: Philosophical Library, 1956. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
  • Sartre, J. P. “Existentialism and Humanism.” B. Frechtman (tr.). 1956. Reprinted in Ways of Wisdom. S. Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 234-43.
  • Schlick, M. 1927. “On the Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed., E. D. Klemke & S. Cahn (eds.). P. Heath (tr.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 62-71. (Originally published in 1927.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. 1840. On the Basis of Morality. (available free online and in several editions)
  • Schopenhauer, A. “On the Suffering of the World.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 41-50. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. “On the Vanity of Existence.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 51-54. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. “On Affirmation and Denial of the Will to Live.” in Essays and Aphorism., R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 61-65. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. “On Suicide.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 77-79. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: The Wisdom of Life. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. rpr. in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004.
  • Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: On Human Nature. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. Reprinted in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004,
  • Schopenhauer, A. The World as Will and Representation. 2 Vols. E. F. J. Payne (tr.). 1969. New York: Dover Publications. (Vol. 1 first appeared in 1818, Vol. 2 in 1844, in German.)
  • Schopenhauer, A. Essays and Aphorisms, R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). 1970. New York: Penguin Books. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
  • Seachris, J., 2012, “Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective,” The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy,
  • Smith, S., (ed.), 1983, Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Tagore, R., 1961, The Religion of Man, London: George Allen & Unwin Co., Reprinted Boston: Beacon Press. (Originally published in 1930.)
  • Taylor, R., 1970, “The Meaning of Life,” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, E. D. Klemke (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 141-150.
  • Tolstoy, L., 2005, A Confession, Aylmer Maude (tr.), Reprinted Mineola, NY: Dover Publications. (Originally published in 1884.)
  • Young, J. 2014, The Death of God and the Meaning of Life, 2nd ed., New York & London: Routledge.


Author Information

Wendell O’Brien
Morehead State University
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Mental Illness

The Philosophy of Mental Illness is an interdisciplinary field of study that combines views and methods from the philosophy of mind, psychology, neuroscience, and moral philosophy in order to analyze the nature of mental illness. Philosophers of mental illness are concerned with examining the ontological, epistemological, and normative issues arising from varying conceptions of mental illness.

Central questions within the philosophy of mental illness include: whether the concept of a mental illness can be given a scientifically adequate, value-free, specification; whether mental illnesses should be understood as a form of distinctly mental dysfunction, and whether mental illnesses are best identified as discrete mental entities with clear inclusion/exclusion criteria or as points along a continuum between the normal and the ill. Philosophers critical of the concept of mental illness argue that it is not possible to give a value-neutral specification of mental illnesses. They argue that that our concept of mental illnesses is often used to disguise the ways in which mental illness categories enforce pre-existing norms and power relations. Questions remain about the relationship between the role that values play within the concept of mental illness and how those values relate to concepts of illness more generally. Philosophers who consider themselves a part of the neurodiversity movement claim that our concept of mental illness should be revised to reflect the diverse forms of cognition that humans are capable of without stigmatizing individuals that are statistically non-normal.

There are also epistemological issues concerning the relationship between mental illness and diagnosis. Historically, the central issue centers on how nosologies (or classification-schemas) of mental illness, especially the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (the DSM), relate mental dysfunctions with observable symptoms. Mental dysfunction, on the DSM system, is identified via the presence or absence of a set of symptoms from a checklist. Those critical of the use of behavioral symptoms to diagnose mental disorders argue that symptoms are useless without a theoretically adequate conception of what it means for a mental mechanism to function poorly. A minimal constraint on a diagnostic system is that it must be able to distinguish a person with a genuine mental illness from a person suffering from a problem with living. Critics argue that the DSM, as currently constituted, cannot do this.

Lastly, there are a host of questions surrounding the relationship between mental illness and normativity. If mental illness undermines rational agency, then there are questions about the degree to which the mentally ill are capable of autonomous decision-making. This bears on questions regarding the degree of moral and legal responsibility that the mentally ill can be assigned. Further questions about agency arise over bioethical questions about the standing of the demands made on healthcare professionals by the mentally ill. For example, individuals with Body Integrity Identity Disorder (BIID) request that surgeons amputate their healthy limbs in order to restore a balance between their internal self-representation and their external body image. Bioethicists are divided over whether the requests of patients with BIID are genuinely autonomous and deserving of assent.

Table of Contents

  1. Conceptions of Mental Illness
    1. Alienism and Freud
    2. DSM I – II
    3. The Bio-psycho-social Model DSM III – 5
  2. Criticisms of the Bio-psycho-social Model
    1. Mental Illness as Dysfunction
    2. Neurobiological Eliminitivism
    3. The Role of Value
    4. Szasz’s Myth of Mental Illness
  3. Neurodiversity
    1. Motivation
    2. Autism, Psychopathy
  4. Responsibility and Autonomy
    1. Psychopathy
    2. Body Integrity Identity Disorder and Gender Dysphoria
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Conceptions of Mental Illness

a. Alienism and Freud

Although there are many conceptions of madness found throughout the ancient world (demon possession, divine revelation or punishment, and so forth), the conception of a distinctly mental form of illness did not fully begin to crystallize, at least in the West, until the latter half of the nineteenth-century with the creation and rise of mental asylums. Individuals who were housed in asylums were thought to be psychotic or insane. Psychotic inmates were seen as distinctly different from the non-psychotic population and this justified the creation of special purpose institutions for the containment of psychotic individuals. Psychotics were construed as suffering from distinct and localizable organic brain disorders and were treated by medical professionals known as Alienists (Elliott 2004, 471). Writing at the time, German psychiatrist Emil Kraepelin’s nosology divided psychoses into one of two types: mood disorders and demtia praexcox (Kraepelin 1896a, 1896b). All other forms of distress were though to fall outside of the province of the asylum and of medical treatment.

Non-psychotic individuals who were unhappy with their lives, who felt intense anxiety, or who might vacillate between periods of high and low-motivation were not thought to have psychotic problem. These individuals were not treated or seen by alienists but instead sought help from their family, friends, or clergy (Horwitz 2001, 40). Non-psychotic dysphoria (unhappiness) was, in this context, understood not as a distinctly medical problem but instead in a variety of other forms: a typically social problem with living, a character flaw, or simply as a different way of life. The solution for the unhappiness that many individuals suffered was not found within the asylum but instead from the family, god, or other social institutions. There was, at this time, a clear distinction between medical problems resulting in psychosis and social problems that caused suffering.

Sigmund Freud grew up in the alienist tradition and received his medical degree in 1881. Freud’s theory of the mental and of mental illness would revolutionize western understanding of psychology and would become the dominant paradigm in the psychological sciences until the middle of the twentieth-century. Where the alienists saw mental illnesses as manifestations of rather discrete brain dysfunctions, Freud would come to understand the distinction between normal persons and the mentally ill as arising from a conflict in psychological mechanisms that were a part of the normal human repertoire (Freud 1915/1977; Ghaemi 2003, 4). Where the alienist understood non-psychotic unhappiness as a problem to be solved by individuals and their support networks, Freud understood problems in living as the domain of the psychotherapist. Paul Roazen famously quotes Freud as claiming that “[t]he optimum conditions for (psychoanalysis) exist where it is not needed—that is, among the healthy” (Roazen 1992, 160).

Crucial to Freud’s reorientation of mental disorder was his view of the relationship between observable behavioral symptoms and underlying psychological disorder. Unlike Kraepelin, who understood psychotic behavioral symptoms as closely tied to specific underlying brain dysfunction, Freud did not believe that behavioral symptoms could be tied to unique disorders. The underlying source of human psychological suffering, as Freud understood it, stemmed from universal childhood experiences that if poorly resolved or understood, could manifest in adulthood as neurosis. Freud saw repression, for example, as a normal part of development from child to adult. An individual could fail to properly apply repressive techniques. If this occurs then poorly repressed trauma can manifest itself in a myriad of ways from obsessive cleaning, chronic gambling, melancholia, and so forth. (Freud 1915/1989; Horwitz 2001, 43). Simply noting melancholia in a patient would not be enough for a psychoanalyst to understand the source of repressive dysfunction.

Because a client troubled by chronic gambling and another client troubled by hysteria could, in principle, be suffering from the same underlying repressive dysfunction, any diagnostic manual based on Freud’s conception of mental disorders would not hold symptoms as fundamentally important to the diagnostic process. Instead, Freud claimed that the only way to truly understand a patient’s underlying psychological dysfunction is to acquire detailed information about a person, including his or her dreams, in order to uncover repressed sexual urges (Freud 1905/1997).

The first two editions of the DSM were largely based on Freud’s underlying theory of repression and mental disorder. This nosology would dominate western thinking about the mentally ill until the 1960s.

b. DSM I – II

When the  first edition of the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders was published in 1952, psychodynamic theorists dominated the clinical and academic landscape. Nearly 2/3 of the chairs of psychology departments in American universities were chaired by psychoanalysts and the emerging DSM strongly reflects their theoretical assumptions (Strand 2011, 277). By this point, psychiatry was seen as an extension of medical practice. This required the creation of a nosology, a catalogue of disorders for clinical practice (Graham 2010, 5).

The first-edition of the DSM represented a revolutionary change in the conception and treatment of mental illness. Given the expansive notion of mental illness proposed by Freud and his students, the first two editions of the DSM conclude that many individuals that, prior to this point,  were not  seen as mentally ill, would benefit from therapy. Because symptoms were only weakly correlated with underlying illness on the psychodynamic view, only repeated, and  intensive, conversations with a qualified analyst could help a person get to the root cause of his problems (Horwitz 2002, 45; Grob 1991, 425). The first-edition of the DSM devotes a significant proportion of its 145 pages to a classification of mental illness concepts and terms (American Psychiatric Association 1952, 73-119). Unlike future editions of the manual, illnesses are not identified in terms of a series of symptoms but instead in terms of the underlying psychological conflict responsible. For example, the manual defines Psychoneurotic Disorder as:

[T]hose disturbances in which “anxiety” is a chief characteristic, directly felt or expressed, or automatically controlled by such defenses as depression, conversion, dissociation, displacement, phobia formation, or repetitive thoughts and acts…a psychoneurotic reaction may be defined as one in which the personality, in its struggle for adjustment to internal and external stresses, utilizes the mechanisms listed above to handle the anxiety created (American Psychiatric Association 1952, 12-13).

Yet, The presence of anxiety is not sufficient to diagnose psychoneurotic disorder. Anxiety must result from an underlying conflict between the personality and other stressors. It is the role of the analyst , in this context, to discover whether this underlying conflict is present. This cannot be done by merely observing symptoms; only psychodynamic therapy can discover the true cause of a patient’s anxiety (Grob 1991, 423).

Dissent against this system of classification and diagnosis arose from many groups both external to psychiatry and internal to the psychiatric discipline; these criticisms solidified in the 1960s. The emerging “anti-psychiatry” movement would come to challenge the assumptions that had grounded psychiatric practice in the first half of the 20th century. Conceptions of mental illness, the underlying assumptions behind the process of diagnosis, and even the status of psychiatry as a science were all subject to sustained critiques. Several of the most vocal critics of psychiatry were themselves clinical psychiatrists: R.D. Laing, David Rosenhan, and Thomas Szasz. The latter’s critique of psychiatric practice and the conceptions of mental illness are outlined in detail below in section 2(b).

Rosenahn conducted a pair of famous studies that would radically undermine the scientific legitimacy of clinical diagnosis, especially in the eyes of the public. In his initial study, Rosenhan, along with seven other volunteers, attempted to have themselves admitted several mental health institutions (Rosenhan 1973, 179-180). Rosenhan instructed his collaborators to claim that they heard a voice which said only two words: “thud” and “hollow.” For all other questions, Rosenhan instructed his subjects to answer honestly. The words ‘thud’ and ‘hollow’ were chosen specifically because they did not correspond to a known pattern of neurosis in the DSM II. Rosenhan, and all of his confederates, were admitted to mental institutions; all but one of Rosenhan’s subjects were admitted under a diagnosis of schizophrenia (Rosenhan 1973, 180). Once admitted, subjects took as long as 52 days before they were released, despite the fact that they did not play-act any symptoms of any mental illness. Rosenhan noted that once he and his confederates had been admitted, everyday behavior began to be interpreted as a sign of their underlying mental illness. Subjects who were taking notes for later use, for example, were noted as engaging in unusual “writing behavior;” subjects speaking with a psychiatrist about their childhood and family were construed as having telltale neurotic early-childhood issues (Rosenhan 1973, 183). Since these subjects were not otherwise in distress, Rosenhan claimed that the diagnostic process was not representing an underlying ‘mental illness’ in any of the pseudopatients but instead that the diagnostic process was unscientific and unfalsifiable.

Once Rosenhan publicized the results of his initial study, several institutions challenged his results by re-asserting the validity of the diagnostic process. They claimed that their institutions would not have fallen for Rosenhan’s ruse and challenged him to send pseudopatients to them for analysis. Rosenhan agreed and, despite the fact that no psuedopatients were actually sent, these institutions suspected at least 41 of their new patients (more than 20% of new patients over a three month period) of being pseudopatients sent by Rosenhan (Rosenhan 1973, 181). Again it seemed as if the diagnostic process was incapable of accurately separating the mentally ill from the healthy. In part resulting from critiques of the diagnostic process like Rosenhan’s studies, the diagnostic model of psychiatry would be radically altered. Beginning as early as 1974, the American Psychiatric Association would assign a taskforce to prepare for the publication of the next edition of the DSM. The DSM III that would result from this process, published in 1980, would represent a rejection of the psychodynamic assumptions built into the previous versions of the manual and provide a framework for all future editions of tDSM.  

c. The Bio-psycho-social Model DSM III – 5

The most recent edition of the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders, the DSM 5, was published in 2013. This edition does not substantially modify the conception of mental disorder that has been offered by the manual since its third edition, first published in 1980. In comparison with the first edition of the DSM, the DSM 5 includes diagnostic criteria for more than 400 individual disorders. The conception of mental disorders used in the DSM 5 presents them as biological, psychological, or social dysfunctions in an individual; this model has, unsurprisingly come to be called the Bio-psycho-social model.  It represents the current consensus view of mental disorder among psychological researchers and clinical practitioners. Psychologists disagree about whether to understand this definition conjunctively or disjunctively (Ghaemi 2007, 8). The Biopsychosocial model states:

A mental disorder is a syndrome characterized by clinically significant disturbance in an individual’s cognition, emotion regulation, or behavior that reflects a dysfunction in the   psychological, biological, or developmental processes underlying mental functioning. Mental disorders are usually associated with significant distress or disability in social, occupational, or other important activities. An expectable or culturally approved response to a common stressor or loss, such as the death of a loved one, is not a mental disorder. Socially deviant behavior (e.g., political, religious, or sexual) and conflicts that are primarily between the individual and society are not mental disorders unless the deviance or conflict results from a dysfunction in the individual, as described above (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 20).

From this characterization we can extract four criteria that serve to a genuine mental disorder from other sorts of issues (problems in living, character flaws, and so forth). In order for a disturbance to be classified as a mental disorder it must:

  1. Be a clinically significant disturbance in cognition, emotion regulation, or behavior
  2. Reflect a dysfunction in biological, psychological, or developmental processes
  3. Usually cause distress or disability
  4. Not reflect a culturally approved response to a situation or event
  5. Not result purely from a problem between an individual and her society

All of the criteria, with the exception of the ‘distress’ criterion, are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for the classification of a patient’s symptoms as stemming from a mental disorder. Prior to the seventh printing of the DSM II, homosexuality had been included as a mental disorder. The revisions to the text that took place between the DSM II and the DSM III were meant to make clear that homosexuality (“an interest in sexual relations or contact with members of the same sex”), does not satisfy the criteria for a mental disorder so long as it is not accompanied by clinically significant dysphoria (American Psychiatric Association 1973, 2). However, an individual who feels dysphoria as a result of their homosexuality can be diagnosed with an Unspecific Sexual Dysfunction in the DSM 5 (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 450).

The third, ‘distress,’ criterion is neither necessary nor sufficient to qualify a mental disturbance as a disorder. This can be seen by examining the process for the diagnosis of the ‘cluster B’ personality disorders (histrionic, anti-social, borderline, and narcissistic personality disorders). Subjects with cluster B disorders often do not suffer as a result of their condition. Indeed, those with Antisocial Personality Disorder, for example, may not see themselves as disordered and may even approve of their condition. This has led some individuals with personality disorders to align with the emerging Neurodiversity movement (see section 3 below). The patterns of behavior manifested by those with cluster B personality disorders are, nonetheless, understood as reflecting clinically significant disturbances in cognition, emotion regulation, and behavior. They form a distinct class of mental disorders in the DSM (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 645-684). Some philosophers have argued that the cluster B personality disorders should not be understood as mental disorders but instead that they are better understood as distinctly moral disorders. Louis Charland argues for this conclusion. He claims that, unlike the cluster A and C personality disorders, the only treatment for the cluster B disorders is distinctly moral improvement; because this fact about the treatment of cluster B personality disorders uniquely distinguishes them from all other mental disorders in the DSM. Thus Charland concludes that they reflect moral (as opposed to value-neutral) dysfunction (Charland 2004a, 67).

Since the publication of the DSM III, mental disorders have been defined as being caused by a clinically significant dysfunction of a mental mechanism. Because the definition of mental illness invokes the concept of dysfunction, it is often subject to critique (see the following section). Although the general definition of mental disorder used by the DSM invokes the concept of dysfunction, the diagnostic criteria for particular mental illnesses do not. It is instructive to provide an example of how particular disorders are defined within the manual. Anorexia Nervosa, for example, is defined by the presence of three clusters of behavioral symptoms (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 338-339):

A: Restriction of energy intake relative to requirements, leading to a significantly low body weight in the context of age, sex, developmental trajectory, and physical health.

B: Intense fear of gaining weight or of becoming fat, or persistent behavior that interferes with weight gain, even though at a significantly low weight

C: Disturbance in the way in which one’s body weight or shape is experienced, undue influence of body weight or shape on self-evaluation, or persistent lack of recognition of the seriousness of the current low body weight

Importantly, this characterization of Anorexia Nervosa presents the disorder as a distinct, specifiable, condition that is present in the person and that the underlying dysfunction is uniquely picked out by the presence of the behavioral symptoms identified as A and C; “B” symptoms are seen as common but not essential to diagnosis (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 340). Given the underlying conception of mental disorder offered by the authors of the DSM, Anorexia Nervosa cannot simply be the result of a conflict between the individual and society. It also must not result from an individual accurately trying to adopt social norms about beauty or appearance or diet. It must instead result from a combination of biological, psychological, and/or social dysfunctions however, the diagnostic criteria do not indicate what this underlying dysfunction consists in nor does it offer any evidence that the symptoms associated with the disorder are caused by the same underlying dysfunction.

Stemming in part for reasons of this sort, both the general bio-psycho-social model of mental disorder and the uses of the model to characterize particular disorders, like Anorexia Nervosa, have been subject to repeated criticism by philosophers.

2. Criticisms of the Bio-psycho-social Model

The definition of mental disorder that stems from the bio-psycho-social model has been subject to several criticisms. Philosophical critiques of the definition of disorder have ranged from calling for revision and specification of the concept of disorder to abandonment of the concept altogether. Many of the 400+ disorders that appear in the DSM have also been criticized. In some cases, these critiques are internal: the disorders do not appear to match the criteria of mental disorder offered in the DSM itself; in other cases, as with some critics of schizophrenia, the aim is to undermine both the existence of the disorder and the conception of mental disorder that results in its inclusion (Bentall 1990).

Many members of the antipsychiatry movement described in section 1b were responsible for setting the stage for the criticisms of the bio-psycho-social model. Although in part political, this movement saw the rise of several alternative conceptualizations of human function and dysfunction that have come to challenge the DSM’s conception of a mental disorder. Chief among these were Thomas Szasz’s influential arguments that mental illness is a ‘myth’ and the rise of ‘positive psychology’ as a viable alternative psychological ideology.

a. Mental Illness as Dysfunction

Nassir Ghaemi has criticized the current conception of mental disorder as resting on an unscientific political compromise between factions within clinical and research psychologists and to stave off the looming threat of neurobiological eliminitivism (see section 2b). Ghaemi argues that many psychologists view the Bio-psycho-social conception of mental illness disjunctively and focus predominantly on their preferred method for understanding a disorder depending on their own assumptions of dysfunction (Ghaemi 2003, 10). Although this compromise presents the appearance of consensus, Ghaemi argues that it is an illusion. He advocates for a form of integrationism about mental disorder that has become popular in some circles (Ghaemi 2003, 291; Kandel 1998, 458). A true integration of biology and psychology requires solving the currently unresolved issue over consciousness and how consciousness is realized by the brain. Because this question does not appear to be resolvable in the near-term, integrationists of Ghaemi’s stripe have offered a placeholder for a replacement to the Bio-psycho-social model instead of a true alternative to current models.

Philosophers have also criticized the DSM conception of mental disorder for its lack of a unified theory of dysfunction. The current DSM requires that mental disorders reflect a dysfunction of biological, psychological, or social mechanisms though the text itself is silent on what it would mean for a mechanism to be dysfunctional and does not provide any evidence that the symptoms used for clinical diagnosis of a disorder are caused by a single underlying dysfunction.

Philosophers have appealed to at least three distinct senses of dysfunction to craft a unified theory of mental disorder: etiological, propensity, and normative dysfunction. Etiological function (and dysfunction) is construed in evolutionary terms. A mechanism is functioning, in the etiological sense, if it evolved to serve a specific purpose and if it is, currently, serving its evolved purpose. In order to discover the function of a mental mechanism, it is necessary to discover its evolved function. Dysfunction can then be construed relative to this purpose (Wakefield 1999, 374; Boorse 1997, 12). A mechanism is dysfunctional if it is not fulfilling its evolutionary purpose. Depression, for example, may, in some cases, represent a dysfunction of a mechanism evolved for affective regulation. However, evolutionary psychological theories of mental function are still in their early stages. Furthermore, some philosophers want to allow for the possibility that many of our mental mechanisms may not have evolved to serve the functions to which we currently put them to use.

A propensity function is not constrained by past selective pressures but instead defines function and dysfunction based upon current and future selective success. Male aggression, for example, may have been adaptive in our ancestral environment and hence may represent a case of proper functioning on the etiological theory. On the propensity view, however, male aggression may not be adaptive for life in modern societies even if it was fitness-enhancing in our ancestral environments. Male aggression might therefore, on a propensity account of function and dysfunction, represent a dysfunctional mechanism and hence a mental disorder (Woolfolk 1999, 663). As with the evolutionary view, propensity function conceptions of mental dysfunction have the advantage of appealing to descriptive evidence in order to determine whether or not a specific pattern of behavior is fitness-enhancing in its current context (Boorse 1975, 52). However, crafting a theory of function and dysfunction in terms of present-day fitness appears to allow some conditions to count as mental disorders that we may be averse to label mental illnesses. One major issue with appealing to propensity function is that it appears to resurrect defunct mental illness. Drapetomania, the mental illness that was applied to runaway slaves in the nineteenth century, would appear to satisfy the definition of a propensity dysfunction. Dysphoria caused by the conditions of slavery and a strong desire to abandon one’s current condition are arguably not fitness-enhancing, in a strictly evolutionary sense, and therefore appear to satisfy the criteria for a propensity dysfunction (Woolfolk 1999, 664).

Purely normative accounts of dysfunction have not garnered much favor within the psychological or philosophical disciplines. On a purely normative account of dysfunction, a person is said to be mentally ill based upon whether or not the behavior fits within the context of a larger normative network. Whether we choose to call a person mentally ill or merely ‘bad’ may depend on whether or not we believe agents like this should be held morally responsible and the concept of responsibility may not be reducible to non-normative elements (Edwards 2009, 78). On such conceptions, it is impossible to avoid invoking evaluative concepts when describing what a mental illness is or why a particular set of behaviors is best understood as an illness (Fulford 2001, 81).

George Graham argues for what he calls an unmediated defense of realism about mental illness; Graham’s defense in unmediated in the sense that he does not believe that it must be shown that mental illnesses are natural kinds or result from brain-disorders in order to qualify as legitimate classification-independent kinds (Graham 2014, 133-134). Instead, he argues that “the very idea of a mental disorder or illness is the notion of a type of impairment or incapacity in the rational or reasons-responsive operation of one or more basic psychological faculties or capacities in persons” (Graham 2014, 135-136; see also Graham 2013a and 2013b). These capacities could be described or analyzed at various levels of implementation according to Graham though their malfunction is understood in normative terms.

Perhaps the most influential theory of dysfunction within the philosophical literature is offered by Jerome Wakefield. Wakefield’s conception of mental disorder attempts to bridge the gap between purely objective conceptions of disorder and subjective or normative views. On Wakefield’s view, a mental disorder arises only when a ‘harmful dysfunction’ is present. This combines two different types of concepts: a concept of dysfunction and a concept of harm. Wakefield’s conception of dysfunction is etiological. A mechanism is dysfunctional if it fails to perform the purpose that it evolved to perform. Etiological function is objective in the sense that etiological functions are pan-cultural: they are not dependent on cultural conceptions of function or value. They are, instead, a set of universally shared facts about human nature. The ‘harmfulness’ criterion, on the other hand, is sensitive to cultural context. (Wakefield 1992, 381; Wakefield 1999, 380). As Wakefield understands it, a person is harmed by a disorder if the disorder causes a “deprivation of benefit to a person as judged by the standards of the person’s culture” (Wakefield 1992, 384). In order to be diagnosed with a mental illness, it must be true that an agent’s behavior is caused by a malfunction of an evolutionary mental mechanism and, furthermore, it must also be true that this dysfunction, in the context of that individual’s culture, deprives her of a benefit.

Wakefield, and others like him, argue that it is crucial to distinguish between mental disorders and other sources of distress (Horwitz 1999). The crucial factor in determining proper treatment for a person’s dysphoria, these philosophers argue, is a proper identification of the cause of his or her distress. Mental disorders are caused by harmful mental dysfunctions. Other sources of distress are better understood as problems in living. Many types of unhappiness that are typically diagnosed as depression, on this view, are better understood not as stemming from depression but instead by an examination of the larger social factors that may be causing unhappiness. Because the DSM’s conception of mental disorder is cause-insensitive and identifies depression only via symptoms, it fails to distinguish between these two forms of unhappiness. The danger, these philosophers argue, is that mental disorders are construed as being problems that reside within an agent and that treatments are therefore focused only on, usually pharmaceutically aided, symptom relief. If distress has an underlying social cause, if it is a problem in living, then treatment unhappiness should have a radically different focus. For example, the symptoms described by Betty Friedan as caused by “the problem that has no name” fit relatively easily within the rubric of depression (Friedan 1963, 17). However, Wakefieldian views would resist this diagnosis. The underlying cause of the distress Freidan describes is social and the best treatment of this form of distress is social change. Sadness that is caused by patriarchal or misogynist cultures does not represent a malfunction in the evolved mechanisms in a person (it may represent just the opposite). On the DSM model, treatment may merely mask these depressive symptoms pharmacologically and would only serve to maintain the unjust social situations that give rise to it. The best understanding for “the problem that has no name” is to identify it as a problem in living stemming from misogynist assumptions about the roles available to women in a culture. Wakefield’s view is realist in the sense that its conception of mental dysfunction is independent of our acts of classification (Graham 2014, 125). Because function is grounded on etiology, there is a culturally-independent fact-of-the-matter regarding the presence or absence of a dysfunction in a person.

Wakefield’s harmfulness criterion allows for different cultures to come to different conclusions about which evolutionary dysfunctions will rightfully count as a mental disorder. On Wakefield’s view, homosexuality may represent a genuine evolutionary dysfunction (in the sense that exclusive homosexual behavior threatens the propagation of genes into future generations) but homosexuality is not harmful in a contemporary broadly Western cultural-context. Because it is not harmful in this cultural-context, it is a mistake to think of homosexuality as a disorder. This leaves open the possibility that the harmfulness criterion would allow homosexuality to be a legitimate mental disorder in other cultural-contexts.

Other critics have assailed Wakefield’s appeal to etiological dysfunction. Aside from the general epistemological problem that results from identifying the evolutionary function of psychological mechanisms, there are two problems that arise with an appeal to etiological dysfunction. First, some have argued that depression is an evolved response and hence could not be construed as a mental disorder on Wakefield’s view (Bentall 1992, 96; Woolfolk 1999, 660). Second, some have argued that many of our mental mechanisms may not have arisen as a result of evolutionary selection pressures. They may be evolutionary “spandrels” in Stephen Gould’s sense. The white color of bones necessarily results from the composition of bone but is itself not a property explicitly selected in an evolutionary sense. A spandrel cannot dysfunction in Wakefield’s terms because it lacks an evolutionary cause for its existence. Although spandrels can confer adaptive advantages, they are importantly not themselves traits that are selected for. If any of our mental mechanisms are spandrels then Wakefield’s view cannot explain disorders arising from their use (Gould and Lewontin 1979, 581; Woolfolk 1999, 664, Zachar 2014, 120). Famously, some philosophers have argued that complex human abilities, like our capacity for language may themselves be evolutionary spandrels (Chomsky 1988; Lilienfeld and Marino 1995, 413). Furthermore, recent critics have suggested that too much of the recent work on mental illness has focused exclusively on elucidating the concept of illness or dysfunction and have neglected to consider how advances within the philosophy of mind and the cognitive sciences might change our conception of the ‘mental’ component of mental illness (Brülde and Radovic 2006, 99).

Philosophers who are critical of attempts to define a distinctly mental conception of disorder have been motivated, in part due to the arguments above, to move in two different directions. Some have proposed that we replace the concept of mental disorder with a strictly neurological conception of dysfunction. Doing so, they argue, would place disorders on a clearer and more scientific footing.

b. Neurobiological Eliminitivism

The transition from the DSM II to DSM III brought with it the adoption of the biomedical model for diagnosis. Unlike the psychodynamic model, which saw symptoms as providing little insight into the underlying cause of distress, the biomedical model afforded symptoms pride of place in diagnosis. For much of the 20th century, the biomedical model of diagnosis understood the symptoms that a patient brought to her clinician as providing insight into the underlying disorder(s) that caused her patient to consult the clinician in the first place.

Psychology, as a therapeutic discipline, adopted this model of diagnosis and, in the process, began to categorized patient symptoms into discrete groupings, each caused by a specific mental disorder. However, some philosophers have noted that the biomedical model itself has changed rapidly in the 21st century and that this has created a dilemma for clinical psychological models of diagnosis. Patient reports, in current biomedical models of diagnosis, have lost their pride of place as the key markers for diagnosis. In their place clinicians turn to laboratory test results to determine the true illness responsible for a patient’s suffering. One motivation for this change, within general clinical practice, is that symptoms underdetermine diagnosis. Adopting this new biomedical model for mental illnesses, however, has been seen by some as presenting an eliminitivist threat to mental disorders (Broome and Bortolotti 2009, 27).

Eliminative materialism arose in the 20th century in order to challenge to views about the mind that assign mental states explanatory/causal roles. The views targeted by the eliminitivist were grounded in common-sense or “folk” ideas about everyday mental states like beliefs and desires. These views situated mental states as entities belonging to proper scientific explanation. Eliminitivists argued that folk psychological theories of the mind would fare no better than our folk biological or physical theories and that the folk mental states should be eliminated from scientific explanations (Churchland 1981). Mature cognitive and neuro-sciences do not need to make reference to folk psychological states like beliefs and desires in order to explain human behavior; furthermore, the neural architecture of the brain itself does not appear to house discrete localizable states like beliefs and desires that are assumed by folk psychology (Ramsey, Stich and Garon 1990). Folk psychological theories tell us that the best explanation of human behavior (including mental illness) should be given in terms of dysfunctional mental states (delusions, compulsive desires, etc.). The eliminitivist, on the other hand, undermines this view by claiming that nothing in the brain corresponds to these folk-psychological states and that we are better off without appealing to them.

Eliminitive materialism has arisen as a challenge to the DSM construal of mental disorders in the form of cognitive neuropsychology. “This process may start as a process of reduction (from the disorder behaviorally defined to its neurobiological bases), but in the end psychiatry as we know it will not just be given solid scientific foundations by being reduced to neurobiology; it will disappear altogether” (Broome and Bortolotti 2009, 27). Just as biomedical diagnosis has shifted away from patient report toward more direct assessments using bio-physiological metrics, the eliminitivist argues that the same process should occur with mental disorders. Neurological dysfunction should supplant folk psychological discussions of mental dysfunction. In much the same way as Alzheimer’s disease is understood as a neurological brain disorder; the eliminitivist claims that a mature cognitive neuroscience will replace contemporary classifications of mental disorders with neurological dysfunction (Roberson and Mucke 2006, 781).

Philosophers who resist the eliminitivist reduction of the mental to the neurological argue that at least some types of mental disorders cannot be understood without appealing to mental states. Plausible candidates for this type of disorder include delusions (Broome and Bortolotti 2009, 30), personality disorders (Charland 2004a 70) and various sexual disorders (Soble 2004, 56; Goldman 2002, 40). Personality disorders, especially those falling under the category of ‘Cluster-B’ disorders, appear to require that individuals have acquired bad characters in order to accurately explain why the behavior stemming from the illness is disordered. If normative competence necessarily makes reference to belief-forming mechanisms (having knowledge about moral concepts, recognition of the agency of other persons, etc.) then Cluster-B personality disorders cannot be fully reduced to their neurobiological underpinnings without a meaningful loss of the disordered element of the disorder (Pickard 2011, 182).

On a related note, philosophers have attempted to resist the purely mechanistic neuro-scientific explanations of psychology. Jeffrey Poland and Barbara Von Eckardt argue that the DSM’s bio-psycho-social model relies on a mechanistic model of mental illness but that purely mechanistic models fail to explain the representational aspects of a mental illness; in their words “[a]ny such account will extend well beyond what one would naturally assume to be the mechanism of (or the breakdown of the mechanism of) the cognition or behavior in question” (Von Eckardt and Poland 2004 982). Peter Zachar argues for a view he calls the Imperfect Community Model. This model is based on a rejection of essentialism grounded in pragmatism; Zachar argues that mental illnesses are united as a class despite lacking any necessary and sufficient conditions to define them; mental disorders bear a prototypical or family resemblance to one another, however, that suggests a rough unity to the concept (Zachar 2014, 121-8).

c. The Role of Value

There are related questions that arise about the nature and role of value and mental illness. The first has to do with whether mental illness is a value-neutral concept. Nosologies of mental illness attempt to create value-neutral definitions of the disorders they contain. In the ideal, the concepts picked out by manuals like the DSM are supposed to reflect an underlying universal human reality. The mental disorders contained therein are, with only minor exception, not meant to represent culturally relative normative value judgments onto the domain of the mental.

The DSM includes a “cultural formulation” section meant to distinguish culturally specific, explicitly normative disorders from the supposed pan-cultural, value-neutral disorders that make up the bulk of the manual (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 749). In part this approach stems from the idea that psychologists adhering to the bio-psycho-social model of mental disorders view their project as being on par with nosologies of non-mental disorders. There are two questions worth raising here. The first is whether or not this “likeness argument” has any merit, the second is whether or not the biomedical illness concept is, itself, value-neutral (Pickering 2003, 244). A heart attack, for example, is a disorder, on this model, no matter the time or location of the infarction. Heart attacks are, in this sense, natural kinds and proper objects for scientific study. A heart attack represents a particular form of cardiovascular dysfunction that is agnostic about the cultural or moral values of a particular community. Despite the fact that heart attacks may not present the same symptoms across different sufferers (some may grab their left arms, some may scream, some may fall to the ground, etc), what unites these heterogeneous seeming symptoms is an underlying causal story that explains them (Boyd 1991, 127). Mental disorders are thought to operate on the same principle. On the one hand, the view that psychological symptoms are united by a common cause may result from pre-theoretical assumptions about mental states (Murphy 2014 111-121).  Critics of the bio-psycho-social model argue that values are an essential component of the concept of mental illness. If values are an ineliminable part of the concept of mental illness, we should be led to ask what kinds of values are invoked by the concept

Michel Foucault was an early critic of mental illness and mental health institutions. In his Madness and Civilization: A History of Insanity in the Age of Reason, Foucault argued that asylums, being institutions where ‘the mad’ were separated from the rest of society, emerged historically by the application of models of rationality that privileged individuals already in power. This model served to exclude many members of society from the circle of rational agency. Asylums functioned as a place for society to house these undesirable persons and to reinforce pre-existing power relations; cures, when available, represented conformity to existing power structures (Foucault 1961/1988). Foucault’s critique of mental disorder inspired a generation of psychologists, many of which see themselves as part of a new counter-movement from within the discipline: the Positive Psychology movement. The constructivist and value-laden interpretation of the DSM’s bio-psycho-social model of mental disorder has led some within this movement to call for the abandonment of the model. There is an intrinsic problem, they argue, with viewing individuals as, primarily, vehicles of dysfunction. Those within the positive psychology movement argue that a new, openly value-laden, conception of human beings should supplant the manual: “[t]he illness ideology’s conception of “mental disorder” and the various specific DSM categories of mental disorders are not reflections and mappings of psychological facts about people. Instead, they are social artifacts that serve the same sociocultural goals as our constructions of race, gender, social class, and sexual orientation—that of maintaining and expanding the power of certain individuals and institutions and maintaining social order as defined by those in power” (Maddux 2001, 15).

Hybrid views, like those of Jerome Wakefield, which attempt to delineate a value-neutral and a value-laden component to the concept of mental illness have also been subject to criticism for the role they assign value. Richard Bentall, for example, has argued that the supposedly objective components of these theories contain value-laden assumptions. Bentall argues that happiness satisfies the objective criteria for mental dysfunction (happiness is a rare mental state, it impairs judgment and decision making, and its neural correlates are at least partially well-understood); however, happiness is not viewed as a dysfunction (and consequently is not categorized as a mental illness) because we value the state for its own sake (Bentall 1999, 97). This view is echoed by constructivists about mental illness.

Constructivists about mental illness can hold a variety of positions about where the concept of social construction operates with regards to mental illness. At the least radical level, constructivists can hold that cultures impose models of ideal agency that are used to label sets of human behaviors as instances of ordered and disordered agency; behavioral syndromes, on this view, can be more or less pan-cultural though each culture develops a theory of ideal agency that renders some of these syndromes ‘illnesses’ while other cultures may group the syndromes differently according to different values (Sam and Moreira 2012). A more thorough-going constructivism understands these packages or syndromes of behavior as themselves objects of constructivism; for example, the set of behaviors currently associated with depression would not be seen as a natural (categorization-independent) grouping of properties. Instead, the set of behaviors we call ‘depressive’ exist only because they have been grouped together by clinicians (for any number of reasons) (Church 2001, 396-397). This form of constructivism claims that the only way to explain why a set of behaviors, feelings, thoughts, and so forth, are grouped into a syndrome is that clinicians have created this grouping. Unlike the set of behaviors characteristic of a heart attack, for which we have a readily available causal story that unifies them, mental illnesses lack a clinician-independent explanation for their grouping. On this view, syndromes are akin to what Ian Hacking has called “interactive kinds” (Hacking 1995, Hacking 1999). For Hacking, while natural kinds represent judgment-independent groupings in the world, an interactive kind “when known, by people or those around them, and put to work in institutions, change the ways in which individuals experience themselves—and may even lead people to evolve their feelings and behaviors in part because they are so classified” (Hacking 1999, 103). To think of mental illnesses, like multiple personality disorder (now Dissociative Identity Disorder), as an interactive kind is to say that multiple personality disorder is not a basic fact about human neurology discoverable by the neuroscientist; instead, once the concept of multiple personality disorder is identified, once a set of behaviors has come to be seen as a manifestation of the condition and clinicians have been trained to identify and treat it, then individuals will begin to understand themselves in terms of the new concept and behave accordingly. Some have argued that many paraphilias and personality disorders are best understood on the interactive kind model (Soble 2004, 60; Charland 2004a, 70).

Critics will note that the natural kind -the socially constructed kind- distinction does note exhaust the alternatives. According to Nick Haslam, the natural kind distinction is tacitly invoked by realists of mental illness; this distinction, however, masks several possible alternative accounts of mental illness that allow for intermediate, less essentialist, even pluralist views (Haslam 2014, 13-20; see also Murphy 2014, 109).

d. Szasz’s Myth of Mental Illness

Perhaps the best-known critic of mental illness to arise out of the anti-psychiatry movement of the 1960’s is Thomas Szasz. He published The Myth of Mental Illness in 1961 initiating a wide-ranging discussion of how best to understand the concept of a mental illness and its relation to physical illnesses. Szasz’s work was (and continues to be) the subject of significant discussion and debate. Szasz’s main claim is that the psychiatric field, and its concomitant conception of a mental illness, rests “on a serious, albeit simple, error: it rests on mistaking or confusing what is real with what is simulation; literal meaning with metaphorical meaning; medicine with morals…mental illness is a metaphorical disease” (Szasz 1974/1962, x). Mental illness should be understood as a metaphorical disease, according to Szasz, because it results from clinicians making a kind of category mistake. It involves the use of concepts derived from one disciplinary body, medicine and the natural sciences, and applying them to a realm where they do not rightfully apply: human agency (Cresswell, 24).

According to Szasz, the proper world-view of the natural sciences is to construe its objects of study as law-like and deterministic. All knowledge in this domain is thought to be reducible to, and explainable in terms of, physicalism. Medicine, being a branch of science, understands medical illness on this model. A malfunctioning heart-valve has characteristic physical discontinuity with a functional one, it has typical effects on the function of the valve, and these effects are identifiable independent of patient symptoms. The treatment for medical illnesses relies on a thoroughly physicalist picture of the workings of the human body. Szasz believed that adopting the concept of a physical illness into the realm of mental illness is fundamentally incompatible with our concept of human agency. This results from two lines of argument. The first is that mental illnesses, unlike physical ones, are not typically reducible to biophysical causes (Szasz 1979, 22). If biological dysfunction cannot be used as a basis for delimiting mental illness then the only option left is to appeal to non-normative behavior. Szasz’s second concern is similar to the worries of neurobiological elimintivism mentioned in section 2(b). Szasz argues that the eliminitivist’s picture of human agency is, at best, incomplete. The root of the problem stems from the fact that Szasz believes that we must view agents as necessarily free, capable of choice, and as responsible; “in behavioral science the logic of physicalism is patently false: it neglects the differences between persons and things and the effects of language on each” (Szasz 1974, 187). Szasz’s argument here is sometimes construed as an appeal to dualism. The physical world is deterministic but the mental world must necessarily be free. Because the bio-psycho-social model uses concepts derived from natural sciences in a realm where they do not rightfully apply (that is, human agency) mental illness, as a concept derived from the natural sciences, is a myth resulting from this category mistake. To say that mental illness is a myth, however, is not meant as a denigration of individuals who suffer. It is, instead, meant to more accurately categorize their suffering as resulting from a failure to conform to social, legal, or ethical norms (Pickard 2009, 85).

Szasz’s critics have responded along several lines. Some do not take issue with his underlying understanding of the illness concept but disagree with his claim that it is not applicable to mental phenomena. Mental illnesses, according to these critics, have been (or will soon be) reducible to neurological or neurochemical dysfunction. They argue that advances in neuroscience give us reason for thinking that the prospect for finding the neurological or neurochemical correlates for at least some of our mental illnesses categories is high (Bentall 2004, 307). Other critics have argued instead in the other direction and attacked Szasz’s construal of physical illness. Szasz’s arguments have been taken, by some, to imply that physical illness itself is a deeply evaluated category reflective of value-judgments in much the same way mental illness is meant to on Szasz’s account (Fulford 2004; Kendell 2004). Still others have aimed to preserve Szasz’s primary claim that the overarching category of ‘mental illness’ will prove to be a non-natural interactive-kind, reflective of our values and practices, while simultaneously maintaining that “particular kinds of mental illnesses may yet constitute valid scientific kinds” (Pickard 2009, 88).

3. Neurodiversity

Human cognitive and physical functions range widely across the species. Although most individuals fall within a statistically normal range in terms of their abilities in all of these arenas, statistical normalcy has long been criticized as a normative marker (Daniels 2007, 37-46). Advocates for what has come to be known as the ‘neurodiversity movement’ have begun, in part stemming from the criticisms of psychiatry and the DSM begun in the 1960’s, to push for widespread acceptance of the  forms of cognition beyond the “neuro-normal” that individuals operate with (Hererra 2013, 11). Members of the neurodiversity movement understand it as “associated with the struggle for the civil rights of all those diagnosed with neurological or neurodevelopmental disorders (Fenton and Krahn, 2007, 1). Forms of cognition currently seen as dysfunctional, ill, or disordered are better understood as representing diverse ways of seeing and understanding the space of reasons. Proponents of neurodiversity claim that agents on the autism spectrum, those with personality disorders, attention deficit and hyperactivity disorder, dyslexia, and perhaps even those with psychopathic traits should not suffer from the stigma associated with the illness label. Individuals to whom these label apply often demonstrate profound capabilities (artistic, mathematic, and scientific) that are inseparable from the condition underlying their illness-label (Glannon 2007, 3; Ghaemi 2011). Pluralism about forms of human agency should be encouraged once we fully understand the problematic ways in which norms have come to influence illness categories.

a. Motivation

Applying the label “mentally ill” or “disordered” can have long-term negative effects not only by  affecting how individuals to whom we apply the label view themselves (Charland 2004b, 338-340; Rosenhan 1973, 256) but also by affecting how others view and treat them (Didlake and Fordham 2013, 101). Often, the decision to create a new mentally ill class is decided without the consultation of the groups involved. Homosexuality, for example, had been labeled a mental disorder in the first two editions of the DSM until social and political movements, largely headed by homosexuals themselves, caused the American Psychiatric Association to re-assess its stance (Bayer and Spitzer 1982, 32). The effects that being labeled mentally ill or disordered have on persons are wide-ranging and durable enough to warrant caution; those in the neurodiversity movement argue, from various perspectives, that clinicians continue to mistake diverse forms of cognition (variations from the neuro-normal) with mental illness because of the assumption, which advocates argue is mistaken, that deviation from statistically-normal neural-development and function constitutes disorder. Advocates for neurodiversity typically argue along two lines. The first is to argue that our current concepts of mental dysfunction are in need of revision because they contain one or more of the problems described in section 2 of this entry. This line of argument focuses especially on issues over the role of power and value in the construction of mental illness categories. The second line of argument is “firmly grounded in motivations of an egalitarian nature that seek to re-weight the interests of minorities so that they receive just consideration with the analogous interests of those currently privileged by extant social institutions” (Fenton and Krahn 2007, 1). Any resulting account of neurodiversity must aim to preserve useful categories of illness or mental disorder (if only for the purposes of treatment).

Perhaps the most forceful arguments from the neurodiversity perspective target the status of autism as a form of mental disorder. Much controversy has followed the APA’s decision to fold the diagnosis of Asperger’s syndrome into the more general category of Autism Spectrum Disorder.

b. Autism, Psychopathy

Autism Spectrum Disorder is the diagnosis applied to a wide-ranging number of individuals who have demonstrated persistent difficulty with social understanding and communication and whose symptoms emerge quite early in development. For example, the DSM-5 lists “[i]mpairment of the ability to change communication to match context or the needs of the listener,” “[d]ifficulties following rules for conversation and storytelling,” and “[d]ifficulties understanding what is not explicitly stated (e.g., making inferences) and nonliteral or ambiguous meanings of language” as diagnostic for ASD (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 50-51). Advocates for neurodiversity argue that it is unjust to attempt to force those with ASD to modify their behavior in order to more closely match neurotypical behavior especially as a form of treatment for a disease or disorder. For example, efforts to “change the diets of people with ASD, force them to inhale oxytocin, and expose children to countless hours of floor time or social stories to try to make persons with ASD more like neurotypicals” fail to realize that these attempts at changing individual cognition imposes a narrow conception of proper functioning as a form of treatment. Furthermore, treatments whose aim is to reduce ASD symptoms, some argue, resemble arguments made by those wishing to eradicate other minority-cultures defined by functioning (that is, deaf-communities) (Barnbaum 2013, 134). Some individuals with ASD argue that they constitute their own unique culture that deserves respect (Glannon 2007, 2). Advocates for neurodiversity argue that conceptions of mental illness that include ASD assume that deviation from neurotypical function is evidence of mental dysfunction rather than a sign of the forms of neurodiversity present in any human population. Autistic flourishing must be understood as being different from (though not a degenerate form of) neurotypical flourishing. Equally important within the call to neurodiversity is the project to identify and articulate the ways that social institutions are built around and advantage persons of “neurotypical” function over others (Nadesan 2005, 30). Given the proper account of functional agency, many individuals with ASD should be seen as functional and not disordered or mentally ill. Although not as common, similar arguments are sometimes advanced for other mental disorders including psychopathy.

Psychopathy is a controversial construct. As currently understood, it is a spectrum-disorder and is diagnosed using the revised version of what is known as the “Psychopathy Checklist” (PCL-R). Importantly, psychopathy does not appear in any version of the DSM as a distinct disorder. In its place, the DSM offers Antisocial Personality Disorder (ASPD). ASPD is intended as an equivalent diagnosis, though there is significant evidence that ASPD and Psychopathy are distinct (Gurley 2009, 289; Ramirez 2013, 221-223). Psychopathy, discussed in more detail in section 4a, is characterized by an inability to feel empathic distress (to find the suffering of others painful) along with a pronounced difficulty in understanding the differences between norms that are purely conventional versus other types of norms (Dolan and Fullam 2010, 995). Beyond these symptoms, however, psychopathy is characterizable as a distinct form of agency that raises concern about neurodiversity. Some psychopaths are ‘successful’ in the sense that they avoid incarceration while satisfying PCL-R diagnostic criteria. Psychopaths of this sort are much more likely to be found in corporate and other institutional settings (academia and legal, medical, or corporate professions) (Babiak 2010, 174). In these contexts, some have argued that psychopathic personality traits should be seen as virtues (Anton 2013, 123-125). A more contextual understanding of psychopathy as a distinct way of relating to reasons, persons, and situations may lead us to appreciate the distinct contributions persons with these traits can make. Psychopathy, especially the effects that psychopathy has on emotional and moral competence, has raised challenges to traditional theories of moral responsibility.

4. Responsibility and Autonomy

Accounts of mental illness are closely tied to accounts of agency and responsibility. It is not unusual, following an especially horrific crime, for public discourse to include questions about a suspect’s mental health history and whether a suspect’s alleged mental illness should excuse them from responsibility. Eric Harris, one of the teens responsible for the Columbine High School massacre, was called a psychopath by psychologist Robert Hare (Cullen); media commentators noted that Adam Lanza, the man responsible for killing 26  at Sandy Hook Elementary School in Connecticut had been diagnosed with autism and raised questions about the role this may have played (Lysiak and Hutchinson). One reason why discussions like these happen so quickly after a crime likely has to do with the relationship between mental illness and the effects that mental illness are thought to have on responsibility. One view on the matter states that “[t]o diagnose someone as mentally ill is to declare that the person is entitled to adopt the sick role and that we should respond as though the person is a passive victim of the condition. Thus, the distinguishing features of dysfunction that we should look for are not a universally consistent set of exclusive qualities, but things that provide the grounds for the normative claim made by applying the label ‘mental illness’” (Edwards 2009, 80). A more careful analysis of the relationship between mental illness and theories of moral responsibility indicates that several factors are often thought to matter when it comes to holding a person with a mental illness responsible for what s/he has done.

a. Psychopathy

Philosophical theories of moral responsibility often make a distinction between two different aspects of responsibility: attributability and accountability (Watson 1996, 228). Attributability refers to all of the capacities that someone must have in order to be responsible. One minimal condition may be that an action is attributable to a person if it stems from her agency in the right sort of way. Accidental muscle spasms, for example, are not typically attributable to an agent.

If we are dealing with an agent that has satisfied these attributability conditions, we can ask further questions about how we should treat this person after she has acted. This is a question about accountability. Some philosophers have claimed that there are many different forms of accountability, each requiring its own justification (Fischer and Tognazzini 2012, 390). It is one thing to make sure that I intentionally made the rude comment at dinner, it is another to decide what should be done to me as a result. The former is a question about attributability, the latter is a question about accountability.

Emotional capacities form an important component of many theories of moral responsibility (Fischer and Ravizza 1999; Strawson 1962; Wallace 1994; Brink and Nelkin 2013). Reactive attitude theories give moral emotions a central location within a conception of attributability and accountability. The term ‘reactive attitude’ was originally coined by Peter Strawson as a way to refer to the emotional responses that operate in the context of responding (that is, reacting) to what people do (Strawson, 1962). Resentment, indignation, disgust, guilt, hatred, love, and shame (and potentially many others) are reactive attitudes. For Strawson, and philosophers who have followed him, to respond to a person’s action with one of these reactive attitudes is to simultaneously hold him accountable. A theory of moral attributability could be derived, in principle, via an examination of the conditions under which we believe it to be appropriate to respond to someone with a reactive attitude.

Reactive attitudes focus on the quality of their target’s will. What this means is that our reactive emotions are sensitive to facts about an agent’s intentions, desires, her receptivity to reason, and so forth. Philosophers refer to this as the Quality of Will Thesis. Reactive attitude theorists explain excuses and an exemption from responsibility by analyzing how an agent’s will affects our attitudes. Legitimate excuses, for example, lead us to believe that we should extinguish our reactive response to a person. Excuses, in effect, show us that we were wrong about the quality of a target’s will (Wallace 1994, 136-147). If you push me and I fall, I might resent you; however, if I realize that you pushed me in order to save me from oncoming traffic, my attitude will be modified. My resentment will have been extinguished and the pushing has been excused. Excuses inform us that we were mistaken about what action was done. Excuses are singular events, they do not cast doubt on a person’s agency, their attributability, but instead inform us that we were wrong about what intention/purpose we attributed to them. Agents that appear to be universally excused are more traditionally said to be exempt from responsibility.

An exemption occurs when we are led to question whether a person meets our attributability requirements. Imagine again that I am knocked over except this time I learn that the person who pushed me suffers from significant and persistent psychotic delusions. She believed, in that moment, that I was a member of the reptilian illuminati and pushing me would get the grey aliens to repossess her hated neighbor’s house. Unlike a case involving excuse, a person whose agency is hampered by delusions as severe as these is not a proper target for our reactive attitudes at all (Strawson, 1962; Broome and Bartolotti, 2009, 30). Agency as abnormal as this is better seen as exempt from judgments of attributability or accountability. Exempt agents are not true sources of their actions because exempt agents lack the ability to regulate their behavior in an intelligibly rational way (Wallace 1994, 166-180). It would not be appropriate to resent these agents.

The logic of excuses and exemptions has been thought to show that responsible agency requires that a responsible agent have epistemic access to moral reasons along with the ability to understand how these reasons fit together (Fischer and Ravizza 1997). Furthermore, some have proposed that an agent must have the opportunity to avoid wrongdoing (Shoemaker 2011, 6). Psychopaths seem to be rational and mentally ill at the same time; because of these features, they create difficulty for many theories of responsibility.

Perhaps the most notable diagnostic feature shared by psychopaths is an inability to feel empathic distress. You feel empathic distress when you are pained by the perception of others in pain. The processes that ground empathic distress are not thought to be under conscious control. Psychopaths do not respond as most people do when exposed to signs of others in pain (Patrick, Bradley and Lang 1993) Although the degree to which someone can have the capacity for empathic distress varies, psychopaths are significantly different from non-psychopaths (Flor, 2002).

Furthermore psychopaths have significant difficulty distinguishing between different types of norms. Psychologists have noted that most people are readily able to note the difference between a violation of moral norms from violations of conventional norms (Dolan and Fullam 2010). Normal persons tend to characterize moral norms as serious, harm-based, not dependent on authority, and generalizable beyond their present context; conventional norms are characterized as dependent on authority and contextual (Turiel 1977). Children began to mark the distinction between moral and conventional norms at around two years of age (Turiel 1977). Psychopaths, on the other hand, fail to consistently or clearly note the differences between them. Most psychopaths tend to treat all norms as norms of convention.  Non-psychopaths note a difference between punching someone (a paradigmatic moral norm violation) and failing to respond in the third-person to a formal invitation (a violation of a conventional norm).  Although there is significant controversy about how much we can infer from the psychopath’s inability to mark the ‘moral / conventional’ distinction, the inability, along with their previously noted empathic deficit, has led some philosophers to argue that psychopaths cause problems for traditional theories of moral responsibility(Turiel 1977).

Reactive attitude theorists have argued that psychopaths should be exempt or excused from moral responsibility on both epistemic and fairness grounds. Given their difficulty distinguishing between moral and conventional norms, many reactive attitude theorists conclude that psychopaths are not properly sensitive to moral reasons and cannot be fairly held accountable (Fischer and Ravizza 1998; Wallace 1994; Russell 2004). It would be unfair to hold someone morally responsible if they cannot understand moral reasons; it is therefore inappropriate to express reactive attitudes at psychopaths (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 78-79). However, some have argued that psychopathic agency can ground accountability ascriptions.

David Shoemaker, for example, has argued that: “[a]s long as [the psychopath] has sufficient cognitive development to come to an abstract understanding of what the laws are and what the penalties are for violating them, it seems clear that he could arrive at the conclusion that [criminal] actions are not worth pursuing for purely prudential reasons, say. And with this capacity in place, he is eligible for criminal responsibility” (Shoemaker 2011, 119). Although Shoemaker’s claim about legal responsibility has struck many as correct, the larger debate is over whether psychopaths are morally responsible for their choices given what we know about psychopathic agency.

If moral responsibility requires the capacity to understand moral reasons as distinctly moral and if, as many philosophers have supposed, this capacity is grounded on the ability to empathize with others, then psychopaths cannot understand moral reasons and should be excused. This puts pressure on Shoemaker’s characterization of psychopathic responsibility. If a psychopath’s understanding of moral reasons can be gauged by, for example, their poor ability to distinguishing moral norms from conventional norms then this also appears to be evidence for their lack of receptivity to moral reasons. Some philosophers have excused psychopaths for just this reason: “[c]ertain psychopaths…are not capable of recognizing…that there are moral reasons…this sort of individual is not appropriately receptive to reasons, on our account, and thus is not a morally responsible agent” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 79). Others, like Patricia Greenspan, have argued that psychopaths do have a form of moral disability, stemming from their emotional impairments, but that this form of disability should serve to mitigate, not extinguish, their responsibility (Greenspan 2003, 437).

Some philosophers note the consequences of psychopathic moral receptivity on the quality of will thesis. If reactive attitudes are sensitive to the quality of an agent’s will, then psychopaths cannot express immoral wills if they do not understand morality. If psychopaths cannot act on a will that merits reactive accountability then they lack attributability altogether. Jay Wallace has argued that “[w]hat makes it appropriate to exempt the psychopath from accountability…is the fact that psychopathy…disables an agent’s capacities for reflective self control” (Wallace 1994, 178).

Others argue that psychopaths may be held accountable by appealing to non-moral reactive attitudes like hatred, disgust or contempt. These attitudes, they claim, can be targeted at the quality of a psychopath’s will even if it is granted that they cannot act on immoral wills (Talbert 2012, 100). This is true even if the psychopath cannot appreciate that we have moral reasons for caring about our status as agents. Insofar as the psychopath can make judgments like these, then, in the words of Patricia Greenspan, “[the psychopath] is a fair target of resentment for any harm attributable to his intention to the extent that the reaction is appropriate to his nature and deeds. He need not be “ultimately” responsible in the sense that implies freedom to escape blame” (Greenspan 2003, 427). Because psychopaths are incapable of understanding moral reasons it is unfair to hold them morally responsible but there are forms of accountability and reactive address that are outside the moral sphere that may remain appropriate to direct at them.

Shame, in particular, appears to be a normatively significant reactive attitude that psychopaths have access (Ramirez 2013, 232). Shame grounds a family of retributive forms of accountability and has been though to serve as another way to hold psychopaths accountable even if it can be established that psychopaths are not capable of feeling or understanding moral reactive attitudes. If psychopaths are susceptible to shame then they can be fairly held accountable on shame-based grounds.

It is fair to hold psychopaths accountable in these non-moral (shame-based) ways based if they are able to feel the emotion being levied against them and can express a quality of will that these attitudes are sensitive to. More importantly, although psychopaths do not understand the distinctiveness and weight of moral reasons, their judgments can still express condemnable attitudes about those reasons. Greenspan notes that all of us have “blind spots” about certain narrow classes of reasons and we stand to those reasons in the same relation that psychopaths stand to moral reasons; these blind spots don’t excuse us from accountability (Greenspan 2003, 435).

b. Body Integrity Identity Disorder and Gender Dysphoria

Conceptions of mental illness, and mentally impaired agency, factor prominently over questions regarding the best way to treat a disorder. In 1997, Robert Smith, a surgeon at the Falkirk and District Royal Infirmary in Scotland, amputated one of this patient’s limbs at this patient’s request. The limb itself was healthy. There did not exist any medical justification for the amputation. In 1999, Smith amputated another patient’s healthy limb, again at the request of the patient, and was scheduled to perform a third amputation (on a third patient) before the hospital’s board of directors forbade him from amputating any more healthy limbs. Smith’s patients came to him with a set of symptoms that do not correspond to any particular disorder in the DSM. Smith’s patients were not under the delusion that their limbs did not belong to them; they did not see their limbs as disfigured or disgusting. Instead, his patients claimed that, from a young age, they had not thought of the limb as part of their authentic selves. They were, the patients claimed, never meant to be born with the limb and were seeking surgery to allow their inner representation of their bodily identity to match their external body presentation. The only way to do this was to amputate their healthy limb.

Patients who seek to radically alter their body via repeated surgeries or extreme dieting are ordinarily (barring other symptoms) diagnosed with Body Dysmorphic Disorder (BDD). BDD, however, requires that patients seek to modify their bodies because they find a specific part of their body disgusting or revolting or flawed. Patients with BDD also tend to engage in obsessive behaviors related to the body-part’s appearance (grooming, ‘mirror checking,’ etc) (APA 2013, 248). Smith’s patients, although they claimed to experience significant dysphoria because of their condition, did not do so because they found their limbs revolting or disfigured. They identified themselves as having a different condition: Body Integrity Identity Disorder. Like psychopathy, BIID is not a disorder cataloged in the DSM. Although BIID is not a DSM disorder, the APA does recognize that it appears distinct from BDD. “Body Integrity Identity disorder (apotemnophilia)…involves a desire to have a limb amputated to correct an experience of mismatch between a person’s sense of body identity and his or her actual anatomy. However, the concern does not focus on the limb’s appearance, as it would be in body dysmorphic disorder” (APA 2013, 246-247). Vilayanur Ramachandran and Paul McGeoch claim that they have discovered several of the neural correlates of BIID and these appear distinct from BDD; specifically, they claim that the disorder arises in part from a dysfunction of the right parietal lobe (Ramachandran and McGeoch 2007, 252).

Apart from the conceptual question over whether BDD and BIID are underlying manifestations of the same mental illness, individuals who claim to suffer from BIID raise significant ethical questions over the nature of mental illness, autonomy, and surgical treatments for dysphoria. Patients with BIID request that surgeons recognize and grant their request for surgical intervention to cure psychological suffering. Although the case of BIID has not received widespread philosophical attention, several different approaches have been advanced with regards to BIID patient requests for amputation. The purpose of these amputations is, they claim, to correct what they see as a mismatch between their inner and outer selves. Some philosophers have raised doubts about the ability of BIID patients to act on genuinely autonomous decisions (Mueller 2009, 35). One worry about challenging the autonomy of otherwise rational agents is that, in other domains, we appear to allow individuals significant freedom to modify their bodies for many reasons (aesthetic, political, self-expression, and so forth) without thereby questioning their status as autonomous agents (Bridy 2004). The right to bodily autonomy is typically construed as one of the guiding values in biomedical decision-making. Furthermore, BIID sufferers who have their requests for amputation denied often resort to self-harm. Many will harm their limbs to the point where amputation becomes medically necessary. Some have argued that it is morally permissible to grant BIID requests for amputation on the basis of harm-prevention (Bayne and Levy 2005, 78). Others have expressed concern over the use of surgical treatments for mental illnesses (if it is granted that BIID is a mental illness), given that the surgery persons with BIID are requesting involve the permanent removal of a capacity typically thought to important (Johnston and Elliot 2002, 430).

Given that BIID patients appear to have a locatable dysfunction in their temporal lobes (an area where internal body representations are thought to be located), some philosophers have argued that surgical treatments are unjustified if a non-surgical solution can be found. That is, if BIID results from the suffering that is caused by a mismatch between a patient’s internal representation of herself and her outer presentation, then if it possible to change the inner representation, and thereby evade surgery, and thus we have an obligation to ought to do so (Johnston and Elliot 2002, 432). This approach, however, forces us to confront philosophical responses to other conditions that involve mismatches between a person’s inner representation of their bodies and their external bodily presentation. In particular, patients with BIID argue that their condition is analogous to the suffering faced by those with gender dysphoria. These individuals often seek sexual reassignment surgery to alleviate their perceived embodiment mismatch (Bayne and Levy 2005, 80). Individuals who are suffering as a result of their assigned sex/gender and who exhibit a strong desire to alter their sex and gender characteristics can be diagnosed with Gender Dysphoria (APA 2013, 451-459). Unlike other patients desiring surgical body modification (for self-expression, to meet unrealistic gender ideals, and so forth), individuals with BIID or Gender Dysphoria both report that their desires for surgical alteration of their body presentation originate at a young age. Both groups seek to have their request for surgical alteration respected by those around them as a recognition of their autonomy and of the value that gender (or bodily integrity) play in the formation of an authentic self (Lombardi 2001, 870).

The discussion of BIID, its status as a mental disorder, and the ethics of granting a person’s request for amputation are all relatively new and hotly debated topics within the Philosophy of Mental Illness and Bioethics generally. This debate is, however, connected to a larger, better established, questions concerning patient autonomy and what it means for an agent to make autonomous choices. At the moment there does not exist a clear-consensus on the status of BIID as disorder or a received view on how to treat BIID requests for amputation.

5. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Erick Ramirez
Santa Clara University
U. S. A.

Roy Wood Sellars (1880—1973)

from The Papers of Roy Wood Sellars; used by permission of the Bentley Historical Library at the University of MichiganRoy Wood Sellars was one of a generation of systematic philosophers in America the likes of which has not been seen before or since. He was born in Seaforth, Ontario in Canada, and spent most of his career at the University of Michigan where he continued working well into his 90s.  He was a fiercely independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to follow his own instincts.  He believed that the philosopher should be well-grounded both in the history of philosophy and in the sciences, and that the philosopher should engage philosophically with the major moral, social, and political issues of the day. His central aims were to combine and harmonize the insights of science and common sense, to update religion with the scientific advances of the day, and to promote a science-grounded system of progressive humanistic values. Over the course of his long life, Sellars wrote and published prolifically. He is the author of 15 books, over 100 articles, 14 book reviews and several miscellaneous works. He is best known for his pioneering formulations of critical realism (roughly, the view that, first, human beings normally perceive independent objects with their sensations but do not perceive sensations, and, second, human beings must interpret their sensations), evolutionary naturalism (a naturalistic version of emergent evolution), the “double knowledge” and mind-brain identity theory (the view that human beings possess two modes of knowledge of a single material reality), and a defence of religious humanism (the view that religion must be reinterpreted in terms of its role in improving humanity’s “this-worldly” existence).  He is the primary author of the Humanist Manifesto I of 1933.  Finally, he is the father of Wilfrid Sellars, a highly influential philosopher in his own right, many of whose views, allowing for the different vernacular and emphasis of the two periods, are continuous with his father’s views.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critical Realism
  3. Evolutionary Naturalism
  4. Organicism
  5. Value Theory
  6. Socialism
  7. The Humanist Manifesto
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Roy Wood Sellars (July 9, 1880-Sept. 5, 1973), was born in Seaforth, Ontario, the second son of Ford Wylis and Mary Stalker Sellars. (Warren 2007, 211 lists Sellars’ birth year as 1883, but this is an aberration. Most sources, including Warren elsewhere, all give the 1880 date. See Warren 1970, xi-xxv; 1973, 19-22; 1975, Ch. 1; Frankena 1973-74.) His ancestors had migrated from the Glasgow region in Scotland to Nova Scotia and later moved to Ontario.  In Ontario, the Sellars’ clan married into the prestigious Wood family, which included a distinguished Captain from the War of 1812 (David Wood) and the acting commissioner of the North West Mounted Police and Commissioner of the Canadian Yukon Territory (Zachary Taylor Wood).  This made him a relative to the 12th president of the United States (Zachary Taylor).  Sellars also took great pride in the fact that one of his ancestors, Lord Stanley, appears in Bosworth Field in Shakespeare’s Richard III.

Roy’s father, Ford, had been a schoolteacher and a school principal until health considerations forced him to abandon that profession.  Thereafter, Ford studied at the Medical School at the University of Michigan and became a physician in 1882. After graduating from medical school, the Sellars family settled in Pinnebog, Michigan. As this was a small town, Roy’s youthful companions were farm boys. In his youth, Roy pursued swimming, baseball, and hockey, and retained an interest in sports all his life.  His father’s library was the only one in the neighbourhood, and though young Roy knew little about philosophy, he read Emerson and Carlyle and had numerous discussions with his father about medicine. In this small rural community, Roy’s intellectual gifts quickly set him apart and he was sent to the Ferris Institute in Big Rapids, Michigan to prepare for a university career.

Roy entered the University of Michigan in 1899, where he did his own cooking and washed dishes for his lodgings.  Due to his small-town, rural background, the insecure young boy felt unprepared for a university program but he resolved to “make a go of it” and, upon his graduation, was voted one of the top two scholars in the class.  He studied widely in both the arts and the sciences, including rhetoric and calculus.  Sellars received his B.A. in 1903 from the University of Michigan and went on to Hartford Theological Seminary, where he studied New Testament Greek, Hebrew, and Arabic (and read the Koran in the original). He acquired a critical historically and culturally grounded approach to religion and a sympathy for social liberalism and humanism that remained with him throughout his life. In 1904 Professor R.M. Wenley of the Department of Philosophy at Michigan recommended Sellars for a fellowship at the University of Wisconsin, where he studied for a time before returning to the University of Michigan as Professor Wenley’s replacement while the latter was on sabbatical leave. Apart from a brief stint at University of Chicago in the summer of 1906 and a year studying in Europe (either 1908-09 or 1909-10 – sources differ on this), Sellars remained at the University of Michigan for the remainder of his approximately 40-year career, first as an instructor and doctoral student (he earned the Ph.D. in 1908 or 09 – again, sources differ), and then as a member of the permanent faculty.

During his year in Europe Sellars studied at the Sorbonne and discussed the possibility of a naturalistic formulation of emergent evolution with Henri Bergson. Bergson in turn referred him to the scientist and vitalist Hans Driesch. Sellars went on to study with Driesch and the neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband at Heidelberg. The precise details of Driesch’s influence on Sellars are not known but it seems likely that he directed Sellars to the study of physiology.  After returning to Michigan from his European adventures, Sellars developed a new course in the philosophy of science in which he used James Ward’s Naturalism and Agnosticism, as well as texts by Huxley, Mach, Poincaré, and Pearson.  Many of his students at this time came from the physical and biological sciences. Sellars remained scientifically-oriented throughout his life, a trait which he passed to his son Wilfrid. Even when Sellars was inspired by Bergson’s romantic or mystical theory of creative evolution, he sought (much like Popper) to recast it in more “naturalistic” terms acceptable to the sciences. Sellars’ naturalistic bent put him at odds with his most ardent supporter, Professor Wenley. Although Wenley regarded him as his best student, he could not accept Sellars’ naturalism, and did not approve of the publication of Sellars’ thesis by the University.

Sellars enjoyed considerable teaching success. His course, “The Principles and Problems of Philosophy,” was favorably remembered by many alumni who found it a “liberating” experience, “like taking a cold bath” (Frankena, 1973-74, 230). Several of the students in his political philosophy course, in which he discussed democracy, communism, socialism, and fascism, remarked that though they had expected him to be a propagandist, the course turned out to be a good scholarly treatment of the issues with no discernible bias.  Sellars had earlier taught a course in elementary logic and eventually published a textbook based on that course.  It was a chance reading of that textbook by Charles Stevenson that led him to the study of philosophy and later become one of Sellars’ colleagues (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).

Sellars married his cousin Helen Maud Stalker, an intelligent and accomplished woman, in 1911. He wrote the Preface to Helen’s translation (from the French) of Celestine Bougle’s Evolution of Values.  Helen provided Sellars with much support and they remained close until her death in 1962.  In 1912 and 1913, respectively, their two children, Wilfrid and Cecily, were born. Cecily become a state-employed psychologist in North Dakota, but was killed in an automobile accident in 1954, an event which impacted Sellars’ scholarly work for decades. Twenty years later, well into his 90’s, he was still working on papers that had been in progress at the time of her death.  Wilfrid Sellars went on to become a highly influential philosopher in the latter half of the 20th century who, like his father, emphasized a firm grounding in the history of philosophy, fluency in the sciences, and a systematic approach to philosophical problems. It is noteworthy that his son Wilfrid developed a sophisticated version of scientific realism that builds on his father’s critical realism. In fact, Wilfrid’s views are often similar in substance to his father’s even if they differ in language and style.

Sellars believed in a fruitful, reciprocal relationship between epistemology and ontology, but saw epistemology as philosophically basic.  His most vehement criticism of other philosophers was often that they were weak in epistemology, but he also considered himself a proud ontologist. Sellars also had a strong interest in ethics, social philosophy, and political philosophy.  Indeed, Sellars belonged to a genre of philosophers, which includes his son Wilfrid, that is rare today, who believed that a philosopher must be knowledgeable in virtually all areas of philosophy. Sellars made contributions to epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, the philosophy of science, social and political philosophy, and the history of philosophy. He could discourse in an intelligent and informed a way about Heidegger, Sartre, and Bergson just as he could about Russell, Carnap, or Einstein.  He was as at home in a discussion about ethics or social and political philosophy as he was in logic or scientific method.

Sellars was an independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to pursue his own philosophical direction.He formulated what may have been the most viable form of realism in his era. He offered a course, titled “Main Concepts of Science,” that may have been the very first course offered anywhere in the philosophy of science.  He formulated evolutionary naturalism, the view that life and mind are emergent products of naturalistically conceived evolution (i.e., without invoking the supernatural element in Alexander or Bergson’s élan vital). He (1923b; 1938a) pioneered the identity theory of the “brain-mind,” which he called the “double knowledge emergence approach” to mind-brain identity.  Although his basic views changed little over his career, he was constantly reformulating, developing, and clarifying them.  In his later years he watched as many of his views became commonplace, without being recognized for his role in their genesis.  

Perhaps because of his fierce independence, Sellars often found himself out of the mainstream. Until 1930, philosophy was dominated by idealism and pragmatism, religion by theism, and social theory by capitalism, while Sellars was a realist, an atheist, and a socialist. Later, analytical philosophy came into dominance and fundamentalism resurged in religion, neither of which appealed to him. Socialism did eventually enjoy a resurgence, but it was Marxist and totalitarian while Sellars was committed to a more moderate and gradual reform of social institutions based on rational persuasion.  Sellars was also critical of the American philosophy in his day. He (1970a, vii; see also Warren, 1975, 28) once remarked that, amongst philosophers, it is “almost always a Sellars against the world”. He often felt that he was better understood by psychologists and biologists than by philosophers and that he was better understood in Europe than in America (Warren 1975, 25).

Nonetheless, Sellars was a respected member of the philosophical community in America and it is safe to say that he inspired a personal affection from many of his colleagues that is unusual. He served as Vice-President of the Eastern Division of the APA in 1918 and President of the Western Division in 1923. He was an energetic correspondent and carried on friendly discussions with Samuel Alexander, C. Judson Herrick, Lloyd Morgan, and Marvin Farber. He also corresponded with F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, C.A. Strong, and Donald Williams, and he debated with D.C. Macintosh, H.N. Wieman, and Sydney Hook.  In 1954 the journal Philosophy and Phenomenological Research devoted an entire issue to Sellars’ philosophy, and in 1964 Andrew Reck listed Sellars as one of the 10 most notable philosophers in recent American philosophy. At the University of Michigan the Roy Wood Sellars Chair was created in his honor and Bucknell University honored him by establishing the Roy Wood Sellars Lecture Series. The first Roy Wood Sellars Lectures were given by Warren and the second by Wilfrid Sellars with Roy Sellars in attendance. In 1970 Notre Dame University honored Roy in his 90th year with a symposium on his philosophy, including presentations by Andrew Reck, Wilfrid Sellars, and C.F. Delany.  Although Roybelonged to a generation of America’s greatest systematic philosophers, Frankena (1973-4, 231) observes that, with hindsight, Sellars may have been one of the most important of them.  However, the fact that his son Wilfrid has developed a powerful formulation of his father’s views may be the greatest testament to Roy Wood Sellars’ lasting achievement.

2. Critical Realism

Much of Sellars’ philosophical work is an attempt to replace outdated mythopoetical views about knowledge, religion, values, and so forth, by up-to-date scientifically grounded views.  Science, he holds, “builds” on common sense, but since it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, the philosopher’s job is to harmonize the common sense and scientific frameworks (1932a, v; 1973, 160-161).

In his first book, Critical Realism , he attempts to justify common sense realism, which is also the view of philosophers when they are not in a reflective mood (1916a, 6)—the view that people perceive real external objects, not just intermediaries of some kind. He also aims to clarify the relation of common sense realism to scientific knowledge: “We start from independent things; and not from percepts” (1916a, 3).  Sellars also argues against the main theories of perception of his day: idealism, representationalism, pragmatism, and positivism, all of which he saw as undermining common sense realism. Other versions of critical realism were espoused by Santanaya and Lovejoy.

The defence of common sense realism, he (1941b; 1959c) holds, requires a robust defence of the correspondence theory of truth.The basic error in those mistaken views of perception is the failure to distinguish between the content and object of perception (1922a, 70 n 4).  Since the content of perception is fixed by aspects of the organism, those mistaken theories wrongly infer that the object of perception is not independent of the perceiver.

Sellars’ critical realism requires real substances (as opposed to ideas, universals, impressions, and so forth) as objects of perception. He (1929c; 1970a, 32; 1973, 182, 346-348, 353) rejects “the historical desiccation of the category of substance,” that is, the whittling down of the Ancient and Medieval robust notion of substance to Locke’s “I know not what”. While representationalism, idealism, pragmatism, and positivism tend to volatize the object of perception into ideas, sensations, or a mere placeholder for properties, Sellars holds the normal objects of perception are real full-bodied independent substances.

Although Sellars’ critical (or “referential”) realism is “built up from” common-sense realism, it is not identical with common sense since the latter has not faced the problems arising from discrepancies in perception (See his 1922c; 1924b; 1927b; 1927c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1959b; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1970, 6-8, 13, 15-16, 17-27, 33-35, 161; see also Warren, 1975, 35, 37). Despite his defense of common sense realism,Sellars rejects the “naïve realism” that identifies the immediate datum of knowledge with objects in the world. He distinguishes between the common sense realism of the ordinary person and the crude philosophical understanding embodied in naïve realism, the view that in perception one actually “intuits” the object (1963; see also Warren, 1975, 36-7).  In opposition to that naïve view, he holds that in perception one interprets one’s sensations. The interpretation of sensations is not a purely intellectual process: “A gull does not in the Lockean way apprehend his sensation …. [It] looks through his sensation at the fish in the water. It is a one-step sensi-motor process” (See his 1970a, 118; 1973, 49-50, 161; 1975; and Warren, 1975, 38-45!).

Sellars holds that the biological basis of knowledge consists in the organism’s adjustment to its external environment, where both the internal adjustment of the organism and external factors must be taken into account.  He sees his version of critical realism as a “mediate realism” that attempts to do justice both to the contribution of the perceiving organism and the claims of objective knowledge. That is, he aims to do justice to both the real and the “ideal” sides of cognition. It is absolutely crucial, he (1922a, 76-77) stresses, to distinguish between the causal conditions of perception and the referential act of perceiving. Perception is the interpretation of sense mediated by factors both internal and external to the perceiving subject. These internal factors are not to be confused with the mechanism or processes that underlie perception (that is, the account of the internal mechanism or processes is not an account of the content of perception). By taking account of both the internal and external factors, he seeks to avoid the evils of both naïve realism and the non-realist view that the objects of perception are not independent of mind.

The attempt of simultaneous justice to both  the subjective contribution of the organism and  the claims of objective knowledge is no easy matter. Various critical realists could not always agree how best to formulate the view (See Ramsperger, 1967). For example, Sellars (1970a, 5) rejects the sort of critical realism espoused by Santayana that erects a barrier of essences between the perceiver and the external object. Perhaps his basic point is that human beings perceive independent objects with their sensations, but do not perceive sensations, essences, or other mental or ideal intermediaries themselves (Warren, 1975, 38, 42). Sellars (1970a, 114-5) stresses that the fact that the object is present to consciousness does not mean that it must be present within consciousness.

Although Sellars’ sometimes wrote as if his version of critical realism is definitive,few agree that it is unproblematic. Since he acknowledges the subjective contribution of the perceiver, it can resemble representationalism. Since, however, he emphasizes that perception is a direct perception of independent objects, it can resembles naïve realism. Sellars counters that critical realism is the view that human knowing is a direct knowledge of objects, but that this knowledge is mediated by “logical ideas” (See his 1970a, 113 and the “Epilogue on Berkeley” in his 1968).  The problem is that it is hard to see how knowledge can be both mediated and direct. The claim that one perceives independent objects via one’s sensations but does not perceive those sensations themselves is a fair negative point, but seems to require a more robust positive account of the precise role of sensations in the perception of external objects. Sellars’ version of critical realism is intriguing, but many feel it requires further clarification (Chisholm 1955; Herbert, 1994; Wright, 1994; Levine, 2007).  Perhaps this is why Sellars continued to return to the issue again and again over the decades (See his 1929a; 1929b; 1929c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1950a; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1965; 1969d, Ch’s 4-5; 1970a, 112-131; and so forth).

3. Evolutionary Naturalism

Sellars does not have a fully developed philosophy of science, this being more characteristic of his son’s generation, but he does have definite views about scientific method and about the close relation of science to philosophy, some of which do anticipate his son’s views.  Sellars’ conception of science and its relation to philosophy is intimately related to his own views of evolutionary naturalism.

In Sellars’ (1973, 160-1) view, science “builds” on common sense, but it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, and so forth. He rejects the monochrome Newtonian universe in favor of an evolution-generated hierarchy of different levels of emergent causality: Under certain favorable conditions, life emerges from matter and mind from life (See his 1920c; 1922a, Ch. IX; 1924a; 1927a; 1933a; 1944b; 1959a; 1932, 4; 1969d, 64-68; and 1973, 290).  He is committed to the emergence of downward causal forces. That is, while the emergence of higher-order entities is causally dependent upon lower-order entities (bottom-up causation), once they emerge, the former may causally influence the latter (top-down causation) in ways not reducible to bottom-up causation (see Roy’s 1970, 38, 44-46 and Meehl and Sellars 1956). Sellars insists that the higher emergent entities are still material systems.

Although he does not deny the possibility of reductions in special cases, his conception of science is generally anti-reductionist (1922a, 16, 332; 1970, 136, 141, 240-1; Warren, 1975, 29).This explains why he holds that the scientific method cannot be identified with that of any particular science, such as physics (Warren, 1975, 29). When he (1932a, 5) describes his own view as physicalism, he does not mean physicalism in the more familiar sense but a view that accepts his own critical realism and emergence. Each of the sciences; natural, psychological, and social, treats of a particular domain in the emergent hierarchy, but none is privileged over the others.

The commitment to real independent substances in his critical realism dovetails with his evolutionary naturalism. The different levels in the emergent hierarchy are not just of events or properties, but of substances (1922a, Ch. XIII; 1932a, Ch. XII; 1943c; 1959a; 1970, 215).  Though the higher emergent levels are not reducible to material mechanisms, they do not introduce new non-natural forces. Life and mind are not non-natural forces entering nature from outside, but emergent capacities of natural substances (See his 1917b, 276-283; 1922a, vii-ix, 277-278, 333-336; 1933a; 1950b). See Emmet (1932, 222-23) for Whitehead’s very different Platonistic view)!

Sellars tends not to employ the classical formulation of emergence, that certain wholes are “greater than the sum of their parts”.  He (1922a, 302) does, however, use such formulations occasionally. See also his remarks on the relations of wholes and parts (1917a, 31, 145, 288). Since he talks of new unitary substantial wholes, talk of separable “parts” may be seen as misleading.Wilfrid Sellars (1949) clarifies his father’s somewhat obscure views. In general, however, in language reminiscent of Bergson but understood naturalistically, Sellars (1922a, viii, 17, 139, 167, 214-215, 297, 303, 322, 335, and so forth; 1932a, 3, 401; Blitz 2010) holds that modern science is beginning to accept the notion of “creative synthesis”, the view that change sometimes involves “the genesis of what Locke called ‘real essences’”.For a discussion of the classical part-whole formulations of emergence see McDonough (2002).

Agential causality, which is central to Sellars’ ethics, is underwritten by his evolutionary naturalism (1970a, 262-267). Agential causality emerges at a certain level of evolution and organization (1970a, viii; 1973a, Ch. 15). Human beings possess no “pushbutton free will,” but rather, an emergent capacity of the human brain is able to develop new judgments and standards that make a causal difference in behaviour (1932a, 396, 405; 1957a; 1959a; 1970a, 305; 1973a, 290-1, 361-384). He called his view “critical anthropomorphism” (1917b, 278).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism colors his view of the relation between science and philosophy. The diversity of the various irreducible levels in the emergent hierarchy requires a diversity of distinct autonomous sciences: physics, chemistry, biology, and so forth.  This yields problems with which none of the special sciences are prepared to deal.  The physicist can describe the behaviour of subatomic particles, but, qua physicist, is unfamiliar with the regularities and properties at higher levels in the emergent hierarchy. Similar points, in reverse, can be made about the biologist (psychologist, sociologist, and so forth), who are familiar with the objects at their higher levels of the hierarchy, but qua biologist, psychologist, sociologist, and so forth, are unfamiliar with the laws and properties at the lower levels.  Since, however, the evolutionary naturalist holds that the different levels in the emergent hierarchy constitute autonomous regions that fall outside any of the particular sciences, and since the items at different levels of the emergent hierarchy are linked in interesting ways that cannot be captured by reductions of one level to another, knowledge of the interrelations between these levels requires a different sort of knowledge, not possessed by any of the special sciences.

It is the distinctive job of the philosopher to obtain an overview of the relations between the different sciences, and between the sciences and the common sense framework, harmonize the new levels in the emergent hierarchy with each other and with the more stable and fixed background of inorganic nature (1922a, 263, 329; 1932a, 44ff, 79ff, 92ff).  Thus, philosophy completes science. “The job of philosophy is to size up the whole situation; and it often needs new leads” (1973, 161).One can see here the general outlines of his son’s (1991, 2, 18-19, 34, and so forth) view, that the distinctive job of philosophy is to obtain a synoptic view of the way things hang together, in the broadest sense.

Sellars published Evolutionary Naturalism in 1922, a year before both Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and Alexander’s “Natural Piety” (Warren, 1970, vi), although the latter two came to be better known for the formulation of emergent evolution. Warren (1973b) remarks that Morgan told Sellars that to his knowledge, Sellars was the first to publish on emergent evolution.  Bergson’s Creative Evolution, first published in 1907, does precede Sellars’ publications, but it differs in that it posits the non-scientific élan vital. Sellars saw his position as more systematic, empirical, and naturalistic than Bergson’s and Morgan’s since it does not introduce any non-natural controlling factors. Although Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism fell out of favor as reductionism gained ground, emergentism has once again arisen as a viable position in science, philosophy and religion (Beckermann, Kim, and Flores 1992; Hasker 2001; McDonough 2002; Davies and Clayton 2008, Blitz 2010; Vintiadis, and so forth).

4. Organicism

Although Sellars (1991, 415, 433) states that no other writer in recent times had challenged him as much, he claims that his own view deserves the title “philosophy of organism” more than Whitehead’s.  This is because Sellars sees living organisms as substantial wholes, whereas Whitehead sees them as a societies or nexuses of more fundamental entities. Sellars (1922a, vii-ix, 164-168) sees an organism as a product of emergent evolution in which simpler materials at a lower level are organized into new integrated substances with new causal powers at higher levels in the hierarchy. This higher-order substance is a true unity and not, as for Whitehead, a plurality (see Roy’s 1961b).

The living organism is, for Sellars, the background against which consciousness must be understood (1922a, 63, 298; 1932a, 446-7; 1949b, 95, 99). This leads him (1991, 415; 1970, 205) to agree with contemporaneous developments in physics, chemistry, biology, and psychology that emphasize fields and Gestalten, both of which are wholes that are not reducible to more fundamental entities.  Even so, the focus on the important organismic background should not lead one to confuse knowledge of the object with knowledge about the organism (1922a, 186-187). For similar reasons, he does not see a person as a combination of two separable substances as in Cartesian Dualism. He (1991, 415) describes his own position, which rejects the vitalistic and non-evolutionary elements in classical Aristotelianism, as an “Aristotelianism of the Left”. The same considerations lead him (1932a, 14-15; 1961b; 1973, 354-56; 1991, 416-7) to oppose the “reformed subjectivism” which he saw as the source both of the Platonism and rejection of naturalism and humanism in Whitehead’s philosophy of organism.

5. Value Theory

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism make values “centripetal” to human life and supports a humanistic theory of ethics and religion (1932a, 448; 1948b; 1949b, 78; 973, Ch. 14), all of which he counts as a virtue  He holds that human freedom emerges at a certain level or organization of organic development and lends a dignity and meaning to human life that is absent in a purely mechanical cosmos (1957a; 1949b, 103-4; 1970, 319-331).  Whereas the “old materialism” had been criticized as being unable to accommodate higher values, Sellars sees it as a virtue of his “new materialism” that it “flowers into humanism” (See also his 1932a, 19; 1944b; 1950b, 427-428). The emergence of living organisms from inorganic nature is a necessary condition for the existence of a world of values (1932a, 446-7).  It is people and human institutions that form the “hot center” of conscious life, while the inorganic world forms the “periphery and yet absolute condition for the whole drama” (1932a, 450).

Sellars is generally averse to ontological dualisms (1916a, 204, 245; 1922, 3091973a, Ch. 14; see also Sellars, McGill, and Farber, 1949) and holds they have done particular damage in value theory (see Roy’s 1917b, Ch. XVI; 1918, Ch. XII and Ch. XVI; 1921a; 1950b; Warren, 1975, 27, 41-2).  In general, he holds that each side in value-dualisms captures some fragment of the truth, but in their pure forms such dualisms are incapable of yielding a coherent theory of value.  Whereas some theories emphasize the objective basis, and others the subjective basis, for values, Sellars’ aims to do justice both “to the possibilities in the object and in the subject,” while taking “as objective a view of value as possible” (1932a, 445, 475; 1969d, Ch. 12). He sees this as an area where compromise and balance are essential. Value judgments are similar to cognitive judgments in some ways, but different in others. One can make mistakes in value judgments just as in cognitive judgments, but physical science does not discover values as properties of objects (1932a, 445; 1973, 344).  Rather, values are an interpretation of objects as having the capacity to affect human life in ways important to an individual or group (1932a, 445, 459-473; Warren 1975, 40).

In cognitive judgments, human beings regard themselves as disclosing the object itself, while in value judgments human beings are estimating the object with respect to its bearing on human life (1932a, 46).When the subjectivist claims that values are based on feelings, Sellars agrees, but holds that these subjective feelings are directed towards facts that can be objectively criticized. When the objectivist claims that values are based on objective facts, Sellars agrees, but holds that these facts only have value when “estimated with respect to human living” (1932a, 444). In valuing we are constrained by objective factors just as in perceiving, but we are also “interpreting” the object in the light of factors which are taken to be intimately linked to the self (1932a, 471; 1970, 244, 253, and so forth). It is important to acknowledge that Sellars (1922a, 29-30, 194-5, 312; and see and Wood, 1950, 525) does see the need for a kind of dualism in epistemology.

Sellars subjects “absolutism” and “factualism” about values to similar criticisms.  He (1932a, 457-459) rejects belief in absolute or intrinsic values since “a good which is not good for someone strikes me as meaningless”.  He (1932a, 16ff) describes “Eleatic views” that deny the significance of everyday beliefs as versions of “illusionism”. Similarly, when the “factualist” attempts to reduce values to some fact about human beings or human groups, for example, the fact that human beings prefer certain things and not others, Sellars (1932a, 452-3; 1970a, 245) replies that people are not like stones with only one possible reaction.  That is, alluding to his critique of “naïve realism”, these various “facts” are always really only some naïve immediate value (1932a,452). Even if some authority, for example, a church or an anthropologist, holds X is good, it is always possible to criticize that naïve immediate valuation by estimating its effect on human life. No authority, neither religious nor “scientific”, is immune to criticism.

Sellars (1932a, 446-7) stresses that “the background” to judgments of value is the emergent level of living organisms presupposed by the existence of value.Since an organism emerges from inorganic nature in the evolutionary process, his evolutionary naturalism is an essential part of his account of the genesis of the complex subject-object situations required for the existence of value (1922a, Ch. XV; 1932a, 68, 442; 1970a, 248-9, 267). Referring to his “open ended” emergent evolutionism (1970a, 267), he states that his “metaphysics of ethics in many ways represents its culmination” and that any attempt to explain the existence of value by reference to mere lifeless nature cannot succeed (1973, 359-60).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism is not just another version of materialism, but is enriched by his belief in the evolution of an emergent hierarchy containing the higher levels organisms and persons (1950b, 420, 422-6; 1970a, 154-173).  His naturalism “does not,” as some older versions of materialism, focused only on the physical sciences, did, “ignore the specialized areas of human living, morals, art, politics” (1932a, 449). Because man is “not just a knower but an agent” and a “desirer of good things”, the philosopher, in order to avoid an overly narrow conception of the human situation, must turn to the poets for a sense of “creative agency and decision” (1932a, 449).

6. Socialism

In The Next Step in Democracy (1916b) Sellars defends his own version of socialism (See also his 1970a, 272-73, 277-79, 289, 311, 334). Sellars distinguishes three stages of socialism: (1) the Utopian socialism of Fourier and Saint-Simon, (2) the “political socialism” that began with Marx’s Communist Manifesto, and (3) the later modification of Marx’s socialism based on an updated understanding of how society and people really work (1944-45b; 1970a, 272). The political socialism of Marx is called “scientific socialism” by its admirers, “orthodox socialism” by its critics (1970a, 279ff).

Sellars also rejects Utopian socialism as naïve and romantic, having little understanding of the obstacles to the creation of a genuine socialist society (1970a, 81). In contrast to the Utopian socialists, Sellars promotes a gradual modification of existing institutions in the light of new scientific advances with a full awareness that any “reckless unsettling” of the social foundations leads to disaster (1970a, 280, 292-293).  Sellars rejected the program to overthrow tradition on the basis of naïve romantic dreams of wishful thinking.

Although Sellars (1970a, 28-287) sees Marx as a fairly realistic and concrete “sort”, he holds that Marx was misled by revolutionary ardour into seeing history as a constant war of class struggle. Sellars, by contrast, sees the Marxian stage of socialism, not so much scientific as realistic, but he thinks Marxist realism (the recognition that the old order will not easily give way to rational persuasion) led to the introduction of a dangerous militancy into socialism. Further, whereas many saw Marx’s determinism as a strength, Sellars takes Marx’s view that capitalist society contains the seeds of its own destruction as empirically falsified (1970a, 308). Further, Marx underestimated the ability of capitalism to make adjustments (1970a, 284, 286, 307-8; 1944-45b).  Sellars (1970a, 287, 303-304) replaces Marx’s “semi-mechanical and almost wholly deterministic” outlook by the view that the people must learn to emancipate themselves by participation in the political process. Participation in the democratic process requires the development of the necessary virtues: cooperation and ingenuity, the application of continuous experiments to find out what works best, the determination and patience to approach the ultimate goal by slow degrees (1970a, 287).  Whereas Marx seems to absolve the individual of responsibility for the eventual outcome by representing the march towards the goal as the inevitable result of the great supra-individual forces of history, Sellars (1971a, 333-334) emphasizes the essential educative role of the individuals participation in the process that renders the individual prepared for and worthy of the final goal. Although Sellars was sometimes seen as a radical in his day (1970a, 272), he defines socialism as a democratic movement whose aim is to secure the greatest justice and liberty for the maximum number of people at any given time, without the wholesale overturning of tradition by violent methods (1943d).  In opposition to the militant socialism of old, he presents a moderate democratic recipe for achieving socialist goals via “rational reform” while escaping the “vicious dialectic of hate and counter-hate” (1970a, 291, 304). Progress cannot be achieved by one side imposing its view on the whole but by the “interplay” of conservatives on the one side and liberals on the other that the direction and speed of social progress is determined” (1916b, 3; 1970a, 307-308).

7. The Humanist Manifesto

Early in his studies, Sellars considered a career in comparative religion, but with his usual idiosyncratic twist, he wished to do so from a scientific, humanistic, and atheistic point of view. In Evolutionary Naturalism, he describes the religious impulse as “one of the most admirable … in human nature” (1922, 5; see also his 1918, 26 and his 1969a, Ch. 11), but he also holds that religion must be “brought to the world disclosed through science” (1918, 44-45, 222; see also Warren 1975, 24-25).  Given his naturalism, the appeal to supernatural entities and explanations must be eliminated and replaced by an emphasis on human flourishing as citizens of a shared world (Wilson, 1995, Ch. 17).  Whereas religions traditionally conceived salvation as something that comes to man from the outside, Sellars (1918, 12) sees it as something that must arise out of the “loyal union” of human beings who share a belief in the values of life. Traditional religions also often see creation as completed, meaning that a person’s job is merely to understand the pattern in order to follow it, Sellars (1947), reflecting Bergson’s influence, holds that people must learn to recognize creation as “a going concern,” in which their contribution to the further emergence of the universe is essential.

In 1932, Sellars was approached by Raymond Bragg on behalf of a Chicago-based group of humanists associated with The New Humanist (for which Bragg was an associate editor). The group had for some time been contemplating the need for an official statement of the religious humanist position, but recognizing the difficulties inherent in group authorship, chose to have a complete first draft written by a single author. After hearing him lecture in Chicago, Bragg approached Sellars about the project and Sellars accepted with the unanimous support of the Chicago group.  The document published in the following year, the Humanist Manifesto of 1933 (or Humanist Manifesto I), is the result of numerous revisions by multiple contributors upon Sellars’ original draft. While that draft has been lost to history, the fact that Sellars signed the 1933 document, and later-on claimed primary authorship of it, suggests that whatever changes were made did not, in his mind, affect the substance of what he had written. For these reasons it has Sellars as the pre-eminent author of the Manifesto, although that is not to minimize the contributions of others.

In the Manifesto, Sellars attempts to put the essence of his religious humanism into a form suitable not just for fellow professors, but for the general public. It is important to remember that along with many of the original signers of the Humanist Manifesto I, Sellars conceived of humanism not as a replacement for religion but as a new religion (1918, Ch. XVI; 1969d, Ch. 11; Wilson 1995, Ch. 17).  Nevertheless, his naturalized religion shades inevitably into a this-worldly humanist philosophy that, he (1932a, 7) holds, attempts to blend “those two great naturalists, Spinoza and Nietzsche, uniting the passion for life of the one with the cosmic calm of the other.”

Humanist Manifesto I was conceived as the statement of a new secular religion designed to replace the old religions that had been founded on claims of supernatural revelation, or on fear and helplessness (1918c, Foreword).  It opposes an acquisitive and profit-motivated society, and outlines a mutually cooperative worldwide society committed to the rational resolution of problems. Thirty-four of sixty-five persons asked to sign did, including Edwin Burtt of Cornell, and John Dewey and John Hermann Randall of Columbia. About one-third of the signatories were professors from the University of Chicago and from Columbia University; about half were Unitarians (Wilson 1995, Ch. 10).

The Manifesto contains fifteen theses (briefly summarized here):

  1. The universe is self-existing, not created.
  2. Man is a part of nature that has emerged in a continuous process.
  3. Since humanists hold an organic view of life, they reject the traditional mind-body dualism.
  4. Man’s religious culture is a result of gradual natural development as a result of  man’s interaction with the natural environment and social heritage.
  5. Science has shown that supernatural and cosmic guarantors of human values are unsupported, so religion must re-formulate its views in the light of scientific knowledge.
  6. Theism, modernism, and other varieties of “new thought” have been surpassed.
  7. The distinction between the secular and the religious cannot be defended any longer: Nothing that is human is alien to religion.
  8. The purpose of man’s life is the complete realization of the possibilities in human personality.
  9. Humanists find their religious feelings expressed in an intensified sense of their personal lives and the cooperative effort to produce social well-being.
  10. There are no uniquely religious emotions connected with the supernatural.
  11. Man must discourage sentimental hopes and wishful thinking and face the challenges of life by embracing rational procedures.
  12. Religious humanists aim to enhance the creative element in man in order to add to produce a more meaningful life.
  13. All social associations should exist for the promotion of human flourishing.
  14. A socialized cooperative economic system must be established for the fair distribution of the necessities of life to all human beings.
  15. Religious humanists seek to affirm human life rather than deny it, seek to discover the full possibilities of life, not run from them, and aim to establish the conditions of a just and meaningful life for all, not just the privileged few.

For a complete statement of the theses, see Sellars (1970a, 331-335).

Some humanists declined to sign Manifesto I. Dr. Arthur Morgan stated several differences of emphasis, but also some more substantial objections (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Anticipating recent views in “deep ecology” (See Sessions, 1995), Morgan felt that Manifesto I placed too much emphasis on human life and failed to recognize that there may be significance in other life-forms. Morgan called for a “race of businessmen” which sees business as a public trust, not a means to personal enrichment, and he objected to the “unjustified cocksureness” of Manifesto I, feeling that it is “not dictated by humility or imagination”. Morgan also felt that though religion should be disciplined by science, it should not be limited by it.  His most biting criticism was that many humanists are “not strong in faith, hope, and love.”

John Haynes Holmes, the prominent Unitarian minister and noted pacifist, declined to sign Manifesto I since he objected to the rejection of theism in the 6th thesis, holding instead that a rational humanism “inevitably unfolds into a rational theism” (Wilson 1995,Ch. 7). He also found terms like “modernism,” in the 6th thesis “hopelessly vague” and wondered why a humanist could not claim to represent the best of modernism. Although he found the deism of some of the authors “not half bad,” he insists that “Theism … is the blossom that grows on the plant of humanism, the poetry into which it unfolds in mystic beauty”.

Howard Shapley, a Harvard astronomer, spoke for many scientists who were reluctant to make judgments about religion: “As a social philosopher I am embryonic and I have decided that I should not misuse my position by pretending to intelligence or comprehension in a field in which my thoughts have been too scattered and probably too prejudiced” (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Although Shapley agrees with current traditions of protecting the weak, he is not sure that this is in keeping with “the biological traditions of the planet”. His point is not that the weak should not be protected, but that, as a scientist, he cannot claim to know this, and, therefore, he should not put his authority as a scientist behind the claim.

In his retrospective on Humanist Manifesto I, Wilson remarks that he now feels it to be a mistake to tie humanism directly to socialism. Humanism should not be tied to any particular economic system, but should concern itself with the more general goals of ending disease, poverty, ignorance, prejudice, and so forth (Wilson 1995, Ch. 18).

Later versions of the Manifesto found their own objections.  Humanist Manifesto II found the language in Manifesto I to be “far too optimistic” about the possibility of eliminating social evils. Frances Schaeffer (2005) authored A Christian Manifesto (in opposition to the Communist Manifesto) which holds that both the humanist and communist Manifestos, despite significant differences between them, tend to foster similar forms of social degeneration. Schaeffer sees humanism as the unfortunate view that man is the measure of all things, and holds that even if that is not the humanist’s intention Manifesto I undermines the ideals of objective truth and morality. One major difference between Manifesto I and later humanist Manifestos and statements is that Manifesto I arose out of religious humanism (1918, Ch. XVI), and was, accordingly, much more sympathetic to religion per se than these later documents.

The objections by various humanists, both earlier and later, to signing Humanist Manifesto I show just how difficult it is to obtain agreement on such a central issue from such a diverse group of intellectuals representing different fields and backgrounds. Nevertheless, despite the various objections and reservations to Manifesto I, and the various replacement manifestos and declarations that appeared in later years, Manifesto I remains a significant historical document in the genesis of the humanist movement, and one that Sellars, who, it is probably fair to say, is “the principal author” of the published version, played an fundamental role in creating.

8. References and Further Reading

Several of Roy Wood Sellars’ works can be obtained in electronic form at The Internet ArchiveThe Autodidact Project and the online library of The Secular Web. Additional information on the various versions of the Humanist Manifestos and The Amsterdam Declaration is available online from the International Humanist and Ethical Union, the American Humanist Association, and the Council for Secular Humanism.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1902. “Re-interpretation of Democracy.” Inlander (University of Michigan publication), 12: 252-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907a. “The Nature of Experience.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods: 14-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907b. “A Fourth Progression in the Relation of Body and Mind.” Psychological Review 14: 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907c. “Professor Dewey’s View of Agreement.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 4 (16): 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908a. “An Important Antinomy.” Psychological Review 15 (4): 237-249.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908b. “Consciousness and Conservation.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (9): 235-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908c. “Critical Realism and the Time Problem I.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (20): 542-48.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908d. “Critical Realism and the Time Problem II.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (27): 597-602. 
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909a. “Causality.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 6: 323-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909b. “Space.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods. 6: 617-23.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1912. “Is There a Cognitive Relation?” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 9 (9): 225-328.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1915. “A Thing and its Properties.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 12 (12): 318-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1916a. Critical Realism: A Study of the Nature and Conditions of Knowledge. Chicago: Rand-McNally and Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1916b. The Next Step in Democracy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917a. The Essentials of Logic. Boston: Houghton Mifflin Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917b. The Essentials of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918a. “An Approach to the Mind-Body Problem.” Philosophical Review 27 (2): 150-63.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918b. “On the Nature of Our Knowledge of the External World.” Philosophical Review 27 (5): 502-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918c. The Next Step in Religion. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918d. “Review of P. Coffey, Epistemology, Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 15: 557-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919a. “The Epistemology of Evolutionary Naturalism.” Mind 28 (112): 407-26.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919b. “Review of George Wobbermin, Christian Belief in God.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 16: 277-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920a. “The Status of Categories.” The Monist 30 (2): 220-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920b. “Space and Time.” The Monist 30 (3): 321-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920c. “Evolutionary Naturalism and the Mind-Body Problem.” The Monist 30 (4): 568-98.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920d. “Knowledge and Its Categories.” Essays in Critical Realism, R.W. Sellars, Durant Drake, A.O. Lovejoy, James Pratt, Arthur Rogers, George Santayana, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 187-219.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920e. “Review of J. A. Leighton, The Field of Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 17: 79-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920f. “Preface.” to Evolution of Values, Helen Maud Sellars, (trans.). New York: Henry Holt.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921a. “Epistemological Dualism versus Metaphysical Dualism.” Philosophical Review 30 (5): 482-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921b. “The Requirement of an Adequate Naturalism.” The Monist 31 (2): 249-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922a. Evolutionary Naturalism. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922b. “Is Consciousness Physical?” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 19 (25): 690-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922c. “Concerning ‘Transcendence’ and ‘Bifurcation'” Mind 31 (121): 31-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1923a. “Le Cerveau, L’âme et La Conscience.” Bulletin de la Société Francais de Philosophie: 1-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1923b (some sources say 1922). “The Double Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S. 23: 55-70 (reprinted in Principles of Emergent Realism: 188-201).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924a. “The Emergence of Naturalism.” International Journal of Ethics 34 (4): 309-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924b. “Critical Realism and Its Critics.” Philosophical Review 33 (4): 379-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926a. The Principles and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926b. “Cognition and Valuation,” Philosophical Review 35 (2): 124-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927a. “Realism and Evolutionary Naturalism: A Reply to Professor Hoernlé.” The Monist. 37 (1): 150-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927b. “Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States.” The Monist 37 (4): 503-520.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927c. “What is the Correct Interpretation of Critical Realism?,” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 24 (9): 238-241.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927d. “Why Naturalism and Not Materialism?,” Philosophical Review 36 (3): 215-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928a. Religion Coming of Age. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928b. “Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States.” Philosophy Today Edward L. Schaub, (ed.). Chicago and London (reprint from The Monist, 1927): 19-36.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929a. “Current Realism.” Anthology of Recent Philosophy D. S. Robinson, (ed.). New York: Thomas Y. Crowell Co. (re-print from Philosophy Today): 279-290.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929b. “A Re-examination of Critical Realism.” Philosophical Review 38 (5): 439-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929c. “Critical Realism and Substance.” Mind 38 (152): 473-88. Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 13-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930a. “A Naturalistic Interpretation of Religion.” The New Humanist 3 (4): 1-4.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930b. “Realism, Naturalism and Humanism.” in Contemporary American Philosophy G. P. Adams and W. P. Montague, v. 2. (eds.), New York: Macmillan: 261-85.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1931. “Humanism, Viewed and Reviewed.” The New Humanist 4 (15): 12-16.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932a. The Philosophy of Physical Realism. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932b. “Reinterpretation of Relativity.” Philosophical Review 41 (5): 517-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933a. “L’Hypothèse de l’Émergence.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 40 (3): 309-24.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933b. “Religious Humanism.” The New Humanist 6 (3): 7-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood (Drafter and co-signer). May-June, 1933c. “Humanist Manifesto.” The New Humanist 6 (3): 58-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933d. “In Defense of the Manifesto.” The New Humanist 6 (6): 6-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933e. “Review of Durant Drake, Introduction to Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 3: 667-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1934. “Nature and Naturalism.” The New Humanist 7 (2): 1-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935a. “Review of C. F. Gauss, Primer for Tomorrow.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review. 41: 465-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935b. “George S. Morris.” Dictionary of American Biography 13: 208-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1937a. “Critical Realism and the Independence of the Object.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 34 (20): 541-550.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1937b. “Henry Philip Tappan.” Dictionary of American Biography 18: 302-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938a. “An Analytic Approach to the Mind-Body Problem.” Philosophical Review 47 (5): 461-87.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938b. “A Statement of Critical Realism.” Revue Internationale de Philosophie 3: 472-496.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939a. “Positivism in Contemporary Philosophical Thought.” American Sociological Review: 26-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939b. “A Clarification of Critical Realism.” Philosophy of Science 6 (4): 412-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1940. “Knowledge and its Categories.” The Development of American Philosophy, W. G. Muelder and Laurence Sears, (ed’s). Cambridge, Mass: 431-40  (Reprinted from Drake, Durant. 1920. Essays in Critical Realism. New York: Gordian Press: 187-219)
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941a. “Humanism as a Religion.” The Humanist 1 (1): 5-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941b. “A Correspondence Theory of Truth.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 38 (24): 653-54.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942a. “Aspects of Democracy II: the Quality of Democracy.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942b. “Galileo Galilei.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 301-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942c. “Review of E. Gilson, God and Philosophy.” The Humanist 2: 36-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942-43. “Dewey on Materialism.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 3 (4): 381-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943a. “Science , Philosophy, and Religion.” The Humanist 3: 84-5.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943b. “Verification of Categories: Existence and Substance” Journal of Philosophy 40 (8): 197-205.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943c. “Causality and Substance.” Philosophical Review.”.  52 (1): 1-27 (Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 26-45).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1943d. “Reason and Revolution,” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review  49: 212-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943e. “Review of J. Maritain, Education at the Cross Roads.” The Humanist 3: 165-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944a. “Causation and Perception.” Philosophical Review 53 (6): 534-56.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944b. “Reformed Materialism and Intrinsic Endurance.” Philosophical Review. 53: 359-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944c. “Is Naturalism Enough?” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (September): 533-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944d. “Does Naturalism Need Ontology?” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (25): 686-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944e. “Can a Reformed Materialism Do Justice to Values?” Ethics 55 (1): 28-45.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45a. “The Meaning of True and False.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (1): 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45b. “Reflections on Dialectical Materialism.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (2): 157-79.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45c. “Knowing and Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 341-344.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45d.  “Knowing through Propositions.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 348-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1945-46. “Review of Yervant Krikorian, Naturalism and the Human Spirit.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  6: 436-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946a. “A Note on the Theory of Relativity.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods  43 (12): 309-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946b. “Materialism and Relativity: A Semantic Analysis.” Philosophical Review 55 (1): 25-51.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946c. “Philosophy and Physics of Relativity.” Philosophy of Science 13 (3): 177-95.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946-47. “Positivism and Materialism.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  7 (1): 12-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1947. “Accept the Universe as a Going Concern.” Religious Liberals Reply Henry Wieman, (ed.). Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1948a. “Do the Natural Sciences Have a Need of the Social Sciences?,” Philosophy of Science  15 (2): 104-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948b. “Naturalistic Humanism.” Religion in the Twentieth Century Vergilius Ferm, (ed.). New York: Littlefield and Adams (later edition date 1958): 415-31.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948c. “Review of A. N. Whitehead, Essays in Science and Philosophy.” The Humanist  8: 92-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949a. “Social Philosophy and the American Scene.” Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed.’s). New York: Macmillan: 61-75.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949b. “Materialism and Human Knowing.” Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 75-106.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949c. “Resume of W. Cook Foundation Lectures.” (delivered by Ralph Barton Perry), Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 55: 185-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood, McGill, V.J., Farber, Marvin. 1949. Forward to Philosophy for the Future, R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: v-xii.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1949-50. “Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 10: 586-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950a. “Critical Realism and Modern Materialism.” Philosophical Thought in France and the United States, Marvin Farber, (ed.). Buffalo: The University of Buffalo Publications: 463-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950b. “The New Materialism.” A History of Philosophical Systems V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 418-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950c. “Review of Frank Chapman Sharp, Good Will and Ill Will,” The Humanist.  10: 277-8
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1950d. “Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 56: 175-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950-51. “The Spiritualism of Lavelle and Le Senne.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 11 (3): 386-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951. “Professor Goudge’s Queries with Respect to Materialism.” Philosophical Review 60 (2): 243-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1951-52a. “Review of R. W. Boynton, Beyond Mythology.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 146-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951-52b.  “Review of Charles Mayer, “Man: Mind or Matter.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 436-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1952. “Le spiritualisme de Louis Lavelle et de René le sense.” Les Études Philosophiques 9(1/2): 30-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1955. “My Philosophical Position: A Rejoinder.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 16 (1): 72-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956a. “Physical Realism and Relativity: Some Unfinished Business.” Philosophy of Science  23 (2): 75-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956b. “Gestalt and Relativity: An Analogy.” Philosophy of Science 23 (4): 275-279.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1957a. “Guided Causality, Using Reason and ‘Free Will’.” Journal of Philosophy 54 (August): 485-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1957b. “Philosophical Orientation and Peace.” The Idea of War and Peace in Contemporary Philosophy Irving Louis Horowitz, (ed.). New York: vii-xx (The book was re-released by Literary Licensing Publisher in 2012).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959a. “Levels of Causality: The Emergence of Guidance and Reason in Nature.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  20 (1): 1-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1959b. “Sensations as Guides to Perceiving.” Mind 68 (January): 2-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959c. “‘True’ as Contextually Implying Correspondence.” Journal of Philosophy 56 (18): 712-22.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood; Lamont, Corliss; Otto, Max; Huxley, Julien; Williams, Gardner; Randall Jr; John Herman. 1959. A Humanist Symposium on Metaphysics. Journal of Philosophy 56 (2): 45-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. October 1960. “Panpsychism or Evolutionary Materialism.” Philosophy of Science 27 (October): 229-50.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1961a. “Referential Transcendence.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 22 (1): 1-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1961b. “Querying Whitehead’s Framework.” Revue Internationale de Philosophie 56-57: 135-66.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1962. “American Critical Realism and British Theories of Sense Perception I and II.” Methodos: 61-108.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1963. “Direct, Referential Realism.” in Dialogue 2 (02): 135-43.         
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1965. “Existentialism, Realistic Empiricism, and Materialism.” Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 25 (3): 315-32.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1968. Lending a Hand to Hylas. Ann Arbor: Edward Brothers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1969a. “A Possible Integration of Science and Philosophy,” Zygon 4 (3): 293-97
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969b. “Some Questions and Suggestions: An Exposition,” Journal of Philosophy. 66 (24): 859-60
  • Sellars, R.W. 1969c. “Le naturalisme de Sellars,” Dialectica 23 (1): 79-80
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969d. Reflections on American Philosophy from Within. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970a. Principles of Emergent Realism. W. Preston Warren, (ed.) . St. Louis: Warren H. Green.
  • This book is really the best place to obtain an overview of R.W. Sellars’ writings with both extensive primary sources and commentary over the course of his development.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970b. Social Patterns and Political Horizons. Nashville: Aurora Publishers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970c. Principles, Perspectives, and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Pageant Press International Corp.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973a. Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. William. Preston Warren, (ed.), Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973b. January-February. “Toward a New Humanist Manifesto.” The Humanist
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1973c. “Recollections of Marvin Farber.” In Phenomenology and Natural ExistenceDale Riepe, (ed.). Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1975. Forward to William Preston Warren. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1991. “Philosophy of Organism and Physical Realism”. The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead. Paul A. Schlipp, (ed.). LaSalle: Open Court: 407-433 (Original publication date, 1941).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Avery, Jon Henry. 1989. “An Analysis and Critique of Roy Wood Sellars’ Descriptive and Normative Theories of Religious Humanism.” PhD diss., The Iliff School of Theology and University of Denver.
  • Bahm, Archie, 1954. “Evolutionary Naturalism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 1-12.
  • Baker, Richard R. 1950. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars,” New Scholasticism. 24 (1): 3-31.
  • Beckermann, Angsar, Flohr, Hans, Kim, Jaegwon. 1993. Emergence or Reduction: Essays on the Prospects of Non-Reductive Physicalism. Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Benjamin, Cornelius. 1934. Book Review: “The Philosophy of Physical Realism.” Roy Wood Sellars. Ethics. 44 (2): 270.
  • Bergson, Henri. 1998. Creative Evolution. Arthur Mitchell, (trans.). New York: Dover.
  • Blau, Joseph, 1952. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. New York: Prentice-Hall.
  • Blitz, David. 2010.  Emergent Evolution and Creative Novelty. New York: Springer.
  • Bogomolov, A.S. 1962. “Roy Wood Sellars in the Materialist Theory of Knowledge,” Russian Studies in Philosophy. 1 (3): 31-32.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1955. “Critical Realism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 33-47.
  • Davies, Paul, Clayton, Philip, (ed’s). 2008.  The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Delaney, C. F., 1969. Mind and Nature: A Study of the Naturalistic Philosophy of Cohen, Woodbridge and Sellars. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Delaney, C. F. 1971. “Sellars and the Contemporary Mind-Body Problem,” The New Scholasticism 45: 245-68.
  • Emmet, Dorothy. 1932. Whitehead’s Philosophy of Organism. London: Macmillan.
  • Ferm, Vergilius. 1950. “Varieties of Naturalism,” A History of Philosophical Systems. V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 429-441.
  • Frankena, William. 1954. “Theory of Valuation,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 65-81.
  • Frankena, William. Dec. 1973. “Roy Wood Sellars: Obituary,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 34 (2): 300-301.
  • Frankena, William. 1973-74. “Roy Wood Sellars: Memoriam,” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 47: 230-232.
  • Gluck, Samuel E. 1971. Review of  Norman Paul Melchert’s Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Illinois: Charles C. Thomas. Philosophy 46 (177): 281ff.
  • Grayling, A.C. 2003. Meditations for the Humanist: Ethics for a Secular Age. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Griffin, James Phillip,  1966. “Foundations of Ethical Value in the Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars and William Temple.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Hasker, William. 2001. The Emergent Self. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Herbert, David. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of Roy Wood Sellars’ Epistemology,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Peirce Society 30 (3): 477 – 514.
  • Hoor, Marten. 1954.  “Humanism as a Religion,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 84-97.
  • Hudson, Yeager. 1965. “Metaphysical Causality in the Philosophies of Brand Blanshard, Roy Wood Sellars, and John Laird.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Iobst, Philip Kirschman. 1975. The Normative Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars: A Critical Examination, Ph. D. Dissertation, State University of New York at Buffalo
  • Kreyche, Robert.  1951. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Ottawa.
  • Kuiper, John. 1954 (some references say 1955). “The Mind-Body Problem,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (September): 46-84.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1973. Humanist Manifestos I and II. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1981. “The Arrogance of Humanism,”  International Studies in Philosophy 13 (1):91-93.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1983. A Secular Humanist Declaration. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2000. Humanist Manifesto 2000: A Call for a New Planetary Humanism. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Levine, Steven. 2007. “Sellars’ Critical Direct Realism,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 15 (1): 53-76.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2007. What is Secular Humanism? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Lamont, Corliss. 1997. The Philosophy of Humanism.  Washington, D.C: Humanist Press.
  • McDonough, Richard. 2002. “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom,” Creativity, Cognition, and Knowledge Terry Dartnall, (ed.). Westport, Connecticut: Praeger: 283-321.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1964. “An Examination of the Physical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Pennsylvania.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1968. Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Ill.: Charles C. Thomas.
  • Munk, Arthur W. P. 1945. “Roy Wood Sellars’ Criticism of Idealism.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Ramsperger, A.G.  1967. “Critical Realism” Encyclopedia of Philosophy, v. 2. Paul Edwards., (ed.) (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press: 262-263.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1962. Recent American Philosophy: Studies of Ten Representative Thinkers. New York: Pantheon Books.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1971. “The Realism of Roy Wood Sellars,” The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 209-44.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1949. “Aristotelian Philosophies of Mind”. Philosophy for the Future, Roy Wood Sellars, V.J. McGill, Marvin Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 544-570.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1955. “Physical Realism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 13-32.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, and Meehl, Paul. 1956. “The Concept of Emergence,” Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, v. 1.  Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press: 239-252.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1965. “The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” Review of Metaphysics 18 (March): 430-51.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1971. “The Double-Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 269-89. (Note that Roy had published an article with the same title in 1923)
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1991. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” Science, Perception and Reality Atascadero, California: Ridgeview: 1-40.
  • Schaeffer, Francis. 2005. A Christian Manifesto. Wheaton, Illinois: Crossway Books.
  • Sessions, George. 1995. Deep Ecology for the Twenty-First Century. Boston: Shambhal.
  • Slurink, Pouwel. 1996. “Back to Roy Wood Sellars: Why His Evolutionary Naturalism is Still Worthwhile,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (3):425-44.
  • Rowntree, Clifford. 1964. “Direct, Referential Realism: A Comment,” Dialogue 2 (04): 452-453.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. 2002. “Emergence,” Philosophical Studies 58 (1-2): 53-63.
  • Trelo, Virgil J. 1966. The Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars. Lisle, Ill.: St. Procopius College.
  • Vintiadis, Elly. “Emergence,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Warren, William Preston. 1967. “Realism 1900-1930: An Emerging Epistemology,” The Monist. 51 (2): 179-205.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1970. Introduction to Roy Wood Sellars. Principles of Emergent Realism, W. Preston Warren, (ed.). St. Louis: Warren H. Green: xi-xxiv.
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  • Warren, William Preston. 1972b. “Experimentalism Plus,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 33 (2): 149-82.
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  • Warren, William Preston. 1975. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • This book is probably the best sympathetic secondary source on R.W. Sellars’ views.
  • Werkmeister, W. H. 1981. History of Philosophical Ideas in the United States. New York: Ronald Press.
  • Warren, William Preston. 2007. “Roy Wood Sellars: Philosopher of Religious Humanism,” Notable American Unitarians, Herbert Vetter, (ed.).  Cambridge, Harvard Square Library: 211-213.
  • Wilson, Edwin. 1995. The Genesis of a Humanist Manifesto. Amherst, NY. Humanist Press.
  • Wood, Ledger. 1950. “Recent Epistemological Schools,” A History of Philosophical Systems, V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 516-539.
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Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium School of Arts & Sciences

African Sage Philosophy

The Sage Philosophy Project began in the mid-1970s at the Department of Philosophy of the University of Nairobi Kenya. At the University, Henry Odera Oruka (1944-1995) popularized the term “Sage Philosophy Project,” and closely related terms such as “philosophic sagacity,” both by initiating a project of interviewing African sages, and by naming this project in a widely read popular article as the most promising of four trends of the relatively new field of African philosophy.

This encyclopedia article focuses primarily on Oruka and his immediate sources of inspiration, and then includes others whose projects share similar methodologies and goals.

Although the definition of the key terms is not always completely uniform, at the heart of this approach to African philosophy lies the emphasis on academically-trained philosophy students and professors interviewing non-academic wise persons whom Oruka called “sages,” and then engaging philosophically with the interview material. Oruka usually (but not always) emphasized keeping the identity of the individual sage well known.  He also insisted that it was the sage who knew the traditions of his or her ethnic group the best, and who would be able to have critical distance to evaluate and sometimes reject prevailing beliefs and practices. The goals of collecting the interviews and evaluating them have been articulated in Oruka’s many works. The first goal was to help construct texts of indigenous African philosophies. Before Oruka’s project there was a dearth of existing texts and a need to record indigenous ideas, both for posterity (that is, for a sense of identity and for historical reasons) and for the present and future. African wisdom that had been marginalized by academia, and by city life, could provide valuable solutions to contemporaneous problems in Africa. Such texts of interviews could also sustain intellectual curiosity and provide practical guidance (or phronesis).

Oruka searched for sages and wanted a wider public to know not only their words (written down in transcripts) but also about their lives.  For him, a sage’s worth was not only in their ideas but also in the way they live: by embodying their philosophies, developing their character, and affecting their communities over the years. After all, the sages in Kenya operate in contexts of social conflict and exploitation. Sages are those from whom others seek moral and metaphysical advice and consultation on issues involving moral and psychological attitudes and judgments.Oruka looked to the term japaro in Luo, meaning “thinker,” to approximate the translation of sage. The term japaro is closely related to jang’ ad rieko which means “professional advisor.” He emphasized that people would single out sages for advice on even the most delicate matters.

Table of Contents

  1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings
  2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context
  3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya
  4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study
  5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages
  6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy
  7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages
  8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years
  9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students
  10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Oruka Biography and Early Writings

The history of the project begins in the 1970s; nevertheless, it is important to understand the project’s beginning in the context of its immediate precursors, both those that served as partial models and those that served as negative examples of what must not be done. It is also important to know something about Oruka’s academic training and background, and the skills and interests he brought to the project.

Oruka grew up surrounded by sages in his home area of Ugenya, in the Nyanza Province of Kenya, and as a youth he looked up to them and learned much wisdom from them. Graduating from St. Mary’s High School in Yala, he won a scholarship to study geography at Uppsala University in Sweden. While there, Oruka was influenced by philosophy Professor Ingemar Hedenius to follow his newly developing interests and study philosophy instead. Philosophy studies at Uppsala were divided into two tracks, Practical and Theoretical, and Oruka specialized in Practical Philosophy: Applied Ethics and Political Philosophy. The approach to philosophy Oruka learned both in Sweden and later at Wayne State University in Detroit, Michigan, was greatly influenced by the logical empiricists.  Indeed, Oruka referred to himself an empiricist as well (Practical 283). He would later remark that this narrow emphasis on analytic philosophy that he received in his formal training was an initial “handicap” to his ability to enter the debates on African philosophy upon his return to Kenya (Oruka, Trends 127).

When he returned to Kenya in 1970, Oruka became one of the first two African philosophy faculty members at University of Nairobi. At that time, many departments at the University of Nairobi (UON) were questioning the Eurocentric curriculum that was their colonial heritage. Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Okot p’Bitek, and Taban Lo Liyong were some of the scholars challenging the curriculum in literature, development studies, and other areas (Ogot). The Institute for African Studies at UON was founded in 1970.  Sage philosophy was an attempt to rise to the challenge of imagining an approach to philosophy that focused on African ideas and realities. The fields of literature and history had turned to oral sources; there was no reason that philosophy could not do the same.

When Oruka received his first full-time position in 1970, the field of African Philosophy was dominated by Placide Tempels, John Mbiti, and other early scholars who sometimes blurred the line between religious and philosophical thinking. Also, at that time, the Philosophy and Religious Studies departments at UON were merged. Having studied with Hedenius, famous for his arguments in favor of atheism, Oruka distinguished himself with early essays in 1972 and 1975 denouncing much of what was passing for “African philosophy” as no more than dressed-up mythical thinking. (He later judged these articles as “youthful” as well as “simplistic and unnecessarily offensive” Oruka, Trends 12, n.1; 125-29; Practical 285; Graness and Kresse 12). He championed a secular and logical approach to life’s big questions. However, also impressed by the need to appreciate an unfairly-marginalized, substantial body of thought coming from Africa, Oruka proposed his “sage philosophy” project as a way to provide missing information about African ideas and values. He was convinced that rural sages were not merely “religious figures” but thinkers who used their own rational powers to develop insights, and who could explain their reasoning to others.

In his early 1972 article “Mythologies as African Philosophy” Oruka was to insist on jettisoning traditions harmful to Africa’s present and future. He criticized both Placide Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy and John Mbiti’s book African Religions and Philosophy as backward-looking champions of absolutely unphilosophical African traditions. He agreed with Fanon’s criticism of a certain type of misguided African intellectual who falsely builds up the greatness of African tradition in a futile attempt to convince Europeans that African culture is as good as theirs. Oruka wanted instead to write for an African audience (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 23).

In “Mythologies,” Oruka began to articulate his emphasis on the need to acknowledge individual thinkers. By anonymizing everyone and providing only group consensus, Tempels, Mbiti, and W. E. Abraham (author of The Mind of Africa) presented “philosophy without philosophers.” He suggested, “We can as well start afresh by interviewing sage Africans and eliciting philosophical expositions from them” (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 30). While individuals’ thinking is influenced by their community and material conditions, they are not determined by them, and in fact individuals can also influence groups. Oruka also pointed out that a philosopher’s role is not just to describe how people think and act, but to make suggestions as to how they ought to think and act (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 31).

2. Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context

Oruka conceived of the project in relation to interjections from Kwasi Wiredu and Paulin Hountondji, whom he had met and who had both been invited to University of Nairobi. He had become familiar with their written works in early philosophy journals published in Africa, such as Second Order (University of Ife Press, Nigeria), Universitas (Accra), and Cahiers philosophiques africains/African philosophical journal (Zaire) (Oruka, Trends 129-30, 132-33). Both scholars had studied philosophy in African universities and abroad, Wiredu at University College, Oxford, and Hountondji at the École Normale Supérieure, and both were critical of the ethnophilosophical approaches of Tempels and Mbiti.

Wiredu, based in Ghana, emphasized the secular and rational nature of much ethical thought among the Akan groups in Ghana. He outlined three major hindrances to African cultural regeneration: anachronism, authoritarianism, and supernaturalism. But he also insisted that Africa had very wise and philosophical persons from whom a lot could be learned, especially if one paid attention to the nuances of concepts in African languages. In a 1972 issue of Second Order, Wiredu wrote that “it is a particular (though not exclusive) responsibility of African philosophers to research into their traditional background of philosophical thought” (“On an African Orientation” 12). However, he argued, while traditional concepts and codes of conduct should be an area of study, they should not lead to anachronism—an attempt to turn back the hands of time or cling to the days of yesteryear (7).

Wiredu was the first to label “what ‘our elders’ said” as “folk philosophies.” He found exciting the prospect of constructing, from “the living wise men of the tribe,” “the elaborate and argumentative reasons” behind the belief systems and moral guidelines of “our philosophers of old.”  Still, the resulting material could not, Wiredu believed, help to tackle most modern problems in Africa (“On an African Orientation” 5). Along with interest in past traditions, he maintained, scientific method and clear argumentation were necessary to guide African youths in confronting the new moral dilemmas facing contemporary African society. Barry Hallen, scrutinizing Wiredu’s article, says that Wiredu intended the phrase “folk philosophies” to refer to unreasoned beliefs whether they were African or Western (Hallen “Yoruba” 106-08). Wiredu followed up this exploration with an article that Oruka recommended to his readers, in which Wiredu compared and contrasted the meaning of “philosopher” and “wise man.” The material, first published in the article (Wiredu “What Is”), was later incorporated in Wiredu’s book (Wiredu Philosophy 139-173; see Oruka Trends 69n5).

Three years later (1975), in Second Order, Oruka explained that he and others at UON were already engaged in a project along the lines of Wiredu’s description. He said, “We are seeking to unsheathe, through constant contacts and discussions with those concerned, the elaborate philosophical views and reasons from the living traditional Kenyan thinkers and sages” (Oruka “The Fundamental” 54n6). He followed Wiredu’s words and ideas closely enough to repeat the descriptors “elaborate” and “reasons.” In his subsequent book he adopted the descriptors “folk philosophies” and “folk sage,” but clarified that, in addition to elders who are examples of folk sagacity, there were some philosophic sages able to scrutinize prevailing beliefs and give sustained arguments for their positions. The elders, he asserted, were more than just depositories of outdated folk wisdom. Philosophical sages were able both to describe the “culture philosophy” held by most members of their community and also to evaluate the content (or at least understand the genesis) of such culture philosophies.  In Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) Wiredu affirmed that “The recording and critical study of the thought of individual indigenous thinkers is worthy of the most serious attention of contemporary African philosophers” (37). In Cultural Universals and Particulars (1996), Wiredu wrote that Oruka’s sage philosophy book was the first to give “substantial notice” to individual philosophical thinkers in Africa (116).

Paulin Hountondji was another key influence on the development of sage philosophy. Hountondji gave a talk, “Philosophy and Its Revolutions,” at the National University of Zaire during “Special Philosophy Days” in June 1973, and a second time at University of Nairobi in November, 1973.  Invitations for these talks came from the Philosophical Association of Kenya, which Oruka had founded (African 71).A paper based on the talks was published in French in 1973 in Cahiers philosophiques africains/African Philosophical Journal and later incorporated into Hountondji’s book, African Philosophy: Myth and Reality (71-108). Hountondji’s “Revolution” article, and chapter, which Oruka and other Kenyans heard in person in 1973, criticized Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy but appreciated the works of two European anthropologists, Paul Radin and Marcel Griaule, suggesting that their approach was much more careful than Tempels’. In fact, Hountondji said, Tempels’ study was “behind the anthropology of the time” (African 76). Twenty years earlier than Tempels, Radin wrote Primitive Man as Philosopher, a study of philosophy in Africa that focused on original thinkers who were members of an intellectual class in their communities. Hountoundji explained that Radin denounced the prejudice that African individuals are submerged in unitary group-think and took it upon himself to transcribe faithfully what members of this intellectual class told him (African 76; “La Philosophie” 30-31).

Paul Radin was an anthropologist originally from Poland who had studied with Franz Boas at Columbia University. Radin recorded interviews with members of a Native American community from Nebraska called the Winnebago. He explained in his book the necessity of researchers presenting “statements made by the Winnebago” word-for-word to the public, rather than merely recounting others’ ideas in ways that mixed the researcher’s interpretation with the words and views of those interviewed (64). Researchers who thought they did readers a service, by weaving together narratives and accounts of multiple informants in a harmonizing way, actually hid the extent of disagreement and diversity of opinion in the community (xxxviii).. Since primary sources are so valuable, Radin advocated a method of careful direct questioning, a process which under the best circumstances “can become something analogous to a true philosophical dialogue” (xxxi). Radin first published his book in 1927 but came out with a second edition in 1957 which critiqued Placide Tempels’ approach as presumptive and wrong-headed insofar as Tempels presumed to describe Bantu philosophy on behalf of Bantu speaking people, instead of letting them speak for themselves.

Hountondji stated that “Radin’s work is still, to the best of my knowledge, the most lucid ethnological critique of the theoretical assumptions of ethnophilosophy” (African 79). He praised Radin for showing the level of variations in retellings of particular myths and the ways each narrator influenced the myth in their own way, thus demonstrating the “profound individualism” among African intellectuals. Though he faulted Radin for use of the insulting word “primitive,” Hountondji was struck by how, unlike other Western anthropologists, Radin conveyed Africa as a place with views as plural as those of Western societies (African 79). While Radin’s study predated Oruka’s coining of the term “sage philosophy,” certainly Radin’s project shared much in common (both in goals and method) with Oruka’s later project. While Radin’s own first-hand research was with the Winnebago tribe (now more accurately called the Ho-Chunk people) in North America, Radin’s book drew upon primary source narratives of philosophical thought from various communities around the world, including proverbs and poems from Africa.

John Dewey, who wrote the foreword to Radin’s book, thanked Radin for challenging certain common misconceptions of Africa, which tended to present Africans as accepting “automatic moral standards” based on custom, when in fact African communities respected freedom of expression and emphasized individual moral responsibility (Radin xix). The relationship and consistency between Radin’s approach and that of Oruka’s sage philosophy project was alluded to by Kai Kresse (27-28), Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage 244n27), and Godwin Azenabor (73).

While Oruka probably heard about Radin in Hountondji’s 1973 presentation in Nairobi, Oruka nowhere credited Radin as an inspiration for his own chosen methods. In fact, Oruka engaged in a lifelong castigation of anthropologists, condemning them along with missionaries like Tempels. Oruka presumed that all anthropologists anonymized and conglomerated their sources into one, and he asserted that no anthropologist had devised a method similar to his own. Another important distinction to highlight is that Radin made extensive use of proverbs, poems, and songs, which he considered primary sources even if the specific authors were unknown, and found profound philosophical thought in these sources. Many in the field of African philosophy have also argued for using these kinds of sources as philosophical sources, for example, Kwame Gyekye of Ghana (An Essay 8-19) and Claude Sumner, a Canadian who researched Ethiopian philosophy for many years, and Ethiopian philosopher Workineh Kelbessa (“Logic”; Indigenous chap. 11). Even Oruka’s philosophy colleague at UON, Gerald Wanjohi, engaged in extensive analysis of proverbs (Wanjohi Wisdom). Oruka did not consider the study of proverbs to be related to his project. He narrowly focused on interviews with living sages as his only source, despite the fact that other contemporaries of his argued that one could find clear expression of logical argument as well as insightful reflection in proverbs (Sumner 22-23, 391-403). In an article he wrote on Sumner, Oruka mentioned that Sumner spent much effort studying and publishing Oromo proverbs (Practical 156), and maintained that studying proverbs is a different method than ethnophilosophy, but he did not develop these ideas. In Sage Philosophy (1990 ed. 115-16; 1991 ed. 117), the sage Simiyu Chaungo discussed the use of proverbs, but it is the only time proverbs are mentioned in the book.

Along with Radin, Hountonji’s 1973 article also included Marcel Griaule as an example of anthropologists whose methods differed from Tempels’ (31). Griaule interviewed Ogotemmeli, a Dogon elder in Mali, at length. Hountondji was disappointed that certain political factions inside and outside of Africa preferred Tempels’ style of massive, definitive synthesis of all Bantu views to capturing the plurality and disorderliness of individual thought by direct interview. In the preface to the second edition of his book, which included “Philosophy and Its Revolutions,” Hountondji again reiterated his 1974 opinion of Griaule as an important trend-setter:

The French anthropologist had chosen to transcribe the words of one sage among many. He showed the possibility of a long term project which would consist of a systematic transcription of such speeches, at least as a starting point of a critical discussion—what my Kenyan colleague the late Odera Oruka would later call “philosophical sagacity”—rather than as reconstruction of implicit philosophy behind the habits and customs of the host society through a lot of non-verifiable hypotheses which always amount to over-interpreting the facts”(ix).

In 1996, Hountondji saw Griaule’s project as an earlier version of Oruka’s project. He reiterated his estimation of Griaule in his reflections, published in English as The Struggle for Meaning (2002). In this work he reflected on his views back in 1970, saying of Griaule’s work:  “Voluntarily assigning to himself the humble task of a secretary, custodian, transcriber of the worldview of a black sage, of one spiritual master among others, the French ethnologist gave the example of scientific patience and, in my eyes, did more useful work than the ethnophilosophers proper who were in a hurry to reach definitive conclusions on African philosophy in general” (99).

Oruka himself was not that impressed with Griaule and Ogotommeli. In his 1983 article in International Philosophical Quarterly, later included in Sage Philosophy, Oruka argued that Ogotemmeli was at best a “folk sage” and not a philosophical sage, because he did not transcend his group’s views. Therefore, Griaule was not engaged in sage philosophy, but only in “culture philosophy” (Oruka Sage, 1991 ed., 34, 47, 49-50).

Hountondji and Oruka both missed research published by other anthropologists in the 1960s that cast doubt on whether Griaule really followed his professed method of interviewing one person and transcribing what that person said. D. A. Masolo made a thorough review of the anthropological literature on Griaule, most but not all of it in French, in which the authors questioned whether the conversation was recorded verbatim on the series of days that Griaule recounted. They suspected Griaule of reconstructing the conversation (Masolo African 69, 77, 260). Jack Goody’s book review discussed the painstaking detail an interview must have in order to meet standards of even a “soft” science like anthropology. The words of the person interviewed should be clearly demarcated from those that are the author’s commentary. Field notes should be identified as such and distinguished from the words of the on-site translator. Original language transcriptions should be available, and the difficulty of translating esoteric words should be discussed by the author. Griaule’s book did not meet these standards (Goody review). Kibujjo Kalumba, who considered Griaule’s book on Ogotommeli one of three possible sources of sage philosophy, complained that the book contained too much of Griaule’s re-wording of Ogotommeli’s ideas (274, 276).

While Oruka declared in 1972 his intent to interview wise elders, he had just the previous year been quite critical of another philosopher’s use of the interview method applied to the topic of Ethics. Tore Nordenstam, a Norwegian based in Khartoum, Sudan, had interviewed three of his students, and on the basis of the interviews, published a book called Sudanese Ethics. In his rather harshly critical review of the book, Oruka questioned how interviews could be helpful at all in the study of ethics.

Oruka himself changed from someone with antipathy toward Nordenstam’s project to a person who promoted a large project interviewing African sages. His own project tried to avoid all of the pitfalls he pointed out in Nordenstam’s project: he did not interview students; he tried to interview those without exposure to studies in European philosophy; he addressed gender issues in most of his interviews; and he asked his interviewees sensitive political questions, even at great risk to himself (as in his interviews with Oginga Odinga). He shared with Nordenstam the focus on ethical issues. Before leaving this section on early precursors and influences on sage philosophy, it is important to note that a Kenyan scholar wrote an article in 1959 that is considered by several African philosophy scholars to be a clear precedent to sage philosophy. Taaita Towett (d. 2007) is known these days mostly for his role in Kenyan education and politics. As Minister of Education, he was “Patron” of the Philosophical Association of Kenya (see Thought and Practice 1.2 [1974] inside back cover). Towett’s 1959 article, translated into French as “Le Role d’un philosophie Africain,” “earlier expressed an identical argument” to Oruka’s, according to Ochieng’-Odhaimbo (“The Tripartite” 30n4). In the PhD thesis he wrote under Oruka’s supervision (later excerpted in Sage Philosophy) and in a 1983 journal article, Anthony Oseghare claimed that Towett’s 1959 article provided “evidence of the existence of critical philosophical reasoning in Africa” (Oseghare “Sagacity” 95; Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 237). D. A. Masolo noted that Towett, as Oruka did later, argued that literacy was not a prerequisite for philosophizing and that Socrates was an example of an oral philosopher. Towett and Oruka both contended that “there must have been African philosophers engaged in the formulation of culture philosophy” (Masolo African Philosophy 236).

3. Beginning Interviews in Kenya

In his published works, Oruka explained that he began his sage philosophy project along with his philosophy colleague Joseph Donders, a White Father from the Netherlands (“The Fundamental” 54n6; Sage 1991 ed., 17-18). Donders explained that the funds for the study were originally received from the UON’s Dean’s Committee (“Don’t Fence” 11).

Oruka’s early publications describing his projects and his methods began in the mid-1970s.  At the time, Oruka made it clear that his project was a national one, and was to include wise sages from a wide variety of ethnic groups in Kenya. At this time, there was a lot of focus on building up Kenya’s national identity, and Oruka wanted his project to be a unifier for the country, where all Kenyans could take pride in a common heritage of wise philosophers. He also wanted Kenyans to evaluate and be able to justify their cultural practices (see Oruka “Philosophy”; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 116-117; Presbey “Attempts”). At the same time, Oruka focused on sages who could articulate reasons for their philosophical and ethical positions that did not rely on mere tradition or on religious authority. He also focused on the individual identities and arguments of the sages rather than melding the ideas of individuals into the “group think” of an ethnic group; to do the latter would have been to engage in the common error in African studies in philosophy.

As F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo has noted, the exact terminology for Oruka’s project has changed over time. In 1974, when Oruka first announced his project, he called it “Thoughts on Traditional Kenyan Sages.” He first coined the term “philosophic sagacity” in 1978, referring to individual critical and reflective sages engaging in thought in such a way that even European or analytic philosophers would have to admit that philosophers were present in Africa. He created and emphasized the approach as an alternative to ethnophilosophy, which he disparaged. Ochieng’-Odhiambo noted that as early as 1983, Oruka called those engaged in philosophic sagacity “sage philosophers.” He contrasted them to ordinary sages (later called “folk sages”) who, in 1983, were not considered philosophical because they lacked critical reflection and ability to create independent positions on topics. In 1984, in “Philosophy in English Speaking Africa,” Oruka used the term “sage philosophy.” At first, the two terms “philosophic sagacity” and “sage philosophy” were used interchangeably and no distinctions were drawn. But during this third stage of Oruka’s works (1984–1995), he used the term “philosophic sagacity” increasingly less, while he used “sage philosophy” increasingly more. Oruka then used the term “sage philosophy” retrospectively to refer to his pre-1984 works (Ochieng’-Odhaimbo, “The Evolution” 19, 24).

The term “philosophic sagacity” Ochieng’-Odhiambo says, was first presented in Oruka’s “Four Trends in African Philosophy” at a conference on Dr. William Amo in Accra, Ghana, in July,  1978 (Oruka Trends 21n1; also see Ochieng’-Odhaimbo “Philosophic Sagacity: Aims”). “Four Trends” was later revised and presented at the World Congress of Philosophy conference in Dusseldorf, Germany, in August, 1978 (Ochieng’-Odhiambo “The Evolution” 22, 30n6). However a Nigerian philosopher, M. Akin Makinde, commenting on Oruka’s popularization of the term, claimed to be the originator of the term in the context of African philosophy. Makinde said he used the term “philosophic sagacity” (with a different connotation than Oruka) earlier than Oruka in a conference paper he presented in June, 1978, at University of Ife (Makinde “Robin”; “Philosophy” 107). Makinde’s 1978 paper drew upon concepts in Bombastus Paracelsus’ essay Philosophia Sagax. Collins English Dictionary explains that “philosophic” is a term created in Middle English around 1350-1400 C.E. that meant “learned, pertaining to alchemy.” Makinde claimed that Oruka used the term and concept “wrongly” but admitted that Oruka’s usage became the more widespread (African 9, 122, 137). Many scholars in African philosophy do not pay attention to the term “philosophic” and refer to Oruka’s method as “philosophical sagacity” (for example see Hallen African 68-75; Imbo 25-26).

Oruka articulated his project and his methods in the context of growing debates on the topic of African philosophy. He spearheaded the founding of the Philosophical Association of Kenya and the creation of its journal, Thought and Practice, in 1974. In his famous “Four Trends” article, he divided African Philosophy into four diverse interests/trends with differing methodologies (ethno-, nationalist-ideological, and professional philosophies including his own, philosophic sagacity).  At these venues and in publications he explained how his own project was not just another example of the wrong-headed “ethnophilosophy” approach (criticized by Paulin Hountondji) but was instead an alternative to it.

In a 1988 article of Oruka’s first published in German and later included in English in Trends (50-69), Oruka described his sage philosophy project, listed eight sages (all men) who were part of his study, and gave a biography of each. Two of them, Paul Mbuya Akoko (d. 1981) and Oruka Rang’inya (d. 1979), would be included at greater length in his soon-to-be-released, book-length study of sage philosophy. The others mentioned in 1988 had only biographies and short excerpts of their interviews in the German-language article, which were repeated in two books.  These latter sages were Njeru wa Kanuenje, Nyaga wa Mauch, Arap Baliach, Muganda Okwako (d. 1979), Joash Walumoli, and Kasina Wa Ndoo (Trends 57-61, 66-67; Sage 1991 ed., 37-40).  Oruka explained that he and researcher Jesse N.K. Mugambi interviewed Njeru wa Kanyenje of Embu district together, in the Embu language (Trends 66, 132).

Oruka’s book Sage Philosophy was published first by Brill in 1990 and later in Nairobi in 1991. There are a few differences between the two publications, but most changes are minor editorial ones, with the major exception that chapter one of the Brill edition has an extra twelve pages telling the background of the study. The book has three parts. The first is Oruka’s introduction to his project. Here, Oruka gathered (with little revision) several of his articles on sage philosophy that had been published over the years. The second part includes interviews with sages, and the third part includes commentators and critics. Documentation of the sages as individuals, and the publication of their originally oral philosophical thoughts, are crucial to Oruka’s methodology; this stands in contrast to ethnophilosophy’s practice of summarizing what informants (often anonymous) say and searching for a common denominator. Also in the second part, a brief biographical sketch and photograph precedes each interview. Oruka insisted on identifying both folk and philosophic sages in the same manner. In this way, his project does not merely repeat the same ground covered by ethnophilosophy.

The book minimizes the editorial/interpretive role of the professional philosopher, in comparison to other anthropological approaches, by including direct excerpts from interviews of sages who were self-conscious of their role as cultural critics and were respected for the critical views they articulated. Interviews with sages covered topics related to philosophy of religion (such as the existence of God, life after death, and so forth), free will and determinism, and ethics. These topics were of central concern to Oruka, whose own academic background from Uppsala was in practical philosophy rather than theoretical philosophy. Oruka mentioned “Chaungo Barasa, Fred Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Sam Oluoch Imbo, Samuel Wanjohi Kimiti and Mwangi Samuel Chege” as his key research assistants in the project (Sage 1991 ed., xi).

Oruka closely followed this first book-length publication with a monograph focusing on the interviews of Jaramogi Oginga Odinga. He explained that for the 1982 interviews he was accompanied by E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo, a well-known Kenyan historian who focuses on oral history, and in 1992 Chaungo Barasa assisted him. Odera Oruka provided his own commentary on the interviews, which focused on Odinga’s love of truth, and how Odinga’s commitment to truth and love of the masses contrasted with Plato’s own position in the Republic regarding the myth of metals, sometimes called the “noble lie” (Oginga Odinga xi, 3-4, 12-13).

4. Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study

Barry Hallen and J. Olubi Sodipo engaged in a research project that involved interviewing wise men among the Yoruba in Nigeria. They began their project around the same time as Oruka, in 1973-74.  As Hallen and Sodipo explain, they started in 1973 with a non-credit student study group at the University of Lagos. During university breaks they asked students to “establish face-to-face fieldwork relationships with the elders and wise men of their family compounds, villages, and towns” (Hallen and Sodipo 9). They chose the concept of the person as the theme for these first discussions. After this first study, they interviewed people in the Ekiti region from 1974-84 and moved the project to the University of Ife (now Obafemi Awolowo University) in 1975 (Hallen and Sodipo xvi, 11). Sodipo became head of the newly independent philosophy department that separated from the religious studies department in 1975.

Hallen and Sodipo chose to study herbalists and native doctors because they were more critically sophisticated than the “ordinary persons” whom they advised, and were able to offer theoretical concepts (10-11).  They explained that the onisegun (Yoruba wise men) they interviewed were organized into their own professional society called an egbe, with rules, evaluations, possible reprimands, and a pledge of secrecy. The onisegun were not mere masters of medicine, but rather, they “[gave] advice and counsel about business dealings, family problems, unhappy personal situations, religious problems, and the future, as well as about physical and mental illness” (13).  They did not name their individual interlocutors because, as they explained, those they interviewed requested to remain anonymous (14). They acknowledged that the practical questions regarding interviewing methods were many, and they tried to sort out the question: “is each man to be treated as an individual, potentially eccentric thinker, or are opinions to be somehow collated and presented as shared and communal?” (8). They followed the latter plan, due to the fact that they were studying language use. Their study had philosophical insights regarding how the use of words “knowledge” and “belief” were understood, and came to note that among the Yoruba, the use of the term translated as “knowledge” is much narrower than the usage in Britain or the United States, because it was reserved for first-hand knowledge alone. In Britain or the U.S., people commonly claimed to know a vast amount of information (in the form of propositions) that went beyond their first-hand knowledge (see Hallen and Sodipo; Hallen “Yoruba”).

Because it involved academic philosophers interviewing wise elders in Africa, many people associated the Hallen and Sodipo project with Oruka’s sage philosophy project. However, at least in some of his writings, Oruka clarified that he did not consider their work that of sage philosophy due to its lack of emphasis on individual sages. In fact, Oruka complained that it looked like the onisegun of the study held views “in consensus” and therefore to study their views was “anthropology, not philosophy” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-10; quote, 10), or even “culture philosophy,” “cultural prejudices” or “philosophication” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 50). “Philosophication” is a term that Oruka intended to have a derogatory tone. At one point he defined it as “the discovery of a philosophy out of no philosophy;” he also played with coining the word “philosofolkation” which involved loving the “folk” so much that one invented a philosophy for them and made oneself its spokesperson (1990b, 7). Oruka’s criticisms began as early as his 1975 article, when he charged J. O. Sodipo with trying to pass off African superstitions regarding the agency of the Yoruba gods as an African understanding of cause and, hence, philosophical (Oruka “The Fundamental” 48). In a more conciliatory tone, he wrote in his 1983 article that the Hallen-Sodipo project, like Griaule’s Ogotemmeli, while not “philosophic sagacity,” may be “some form of sagacity” (Oruka “Sagacity” 389; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 133).

On this point, Ochieng’-Odhiambo pointed out (“The Evolution” 27) that a particular end note in an article of Oruka’s 1990 book, Trends in Contemporary African Philosophy (Oruka Trends 68), suggested that Hallen and Sodipo’s project might be part of sage philosophy, despite Oruka’s clarification in other works (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-9, 50) that it was not. This endnote is a bit indirect. Oruka listed Hallen and Sodipo’s works along with several others that directly address sage philosophy, and then added the caveat, “It is not the case that every one of these writings addresses itself to the direct question of Sage philosophy. But they all make special reference to a type of thinking in Africa that can only owe its existence to the thoughts of some wise men (and women) in traditional Africa.” This statement makes it sound like Hallen and Sodipo were fellow travelers. Interestingly enough, Oruka mentioned that at a certain point in his research he interviewed some sages who wanted their names withheld (Sage 1991 ed., 65n4), and he mentioned specifically a parallel with Hallen and Sodipo’s study.

In his 2006 book, African Philosophy: The Analytic Approach, Hallen agreed that it was best to keep his own project and Oruka’s separate. As good grounds for separating them, Hallen explained that his and Sodipo’s project was always intended to be an exercise in philosophy of language, and he admitted that such was not the case with Oruka’s interviews. He also acknowledged that Oruka wanted to keep them separate (4–5). But he also explained, in Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft, that he thought that the kinds of description of their project that Oruka engaged in were unkind and unfair. Oruka did not take into account that when one does philosophy of language one cannot help but search for common usages of terms and concepts. Hallen recounted in an afterword to the 1997 edition of Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft the shock he experienced upon first reading criticisms of their work such as this. He and Sodipo had been bracing for criticisms from anthropologists; they expected to be told that they weren’t properly trained to do fieldwork. But they were surprised to find themselves criticized by philosophers for advocating a communal consensus account of African thought, basically being accused of the dreaded “ethnophilosophy” as Hountondji had described it.

Hallen asked Hountodji and Oruka to rethink their criticism, since there was no way to practice ordinary language philosophical analysis, whether in Africa, England, or elsewhere, without focusing on common meanings. Hallen thought that the fact that their study was able to debunk many prevailing myths and stereotypes about Africa, including misconceptions made popular by some anthropologists that considered African thought as pre-reflective, uncritical, traditional, emotional, and non-reasonable. This was evidence that they should be appreciated, not lumped in with anthropologists and ethnophilosophers whose projects were evaluated negatively (Hallen and Sodipo 136-37n16; 140). Indeed, one of the surprising conclusions of Hallen and Sodipo’s study was that the onisegun had such stringent criteria for counting something as knowledge (that is, restricting it to first-hand experience, and requiring careful reporting and testimony from all witnesses), that they made Euro-Americans who accept second-hand propositional knowledge as true seem “dangerously naïve or perhaps even ignorant” in comparison to the onisegun (Hallen Yoruba 299).

While discussing parallels in Nigeria, it is important to note that Campbell S. Momoh (d. 2006) engaged in interviews with elders of the Uchi community.  Momoh says he responded to Hallen’s call for philosophers to go to villages to discuss philosophical topics with illiterate elders (Momoh “African” 99). He cited as his intellectual sources for the methodology of the project not Oruka but instead both Paul Radin and William Abraham. In his 1962 book, Abraham distinguished public philosophy from private philosophy, referring to Griaule’s study of Ogotommeli as an example of “of an individual African philosopher rather than a repository of the public philosophy” (104). Momoh saw a commonality between Radin’s notion of the African intellectual and what Abraham called “private philosophy” (Momoh The Substance 53, 55). Momoh insisted that interviewees should be named and credited.

Momoh was himself involved in interviewing elder sages. He did his dissertation fieldwork in 1978 and submitted his dissertation in 1979 to Indiana University. His dissertation committee included William Abraham and Ivan Karp (An African Conception).  The dissertation includes lengthy sections naming elder interlocutors (such as Aliu Oshiothenaua, Saliu Ikharo and others), paraphrasing their conversation in detail as well as quoting them directly (92-120). Momoh also provides contextual background of the sages’ standing and purpose in their communities (see especially 45-48, 67-70, 85-87). He even mentions seeming interruptions in the discussion, such as the presence of a young boy or a chicken, and how the conversation is shaped by these interactions (something for the most part missing from the interviews in Oruka’s study). Topics focus on metaphysics and ethics. Along with accounts of the elders’ discussions, Momoh includes his interpretation and analysis of what the elders say. While the elders may convey their ideas in story and myths, these do not just reflect communal philosophies since some of the stories are creations of individual men (for example, Ikharo’s story of woman’s refusal to accept marrying man as her God-given duty and role, see 116-117).

In his published work, Momoh names some elders, quotes them verbatim, and gives specific examples of methodological challenges during his interview of them (“African Philosophy” 87-88).  He named Aliu Oshiothenaua, Pa Egbue, Pa Abudah (Momoh’s uncle), and a hunter named A. M. J. Momoh (The Substance 66, 245, 254-55, 376-78). He found in the interview of the hunter a “doctrine of existential gratitude” (The Substance 382). Oshiothenaua asserted a theory of human dependence on nature (The Substance 376). An ethnophilosophical study that merely explored communally held beliefs in the sense of Abraham’s “public philosophy” would be incomplete, Momoh insisted, because “alongside with it” it would need to name individual intellectuals and add additional contextual information such as the time period, cultural paradigm, and branch of philosophy relevant to the discussions. He criticized Bodunrin, who wanted to make an “absolute dichotomy” between ethnophilosophy and the sagacious elders, since, according to Momoh, the latter were based on the former–that is, the “sagacious elders” philosophized in a general context provided by public philosophy (“African” 77-78, 80-81; The Substance 56, 58, 59).

Momoh also insisted that sagacious elders had a better practice than much of contemporary analytic academic philosophy, since their goal was not the narrow one of negatively appraising received ideas, but the broader project of building holistic systems and attending to important moral issues (“African Philosophy” 91; The Substance 69, 75, 78). While Oruka notes that in Momoh’s earlier 1985 article Momoh seemed unaware of Oruka’s sage philosophy project (Oruka, Sage 1990 ed., xxiv) and castigated Oruka as a member of the “African logical neo-positivists” who denigrated ancient African philosophy (Momoh based this estimate on Oruka’s 1972 article critical of myth, see The Substance 64), he later revised his estimate of Oruka and acknowledged his sage philosophy project (The Substance x). In an article originally published in 1987 (included in Sage 1990 ed.), Oruka expressed his agreement with C. S. Momoh’s position that the names of sages interviewed must be given and their views credited to them (Sage 1990 ed., 20). Fayemi Ademola Kazeem considered Momoh to be engaging in a sage philosophy project as was Oruka, noting that Momoh preferred to call it “ancient African philosophy” (Kazeem 196).

Godwin Azenabor included Hallen and Sodipo, Momoh, Oruka and others in a common category of African philosophy which he called the “Purist school” because all were committed to the assertions that Africa has a similar practice of raising philosophical questions and answering them as does the West; however they all saw the need to break free of Western paradigms, conceptual schemes, and conditioning. All in the Purist School emphasized the relevance of African culture and tradition for both philosophy as well as models for African development (Azenabor Understanding xiv). While the choice of “Purist” as a descriptor can be questioned (see Sophie Oluwole’s defense of Oruka’s project as admitting up front the multiple influences on contemporary rural sages, in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 155), Azenabor’s categorization helps us to see the common themes and approaches of authors who emphasized their distinction from and competition with each other.

5. Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages

In some works Oruka was at pains to distinguish “folk sages” and “folk sagacity” (wise elders who could recount community traditions and beliefs but not take a critical, evaluative stance toward them) from “philosophical sages” or “philosophic sagacity” which were the interviews and ideas of particularly reflective and evaluative sages. The distinction copied “first order” and “second order” distinctions in philosophy to a great extent. Many philosophers concluded that the only important part of the sage philosophy project was the “philosophic sagacity” part. However, such an approach left unexplained the role that folk sages played in the project. Why continue to include folk sages if they are examples of unphilosophical individuals? Several scholars addressed this thorny topic (Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria”; Van Hook).

Omedi Ochieng noted the irony that while Oruka first began his project to debunk Western scoffers who thought Africans were involved in unreflective groupthink, his comments championing the philosophic sages as “geniuses” in contrast to folk sages and other Africans who were satisfied at following others and not thinking for themselves ended up reinforcing the negative stereotype of Africans (“Epistemology” 348-351). He thought that Oruka capitulated and accepted academic definitions of philosophy that belittled folk wisdom and championed abstraction in a way that silenced the important contributions of many Africans (“Ideology” 153-57). Oluwole likewise noted that in some of Oruka’s texts he seemed to define “philosophy” so narrowly that even his own sages would fail to meet such narrow criteria, which would ironically lead to the failure of his own project. She insists, however, that if the sage interviews could be approached by sensitive scholars familiar with the sages’ language and context, without the near-ubiquitous prejudice against finding philosophy in African oral practices, that the project in this sense is very promising (Oluwole in Graness and Kresse 158-61).

An additional problem is that even when Oruka sorted out his folk and philosophical sages, the folk sages still demonstrated the intellectual virtues Oruka insisted belonged only to the philosophical sages. To illustrate this point, let me highlight that each of the seven “folk sages” in Sage Philosophy (chap. 6) distinguished their views from those of their communities on at least one topic. Chege Kamau said that he didn’t believe the afterlife consists in ancestral spirits as others believe. Rather, he posited, all people rejoin one big soul, which he called God. Joseph Muthee advocated sometimes unpopular inter-tribal marriages as a means of building a national culture. Ali Mwitani Masero argued that death is the end of the human being. Zacharia Nyandere said he believed men and women were equal, despite Luo perceptions to the contrary. Abel M’Nkabui said all humans were equal, and that inequalities were historical accidents. Based on this conviction, he was critical of Meru prejudice against blacksmiths. Joseph Osuru said that the Teso think that God does not belong to other tribes or races. But he thought that God belongs to all people. He also mentioned that some Teso think that having dreams of the deceased is proof that they live in a world after death. But, he pointed out, having a dream is not proof. Peris Njuhi Muthoni said that it was good that the practice of female circumcision is dying, because it led to medical problems. She stated that it was her conviction that Luo should not remove their teeth as a rite of passage. These concrete examples show that all of the so-called “folk sages” can critique their own societies, an attribute Oruka assigned only to the “philosophic sages.”

Oruka listed “philosophic sages” in their own chapter (chap. 7). The sages included there were Okemba Simiuyu Chaungo, Oruka Rang’inya, Stephen M. Kithanje, Paul Mbuya Akoko, and Chaungo Barasa (Sage 1991 ed., 109-155). An additional aspect of the sage philosophy project was that Oruka did not want the project to stay on the descriptive level. He wanted Kenyans to read and grapple with the ideas of the sages, evaluate them, extend them, and apply them to their lives. However, his own published commentary on the interviews was brief (Trends 64-65). In Sage Philosophy, he left the job of commentary on the interviews to his student, Anthony Oseghare (Sage 1991 ed., 156-160).

D. A. Masolo made the point that it is not mere disagreement with one’s cultural group that makes one a philosophic sage, but rather that “the criterion for a moral ideal, according to the sage, is not that it match the historical belief of the community but that it satisfies an acceptable idea of right, fairness, and respectfulness toward all those who are involved or may be affected by its practical application” (Masolo “Sage”). He gave the example of a sage who would counsel against the practice of a certain ritual if it would jeopardize the health of an individual. In these circumstances, the important criteria “was not their mere variance from the communal beliefs of the sages’ own groups but also a theoretical account provided by the sage as the foundation of his or her own view. . . The sage attends to the rationality of views rather than to the judgment of the group” (Masolo “Sage”).

One of the tensions found within sage philosophy is that, while Oruka privileged sages critical of their societies’ prejudices, as in the examples above, on the other hand he championed sages who hold in high esteem traditional values forgotten or marginalized by young Kenyans.  In a 1979 research proposal for sage philosophy, he explained that his project was a way of defending his nation from the “invasion by foreign ideas,” which could not be stopped by guns but instead must be combated on the level of ideas. This cultural invasion included worship of technology and an adherence to crass materialism as a measure of success. Oruka bemoaned the fact that African traditional morality was already eroded by European colonialism, and their replacements, Christianity and Islam, he argued, were incapable of standing up to the cultural erosion of values (“The Philosophical”).

Oruka often asked questions about the proper relationship between men and women during his interviews with sages. Many of the sages insisted that women were inferior to men. Oruka cautioned readers that the sages were reflecting the cultural prejudices of their times, and he reminded those familiar with Western philosophy that such assertions of women’s inferiority could be found as well throughout the Western canon of well-known and respected philosophers. Still, he was proud of the fact that some of his sages held relatively progressive views on this topic (Sage 1990 ed., xix-xx; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 136), and he even had one sage’s views on the topic published in a Nairobi newspaper (“Paul Mbuya”). The views asserting men’s superiority could be found in the sages interviewed by his student F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo and Ngungi Kathanga. In Oruka’s studies as well as his students’ studies, few women sages were interviewed. Gail Presbey has drawn attention to women sages in her works (“Who”; “Kenyan”).

6. Criticisms of Sage Philosophy

From early on, critics from within the community of African philosophy scholars put forward their criticisms. Oruka included three critics (Bodunrin, Kaphagawani, and Keita) and three supporters (Outlaw, Oseghare, and Neugebauer) in Sage Philosophy. Peter Bondunrin said Oruka’s sages were not enough like the Greek philosophers, who expounded their view in a context of literacy (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 163-179, esp. 168-69). Lansana Keita said that when Oruka relegated creative individual thinking to the critical views of “philosophic sagacity,” he failed to acknowledge that the folk or ethnophilosophy of the community could itself be a product of earlier creative individual philosophizing (Sage 1990 ed., 210). While some of these criticisms were perhaps based on a misunderstanding of Oruka’s project (see Bewaji review 109), Oruka did appreciate the debates that ensued and responded to these critics in his own articles, which were included in the first part of the book.

After the publication of the book, criticism continued. D. A. Masolo said the sages Oruka quoted often made comments that were no more than common sense, perhaps with some cleverness thrown in, rather than sustained arguments (Masolo African Philosophy 236-245).  Ochieng’-Odhiambo had a clever and insightful response to this kind of criticism. “The idea that philosophy must always operate at a higher rarefied level with deep abstractions is not always true . . . Philosophy can, in many ways, be expressed very simply”; in fact, he agreed with Christopher Nwondo, who advocated that philosophers in Africa should attempt to write in clear and simple language (Trends 138). But Ochieng’-Odhiambo did clarify that Masolo was not against the sage philosophy project itself, but had just stated that he thought the interviews included were not yet strong enough to prove the point to his liking (Trends 137).

Tunde Bewaji reviewed Sage Philosophy and was impressed by Oruka’s sage interviews because they “reflect a clarity of thought which is not seen in ethnographic, anthropological or sociological studies” (106). While Simiyu Chaungo argued that God was the sun, because without the sun there could be no life, Ali Mwitani Masero, on page 96 of Sage Philosophy, argued that if God created the sun, God cannot also be the sun. Bewaji also commended Osuru’s criticism of popular practices that regarded dreams as evidence about the afterlife. Bewaji pointed out that many persons from so-called civilized societies still consider dreams evidence of another world. He also commended Kithanje for arguing that there could not be many gods, because such gods could not account for the uniformity of creation (106-07).

In chapter four of his book, Philosophy in an African Place, Bruce Janz reflected upon Oruka’s sage philosophy project. He noted that the approach seemed to solve the paradox of African philosophy by appealing to universal principles of reason and exploring the context of African lived experience. Yet, Oruka imported Western philosophical ideas to a large extent and left them mostly unacknowledged.  This was problematic since his project purports to be all about African philosophizing. Additionally, Janz offered critiques of the methodology.  The method at first looked promising, by focusing on conversation between sage and the interviewer (an academically trained philosopher) where the two cooperatively worked toward truth.  Yet, to Janz, it often sounded nevertheless like it was the academic philosopher who focused upon and made manifest the latent reasoning in the sage’s conversation. Janz noted that past, outmoded ethnographies turned Africans into objects of others’ studies and declared that he therefore preferred open-ended conversation. But the structure of questions that most sages were asked in interviews steered them toward certain answers that fit in the context of past Western philosophical paradigms such as asking for an essence (What is wisdom? What is virtue?). Such questions presumed that increasing levels of abstraction were abilities to be praised in a sage. Interviewers guided the sages, he argued, by eliciting the sage’s opinion on topics that the interviewer thought important.  Janz also took Oruka to task for promising to evaluate which of the sages were wise according to an objective criterion. Janz noted the complex and multiple aspects of being a wise person, and suggested that it would not be easy for anyone to sort out the wise from the not-wise. Further, Oruka did not address whether or not wisdom is a culture-bound concept. Janz suggested that wisdom was better recognized intersubjectively, identified in “a process of explicating shared meanings in a community, rather than identifying an essence” (107).

Omedi Ochieng likewise insisted that the sages be placed in a context where their speech could be understood contextually, and he found several places where Oruka failed to fill in important aspects of context. In fact he questioned the “interview” as Oruka’s chosen method, suggesting that sages might not understand an interview as a context in which to justify their philosophical beliefs when challenged by a provocateur. Adversarial debate is a particular form of philosophizing that may not be valued by the sage. But Ochieng did think that interviews with sages in some form should still be done in a “reconstructed” version of African sage philosophy (“Epistemology” 346-47, 359).

Janz similarly suggested that Oruka depended too much on the idea of philosophizing as critique and divergence from communally accepted beliefs. Why not look for other signs of wisdom, such as creative thinking? Janz found many examples of creative thinking among the sages, such as Stephen Kithanje’s “fecund metaphor of God being like heat and cold.” Likewise, Okemba Chaungo showed through his debate of the relative good of wisdom versus land that the seeming contradiction could be overcome by understanding different senses of “good” (109). In general, Janz was frustrated that sage philosophy was not more self-critical about its methods, did not come to terms with its positionality, and did not devote time to critiquing its own methods.

W. J. Ndaba critiqued Oruka’s work, arguing that the ideal of philosophy as “an individual, explicit, critical and self-critical ratiocinative consciousness” was a Western notion, since such emphasis was “counterproductive for the emergence of a genuinely rooted African philosophy” (17). He held that an African perspective would value the folk sage, that is, the person who consulted the wisdom of their community and did not try to do it alone. He referred to the Zulu proverb, Iso—elilodwa—kaliphumeleli (“An eye—when it is one—does not succeed”), to emphasize the importance of consulting other persons who could “note points of detail which elude him or unforeseen snags which turn up to mar his plan” (20-21).  He disagreed with Oruka’s claims that the philosophic sage was more valuable than the folk sage. He did, however, appreciate Oruka’s emphasis on the philosophical sage being able to warn society against holding one-sided or close-minded, ethnocentric views.

While there have been critics of sage philosophy, there have also been many scholars who have appreciated its contribution. In addition to those already mentioned above, substantive treatments of Oruka’s project can be found in the works of Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage); Sophie Oluwole, Muyiwa Falaiye and Ulrich Loelke (in Graness and Kresse), and others.

7. Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages

Oruka was convinced, both by his training in practical philosophy as well as his own sense of values and priorities, that philosophy in general, and the sage philosophy project in particular, had to address itself to the concrete problems facing Kenyans and Africans.  It should address issues in the present and suggest a course of action to make Africa’s future better.. Thus, he wanted his project to be both practical and accessible to a general audience beyond academia. He often wrote for the newspapers, such as the Daily Nation, and other popular publications. In 1986, he participated in a study sponsored by the Institute of African Studies at the University of Nairobi called “Kenya’s Socio-Political Profiles” where he was required to contribute a broad outline of the general beliefs and practices of the Luo ethnic group (Oruka Sage 1990 ed., 53, 58-61). In 1986 he became an expert witness for a now-famous trial often referred to as the S. M. Otieno burial saga. Oruka took the witness stand, and gave an account of the philosophy and practices of burial among those from the Luo ethnic group. He argued that his expertise was due to his study of so many interviews with philosophical sages from the area. He included a transcript of his evidence in court in Sage Philosophy (1990 ed., 65-80).

Note that “culture philosophy,” that is, an account of the prevailing beliefs of an ethnic community, was an offshoot of interviews aimed at discovering philosophic sagacity. In order to see how a particular sage deviated from norms in his individual, critical thinking, the sage often began by recounting reigning shared values in his community. This “offshoot” of sorts (which Oruka had before dismissed in a disparaging way as philosophy only in a broad or even “debased” sense) now became a focus. Some experts in customary law even accused Oruka of giving the court an outdated account of practices, presented as timeless truths of the Luo ethnic group (Cotran 155). When Oruka was in the witness stand, Khaminwa, Wambui Otieno’s lawyer, asked him whether in traditional society there may be people opposed to customs who want to depart from those customs and do things their own way. Oruka explained to Khaminwa that “in a traditional communal society there were very few rebels” (Sage 1990 ed., 70). He minimized the existence and role of such dissent, even though in his academic work on sage philosophy he particularly championed such dissent.

Rather than see him as taking on the role of ethnophilosopher, Ochieng’-Odhiambo suggested that, at that point, Oruka showed that he himself was a philosophic sage able to recount the traditions of his ethnic group while also resolving any inconsistencies (Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 125). Masolo thought that Oruka’s popularity grew because of his role in the trial, due to his ability to unmask the faulty logic of the widow’s defense team that equated “modern” with “Western” in a stereotypical and unfair way (“Sage”). Be that as it may, the court case can also be seen as another missed opportunity for Oruka to champion the rights of women in a male-dominated context (Presbey, 2012, 2013).

The court case was the beginning of a new phase in Oruka’s sage research. As Oruka explained, due to his notoriety in the case, he was offered work sensitizing District Officers and Commissioners to Luo philosophy and customs. When he gave these talks, he reiterated common beliefs among the Luos and quoted individual philosophical sages (Sage 1990 ed., 58-64). He also put his sage sources to use when studying Kenyan beliefs and practices regarding family planning, for the Department of Populations. He had two control groups, non-sages and sages, and gave the views of both. His main point was that Kenyan traditions and values already had the resources for population control through natural family planning.  Further, a sensitive study of the culture of Kenyan people could reveal attitudes and practices that worked against family planning and then point the way to solutions to the problem. Here he seemed to have crossed over quite a bit into the social sciences. Dorothy Munyakho explained that his approach was still considered experimental and controversial from the perspective of people in Population Studies who were more familiar with demographics and statistics than with qualitative analysis of interview content (21).

Critic Didier Kaphagawani, in a 1987 article reprinted in Sage Philosophy, charged sage philosophy with being parasitic on ethnophilosophy, insofar as philosophic sages practiced second-order reflection and analysis of first-order ethnophilosophy (Kaphagawani in Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 181-204). But Oruka responded and clarified. He said instead that philosophic sagacity is second order to culture philosophy. Sages reflect upon the culture, though not as it is summarized in consensus form and analyzed by professional philosophers, theologians, or missionaries (as in ethnophilosophy); rather, they do so based on their first-hand observations of the culture philosophy through their personal experiences in the community (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). This same point could serve as a fine-tuned criticism of Momoh’s terminology mentioned above, since Momoh sometimes referred to ethnophilosophy and communal philosophy without distinction. Momoh added the helpful point that all communal philosophies, not just African communal philosophies, are non-critical, and he gave some examples from Britain (The Substance 59, 63).

In an article, “Sage Philosophy Revisited,” based on a radio interview in 1993 and published posthumously, Oruka noted that some scholars considered his project “just one of the brands of ethnophilosophy,” similar to Mbiti and others, and disagreed with those critics (Practical 183). He agreed that he studied “culture philosophy” and described it as the “beliefs, practices, myths, taboos, and general values of a people” (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). To the end, Oruka trusted his method more than that of ethnophilosophers like Tempels because he based his accounts of culture philosophy on the testimony of trusted indigenous experts (the philosophical sages), and he considered himself to be conveying only what they had told him (Sage 1990 ed., 57; 1991 ed., 43n2). Of course, there is no escaping one’s role in shaping the data insofar as the researcher, even Oruka himself, decides which parts of which interviews to highlight when presenting them to others. This methodological point was raised by Emmanuel Eze regarding Oruka’s work (Eze and Lewis 19).

It’s important to note that as time went on, ethnophilosophy’s staunchest critic, Paulin Hountondji, modified his position.  He reflected on the debate that was started by his criticism of ethnophilosophy and said in 2002 that his earlier rejection of collective thought was excessive. He explained that collective culture must be taken seriously, and that individuality is fashioned from a basic personality, which has rootedness. While he agreed that individual thought should be seen in cultural context, he noted that it should not be stuck there. Roots should not become a “prison house” (The Struggle 128, 151-52, 204-05). Also, one of Hountondji’s biggest complaints about the ethnophilosophers like Tempels was that they were foreigners, or if not foreigners, at least they were writing for a foreign audience, responding to debates and criteria created abroad. Hountondji called this “extroversion,” and wanted instead to have African philosophy being written by Africans and responding to the interests and needs of Africans (“Introduction”). Certainly, the trajectory of Oruka’s interests in the sages showed that over time, the issue of proving anything to outsiders diminished in importance, as the question of how sage wisdom and reflection could help Kenya and Africa took center stage (Ochieng’-Odhiambo “The Tripartite” 21, “The Evolution” 29, and “Philosophic” 78; Kalumba 39-40; Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria”).

8. Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years

Oruka intended his sage philosophy project to continue to grow. He called his 1992 book, on former Vice-President of Kenya Jaramogi Oginga Odinga, a continuing study in sage philosophy (Practical 162). In many respects, Oginga Odinga was quite different than the other sages, insofar as he was literate, had formal education and extensive experience in government (being first vice president of Kenya and later a presidential candidate) and had also traveled abroad.  Nevertheless, Oruka insisted that in Oginga Odinga’s role as ker, that is, spiritual and cultural leader of the Luo people, he maintained with the other sages an important commitment to the betterment of his community. Oruka also clarified that, while he had begun his sage philosophy research interviewing illiterate elder sages, because their testimony might soon be lost, he never intended his project to be limited to the illiterate, elderly or rural persons. Thus, speculations that his project would become out of date the more that literacy spread in Africa were based on a misunderstanding of his project (Sage 1990 ed., xviii). Indeed, in Sage Philosophy, he included an interview of one young, educated sage, Chaungo Barasa (a water engineer), due to his wisdom and his commitment to his community (1990 ed., 149-57).

Oruka articulated and emphasized other reasons to continue sage philosophy as a project, including the need for a generation of Kenyans who grew up in cities to remain connected to their roots. He was also concerned with the practical challenges of poverty and corruption and curtailment of liberties in Kenya. He thought that sages, from the obscure rural ones to the more famous ones like Oginga Odinga, could offer a bold moral critique of Kenyan society that could help people improve their lives both individually and as a community and nation.

Oruka’s life was cut short in a road accident in December of 1995. As a pedestrian, he was struck down by a motorist in the streets of Nairobi (Nation Reporter 40). Further studies in sage philosophy have certainly been stymied by this loss but not wholly halted. Anke Graness and Kai Kresse quickly assembled scholars to comment on sage philosophy’s legacy in a memorial book to Oruka that came out shortly after his death, Sagacious Reasoning. A book of essays that Oruka had been working on at the time of his death, Practical Philosophy, was subsequently published. This book divided Oruka’s essays into four sections, one on African philosophy and culture and the other three covering issues of truth and faith, value and ideology, and environmental ethics. Excerpts of sage interviews can be found in some collections on African philosophy (see Oruka’s interview of Paul Mbuya Akoko in Hord and Lee 32-44).

9. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students

To explore the ongoing influence of sage philosophy, it’s best to cast a wide net. While “philosophic sagacity” was a specialized part of sage philosophy, the project also included folk sages and culture philosophy. It makes sense to survey those who found Oruka’s emphasis on the interview process central to their own work in African philosophy. Some of these persons did not mind drawing upon interviews as well as proverbs. Many provided extensive historical background and filled in details of the context of those they interviewed to a far greater extent than Oruka ever did in his studies, and they did so for good methodological reasons. Some refined the interview method beyond Oruka’s own practice, going more in-depth, refraining from misleading questions, and some even preferred participant observation to interview. With all of these variations, it is best to understand these works as influenced by Oruka and perhaps even as improvements on his project, rather than as strict copies.

This survey will begin with those who had been Oruka’s own graduate students. Most published work beyond their original theses and many became scholars in their own right. During Oruka’s time at University of Nairobi, MA and PhD students such as Kenyans Ngungi Kathanga, Oriare Nyarwath, Patrick Dikirr, F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo (“The Significance”), Wairimu Gichohi, and Nigerian Anthony Oseghare  incorporated sage philosophy as a topic and/or interviews with sages into their studies while under Oruka’s supervision. Some of them published articles sharing their research with others. Oseghare’s thesis reiterated many points of Oruka’s own position—holding  a universalist definition of philosophy, limiting investigation to texts that met the philosophical standards of being critical, rigorous and of a second-order activity—and  analyzed three sages according to this criteria. Two of the sages appeared in Oruka’s book, and Oseghare’s commentary on those two sages was excerpted and included in Sage Philosophy. But the thesis included discussion of a third sage, Oigara from the Kisii community. Oseghare liked Oigara best because unlike Oruka Rang’inya (who happened to be Oruka’s father) who explained the psychology behind “explaining events through the activities of spirits as a ploy of encouraging good behavior,” Oigara instead directly appealed to individuals’ abilities to make rational judgments (Oseghare xii). Oseghare concluded that the sages met his criteria for philosophical thinking.

Gichohi analyzed the interviews of sages included in Sage Philosophy (1991), finding contradictions in the concepts and positions held by some of the sages regarding their concepts of God.  For starters, she questioned why Paul Mbuya Akoko said there must be one god to account for the orderliness of the universe.  According to Gichohi, Mbuya begged the question, for who is to say that many gods must take on a mischievous character? (89). She also noted that Mbuya said that no one really knows God but later affirmed that God exists and rules nature (91). She noted that Oruka Rang’inya was involved in a contradiction between God being a concept and God’s living in the wind (93). She further was concerned that M’Mukindia Kithanje’s interpretation of God as present at the biological process of procreation confused the mysterious or marvelous with God (94). When it came to their ideas for the improvement of society, Gichohi found some of the sages’ suggestions problematic.  Gichohi was particularly concerned with Mbuya Akoko’s suggestion that a criminal should be administered a drug during which time he could be reformed.  She expressed her skepticism that such a procedure would reform the individual.  Since being subjected to such drugs involuntarily is dehumanizing, how could one be reformed while his humanity has been eroded?  In addition, Mbuya did not explain what type of offender and under what circumstance the punishment should be administered.  These are all very important objections to the procedure which were not even questioned during the interview (103-04).  Likewise, when Simiyu said that illness is due to laziness, his view, although perhaps sometimes true, could not count for all cases, such as physical destruction and disease brought on by earthquakes and other large-scale calamities not caused by humans. (131-32).

Ochieng’-Odhiambo described in his thesis and subsequent articles that his efforts were aimed at exploring “philosophic sagacity” to prove to skeptics that Africans can philosophize. For this reason, he explained, “my efforts were channeled toward presenting the thoughts of some sages in an elaborate and rarefied manner. More specifically, I concentrated on those topics that had been the focus of most ancient Greek philosophers” (“The Tripartite” 18). By proceeding in such a way, he would not only “uncoil” the philosophical ideas and logic of the sages but also “show beyond the shadow of a doubt that philosophers existed in traditional Africa” (“The Tripartite” 19). As Ochieng’-Odhiambo explained in a 1997 article that presented some of his 1994 dissertation’s findings, “The rationale of my approach was that if the thoughts of the pre-Socratics are philosophical (and this is never doubted) and if the African (Kenyan) sages think in a similar manner, then they should also be granted the prestige of being philosophical” (“Philosophic” 174). Oruka himself made references to the sages being at least as good as the pre-Socratics (Sage 1990 ed., xv-xvi, xxv, 37), so Ochieng’-Odhiambo was clearly following Oruka’s lead. The rest of the article, based on the research he did for his dissertation, involved interviewing sages and asking them, for example, questions on change and permanence. Ochieng’-Odhiambo asked Rose Ondhewe Odhiambo whether things change or are permanent (in obvious reference to the Parmenides and Heraclitus paradox). She gave a nuanced answer: some things change more than they are permanent, and some are more permanent and change little. Certainly she used reason and put forward a rational view. Ochieng’-Odhiambo went on to interview a man, Naftali Ong’alo, who when asked what the single most important element is, argued that “water is the single most important thing in the universe” (“Philosophic” 175-77).

It’s possible to raise some methodological questions regarding the approach in Ochieng’-Odhaimbo’s early works. The problem of asking “leading questions,” whether pursued intentionally or not, is a real one for any interviewer; Ochieng’-Odhaimbo himself addressed the dangers of leading questions in another work of his (Trends 132-33). While his studies with Oruka were in the 1990s, he continued to address African Philosophy in general, and sage philosophy in particular, as a key topic in his philosophical writings. He gave a thorough account of Oruka’s sage project in his 2002 and 2006 articles, and in his 2010 book (Trends 115-150).

Patrick Maison Dikirr published some findings from his 1994 master’s thesis which he wrote under Oruka’s supervision. Dikirr interviewed Maasai sages on the topic of death. As Dikirr explained, by discussing death, certain ideas, values, or lessons were reinforced about life. There were ambiguous practices among the Maasais, some of which seemed to argue for an idea of the afterlife. For example, when a Maasai person saw a snake (black python or cobra) in a hut of someone who has recently died, they fed it milk, greeted it, and told it, “We are always together!”  After all, the snake may be a deceased important person such as an oloiboni (diviner), a great chief or counselor, or a wealthy man. But Dikirr wondered further, were snakes fed just to avert their anger, so that humans could survive?  Or, were there ethical lessons contained in the treatment of snakes, such as: do not despise strangers who may show up to one’s house? He preferred that these lessons be the real reason behind the stories. Likewise, Maasais thought that waking someone suddenly from deep sleep should be discouraged, because the spirit travels while sleeping. But, Dikirr preferred to understand this practice as a focus on the ethical values of politeness and humility toward others. Dikirr thought the Maasai conception of self was closer to the Aristotelean unitary self-experience. He found evidence to show that Maasais thought there was a permanent end to life. The dead are no longer around. The only thing left after death is how one’s personality affects the children. A person who has children will not easily fade from memory like the single person who dies without children. Here, immortality is understood as a name to remember.

Ngungi Kathanga wrote a master’s thesis on philosophic sagacity at UON in 1992. Seven male (and no female) sages, all Kikuyus from Kirinyaga district, were included in Kathanga’s study. He explained that he originally interviewed fifty women and men (he does not mention how many of the fifty were women), but only the seven men included were judged by him to be sages (96). He included three sages’ responses to questions of men and women’s equality. All three said men were superior to women. All pointed out her physical weakness, and some added other weaknesses. Mwangi Wangu stated that women are unable to keep secrets.  But he said they are respected for their roles as child-bearers, because through the naming of children, the dead survive. Joel Rukenya said women cannot rise up to tough challenges in life, and therefore should not be put in positions of power (122-24). The sages are, however, quoted as supporting racial equality (128-131).

Regarding Oginga Odinga, Peter Ogola Onyango of Moi University claims that a philosophic sage must first become a folk sage before he or she can become a philosophic sage. He then argues that Oginga Odinga proves his ability to be a folk sage by the fact that he is chosen as Ker of the Luo. Ogola Onyango then shows that Oginga Odinga is a philosophic sage because he disagreed with popular opinion of many Luos during the S. M. Otieno burial trial, when he claimed that it is fine for Luos to be buried anywhere in Kenya (240-42).

Oriare Nyarwath analyzed several of Oruka’s sages on the topic of freedom (Nyarwath in Graness and Kresse 211-218). He went on to write a PhD thesis in 2009 on Oruka’s philosophical works which included his review of the sage philosophy project’s purpose and methodology, but he did not include interviews of sages or commentary upon Oruka’s sage interviews (139-161, 247-48). Instead, the thesis focused on the question of Oruka’s commitments and overarching themes throughout his published works.

Also, students at Tangaza College in Nairobi’s Maryknoll Institute of African Studies program were regularly offered a course in sage philosophy, earlier taught by Oruka himself, then by F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo, and later, by Oriare Nyarwath (Maryknoll “Sage Philosophy”). These students continued to interview sages; their reports can be found in the Tangaza College library. In the earlier years, that is, in the 1990s, reports were almost always accompanied by transcripts of the interviews. But after around 2000, the number of student papers containing the transcript of the interviews declined. Either students gave short quotes of the interviews, or they only referred to interviews without giving any direct quotes.

10. Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars

Kai Kresse’s book, Philosophising in Mombasa, got its inspiration from Oruka’s project. Kresse explained that he was seeking knowledge about knowledge in the context of the Muslim community living on Kenya’s Swahili coast. He wanted to study the self-reflexive, critical knowledge of local thinkers there. His book contained three in-depth portraits of local elder intellectuals and several briefer portraits of younger thinkers.  Kresse explained how his methodology differed from Oruka’s.  Unlike Oruka, Kresse did not center his study on direct questions put to each thinker interviewed, but instead observed the intellectuals during their philosophical discourses with members of their community.  Kresse himself became fluent in Swahili so that he could follow such discussions directly, and read the scholars’ lectures, poetry and other writings. He lived in the Mombasa Old Town community so that he could be socially accepted and therefore placed in situations to hear and document the most interesting discussions. Kresse also helped his readers by describing the historical, religious and cultural context in which the debates occurred, as well as the personal biographies of the participants. But like Oruka and Brenner, Kresse saw a key part of his work as documenting “the utterances of the intellectuals” (31; Brenner). While Kresse added his own interpretation, he provided clear demarcation to his commentary, so that the reader could accept or reject the interpretations offered.

Kresse then followed with several chapters, each focusing on a particular thinker.  Ahmed Sheikh Nabhany had as his goal the preservation of all that was good in Swahili traditions. Through poetry he was able to use his creative skills to communicate the basics of Islamic practices as well as moral guidelines and cultural practices. Nabhany was active in his proposals for preservation of a moral code that was losing ground in contemporary society. In his next chapter Kresse explored Ahmad Nassir, who in his poem “Utenzi wa Mtu ni Utu” summed up a moral code that involved respecting all human beings, that provided guidelines for distinguishing between good and bad actions, and that offered a way to measure moral status. Kresse considered Nassir to be an innovator insofar as he constructed a theory of utu (humaneness) and formulated sub-concepts that enforce utu. The next chapter focused on Sheikh Abdilahi Nassir’s Ramadan lectures. Kresse argued that Abdilahi was a sage, referring to Oruka’s use of the term in the context of his sage philosophy project. Abdulahi’s practice of rethinking his own positions on issues of dire importance to his community, and the extent of his conscious effort to clarify his ideas, made Abdulahi’s practices a clear example of philosophizing (206-07).

Kresse followed the book with an article in 2008 that engaged in a study of the concept of wisdom, based on two Swahili sages. He argued that a person is identified as wise if they are able to make others see the world in a different light or from a new perspective. He argued that wisdom required social performance and interaction (“Can,” 194, 199).

Workineh Kelbessa, a philosopher from Ethiopia who had met Oruka and was inspired by his project, used Oruka’s interview method to gain knowledge about environmental values among the Oromo of Ethiopia. He wrote a book about his findings. His work drew upon culture philosophy as well as the insights of philosophic sages. He explained, “In this work, the term ‘indigenous environmental ethics’ is used sometimes to refer to the ethical views of philosophic sages who have their own independent views, and in most cases it is used as a plural (of ‘environmental ethic’) to refer to the norms and values of various Oromo groups and of other indigenous peoples” (ch. 1). His objective was to “show how indigenous knowledge systems can serve as a critical resource base for the process of development and a healthy environment.” He cautioned that he did not intend to engage in uncritical, nostalgic acceptance of Oromo indigenous knowledge.  He used various sources, but depended most upon “interviewing, focus group discussion and observation” because they “enable us to understand values and attitudes of the people towards the environment at a level inaccessible to a questionnaire.” He interviewed peasant farmers and pastoralists to learn about their concepts of time and divination, their ecotheology, and their attitudes toward wild animals, forests, and agriculture (ch. 1). His study drew upon many proverbs.

A further sage philosophy study which attempted to apply the insights gained from sage philosophy to the topic of a new national culture for Kenya was written by Chaungo Barasa, who helped Oruka conduct his sage philosophy interviews. Chaungo argued that cultural practices needed to be connected to consistent thoughts and belief systems.  He suggested Kenyans re-examine their lives and cultures in five areas:  the intersection/harmonization of tradition and modernity, death and burial ceremonies, marriage and inheritance, inter-family and clan relations, and leadership and role-modeling.  All of this could be attained with the help of sage philosophy, which encouraged people to pursue wisdom and reflect on their beliefs.  The family taught moral behavior, he noted; however, in Kenya’s modern families (making up about 35 percent of the population) there was, he argued, a lack of morality. “Modern” Kenyans, he wrote, held a flawed concept of modernity, equating it with European culture and religion, and their understanding of that culture was rudimentary and incoherent.  Chaungo maintained that the modern Kenyan also had a stunted understanding of indigenous cultures and traditions; in their place were materialism, and consumerism, and status.  They barely masked their distaste for rural folk and environment, Chaungo argued; yet, they engaged in gender oppression which contradicted modernity.  Also, modern Kenyans were easily manipulated and bought by various politicians.  Such a description showed that philosophical reflection upon tradition was mandatory in order for society to become productive and coherent.

Oral historian E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo’s article “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development:  Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya” (2000) analyzed and evaluated books and pamphlets written by these two sages. Paul Mbuya Akoko, interviewed by Oruka and included in Sage Philosophy, was also a writer.  This article met the two criteria of quoting individual sages, and engaging in critical analysis. Since the sages addressed the topic of development, the thrust of the article also fit in with Oruka’s expressed goals for his sage philosophy project. Mbuya was not the only sage included in Oruka’s Sage Philosophy who had written down his own ideas, and yet Oruka did not analyze the written works of the sages he included in his study.

In his “Conversations with Luo Sages,” D. A. Masolo recorded a conversation of pressing issues of the day in which a sage takes center stage, and in which Masolo was a participant but did not direct the conversation. Masolo considered this an example of participant observation, which, according to some anthropologists, could be a more reliable source of texts for understanding African philosophy than interviews. Masolo included this conversation transcript in his book Self and Community (255-60) because it shed light on contemporary moral debate in Kenya. While not explicitly expressed, what “emerged” during the conversation was the question of whether the worth of abstract moral principles “ought to be judged independently of any real situation” (263). Masolo then further analyzed the issues raised, in the context of moral positions expressed by Kant, Hume, and Wiredu. In another part of the same work, Masolo drew upon the insights of a sage interviewed by Oruka, Paul Mbuya Akoko. He found these to express helpful ideas for grounding the ethics of communalism, described by the sage as, in Masolo’s words, “a norm arrived at for purposes of affecting order in the lives of people by reducing social differences and promoting peace” (50). Masolo could be seen as a contemporary advocate and practitioner of a variant of sage philosophy.  His methods focused not on interviews of a sage by a researcher, but rather the analysis of discourse at various public fora in which the sages gathered, such as “palavers,” public debates and negotiations. In these contexts, sages used their mental skills and were involved in sustained critical inquiry (“Sage Philosophy”).

Richard Bell’s book, Understanding African Philosophy, devoted a section to Oruka’s sage philosophy. He wanted to take Oruka’s project further by exploring oral philosophy as an example of narrative and Socratic discourse found not only in the texts of sages but also in everyday discourse and village palavers (32-35, 111-12).). For Bell, philosophy in Africa had to be tied to the experience of the lived reality of Africa, which was made up of the pre-colonial traditions of Africa, and its colonial history, current harsh circumstances, and human struggles (35). Bell analogized to Plato’s dialogues, such as Euthyphro, where, in the context of everyday life, circumstances give rise to philosophical dilemmas.  Sages similarly prompted to engage in discussion as well as deep thought, and they grappled with situations which gave rise to what Bell called the “narrative ‘stuff’ of philosophy” (112).

Bekele Gutema argued that sage philosophy’s method was particularly productive in exploring topics of conflict resolution, such as crises of democracy, problems of ruling elites and corruption, and ethnic strife. Sages emphasized solutions that addressed the needs and perspectives of all parties, having as their goals the harmony between people as well as between people and nature. He added what he knew about elders being involved in reconciliation from his own experience (208-11). Presbey interviewed sages with these themes in mind. She found sages in both Kenya and Ghana who shared their insights into conflict, whether interpersonal or ethnic, and their procedures for bringing estranged parties together. She quoted from her interviews with the sages and evaluated their insights (Presbey “Contemporary African Sages”; “Philosophic Sages”; “Sage Philosophy and Critical Thinking”).

Charles Verharen of Howard University engaged in a project which combined Oruka’s sage philosophy project with the methods of Claude Sumner, S.J., the scholar who studied Ethiopian philosophy while living there for 45 years. Verharen noted that Sumner, following the suggestion of Alain Locke, enlisted the aid of linguists and anthropologists to do his philosophical work, something that Oruka did not do, but that Verharen considered essential to his project. Verharen engaged in interviews both among the Oromo and, with the help of Rianna Oelofsen of University of Fort Hare, South Africa, among the Xhosa and San. Verharen explained that he was drawn to study sage philosophy out of concerns for cultural survival as well as philosophy’s survival, as he searched for “better stories to tell” in a world where human survival was jeopardized (83-88). He suggested interviewing both those known as sages and a broader group drawn from all parts of the society, questioning them in such a way as to reveal their level of critical rationality (75-76).

Kazeem likewise suggests that sage philosophy research should continue with slight modifications in order that philosophers can salvage “indigenous epistemologies threatened with extinction” and thereby contribute to a “polycentric global epistemology” (200). Kazeem names his approach “hermeneutico-reconstructionism” and asserts that it can be used to solve Africa’s current problems (200-01).

Oruka’s contribution to the field of African philosophy was substantial, and his influence is ongoing, as sage research continues.

11. References and Further Reading

  • Abraham, W. E. The Mind of Africa. Chicago: U of Chicago P, 1962.
  • Atieno-Odhiambo, E. S. “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development: Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya.” African Philosophy as Cultural Inquiry. Ed Ivan Karp and D. A. Masolo. Bloomington: Indiana UP, 2000. 244–258.  African Systems of Thought.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. “Odera Oruka’s Philosophic Sagacity: Problems and Challenges of Conversation Method in African Philosophy.” Premier Issue. Spec. issue of Thought and Practice: A Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya ns 1.1 (June 2009): 69-86.
  • Azenabor, Godwin. Understanding the Problems in African Philosophy. Second Edition. Lagos, Nigeria: First Academic Publishers, 2002.
  • Bell, Richard H. Understanding African Philosophy: A Cross-Cultural Approach to Classical and Contemporary Issues. New York: Routledge, 2002.
  • Bewaji, Tunde. Rev. of Sage Philosophy, ed. H. Odera Oruka. Quest: Philosophical Discussions 7.1 (June 1994): 104-111.
  • Brenner, Louis. West African Sufi: The Religious Heritage and Spiritual Search of Cerno Bokar Saalif Taal. London: C. Hurst, 1984.
  • Chaungo, Barasa. “Narrowing the Gap between Past Practices and Future Thoughts in a Transitional Kenyan Cultural Model, for Sustainable Family Livelihood Security (FLS).” Presbey, et al. Thought and Practice 217–222.
  • Cotran, E. “The Future of Customary Law in Kenya.” The S. M. Otieno Case: Death and Burial in Modern Kenya. Ed. J. B. Ojwang and J. N. K. Mugambi. Kenya: Nairobi UP, 1989. 149-165.
  • Dikirr, Patrick Maison. “The Philosophy and Ethics Concerning Death and Disposal of the Dead Among the Maasai.” MA Thesis U of Nairobi, 1994.
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Author Information

Gail M. Presbey
University of Detroit Mercy
U. S. A.


Desert is a normative concept that is used in day-to-day life.  Many believe that being treated as one deserves to be treated is a matter of justice, fairness, or rightness.  Although desert claims come in a variety of forms, generally they are claims about some positive or negative treatment that someone or something ought to receive.  One might claim that a hard-working employee deserves a raise, an exceptional student deserves an academic scholarship, a dishonest politician deserves to lose an election, or a thief deserves to be imprisoned.  But while such appeals to desert are common, there are a number of unsettled issues regarding the concept of desert itself and its relevance to justice.  For example, it is common for people to claim that things other than humans, such as nonhuman animals or inanimate objects, can be deserving.  How should we assess such claims?  Some argue that desert presupposes responsibility.  But must this be the case?  According to some theories, desert is an important component of justice.  Yet according to other theories, it has little or no role in justice.  Some even question whether desert itself is a defensible concept.  This article is designed to capture the scholarly agreement about these and other issues regarding desert.  Where there is not such agreement, overviews of some of the competing accounts are presented.

Table of Contents

  1. The Structure of Desert
    1. Deserving Subjects
    2. Deserved Modes of Treatment
    3. Desert Bases
      1. Desert and Responsibility
      2. Desert and Time
  2. Desert and Some Related Concepts
    1. Merit
    2. Entitlement
  3. The Role of Desert in Justice
    1. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice
    2. Desert, Institutions, and Justice
  4. Meritocracy
  5. Some Arguments against Desert
    1. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument
    2. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments
    3. Libertarian Arguments
  6. Concluding Remarks
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Structure of Desert

It is widely held that desert is a relation among three elements: a subject, a mode of treatment or state of affairs deserved by the subject, and some fact or facts about the subject, which are often referred to as desert base or desert bases (McLeod 1999a, 61-62; Pojman 2006, 21; Sher 1987, 7).  This relation is shown in the formula:

S deserves M in virtue of B,

where S is the subject, M is the mode of treatment, and B is the desert base or bases. Each of these elements will be examined in greater detail.

a. Deserving Subjects

One’s view about who or what are the appropriate subjects of desert is going to be influenced by one’s view about what desert requires on the part of a subject.  If one thinks that merely having a quality or feature is sufficient to establish desert, then one will place few restrictions on the kinds of things that can be deserving.  If one thinks that having some baseline self-awareness is sufficient to make one the appropriate subject of desert, then nonhuman animals such as bottlenose dolphins and chimpanzees can be appropriate bearers of desert.  If one thinks that desert requires a certain level of responsibility, then one will advocate for a conception that places stricter limits on who or what qualify as deserving subjects.  While there is some disagreement in the literature, most who theorize about desert view human beings, or at least some subset of human beings, as appropriate subjects of desert  A very broad conception of desert might seek to extend the concept to apply to certain or all sentient creatures, living things in general, or even inanimate objects.  In fact, common language usage seems to support such a broad understanding.  One might claim that Gone with the Wind deserves its reputation as one of the greatest movies ever made or that K2 deserves its reputation as one of the most difficult mountains to climb.  But such a broad understanding of desert might involve problematic conflations of desert with other concepts.  For example, while one might think Gone with the Wind’s lofty reputation is appropriate, one might argue that, strictly speaking, its reputation is not deserved.  Instead, one might argue that in the cases of movies, mountains, and the like, the proposed desert claims are best understood as nothing more than general claims about how something should be judged or about what something should have or receive.  So, in an effort to maintain conceptual clarity, it might be best to attribute some common uses of the term ‘desert’ to inexact language usage.  A survey of the literature suggests some support for both broader (Schmidtz 2002, 777) and narrower uses of the term (Miller 1999, 137-138).

b. Deserved Modes of Treatment

Subjects are said to deserve a wide variety of things.  The modes of treatment or states of affairs that one can deserve can be classified as positive or negative outcomes, harms or benefits, or gains or losses (Kristjánsson 2003, 41).  Positive modes of treatment include such things as awards, compensation, good luck, jobs, praise, prizes, remuneration, rewards, and success.  Negative modes of treatment include such things as bad luck, blame, censure, failure, fines, and punishment.  Oftentimes, a deserved mode of treatment will incorporate a source or supplier of that treatment.  For example, one might argue that an athlete deserves praise from his manager.  But such a source need not be specified in all cases since legitimate desert claims need not be directed toward any source.  This is, in part, because legitimate desert claims need not be enforceable or even prescribe any action.  Consider the claim that certain hardworking people deserve good fortune.  While this is a legitimate desert claim, it need not be directed toward any source and it need not result in a call for any corrective action in cases in which particular hardworking people have not had good fortune (Kekes 1997, 124).

c. Desert Bases

There are a variety of ways in which desert bases can be categorized.  Two categories that are commonly used in the philosophical literature are desert based on effort and desert based on performance.  Some accounts of desert focus primarily on one’s effort toward achieving some goal.  Usually the goal has to be viewed as worthwhile, since quixotic effort is rarely considered to be a basis for desert.  Some argue that desert is not based solely, or even primarily, on effort, but also on one’s performance in a given context.  The performance can be any number of activities that give rise to positive or negative evaluation, such as the winning of a race or performing poorly in a music competition.  In some contexts, the performance can be assessed in terms of the contribution that one makes as a part of some group, such as a family, company, community, or even a society as a whole.  Depending on the context, this contribution can be measured in terms of productivity, success, or some other similar measure. Michael Boylan presents a thought experiment that raises questions concerning how one’s effort and performance often are, and how they should be weighed as factors in determining one’s desert.  We are presented with two puzzle makers.  The first puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is 80 percent complete, and he finishes the puzzle by completing the remaining 20 percent.  The second puzzle maker is presented with a puzzle that is totally incomplete.  He manages to complete 80 percent of the puzzle, and therefore does not finish it (2004, p. 139 ff). Boylan notes that, according to a common interpretation, the first puzzle maker would be the one who deserves the credit, and the resultant spoils, for completing the puzzle.  But why should this puzzle maker get more credit when he completed significantly less of the puzzle?  He cannot claim credit for, and therefore cannot claim to deserve, receiving the puzzle in a more advanced stage of completion, since he did nothing to bring the puzzle to that stage of completion. The puzzle maker example highlights important issues regarding the nature and use of desert.  First, there is the question of what basis or bases one should use to determine desert.  Should effort, performance, or some combination of the two be used?  Are there other criteria that ought to be used?  Second, even if one determines that effort and performance are the relevant desert bases, then one must still determine how to correctly weigh the two in a given situation.

i. Desert and Responsibility

As noted above, one’s view about who or what can qualify as a deserving subject will be influenced by one’s view of the role of responsibility in establishing desert.  Some have argued that at least some type of responsibility is a necessary condition for all desert (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b), whereas others have argued that, in at least some cases, one can deserve some mode of treatment without anyone being responsible for the desert base that gives rise to that mode of treatment (Feldman 1995, 1996).  An example of responsibility without desert could be cases in which a victim of theft is said to deserve compensation even though he was not responsible for having his money stolen.  In such a case, however, there is still someone, namely the thief, who is responsible for the desert base.  Others might offer desert claims based on suffering that people endure at the hands of beings with dubious levels of responsibility, such as children, mentally handicapped or emotionally disturbed adults, and nonhuman animals.  Some argue that there can be desert in cases in which the suffering is not caused by any being, such as when people suffer as the result of a natural phenomenon.  One who supports this view might argue that a tornado victim can deserve financial support as a result of his suffering through that natural disaster. So, one can argue that while certain cases of desert require responsibility, not all do.  In at least some cases, one can attempt to maintain a connection between desert and responsibility by appealing to a notion of negative responsibility.  That is, one can argue that if someone suffers a misfortune for which she is not responsible, and this misfortune causes her to fall below some baseline condition, then she can deserve some treatment as a result of her suffering (Smilansky 1996a, 1996b).  Alternatively, one could argue that cases like those of the crime and tornado victims are not cases of genuine desert.  One might argue that in situations in which a person suffers through no fault of her own she might be due compensation, and while it is a matter of justice whether she receives compensation, strictly speaking she does not deserve compensation.

ii. Desert and Time

Most desert theorists argue that desert is strictly a backward-looking concept.  According to this standard view, a person’s desert is based strictly on past and present facts about him (Rachels 1997, 176; Feinberg 1970, 72; Miller 1976, 93).  The view that desert must be backward looking has been challenged, however.  According to these alternative, forward-looking accounts, certain legitimate desert claims can be based on future performances (Feldman 1995, Schmidtz 2002).  This forward-looking view has been questioned based in part on a concern that it relies on instances of desert without legitimately grounded desert bases.  The argument is that in order for a person to deserve something at a given time there must be some relevant fact about the person at that time that gives rise to his desert.  The concern is that a desert base with sufficient grounding conditions that lie in the future cannot be such a fact, for it is metaphysically dubious (Celello 2009, 156).

2. Desert and Some Related Concepts

Desert is one of many concepts that are used to assess the appropriateness of what one does or should have.  Prior to discussing the role of desert in justice, it is worthwhile to consider a couple of these other concepts.

a. Merit

There is not a consensus on how to understand the relationship between desert and merit.  Some argue that the terms ‘desert’ and ‘merit’ do not identify separate concepts.  And, in ordinary language, the two are often used interchangeably (McLeod 1999a, 67).  But many scholars have offered important distinctions between the two concepts.  One way to distinguish between the two is to claim that merit should understood more broadly than desert, since merit results from any quality or feature of a subject that serves as a basis for the positive or negative treatment of that subject even if that treatment is not strictly speaking deserved.  On this account, desert is a species of the genus merit (Pojman 1997, 22-23).  Although scholars discuss other distinguishing factors, e.g. effort and intention, a main factor used to distinguish desert from merit is responsibility.  David Miller claims that a distinction between desert and merit is supported by the ways in which the two are discussed in contemporary discourse (1999, 125).  He notes that ‘merit’ is used to refer to a person’s admirable qualities whereas ‘desert’ is used in cases in which someone is responsible for a particular result.  One who supports such a distinction might claim that a person can merit treatment based on factors over which he has little or no control, based on characteristics that he did little to develop, and based on performances that required very little effort.  For example, a man can merit, but not deserve, admiration for his native good looks.  In addition, since merit does not require responsibility, it can apply to a wide variety of things, including nonhuman animals and even inanimate objects.

b. Entitlement

Understood in one way, entitlement claims are specific to particular associations, organizations, or institutions.  Entitlement results from a subject having a claim or right to some treatment as a result of following the rules or meeting some explicit criterion or criteria of an association, organization, or institution.  Although certain entitlements might be related to or give rise to desert (McLeod 1999b, 192), it is important to keep the two concepts distinct.  There are many situations in which one deserves some treatment without being entitled to that treatment or in which one is entitled to something that one does not also deserve.  Consider an automobile race in which the leading driver is caused to wreck by debris on the track.  As a result, he crashes just prior to crossing the finish line.  In such races, crossing the finish line first is the criterion used to establish the winner.  If the crash prevented the driver from winning, one could reasonably argue that, although the driver is not entitled to win, he deserved to win because he had made the requisite effort, performed better than all of the other drivers for the entire race leading up to the crash, and was clearly going to win before he crashed.  In addition to the fact that one can deserve something that one is not entitled to, one can be entitled to something that one does not deserve.  Based on the laws of his country, an evil dictator could be entitled to a subject’s property that the dictator seized on a whim, but this does not mean that the dictator deserves the property.  To use another common example, a son might be entitled to an inheritance left to him by his father, but he might not have done anything to deserve that inheritance.

3. The Role of Desert in Justice

In a general sense, justice can be understood to consist in persons getting what is appropriate or fitting for them.  This idea of justice can be traced back to ancient times.  Plato discussed justice in general, and distributive justice in particular, as involving a type of appropriateness or fittingness of treatment (Republic 1.332bc).  According to some translations of Laws, Plato suggested that justice involves treating people as they deserve to be treated (6.757cd). Although there are many important differences between their theories, Aristotle joined Plato by arguing that justice involves a type of equality.  In Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle maintained that distributive justice involves judging people according to certain criteria in order to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  He argued that, in distributions, it is just for equals to receive equal shares, unjust for equals to receive unequal shares, and unjust for those who are unequal to receive equal shares.  He maintained that what each person receives should be geometrically proportional to the degree or extent to which his or her actions fit or match these criteria (5.3.1131a10-b16).  People are judged based on normative concepts such as desert, merit, and entitlement to determine whether they are equal or unequal.  Consider a distributive context in which two people are to be treated based on what each deserves.  According to the idea of geometrical proportionality, if one person is twice as deserving as the other, then she ought to receive twice the share of what is to be distributed. According to the classical tradition, desert is one of the conceptual components of justice.  But it is not understood as being the only conceptual component of justice.  The Greek word axia, a word used by both Plato and Aristotle in their discussions of the distribution of things such as goods, honors, and services, can be translated as, or understood to include, “desert”.  But, in certain contexts, it might be misleading to translate axia as ‘desert’ instead of translating it as ‘merit’ or some other related concept (Miller 1999, 125-126). Desert has a prominent role in certain more recent conceptions of justice, such as those of John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick.  In Utilitarianism, Mill claimed that it is considered just when a person gets whatever good or evil he deserves and unjust when he receives a good or suffers an evil that he does not deserve (2001, 45).  Sidgwick argued that justice involved one’s desert being requited (1907, 280 ff).  According to some contemporary theories of justice, often referred to as “pluralist” theories, desert is one among other important conceptual components of justice.  These other components can include, but need not be limited to, entitlement, equality, merit, need, reciprocity, and moral worth.  According to these theories, whether and to what extent desert is relevant to justice depends on the context in which the judgment is being made.  And, when desert conflicts with the other components of justice, it must be measured against them in order to determine what justice requires (Miller 1999, 133; Schmidtz 2006, 4).

a. Desert in Distributive and Retributive Justice

Some scholars argue that desert’s role in distributive justice and retributive justice is symmetrical, i.e., that desert is more or less equally relevant in both (Sher 1987; Pojman 2006, 126).  There is disagreement in the literature as to whether desert’s role ought to be understood in this way (Moriarty 2003; Smilansky 2006).  Those who argue in favor of an asymmetry in desert’s role may attempt to explain the asymmetry in different ways.  Some might argue that desert is relevant in retributive justice but not in distributive justice because being the appropriate recipient of a harm requires a level of responsibility that being the appropriate recipient of a benefit does not.  Or, some might argue in favor of the asymmetry based on the differing modes of treatment that are called for in distributive and retributive contexts.  The motivating idea used to support this view is that desert is an appropriate and important basis for punishment, but other concepts, e.g. equality and need, are the appropriate bases for distributions of goods and services.  Even if one recognizes desert as an important conceptual component of both distributive and retributive justice, one might argue that desert differs in these different spheres.  For example, one might argue that desert in distributive justice can be forward looking, while desert in retributive justice cannot (Feldman 1995, 74-76; Schmidtz 2002, 783-784).

b. Desert, Institutions, and Justice

In many cases, what one is said to deserve is connected to a certain convention or practice within an association, organization, or larger social institution.  One cannot deserve first place in an automobile race if there are not any such competitions, nor can an employee at a steel mill deserve a raise absent the existence of the steel mill and the economic system of which the steel mill is some very small part.  In the light of such examples, some scholars claim that, if it is a defensible concept at all, desert cannot exist in the absence of such institutional conventions or practices (Cummiskey 1987).  This idea leads some scholars to offer what they view as an important distinction between pre-institutional desert (p-desert) and institutional desert (i-desert). Those who recognize p-desert argue that although specific desert bases or deserved modes of treatment are often defined within a particular associational, organizational, or institutional context, desert is a concept that is logically prior to and independent of both tacit and explicit institutional criteria and rules.  They argue that the conflation of p-desert with i-desert is based on a failure to recognize the distinction between desert as a general normative concept and a particular type of desert that is influenced by institutions.  According to this view, the distinction between p-desert and i-desert is based on an important difference between one deserving something regardless of whether one is a part of an institution and deserving a specific thing based mostly or wholly on institutional criteria or rules.  The reason why someone deserves a specific trophy made of a specific material for his effort and performance toward winning a particular automobile race is because there is an institution that holds and regulates such an event.  But the underlying reason why the person deserves something for winning the automobile race is that, pre-institutionally, effort and performance give rise to desert. Some argue that rejecting p-desert is problematic since, without it, there is no independent normative concept of desert.  That is, there is no concept of desert that is external to any given institution which can be used to evaluate the justice of institutions.  Another difficulty with the rejection of p-desert is that it would disallow the seemingly reasonable claim that a person can deserve something even if she is not a part of any identifiable institution.  One could argue that a person could deserve something in a state of nature or that she could deserve something even if she were the last person on Earth.  If she were to work hard to build a shelter and grow crops, for example, one could argue that she thereby deserves the benefits that resulted from those activities. Some who argue that John Rawls’s theory of justice as fairness allows for desert in distributive contexts interpret his theory as advancing a purely institutional conception of desert.  Samuel Scheffler (2000) argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial desert and not pre-institutional desert, however.  According to Scheffler, Rawls rejects prejusticial desert because Rawls thinks that desert can exist only after the principles of justice have been established.  Scheffler interprets Rawls as arguing that a person deserves whatever it is that justice dictates he should receive and only what justice dictates he should receive.  On this view, desert is not prejusticial since desert is defined in terms of justice as opposed to justice being defined, at least in part, in terms of desert.  But justice is understood as being pre-institutional since justice is a normative concept, external to any particular institution, which can be used to judge institutions.  The rejection of prejusticial desert will be viewed as problematic by those who, following more traditional conceptions of justice, define justice, at least in part, in terms of desert.  The concern is that defining desert in terms of justice, instead of defining justice in terms of desert, results in a backward understanding of the relationship between the two concepts.

4. Meritocracy

In general, a meritocracy is a social system in which advancement, reward, and status are based on individual abilities and talents.  In theory, those who are more able and talented would advance further, reap greater rewards, and achieve loftier status.  Meritocracy can involve attempting to erect a basic structure of society according to the ideas of a meritocracy or it can involve attempting to implement a system in which a society’s basic institutions are governed, at least in part, by principles of awarding jobs and specifying rewards for jobs on the basis of merit.  Although the two issues are sometimes conflated, Norman Daniels notes that whether someone merits a job is separate from what rewards are attached to that job.  So, while a person might merit a particular job of great importance, one should not assume that he merits higher wages or greater rewards than another person who merits a job of much less importance (Daniels, 218-219). As discussed above, there is some scholarly disagreement about the relationship between merit and desert.  For those who offer clear distinctions between the two, a social system in which advancement, reward, and status were based on desert would be different from one in which such benefits were based on merit.  A system of merit would be based on persons’ abilities and talents, whereas a system based on desert would focus on persons’ efforts and performances for which they are responsible.  As a result, although the creation of either would be difficult, the creation of a system based on desert, a “desertocracy” if you will, seems to be more problematic than one based on merit.  This is because a desertocracy would seem to require more, and more specific, information about persons than would a meritocracy.

5. Some Arguments against Desert

While many consider desert to be an important conceptual component of justice, others have argued against this view.  Some argue that the concept of desert itself is problematic.  This is known as the metaphysical argument against desert.  Others claim that, even if desert is a defensible concept, determining what people deserve or treating people according to what they deserve is not feasible.  These ideas are defended in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert.  Some maintain that, regardless of the force of the metaphysical, epistemological, or pragmatic arguments, desert does not have a prominent role in distributive justice.  Examples of this view can be found in right- and left-libertarian theories of justice.

a. Rawls’s Metaphysical Argument

Among the contemporary theories of justice in which desert does not have a prominent role, John Rawls’s is the most often discussed.  Drawing from Herbert Spiegelberg’s (1944, 113) idea that the inequalities of birth are types of underserved discrimination, Rawls (1971, 104) claims that desert does not apply to one’s place in the distribution of native endowments, one’s initial starting place in society, i.e. the familial and social circumstances into which one is born, or to the superior character that enables one to put forth the effort to develop one’s abilities.  As is often the case with Rawls’s work, as evidenced by the discussion of pre-institutional and prejusticial desert above, there are many competing interpretations of his views on the relationship between desert and justice.  Yet, regardless of which of these interpretations is correct, Rawls work suggests a metaphysical argument against desert. According to this metaphysical argument, since most of who we are and what we do is greatly influenced by undeserved native endowments and by the undeserved circumstances into which we are born, one cannot deserve anything, or, at best, one can deserve very little.  According to a common interpretation, Rawls believes that desert should not have any role in distributive justice, since these undeserved factors have a major influence on all would-be desert bases (Sher 1987, 22 ff).  Others contend that Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert (Moriarty 2002, 136-137).  Regardless of whether Rawls does allow for some limited amount of desert, if sound, the metaphysical argument against desert would either substantially or completely undermine the concept.

b. The Epistemological and Pragmatic Arguments

David Hume was an early critic of those theories of distributive justice in which merit was assigned a prominent role.  Although, as discussed above, there are differences between the concepts of desert and merit, and although Hume’s use of  the term ‘merit’ differs from more modern uses, the kinds of arguments that Hume offered against merit are often used against desert in contemporary discussions.  Hume argued that since humans are both fallible in their knowledge of the factors that would establish others’ merit and prone to overestimating their own merit, distributive schemes based on merit could not result in determinate rules of conduct and would be utterly destructive to society (Hume, 27).  This thinking is captured in the epistemological and pragmatic arguments against desert. According to the epistemological argument, since we cannot know the specific details of the lives of every member in a community or society, we cannot accurately treat people according to their desert.  Recall that effort and performance are commonly cited as appropriate desert bases.  Even if one agrees that only effort and performance should be used to determine one’s desert, concerns about how such determinations could be made with any accuracy or consistency still remain.  How could one know how much of a person’s performance was the result of effort as opposed to natural talent, brute luck, or any other number of complicating factors?  The pragmatic argument against desert is that, regardless of whether we could gain the knowledge needed to treat people according to their desert accurately, attempting to do so would have overriding negative consequences.  Such negative consequences could include expending large amounts of time and resources in an effort to make accurate desert judgments and, perhaps, losses of personal privacy as one delves into the details of others’ lives. Both the epistemological and pragmatic arguments must be accounted for when attempting to explain how a true meritocracy could and should be arranged.  Those who do not advocate meritocracies on a large scale might overcome the difficulties suggested by the epistemological and pragmatic arguments by maintaining that the use of desert should be limited to smaller, local contexts.  According to this view, since it is easier to determine a person’s desert in contexts that are limited in size and scope, accurate desert judgments would be both possible and feasible in such contexts.

c. Libertarian Arguments

According to Libertarianism, each individual agent fully owns himself.  As a full self-owner, the agent is entitled to use his various abilities to acquire property rights in the world.  For the libertarian, the primary goal of justice is the protection of negative liberty.  Based on a principle of non-interference, negative liberty is understood as the absence of constraints on an individual’s actions. Some mark a distinction between right-libertarianism and left-libertarianism.  Perhaps the most well-known explication of right-libertarianism, which is often understood as the traditional version of libertarianism, is given by Robert Nozick in Anarchy, State, and Utopia.  Nozick advances an entitlement theory of justice.  On this view, a just distribution is one in which each person is entitled to the holdings that she possesses according to the principles of justice in acquisition, transfer, and rectification. Nozick describes his entitlement theory as “historical,” because it determines the justice of holdings on the basis of how those holdings came to be held, and “unpatterned,” because the justice of holdings is not determined on the basis of some additional normative criteria, such as merit, need, or effort (1974, 155 ff).  Because meritocracies are patterned, Nozick would reject them.  Right-libertarians would be concerned with liberty-restricting attempts at distributing or redistributing resources according to prevailing conceptions of merit or desert.  Therefore, the concept of desert does not have a major role in their theories of justice.   Libertarians need not reject the concept of desert entirely, however.  And Nozick offers various arguments against Rawls’s rejection of desert (1974, 215 ff).  For the right-libertarian, desert could be a concept for the individual to consider in his personal decision-making processes, but not one that the state should use to try to guide allocations or distributions of resources. As with right-libertarianism, left-libertarianism is based on the idea that each individual agent fully owns himself.  But the left-libertarian view about the appropriation of natural resources differs greatly from the right-libertarian view.  Left-libertarians believe in the egalitarian ownership of natural resources.  Anyone who appropriates a natural resource would have to pay others for the value of that resource.  Such a payment might then be placed into a social fund, from which distributions to other members of a society are made.  The resources are divided according to egalitarian principles and not on the basis of merit or desert.  The rejection of desert as a basis of distribution could be based on the metaphysical argument that, strictly speaking, people do not deserve anything.  Or, a left-libertarian could recognize desert as a distributive concept, but one that is less important than equality.  According to such a view, equality, and not desert, should be the primary basis of distribution within a society.

6. Concluding Remarks

Despite its use in daily life, desert is a concept that remains somewhat nebulous.   Regardless of certain areas of disagreement, those who recognize desert as an important normative concept generally agree on a number of issues regarding the nature of desert.  One point of general agreement is that desert consists of, at least, three main parts – a subject, a mode of treatment, and a desert base.  In addition, scholars generally argue in favor of the view that desert is applicable to human beings, or at least some subset of them.  Lastly, scholars generally agree that understanding the nature of desert is important to understanding the nature of justice.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. 2nd Ed.  Translated, with an Introduction, by Terence Irwin.  Indianapolis: Hackett, 1999.
    • An accessible translation that also includes detailed notes and a glossary.
  • Boylan, Michael.  A Just Society.  Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield, 2004.
    • Presents a worldview theory of ethics and social philosophy.
  • Celello, Peter. “Against Desert as a Forward-Looking Concept.” Journal of Applied Philosophy 26, no.2  (May 2009): 144-159.
    • Argues that desert should be understood as a strictly backward-looking concept.
  • Cummiskey, David. “Desert and Entitlement: A Rawlsian Consequentialist Account.” Analysis, 47, no. 1 (Jan., 1987): 15-19.
    • Advances an institution-dependent account of desert.
  • Daniels, Norman.  “Merit and Meritocracy.” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 7, no. 3 (1978): 206-233.
    • A discussion of meritocracy, and the meriting of both jobs and the rewards attached to those jobs.
  • Feinberg, Joel. Doing and Deserving: Essay in the Theory of Responsibility. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1970.
    • A collection of previously published essays, and previously unpublished lectures, focused on issues surrounding the harm and benefit of others.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom.” Mind, New Series 104, no. 413 (January 1995): 63-77.
    • Argues against the ideas that desert must be backward-looking and that desert requires responsibility.
  • Feldman, Fred. “Responsibility as a Condition for Desert.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996): 165-68.
    • A reply to Smilansky’s “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction,” in which Feldman argues that Smilansky’s solution to maintaining a connection between desert and responsibility fails.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals. Edited by J. B. Schneewind. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1983.
    • A presentation of Hume’s moral philosophy in which he develops ideas from Book III of A Treatise of Human Nature.
  • Kekes, John. Against Liberalism. Ithaca, NY: CornellUniversity Press, 1997.
    • A sustained criticism of political liberalism, which includes a defense of the view that justice should be understood to combine desert and consistency.
  • Kristjánsson, Kristján. “Justice, Desert, and Virtue Revisited.” Social Theory and Practice 29, no. 1 (January 2003): 39-63.
    • Argues that the sole basis for desert is moral virtue.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Contemporary Interpretations of Desert: Introduction.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999a): 61-69.
    • A brief essay about desert, its bases, and its relation to other concepts.
  • McLeod, Owen. “Desert and Institutions.” In Pojman and McLeod, eds., (1999b): 186-95.
    • Argues that some desert is institutional and some is preinstitutional.
  • Mill, John Stuart. Utilitarianism. 2nd ed. Edited by George Sher. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2001.
    • Mill’s highly influential explication of the normative ethical theory of utilitarianism.
  • Miller, David. Principles of Social Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1999.
    • A theory of social justice that includes detailed treatments of the concept of desert and its role in justice.
  • Miller, David. Social Justice. Oxford: OxfordUniversity Press, 1976.
    • A work on social justice, including a chapter devoted to desert.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Against the Asymmetry of Desert.” Nous 37, no. 3 (2003): 518–536.
    • Argues against the view that desert can have an important role in retributive justice, while not having an important role in distributive justice.
  • Moriarty, Jeffrey. “Desert and Distributive Justice in A Theory of Justice.” Journal of Social Philosophy 33, no. 1 (Spring 2002): 131-43.
    • Argues that John Rawls recognizes pre-institutional desert and that Rawls’s failure to consider such desert in his theory of justice seems unjust.
  • Nozick, Robert. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. New York: Basic Books, 1974.
    • An influential defense of libertarian principles.
  • Plato. Laws. Translated by Trevor J. Saunders. In Plato: Complete Works, edited by John Cooper. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
  • Plato. Republic. Translated by G. M. A. Grube.  Revised by C. D. C. Reeve. In Plato: Complete Works.
    • The Complete Works contains recent translations of all of Plato’s works, dubia, and spuria.
  • Pojman, Louis. “Equality and Desert.” Philosophy, 72, no. 282 (Oct. 1997): 549-570.
    • Argues that the underlying justification of punishment and reward is desert or merit.
  • Pojman, Louis. Justice. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Pearson, 2006.
    • An accessible introduction to different theories of justice, which includes a chapter on justice as desert.
  • Pojman, Louis, and Owen McLeod, eds. What Do We Deserve?: A Reader on Justice and Desert. New York: OxfordUniversity Press, 1999.
    • Contains selections from many influential works on desert and its role in justice.
  • Rachels, James. “What People Deserve.” In Can Ethics Provide Answers?: And Other Essays in Moral Philosophy, 175-97. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997.
    • A chapter on desert, which includes a discussion of the relationship between desert and responsibility and a    discussion of desert’s temporal orientation.
  • Rawls, John. A Theory of Justice. Cambridge, MA: HarvardUniversity Press, 1971.
    • Rawls’s seminal work in which he advances a theory of justice as fairness.
  • Scheffler, Samuel. “Justice and Desert in Liberal Theory.” California Law Review 88 (May 2000): 965-90.
    • Discusses Rawls’s view on the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice, and argues that Rawls rejects prejusticial, but not pre-institutional desert.
  • Schmidtz, David. Elements of Justice. Cambridge: CambridgeUniversity Press, 2006.
    • Argues for a pluralist theory of justice based on principles of equality, desert, need, and reciprocity.
  • Schmidtz, David. “How to Deserve.” Political Theory 30, no. 6 (December 2002): 774-99.
    • Includes a “promissory account” of desert, which has forward-looking aspects.
  • Sher, George. Desert. Princeton: PrincetonUniversity Press, 1987.
    • A detailed examination of desert and its role in justice.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. 7th ed. London: Macmillan, 1907.
    • His seminal work in which he discusses egoism, intuitional morality, and utilitarianism.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “The Connection between Responsibility and Desert: The Crucial Distinction.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 419 (July 1996a): 485-86.
    • A reply to Feldman’s “Desert: Reconsideration of Some Received Wisdom,” in which Smilansky argues that there is a connection between desert and responsibility.
  • Smilansky, Saul.  “Control, Desert, and the Difference between Distributive and Retributive Justice.  Philosophical Studies, 131(3) (2006): 511–524.
    • Provides a defense of the asymmetry between desert’s role in distributive and retributive justice.
  • Smilansky, Saul. “Responsibility and Desert: Defending the Connection.” Mind, New Series 105, no. 417 (January 1996b): 157-63.
    • A reply to Feldman in which Smilansky argues for a distinction between positive and negative responsibility conditions for desert.
  • Spiegelberg, Herbert. “A Defense of Human Equality.” Philosophical Review 53, no. 2 (1944): 101-24.
    • Defends an ethical principle of human equality, and a view of justice based on that principle.


Author Information

Peter Celello
Ohio State University Newark
U. S. A.

American Wilderness Philosophy

Roosevelt & Muir, by Underwood & Underwood Wilderness has been defined in diverse ways, but most famously in the Wilderness Act of 1964, which describes it “in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape … as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain.” The idea of wilderness has played a curious and crucial role in American culture generally, and especially in the rise of American environmentalism. Conquering wilderness was central to colonial and pioneer narratives of progress. Reverence and nostalgia for wilderness became tangled with American nationalism at the end of the 19th century, with the end of the frontier. The passage of the Wilderness Act was an historically important event in American environmental politics, which tied the fate of much of America’s public lands to disputes over the meaning of wilderness. Since then, critics both international and domestic, but mostly from within the environmental movement, have criticized the idea of wilderness. Not that preserving or protecting natural places is a bad idea, rather they argue that thinking about nature in terms of wilderness obscures important issues and leads to bad decisions.

Table of Contents

  1. Etymology
  2. Historical Attitudes
    1. Sources of Antipathy
    2. Sources of Appreciation
  3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures
    1. Henry David Thoreau
    2. John Muir
    3. Aldo Leopold
  4. The Wilderness Act
  5. Critical Scholarship
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Etymology

The etymology, or history of a word, is sometimes offered as though the roots revealed the word’s correct, present meaning. This is a misunderstanding, as the meaning of a word changes over time and may end up far from its original use. However, an etymology may provide important clues into the biography of an idea and may have rhetorical significance when the meaning of a word is contested. Both of these are true of the etymology of wilderness.  A rough summary of the roots of wilderness is a place essentially characterized by wild animals.  The oldest and central root in this word is wild. It is present in Common Germanic, and is found in Old English as wilde, with surviving instances from c.725 as an adjective for plants and animals that were not tamed or domesticated and applied similarly to places by c.893. The Oxford English Dictionary gives its probable origin as the pre-Germanic ghweltijos, with a possible parallel in the root of the Latin and Greek words for wild beast.

An alternate and apparently mistaken origin of wild often given in the wilderness literature, repeated in Thoreau’s journals and given by Roderick Nash for instance, is that it is the past participle of will (Nash 2014). Wilderness is understood to be self-willed land, not subjected to the will of a domesticator or cultivator. The resonance of the idea is strong, but unfortunately the Old English willian, the root of will, has no clear connection to wilde. One upshot of rejecting this interpretation is that wild is first a word for plants and animals, later applied by analogy to people, and not vice versa as Nash reports.

The next piece in the etymology is the Common Germanic word for beast, found in Old English as deor. This was combined with wilde to form wilddeor, “wild animal,” with instances known from c.825. The “(d)er” which separates wilderness from wildness, is the root of our modern word for deer. In Old English, this was combined with the suffix –en, to make the adjective wilddeoren, which became wildern in Middle English, and was used to describe places. The –en suffix generally denotes what something is made of, as in “wooden” and “earthen,” so a wildern place is one made of wilddeor, of wild beasts. To this is joined the suffix –ness in an unusually concrete sense to form wilderness..

The centrality of wild animals in the etymology is important. Wilderness points not only to the absence of human culture in the landscape but to the presence of that which is often incompatible with it. When the wolves and the bears flourish, the domestic livestock are in danger, and people fear to walk at night. And wild beasts are easily displaced by human activity and presence. Aldo Leopold calls the crane “wildness incarnate” because of its love of solitude (1949). Nash draws out this connection to animals when he interprets the etymology as “the place of wild beasts” (1970). “If wildlife is removed,” he writes, “although everything else remains visibly the same, the intensity of the sense of wilderness is diminished” (Nash 1970). He cites Thoreau’s delight in the New England Lynx, Theodore Roosevelt’s equating wilderness with big game ranges and Leopold’s discussion of the last Grizzly on Escudilla. Leopold often treats particular species as defining the character of the places they dwell.

2. Historical Attitudes

A history of conflicted attitudes towards wild places and nonhuman nature goes much further back than the roots of the word wilderness. Many languages have no equivalent word to wilderness, but still they have managed sophisticated literature on the question. Both the beauty and the inhospitality of wild nature, and humanity’s ambiguous relationship to it, are common themes going back to the very oldest preserved literature.

In telling the history of attitudes toward wild nature, there are two opposite errors of oversimplification to avoid. On the one hand, some treat the modern American and romantic elevation of wilderness as something entirely new, contrasting with previous expressions of antipathy toward wild nature. Roderick Nash (2014) leans in this direction when he says wilderness began “as the unrecognized and unnamed environmental norm for most of Earth’s history, created as a concept by civilization, thereafter widely hated and feared, and quite recently and remarkably, appreciated.” On the other hand, one might find romantic sounding passages of wilderness appreciation in diverse ancient texts, whether the Epic of Gilgamesh, the Vedas or the Psalms, and conclude that there is nothing particularly new or interesting about the American idea. The more interesting historical questions are the more nuanced considerations concerning how and why wilderness is valued or shunned across times and cultures.

a. Sources of Antipathy

While there was no universal hatred or fear of wild nature in the ancient world, at least not to the exclusion of a great deal of appreciation, there was a remarkable degree of denigration of wild nature, reaching something of a climax in early modern Europe. Romanticism was in part a reaction against this, and the ideas that lead to it, and modern wilderness appreciation and preservation took root in the soil of romanticism. The origins of that hostility are variously attributed to the Jewish and Christian scriptures, Greek and Roman philosophy, the scientific and industrial revolutions, or some combination of these.

Clear claims of anthropocentrism, of the relative worthlessness and proper subjugation of wild nature, are frequently found in ancient Greek and Roman philosophers. Here, rationality is established both as the substance of dignity and worth and as the dividing line between the human and the nonhuman (as well as marking the proper hierarchies between some humans and others). Plato, in the voice of Socrates, makes clear his limited estimation of the value of wild things in the Phaedrus (section 230d) when he writes, “I am devoted to learning; landscapes and trees have nothing to teach me—only the people in the city can do that.” Aristotle shows a much greater inclination to appreciate and study wild nature, but he makes clear its subjugation and secondary value: nature making nothing in vain means that it all must exist for the sake of man (Politics 1256b7-22). Chrysippus agrees, finding it absurd to think that the world could have been made for the plants, or the irrational animals (cited in Coates 1998). The Roman philosopher Lucretius describes the presence of forests, mountains and wild beasts on the earth as a serious defect, taking heart that “these regions it is generally in our power to shun” (cited in Nash 2014). This is not to say that there were no elements of appreciation for wild nature in Greek or Roman society or letters, for that is not the case. But there was a clearly articulated and enduring view which implied wild nature was essentially wasted space.

Many commentators, including Nash, have followed Lynn White’s lead in pointing to theism and the Jewish and Christian scriptures as the source of antipathy toward wild nature (White 1967). These scriptures had a formative influence on modern attitudes toward wilderness because of the prominent use of the word in English translations of the Bible. Spiritual connotations, especially from the Exodus account of the Israelites wandering in the wilderness for forty years, were laid onto the word, as well as new physical associations with arid and desert landscapes. The meaning of these spiritual connotations is complex, as wilderness is at once a place of divine revelation as well as temptation and punishment. The Bible does not clearly convey an overarching attitude of fear or hatred of the wild. Genesis 1 repeatedly declares the goodness of everything, prior to the creation of humans. The Psalms celebrate both the useless parts of nature, such as rock badgers, as well as the dangerous, such as lions, as independently glorifying to God (Psalm 104).  Animals, both wild and domestic, plants and even soil are given protections in the Mosaic Law (for example, Exodus 23:10-11; Deuteronomy 20:19-20, 22:6, 25:4), and God is described as making covenant with the Earth and all its creatures (Genesis 9). Even the often cited passage giving people dominion over the other animals, does not clearly put them at human disposal, for it manifestly did not include permission to eat animals (Genesis 1:28-29; Genesis 9:3).

As Greco-Roman philosophy and Christian theology increasingly joined together in medieval and modern European intellectual culture, the ideas of Plato and Aristotle were given new expression in biblical and theological language. Rationality is privileged by Aquinas in this combined way, for instance, arguing that only the rational creatures can know and love God and thereby fulfill the purpose of creation (Summa Contra Gentiles c.1270).  The enlightenment and scientific revolution included a great revival of interest in Greek and Roman philosophy, and serious interest in nature was focused onto the search for universal, mathematical laws. Francis Bacon’s writings in the early 17th century established a lasting connection between the idea of dominion in Genesis and the project of scientific-technological mastery over nature. The metaphor of nature as machine came to dominate. Descartes argued that, lacking rationality, non-human animals should not be supposed to have souls or consciousness at all, but are mere automata, to be freely experimented upon (Discourse on Method 1637). As the scientific project bore fruit in the industrial revolution, the dominant view of wild nature was as disordered material which could be brought into rational order through science and labor, and thus serve its ultimate purpose of existing for the benefit of mankind. This view is clearly expressed in John Locke’s influential labor-theory of property, which justifies the human worker’s property rights over nature on the basis of nature having little to no value before the worker’s labor was mixed with it (Second Treatise on Government 1689).

The Lockean attitude toward wilderness as waste is clearly evident among the early American colonists. For instance, the Puritan John Winthrop gave as a reason for going to America that it would be wrong to let a whole continent lie waste (Nash 2014). Justification for displacing indigenous people was often asserted on the basis that they had not worked it, or at least not rationally. And the attitude continued to dominate well into the settlement of the west. Alexis de Tocqueville complained upon visiting America in the 1830s that Americans could only see their wilderness as an obstacle to progress (cited in Nash 2014). During the time of the exploration, colonization and settlement of the North America by the Europeans, the idea that the less rational parts of nature existed for the sake of the more rational was thoroughly entrenched. And wilderness especially had to be transformed by labor to fulfill that purpose.

b. Sources of Appreciation

The scientific revolution also produced a contrary attitude towards nonhuman nature, however, best expressed in a group known as the physic-theologians. Writers such as John Ray (1627-1705) found in wild nature, not the absence of rationality, but the rational design of God, worthy of study and contemplation. Indeed, studying wild nature was thought to be an especially important path to understanding God, since only wild nature was unaffected by the fall and sin of mankind. Physico-theology contributed to the rise and influence of natural history, an approach to science that in turn deeply informed the wilderness preservation movement.

The practice of natural history flourished in America in the 18th and 19th centuries and was characterized by the description, collection and classification of natural specimens and objects. The fondness of European aristocrats and intellectuals for natural curiosities from around the world made natural history a singular way for colonists to stay connected to the social and intellectual affairs of Europe. The travel and work of natural historians was thus often tangled with the broader European projects of exploration and conquest, and the naturalists, who frequently found themselves caring for what was being destroyed, often expressed significant concern about this connection. Natural historians were largely generalists, writing about nature as a comprehensive whole, and often organized in local, amateur, natural history societies (Smallwood 1967). Some like Alexander von Humboldt, were well connected members of European society who travelled over much of the world, while others like John and William Bartram and John James Audubon were from the colonies and travelled only regionally. Artistic and literary abilities were crucial for their success, and the travel narratives of naturalists became a popular literary genre, where some of the earliest and strongest positive evaluations of wild nature found their greatest audiences.

Romanticism, a multifaceted cultural trend and backlash against the scientific and industrial revolutions, brought not just an acceptance but an enthusiastic veneration of wild nature and wilderness to cultural prominence. Romanticism had strong connections to the natural history tradition: William Wordsworth and Samuel Coleridge were readers of William Bartram (Smallwood 1967), and Alexander von Humboldt was closely associated with Goethe. But romanticism’s influence on wilderness appreciation comprised much more than its further endorsement of natural history as a significant mode of science. Romanticism treated aesthetic responses to nature as just as important as nature’s quantifiable properties, and developed a robust conception of the sublime. Romantic trends in literature and painting, especially the Hudson River school, produced many powerful, positive portrayals of wilderness. Suspecting that modern industrial society corrupts people rather than cultivates them, romanticism also endorsed primitivism and the pursuit of frequent solitude in nature.

Another aspect of romanticism that was important for the rise of wilderness preservation, was its emphasis on nationalism. America’s great wilderness became a point of pride and national identity, something that set it apart from Europe. The historian Frederick Jackson Turner argued that several aspects of the American character, from self-reliance to a democratic spirit, were products of the American frontier experience (1921). And he worried that the continuation of the American national distinctiveness was jeopardized by the end of the frontier, which was formally declared in the 1890 census. Frontier nostalgia drove a lot of early preservation work, as well as related phenomena, particularly the scouting movement and recreational hunting.

America also saw the development of a distinctive form of the romantic movement known as American transcendentalism. Ralph Waldo Emerson’s Nature, a seminal text for transcendentalism, explores the importance of solitude, the beauty of nature and the significance for both of these for understanding God. Emerson’s influence on Henry David Thoreau, and his long relationship with him, plants the roots of the American wilderness preservation movement firmly in transcendentalism. For Thoreau is the first major figure and intellectual of the wilderness tradition.

Another important factor in in the growing appreciation of wilderness was America’s early experience with extensive deforestation. Among the many who bemoaned this loss, none articulated the problem for the public more clearly and effectively than George Perkins Marsh. His 1864 Man and Nature first clearly indicted deforestation for its effects on soil and water. Marsh refuted the naïve optimism of the day, concerning the beneficial effects of all human labor on nature, and outlined rather the devastating, unintended harms caused by inappropriate uses of land. The economically practical case he provided for the conservation of forests and general care for the land provided an important complement to the aesthetic and spiritual emphasis of the romantics.

3. Wilderness Preservation: Major Figures

Expressions of wilderness appreciation multiplied quickly in the late 19th and early 20th century, and many people made distinctive contributions in art, literature, science and policy. A few major figures, however, laid out distinctive visions which guided the course of wilderness preservation, and which contemporary scholars tend to treat as the defining core of the tradition.

a. Henry David Thoreau

Thoreau’s work develops many of the romantic themes towards nature. Especially in Walden, he is concerned with the degrading influence of too much society, commerce and industry and with the salutary effects of nature’s company. He was a frequent canoe traveler and mountaineer, and developed a daily habit of extensive hiking. Both Walden and his travel writings argue for the existence of deeper meanings and higher uses in nature than as mere material for the human economy. He found the aesthetic value of nature to be spiritually and morally important, and woefully underappreciated. But he also spoke of a broader point view, which sees the weeds as food for the birds and the squirrels as planters of the forest. Recognizing that nature, often in the very places it is widely despised, has hidden and indirect values, he anticipates the contemporary economic idea of ecosystem services.

After his stay at Walden Pond, Thoreau turned his energies increasingly to natural history, particularly in the mode of Humboldt. He expressed some concern about the possibility of a purely scientific disenchanting nature and dulling of the imagination. But he was committed to cultivating the greatest awareness of nature as possible and to fully appreciating the value of facts, refusing to reduce appearances to the merely symbolic as Emerson had tended to. He kept careful records of plant and animal distribution and phenology, which have proven valuable for current climate science, and made seminal contributions to the understanding of forest succession and seed distribution. Unfortunately Thoreau’s early death left many of these projects unfinished and unpublished, although most are now available. His extensive journals, influential works in their own right, show a rich blending of this careful attention to natural history with the poetic and philosophical insight.

The essay Walking, revised and reworked until the end of his life, is particularly significant for wilderness thought. In this essay he treats wildness as the highest ideal of ethics and aesthetics and defends the view that both land and people need a balance of the cultivated and the wild, albeit sharply tilted toward the wild. In this work appears his oft-quoted dictum that “In wildness is the preservation of the world.” Max Oelschlaeger points to Thoreau’s lament for pine trees reduced to mere lumber as the earliest and clearest statement of a preservationist’s credo: “Every creature is better alive than dead, men and moose and pine trees, and he who understands it aright will rather preserve its life than destroy it” (cited in Oelschlaeger 1991). Other late works, such as Huckleberries, progress from his early radical valuations of nature to clear preservationist policy arguments for parks, greenways and protected areas.

Considered a minor figure at first, then highly esteemed in American literature and political thought, Thoreau’s philosophical contributions—not only to environmental philosophy but also epistemology, philosophy of science and ethics—received increasing attention in the early 21st century.

b. John Muir

The Muir family emigrated from Scotland when Muir was a young boy, as his father sought the opportunity to live his Campbellite faith more authentically. Muir’s childhood was saturated with an evangelical Biblicism and the poetry of Robert Burns, the Scottish romantic. His experience as a frontier farmer was largely negative, as he was sorely abused by his father for hard labor. Thanks in part to his genius for mechanics and invention, he found his way to the University of Wisconsin in Madison where he found an enthusiasm for botany. He also encountered transcendentalism and a romantic, nature-centered spirituality, which at first supplemented and then gradually transformed his evangelical faith. There is substantial debate on if and when he might be considered a pantheist. What is clear is that Muir’s wilderness philosophy is often expressed in much more intensely religious language than Thoreau’s, and is frequently wrapped in biblical metaphor.

Frequently a solitary traveler in the wilderness himself, he often focused on the potential of wilderness and of nature study for personal and spiritual transformation. His prescription for overworked and materialistic America was a conversion, a baptism in mountain beauty and reconciliation to wild nature. Muir found nature to be not only sublime and beautiful but earnestly benevolent. Even what appears harsh and destructive in nature, such as glaciation (a process on which he became a significant expert), should be seen as part of the ongoing, loving, creative process. Like Thoreau, Muir found tame and domestic plants and animals to be generally degraded versions of their wild counterparts, and he sometimes spoke in terms of the rights of nonhuman nature.

Muir’s increasing political significance grew out of his personal involvement with Yosemite, and its gradual progress toward becoming a national park. He became convinced that federal ownership was the only way that such exceptional places could be preserved from destruction. While God had preserved California’s giant trees through the ages, he wrote, only Uncle Sam could protect them from fools (1901). His eloquent writing on behalf of national parks and preservation made him a figurehead for the movement, a role which was formalized with the formation of the Sierra Club with him as charter president.

Early in the 20th century, the movement for conservation on public lands began to fracture. Muir came to represent one end of a spectrum on how much and what sort of economic uses should be present in the federal reserves. Muir’s emphasis on the spiritual and aesthetic values of wilderness clashed with the progressive, utilitarian vision of Gifford Pinchot, who was more concerned that the nation’s resources should be developed efficiently for the public good, protected from shortsighted exploitation for private enrichment. The proposed and eventual damming of Hetch Hetchy Valley, within Yosemite National Park, for municipal water and power, brought this tension to bitter conflict during Muir’s later years. Muir was not opposed to productive work in nature, nor the human transformation of it in many places. He spent many profitable years working in sawmills and later managing a vineyard. But beauty, he held, is as much a need as bread or water is, and our physical needs can be met without destroying our most beautiful scenery. Just as timber can be had without cutting the redwoods, water could be had without flooding a national park. Muir saw the problem as one of greed for profit unconstrained by higher sensibilities.

c. Aldo Leopold

Aldo Leopold made significant contributions to both wilderness philosophy and policy. An avid naturalist and outdoorsman, Leopold worked within the new forest service to enhance recreation and hunting opportunities. He developed and established the scientific practice of game management. He was constant in his advocacy of a thoughtful and informed stewardship of nature, but his early confidence in the possibility and value of scientific manipulation the land for increased timber and game production was heavily tempered in his mature work.

Leopold’s major policy contribution was to push for a separate classification of land within the national forests, to be kept as roadless wilderness—a clear precursor to the Wilderness Act. Leopold, and those who followed his lead, such as Bob Marshall and the other founders of the Wilderness Society, were responding to the rise of the automobile, which Muir had not so much appreciated as a threat to wilderness. Touring and camping by automobile was growing rapidly, and the parks and forest recreation areas were filling with the roads and hotels to accommodate them. Leopold sought to protect some areas from this sort of development, first for those who wished to pursue more primitive types of recreation, including travel by canoe and pack train, and seekers of solitude, and then later for the protection of land and wildlife.

Philosophically, Leopold integrated wilderness appreciation with the maturing science of ecology, developed new arguments for preserving wilderness and articulated a moral vision for human relations to nonhuman nature, which he called the land ethic. From ecology, Leopold took a much more detailed picture of the land as an interdependent system of plants, animals, soils and natural processes—a biotic community. Understanding the land as a functionally integrated entity means that the land can be healthy or sick, analogously to an organism. Nutrients can be retained in cycles or lost; soils can be accumulated or depleted; species can persist or become extinct. Only healthy land has the capacity to replenish itself when disturbed. And since the workings of the land mechanism are beyond a full human understanding, an attitude of caution is warranted. Removing predators (the standard practice when he began his forestry career) could lead to disastrous consequences for soils and plants, a lesson he learned from personal experience.

Leopold developed the recreation argument for wilderness along several lines. Against charges of elitism, that big wilderness served the small minority with the strength and leisure time for it, he held that minority interests are worthy of protection. There is no danger of insufficient places for the more popular auto tourism, and public lands should not all be devoted to one kind of recreation. Camping and woodcraft are not only an idle nostalgia for our frontier past, they are a moral improvement upon it, directing old instincts to higher ends. He likened this change to the way football is an improvement over war; the transformation to sport preserved the best parts of the older practice without the downsides.

In later works, Leopold increasingly emphasized the value of wilderness for science. Wilderness is not the only healthy land, some traditional agricultural landscapes have showed long-term resilience, but it provides crucial examples of biotic communities that have functioned well over long time spans. Ecologists need wilderness the way doctors need healthy bodies to study. His own restoration of a worn-out farm demonstrated the practical value of this kind of ecological knowledge. Wilderness is also an important refuge for preserving wildlife, especially the large predators generally eliminated in other places. The arguments from science and wildlife are not entirely separate from the recreation argument, as Leopold suggests that wildlife study is one of the greatest forms of outdoor recreation.

The land ethic grew out of Leopold’s conviction that only a change in our ethical attitude toward the land could prevent us from spoiling it. Such a change he thought was not only possible but underway. The care people naturally feel toward their community and their neighbor can be extended to the land, for ecology clearly shows that the land is a community to which we belong. The recognition that we are plain members and citizens of that community supports the restraint and forbearance that is necessary to live in harmony with the land. Preserving the “integrity, stability and beauty of the biotic community” should limit our use of the land, as surely as economic feasibility does.

Leopold’s land ethic has been heralded as the first ecocentric ethic, an approach finally adequate to our environmental problems. It has also been criticized as offering a fascist justification for overriding individual rights in the interest of the community (Tom Regan, cited in Callicott 1987). Its lineage has also been debated: whether it is based on Darwin’s use of Hume’s ethics (Callicott 1987), or if it has more in common with the pragmatism Leopold would have encountered at Yale (Norton 1988). Either way, Leopold’s respect for the biotic community and his vision of wilderness as an important use within federal lands profoundly shaped the future of environmental thought and the coming Wilderness Act.

4. The Wilderness Act

The National Wilderness Preservation System was created with the passage of the Wilderness Act in 1964. The Act did not create a separate agency, but designated and protected roadless areas within federal lands, whether managed by the Forest Service, National Park Service, Fish and Wildlife Service or the Bureau of Land Management. The Act provides for substantial public input on proposed listings and requires congressional action for land to be added or removed from the system. Similar to national parks, wilderness areas are required to be managed under a twin mandate, kept both for the “use and enjoyment” of the people and preserving their wilderness character unimpaired.

The Wilderness Act includes a poetic definition of wilderness, which has been the subject of much critical discussion:

A wilderness, in contrast with those areas where man and his own works dominate the landscape, is hereby recognized as an area where the earth and its community of life are untrammeled by man, where man himself is a visitor who does not remain. An area of wilderness is further defined to mean in this Act an area of undeveloped Federal land retaining its primeval character and influence, without permanent improvements or human habitation, which is protected and managed so as to preserve its natural conditions and which (1) generally appears to have been affected primarily by the forces of nature, with the imprint of man’s work substantially unnoticeable; (2) has outstanding opportunities for solitude or a primitive and unconfined type of recreation; (3) has at least five thousand acres of land or is of sufficient size as to make practicable its preservation and use in an unimpaired condition; and (4) may also contain ecological, geological, or other features of scientific, educational, scenic, or historical value.

Some of the definition’s notable features are the emphasis on the absence of human presence and impact, the language of degree and subjective appearance and the unusual word, “untrammeled.” Trammel is not a form of trample, and does not involve the idea of walking. It means to bind up, constrain or fetter, not simply touch or influence. Trammel can also be a noun, referring to a kind of fish net or to rope shackles tied on a horse’s legs to keep it from galloping.

Implementation of the Wilderness Act required some interpretive decisions. The Forest Service, generally seeking to maintain more flexible control over its lands, argued for a strict interpretation of wilderness, excluding any lands with a significant history of human impact. This came to be known as the purity policy. Others, including the Wilderness Society, the non-profit organization which had first pushed for the law and shepherded it through the years of debate before it finally passed, argued for a more flexible and pragmatic understanding of wilderness (Turner 2012). Rather than looking back at whether the land had suffered human impact, the question was whether it could be managed in a way that would render human impact substantially unnoticeable in the future (Woods 1998).

At stake in this question was both how big the wilderness system could be and whether there would be more than a few wilderness areas east of the Mississippi, where historic impacts were generally greater. The forward-looking approach championed by the Wilderness Society eventually triumphed with the 1975 designation of many eastern areas with significant past impacts, which has come to be called the Eastern Wilderness Act.

Another issue that came into the question of purity was how much wilderness should be protected from recreational overuse. Frontier nostalgia tended to a form of recreational woodcraft that was fairly high impact, with campers cutting boughs for beds and lean-tos, for instance. As outdoor recreation continued to increase in popularity through the 1960s and 70s, there was debate over whether wilderness and lands for recreation ought to be given separate designations, which would have resulted in far less wilderness areas. The dilemma was mitigated with a movement toward low-impact camping, culminating in the Leave No Trace program (Turner 2002). While vastly increasing the number of people who can camp in a wilderness area without spoiling it, the new methods have also introduced a greater dependence on consumer products and synthetic materials and reduced the need for knowledge of the natural history of the place.

Another test for the meaning of federal wilderness areas would come with the debates over public lands in Alaska, where vast roadless areas often contained indigenous peoples practicing subsistence lifestyles. In 1980, the Alaska National Interest Lands Conservation Act added 56 million acres to the National Wilderness Preservation System, more than doubling its size, but permitting many activities crucial to subsistence living not permitted in designated wilderness outside Alaska. Some motorized access and even log cabins, it was decided, do not pose the same threat to the “Earth and its community of life” in Alaska as they would in the more densely populated U.S. states.

5. Critical Scholarship

Wilderness preservation has often faced criticism and opposition in the political arena. The Sagebrush Rebellion was largely a reaction against the implementation of the Wilderness Act on western lands. Such conflict is often rooted in issues of public versus private property rights. The academic literature on wilderness has tended to focus on other issues—the history of the idea, its influence on policy, and whether it represents a reasonable or appropriate approach to nonhuman nature.

Roderick Nash’s 1967 book, Wilderness and the American Mind, was the seminal work for contemporary wilderness scholarship. It traced the history of the idea of wilderness from ancient attitudes toward nature through the passage of the Wilderness Act. Nash frames the story as the remarkable rise of appreciation for wilderness from the midst of long-standing antipathy. Though not without offering some criticism, the work is largely celebratory of the wilderness tradition and preservation movement and has had an enduring popularity with the backpackers and activists as well as a lasting influence on scholarship. Much of the wilderness scholarship subsequent to Nash’s work has essentially aimed to supplement or correct the general picture given in it.

The first in a series of criticisms and responses, that came to be known as the great new wilderness debate, came from Ramachandra Guha, an environmental and political historian from India (1989). Guha argued that the radical environmental movement in America had an unhealthy focus on biocentrism and wilderness, which are largely irrelevant to the problems he claims are at the root of the environmental crisis: overconsumption and militarization. Environmentalism in India has largely been a class struggle between the rural poor, who depend on the forests for their subsistence, and the over-consuming urban industrialists, which threaten to destroy the forests and poor alike. Western environmental organizations coming into India and working to establish wilderness-like reserves, such as the tiger reserves, are further displacing traditional subsistence economies to make playgrounds for the wealthy. Wilderness, according to Guha, was not appropriate in densely and long inhabited places like India.

William Cronon, an environmental historian, and J. Baird Callicott, an environmental philosopher, followed with arguments that there was something more deeply flawed about the idea of wilderness, even in North America (Cronon 1995; Callicott 1991). Unlike Guha, both insisted that they support protected areas; their problem was with a way of thinking. Wilderness is historically false, denying the long and extensive human influences on the North American landscape, and thus continuing the denial of the humanity of Native Americans. Wilderness thinking presupposes a pre-Darwinian dichotomy between people and nature by treating only people-less places as real or pristine nature. The result of this dualism is misanthropy and a tendency to see the removal of people as the solution to every environmental problem. Holding wilderness to be the ideal form of nature, they argued, is an obstacle to a responsible environmentalism, which must help us live in harmony with nature in the places we inhabit and work not just the places we visit and play in. Cronon in particular worried that caring for pristine nature far from home makes it easier to tolerate the abuse and destruction of mundane nature close to home. Wilderness thinking, they alleged, also tends to treat nature as static, seeking to preserve a place in a particular form, instead of recognizing the dynamic processes at play in nature.

More critics soon followed, drawing out the imperialism, colonialism or ethnocentrism latent in the preservation project. Many of the criticisms were clearly grounded. Frontier nostalgia requires a certain blindness to the perspectives of Native Americans, and western style parks have been implemented in Africa in ways that are brutal to the indigenous inhabitants. But many wilderness advocates found the criticisms to be unfair overall and not helpful to achieving the responsible environmentalism the critics claimed to desire. The Wilderness Act had not endorsed an ideal of pristine or untouched nature, and the Forest Service’s attempt to interpret it that way had been roundly defeated (Friskics 2008). And the experience in Alaska had showed that wilderness preservation need not be hostile to indigenous people or traditional subsistence cultures. It is not that the environmental movement in America has only sought wilderness preservation and not worked for reform in forestry, agriculture and industry; it is just that reform efforts have often been less successful and harder to accomplish than wilderness designation (Foreman 1998).

Val Plumwood gives a thorough analysis of the issue of dualism in the wilderness tradition, finding it in the frequent appellation, “virgin,” and the legal doctrine of terra nullius in the Australian outback (1998). But she also demonstrated how much of the tradition is open to a non-dualistic interpretation, treating the other of wilderness not as the mere absence of the human but as the presence of something else. The extensive concern with natural history in all the major figures of the wilderness tradition strongly supports this non-dualistic interpretation of wilderness as presence. And if wilderness is not simply the absence of human touch, then valuing and preserving it need not lead to misanthropy. People visiting but not remaining is not the essence of wilderness but a practical strategy for protecting what is essential to wilderness: the living, active presence of nonhuman nature, whether it be grizzly bears or giant trees.

Other responses have come from the new conservationists, a diverse alliance of wilderness activists and conservation biologists, which have pushed for a much more aggressive preservation strategy in the 90s and 2000s. The Wildlands Project, for example, proposed a map of wilderness areas, buffer zones and wildlife corridors that puts 50% of the contiguous US into some form of protected status. James Turner suggests that this more aggressive strategy precipitated the great new wilderness debate (2012). But the new conservationists, such as Reed Noss and Dave Foreman, are clear that their sense of wilderness is largely about securing the wildlife habitat necessary to mitigate the extinction crisis (Foreman 1995, 1998 and Noss 1991). Rather than looking for lands supposedly never touched by people, they seek to restore much land that is presently heavily trammeled and dominated by the works of man. And rather than seeing nature as static, their pursuit of bigger and bigger wilderness areas is driven by an increased understanding of landscape dynamics and of the population sizes needed for evolution to occur.

The legacy of wilderness in America thought and policy is complex, with some parts that have many opponents (for example, the erasure of indigenous cultures and histories) and some that have very wide appeal (for example, the national parks). The writings of Thoreau, Muir and Leopold have enriched and enchanted the lives of many Americans. The National Wilderness Preservation System has been remarkably successful at preserving large roadless areas, and many conservation biologists see an extension of this strategy as the best hope for protecting biodiversity. Others have found the cultural baggage of wilderness too great, and would prefer to take other strategies, hoping to better integrate the human economy with natural systems. Clearly wilderness preservation cannot solve all environmental problems, such as environmental injustice or climate change, but it may help with a lot of problems, even those.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Abbey, Edward. Desert Solitaire: A Season in the Wilderness. (New York: McGraw Hill, 1968).
    • An influential articulation of a wilderness philosophy, this book was written after the Wilderness Act but early in the process of review and designation. It is deeply imbued with an appreciation of the desert southwest.
  • Bartram, William. Travels and Other Writings. Thomas P. Slaughter, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1996).
  • Bartram’s Travels, first published in 1791.
    • His major literary work, representing natural history in a romantic mode and a literary genre of significant importance for the growing wilderness appreciation.
  • Bugbee, Henry. The Inward Morning: A Philosophical Exploration in Journal Form (Athens, Ga: University of Georgia Press, 1999). First published in 1958.
    • A remarkable and beautiful use of wilderness for understanding reality and our place in it. Deep Thoreauvian reflections in dialogue with mid-20th century philosophy.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Conceptual Foundations of the Land Ethic.” Companion to A Sand County Almanac: Interpretive and Critical Essays. J. Baird Callicott, ed. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1987): 186-217.
  • Callicott, J. Baird. “The Wilderness Idea Revisited: The Sustainable Development Alternative” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 235-47. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998).
    • A comprehensive collection of contemporary wilderness criticism, including a selection of important works from across the history of the wilderness tradition.  It also includes several significant original pieces.
  • Callicott, J. Baird and Michael Nelson, eds. The Wilderness Debate Rages On: Continuing the Great New Wilderness Debate (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2008).
    • A second large collection, this volume includes a lot of the critical scholarship on wilderness published since the first collection. It also covers some gaps in the previous volume, including important works by early 20th century ecologists and more discussion of race and class.
  • Chipeniuk, Raymond. “The Old and Middle English Origins of ‘Wilderness.’” Environments 21(1991): 22-28.
  • Coates, Peter. Nature: Western Attitudes since Ancient Times (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998).
    • This book is especially helpful on Roman and Medieval times, often skipped over in other treatments, and it balances the history of ideas with the history of the environment, considering ancient impacts in some depth.
  • Cole, David N. and Laurie Yung, eds. Beyond Naturalness: Rethinking Park and Wilderness Stewardship in an Era of Rapid Change. 2nd ed. (Washington, D.C.: Island Press, 2010).
    • Diverse approaches to interpreting naturalness and wildness are considered in light of the practical management of protected areas and the challenges currently facing such management, including climate change and invasive species.
  • Cronon, William, ed. Uncommon Ground: Rethinking the Human Place in Nature. (New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1995).
    • This anthology is largely critical of the idea of wilderness and includes Cronon’s much discussed piece, “The Trouble with Wilderness, or, Getting Back to the Wrong Nature.” It includes several other worthwhile chapters as well, particularly Anne Spirn’s chapter on the legacy of Frederick Law Olmsted.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo. Nature (Boston: James Munroe & Company, 1836).
    • Emerson’s classic is widely available in print and on the internet, including a scanned image of the 1836 original.
  • Friskics, Scott. “The Twofold Myth of Pristine Wilderness: Misreading the Wilderness Act in Terms of Purity” Environmental Ethics 30 (2008): 381-99.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness Areas for Real.” The Great New Wilderness Debate.. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 395-407.
  • Foreman, Dave. “Wilderness: From Scenery to Nature” Wild Earth 5(4) (Winter 1995/96): 9-16. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Guha, Ramachandra. “Radical American Environmentalism and Wilderness Preservation: A Third World Critique.” Environmental Ethics 11 (1989): 71-83. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Harding, Walter. The Days of Henry Thoreau: A Biography. 2nd ed. (Mineola, NY: Dover Publications, 2011).
    • First published by Knopf in 1965, this biography has seen many printings. See also Richardson, 1988.
  • Hargrove, Eugene C. Foundations of Environmental Ethics (Denton: Environmental Ethics Books, 1996).
    • First published in 1989, this work is valuable for its discussion of the history of property rights and their tension with preservation. It also defends the viability of aesthetic arguments for preservation and their connection to wildlife conservation.
  • Harvey, Mark. Wilderness Forever: Howard Zhaniser and the Path to the Wilderness Act (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2005).
    • Zhaniser was the primary author of the Wilderness Act and a driving force behind its eventual passage.
  • Leopold, Aldo. A Sand County Almanac and Sketches Here and There. Special Commemorative Edition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987). First published in 1949.
    • Aldo Leopold’s most influential work, accepted for publication just before his death. The last section of the book, called the “Upshot,” contains the most direct discussion of wilderness and the land ethic.
  • Leopold, Aldo. The River of the Mother of God and Other Essays. Susan L. Flader and J. Baird Callicott, eds. (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 1991).
    • Many of Leopold’s other works, arranged chronologically, enabling the reader to see the development of his thought over time.
  • Lewis, Michael. American Wilderness: A New History (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).
    • An anthology covering diverse aspects of the history of wilderness and preservation in America, updating and complementing Nash’s work in several ways. For instance, it includes a chapter chronicling the extensive role of women and women’s clubs in the early preservation movement.
  • Lowenthal, David. George Perkins Marsh: Prophet of Conservation (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2000).
    • A scholarly biography situating Marsh’s life and work in relation to the early conservation movement.
  • Marsh, George Perkins. Man and Nature; or, Physical Geography as Modified by Human Action (New York: Charles Scribner, 1864).
    • Immensely influential on the beginnings of the conservation movement, this work by Marsh first clearly established that human labor in nature is often more destructive than helpful. He focuses on the role of forests and deforestation on the condition of waters and soils and on the possibility of people working to heal or restore damaged land.
  • Meine, Curt D. Aldo Leopold: His Life and Work (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press: 1988).
    • This is the foremost biography of Leopold. The 2010 edition has a new preface and a contribution from Wendell Berry.
  • Muir, John. Our National Parks. (Boston: Houghton, Mifflin & Company, 1901).
  • Muir, John. Nature Writings. William Cronon, ed. (New York: Library of America, 1997.)
    • Most of Muir’s writings were published first as magazine articles, and later collected into books. This collection contains many of the most influential pieces.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. Wilderness and the American Mind. 5th ed. (New Haven: Yale, 2014)
    • First published in 1967, this work was path breaking scholarship and has had enduring popularity with wilderness enthusiasts and activists. Several chapters have been added in subsequent additions, and the 5th edition includes a forward by Char Miller.
  • Nash, Roderick Frazier. “‘Wild-d­ēor-ness,’ The Place of Wild Beasts.” Wilderness: the Edge of Knowledge. Maxine E. McCloskey, ed. (San Francisco: Sierra Club, 1970):  34-37.
  • Norton, Bryan G. “The Constancy of Leopold’s Land Ethic.” Conservation Biology 2(1) (1988): 93-102.
  • Noss, Reed. “Wilderness Recovery: Thinking Big in Restoration Ecology.” The Environmental Professional 13 (1991): 225-34. Reprinted in The Great New Wilderness Debate.
  • Oelschlaeger, Max. The Idea of Wilderness (New Haven: Yale, 1991).
    • Extensive treatment of the major figures of the wilderness tradition. Includes a notable chapter on the poets Robinson Jeffers and Gary Snyder.
  • Plumwood, Val. “Wilderness Skepticism and Wilderness Dualism.” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 652-690.
  • Richardson, Robert. Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind (Oakland: University of California Press, 1988).
    • This biography focuses on the intellectual development of Thoreau, with critical discussion of his written work.
  • Sachs, Aaron. The Humboldt Current: Nineteenth-Century Exploration and the Roots of American Environmentalism (New York: Viking, 2006.)
    • Sachs provides an in depth discussion of the influence of romantic natural history, especially in the person of Alexander von Humboldt, on American culture and attitudes toward nature.
  • Smallwood, William Martin. Natural History and the American Mind (New York: AMS Press, 1967).
    • Chronicles the development of natural history and its cultural importance in the American colonies and the young republic.
  • Spence, Mark David. Dispossessing the Wilderness: Indian Removal and the Making of the National Parks (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Sutter, Paul. Driven Wild: How the Fight Against Automobiles Launched the Modern Wilderness Movement (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2002).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. The Journal of Henry D. Thoreau. 14 volumes. B. Torrey and F. Allen, eds. (New York: Dover, 1962). Originally published in 1906.
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Walden: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004).
  • Thoreau, Henry David. Essays: A Fully Annotated Edition. Jeffrey S. Cramer, ed. (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2013).
    • This volume contains “Walking” and his most important wilderness travel and natural history writings.
  • Turner, Frederick Jackson. The Frontier in American History (New York: Henry Holt & Company, 1921).
    • Turner’s “frontier thesis” was originally given as an address in 1893, just after the census declared the end of the frontier. The idea gave fervor to the growing frontier nostalgia, and its accuracy as history has been long debated.
  • Turner, Jack. The Abstract Wild. (Tucson: University of Arizona Press, 1996).
    • A manifesto and sustained argument against, among other things, the sufficiency of managed parks for the preservation of wildness.
  • Turner, James Morton. “From Woodcraft to ‘Leave No Trace’: Wilderness, Consumerism, and Environmentalism in Twentieth-Century America” Environmental History 7(3) (2002): 462-84. Reprinted in The Wilderness Debate Rages On.
  • Turner, James Morton. The Promise of Wilderness: American Environmental Politics since 1964 (Seattle: University of Washington Press, 2012).
    • This work picks up the history where Nash’s book left off, successfully putting to rest any notion that public lands preservation has been less important to environmentalism since the 60s. This is the best source on the way different agencies and organizations have interpreted wilderness in applying the legal designation.
  • White, Lynn, Jr. “The Historical Roots of Our Ecological Crisis.” Science 155 (1967): 1203-07.
  • Woods, Mark. “Federal Wilderness Preservation in the United States: The Preservation of Wilderness?” The Great New Wilderness Debate. J. Baird Callicott and Michael Nelson, eds. (Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1998): 131-153.
  • Worster, Donald. A Passion for Nature: The Life of John Muir (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008).
    • An extensive biography of Muir by one of the foremost environmental historians.
  • Worster, Donald. Nature’s Economy: A History of Ecological Ideas. 2nd ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994).
    • This is an important treatment of the romantic natural history tradition and its legacy in general, and of Thoreau in particular.


Author Information

David Henderson
Western Carolina University
U. S. A.