Peter Abelard (1079—1142)

abelardPeter Abelard (1079-1142) was the preeminent philosopher of the twelfth century and perhaps the greatest logician of the middle ages. During his life he was equally famous as a poet and a composer, and might also have ranked as the preeminent theologian of his day had his ideas earned more converts and less condemnation. In all areas Abelard was brilliant, innovative, and controversial. He was a genius. He knew it, and made no apologies. His vast knowledge, wit, charm, and even arrogance drew a generation of Europe’s finest minds to Paris to learn from him.

Philosophically, Abelard is best known as the father of nominalism. For contemporary philosophers, nominalism is most closely associated with the problem of universals but is actually a much broader metaphysical system. Abelard formulated what is now recognized as a central nominalist tenet: only particulars exist. However, his solution to the problem of universals is a semantic account of the meaning and proper use of universal words. It is from Abelard’s claim that only words (nomen) are universal that nominalism gets its name. Abelard would have considered himself first a logician and then later in his life a theologian and ethicist. He may well have been the best logician produced in the Middle Ages. Several innovations and theories that are conventionally thought to have originated centuries later can be found in his works. Among these are a theory of direct reference for nouns, an account of purely formal validity, and a theory of propositional content once thought to have originated with Gottlob Frege. In ethics, Abelard develops a theory of moral responsibility based on the agent’s intentions. Moral goodness is defined as intending to show love of God and neighbor and being correct in that intention.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Universals
  3. Metaphysics
  4. Logic and Philosophy of Language
  5. Cognition and Philosophy of Mind
  6. Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. General Surveys
    2. Life
    3. Universals
    4. Logic, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Mind
    5. Ethics
    6. William of Champeaux

1. Life and Works

Peter Abelard was born the eldest son of lesser nobility in La Pallet in Brittany. In 1092, around the age of 13, Abelard gave up his inheritance and knighthood and began an extraordinary philosophical education with the greatest philosophical and theological minds of his day: Roscelin of Compiegne (from 1092-1099), William of Champeaux (from 1100-1102 and 1108-1110), and Anselm of Laon (in 1113). Although each of these men was at the peak of his intellectual reputation, Abelard quickly became disenchanted with them all. He moved first from Roscelin to William and then, believing he could do better, set up his first school at Melun in 1102. He ran this school successfully for two years until he was forced to return to Brittany. He claims this was due to ill health. Recent biographers have speculated that it had more to do with political turmoil involving his patron Stephen de Garlande. In 1108 he returned to Paris to study again with William. Conflict was probably inevitable between the established scholar who held the reputation for being the leading intellectual in Paris and the young genius who felt he deserved an even greater crown. Between 1108 and 1110 Abelard and William had their famous disputes over the nature of universals. Abelard claims to have driven William from the schools of Paris in shame. In fact, William left Paris to become a Bishop of Châlon-sur-Marne and Papal ambassador to the court of Emperor Henry V. This is perhaps not as shameful as Abelard suggests, but William’s views on universals have never since been seriously held by another philosopher.

Abelard continued to teach successfully until 1113 when he left to study theology with Anselm of Laon. Abelard was equally disenchanted by Anselm, but not quite so lucky in this dispute. Abelard set himself up as a competing lecturer. He attracted many of Anselm’s students to himself, but earned the enduring enmity of others. Anselm’s aggrieved disciples dogged Abelard his entire career. They quickly acquired St. Bernard of Clairvaux as their champion. Bernard needed little convincing. He took offence at Abelard’s attempt to apply the tools of logic and dialectic to questions Bernard felt were properly mystical and spiritual. Twice Bernard orchestrated councils where Abelard’s works were condemned. At Soissons (1122) Abelard was forced to ceremonially burn his own book the Theologia Summi Boni. At Sens (1140) a revised version, the Theologia Scholarium, was again condemned and Abelard and his followers were excommunicated.

These condemnations were in the future when Abelard returned to Paris in 1113 to take up the chair at Notre Dame that had been vacated by William of Champeaux. Once again Abelard taught successfully, for a few years. In 1116 or thereabouts Abelard began an affair with Heloise his student and the niece of Fulbert the canon of Notre Dame. She was to become one of the great minds of the twelfth century in her own right, and theirs is the great tragic love story of the middle ages. They fell in love, had a child, secretly married, and exchanged a series of love letters that have become the stuff of legend. Unfortunately, they kept their marriage a secret from Fulbert. Heloise’s uncle exercised the traditional right of aggrieved families in such cases and had Abelard castrated.

For the next ten years, Abelard undertook an unsuccessful career as a monk. Because of his reputation many monasteries wanted to claim him as their own. Because of his personality this rarely worked out well. He left St. Denis after “proving” that the monastery’s founder (also the patron saint of France) could not be the St. Denis that they claimed but rather was a different and less significant St. Denis. In 1126 he was appointed abbot of St. Gildas. He had been elected by the brothers based on his flamboyant reputation. They were bitterly disappointed to get in Abelard a strident reformer of monastic discipline. Abelard claims that the monks tried to kill him.

Abelard returned to Paris for the last time in 1133 where he taught and wrote until the council of Sens in 1141. St. Bernard had diligently worked behind the scenes to ensure that Abelard and his works would be condemned. Recognizing that the council was not a forum to debate ideas but rather a panel assembled to confirm a pre-established conclusion, Abelard was famously silent when questioned. He appealed the decision directly to the Pope in Rome. Once again Bernard’s superior connections and diplomatic skills won out. Before Abelard could even leave France, Bernard had already orchestrated a pronouncement from the Pope upholding the council’s decision. The Pope lifted the excommunication, but Abelard was condemned to silence. Abelard lived out his days under the protection of Peter the Venerable Abbot of Cluny. He died on April 21, 1142 and was buried at the Paraclete, the abbey he had founded with Heloise. Today Abelard and Heloise’s bodies are interred at Père Lachaise cemetery in Paris.

Abelard’s best known writings are his autobiography the Historia Calamitatum (The Story of my Misfourtunes), the letters he exchanged with Heloise, and the Sic et Non. The Historia, written after Abelard’s escape from St. Gildas, details Abelard’s rise to fame and the misfortunes of his fall. It is addressed to an unidentified friend with the hope that this friend will feel better about his own suffering after reading of Abelard’s. The real purpose was likely to remind people of Abelard’s past fame and to pave the way for a return to Paris. The letters of Abelard and Heloise discuss issues ranging from their relationship to theological and philosophical matters affecting Heloise’s nuns at the Paraclete. In the past century there was considerable debate about the authenticity of these letters, or at least about Heloise’s letters. It is now generally accepted that the letters are authentic, and that Heloise was as formidable a personality in real life as she appears in her letters. The Sic et Non does not strictly speaking contain any of Abelard’s original thought. Rather, Abelard collected a list of 158 controversial theological questions and compiled writings from authorities some for (“Sic“), some opposed (“Non“). The reader should be able to dissolve the apparent conflict between authorities and come to understand the answers to the questions posed through rational discussion.

Abelard’s works in logic and metaphysics were written mostly in those periods he was teaching in and around Paris. The result is Abelard’s earliest work, is a series of glosses called the Introductiones Parvulorum (ca. 1100-1104). These are almost line by line explanations of the standard logical texts available in the Latin West: Porphyry’s Isagoge, Boethius’ De hypotheticis syllogismis and De topicis differentiis, and Aristotle‘s Categories and De interpretatione. These close textual commentaries show how much Abelard’s early thought was influenced by his first teacher Roscelin. Abelard explains these texts—even the Categories—as being about words and language not things in the world. In his second stint teaching in Paris, Abelard wrote another series of commentaries on the same works, the Logica Ingredientibus, and a treatise in logic, the Dialectica (ca. 1115-1119). These works are much more expansive. It is here that Abelard develops his distinctive form of nominalism, and develops his most influential thoughts in logic. The switch from Roscelin’s vocalism, a theory of words, to his own nominalism, a theory of names, reflects a more sophisticated understanding of semantics and metaphysics developed while disputing with William. The Logica Nostrorum Petitioni Sociorum, a later commentary on Porphyry perhaps from his third stint in Paris, contains a restatement and perhaps several subtle changes in his theory of universals.

In his final period of teaching in the 1130s, Abelard turned primarily to ethics and theology. His lectures on logic were well attended but John of Salisbury suggests that late in his career Abelard was no longer on the cutting edge. Abelard’s two major ethical works—the Ethics or Know yourself and the Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian (or Colationes)—were both written in the late 1130’s.

Over the course of his career Abelard wrote three distinct treatises on the Trinity. The sequence and progression of Abelard’s Trinitarian thought is better known than some other aspects of Abelard’s thought. The Theologia Summi Boni was condemned at the council of Soissons (1122). The Theologia Christiana (ca 1125-30) remains the most influential of the three. This is because the third the Theologia Scholarium was itself condemned at the counsel of Sens (1141), where Abelard and his followers were excommunicated. In addition to these extensive works on the Trinity, Abelard wrote several commentaries on books of the bible, soliloquies, ethical and religious poems, and studies of the various creeds.

2. Universals

Abelard is credited as the founder of nominalism for his claim that a universal is a name (nomen) or significant word (sermo). He is also credited with inspiring a school of followers called the nominales. His discussion of universals has two parts: a rejection of realism and a semantic solution to the problem of universals. In its simplest form, the problem of universals is the problem of explaining how two or more individuals are the same (or similar). Plato and Socrates are both human beings yet they are distinct individuals. A realist posits some item in the world, namely, “humanity”—a universal that is somehow shared by both Plato and Socrates. This shared universal makes both Socrates and Plato human and is the reason the word “human” applies equally to both. Abelard denies the existence of any such universal item in this realist sense. His solution to the problem of universals is a semantic account of how universal words apply to many discrete individuals when there is no universal shared by those individuals.

For the first part of his argument, Abelard generally finds it sufficient to refute particular realist arguments. The three most prominent in Abelard’s writings are (1) material essence realism and (2) indifference realism—both held by William of Champeaux—and (3) collective realism.

Material essence realism has three central theses:

(1) there are ten most general essences, one corresponding to each of Aristotle’s ten categories. These ten most general essences exist in some degree unformed.

(2) these general essences are the “matter” that is formed into sub-altern genera and species by the addition of differentia, the characteristic features that determine the species to which each type of substance belongs. The most general essence, Substance, is formed into Corporeal Substance and Incorporeal Substance by the addition of the differentiae Corporeal and Incorporeal, and so on down the tree of porphyry

(3) individuation is accomplished by the addition of accidental forms. At the species level—when substance has been differentiated into Rational, Mortal, Animate, Corporeal, Substance (Human)—the addition of accidental forms divides the material essence into discrete individuals. Socrates and Plato share exactly the same material essence of Humanity. But Plato is tall and has brown hair. Socrates is short and bald. These accidental properties make them individuals.

The individuals in a species or genus share the single material essence. This pure universal essence is never actually found in the world, but William claims “it does not go against nature for it to be a pure thing if it were to happen that all its accidents were removed.” (Marenbon 2004: 33) This exercise of stripping away the accidental forms of Socrates to arrive at pure humanity is not merely a mental exercise; it could possibly occur thereby revealing the underlying pure universal essence.

It is this principle of a single universal substance individuated by accidents that Abelard reduces to absurdity. Material essence realism makes individuation itself impossible. The accidents that are supposed to individuate substance are themselves un-individuated universal essences. The material essences in the categories of quality and quantity etc. also must be individuated by the addition of an accidental form. An accident cannot individuate substance unless that accident has been individuated first. Abelard writes “The <accidental> forms in themselves are not in essence diverse from one another…. Therefore, Socrates and Plato are no more diverse from one another because of the nature of quality than they are because of the nature of substance.” (Spade, 1994: §37) Material essence realism cannot explain the existence of discrete individuals.

In response, William formulates a second realist theory of universals. Indifference realism rejects the core principle of material essence realism: shared essences. William now accepted that it is simply a basic fact about individuals that they are completely discrete from one another. The seed of the theory is found in an ambiguity in the words “one” and “same.” William claims that, “When I say Plato and Socrates are the same I might attribute identity of wholly the same essence or I might simply mean that they do not differ in some relevant respect.” The stronger sense of “one” and “same” applies to Peter/ Simon, Saul/ Paul (we would say Cicero/Tully). As for Plato and Socrates:

We say that they are the same in that they are men, “same” pertaining with regard to humanity. Just as one is rational so is the other, just as one is mortal so is the other. But if we wanted to make a true confession it is not the same humanity in each one, but similar humanity since they are two men. (Sententiae 236.115-120)

So although Plato and Socrates have no common matter they are still called “same” because they do not differ. This leads to the claim that Abelard finds so disturbing: each individual is both universal and particular. William writes:

One Man is many men, taken particularly. Those which are one considered in a species are many considered particularly. That is to say, without accidents they are considered one per indifference, with accidents many (Iwakuma 1999 p.119).

Indifference realism is not a complete departure from material essence realism. When the accidents are stripped away, Plato and Socrates are still the same although in a weaker sense of “same.” They do not share a material essence, nonetheless they do not differ. William’s indifference realism holds that when the individuating accidents are stripped away from two individuals what you are left with may be numerically distinct but not discernable individuals. There are two of them but you cannot tell them apart or tell which one was Plato. What you are left with are pure things—there are no individuating characteristics. Each individual is itself the universal.

In his own works, Abelard did not explain indifference realism in any detail. He notes that this view is closer to the truth but he does not explain how or why. He rejects the view based on the metaphysical absurdity of the individual being the universal. On William’s second view Socrates is the species “humanity.” If Socrates, insofar as he is humanity, is the universal, then it is in fact Socrates that is predicated of Plato when we say “Plato is human.” Conversely if the species “humanity” is the individual then it cannot be a universal. By definition an individual cannot be predicated of many. To the more basic claim that Plato and Socrates are the same in that they do not differ in being man, Abelard responds that they are also the same in that they do not differ in being stone. Pointing out that things do not differ does not explain their similarity, agreement, or sameness.

The third prominent realist theory Abelard refutes is collective realism. This is the view that the entire collection of individuals contained in a species constitutes the universal. For example, the entire collection of humans would constitute the universal “Humanity.” The entire collection of animals is the universal “Animal.” And so forth. Abelard’s attack on this view is equally devastating. The central idea in his best arguments is that being an individual of a certain species or genus is metaphysically prior to inclusion in the collection. If there is a prior reason for placing an individual in one collection and not another—if there is a right and a wrong way to put individuals into species—then the collection is not doing the work of the universal. The collection is not defining genera and species, it is reflecting genera and species. If there is no such principle, then any collection of random items could be a genus and any subset of that collection would be a species. Two men, one squirrel and paper cup could be a universal. Collective realism either fails to explain what it purports to explain or adopts such radical conventionalism about ontology that it is reduced to absurdity. Abelard’s refutation of William’s realism revealed his (Abelard’s) commitment to a world populated by discrete individuals. And his refutation of collective realism reveals a belief that individuals fall into natural kinds.

The refutation of prominent realist theories leaves Abelard free to pursue the second part of his argument. Having shown that there are no universal things, he can now develop a semantic theory of universals. In his Logica Ingredientibus, Abelard approaches the subject by posing three distinct questions: What is the common cause for the imposition of universal words? What is the common conception signified by universal words? Are universal words universal because of the common cause, the common conception, or both?

The common cause for the imposition of universal words is the status. The person who imposed the universal word “human” established the convention whereby the word’s corresponding sound names each individual that has the status: being a human. In contemporary terms, Abelard holds a theory of direct reference. The universal word refers to—or nominates—each individual with the status even when speakers do not have a clear understanding of the status involved. The status itself is not an item in Abelard’s ontology. That is, it is not matter, form, or essence; it is not a part of the individual. Each individual human can be said to have the status: being a human. But equally a horse and an ass are alike in the status: not being human. Not being human is clearly not some thing shared by a horse and an ass. The status or states of being human or of not being human are basic features of the individual itself. Each human just is a human. Each horse is just not a human. It is a basic fact about individuals that each falls into a niche on the tree of Porphyry, each is of a particular kind. This is because of the way individuals are created. According to Abelard, God conceives an exemplar or model in his mind before he makes individuals. An individual’s being human is the result of an individual’s being made according to the exemplar for human beings. Analogously, a house’s being a ranch results from its being built according to certain blueprints. Being human and being a ranch are not metaphysical items distinct from the individual. It is a basic fact about individuals that each one is made according to an exemplar in the divine mind.

The common conception is the understanding signified by the universal word. The utterance of the word “human” generates an understanding in the mind of the hearer. This common conception or common understanding is the meaning of the word. In successful communication, the speaker has an act of understanding that pertains to all and only things with the status being a human (as described below). He utters the word “human” and thereby causes his hearer to have his own act of understanding that pertains to all and only things that have the status being a human. The understanding generated in the mind of the hearer pertains to the same things as the speaker’s understanding when uttering the word. These understandings are formed through a process of abstraction. From studying individual humans and honing the understanding of them, we form an understanding that pertains to each individual with a status but to no individual uniquely. The process of abstraction produces understandings that are alone (sola), bare (nuda), and pure (pura). Alone means apart from sense; we do not understand the individual as a present object of sensation. A bare understanding abstracts away some of the forms in the individual. An understanding that is alone and bare conceives of this-humanity, this-whiteness, etc. An alone and bare understanding is not yet a universal understanding. A universal understanding must be pure: it must abstract from all individuating conditions. The universal understanding generated by the word “human” conceives of just the nature, mortal rational animal, and nothing else. It pertains to all individual humans but only insofar as each is human. The understanding contains nothing by which one individual could be picked out over any other. These alone, bare, and pure understandings can approximate the exemplars in the divine mind sufficiently for the imposition and use of language. However, because we must learn by studying the created individuals our human understandings will always fall short of knowledge. We will never understand natures and properties as well as the creator.

The primacy of the individual is the central element in Abelard’s theory. Unless and until individuals with a particular status are created, we cannot form an understanding of their nature or impose a word to name them. This limitation is not an accident of our imperfect epistemic position. In a way that Abelard finds disturbing, the same holds for God.

But a question now arises about the builder’s (God’s) plan: Is it empty ‘false or meaningless’ while he now holds in mind the form of the future work, then the thing is not that way yet?… If someone calls it “empty” on the grounds that it would not yet be in harmony with the status of the future thing, we shudder at the awful words, but do not reject the judgment. For it is true that the future status of the world did not materially exist while God was intelligibly arranging what was still future. (Spade, 1994: §135)

Before he creates roses even God’s alone, bare, and pure understanding of the nature rose is empty. Presumably, were God to attempt to use the word “rose” under these conditions his word would not name any thing, and no one would know what he was talking about.

Discussion of the problem of universals in the early middle ages was framed by Porphyry’s three questions: (a) whether genera and species are real or are situated in bare thoughts alone, (b) whether as real they are bodies or incorporeals, and (c) whether they are separated or in sensibles and have their reality in connection with them. These questions had clearly been formulated with a realist answer in mind. After some not too subtle spin in answering Porphyry’s questions Abelard adds a fourth.

Do ‘universals’ so long as they are ‘universals’ necessarily have some thing subject to them by nomination? Or alternatively, even if the things named are destroyed, can the universal consist even then in the signification of the understanding alone? For example, the name “rose” when there are no roses to which it is common. (Spade 1994: §10)

Abelard’s answer is “no.” When there are no roses then the word “rose” is no longer a universal word; it no longer names (or nominates) many discrete individuals. The word “rose”, when uttered, would still generate an understanding which would pertain to all roses were the roses to return. When all the roses are gone the sentence “There are no roses” would be both meaningful and true. The understanding, although preserving the meaning of the universal term, is not the universal. When the individuals are destroyed the word is no longer universal.

3. Metaphysics

The fundamental commitment behind Abelard’s nominalism, that there is nothing that is not individual (or at least particular), is the conceptual core of all his metaphysical thought. Abelard held that the individual is primary, ontologically basic, and requires no explanation. It is notoriously difficult to prove such a claim. If Abelard could be said to have a metaphysical project it would be to show that other “items” that more promiscuous philosophers would add to their ontology can be reductively explained in terms of individuals (or at least of particulars).

Abelard asserts that individuals are integral wholes, and he adopts the language of form-matter composites to describe individuals, but the form is nothing other than the arrangement of the parts that comprise the whole. (cf. LI cat 79ff) Abelard holds a doctrine of double creation. God first created the four basic elements and then combined the four basic elements into various individuals according to the exemplars in his mind (LI cat 298ff; D 419ff). Only God has this power to assemble parts into a single discrete individual substance. Only God can impose form on matter (D 419). It makes perfect sense for Abelard to talk about forms, but the form is not a part of the individual. This is the hallmark of Abelard’s reductivism; “form” is a name for an objectively discernable feature of the individual, not for an ontologically distinct item.

Individuals thus created are discreet from all others; they share no matter or form, yet they are similar. Abelard will explain this in terms of natures or substantial forms, but again prefers a reductive account. Individuals have a certain nature because they have a certain substantial form, but this substantial form is not a part of the individual or any item that could be shared by two individuals. In contemporary terms Abelard would be a resemblance nominalist. Individuals created by God according to the same exemplar will be naturally similar in the way that houses made according to the same blueprint are similar. This similarity is real, not conventional, but nothing in addition to the individuals is required to explain this fact. The individuals that populate the world fall into natural kinds. Natures themselves do not need to be posited to explain this fact about the world.

Abelard provides many similar reductive accounts. Time reduces to nothing other than the individuals whose duration is measured. Relations are nothing more than the properties of the discreet individuals involved. Abelard’s reductive accounts can be quite convoluted but the basic metaphysical commitment is consistent. His most difficult case is with the dictum asserted by a declarative sentence. He could not find a way to reduce false dicta and counterfactual dicta to extant individuals, but he asserts repeatedly that dicta are “wholly nothing” and “no essence at all.”

4. Logic and Philosophy of Language

In the introductions and preambles to his various works, Abelard writes that a student should proceed from the study of words to the study of propositions—all with the goal of learning about argument. In addition to the semantic theories described above, Abelard developed a theory of propositional content thought to have originated with Frege; a theory of formal validity for syllogisms; and an as yet not well understood theory of true conditionals that differs from the account of syllogisms.

The study of words begins with the initial imposition of words. As new items are encountered, the creator of the language imposes a conventional sound to name that thing, or some nature or property of that thing. The word refers to the item directly by naming or nominating it. Naming directly picks out the item even if the imposer does not fully understand the individual, nature, or property named or even if he or she does not think about it completely correctly. In fact, Abelard writes that the imposer and subsequent users of the word may be completely ignorant of how to correctly understand the nature or property by virtue of which individuals are named by the word—as is the case with the word “stone”—and yet successfully name the individual or individuals the word was imposed to name.

Abelard assigns two related forms of signification to words: the signification of understandings and the signification of things. These two significations provide the meaning or content of the words. A spoken word signifies an understanding by generating an act of understanding in the mind of some hearer. This understanding generated should be the same as the understanding in the mind of the speaker, that is, both the speaker’s and hearer’s understanding of the same individual, nature, or property should correspond. The word is said to signify the thing that is the object of the act of understanding. Abelard is quite clear and explicit in arguing that the word does not signify a mental image or a concept. The spoken word causes the hearer to have an act of understanding—to think about—the individual, nature, or property that the speaker used the word to name. (The understanding of a nature or property pertains to all individuals with the nature or property and so is of individuals but not of any one individual uniquely.)

Abelard’s discussion of words is undertaken with an eye towards sentences. The sentence is a combination of words and so what is signified by the sentence is, in a qualified sense, composed of what is signified by the words. Abelard will call the understanding generated by a sentence “composite” but this means only that the hearer’s understanding is assembled piece by piece as he hears the words of the sentence. The “thing” signified by the sentence however is not composed of the things signified by the individual words. Rather, a declarative sentence signifies what is asserted to be the case. This is not a state of affairs nor is it a proposition if the latter is thought of as some item in the ontology. Abelard calls this the dictum; the declarative sentence “Socrates sits” signifies as its dictum that Socrates sits. The sentence is true or false if what it asserts to be the case actually is the case.

A declarative sentence signifies its dictum by asserting it, but not all sentences are declarative. With a slight change in intonation the sentence “Socrates sits” can be uttered as a question. The propositional content of the declarative sentence and the question are the same. Uttered as a declarative sentence, it is asserted that Socrates sits; a dictum is signified, and the sentence is either true or false. Uttered as a question, the propositional content is the same but there is no assertion that Socrates sits. There is no dictum. Abelard discusses the many different attitudes that can be taken with regard to the same propositional content and develops these ideas into a theory of propositional logic. He treats conditional sentences as assertions of the relation between the propositional content of the antecedent and consequent and not as an assertion of the truth of either. He also develops a theory of propositional negation which defines the negation of “All As are Bs” as “it is not the case that All As are Bs.” This negation extinguishes the propositional content and has no existential import. (Traditional Aristotelian negation held that the negation of “All As are Bs” is “Some As are not Bs.”)

There are several insights and innovations in Abelard’s discussion of argument, inference, and entailments. However, there is also some tension between different texts and not all Abelard’s views are well understood yet. Most worthy of note is Abelard’s distinction between perfect and imperfect entailment.

A perfect entailment—syllogism or conditional—is valid by virtue of its form. Abelard held that the canonical moods of syllogisms—and their conditionalizations—were formally valid and did not need a topic or maximal proposition to warrant the inference. Abelard’s criterion for perfect entailment is universal substitution, another insight that was thought to have originated centuries later. The syllogism

  1. All As are Bs
  2. All Bs are CsTherefore:
  3. All As are Cs

is valid for any terms substituted for A, B, and C. Nothing other than the formal logical structure is needed to warrant the entailment.

Imperfect entailments require more to warrant the inference. Here Abelard draws a further distinction between syllogisms and conditionals. The criterion for the validity of an imperfect syllogism is that it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion false. However Abelard allows non-formal facts about the world (de natura rerum) to warrant the necessity of the syllogistic inference. These facts about the world are codified as topics and maximal propositions. A maximal proposition; for example, “whatever is predicated of the species is predicated of the genus” not only warrants an inference by stipulating a non-formal fact about the world, it limits the range of acceptable substitution to those terms signifying genera and their species. The necessity of a valid imperfect syllogism is found not in logic but in physics.

Abelard has a stricter criterion for conditionals. In contemporary terms, Abelard denied the deduction theorem. It is not enough that it be impossible for the antecedent to be true and the consequent false at the same time. This relationship might be accidental. For a conditional to be true it must also be the case that the understanding signified by the antecedent “contain” the understanding of the consequent. An example of a true conditional Abelard gives is, “If something is a body, it is corporeal.” Corporeality is contained in the understanding signified by the term “body” and so this conditional is true. However, “If something is a body, it is colored” is false. It is a fact about the world that every body is some color or other, but “being colored” is not contained in the understanding of body. So, while the enthymeme, “X is a body therefore X is colored” is valid, the corresponding conditional is false. His student, John of Salisbury, expressed shock that Abelard would accept some syllogisms as valid but reject their corresponding conditionals as false.

5. Cognition and Philosophy of Mind

While Abelard’s theory of mind and cognition was a foundation for his theories of universals and philosophy of language, he was not overly interested in philosophy of mind as such. His discussions of universals and signification each include a brief account of cognition. He wrote a stand-alone Treatise on Understandings with the express purpose of clarifying issues essential to his semantic theories.

Abelard considered his philosophy of mind to have been Aristotelian, but his knowledge of Aristotle on this subject was quite thin. He repeatedly echoes stock Aristotelian claims—sensation is of and through bodies, and so forth—but also rejects many core Aristotelian claims. Without recognizing it, Abelard rejects the accounts of cognition that can be found in Aristotle, most notably the accounts in De Anima and de Interpretatione. Abelard thoroughly rejects the theory (found in Aristotle’s theory in De Anima) that cognition involves the formal identity between the mind and the object understood. He argues that it would be absurd to claim that the mind becomes four sided when it thinks of a four sided tower. He also points out that one can think of several things at once while nothing could have those contrary forms at the same time. These criticisms suggest that Abelard was completely unaware of Aristotle’s account of intelligible forms. Given his own conception of form, this Aristotelian account of mind is nonsense.

Abelard also denies the view (expressed by Aristotle’s in the de Interpretatione) that cognition is the formation of representations, images or likenesses, of the object cognized. Although images are important to Abelard’s account of cognition, the image is only needed when direct cognition of the object via sense is not possible. Images are substitutes for present occurant experience. They are not necessary intermediates in the cognitive process. Nor are images in any way the object of cognition (except to think of a particular image as an image.)

In Abelard’s paradigm case of cognition, there are three steps: sensation, imagination, and understanding. Sensation is a power of the mind not a power of the animate body. Through the sense organ the mind looks out “as if through a window” at the world. When a physical object is present—and all other conditions are appropriate—sensation provides an initial “confused conception” of the object. This initial conception is confused because, as yet, the mind does not grasp the nature or any property of the object. We are aware of the object but don’t yet understand what it is. Imagination supplements the present sensation. If I see a tree at a distance through the sense of sight, I perceive the color and other proper objects of vision. Imagination adds texture and hardness and scent. Imagination can also provide the full substitute for absent objects. When sensation and/or imagination present this confused conception, the rational power of the mind can focus on the confused conception and focus its discerning attention on some nature or property of the object sensed or imagined. Abelard describes this as an act of understanding; it is the conscious and transient act of thinking about some thing or a nature or property of the thing. Abelard is explicit in claiming that the act of understanding is just a transient act of thinking about something. The understanding is not a concept. For Abelard the understanding is not the object of cognition nor is it object of knowledge (or as with some later nominalists the universal). Knowledge is the habit of having accurate acts of understanding something.

6. Ethics

Abelard’s ethical thought is found primarily in two works, the Ethics, (or Know yourself), and the Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Christian, and a Jew (or Colationes.) Unfortunately neither of these works is complete, and because these are late works, it is not clear whether the missing sections are lost, or were never completed. What we have is the mature thought of a man who had experienced much in life and deeply believed that an ethics based on love, for God and for neighbor, is an integral part of human existence. Abelard had lived an eventful and turbulent life. His ethical writings have an intensity that one would expect from a monk infamous for his careerist pride and his tragic love affair. Like Augustine before him, Abelard understood ethics from both sides.

In the Ethics Abelard develops a form of intentionalism; moral rightness or wrongness is a function of the intentions of the agent. He develops a purely intentionalist account of moral wrongness. Yet in order to avoid the sort of subjectivism or relativism that his account might initially suggest, he asserts a more complicated account of moral rightness. Abelard’s concept of moral rightness and wrongness follows from his belief that God is both goodness and love, and we are thus commanded to love God and neighbor. Good intentions demonstrate love for God and neighbor, bad intentions scorn. Any intention to do what one believes to be wrong shows contempt for God as the source of all love and also contempt of neighbor as the proximate victim of the lack of love. One who intends to do what he believes to be good is, similarly, intending to demonstrate love. Such a person incurs no moral fault, but if he is to be truly morally good his belief must be correct.

Abelard develops a fairly complicated moral psychology in order to isolate exactly what consent and intention are and why these alone incur moral praise or blame. Abelard lists as the components of behavior (a) mental vice, (b) will or desire, (c) pleasure, (d) voluntariness, (e) consent and intention, and (f) the action or deed itself. In most cases the stars align: one has a vice, desires that the vice be satisfied, voluntarily consents with the intention of satisfying this desire, and takes pleasure in the successful completion of the bad act. For Abelard however, the only morally significant component on this list is (e) consent and intention. Each of these other components that make up immoral behavior is irrelevant to the moral assessment of the agent. The structure of Abelard’s argument is clear and direct. He argues that each of these other components is either present in morally good behavior, or absent in immoral behavior and is morally irrelevant.

Consent and intention are thus intimately connected. To consent is simply to give oneself over to what one intends. The intention is the agent’s understanding of what he is consenting to, including: the reasons for engaging in the action, his beliefs about the effects of the action, his evaluation of the morality of the action, and the end or goal the agent hopes to achieve by the action. An intention can in most cases explain why the agent undertook the action. An agent can be said to consent to an action only if he could provide an account of his intention. This is not to say that the account must be a good one. We can and do consent to all manner of actions with foolish and ill-conceived intentions.

Mental vice (a) and will or desire (b) can be dispensed with as sources of moral blame because they are beyond our control. Mental vice is simply the inclination towards evil. Some people are just born with strong natural inclinations to lust or gluttony or anger. Will or desire is a more reflective wanting of what one is inclined towards. It is not in an agent’s power to change the fact that he has vices, wants, and desires. However whether he consents to satisfy the desires is in his control. To experience pleasure (c) is not, of itself, immoral. William of Champeaux had argued that pleasure was the result of our fallen state, in Eden there was no physical pleasure thus any experience of pleasure is immoral. Before the fall sex was no more pleasurable than “putting your finger in your mouth” (Sen. 254). Abelard disagrees. We feel pleasure because God made us in such a way that some things are pleasurable. If pleasure were bad then the fault would lay with God, not us. In a truly strange example Abelard describes a monk, dragged in chains, and forced to have sex with women. Abelard’s monk is drawn by the softness of the bed and the touch of the women into pleasure but not consent. “Who” Abelard writes “can venture to call this pleasure nature has made necessary a sin?” (Spade, 1995: §42)

That the behavior is voluntary (d) is also not a defining characteristic of immoral behavior. This is the point at which Abelard disagrees with many other ethical theorists. Abelard not only believes in involuntary consent but also that we are morally responsible for involuntary consent. As Abelard sees it, much immoral behavior is at a fundamental level irrational and thus not voluntary. When an agent consents to commit adultery he consents to the act without wanting the punishment that necessarily follows. He wants his partner to be unmarried, or he wants the sixth commandment to be repealed. Acting in the hope that the moral laws of the universe will alter and allow an exception, just this once, is irrational. The agent’s consent cannot be fully voluntary because he is consenting to something he knows cannot occur. Abelard argues further that a conflict between first and second order desires makes some behavior involuntary. An alcoholic may have a very strong first order desire to drink. This same alcoholic also has a very strong second order desire, namely, the desire not to desire alcohol. The alcoholic desperately wants a drink; he also desperately wants to be free from this desire for alcohol. When this alcoholic drinks alcohol the behavior is involuntary. He consents to drink. He knows what he is doing and he does it. Even though an agent is deeply confused he can still form an intention and consent to it. Abelard writes that such an agent is “compelled to want what he does not want to want. I don’t see how this consent, that we do not want, can be called voluntary.” (Spade, 1995: §33) Abelard nonetheless still considers it consent. If this account is correct, much immoral behavior will be involuntary but still something for which we are morally responsible.

Finally, Abelard argues that the act itself is morally irrelevant. Several of Abelard’s arguments are reiterations of standard themes. He gives the Platonist/Augustinian claim that the act is irrelevant because nothing outside the soul could possibly harm the soul. He also voices a common enough mediaeval claim that all external events occur either by God’s will or at God’s sufferance, thus all external events are in some way good. He points out that we often act in ignorance. In what may be the first serious use of this defense, Abelard argues that if a man genuinely mistakes another woman for his wife he may physically act but he has not sinned because he did not consent to commit adultery. Conversely, a man who arranges to commit adultery and would follow through has committed adultery even if the woman does not show up.

More significant is Abelard’s argument that external acts may be morally indistinguishable. Acts of “charity” can be done for many reasons other than love. The genuine misanthrope who donates to famine relief believing that death is the end of all pain and intending to increase the sum total of human misery does what is good but is not a good person. Strikingly, Abelard argues that the central event in Christian history, the crucifixion of Christ, was carried out by many agents, some praiseworthy for their participation, some not. Christ is to be praised; his consent to suffer crucifixion was morally right. He intended to do what was pleasing to God by redeeming mankind. Judas played an integral role also, but his consent to betray a man he believed to be the messiah was immoral. Even though his action was a necessary part of God’s plan, Judas acted out of some combination of greed and fear, not out of loving obedience to God’s plan. The Jews were morally blameless. The Jews believed that executing this convicted criminal was required by God. They were acting in accordance to what they believed to be God’s will; to have done otherwise would have been a sin. The event of the Crucifixion was brought about by all these agents acting together. Jesus merits moral praise. He consented to what he believed was pleasing to God and his belief was correct. Judas is morally bad. He consented to what he believed was offensive to God. The Jews are blameless, but not morally good. They consented to what they believed was pleasing to God, but their belief was mistaken. The Jews sinned in act but not in fault: it is worse to sin in fault.

The basic question, “What does it mean to be a good person?”, is still unanswered. To be good one must avoid not only sinning in fault but also sinning in action. One must intend to do what one believes shows love of God and neighbor, and these beliefs must be correct. Presumably Abelard would have offered a fuller account in book II of the Ethics or in the unfinished judgment of the Dialogue. His explanation likely would have relied heavily on his discussion of natural law. Through study of the natural law we can recognize goodness and love without divine revelation. There are precepts of natural law that we can discover and probably ought to know. Abelard discusses several examples to show that one can sin in action (violate the natural law) but not in fault (intentionally violate the natural law). Ignorance of these precepts may exonerate us from fault, but the existence of such precepts also means that there is an objective standard we must achieve in order to be morally good. Merely believing our intentions are good is not enough.

The Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian is really a pair of dialogues, the first between a Philosopher and a Jew, the second between a Christian and a Philosopher. The fictional circumstance is that a Philosopher (identified as a son of Ishmael and so likely a secular Arab, a notable choice some 35 years after the first crusade), a Jew, and a Christian are arguing over the nature of humanity’s ultimate happiness, and the path to this ultimate happiness. Unable to reach a conclusion, the three come to Abelard begging him to act as judge. Abelard’s judgment is missing.

In the dialogue between the Philosopher and the Jew, the Jew claims that the law of the Old Testament is the path to ultimate human happiness. The Jewish conception of the path to ultimate happiness is characterized as an exhaustive list of prescribed ritual and prohibited behavior. For many of the reasons discussed above, the philosopher argues that it is possible to obey all the precepts of the old law and yet intend to scorn and hate God. Explicit behavior is not necessarily reflective of the inner state of one’s soul. The philosopher argues in turn that true happiness must be within our power to acquire and maintain. Since the only thing we have complete control over is our own soul, the basis for happiness must be internal and in our power to attain.

In the dialogue between the Philosopher and the Christian, the Philosopher defends the Stoic claim that ultimate happiness is the state of mental tranquility achieved when one has attained virtue. For the Philosopher, ultimate happiness is achievable in this life by the person who seeks virtue. The Christian argues that ultimate happiness is attainable only in the afterlife, and that it is different from any state attainable without divine grace. The Christian argues for a sort of beatific vision of God, in which those who love God are rewarded with a clear vision of God that inspires more love and hence clearer vision in an ever rising spiral of pure love and spiritual bliss. (Exactly the opposite happens to those who do not love God. They end up in an ever plummeting spiral of hate and loathing. They also suffer some spiritual equivalent of physical pain: the Christian in the dialogue is concerned that a sinner who does not love God may not subjectively suffer from the alienation from God’s love.) The Philosopher is convinced by the Christian’s arguments. Abelard’s judgment is missing but his own view is likely a combination of these two positions, a Christianizing of Stoicism. Seeking and developing virtue is the path to human happiness, but true happiness is not attainable by human means alone. We need grace. Since human virtue requires that we understand and demonstrate love in this life we are primed to receive and accept this grace. True happiness is then the spiritual bliss and tranquility that comes with the ever rising love and understanding of God. Although without the conclusion to the Dialogue it is impossible to know how Abelard would have worked out many of the details.

7. References and Further Reading

a. General Surveys of Abelard’s Philosophical Works

Any one of the following is an excellent place to look for fuller account of Abelard’s thought. Each of these sources also contains a complete list of Abelard’s works in Latin editions.

  • Brower, J., Guilfoy, K. The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Marenbon, J. The Philosophy of Peter Abelard. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
  • Marenbon, J. “The Rediscovery of Peter Abelard’s Philosophy”. Journal of the History of Philosophy 44.3 (2006) 331-351.
  • Mews, C. Abelard and Heloise. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005).

b. Life

  • Abelard, P. Historia calamitatum. B. Radice (trans.), The Letters of Abelard and Heloise. (London: Penguin, 1974).
  • Clanchy, M. T. Abelard: A Medieval Life. (Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1997).
  • Mews, C. Peter Abelard. Authors of the Middle Ages: historical and religious writers of the Latin West. (Aldershot, Hants.: Variorum, 1995).

c. Universals

  • Abelard, P. Logica Ingredientibus commentary of Porphyry’s Isagoge. P Spade (trans.), Five Texts on the Medieval Problem of Universals: Porphyry, Boethius, Abelard, Duns Scotus, Ockham. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994).
  • King, P. Peter Abailard and the Problem of Universals in the Twelfth Century. (Ph.D. Diss. Princeton University, 1982).
  • Tweedale, M. M. Abailard on Universals. (Amsterdam: North-Holland, 1976).

d. Logic, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Mind

There is much scholarly dispute as to how far Abelard intended to take his reductive project in metaphysics, as well as debate about how successful he ultimately was. King 2004 presents Abelard as an extreme “irrealist” about everything except individuals. Marenbon 1997 and 2005 argues for a more moderate reductivism, arguing that there are several items Abelard could not eliminate from his ontology and suggesting it would have been unwise to have tried. Tweedale 1976 describes a category of “non-things” in Abelard’s ontology. These are items that exist but are not individuals. Arlig 2005 draws a distinction between particulars and individuals arguing that everything that exists is particular, that is discrete from everything else, but not everything is an individual.

  • Abelard, P. Logica Ingredientibus commentary on De Interpretatione. Selections on mind and language translated in King 1982: vol ii.
  • Abelard, P. Logica Nostrorum Petitoni Sociorum. Selections on genera and differentia translated in King 1982 vol ii.
  • Abelard, P. Tractatus de Intellectibus (= A Treatise on Understandings). Translated in King 1982, vol ii.
  • Arlig, A. A Study in Early Medieval Mereology: Boethius, Abelard, and Pseudo-Joscelin. (Ph.D. Diss. Ohio State University, 2005).
  • Guilfoy, K. “Mind and Cognition.” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Jacobi, K. “Philosophy of Language” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • King, P. “Metaphysics.” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Kretzmann, N. “The culmination of the old logic in Peter Abelard.” In Renaissance and Renewal in the Twelfth Century, Eds. R. L. Benson and G. Constable, 488–511. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982).
  • Martin C. “Logic.” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).

e. Ethics

  • Abelard, P. Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian (or Collationes). Orlandi, G. and J. Marenbon (trans). Peter Abelard: Collationes. Oxford medieval texts. (Oxford: Clarendon 2001) also translated in Spade 1995.
  • Abelard, P. Ethics (or Scitote Ipsum). trans Spade P. Peter Abelard, Ethical Writings: His Ethics or “Know Yourself” and his Dialogue between a Philosopher, a Jew, and a Christian. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1995).
  • Mann, W. “Ethics.” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • Williams, T. “Sin Grace and Redemption.” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).

f. William of Champeaux

William’s works are not easily accessible. In many cases all that is easily found are excerpts of unedited manuscripts quoted in other sources. Guilfoy 2005 contains a full list of sources for William’s writings. Citations for works cited in this article are provided here.

  • Guilfoy, K. “William of Champeaux.” in Zalta E. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2005 Edition).
  • Iwakuma, Y. “Pierre Abélard et Guillaume de Champeaux dans les premières années du XIIe siècle: Une étude préliminaire,” in Langage, sciences, philosophie au XIIe siècle. Ed. J. Baird. Paris: Vrin, 1999.
  • Marenbon, J. “Life Milieu, and Intellectual Contexts.” In The Cambridge Companion to Peter Abelard. Ed. J. Brower and K. Guilfoy. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004).
  • William of Champeaux. Sententiae, ed. Lottin, O. Psychologie et Morale au XIIe et XIIIe siècles. vol v, (Gembloux: Duculot, 1959).

Author Information

Kevin Guilfoy
Carroll College
U. S. A.