Deductive and Inductive Arguments

When assessing the quality of an argument, we ask how well its premises support its conclusion. More specifically, we ask whether the argument is either deductively valid or inductively strong.

deductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer to be deductively valid, that is, to provide a guarantee of the truth of the conclusion provided that the argument’s premises are true. This point can be expressed also by saying that, in a deductive argument, the premises are intended to provide such strong support for the conclusion that, if the premises are true, then it would be impossible for the conclusion to be false. An argument in which the premises do succeed in guaranteeing the conclusion is called a (deductively) valid argument. If a valid argument has true premises, then the argument is said also to be sound. All arguments are either valid or invalid, and either sound or unsound; there is no middle ground, such as being somewhat valid.

Here is a valid deductive argument:

It’s sunny in Singapore. If it’s sunny in Singapore, then he won’t be carrying an umbrella. So, he won’t be carrying an umbrella.

The conclusion follows the word “So”. The two premises of this argument would, if true, guarantee the truth of the conclusion. However, we have been given no information that would enable us to decide whether the two premises are both true, so we cannot assess whether the argument is deductively sound. It is one or the other, but we do not know which. If it turns out that the argument has a false premise and so is unsound, this won’t change the fact that it is valid.

Here is a mildly strong inductive argument:

Every time I’ve walked by that dog, it hasn’t tried to bite me. So, the next time I walk by that dog it won’t try to bite me.

An inductive argument is an argument that is intended by the arguer to be strong enough that, if the premises were to be true, then it would be unlikely that the conclusion is false. So, an inductive argument’s success or strength is a matter of degree, unlike with deductive arguments. There is no standard term for a successful inductive argument, but this article uses the term “strong.” Inductive arguments that are not strong are said to be weak; there is no sharp line between strong and weak. The argument about the dog biting me would be stronger if we couldn’t think of any relevant conditions for why the next time will be different than previous times. The argument also will be stronger the more times there were when I did walk by the dog. The argument will be weaker the fewer times I have walked by the dog. It will be weaker if relevant conditions about the past time will be different next time, such as that in the past the dog has been behind a closed gate, but next time the gate will be open.

An inductive argument can be affected by acquiring new premises (evidence), but a deductive argument cannot be. For example, this is a reasonably strong inductive argument:

Today, John said he likes Romona.
So, John likes Romona today.

but its strength is changed radically when we add this premise:

John told Felipé today that he didn’t really like Romona.

The distinction between deductive and inductive argumentation was first noticed by the Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) in ancient Greece. The difference between deductive and inductive arguments does not lie in the words used within the arguments, but rather in the intentions of the arguer. It comes from the relationship the arguer takes there to be between the premises and the conclusion. If the arguer believes that the truth of the premises definitely establishes the truth of the conclusion, then the argument is deductive. If the arguer believes that the truth of the premises provides only good reasons to believe the conclusion is probably true, then the argument is inductive. If we who are assessing  the quality of the argument have no information about the intentions of the arguer, then we check for both. That is, we assess the argument to see whether it is deductively valid and whether it is inductively strong.

The concept of deductive validity can be given alternative definitions to help you grasp the concept. Below are five different definitions of the same concept. It is common to drop the word deductive from the term deductively valid:

  1. An argument is valid if the premises can’t all be true without the conclusion also being true.
  2. An argument is valid if the truth of all its premises forces the conclusion to be true.
  3. An argument is valid if it would be inconsistent for all its premises to be true and its conclusion to be false.
  4. An argument is valid if its conclusion follows with certainty from its premises.
  5. An argument is valid if it has no counterexample, that is, a possible situation that makes all the premises true and the conclusion false.

Some analysts prefer to distinguish inductive arguments from “conductive” arguments; the latter are arguments giving explicit reasons for and against a conclusion, and requiring the evaluator of the argument to weigh these competing considerations, that is, to consider the pros and cons. This article considers conductive arguments to be a kind of inductive argument.

The noun “deduction” refers to the process of advancing or establishing a deductive argument, or going through a process of reasoning that can be reconstructed as a deductive argument. “Induction” refers to the process of advancing an inductive argument, or making use of reasoning that can be reconstructed as an inductive argument.

Although inductive strength is a matter of degree, deductive validity and deductive soundness are not. In this sense, deductive reasoning is much more cut and dried than inductive reasoning. Nevertheless, inductive strength is not a matter of personal preference; it is a matter of whether the premise ought to promote a higher degree of belief in the conclusion.

Because deductive arguments are those in which the truth of the conclusion is thought to be completely guaranteed and not just made probable by the truth of the premises, if the argument is a sound one, then we say the conclusion is “contained within” the premises; that is, the conclusion does not go beyond what the premises implicitly require. Think of sound deductive arguments as squeezing the conclusion out of the premises within which it is hidden. For this reason, deductive arguments usually turn crucially upon definitions and rules of mathematics and formal logic.

Consider how the rules of formal logic apply to this deductive argument:

John is ill. If John is ill, then he won’t be able to attend our meeting today. Therefore, John won’t be able to attend our meeting today.

That argument is valid due to its formal or logical structure. To see why, notice that if the word ‘ill’ were replaced with ‘happy’, the argument would still be valid because it would retain its special logical structure (called modus ponens by logicians). Here is the form of any argument having the structure of modus ponens:


If P, then Q

So, Q

The capital letters should be thought of as variables that can be replaced with declarative sentences, or statements, or propositions, namely items that are true or false. The investigation of logical forms that involve whole sentences and not their subjects and verbs and other parts is called Propositional Logic.

The question of whether all, or merely most, valid deductive arguments are valid because of their logical structure is still controversial in the field of the philosophy of logic, but that question will not be explored further in this article.

Inductive arguments can take very wide-ranging forms. Some have the form of making a claim about a population or set based only on information from a sample of that population, a subset. Other inductive arguments draw conclusions by appeal to evidence, or authority, or causal relationships. There are other forms.

Here is a somewhat strong inductive argument having the form of an argument based on authority:

The police said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is an inductive argument based on evidence:

The witness said John committed the murder. So, John committed the murder.

Here is a stronger inductive argument based on better evidence:

Two independent witnesses claimed John committed the murder. John’s fingerprints are on the murder weapon. John confessed to the crime. So, John committed the murder.

This last argument, if its premises are known to be true, is no doubt good enough for a jury to convict John, but none of these three arguments about John committing the murder is strong enough to be called “valid,” at least not in the technical sense of deductively valid. However, some lawyers will tell their juries that these are valid arguments, so we critical thinkers need to be on the alert as to how people around us are using the term “valid.” You have to be alert to what they mean rather than what they say. From the barest clues, the English detective Sherlock Holmes cleverly “deduced” who murdered whom, but actually he made only an educated guess. Strictly speaking, he produced an inductive argument and not a deductive one. Charles Darwin, who discovered the process of evolution, is famous for his “deduction” that circular atolls in the oceans are actually coral growths on the top of barely submerged volcanoes, but he really performed an induction, not a deduction.

It is worth noting that some dictionaries and texts define “deduction” as reasoning from the general to specific and define “induction” as reasoning from the specific to the general. However, there are many inductive arguments that do not have that form, for example, “I saw her kiss him, really kiss him, so I’m sure she’s having an affair.”

The mathematical proof technique called “mathematical induction” is deductive and not inductive. Proofs that make use of mathematical induction typically take the following form:

Property P is true of the natural number 0.
For all natural numbers n, if P holds of n then P also holds of n + 1.
Therefore, P is true of all natural numbers.

When such a proof is given by a mathematician, and when all the premises are true, then the conclusion follows necessarily. Therefore, such an inductive argument is deductive. It is deductively sound, too.

Because the difference between inductive and deductive arguments involves the strength of evidence which the author believes the premises provide for the conclusion, inductive and deductive arguments differ with regard to the standards of evaluation that are applicable to them. The difference does not have to do with the content or subject matter of the argument, nor with the presence or absence of any particular word. Indeed, the same utterance may be used to present either a deductive or an inductive argument, depending on what the person advancing it believes. Consider as an example:

Dom Perignon is a champagne, so it must be made in France.

It might be clear from context that the speaker believes that having been made in the Champagne area of France is part of the defining feature of “champagne” and so the conclusion follows from the premise by definition. If it is the intention of the speaker that the evidence is of this sort, then the argument is deductive. However, it may be that no such thought is in the speaker’s mind. He or she may merely believe that nearly all champagne is made in France, and may be reasoning probabilistically. If this is his or her intention, then the argument is inductive.

As noted, the distinction between deductive and inductive has to do with the strength of the justification that the arguer intends that the premises provide for the conclusion. Another complication in our discussion of deduction and induction is that the arguer might intend the premises to justify the conclusion when in fact the premises provide no justification at all. Here is an example:

All odd numbers are integers.
All even numbers are integers.
Therefore, all odd numbers are even numbers.

This argument is invalid because the premises provide no support whatsoever for the conclusion. However, if this argument were ever seriously advanced, we must assume that the author would believe that the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. Therefore, this argument is still deductive. It is not inductive.

Given the way the terms “deductive argument” and “inductive argument” are defined here, an argument is always one or the other and never both, but in deciding which one of the two it is, it is common to ask whether it meets both the deductive standards and inductive standards. Given a set of premises and their intended conclusion, we analysts will ask whether it is deductively valid, and, if so, whether it is also deductively sound. If it is not deductively valid, then we may go on to assess whether it is inductively strong.

We are very likely to use the information that the argument is not deductively valid to ask ourselves what premises, if they were to be assumed, would make the argument be valid. Then we might ask whether these premises were implicit and intended originally. Similarly, we might ask what premises are needed to improve the strength of an inductive argument, and we might ask whether these premises were intended all along. If so, then we change our mind about what argument existed was back in the original passage. So, the application of deductive and inductive standards is used in the process of extracting the argument from the passage within which it is embedded. The process goes like this: Extract the argument from the passage; assess it with deductive and inductive standards; perhaps revise the decision about which argument existed in the original passage; then reassess this new argument using our deductive and inductive standards.

Implicit premises and implicit features of explicit premises can play important roles in argument evaluation. Suppose we want to know whether Julius Caesar did conquer Rome. In response, some historian might point out that it could be concluded with certainty from these two pieces of information:

The general of the Roman Legions of Gaul crossed the Rubicon River and conquered Rome.

Caesar was the general of the Roman Legions in Gaul at that time.

That would produce a valid argument. But now notice that, if “at that time” were missing from the second piece of information, then the argument would not be valid. Here is why. Maybe Caesar was the general at one time, but Tiberius was the general at the time of the river crossing and Rome conquering. If the phrase “at that time” were missing, you the analyst have to worry about how likely it is that the phrase was intended. So, you are faced with two arguments, one valid and one invalid, and you don’t know which is the intended argument.

See also the articles on “Argument” and “Validity and Soundness” in this encyclopedia.

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