Epistemic Conditions of Moral Responsibility
What conditions on a person’s knowledge must be satisfied in order for them to be morally responsible for something they have done? The first two decades of the twenty-first century saw a surge of interest in this question. Must an agent, for example, be aware that their conduct is all-things-considered wrong to be blameworthy for it? Or could something weaker than this epistemic state suffice, such as having a mere belief in the act’s wrong-making features, or having the mere capacity for awareness of these features? Notice that these questions are not reducible to the question of whether moral responsibility for something requires free will or control over it. Initially, then, it is worth treating the epistemic condition (otherwise known as the “cognitive” or “knowledge” condition) on moral responsibility as distinct from the control condition. As we shall see, however, some make it part of the control condition.
This article introduces the epistemic conditions of moral responsibility. It starts by clarifying the parameters of the topic and then the two most significant debates in the epistemic condition literature: (1) the debate on whether blameworthiness for wrongdoing requires awareness of wrongdoing, and (2) the debate on whether responsibility for the consequences of our behaviour requires foreseeing those consequences. The bulk of the rest of the article is devoted to an overview of each debate, and it closes with a consideration of future directions for research on the epistemic condition—especially concerning moral praiseworthiness, collective responsibility, and criminal liability.
Table of Contents
- The Epistemic Conditions: The Topic
- The Epistemic Conditions of Culpable Misconduct
- The Epistemic Conditions of Derivative Responsibility
- Future Areas for Research
- References and Further Reading
The epistemic conditions of moral responsibility specify an epistemic property (or set of properties) of the agent that the agent must possess in order to be morally responsible for an act, attitude, trait, or event. “Epistemic” is understood loosely to mean “cognitive” or “intellectual.” The sense of “responsibility” here is, of course, to be distinguished from the sense of responsibility as a baseline moral capacity (being a “morally responsible agent”), as a virtue (“she is very responsible child”), or as a role or obligation (having “the responsibility” to do something). The relevant sense of responsibility is the one involved in being held responsible for something, implying accountability, or eligibility for praise or blame for that thing. Moreover, nearly every theorist of the epistemic condition takes the “backward-looking” perspective on accountability that praise or blame is fitting only in response to something that is about them or what they have done in the past, rather than fitting for the purposes of bringing about good consequences (as on “forward-looking” views).
The topic of the epistemic condition actually has a rather large scope. For anything X that we can be held responsible for—whether X is an act, omission, mental state, character trait, event, or state of affairs—we might be concerned with the epistemic conditions of responsibility in general, for X, or the epistemic conditions of praiseworthiness or blameworthiness in particular, for X. Moreover, we might be concerned with different degrees of responsibility (blameworthiness, etc.) and different modes of responsibility for X. For modes of responsibility, direct/original/non-derivative responsibility for X is obtained when all the conditions on responsibility are fulfilled at the time of X, whereas derivative/indirect responsibility for X is obtained when one or more conditions are not fulfilled at the time of X but are fulfilled at some suitable prior time. When responsibility is derivative, we talk of “tracing” responsibility back to that prior time. Finally, we might even be interested in more than one concept of responsibility for X (Watson 1996).
Concerning the epistemic condition itself, relevant epistemic states in the agent could include beliefs, credences, or capacities to have those beliefs or credences. With respect to X, the content of these epistemic states could include:
- that one is doing or causing or possesses (etc.) X;
- that X has a certain moral significance (for example, “is wrong”) or has features that make it morally significant (for example, harms others);
- that X has an alternative Y;
- that X could cause some consequence Y;
- that W is how to perform X; and
- any combinations of the above.
There is also an important distinction between occurrent and dispositional beliefs/credences. Occurrent beliefs are consciously thought, considered, or felt, whereas dispositional beliefs are not occurrent but are disposed to be occurrent under certain conditions. Finally, often the concepts of knowledge, awareness, foresight, and ignorance are used in the literature to refer to relevant epistemic states. While the traditional view is that ignorance is the lack of knowledge and that awareness is knowledge (or justified true belief), recent theorists of the epistemic condition take true belief to be necessary and sufficient for awareness, and they identify ignorance as the lack of true belief, the opposite of awareness (Peels 2010; Rosen 2008; Rudy-Hiller 2017). Partly for this reason, and for the reason that there is a plausible argument for thinking that the lack of knowledge (even justified true belief) that an act is wrong is no excuse for performing wrongdoing if one still believes that it is wrong (Rosen 2008), positions in the literature tend not to be couched in terms of knowledge. Like awareness, foresight (of consequences) tends to be analysed in terms of true belief as well (Zimmerman 1986).
It is clear, then, how wide the topic of the epistemic condition could be. But given the typical focus in responsibility studies on blame, rather than praise, and on actions/omissions and their consequences, it is unsurprising that the current focus of the debate has been on blameworthiness for actions/omissions and their consequences. Moreover, given the conceptual links between culpable conduct (that is, conduct for which one is blameworthy) and wrongful conduct, or conduct that is bad in some other way (for example, the “suberogatory”; McKenna 2012, 182-3), the focus has largely been on whether awareness of our conduct’s wrongfulness (or badness) is required to be blameworthy for performing it (Section 2). Partly because some views in this debate invoke the notion of blameworthiness for consequences of our conduct, too, there is also an interrelated literature on whether, and if so, what kind of epistemic condition must be satisfied to be culpable for the bad consequences of our conduct (Section 3).
The focus on whether awareness of wrongdoing is necessary for blameworthiness has also been spurred on by interest in the revisionary implications of a view known as “volitionism” or “strong internalism” (see Strong Internalism (aka Volitionism) below). The revisionary implications in question are that we should revise most of our ordinary judgments and practices of blame. There are also views on the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility (in particular, Foresight and Foreseeability Views) that have similar sorts of revisionary implications that have been brought to the attention of philosophers in the debate on derivative responsibility (cf. Vargas 2005). Not surprisingly, many of the positions in these debates have been offered as attempts to avoid these revisionary implications and vindicate our ordinary judgments and practices of blame. In recent times, though, discussion of the relative merits of these non- or semi-revisionary views has come to take centre stage, and the literature will undoubtedly continue to move away from the question of how to respond to revisionism (see Section 4 Future Areas for Research).
What are the epistemic conditions on blameworthiness for wrongful (or bad) conduct? A useful initial way to carve up the literature on this question is to divide views into culpability internalist and culpability externalist kinds. This is, of course, to use terminology familiar to theorists of rationality, motivation, knowledge, and epistemic justification. But internalist/externalist terminology is not without some precedent in the literature on the epistemic condition (Husak 2016; Wieland 2017; Cloos 2018), even though the distinction is not often clearly defined. Let us define culpability internalism as follows:
An agent is non-derivatively (directly, or originally) blameworthy for some conduct X only if, at the time of X, the agent possesses a belief/credence concerning X’s badness or X’s bad-making features (or a higher-order belief/credence about the need to have the capacity to form such a belief/credence).
(The qualification in parentheses becomes relevant when we discuss Capacitarian Views below.) Culpability externalism is then the denial of culpability internalism. To use George Sher’s (2009) pithy phrase, Culpability externalism affirms the possibility of “responsibility without awareness.” The difference between culpability internalist and externalist views is best not defined in terms of awareness, though, since there are intuitively internalist views which regard acting contrary to one’s mistaken belief in wrongdoing to be blameworthy (Haji 1997). Thus, if a position demands belief in wrongdoing for the wrongdoing to be non-derivatively culpable, then the position is a form of culpability internalism. If, by contrast, a position demands only the capacity to believe that one’s conduct is wrong for it to be non-derivatively culpable, then the position counts as externalist.
The distinction between internalist and externalist theories of the epistemic condition, while useful, is very broad-brush. Fortunately, we can group views more informatively along the lines of what they take to support an internalist or externalist condition, for there are at least four different types of views about the underlying grounds for an epistemic condition: (1) basic views, (2) control-based views, (3) capacitarian views, and (4) quality-of-will views of the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct. Basic views holds that an epistemic condition is basic—that is, not based on any other condition for blameworthiness. Control-based views hold that an epistemic condition is based (partly) on the control or freedom condition for blameworthiness. Capacitarian views hold that an epistemic condition is based (partly) on a capacity-for-awareness condition of blameworthiness. And quality-of-will views hold that an epistemic condition is based (partly) on a quality-of-will condition for blameworthiness. This more informative taxonomy will be used to structure the overview of the debate on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct.
Basic and control-based views tend to be treated as one family in the literature, as distinguished from the rest, and so the two will be treated together in the following sub-section.
According to basic views, an epistemic condition is a basic condition of culpability for misconduct. That is, it is not based even partly on any other condition for blameworthiness. There may be a control or quality-of-will condition for culpable misconduct, but such a condition is entirely independent of the epistemic condition; or there may be no other condition for culpable misconduct than an epistemic condition. Michael Zimmerman (1997), for example, identifies awareness as a “root requirement” of responsibility. And according to Alexander Guerrero (2007), a meat-eater is blameworthy simply if they eat meat while knowing that they don’t know whether the source of meat has “significant moral status.” Nothing else is required. Usually, the support for basic views is a mere appeal to intuition, however Guerrero (2007) appeals to how his principle is supported by theories of right and wrong.
According to control-based views, an internalist/externalist epistemic condition is based (partly) upon the control condition for blameworthiness (“partly,” in order to accommodate views on which the epistemic condition is not entirely a subset of the control condition.) Typically, the epistemic condition is internalist. The idea may be that a belief in the moral significance of the act is part of having the right sort of control at the time of the act—for example, “enhanced control” (Zimmerman 1986), the ability to do the right thing for the right reasons (Husak 2016; Nelkin and Rickless 2017), or the rational capacity to meet a reasonable expectation to act differently (Levy 2009; Robichaud 2014; cf. Rosen 2003).
Basic and control-based theorists are almost always internalists, and a distinction is usually drawn within basic and control-based internalism between a strong internalist view known as “volitionism” and weaker forms of basic or control-based internalism. Plausibly, though, there are basic and control-based theorists who are externalists about the epistemic condition—even though theorists of this kind tend not to be actively involved in the debate on the epistemic condition. This section will discuss, in turn, strong internalism, weak internalism, and then the possibility of basic and control-based externalism.
Several philosophers (Levy 2009, 2011; Rosen 2003, 2004, 2007; Zimmerman 1997) defend the “strong internalist” (Cloos 2018) thesis—which also goes by the name of “volitionism” (Robichaud 2014)—that blameworthiness for misconduct is, or is traceable to blameworthiness for, an act done in the occurrent belief that the act is (all-things-considered) wrong. That the belief must be true, and so the act objectively wrong, is debated. Since akrasia is (often) defined as acting contrary to such an overall moral or all-things-considered judgment, strong internalism is often described as requiring “akrasia” for blameworthiness (Rosen 2004; Levy 2009). And it is often described as requiring “clear-eyed” akrasia in particular (FitzPatrick 2008), because it requires that one acts contrary to this belief when occurrent.
Why accept strong internalism? The key reasons are that (a) someone is blameworthy for an act only if it is either an instance of clear-eyed akrasia, or done in or from culpable ignorance; and (b) ignorance is culpable only if culpability for the ignorance is itself traceable to an instance of clear-eyed akrasia. “Ignorance” here means the lack of an occurrent true belief in the wrongfulness of the act.
In support of (a), everyone in the debate agrees that clear-eyed akratic wrongdoing is blameworthy (perhaps even the paradigm case of blameworthiness). Deliberately cheating on your partner while consciously knowing that it is wrong to do so is obviously blameworthy, provided that the non-epistemic conditions on blameworthiness are met. But when the agent acts in or from ignorance of wrongdoing (when the wrongdoing is “unwitting”; Smith 1983), strong internalists appeal to the intuition that they can still be blameworthy for wrongdoing but only through blameworthiness for their ignorance. Thus, the pilot who does not know that she is wrongfully initiating take-off without disengaging the gust lock is still blameworthy if she is blameworthy for failing to know that the gust lock is still engaged. This is a case of “factual ignorance,” where the agent’s ignorance of wrongdoing is owing exclusively to ignorance of some non-normative fact. But strong internalists argue, more controversially, that the same principle applies “by parity” (Rosen 2003) to “moral ignorance,” where one’s ignorance of wrongdoing is owing to ignorance of moral truth. (Indeed, some strong internalists [Rosen 2003] argue that the principle applies even to all-things-considered normative ignorance or ignorance of the way that morality trumps self-interest under the circumstances). Thus, the Battalion 101 policemen who executed Jewish women and children in the horrific Józefów Massacre (1942) would still have been blameworthy for the massacre if they did not know that they were doing wrong but were blameworthy for being ignorant of their wrongdoing. However, strong internalists appeal to more than a mere intuition to bolster the claim that when the act is unwitting, it is culpable only if it is done in or from culpable factual or moral ignorance. They cite considerations of control in support of (a). When the agent is ignorant, the agent no longer has the relevant abilities (for example, Levy’s  “rational capacity”) to avoid wrongdoing or to act deliberately (Zimmerman 1997, 421-22); it would no longer be reasonable to expect them to act differently (Rosen 2003; Levy 2009), and it would be inappropriate to react with the blaming emotions to the wrongdoer. But if the ignorance is culpable in the first place (as we shall see, due to the presence of these abilities at an earlier time), then lacking these abilities is no legitimate block for blame.
Intuitions of blameworthiness and control-based considerations are also adduced in support of the claim (b), that ignorance is culpable only if culpability for the ignorance is itself traceable to an instance of clear-eyed akrasia. But a couple of further points are needed in support of (b). The first is that ignorance cannot be directly blameworthy (like akratic conduct), because the thesis of doxastic voluntarism is false: we do not have direct voluntary control over our belief-states. Thus, at best, ignorance can only be indirectly culpable through indirect control over it, which involves having direct control over prior acts that can (foreseeably) cause the formation or retention of such a state. (Strong internalists take a foresight or foreseeability view of responsibility for consequences; see 3. The Epistemic Condition for Derivative Responsibility.) Ignorance-causing/-sustaining acts are, of course, known as “benighting acts,” after Holly Smith (1983). And everyone agrees with Smith that benighting acts must be culpable for the ignorance to be culpable. So strong internalists argue that ignorance is culpable only if culpability for ignorance is traceable to culpability for a benighting act. Not just any benighting act will do, however: the distinctive of strong internalism (and what goes beyond Smith’s work) is that culpable benighting acts must themselves either be occurrently akratic or culpably unwitting. Why not, after all, think that the principles already on the table regarding culpability for wrongdoing apply equally well to culpability for benighting acts (Rosen 2004, 303)? Furthermore, since unwitting acts are never directly culpable, strong internalists therefore envision the possibility of yet further tracing when the benighting acts are unwitting, through an indefinitely long “regress” or “chain of culpability” (Zimmerman 2017), whose origin must lie in a case of clear-eyed akrasia. The result is the strong internalist’s “regress argument” (Wieland 2017).
Herein lies strong internalist’s much discussed revisionism to blameworthiness ascriptions. The strong internalist regress must end only with a case of clear-eyed akrasia, but how easy is that to find? Zimmerman and Levy argue that clear-eyed akratic benighting acts are extremely rare or at least rarer than many think (Levy 2011, 110-32; Zimmerman 1997, 425-6). How often are we in a position to take a precaution against ignorance but decide contrary to our all-things-considered moral judgment to forgo that precaution (and thereby commit a culpable benighting act)? The answer appears to be “not often.” Levy (2011, 121-2) appeals to compelling empirical work which supports this answer. In contrast to Zimmerman and Levy, Gideon Rosen (2004) argues less that the regress makes culpability rare than that the regress recommends skepticism about moral responsibility. Any instance of akrasia, he argues, is extremely difficult to ascertain, and so blameworthiness is difficult to ascertain. Why is akrasia difficult to ascertain? Rosen cites “the opacity of the mind—of other minds and even of one’s own mind” (2004, 208). Indeed, clear-eyed akrasia may be hard to notice even when we can see into someone’s mind because:
it is not readily distinguishable from an impostor: ordinary weakness of will. The akratic agent judges that A is the thing to do, and then does something else, retaining his original judgment undiminished. The ordinary moral weakling, by contrast, may initially judge that A is the thing to do, but when the time comes to act, loses confidence in this judgment and ultimately persuades himself (or finds himself persuaded) that the preferred alternative is at least as reasonable. (2004, 309)
This problem is then compounded when we have to look into the past to determine an episode of clear-eyed akrasia; and it is probably harder to find such an episode when it is a case of benighting akrasia. Strong internalists therefore argue that we should revise most of our ordinary practices and judgments of blame.
One reaction to strong internalism and its culpability revisionism is to argue that the same—basic, and control-based—grounds to which strong internalists appeal to support their view support an easier-to-satisfy form of culpable internalism. Call this form “weak internalism,” for the fact that its epistemic requirements are weaker than strong internalist requirements. A number of different views fall under weak internalism.
One is the dispositional belief-in-wrongdoing view according to which wrongdoing in a non-occurrent belief in wrongdoing can still be originally blameworthy (Haji 1997; Peels 2011; cf. Husak 2016, ch. 4). In support of this view, Haji appeals to the intuition that:
Tara may be blameworthy for quaffing her third gin-and-tonic even though, at the time, she does not have the occurrent belief that getting inebriated is wrong [but has a dispositional belief that getting inebriated is wrong]. (1997, 531)
Indeed, it is perfectly consistent for the dispositional belief theorist to assert nonetheless that she knows full well that she shouldn’t, even if the circumstances prevent her from having this thought explicitly. But there may be good theoretical reasons to require occurrent belief.
On the widely accepted principle that one is non-derivatively blameworthy for an action only if it would have been reasonable to expect the agent to avoid the action, Levy argues that
we can only reasonably be expected to do what we can do by an explicit reasoning procedure, a procedure we choose to engage in, and when we engage in explicit reasoning we cannot deliberately guide our behavior by reasons of which we are unaware, precisely because we are unaware of them. (2009, 736, n. 16)
If Tara does not have the occurrent thought that it is wrong to have another gin, then how can she engage in an explicit reasoning procedure with the upshot of avoiding wrongdoing? But this, Levy would argue, is required for her to be subject to a reasonable expectation to avoid having another gin and hence to be blameworthy for having it. Dispositional belief theorists might, however, try to resist Levy’s argument here on the grounds that Tara is subject to a reasonable expectation to avoid wrongdoing, despite her dispositional belief in wrongdoing. Perhaps the fact that her belief in wrongdoing would ordinarily be occurrent under the circumstances is sufficient to ground a reasonable expectation to avoid wrongdoing (but see Capacitarian Internalism? below). Or perhaps she has some other kind of occurrent awareness which grounds the reasonable expectation to act differently (cf. “the phenomenology of deliberative alertness”; Yates 2021, 189-90). In the end, though, the dispositional belief theorist could dig their heels in with the reply that accepting Levy’s argument requires far too drastic a revision to our commonsense ascriptions and practices of blame for his conclusion to be acceptable (Robichaud 2014, 149-151). (It is worth noting that Zimmerman himself seems to allow for an exception to his general requirement of occurrent belief in cases of “deliberate wrongdoing in a routine or habitual… manner” [1997, 422; cf. Zimmerman 2017].)
Another set of weak internalist responses challenge the strong internalist’s requirement of belief in wrongdoing, where the content of the belief is in question. Focusing especially on direct culpability for benighting conduct (see also Nelkin and Rickless 2017), Philip Robichaud (2014) has argued that a wrongdoer can be blameworthy even though they have only “sufficient, non-decisive motivating reasons” to act differently. Robichaud defines these reasons as “strong enough” as to make it (internally) rational to avoid wrongdoing, but not strong enough as to decisively support the avoidance of wrongdoing (2014, 142). To take his example, although we do not believe that we have an obligation (or that we morally ought) to check the functionality of our brake lights every time we go to drive, we may believe that “it would be good” (2014, 143) to check them. “It would be good” or alternatively “it would be safe,” or “I haven’t checked them in a while” (not his examples), would then function as non-decisive motivating reasons to check them and not to ignore them, in contrast to the strong internalist decisive reasons of “it would be wrong not to,” “I overall ought to,” or “I have an obligation to” check them. Suppose, then, that your brake lights were to fail, causing a fatal accident. Robichaud argues that you could be originally blameworthy for the accident, even though you only had these non-decisive reasons. In support of his account, Robichaud appeals to the aforementioned reasonable expectations condition of blameworthiness, and argues, against Levy (2009) that it would be reasonable to expect you to check the brake lights despite having only non-decisive reasons to do so. This is because, he contends, you would still have the rational capacity to check your brake lights under these conditions.
Levy (2016) has responded that acting for non-decisive reasons is too “chancy” to count as making the act one that it would be reasonable to expect you to perform; that is, decisive reasons are required. The reason is that:
when it is genuinely the case that an agent has sufficient but not decisive reasons to choose from two or more conflicting options, chancy factors [such as ‘trivial aspects of the environment or of the agent herself’] will play a decisive role in how she chooses. (2016, 5)
But it is not clear that this should move Robichaud. On some accounts—for example, on leeway incompatibilist accounts (see Free Will)— of control, cases in which one is torn between conflicting motivating reasons to do different things are often regarded as paradigm cases of responsibility-relevant control. Such a conflicted state might provide room for the exercise of agent-causal power on agent-causal accounts such as Roderick Chisholm’s (1976), and so it would not follow from a conflict between non-decisive reasons that “chancy factors” cause the choice. But does it follow that Robichaud needs to help himself to a controversial libertarian account of control to defend his appeal to non-decisive motivating reasons?
Another form of weak internalism that challenges the content of the strong internalist akrasia requirement is Alexander Guerrero’s (2007) moral risk view (cf. also Husak 2016, ch. 3). Guerrero responds to Gideon Rosen’s strong internalism by defending the principle, “Don’t Know Don’t Kill” (DKDK):
[if] someone knows that she doesn’t know whether a living organism has significant moral status or not, it is morally blameworthy for her to kill that organism or to have it killed, unless she believes that there is something of substantial moral significance compelling her to do so. (2007, 78-9)
Thus, DKDK entails that the Battalion 101 shooters would still have been blameworthy if they were merely uncertain whether Jewish women and children have “significant moral status,” and they lacked the belief that something compelled them to perform the executions. Guerrero argues then that a kind of moral recklessness can be grounds for original blameworthiness, alongside cases of clear-eyed akrasia. Indeed, Guerrero believes that forms of moral recklessness other than violating DKDK can be grounds for original blameworthiness too (cf. “Don’t Know Don’t Invade”; 2007, 94), however he confines his attention to the defense of DKDK. Still, one might be tempted to generalise (and simplify) the view to the following: someone is directly blameworthy for an act only if they believe that the act is wrong or that the act risks wrongdoing (Husak 2016, ch. 3).
Guerrero has already been identified as a basic internalist, and that is because he does not appeal to considerations of control to support DKDK. Rather, he appeals directly to intuitions of culpability, especially in cases of meat-eating under moral uncertainty, but also to theories of right action which would look favourably upon DKDK. Notably, he takes DKDK to be supported by recent theories of what to do under moral uncertainty which (rationally or morally) prescribe taking the least morally risky option. Nevertheless, one could certainly cite control-based considerations to support a moral risk view—for instance, the consideration that moral uncertainty provides a non-decisive motivating reason to avoid wrongdoing.
More critically, if the moral risk view does appeal to a non-decisive motivating reason to avoid wrongdoing, its defender would of course have to deal with Levy’s (aforementioned) luck-based objection to Robichaud’s view. There may also be the problem, from Robichaud’s perspective, of the view being still too restrictive in its appeal to only akrasia or moral recklessness as bases for blameworthiness: for Robichaud, believing that checking the brake lights “would be good” can be epistemically sufficient for blameworthiness. On the other side, the strong internalist could object that there are no cases of moral recklessness without akrasia.
One final version of weak internalism can be found in the work of Carolina Sartorio (2017). According to Sartorio, non-derivative blameworthiness requires awareness of the moral significance of one’s behaviour. Moreover,
being aware of the moral significance of our behavior—could be satisfied in different ways in different circumstances. In circumstances where we act wrongly, it could be satisfied by the awareness that we were acting wrongly, or by the awareness that one ought to have behaved differently. In circumstances where we don’t act wrongly, and perhaps are aware that we don’t act wrongly, it could be satisfied simply by virtue of recognizing that we are acting from morally reproachable reasons. (2017, 20)
The way that Sartorio spells out awareness of moral significance here and throughout the paper seems to indicate that Sartorio is thinking of the requirement that there is awareness of moral significance conceived as such for blameworthiness. To use language from the literature, she appears to demand “de dicto” awareness of moral significance (a term derived from “de dicto concern” about morality; Arpaly 2002). An alternative—weaker—view would have it that mere de re awareness of moral significance could be epistemically sufficient for blameworthiness, where de re awareness of moral significance would simply be awareness of features of the act that, as a matter of fact, make the act have its moral significance, whether or not there is awareness of its moral significance as such.
But now internalists might wonder whether de dicto awareness of moral significance is really required for blameworthiness. Quality-of-will internalists deny this requirement (see below). But recall Robichaud’s view that non-decisive motivating reasons suffice, where such a reason could be “I haven’t checked the brake lights in a while” (not his example). This would be a mere de re moral belief. But now suppose that you had this belief while lacking the morally de dicto belief that “therefore, checking the brake lights is now morally right, obligatory, or good.” Even so, it seems that having this de dicto belief could be sufficient epistemic grounds for you to be blameworthy for causing an accident.
Whether or not Sartorio has a successful response to this objection, however, it is worth noting that she tries to account for an intuition of blameworthiness in a certain range of cases that have not been given enough attention in the epistemic condition literature. These are so called “Nelkin-variants” of Frankfurt-style (1969) cases. Suppose that Jones shoots Smith even though he could not have done otherwise; a mad neuroscientist would have intervened if Jones faltered. According to Frankfurt and many of his followers (including Sartorio), Jones can still be blameworthy if he chooses to shoot Smith for reasons of his own. Now a “Nelkin-variant” of this Frankfurt-style case (named after cases raised by Dana Nelkin’s earlier work—cited in Sartorio 2017) would be one in which Jones becomes aware of the fact that a mad neuroscientist will intervene if Jones falters in his attempt to shoot Smith, and thereby comes to believe that he has no alternative to shooting Smith. Jones becomes aware of the neuroscientist’s intentions “at some point during the process” (m 2017, 8) resulting in the shot but in a way that (allegedly) leaves Jones unaffected, preserving his acting on the basis of his own reasons. On Sartorio’s view, Jones may still be blameworthy for shooting Smith if he “makes the choice completely on his own, on the basis of his own reasons (morally reproachable reasons, such as a desire for revenge), in exactly the same way he would have made it if he hadn’t been aware of the neuroscientist’s presence” (2017, 19). He would only need awareness of acting on those morally reproachable reasons. The upshot, for Sartorio, is that belief in alternatives is not an epistemic requirement on culpable conduct.
Plausibly, however, most of the views that we have discussed so far (especially due to Levy, Rosen, Robichaud, and Guerrero) assume such a requirement, and so we might wonder whether they are open to a plausible defense of this requirement. Perhaps they could question whether it is really possible (as Sartorio contends) for Jones to become aware of the neuroscientist’s presence and not let that affect his own assessment of his reasons to shoot Smith or of his alternatives. Perhaps he still has the (micro) alternative of shooting Smith not from his own reasons but by giving into the neuroscientist’s manipulation. Thus, maybe awareness of this alternative is needed for Jones to be blameworthy.
We have canvassed a range of different weak basic and control-based internalist responses to strong internalism, but it is of course possible to combine elements of each. Robichaud (2014), for example, couples his appeal to non-decisive motivating reasons with an appeal to mere dispositional belief. This would further enable such views to account for the commonness of culpability. More recently, Thomas Yates (2021) has provided a sustained defense of weak control-based internalism which incorporates distinctive elements of each of the above views with his requirement, on direct culpability, that the wrongdoer has outweighing motivating reasons to avoid wrongdoing that are based upon the normative reasons to avoid wrongdoing.
It would be premature to shift away from basic and control-based views without briefly discussing a sub-variety of these views that appears in ethics and the philosophy of action but that does not feature actively in the literature on the epistemic condition. This would be the subvariety of basic and control-based views that are externalist about culpability, on which culpability internalism is false but on basic or control-based grounds. Consider, for example, a view on which freedom or control over wrongdoing is necessary and sufficient for it to be culpable, but where the relevant control does not include a belief/credence according to which one’s conduct is bad. (Such a view might still, of course, involve awareness of what one is doing, and of alternatives, but it would not count as internalist, unless this awareness entailed having a belief/credence in the badness or bad-making features of one’s conduct.) Those who tend to run together “free action” and “action for which one is morally responsible” might endorse such a view. Roderick Chisholm, for instance, states that a “responsible act is an act such that, at the time at which the agent undertook to perform it, he had it within his power not to perform the act” (1976, 86). Michael Boylan (2021) also ties responsibility and freedom tightly and he contends that the judgments of right or wrong “assign praise or blame” (2021, 4-5). Indeed, ethics concerns only those actions that originate from “the free choice to do otherwise”—the same freedom that grounds moral responsibility for one’s actions. Later in the book, Boylan argues that cases of factually ignorant wrongdoing involve breaches of a prior duty (of “authenticity”) to “engage in all reasonable steps to properly justify a belief” (2021, 33)—no doubt, to justify it with respect to the “common body of knowledge” (2021, 34). Thus, as long as Boylan thinks that freely breaching a duty is culpable and need not involve awareness of that duty (or of the reasons for its application in the circumstances), such a view would then count as externalist. As on weak internalist tracing views such as Robichaud’s (2014), culpability for unwitting wrongdoing would not need to be traced back to culpability for clear-eyed akrasia. Nevertheless, culpability for the benighting act would be even easier to satisfy than on weak internalist views. (See Epistemic Vice Theories for a similar form of culpability externalism.)
While basic and control-based externalists may have the advantage of explaining more of our commonsense intuitions of blameworthiness than internalist views, many internalists would argue that basic and control-based externalists give us far too many false positive verdicts of blameworthiness. Consider, for example, that such views, if wedded to a simple conception of the ability to do otherwise, could easily pronounce youth, the elderly, the mentally impaired, the morally incompetent, and the morally ignorant (for example, cult members), blameworthy for their conduct, even though we might find it natural to excuse these wrongdoers. Proponents of such views must also find a way to successfully rebut internalist arguments to the effect that control-based considerations justify internalist requirements on culpable misconduct (see the debate between Levy and Robichaud above). Indeed, most control-based theorists of the epistemic condition think that there is more to culpability than wrongdoing or wrongdoing plus the ability to do otherwise.
Another broad family of views on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct go by the name of “capacitarian” views (Clarke 2014, 2017; Murray 2017; Rudy-Hiller 2017 [who coined the term]; and Sher 2009). Their basic idea is that having the unexercised capacity for awareness without actual awareness of the act’s bad-making features can be grounds for direct blameworthiness. Thus, if a pilot initiates take-off despite failing to notice the engaged gust lock, the idea is that the pilot could still be directly blameworthy for doing so (and for thereby risking the lives of all the passengers on board) if the pilot could have been aware—that is, had the unexercised capacity to be aware—of the engaged gust lock. More conditions are added, but that is the core idea.
Some capacitarians are interested in giving a capacitarian account of control (Clarke 2017; Murray 2017; Rudy-Hiller 2017), and so it could be argued that they advocate a type of control-based account. However, some capacitarians (for example, Sher 2009, 94) deny that they are giving an account in terms of control. Moreover, the control-based views above tend to have the distinctive features that (i) culpable conduct is due to the volitional exercise of one’s capacities, in contrast to the capacitarian’s unanimous appeal to unexercised capacities (but see Nelkin & Rickless 2017); and (ii) the capacities that are emphasised as needed are capacities to act or omit rather than capacities for awareness.
Capacitarian views are externalist—or at least capacitarianism “proper” is externalist. But there seems to be the possibility of “a capacitarian” (Rudy-Hiller 2019, 726) view which nevertheless requires a certain kind of awareness of moral significance, albeit not a first-order awareness of the bad-making features of one’s conduct. Capacitarianism proper will first be discussed before the possibility of “capacitarian internalism.”
Capacitarianism proper is externalist: it holds that original blameworthiness for misconduct requires either awareness or the capacity for awareness of that conduct’s bad-making features. (The capacity for awareness of these features also does not depend on possessing actual beliefs or credences in one’s conduct’s bad-making features.) The view is disjunctive, because capacitarians allow blameworthiness in cases of acting in awareness of the bad-making features as well. Capacitarians demand the satisfaction of other conditions related to the exercise of the capacity, too. Fernando Rudy-Hiller (2017, 405-6) describes his capacitarian view as that when the agent is ignorant of some (non-moral) fact, they are blameworthy for their unwitting conduct (and their ignorance) only if they should and could be aware of that fact, where being able to be aware of this fact involves not only capacities to be aware of it but the (fair) opportunity to exercise those capacities. And Rudy-Hiller’s view is representative. The three essential elements to a capacitarian view are, to illustrate, (a) that the pilot must have the unexercised capacity to notice the engaged gust lock, (b) that the pilot must have the (fair) opportunity to (exercise the capacity to) notice the engaged gust lock, and (c) that the pilot should notice the engaged gust lock.
One significant advantage of capacitarianism is that it can accommodate folk intuitions of blameworthiness for so-called “unwitting omissions” (Clarke 2014)—cases of failing to do something you ought to do while lacking awareness of that failure. The case of the pilot failing to disengage the gust lock before taking-off is one such example. (Indeed, the unwitting omissions that capacitarians typically have in mind are factually unwitting, although there may be reason for capacitarians to extend their accounts to cover cases of morally unwitting omissions too). But another intuition that capacitarians account for is the intuition that culpability for unwitting omissions (or a subset of them) does not trace back to culpability for a benighting act. Now a tracing strategy could probably be employed to explain the pilot’s culpability in the airplane crash case (grounding culpability in the earlier failure to run through the pre-flight checklist); and indeed, tracing critics of capacitarianism have argued that many of the proposed “non-tracing” cases can be given a plausible tracing analysis (see Nelkin & Rickless’  discussion of cases given by Sher and Clarke). But let us try to consider an uncontroversial non-tracing case. Suppose that “a house burns down because someone forgot to turn off a stove” (Clarke 2017, 63), but where the culprit—call him Frank—has never forgotten to turn it off, and where it never occurred to him this time, or ever, to be more vigilant about turning it off after using it. Even still, many of us report intuitions of blameworthiness. It might, after all, seem fair for the landlord or family member to blame Frank (morally) for the house fire, especially after learning that he forgot to turn off the stove. And yet Frank was not aware of leaving the stove on at all, let alone aware of its being wrong to do so. Thus, it looks like internalist views are in trouble. But capacitarians can account for the intuition of culpability by appealing to Frank’s capacity to notice the stove, opportunity to exercise this capacity, and obligation to notice the stove.
While all capacitarians endorse this thesis about direct blameworthiness, some—for example, Rudy-Hiller (2017, 417)—also require that the ignorance is culpable for the unwitting conduct to be culpable, but others deny this. Clarke (2014, 173-4) argues that the ignorance need only be faulty for the unwitting conduct to be directly culpable, while tracing would be required to explain culpability for the ignorance. But Rudy-Hiller does not think that a culpable ignorance requirement entails that culpability for unwitting conduct is derivative of culpability for the ignorance. Rather, he thinks that both the ignorance and the unwitting conduct are under “direct” capacitarian control (apparently accepting a kind of doxastic voluntarism).
Capacitarians generally agree on which kinds of cognitive processes or faculties constitute cognitive capacities, however they disagree on how exactly to characterise them. Some also try to unify them under one “mother” capacity—for instance, vigilance (Murray 2017). On which kinds of faculties constitute cognitive capacities, Clarke has a useful passage cataloguing the relevant capacities:
Some are capacities to do things that are in a plain sense active: to turn one’s attention to, or maintain attention on, some matter; to raise a question in one’s mind or pursue such a question; to make a decision about whether to do this or that. These are, in fact, abilities to act. Others, though capacities to do things, aren’t capacities whose exercise consists in intentional action. These include capacities to remember, to think of relevant considerations, to notice features of one’s situation and appreciate their normative significance, to think at appropriate times to do things that need doing. (2017, 68)
Most capacitarians allow both kinds of capacities, however some do not allow the first class of capacities that consist in abilities to act. For example, Sher argues that “if we did construe the cognitive capacities as ones that their possessors can choose to exercise, then we would have ushered [an internalist control-based view] out the front door only to see it reenter through the back” (2009, 114). It is not clear, however, that allowing these capacities to act would involve smuggling such a view back in, for capacitarians need not hold that as soon as we enter any domain of agency or choice, let alone the domain of exercising cognitive capacities, internalist conditions need to be met.
Capacitarians face the challenge of answering what it takes to have a relevant capacity for awareness. Clarke and Rudy-Hiller take a view on which the agent has the relevant capacity if on similar occasions in the past, they have become aware of the relevant bad-making features. By contrast, Sher adopts a counterfactual analysis of capacities, according to which someone has the relevant capacity if she would have been aware of the relevant facts in a range of other similar circumstances (2009, 114). Whichever way we might spell out the relevant capacity there are some unique challenges that need to be met. For both the past-occurrences and counterfactual views, we might ask what (past or counterfactual) circumstances count as “sufficiently similar.” And concerning the past-occurrences view, we might be concerned with cases in which the agent has lost their capacity for awareness ever since they were last relevantly aware (Sher 2009, 109).
For capacitarians, having the capacity for awareness means nothing without a (fair) opportunity for it to manifest. Rudy-Hiller, for instance, requires that there are no “situational factors that decisively interfere with the deployment of the relevant abilities” (2017, 408). Frank would be excused for failing to turn off the stove if Frank collapsed with a heart attack during his cooking (although it is dubious that failing to turn off the stove would still count as wrong in this case). Clarke says something similar, although he argues that it is enough that they “sometimes mask… the manifestation of psychological capacities without diminishing or eliminating them” (Clarke 2017, 68). Imagine, instead, that Frank merely fell ill for the next couple of hours and had to lie down. In these cases, Clarke argues that it would “not be reasonable to expect [him] to remember or think to do certain things that [he] has a capacity to remember or think to do” (2017, 68).
The last key requirement, according to the capacitarian, is that the agent should have been aware of the relevant considerations at the time of their action or omission. Why is such a condition indispensable? Well, just as internalist tracers argue that blameworthiness for an unwitting act requires performing a benighting act that falls below a standard that would have been reasonably expected of them, so capacitarians contend that blameworthiness requires that the agent’s awareness fell below a certain “cognitive standard” (Clarke 2014) that would have been reasonably expected of them. If, for example, Frank fell ill while cooking, it seems false that Frank ought to have remembered that the stove was on, for such a standard seems too harsh or demanding. Capacitarians disagree, however, on whether this standard is set by an obligation (Rudy-Hiller 2017, 415; Murray 2017, 513) or merely a norm (Clarke 2014, 167) of awareness.
A number of objections to capacitarianism, in addition to the problems for giving an adequate account of capacity for awareness, have been raised in the literature. One objection is that the appeal to capacities fails to capture anything that is morally relevant for attributions of moral responsibility. Sher (2009), for instance, argues that the fact that wrongdoing originated from the wrongdoer is sufficient for the wrongdoer’s culpability, never mind whether they had control, freedom, or ill will (see Quality-of-Will Views below). Sher’s story is complicated, and appeals to the way that we react, as blamers, to the whole person when we blame them, to all their psychological capacities, and not only to their vices. But A. Smith (2010) has argued that attributability via origination threatens to collapse attributions of moral responsibility into attributions of causal responsibility. Indeed, the problem seems particularly poignant for accounts such as Sher’s which deny the control condition of blameworthiness, since those who appeal to control at least try to appeal to a widely accepted basis for responsibility attributions. Thus, a good deal seems to ride on a successful defense of the notion of capacitarian control.
A second objection is the reasonable expectations objection raised by Levy (2017) (cf. also Rudy-Hiller 2019). As we have seen, capacitarians appeal to the way that their conditions ground a reasonable expectation to avoid unwitting misconduct. Levy, however, argues that capacitarian conditions fail to ground such a reasonable expectation, because expecting someone to avoid wrongdoing through the exercise or activation of a capacity for awareness is expecting someone to avoid wrongdoing “by chance or by some kind of glitch in their agency” (2017, 255). The problem is especially pressing when one considers those capacities that are not, as Clarke describes them, “capacities to act,” and so it might be in the capacitarian’s interests to restrict the relevant capacities to those that require “effort to appropriately exercise” (Murray 2017, 516). Past-occurrent capacitarians could also reply (as they have done) that:
if an agent has demonstrated in the past that she has a certain capacity and there is no obvious impediment to its manifestation in the present circumstances, then it is reasonable to expect her to exercise it here and now. (Rudy-Hiller 2019, 734)
Even so, Levy’s point is that they would need awareness of the fact that, for example, their mind is wandering for them to have the right sort of control over their capacities, but (1) this is not required by capacitarians (at least of the externalist variety; see below) and (2) this awareness itself is not under the agent’s voluntary control (2017, 255). Rudy-Hiller (2019; see Capacitarian Internalism?) has also argued that there are cases in which the present circumstances are sufficiently different from previous circumstances (in which you demonstrated the relevant capacity for awareness), such that the agent in the present circumstances lacks awareness of the risk of not being aware of the relevant facts, and therefore lacks awareness of the need to “exert more vigilance in the particular circumstances she [is] in” (2019, 735). In these cases, he argues, it is not reasonable to expect the agent to avoid wrongdoing.
Of course, the capacitarian could deny the widely accepted reasonable expectations conditions of blameworthiness. But this would seem to come at the high price of exacerbating the first problem (above) of how to avoid collapsing moral responsibility into causal responsibility. William FitzPatrick (2017, 33) also argues that rejecting this condition fails to account for the way that reasonable expectations are grounded in moral desert, an indispensable aspect of blameworthiness on his view.
But another response to the reasonable expectations objection to capacitarianism proper is to amend capacitarianism so as to include an awareness condition after all. This is Rudy-Hiller’s revised (2019) view. According to this view, the core elements of capacitarianism are left intact and constitute part of what he calls “cognitive control,” but the other part involves an awareness-of-risk condition, that is, awareness of the risk of “cognitive failure” (for example, awareness of the risk of not noticing that the stove is still on), and a know-how condition, involving awareness of how to avoid that cognitive failure in the circumstances. Rudy-Hiller argues that these conditions need to be added, because without having been in similar circumstances in the past, agents are “in the dark regarding the risks associated with allocating cognitive resources in certain ways and therefore… in the dark regarding the need to exercise that capacity” (2019: 731). Indeed, Rudy-Hiller would argue that these agents are “entitled to rely on the good functioning of [their] cognitive capacities without having to put in special effort to shore them up” (emphasis added, 2019: 732). Thus, it turns out that many unwitting wrongdoers are blameless in the end, because they fail to satisfy the awareness-of-risk and know-how conditions. Imagine that Frank’s partner announces halfway through his meal preparation that her friends are coming over, and that they are gluten-free, and so he must now change his cooking plans to accommodate them. He has never had to do this. Suppose then that they arrive and he keeps himself occupied by being a good host. Unfortunately, this means that he is no longer mentally present enough to remember to turn the stove off and it causes a kitchen fire partway through the evening. In this case, Rudy-Hiller would say that Frank is blameless, because he is not especially aware of the risk of failing to notice that the stove is still on.
Such a view seems to count as an internalist view, not only in the spirit of its appeal to awareness, but in the contents of the awareness itself. While it does not involve awareness of the badness or bad-making features of the wrongful omission, it does involve a kind of higher-order awareness of the need to have the capacity for awareness of those features (whatever they may be). (This then explains the parenthetical disjunct in the definition of culpability internalism above.) That being said, one could argue that failing to exercise enough vigilance is itself a wrongful mental omission which explains the subsequent omission to turn the stove off. If so, then awareness of the risk of failing to exercise enough vigilance in the circumstances satisfies the ordinary internalist requirement of possessing a “belief/credence in the bad-making features of one’s conduct.”
Rudy-Hiller’s capacitarian internalist view has certainly much to be said for it, and it is yet to receive significant criticism. However, it is unlikely to move those who wish to accommodate a strong intuition of culpability even in these special cases of “slips.” Rudy-Hiller sacrifices this advantage for the benefit of preserving the reasonable expectations and control conditions on responsibility. We might also wonder to what extent Rudy-Hiller’s capacitarian internalism is not a closet tracing view (a variation on the control-based internalist views from the last section) if it can intelligibly be argued that the omission to exert enough vigilance in the circumstances is a separate “benighting” mental omission that gives rise to the subsequent “unwitting” omission. These would, after all, be cases in which “the temporal gap between it and the unwitting [omission] is infinitesimal” (Smith 1983, 547).
Another set of views on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct approaches the topic from an entirely different perspective. According to these so-called “quality-of-will” views (which are also known as “attributionist” views, even though this term has been used for some capacitarians), blameworthiness for misconduct requires that a bad quality of will was on display in that misconduct, or in prior (benighting) misconduct. Moreover, the question of the epistemic condition for blameworthiness is to be answered by inquiring into the epistemic condition for the display of ill will. Thus, what licenses culpability ascriptions is not primarily control, as on control-based views, nor capacities, as on capacitarianism, but a bad will.
The basic idea of quality-of-will theories is simple and intuitive: the Battalion 101 shooters are blameworthy for their participation in the Józefów Massacre because they displayed an egregious disregard for the lives of Jewish women and children. The pilot who takes off without disengaging the gust lock acts carelessly and recklessly.
The main varieties of quality-of-will views are moral quality-of-will views and epistemic vice theories. Moral quality-of-will views appeal to morally reproachable qualities of the will (such as disregard for what’s morally significant). Epistemic vice theories are regarded in this article as quality-of-will views because they ground culpability for unwitting wrongdoing ultimately in the expression of a bad epistemic quality of will—for example, the epistemically vicious traits or attitudes of carelessness, inattentiveness, or arrogance. As we will see, moral quality-of-will views fall on either side of the culpability internalism/externalism debate, but epistemic vice theories are externalist.
Moral quality-of-will theories appeal to morally reproachable qualities of the will. Accordingly, the “display of ill will” has been analysed in terms of the act’s expressing or being caused by an inadequate care for what’s morally significant (Arpaly 2002; Harman 2011), indifference towards others’ needs or interests (Talbert 2013, 2017; McKenna 2012), objectionable evaluative attitudes (A. Smith 2005), and reprehensible desires (H. Smith 1983, 2011).
These theorists are united in their view that one can be directly blameworthy for wrongdoing, even if it is done in the absence of a belief in wrongdoing or a de dicto belief in the moral significance of the act (against, for example, Sartorio). Even if the Battalion 101 shooters did not know that it was wrong to murder Jewish women and children, they are directly blameworthy for doing so, because they displayed an objectionable disregard for the moral status (humanity, etc.) of their victims. For some quality of will theorists (Talbert 2013, 234), this holds even if the shooters’ moral ignorance was blameless (or epistemically justified), given widespread cultural acceptance of the inferior status of Jews in Nazi Germany. However, others (Harman 2011, 461-2) would still require that their moral ignorance was blameworthy, even if culpability for their ignorance did not explain culpability for their unwitting wrongdoing. Nevertheless, quality-of-will theorists tend to make it easier than control-based theories for attitudes or states such as ignorance to be culpable, for these states tend to be regarded as directly, rather than indirectly, culpable, and under the same conditions as actions are culpable—namely, when they display ill will (consider, for example, prejudiced or misogynistic beliefs about women; Arpaly 2002, 104). Indeed, these theorists typically do not promote tracing explanations, because, like their “real self” forebears (Waston 1996), they hold that the relevant responsibility relation between agent and object (act, belief, etc.) is an atemporal or structural relation between the agent’s quality-of-will and the object of responsibility assessment. Not surprisingly, then, moral quality of will theorists tend not to focus on benighting conduct. But they could easily extend their views to cover benighting conduct in the way that epistemic vice theorists do below, or by appealing to the notion of motivated ignorance.
Moral quality-of-will theorists are divided on the culpability internalism/externalism debate. Matthew Talbert (2013) and Elizabeth Harman (2011, 460) are internalist, because they argue that caring inadequately for what is morally significant requires awareness of what is morally significant. Hence, they require only de re moral awareness, or awareness of the bad-making features of their conduct. Talbert has probably produced the most sustained defense of this idea. Suppose that walking on plants turns out to be wrong because it causes them to suffer, and you are ignorant of plant suffering (Levy’s  example). Talbert argues that ignorance of plant suffering would excuse you from blame because doing so would not express “a judgment with which we disagree about the significance of the needs and interests of those [plants] affected by the action” (2013, 244). However, if you were to become aware that plants suffer, then you would no longer be excused for walking on plants, even if you believed that it was permissible to continue walking on them. This is because you now express a judgment concerning plant suffering that we disagree with, the judgment that plant suffering does not matter, or should not be regarded like the suffering of other living things.
Some moral quality-of-will theorists by contrast do not require awareness of misconduct’s bad-making features for it to be culpable. Most prominently, Angela Smith (2005) has argued that, among other things, unwitting omissions—such as her case of omitting to send your friend a card on her birthday because you have forgotten it is her birthday—are directly culpable because these omissions and their accompanying ignorance express objectionable evaluative attitudes (for example, the judgment that a friend’s birthday is unimportant). Critical to her argument for the culpability of unwitting omissions is her appeal to the concept of responsibility as answerability—as, being open to “demands for reasons or justifications” (2005, 259)—a property which seems applicable to you in the case of forgetting your friend’s birthday. Since these kinds of cases involve the lack of any belief or credence in the bad-making features of one’s omissions (for example, the features that today is your friend’s birthday and that it would be inconsiderate not to give her a call), the view counts as externalist.
Quality-of-will externalists like Smith and capacitarians therefore have the similarities that both are concerned with unwitting omissions, and both argue against tracing strategies for explaining culpability for unwitting misconduct. Nevertheless, an important difference between these views is that quality-of-will externalists require displays of ill will for blameworthiness. To the extent that in the above house fire case, Frank has never in his cooking shown an objectionable orientation towards his home and his family (nor the house’s owner), we might think that on this occasion, when he forgets to turn it off, Frank does not display any ill will. If so, then even quality-of-will externalists would excuse him for not turning off the stove. We have seen, though, that Frank could easily fulfil the capacitarian’s conditions, and so this is a type of case in which the verdicts of quality-of-will theorists and capacitarians could easily diverge. Admittedly, Smith seems to take it that normal cases of unwitting omissions count as cases involving objectionable attitudes, and so there may not be much of a difference in practice between the verdicts of Smith and capacitarians. But certainly, the contrast between capacitarian views and quality-of-will internalist views is significant. While Talbert (2017) appears to concede to Smith that some cases of factually unwitting omissions are culpable, Talbert argues that “garden-variety” cases of unwitting omissions—including the one about forgetting your friend’s birthday—are not obvious cases of culpability because “quite often, we probably shouldn’t have much confidence that another person’s forgetfulness or his failure to notice something conveys much morally relevant information about what he values” (2017, 30). Capacitarians and quality-of-will externalists have intuitions of culpability Talbert thinks (2017, 31ff.), because humans have a bad tendency (according to studies in psychology) to attribute ill will to other humans (even non-humans) when ill will is absent, especially when we see the harmful results of their behaviour.
Three important objections have been raised against moral quality-of-will theories in the literature. The first objection is one that we have already seen raised against capacitarians: quality-of-will theorists cannot account for the reasonable expectations conditions of blameworthiness (FitzPatrick 2017, 33-4). Consider, for example, that it might not have been reasonable to expect the Battalion 101 shooters to avoid participating in the massacre of Jewish women and children if they were entirely oblivious to the fact that it was wrong, but a quality-of-will theorist has the verdict that they are blameworthy. But this kind of case might reveal that there is a problem with the reasonable expectations conditions of blameworthiness, and this is how Talbert (2013) defends his quality-of-will theory.
A second objection to quality-of-will theories is that they collapse the “bad” and the “blameworthy” (Levy 2005)—once again, a similar objection to one raised against capacitarianism. Smith, after all, identifies the “precondition for legitimate moral assessment” (Smith 2005, 240) with the precondition for legitimate responsibility assessment—that is, she identifies “moral criticism” with moral blame. But mere negative moral assessments of a person given their behaviour—that is, judgments of their being vicious, having an objectionable attitude, or lacking sufficient care for others—seem to be crucially different from, and need not imply, judgments of moral responsibility or blameworthiness for the behaviour in question. Perhaps we think that people need the right kind of control over whether they display their ill will in order to be morally responsible for their behaviour (Levy 2005). Not according to A. Smith (2005): she is happy to accept the consequence that she collapses the bad and the blameworthy. But another quality-of-will response is to accept that this is a problem and try to explain the difference.
According to Holly Smith, we can “appropriately think worse of a person” who expresses a single or “isolated” quality of will that is objectionable, but we cannot blame her, unless she reveals “enough of her moral personality” (2011, 144). Consider her key example (2011, 133-4). Clara strongly dislikes Bonnie but has always managed to reign in “nasty” comments about her hair in order to keep a good reputation (among other reasons). One day, however, “Clara’s psychology teacher hypnotises Clara,” the outcome of which is that Clara no longer cares about her reputation (etc.). In consequence, Clara launches a “cutting attack on Bonnie’s appearance.” Now, what is important is that the attack manifests ill will (her desire to “wound” Bonnie). But H. Smith’s intuition is that she is not blameworthy. After all, the desires for maintaining her good reputation (etc.) that would normally inhibit her are not operative. Thus (apart from akrasia [H. Smith 2011, 145]), blameworthiness requires the display of a sufficient portion of the agent’s will, not just one part of it (for example, a single bad desire). Whether this distinguishes eligibility for moral criticism from eligibility for moral blame sufficiently is not clear, however. There are also concerns in the literature about the ability for quality-of-will theorists to account for intuitions of blamelessness arising from other “manipulation” cases.
A third objection to moral quality-of-will theories is simply that ill will is not necessary for blameworthiness, and the aforementioned capacitarian non-tracing cases are usually trotted out in this context. So a great deal hinges on what we are to make of that debate.
Another subvariety of quality-of-will theories are James Montmarquet’s (1999) and William FitzPatrick’s (2008, 2017) epistemic vice theories. Interestingly, both theorists agree with those control-based internalists who argue that moral and factual ignorance excuses wrongdoing, but they contend that culpability for that wrongdoing traces back to culpability for the ignorance, which, they argue, is grounded in exercises of epistemic vice. The epistemic vices are apparently possessed as character traits on FitzPatrick’s (2008) view, but Montmarquet (1999) seems only to envision a momentary vicious attitude or motive (viz., insufficient “care” in belief-formation).
Consider Zimmerman’s case of Perry who, upon arriving at the scene of a car crash involving a trapped individual, Doris, and a burning car, “rushes in and quickly drags Doris free from the wreck, thinking that at any moment both he and she might get caught in the explosion” (1997, 410). Alas, Perry paralyses Doris in the act of dragging her free. In defense of the appeal to epistemic vices, Montmarquet (1999, 842) attaches significance to Zimmerman’s admission that the natural thing to say about this case is that Perry is culpable for unwittingly paralysing Doris and that this is due to Perry’s “carelessness,” “inconsiderateness,” or “inattentiveness” in failing to “entertain the possibility of doing more harm than good by means of a precipitate rescue” (Zimmerman 1997, 416). For Montmarquet, this is indeed what we should say. In fact, Montmarquet would argue that in this moment, Perry has “direct (albeit incomplete)” control (1999, 844) over his beliefs, and that the way he exercises that control is epistemically vicious, for it fails to exhibit enough “care” in belief-formation. (It is not, however, essential for epistemic vice theories to appeal to direct control over one’s beliefs. FitzPatrick (2008) denies doxastic voluntarism.) At any rate, grounding Perry’s culpability in his lack of care in belief-formation is externalist, because contrary to Zimmerman and other control-based internalists, Montmarquet and FitzPatrick would not require for Perry’s culpable ignorance that Perry was aware of his failure to be open-minded to “the possibility of doing more harm than good.”
The root idea… is that a certain quality of openness to truth- and value-related considerations is expected of persons and that this expectation is fundamental, at least in the following regard. The expectation is not derivative of or dependent upon one’s (at the moment in question) judging such openness as appropriate (good, required, etc.)—just the opposite: it would include a requirement that one be open to the need to be open, and if one is not open to this, one may be blameworthy precisely for that failure. (Montmarquet 1999, 845)
It is clear in this passage that Montmarquet employs the reasonable expectations conditions of blameworthiness (well before it became a key focus of the debate in the late 2000s) and he evidently tries to account for how it is met by his epistemic vice theory. FitzPatrick (2008, 2017) also takes up this project, but he argues in response to Levy’s (2009) strong internalist requirement for reasonable expectations that if it is not reasonable to expect someone to avoid acting from their epistemic vices, then culpability traces even further back to culpability for those vices and for those vicious character-forming acts that it would have been reasonable to expect the agent to avoid in the first place (FitzPatrick 2017). It is not clear that this solves the issue from the strong internalist’s perspective, however, for the internalist would still require that the character-forming choices were themselves seen as wrong. It seems, then, that it is in the best interests of the epistemic vice theorist to resort to Montmarquet’s appeal to the fundamentality of exercises of epistemic vice with or without awareness of doing so (and with or without Montmarquet’s appeal to direct doxastic control).
The debate between epistemic vice theorists and other defenders of the reasonable expectations condition then becomes whether the epistemic vice theorist can ground a reasonable expectation without an internalist requirement. But clearly, it is open to these theorists to dispense with this requirement—as their cousins in the moral quality-of-will camp have done (see above).
But epistemic vice theorists have their own challenges, too. Why, for example, should benighting conduct be treated any differently from ordinary (non-benighting) conduct, as far as culpability ascriptions are concerned? It is difficult to see what it is about being the kind of act or omission that causes ignorance that makes it eligible for a different culpability assessment than any other kind of act or omission. Perhaps an epistemic vice theory is best employed in conjunction with a moral quality-of-will theory of culpability for non-benighting conduct, which does away with tracing.
We have nearly canvassed the full range of positions that are currently defended on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct. What we have left are those positions that mix some of the above views in different ways. There are two ways that this can be done: (1) defend a hybrid theory, which combines one or more of the above views in a single theory of blameworthiness; or (2) defend pluralism, which divides blameworthiness into different kinds, and then assigns different epistemic conditions to each.
For examples of a hybrid theory, FitzPatrick (2008) combines his epistemic vice theory with a kind of capacitarian requirement. The agent must have the capacity and the social opportunity to become aware of and avoid acting from epistemic vice. More recently, Christopher Cloos (2018, 211-2) argues that culpability for wrongdoing is secured either directly, under quality-of-will internalist conditions, or indirectly (when there is culpable factual ignorance) under weak internalist or epistemic vice theoretic conditions. Taking an all-inclusive approach like Cloos’s clearly gives you the advantage of accounting for as many of our ordinary intuitions of blameworthiness as possible, however it also inherits some of the distinctive problems of the views it combines. It must also face the charge of ad-hocness: is there some motivation for a hybrid theory other than its ability to account for intuitions about individual cases relevant to the epistemic condition? Is there, for instance, a plausible background theory about responsibility or blame that gives rise to such a hybrid?
By contrast, Elinor Mason (2019) and Michael Zimmerman (2017) offer pluralist accounts of the epistemic condition. Mason holds that there are three “ways to be blameworthy.” One form requires the satisfaction of strong internalist conditions; another demands only the satisfaction of quality-of-will conditions; and then the third is generated voluntarily by taking responsibility for one’s conduct (bringing along epistemic conditions of a different kind). Zimmerman (2017) defends a similar sort of pluralism, submitting that in his earlier (1997) work, he was only intending to give a strong internalist account of one form of blameworthiness, the one that is supposedly the basis for punishment. As for hybrid views, pluralist views inherit some of the problems of the monist views discussed above, but they also face the challenge of accounting for why different forms of blameworthiness are needed to account for the relevant considerations. Given that simplicity should be preferred over complexity, it seems that the debate would need to be intractable enough to warrant splitting blameworthiness into multiple forms, but it is not clear that this is so. How, for instance, should Mason and Zimmerman reply to the control-based criticism of quality-of-will views that they do not specify sufficient conditions for blameworthiness but only for some form of closely related negative attributability which is often confused for blameworthiness (Levy 2005)? Another challenge for pluralist views is justifying the exclusion of those monist analyses above (that is, capacitarianism, for Mason and Zimmerman) that do not constitute an analysis of one of the ways to be blameworthy.
Alongside the debate on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct, an interrelated debate has taken place on the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility—that is, responsibility (especially blameworthiness) for the consequences of our conduct. Why the debate on the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility is interrelated with the debate on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct should now be clear: in the latter debate, culpability for unwitting omissions is often traced back to culpability for prior conduct, and these tracing strategies nearly always make essential reference to culpability for ignorance as itself a consequence of prior (benighting) conduct. But we have also seen how derivative responsibility for character (epistemic vices) might be part of the story. Thus, many of the philosophers whose views have already been discussed address the question of the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility in the context of the above debate (see below). But as we shall see, a number of philosophers are interested in the question of the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility as a question worth thinking about in its own right, or else they address the question in the context of another debate in responsibility studies (for example, on doxastic responsibility: Nottelmann 2007; Peels 2017). There are also many views which affirm the idea of derivative responsibility but which leave out a discussion of its epistemic condition, and so it is not clear what they have to say on the epistemic condition.
Views on the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility divide into those we might call foresight views, foreseeability views, and no-foreseeability views. Foresight views have the strongest epistemic condition in their claim that foreseen consequences are the only consequences of our conduct for which we are responsible (see, for example, Boylan 2021, 5; H. Smith 1983; Nelkin and Rickless 2017; Zimmerman 1986, 1997). By contrast, foreseeability views claim that unforeseen but (reasonably) foreseeable consequences can also be consequences for which we are responsible (Fischer and Tognazzini 2009; Murray 2017; Rosen 2004, 2008; Rudy-Hiller 2017; Sartorio 2017; Vargas 2005). Before we discuss the debate between these views, it would be worth introducing various disagreements about the nature and content of the foresight that one must have or be able to have.
On both foresight and foreseeability views, the foresight is nearly always analysed in terms of belief concerning the relevant consequence of one’s conduct (see especially, Zimmerman 1986, 206; cf. Nottelmann’s [2007, 190-3] criticism). Sometimes there is also an appeal to reasonable foresight (see, for example, Nelkin and Rickless 2017; cf. “reasonable foreseeability,” Vargas 2005) Moreover, some theorists analyse foresight in terms of occurrent belief (Zimmerman 1986), while others argue that dispositional belief suffices (for example, Fischer and Tognazzini 2009). Intuitively, if the pilot decided to skip running through every item on the pre-flight checklist but did not consciously foresee that doing so could lead to a catastrophic airplane crash, she could still be blameworthy for these consequences even if she merely dispositionally believed that these were the risks of rushing the pre-flight check (that is, if she would have cited these as reasons not to rush the check if asked). But plausibly this debate hangs on whether a successful defence of the requirement of occurrent belief can be found for directly culpable misconduct (see above).
There are also a number of disagreements surrounding the content of the relevant foresight. One disagreement concerns whether an increased likelihood of the consequence of one’s conduct must be foreseen/foreseeable. Zimmerman (1986, 206) includes no such condition, citing merely belief that there is at least “some probability” that the consequence will occur. But it is much more common to require foresight/foreseeability of an increased risk or likelihood of the consequence (Nottelmann 2007, 191ff.; Nelkin and Rickless 2017, 120; Peels 2017, 177). Intuitively, foreseeing some probability but no increase in the risk of a bad consequence would not give one a reason to take a precaution against it.
Another issue is subject to greater debate: must the specific consequence be foreseen/foreseeable, or does it suffice that the general type of consequence (“consequence type”) is foreseen/foreseeable? Some (Zimmerman 1986; Vargas 2005) think that there must be foreseeability of the specific/token consequence. In contrast, others (Fischer and Tognazzini 2009; King 2017; Nelkin and Rickless 2017; Nottelmann 2007), think that there can be foreseeability of the consequence type. The latter view is perhaps more intuitive. Suppose that a teacher comes up with the wrong answer to a highly important question raised by a student after failing to prepare for class despite recognizing the need to be well-prepared. To be responsible for giving the wrong answer, it seems that the teacher need not have foreseen the specific question to which she gave the wrong answer, nor even foreseen responding wrongly to a student’s question. She need only have foreseen the risk of misguiding the students or asserting falsehoods in class as a consequence of not preparing. A consequence-type view would also more easily accommodate intuitions of derivative culpability for morally unwitting wrongdoing: if the Battalion 101 shooters had the opportunity to question Nazi ideology at some point in their life prior to the massacre while believing that failing to question this ideology could lead to harming the Jews, then they could well have been indirectly blameworthy for their participation in the massacre. How, then, can defenders of the requirement of foreseen/foreseeable token consequences respond to the intuitive sufficiency of consequence-type foresight/foreseeability? Perhaps there are problems with specifying how broad a “type” the token consequence can fall under. Would foresight of a consequence as general as “causing something bad” suffice?
The final disagreement concerning the content of the required foresight/foreseeability is disagreement about how the foresight/foreseeability of the consequence’s moral significance or morally significant features is to be spelled out. After all, foresight of the consequence’s morally significant status or features is surely required (cf. Vargas 2005; Fischer and Tognazzini 2009; even though it is sometimes left out of analyses—see, for example, Nelkin and Rickless 2017). Suppose, for example, that the pilot foresaw the risk of an airplane crash from failing to run through the pre-flight checklist but did not believe that this was wrong or bad, nor even that it risked being bad. Or suppose that the pilot was crucially factually ignorant, believing mistakenly but fully that she had been told to intentionally crash the plane for a film stunt. Employing various of the intuitions generated in reflection on the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct (above), she is surely blameless for the crash under one or more of these conditions, unless she was blameworthy for her ignorance, or she displayed ill will despite her factual ignorance, or she had the capacity to be aware that she was not in a film set.
What moral significance or morally significant features, in particular, must be foreseen/foreseeable? Plausibly the answer should be informed by one’s account of the epistemic condition for directly culpable misconduct. Thus, strong internalists and others (for example, Sartorio) who require de dicto awareness of moral significance might be tempted to require, for culpability, that the consequence is believed to be morally bad or wrong. Weak internalists such as Robichaud might only require foresight/foreseeability of reasons against the consequence. And quality-of-will theorists and capacitarians might only require foresight/foreseeability of the consequence’s bad-making features.
At last, we come to the debate between foresight and foreseeability views. Why demand a more restrictive foresight condition for derivative responsibility? Intuitively it seems that (reasonable) foreseeability could suffice. Suppose that the teacher failed to even foresee misleading her students as a consequence of not preparing for her class, but that this consequence was (at least reasonably) foreseeable for her. Even so, it seems that she could be blameworthy for misleading her students. At the very least, that is the type of view that quality-of-will externalists and capacitarians would be drawn to (cf. Rudy-Hiller 2017). Consider, after all, that she seems to meet capacitarian conditions with respect to the consequence of misleading her students: she seems to have the capacity and the opportunity to foresee, and failing to foresee falls short of a cognitive standard that applies to her (no doubt qua teacher). In fact, capacitarian conditions seem to provide a plausible analysis of the nature of foreseeability (compare Zimmerman’s  discussion of an alternative analysis in terms of what the “reasonable person” would foresee, as used in the legal definition of negligence). Quality-of-will externalists might also appeal to the way that her failure to foresee misleading her students, despite its being reasonably foreseeable for her, reveals an objectionable indifference to their success.
But the fact that a foreseeability view is at home with externalism about directly culpable misconduct might give us a clue as to how the foresight view could plausibly be defended against it, despite being more restrictive and maybe less intuitive: we seem to get the best justification for the foresight view from internalism about directly culpable misconduct. Interestingly, however, some internalists (Rosen 2008; Fischer and Tognazzini 2009), who argue that blameless ignorance excuses wrongdoing from it, defend a foreseeability view. But they do not tend to give an argument for this combination of internalism about direct culpability with a foreseeability view about indirect culpability. And, in fact, Daniel Miller (2017) has recently produced an ingenious argument for the inconsistency of this combination of commitments:
The argument begins from the premise that it is possible for an agent to be blameless for failing to foresee what was foreseeable for him. The second premise is the principle that an agent is blameworthy for acting from ignorance only if he is blameworthy for that ignorance. If blameless ignorance excuses agents for actions, though, then it also excuses agents for action consequences (the third premise). But, given the first premise, foreseeability versions of the tracing strategy contradict this: they imply that an agent can be blameworthy for some consequence even if he was blamelessly ignorant of it. (Miller 2017, 1567)
So it looks like Rosen and Fischer and Tognazzini owe Miller a reply. Perhaps they might do best to question premise one. If they cannot respond to this charge of inconsistency, however, they must revise one of their commitments.
Foresight and foreseeability views are not the only views on the epistemic condition for derivative responsibility. No-foreseeability views (we might call them) hold that we can be responsible for the consequences of our conduct even if they are entirely (or at least reasonably) unforeseeable at the time of that conduct, but when the consequences are appropriately (for example, “non-deviantly”) caused by it, or reflect the agent’s ill will, or what have you. Basic and control-based externalists and quality-of-will externalists could therefore be attracted to such a view. In fact, Rik Peels (2017), appears to defend a kind of no-foreseeability view of derivative responsibility for beliefs. On his view, we are responsible for those beliefs that we have merely influenced through our actions, where influence of a belief that p consists simply in the “ability to believe otherwise”—or there being some “action or series of actions A that [the agent] S could have performed such that if S had performed A, S would not have believed that p” (2017, 143). But this view seems to propose far too weak a condition of derivative responsibility for beliefs. A corresponding account of derivative responsibility for events would entail that, for example, if the pilot’s airplane crash could have been prevented had the pilot ran through the pre-flight checklist but the crash caused the airplane company to go into liquidation, then the pilot would be responsible for this consequence, even if the pilot had no way of foreseeing it (especially given her justified belief that the company was on firm financial footing). And it does not seem that beliefs as action consequences are relevantly different from events. From another point of view, quality-of-will externalists might try to justify a no-foreseeability view by arguing that there are cases in which the consequences of one’s conduct reflect ill will even though those consequences weren’t (reasonably) foreseeable. But even if the pilot displayed recklessness towards other people’s lives by rushing through the pre-flight checklist (in the case where the pilot does not believe she is doing a film stunt), it does not seem that she is morally responsible for throwing the company into liquidation, for this consequence does not seem to reflect ill will. But perhaps the quality-of-will externalist could try to argue that there are some unforeseeable consequences of the airplane crash that do reflect the pilot’s recklessness.
These are the challenges facing a no-foreseeability view of derivative responsibility. But a reason to take the view seriously is found in Manuel Vargas’ (2005) well-discussed dilemma for foresight and (reasonable) foreseeability views (which in many ways parallels the revisionist dilemma posed by strong internalists about culpable misconduct). According to Vargas’ dilemma, there are many cases in which the consequences of our behavior (for example, as youth) on our character and later choices are not foreseeable at the time of that behavior, and yet we are intuitively to blame for those consequences. Commonly discussed is his case of “Jeff the Jerk” in which Jeff, a high-school school kid, endeavors to become more like the “jerks” who have “success” with their female classmates. He successfully becomes a jerk, but this means that later in life he is “rude and inconsiderate about the feelings of others” as he lays off his employees (2005, 271). Vargas argues that it is natural and common to think that we are culpable for these sorts of consequences of our earlier behavior, even though they are not reasonably foreseeable. But foresight and reasonable foreseeability views must regard these character traits and choices as something for which we lack responsibility. Thus, we have a dilemma: either we accept a reasonable foreseeability or foresight view and its culpability revisionist implications or we reject those views in order to vindicate our ordinary pre-theoretical intuitions.
But are foreseeability and foresight views stuck on the horns of this dilemma? In favour of a reasonable foreseeability view, Fischer and Tognazzini (2009) reply that Vargas’ cases are either cases in which the consequences in question are intuitively non-culpable, or they are culpable but there is a way for reasonable foreseeability views to account for their culpability. Concerning Jeff the Jerk, for instance, Fischer and Tognazzini argue that he is blameworthy for the way that he lays off his employees, since a relevant consequence type was foreseeable for Jeff: the consequence that he would “[treat] some people poorly at some point in the future as a result of his jerky character” (2009, 537). So it is not clear that Vargas’ dilemma for foresight and foreseeability views can successfully be used to defend no-foreseeability views, or at least used against consequence-type reasonable foreseeability views.
The epistemic conditions of moral responsibility is thus a ripe field of philosophical research. While there is much more room for future contributions to the epistemic condition for culpable misconduct and for derivative responsibility, there are at least three other areas for future research on the epistemic conditions on which comparatively less has been written.
One of these areas is the epistemic condition for moral praiseworthiness, to which there are only a few extant contributions. Nomy Arpaly (2002) defends the view that cases of “inverse akrasia” or of doing something right while believing that it is wrong can in fact be morally praiseworthy, given appropriate care about the act’s right-making features. Paulina Sliwa (2017) disagrees, holding that there must be awareness of the rightness of the act to be praiseworthy for it. But even if we grant with Sliwa that a belief in wrongdoing undermines praiseworthiness, must there be awareness of the act’s rightness? What about a view modeled on a kind of weak internalism about culpability? But maybe there are reasons to embrace an asymmetry between the epistemic condition for praiseworthiness and the epistemic condition for blameworthiness?
Another area for future research is the epistemic condition for collective responsibility. As yet, there is not much work on this subject, but there are interesting questions to be asked on what the satisfaction of the above epistemic conditions on individual responsibility would look like at the collective level (supposing that such epistemic conditions ought to be satisfied for collective responsibility), and whether any unique epistemic conditions must be satisfied. If we took a “collectivist” approach to collective responsibility, according to which groups or corporations themselves can be morally responsible for collective actions and their consequences (whatever we say about the responsibility of individual members), we might wonder whether and under what conditions groups can themselves know or believe things, or whether this is even required for them to be morally responsible. Alternatively, if we took a more “individualistic” approach to collective responsibility, according to which only individual members of groups can be held responsible for collective actions and their consequences, it would seem that ordinary epistemic conditions apply concerning responsibility for their direct contribution to the collective action, but that further epistemic conditions need to be satisfied for them to be held responsible for collective actions and their consequences. On Seumas Miller’s (2006, 177) individualist approach, for instance, individual members are morally responsible for a collective action and any consequences of it only if they have a true belief that by acting in a certain way, “they will jointly realize an end which each of them has.”
A final area for future research is on the significance of the epistemic condition for criminal liability. In one of the first book-length studies of this kind, Douglas Husak (2016), a weak control-based internalist, argues that ignorance that an act is, or might be, morally wrong should ideally excuse offenders from criminal punishment. Such a view, if implemented, would force significant revisions to current (Anglo-American/common law) legal systems. Of course, it is already true in such systems that to determine whether a criminal offence has actually taken place—that is, to determine whether the accused performed the actus reus (that is, act) with the mens rea (that is, mental state) of criminal intent, knowledge, recklessness, or negligence—the satisfaction of certain epistemic conditions concerning awareness/ignorance of (non-moral/non-legal) facts must be proven beyond reasonable doubt. These conditions are part of the mens rea components of offenses. If your unattended child is harmed and you are ignorant of the risk of harm, but a “reasonable person” would have recognized that risk, then you are criminally negligent (for example, guilty of negligent homicide or endangerment). You are criminally reckless, by contrast, if you cause harm while recognizing the risk of harm; and you have criminal intent or knowledge if you cause harm knowing that the act would cause harm. Your sentence would likely also be heftier having been found guilty of one of these forms of liability than if you were found guilty of mere negligence (matching the common but not uncontroversial assumption that akratic wrongdoing is more culpable than unwitting wrongdoing.) Some existing offenses do also include awareness of the act’s illegality or wrongfulness in their mens rea components. (And one might think of the existing “insanity defense” in this context, for how it allows offenders to avoid conviction on the grounds that they cannot “distinguish right from wrong.” But in responsibility terms, this would be to appeal to a lack of a baseline moral capacity of responsibility, rather than to appeal directly to ignorance of the act’s wrongfulness). However, in Husak’s mind, we need to look beyond the way that actual jurisdictions impose criminal liability. If, guided by the “presumptive conformity” of law to morality, we were to consistently apply the correct—in Husak’s view, weak internalist—epistemic conditions of moral blameworthiness to criminal liability in the ideally just legal system (that is, without consideration of real-world problems concerning its applicability), then not only might we have to remove negligence as a form of criminal liability (for it is after all a form of ignorance of fact), but, argues Husak, we would have to “treat mistakes of fact and law [or morality] symmetrically by replicating the same normative structure in each context” (2016, 161). That is to say, the just legal system would impose criminal liability and punishment only on those offenders who are intentional, knowledgeable, reckless, and probably not negligent with respect to the underlying morality of the offence—in particular, with respect to whether it is “contrary to the balance of moral reasons and is wrong” (2016, 161). In practice, the just legal system would then either explicitly or implicitly build a requirement of awareness of (the risk of) wrongdoing into the mens rea element of the definition of the offense (for example, “murder” would be “knowingly killing someone while knowing the wrongfulness of doing so”), or (less symmetrically) such a system would leave the definitions of offences untouched and provide a unique “mistake of law/morality” defense (alongside other defenses, such as the insanity defense) for a not-guilty plea (see Husak’s discussion in: 2016, 262ff).
Husak’s revisionary application of the epistemic condition to criminal liability raises a number of questions. One issue that many will have with his straightforward application of culpability internalism to criminal liability is that the ideally just legal system would not punish “zealous terrorists who are unaware of wrongdoing” (2016, 265)—a rather counterintuitive consequence of the view! In this connection, we might ask whether it is true that a just legal system would make criminal liability depend on (at least one form of) moral blameworthiness, and thus on the satisfaction of its epistemic condition. Suppose that it wouldn’t. Would criminal liability still be structurally analogous to moral blameworthiness (cf. Rosen 2003 80-81), such that a parallel epistemic condition applies? If it were to make criminal liability depend on moral blameworthiness or a structural analogue, would the just legal system make criminal liability depend on the most plausible view of the epistemic condition (for example, in Husak’s view, a weak control-based internalism), or rather would it make criminal liability depend on the most accepted view of moral blameworthiness, or maybe whatever view accords most with common-sense intuitions of blameworthiness? Or should criminal liability have nothing to do with moral blameworthiness (but be concerned exclusively with, say, mere wrongdoing, deterrence, or rehabilitation). These are all important questions for future inquiries into the epistemic condition.
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