Boredom: A History of Western Philosophical Perspectives
The essayist Joseph Epstein has remarked, “Boredom is after all part of consciousness, and about consciousness the neurologists still have much less to tell us than do the poets and the philosophers.”
Although not a major topic for Western philosophers, some important Western philosophers have spoken of it, and regarded it as a major philosophical theme of human life. They have addressed the following issues: (1) what boredom is, which can be taken as the problem of producing an analysis of the concept of boredom, or as the problem of giving a typology of boredom, or as a phenomenology of the experience of it; (2) what to do about boredom, how to overcome it, lessen it, or learn to live with it; (3) what, if anything, the phenomenon of boredom reveals about matters metaphysical or otherwise deep—for instance, God, being, the meaning of life, human nature, the nature of the self, or the nature of some culture or other; (4) what boredom produces, and what it explains; (5) whether and how boredom represents a fundamental mood or “attunement” to the world for a reflective human being; (6) what the conditions are produce boredom, and what sorts of beings tend to feel it; and (7) ethical issues that relate to the phenomena of boring others and being bored oneself.
Why is boredom a philosophical issue? The preceding sketch should indicate how boredom may be regarded not only as a legitimate philosophical issue but as a major one. Moreover, there are several aspects of the problem of boredom which prevent its exhaustive treatment in a straightforward biological, psychological, sociological, or statistical way. There is a problem of identifying what boredom essentially is—a part of which is the problem of determining whether it is one thing or something that comes in a variety of importantly different forms or modes. Whatever scientific studies may be able to contribute to this problem, progress toward its solution will inevitably require contributions from conceptual and phenomenological investigations. There is also the fact, emphasized by Lars Svendsen, that most people have difficulty saying whether they are bored or not, both at the moment and in general throughout their lives—a fact that points to obvious limitations of statistical studies that begin from survey questions about, say, whether people tend to be bored and what bores them, and issue in claims about boredom’s prevalence, objects, typical conditions, cures, and so forth. Finally, it seems clear that if any academic discipline has much to say concerning the metaphysical or ethical implications of boredom, it is more likely to be philosophy than any of the empirical sciences.
The main philosophical texts on boredom are A Philosophy of Boredom by L. Svendsen, Boredom: A Lively History by the classicist P. Toohey, and Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics by M. Heidegger.
Table of Contents
- Ancient and Medieval Times
- Early Modern Period
- Nineteenth Century
- Twentieth Century
- Philosophical Work since the 1990s
- References and Further Reading
There is a debate among scholars, including philosophers, about how far back in history boredom goes. Several philosophers claim that boredom has always plagued human beings, while others hold that it is peculiarly a malady of the modern world. Those holding the latter view do generally admit, however, that there were pre-modern precursors of boredom. It is with discussion of three of these precursors that this study begins.
Qoheleth (c.200 B.C.E.), traditionally “Solomon”, author of Ecclesiastes, certainly sounds like he is speaking in large part of something like boredom and that he suffers from the condition himself. What we actually get in Ecclesiastes is nothing like a philosophical analysis of boredom or reflections on any deep implications it might have. Rather, we get expressions of the condition itself, partial identification of its causes or reasons, as well as advice concerning how to reduce it, or anyway how to live a halfway decent life in spite of it.
Expressions of boredom or tedium vitae run throughout the book. “Vanity of vanities, all is vanity.” “The eye is not satisfied with seeing, nor the ear with hearing.” “All I labored to do was vanity and vexation of spirit.” “I hated life because all my work was grievous to me.” These are the sounds a seriously bored (and rather depressed) man makes.
The reasons for boredom in Ecclesiastes seem to be primarily that nothing satisfies and the same old things keep getting repeated, within an individual life, and over countless generations. That which has been is now; and that which is to be has already been. There is nothing new under the sun.
And yet there does seem to be a moral Qoheleth draws.
Go thy way, eat thy bread with joy, and drink thy wine with a merry heart . . . . Let thy garments be always white; and let thy head lack no ointment. Live joyfully with the wife whom thou lovest all the days of the life of thy vanity, which he hath given thee under the sun, all the days of thy vanity: for that is thy portion in this life, and in thy labour which thou takest under the sun. Whatsoever thy hand findeth to do, do it with thy might; for there is no work, nor device, nor knowledge, nor wisdom, in the grave, whither thou goest. (King James Version, 9: 7-10)
That is, live life with gusto, and get enjoyment from what you do, if you can. One might well wonder how effective this advice could be to one truly suffering from a bad case of severe boredom.
Lucius Annaeus Seneca (4 BCE – 65 CE), the Roman Stoic philosopher, talks about boredom or tedium in his essay, “On Tranquillity,” addressed to his friend “Serenus”, who always seems to need a lot of advice. Based on some things Serenus says, Seneca apparently thinks his friend is on the verge of lapsing into boredom, or at least has gotten himself into a mode of living that leads straight to it. To the modern reader, Serenus’s confessions do not sound like confessions of anything like boredom.
In any event, Seneca takes them as such and proceeds straightway to the following pronouncement.
All are in the same case, both those, on the one hand, who are plagued with fickleness and boredom and a continual shifting of purpose, and those, on the other, who loll and yawn.
Notice here that Seneca includes two central elements in the phenomenon of boredom. On the one hand there is fickleness and restlessness, and on the other a lack of motivation and interest, a weariness that expresses itself in lolling and yawning. His subsequent remarks provide a pretty apt description of the phenomenology of boredom—what the bored person feels, and how he or she is inclined to act (or fail to act). Seneca shall be quoted at length here because of the delightfulness of his prose and the aptness of his portrait of bored people.
[T]hen creeps in the agitation of a mind which can find no issue, because . . . of the hesitancy of a life which fails to find its way clear, and then the dullness of a soul that lies torpid amid abandoned hopes. And all these tendencies are aggravated when men have taken refuge in solitary studies, which are unendurable to a mind that is intent upon public affairs, desirous of action, and naturally restless, because assuredly it has too few resources within itself. When, therefore, the pleasures have been withdrawn which business itself affords to those who are busily engaged, the mind cannot endure home, solitude, and the walls of a room, and sees with dislike that it has been left to itself.From this comes that boredom, dissatisfaction, the vacillation of a mind that nowhere finds rest, and the sad and languid endurance of one’s leisure.
Thence comes mourning and melancholy and the thousand waverings of an unsettled mind, which its aspirations hold in suspense, and then disappointment renders melancholy. Thence comes that feeling which makes men loathe their own leisure and complain that they themselves have nothing to be busy with.
[T]heir mind becomes incensed against Fortune, and complains of the times, and retreats into corners and broods over its trouble until it becomes weary and sick of itself. For it is the nature of the human mind to be active and prone to movement. Welcome to it is every opportunity for excitement and distraction.
Hence men undertake wide-ranging travel, and wander over remote shores, and their fickleness, always discontented with the present, gives proof of itself now on land and now on sea. They undertake one journey after another and change spectacle for spectacle. They began to be sick of life and the world itself, and [think]: “How long shall I endure the same things?”
You ask what help, in my opinion, should be employed to overcome this tedium. The best course would be . . . to occupy oneself with practical matters, the management of public affairs, and the duties of a citizen.
So what do we get from Seneca that will help us in our attempts to understand boredom? We get three things: first, a rather compelling phenomenological account of what the state is like; second, an indication that it can lead to states worse than itself (for example, melancholy, jealousy, and envy); and, third, some advice about how to eliminate or at least ameliorate the condition, namely, through work and immersion in practical affairs.
Acedia, the “disease that wasteth at noonday” or the demon responsible for the infliction of the disease, was a form of pre-boredom or boredom with sloth that afflicted innumerable practitioners—priests, monks, hermits, and the like—of the religious life in the Christian middle ages. Since our concern here is with philosophical thought on boredom, this fascinating chapter in the book of boredom must be largely passed over. But before it is passed over altogether, it should be noted that there was an ethical overtone to acedia/boredom. The overtone was negative. If God, God’s world, and the life God has ordained for you seem boring to you, there is almost certainly something wrong with your soul, something you had better hasten to fix.
Readers who wish to understand more about acedia should consult the excellent treatment of it in Toohey 2011.
But let us move on to the seventeenth century French philosopher Blaise Pascal (1623-1662). With Pascal, we are in the era of history termed “modernity” or “early modernity” or the “beginning of the modern world.” Pascal treats boredom with more depth, passion, and insight than any of his predecessors. He does this in his book, Pensees, especially in section II “The misery of man without God.”
Most of what we get from Pascal are observations of human nature, or of people in general. His primary and oft-repeated point concerning them is that, without diversions and distractions, human beings are naturally bored. Boredom is the natural state of the human being left to his or her own devices.
Diversion is a dominant theme in Pascal’s thought. People cannot live in quiet, peace, and rest with themselves, and so they seek distractions and diversions to draw away their attention from their own empty selves and lives. The diversions do not really work, and so people find themselves returning again and again to perception of the emptiness and nothingness of their own lives, and to a pervasive sense of ennui or boredom, the fit response to their own emptiness and nothingness.
Pascal’s description of the bored and weary person is apt and insightful. He is noteworthy for the claim that boredom and ennui are the natural state of the human being. But his message is not entirely negative. Boredom is the natural state of a human being without God. A life in relation to an infinite God fills the emptiness of the soul and obliterates the restlessness, weariness, and boredom which naturally afflicts people.
Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) speaks of boredom in passing. His remarks about it occur primarily in his Lectures on Ethics. Kant believes that boredom plagues the person who is inactive and has nothing to do. His cure for it is activity, either work or participation in activities of recreation and diversion. The person who just loafs and does not engage in activity can find no rest at the end of the day, while the one who has been active can.
It is interesting to note that Kant’s solution to boredom does not carry the theological overtones that Pascal’s does. Pascal advises one to overcome boredom by establishing a relationship with God; Kant just recommends activity, whether of work or play.
We now come to a philosopher who makes boredom a centerpiece of his philosophy. He is the great German pessimist Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1870). Several things stand out in Schopenhauer’s treatment of boredom.
First, there is his claim that boredom is one of the twin poles of human life. The other pole is need, want, lack, or desire. Here is the way it works. We feel that we lack something, something we need. We pursue it and, if we are fortunate, capture it. But the capture does not bring the satisfaction we had expected. What we get instead is a strong dose of boredom, and we find ourselves casting about to identify another object of pursuit, somehow convincing ourselves that if we can get it, we will experience satisfaction. Neither want nor boredom is a particularly pleasant state to be in; in fact, both are forms of misery. And so life may be viewed as a pendulum that passes back and forth between one bad state and another.
Second, Schopenhauer offers something like a definition of boredom, a brief analysis of the concept, which may be the first offered in Western thought. Boredom, he says, is a “tame longing without any particular object.”
Third, Schopenhauer offers in addition not just a definition but a substantive account of what boredom is. Boredom, he says, is the sensation of the worthlessness of existence. Boredom may even be regarded as evidence or proof that existence is worthless. If life itself had any real, positive value, there would be no such thing as boredom. Simply being alive would delight us. But, as things are, we can find no modicum of relief from our misery, except when we are diverted or distracted from our lives.
Fourth, Schopenhauer reflects on what boredom or its absence reveals about the intelligence and complexity of the one who suffers from it. His general claim here is that a propensity to be bored is a sign of intelligence. Animals, he speculates, feel very little boredom. Humans are prone to it in proportion to how smart they are. It takes a rich and varied world to hold the interest of a genius, and the real world often doesn’t measure up. As for those who are content with something like mere everyday existence, they are the stupidest of people, not much, if any, above the level of the brutes.
It should be added that there are exceptions in Schopenhauer to his intelligent bored person. One of these is the human being who is lost in the contemplation and enjoyment of art, especially music. The other is the sage, saint, or mystic who has thoroughly denied the will to live and exists in nirvana, or something like it. But very few can even conceive of such a state, let alone achieve it. The vast majority of intelligent people simply have to put up with long stretches of boredom throughout their lives.
Finally, Schopenhauer stresses the seriousness of boredom more than any of his predecessors. It is a form of misery, and a real scourge on the human race. It can lead to the death of the bored one; it can make him or her hang himself or herself. Or, to overcome it, he or she may find himself or herself the instigator of wars, massacres, and murders.
The American Transcendentalist philosopher Henry David Thoreau (1817-1865) does not write about boredom as such at any length. But he does make some remarks about it—he calls it “ennui” or “tedium”—which are striking because they are very nearly the opposite of what Schopenhauer claims about the link between boredom and intelligence, and because they provide one answer to a question that would become prominent in the debates about boredom of later philosophers and other scholars.
Thoreau writes, “Undoubtedly the very tedium and ennui which presume to have exhausted the variety and the joys of life are as old as Adam.” Thoreau here anticipates an issue discussed by philosophers more than a century later. The issue is whether boredom is a natural state that has been around ever since there were humans, or whether it developed, or was invented, in the early modern period and is uniquely an affliction of modernity. Thoreau’s answer is that it is as old as Adam.
Moreover, in contrast to Schopenhauer, Thoreau seems to think that it is those who are less intelligent, less mentally active, and more “asleep” who tend to suffer most from boredom. In his Walden essay “Where I Lived and What I Lived For” Thoreau says:
Moral reform is the effort to throw off sleep. Why is it that men give so poor an account of their day if they have not been slumbering? . . . . The millions are awake enough for physical labor; but only one in a million is awake enough for effective intellectual exertion, only one in a hundred millions to a poetic or divine life. To be awake is to be alive. . . . If we respected only what is inevitable and has a right to be, music and poetry would resound along the streets. When we are unhurried and wise, we perceive that only great and worthy things have any permanent and absolute existence, that petty fears and petty pleasures are but the shadow of the reality. This [reality] is always exhilarating and sublime.
Thoreau’s point about boredom is that it is the state of one of limited mental capacities, or of one “asleep”. An intelligent and alert mind is never bored. In its surroundings there are always a thousand things that are fascinating and sublime. The hum of a mosquito, if alertly attended to, is as fascinating and enthralling as an Iliad or an Odyssey.
The Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855) has several things to say about boredom. Four of them will be mentioned here.
First, Kierkegaard shares with Schopenhauer the idea that boredom is quite a serious matter. He claims at one point that boredom is the root of all evil. The consensus among philosophers is that, while there may be something to this, it is a bit of an exaggeration.
Second, Kierkegaard’s conception of boredom is that it is a kind of nothingness, a nothingness that permeates all reality. He calls it “demonic pantheism”—demonic, because it is that which is empty, pantheism because it is all-pervasive.
Third, in spite of (or because of?) its nature of nothingness, boredom functions as a highly effective impetus to action. This strikes Kierkegaard as something of a paradox. He finds it strange that something as staid and solid—staidness and solidity somehow apparently being compatible with nothingness—as boredom could serve as a motivator and stimulus of action. Desire certainly stimulates to action, which is not so puzzling. But boredom is the opposite of desire, not attraction but repulsion. It is some kind of negative stimulus to action. Hence Kierkegaard speaks of boredom’s action-instigating character as “magical”.
Fourth, for Kierkegaard, boredom is a sort of status symbol. It belongs to persons of rank. He writes, “Those who bore others are the plebeians; . . . those who bore themselves are the chosen ones, the nobility.”
The German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) nowhere gives an extended treatment of boredom as such, but he does speak of it here and there throughout his writings, and much of what he says about it is thought-provoking. Here are some of his especially interesting points.
First, boredom is part of the explanation of Christian, saintly, or ascetic ideals and practices. These ideals are created, and these practices are followed, largely in an attempt to combat boredom. They are ways to fight it, ways to find a remedy for it. In On the Genealogy of Morals Nietzsche writes:
What do ascetic ideals mean? . . . . [A]mong physiologically impaired and peevish people (that is, among the majority of mortals) they are an attempt to imagine themselves as “too good” for this world, a holy form of orgiastic excess, their chief tool in the fight with their enduring pain and boredom.
He makes the same kind of point in The Antichrist:
In Christianity the instincts of the subjugated and oppressed come to the fore: here the lowest classes seek their salvation. The casuistry of sin, self-criticism, the inquisition of the conscience, are pursued as a pastime, as a remedy for boredom.
Second, boredom explains not only saints and ascetics. It explains virtually everything. In The Antichrist, Nietzsche says that, according to the story in Genesis at the beginning of the Bible, the old God is bored. So he invents man. Man is entertaining to God, but man himself is bored. God then creates animals for him to play with, but they do not entertain him. So, God creates woman.
If he is serious here, Nietzsche implies that, according to the Biblical story anyway, boredom is powerful indeed. It gave rise to the entire human and animal world!
Third, Nietzsche sometimes speaks positively of boredom. He agrees with Schopenhauer that boredom is a sign of vitality and intelligence in the one who has it. Anticipating Heidegger, Nietzsche says that a person who blocks all boredom from his or her life also blocks access to his or her deepest self and the water that flows from its fountain. In another place, Nietzsche makes a claim about boredom that would make it sound like a good thing to many of us, if not to Nietzsche himself. The claim is that, although normally we look away from those who are suffering, we sometimes attend to them and help them in order to rid ourselves of our own boredom.
But, fourth, Nietzsche also speaks of boredom as something we do not want. In Beyond Good and Evil he writes:
[L]et us be careful lest out of pure honesty we eventually become saints and bores! Is not life a hundred times too short for us—to bore ourselves?
Finally, an amusing remark of Nietzsche’s in his late Twilight of the Idols—which, unfortunately may have some truth in it—is worth quoting:
“What is the task of all higher education?” To turn men into machines. “What are the means?” Man must learn to be bored. “How is that accomplished?” By means of the concept of duty. “Who serves as the model?” The philologist: he teaches grinding.
The American Pragmatist philosopher and psychologist William James (1842-1910) has a couple of interesting things to say about boredom in “The Perception of Time,” Chapter XV of his massive Principles of Psychology (1890).
First, James tells us what boredom is and the conditions under which it arises. Boredom, he says, is an experience or sensation that “comes about whenever, from the relative emptiness of content of a tract of time, we grow attentive to the passage of the time itself.” When bored, you attend closely to the mere feeling of time per se.
Second, James notes that the experience of boredom is unpleasant, even odious, and he offers an explanation of why that is so. The odiousness of the experience of boredom arises from its insipidity. The feeling of bare time is the least stimulating experience we can have, and stimulation is a necessary component for any pleasure we might find in, or get from, an experience. James quotes with apparent approval the statement of another psychologist who says that “the sensation of tedium is a protest against the entire present.”
The great British analytic philosopher Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) devotes an entire chapter of his popular book The Conquest of Happiness (1930) to boredom. The chapter is rich in ideas, despite some apparent confusion.
Russell offers a view of what boredom essentially is. “Boredom,” he says, “is essentially a thwarted desire for events.” And besides this thwarted desire, there are two additional essentials of boredom. One is a contrast between present circumstances and some other more agreeable circumstances which force themselves irresistibly upon the imagination. The other is that one’s faculties must not be fully occupied. The opposite of boredom is excitement.
Russell moreover begins the tradition of distinguishing different kinds of boredom (unless we can regard Seneca as the initiator of the tradition). Russell’s distinction is rather odd. The two kinds of boredom are the kind that arises from the absence of drugs and the kind that arises from the absence of vital activity.
There are at least two things in this account that many philosophers would take issue with. Those who think of boredom as a kind of empty longing, or a tame longing without an object, or a desire for a desire, would not accept Russell’s suggestion that in boredom circumstances other than the bored person’s present ones force themselves irresistibly upon his or her imagination. And some philosophers would think it obvious that the opposite of boredom is not excitement but interest. An excited person is no doubt interested in something, but a person whose interest is captured by something need not be excited by anything. It seems wrong to consider a person who is interested in something (for example, the crossword puzzle she is quietly working) as bored just because at the moment there is nothing in her that is exactly excitement.
Russell surmises that boredom (or fear of it and a desire to get rid of it) has been a great motivator throughout human history. It has produced wars, persecutions, quarrels with neighbors, and witch-hunts. Russell even speculates that “more than half” of the sins of humankind have been caused by fear of boredom.
Russell observes that boredom is unpleasant and thus it is natural to want to get rid of it. There is a deep-seated desire for excitement in human beings.
But boredom is not all bad. Some boredom may be a necessary ingredient in life. In fact, Russell says that a certain power of enduring boredom is essential to a happy life. He even claims that:
All great books contain boring portions, and all great lives have contained uninteresting stretches. . . .[A] quiet life is characteristic of great men, and . . . their pleasures have not been of the sort that would look exciting to the outward eye. No great achievement is possible without persistent work, so absorbing and so difficult that little energy is left over for the more strenuous kinds of amusement.
The idea is apparently that great lives require those who live them to endure a lot of quietness and boredom; and the same must be endured by those who make great achievements.
One issue spoken much of in the twentieth century interdisciplinary literature on boredom is that of whether there is more or less boredom in the modern era than in previous times. The usual claim is that there is more boredom in modernity, that is, now. Russell weighs in on this issue and offers the suggestion that there is actually less boredom now than in prior eras. Here is his view. Long ago, in the hunting stage of humanity, there was much excitement and little boredom. Early man was constantly involved in exciting activities that kept him entertained—hunting, fighting, courting, and so forth. But then several centuries ago the agricultural era began, an era that lasted right up to the modern period. Life in the agricultural era was incredibly boring. Work in the fields was generally solitary and repetitive. Life at home in the evenings was as dull as could be. There was no electricity; there were no books, music, or movies; there wasn’t much of anything to do except hunt occasionally for witches. The farmer and his family lived lives of perpetual boredom. But things changed drastically with the coming of the machine age and advances in technology. True, factory workers’ jobs are repetitive and sometimes tedious. But at least the workers usually have company. And during their time off work, there are many things for them to do. Modern life is much less boring than it was for centuries in the agricultural past.
Russell wrote this in 1930. It’s pretty clear that he would say that life is even less boring in the current computer and iPhone age. Most people simply aren’t bored very often these days. They have much excitement and little boredom.
But Russell makes this observation. Although we experience less boredom than our ancestors did, we are more afraid of boredom than they were. They just accepted it; we think that an ideal human life should be completely free of boredom. We tend to think that boredom is not a part of a natural human life.
And so many of us seek one exciting stimulation after another. Russell thinks that this approach to life won’t work. Too much excitement leads to the need for more and more excitement, which results in the end in the inability to be excited at all—and also in the inability to experience many or most of the joys of life. A too zealous quest for excitement leads, paradoxically, to boredom.
Russell isn’t opposed to the pursuit of excitement altogether. If it is engaged in only rarely and then in moderation, it can contribute greatly to the happiness of a life. But in the end Russell recommends a quiet life, one in sync with “the rhythm of the earth”. “A happy life,” he says, “must be to a great extent a quiet life, for it is only in an atmosphere of quiet that true joy can live.”
Russell sometimes speaks as though, in recommending a quiet life, what he is recommending is a life that contains a large amount of boredom. But there may be some confusion on his part here. It seems clear that what he is really recommending is a life that looks boring from the outside, and would be boring to one who needed a lot of stimulation and excitement to be happy, not a life that is boring to the one living it. For the quiet life is one of true joy.
The German philosopher Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) discusses boredom at length in his 1929-30 lecture series The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics. What Heidegger says there will be the focus of the present summary of his conception of boredom and its significance.
This summary can be little more than a sketch—for several reasons: Heidegger’s treatment of boredom is complex and subject to various interpretations; it cannot be fully understood apart from the vast body of his philosophical work as a whole; and much of it is couched in technical terminology, or in ordinary terms to which Heidegger gives special meanings, which makes it difficult to render into readily intelligible English prose.
But we can say the following things with some confidence. They will necessarily be disjointed. Their relationship is unclear even to many of Heidegger’s close readers.
(1) Heidegger writes about boredom more than any other major philosopher, and perhaps he sees it as having a greater significance than any other major thinker has seen it as having.
(2) The central concept of Heidegger’s philosophy is Dasein, literally, “being there”. Dasein is the kind of being we are. We are beings who are there, in the world. Throughout his long academic career, Heidegger was preoccupied with the question of the meaning of being. In everyday German language the word “Dasein” means “life” or “existence.” Dasein, that being which we ourselves are, is distinguished from all other beings by the fact that it makes an issue of its own being. As Da-sein, it is the location, “Da”, for the disclosure of being, “Sein.”
(3) Fundamental moods or “attunements” figure prominently in Heidegger’s thought. They reveal Being to us. But moods are not to be thought of as mere subjective feelings, inner happenings, or responses to objective facts. A mood is neither internal or external; a mood goes beyond such a distinction and is a basic characteristics of being-in-the-world. It is by way of a mood that we relate to our surroundings. Moods have epistemic as well as merely subjective significance. They reveal the world to us as much or more than our senses do.
(4) Boredom, Langeweile, is a fundamental attunement, a mood. Along with anxiety, it is one of the most important and profound ones. Heidegger makes a distinction between being bored with something and boring oneself with something. The latter is a more profound and useful form of boredom. There may be an even more profound form of boredom. Normally, it is there, in us, but asleep. Heidegger wants to wake it up.
(5) Heidegger wants to awaken boredom rather than let it slumber through various forms of everyday pastime. Boredom, and we ourselves, are asleep in our everyday pastimes in our actual life. We like being asleep. We like lives of slumbering distractions. We seek to be occupied because it liberates us from the emptiness of boredom. But why on earth would we want to wake up, and especially to awaken in a mood as dreary and empty as boredom? Boredom removes an illusion of meaning from things and allows them to appear as what they are: emptiness and nothingness. Who in her right mind would want to remove such an illusion?
(6) Heidegger’s main answer to these questions may be: Boredom prepares the mind for profound vision. Svendsen writes:
By awakening the mood of boredom Heidegger believes we will be in a position to gain access to time and the meaning of being. For Heidegger, boredom is a privileged fundamental mood because it leads us directly into the very problem complex of being and time.
Profound boredom can set us on the road to authenticity. When boredom works its magic, what is left is nothing less than Being itself and its meaning—if it has any. But Dasein is still there, and Being can reveal itself to Dasein.
(7) Heidegger has other answers to the questions raised above (about why one would want boredom and its insights). Here are two of them: (a) accompanying sober boredom is a strange kind of calm joy; and (b) “[p]hilosophy is born in the nothingness of boredom.”
(8) Finally, let us mention three of Heidegger’s points about boredom that have some interest in their own right. They are: (a) normally time is transparent, but in profound boredom we experience time as time; (b) boredom is a mood that in many respects is like an absence of mood; it is indeed a mood, a fundamental attunement, but it is also, paradoxically, a kind of a non-mood; and (c) Heidegger’s answer to the question of what exactly in the world it is that bores us is that it is the Boring. Wrestling with these three claims, wondering if they make sense and, if they do, what sense it is, would make a fit pastime for whiling away a slow slumbering evening.
The prominent English moral philosopher Williams Bernard ‘s (1929- 2003) famous essay, “The Makropulos Case: Reflections on the Tedium of Immortality,” is not about the nature of boredom as such. Its thesis is, roughly, that it would not be a good thing to live forever, for eventually immortal life would become boring. But in the essay, Williams makes several important points about boredom.
Williams’s conception of boredom is apparent from his language. He thinks of boredom as indifference, detachment, coldness, and inner death.
Long-lasting sameness is what brings it on. Williams explores the issue by reference to his test case, a woman called “EM” in a play Williams uses as a springboard for his reflections. EM had taken an elixir at age 42 which kept her at 42 and continued to do so every year she took it. At the time of the action in the play, EM has been 42 for 300 years, and she is bored to death. She refuses this time to take the elixir, and she dies. EM’s boredom is connected with the fact that everything that could happen and make sense to one particular human being had already happened to her.
One implication of this is that, in Williams’s view, boredom is a rather serious thing that can motivate, not suicide exactly, but the choice of death over life.
Williams seems to think that EM’s boredom (and consequent choice of death over life) is entirely understandable, proper, and fitting.
In all this there is the idea, stated more or less explicitly at certain points, that there are circumstances in which one ought to be seriously bored. Not being bored suggests an impoverishment in one’s consciousness of her circumstances. Williams writes that, “not being bored can be a sign of not noticing or not reflecting enough.” So, Williams may think that sometimes we have a moral, or more broadly ethical, or still more broadly human, reason to be bored. There are times when we ought to be bored, and not being so represents some kind of ethical, intellectual, or human failure.
It is impossible to do justice here to current writing on boredom. Work on it by philosophers (and others) is thriving. The major philosophical work, as has been mentioned, is Svendsen’s Philosophy of Boredom. Other important works are: Toohey’s Boredom: A Lively History; the Routledge Boredom Studies Reader: Frameworks and Perspectives, edited by M. E. Gardiner and J. J. Haladyn, a rich anthology by a diverse group of contributors exploring multiple issues, many of them philosophical, that the phenomenon of boredom raises; W. O’Brien’s “Boredom” in the 2014 volume of the journal Analysis; and several works on boredom by Andreas Elpidorou, probably the most prolific and certainly one of the most interesting of the writers on the subject at present. Only two of the issues in the current debate will be mentioned here.
First, there is discussion about the question of whether there really is such a thing as “existential” or “profound” boredom (as distinct from everyday situative boredom, whose reality nobody questions). Svendsen, following Heidegger, argues that existential boredom is indeed real and important. Toohey, in contrast, denies that there is any such state, arguing that what has been misidentified as such is actually a particular form of depression. Although there are exceptions, “analytical” philosophers tend to side with Toohey on this matter while “continental” philosophers tend to side with Svendsen. (Perhaps this is due to the great influence of Heidegger on continental thought, an influence largely absent in analytical circles.)
Second, an analysis of the concept of boredom has been proposed by Wendell O’Brien in the journal Analysis. O’Brien suggests that boredom is an unpleasant or undesirable mental state of weariness, restlessness, and lack of interest in something to which one is subjected, a state in which the weariness and restlessness are causally connected in some way to the lack of interest. The extent to which O’Brien’s analysis is satisfactory remains to be seen. Those on the Toohey side of the disagreement just mentioned are likely to accept something like it. Those on the Svendsen side are likely to find it deeply problematic, though they may concede that some variation of the sort of analysis O’Brien proposes might capture the notion of everyday situational boredom.
If the reader wishes to pursue study of this current work, it is suggested that he or she begin by consulting post-1990 sources listed in the “References and Further Reading” below.
- Ecclesiastes. KJV.
- Elpidorou, A. 2014. “The Bright Side of Boredom,” Frontiers in Psychology 5: 1245.
- Elpidorou, A. 2016. “The Significance of Boredom: A Sartrean Reading,” in Philosophy of Mind and Phenomenology: Conceptual and Empirical Approaches, ed. D. O. Dahlstrom, A. Elpidorou, and W. Hopp, pp. 268-285. London: Routledge
- Frankfurt, H. 1999. “On the Usefulness of Final Ends,” in Necessity, Volition, and Love, 82-94. Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Gardiner, M. E. and J. J. Haladyn, eds. 2016. Boredom Studies Reader: Frameworks and Perspectives. London: Routledge.
- Healy, S. D. 1984. Boredom, Self, and Culture. Madison, N. J.: Fairleigh Dickinson University Press.
- Heidegger, M. 1995. The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, W. McNeill & N. Walker trans. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- James, W. 1890. The Principles of Psychology. (Now in the public domain and readily accessible online.)
- Kant, I. 1963. Lectures on Ethics, Louis Infield trans. London: Harper & Row.
- Kierkegaard, S. 1992. Either/Or, Alastair Hannay trans. & abridged. London: Penguin Books.
- Lombardo, N. E. 2017. “Boredom and Modern Culture,” Logos: A Journal of Catholic Thought and Culture, 20: 2, 36-59.
- Millgram, E. 2004. “On Being Bored Out of Your Mind,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, Vol. 104, pp. 165-186.
- Nietzsche, F. 1954. The Portable Nietzsche, W. Kaufmann trans. & ed. New York: Viking Penguin.
- Nietzsche, F. 1968. Basic Writings of Nietzsche, W. Kaufmann trans. & ed. New York: The Modern Library, Random House.
- O’Brien, W. 2014. “Boredom,” Analysis 74:2, 236-243.
- Pascal, B. 1958. Pensees, W. F. Trotter trans. New York: E. P. Dutton.
- Raposa, M. L. 1999. Boredom and the Religious Imagination. Charlottesville: University of Virginia Press.
- Russell, B. 1930. The Conquest of Happiness. London: Liveright.
- Schopenhauer, A. 1970. Essays and Aphorisms, R. J. Hollingdale trans. London: Penguin Books.
- Seneca, L. 1917. Epistles: Vols. IV-VI. Loeb Classical Library, R. M. Gummere, trans. Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press.
- Spacks, P. M. 1995. Boredom: The Literary History of a State of Mind. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
- Svendsen, L. 2005. A Philosophy of Boredom, John Irons trans. London: Reaktion Books.
- Thoreau, H. 1983. Walden and Civil Disobedience. New York: Penguin Books. (Originally published in 1854.)
- Toohey, P. 2011. Boredom: A Lively History. New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Williams, B. 1973. “The Makropulos Case: Reflections on the Tedium of Immortality,” in Problems of the Self, pp. 81-100. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Yao, V. 2015. “Boredom and the Divided Mind,” Res Philosophica, 92:4, 937-957.
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