Olympe de Gouges (1748—1793)

Olympe de Gouges“Woman has the right to mount the scaffold; she must equally have the right to mount the rostrum” wrote Olympe de Gouges in 1791 in the best known of her writings The Rights of Woman (often referenced as The Declaration of the Rights of Woman and the Female Citizen), two years before she would be the third woman beheaded during France’s Reign of Terror. The only woman executed for her political writings during the French Revolution, she refused to toe the revolutionary party line in France that was calling for Louis XVI’s death (particularly evident in her pamphlet Les Trois Urnes, ou le Salut de la Patrie [The Three Ballot Boxes, or the Welfare of the Nation, 1793).  Simone de Beauvoir recognizes her, in Le Deuxième sexe [The Second Sex] (1949 [1953]), as one of the few women in history who “protested against their harsh destiny.” Favorably described by commentators alternately as a stateswoman, a femme philosophe, an artist, a political analyst, and an activist, she can be considered all of these but not without some qualification. While contradictions abound in her writings, she never wavered in her belief in the right to free speech and in its role in social and political critique.

On the death of her husband after a brief unhappy marriage, she moved to Paris, where, with the support of a wealthy admirer, she began a life’s work focused wholly on mounting the rostrum denied to women. Defying social convention in every direction and molding a life evocative of feminism of a much later age, Gouges spent her adult life advocating for victims of unjust systems, helping to create a public conversation on women’s rights and the economically disadvantaged, and attempting to bring taboo social issues to the theatrical stage and to the larger social discourse. There is disagreement on whether she participated in or even occasionally hosted some of the literary and philosophic salons of the day. Her biographer Oliver Blanc suggests yes; historian John R. Cole (2011) turns up no evidence. Still, she was recognized among the fashionable and intellectual elite in Paris, and she was well-versed in the main themes of the most influential thinkers of her day, at least for a time. Her name appears in the Almanach des addresses (a kind of social registry) from 1774-1784. Despite harsh criticism for using her voice in the political arena and thus challenging deeply entrenched gender norms (“having forgotten the virtues that belong to her sex,” wrote Pierre Gaspard Chaumette, then-President of the Paris Commune, warning other politically active women of Gouges’s fate), she was certainly the author of 40 plays (12 survive), two novels and close to 70 political pamphlets.

While not a philosopher in any strict sense, she deserves attention for her morally astute analysis of women’s condition in society, for her re-imagining of the intersection of gender and political engagement, for her conception of civic virtue and her pacifist stance, and for her advocacy of selfhood for women, blacks, and children (especially in their right to know their origins). She was among the first to demand the emancipation of slaves, the rights of women (including divorce and unwed motherhood), and the protection of orphans, the poor, the unemployed, the aged and the illegitimate. She had a talent for emulating those she admired, including especially Rousseau but also Condorcet, Voltaire, and the playwright Beaumarchais.

Table of Contents

  1. Early Life
  2. Intellectual Pursuits
    1. Literary
    2. Political
    3. The Rights of Woman (1791)
    4. Philosophical
      1. Gouges and Rousseau
  3. Relevance and Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Extant Works by Olympe de Gouges (in French)
    2. On-line English Translations of Gouges’s Original Works
    3. Secondary Sources in English (except Blanc)

1. Early Life

Details are limited. Born Marie Gouze in Montauban, France in 1748 to petite-bourgeois parents Anne Olympe Moisset Gouze, a maidservant, and her second husband, Pierre Gouze, a butcher, Marie grew up speaking Occitan (the dialect of the region). She was possibly the illegitimate daughter of Jean-Jacques Le Franc de Caix (the Marquis de Pompignan), himself a man of letters and a playwright (among whose claims to fame includes an accusation of plagiarism by Voltaire). In her semi-autobiographical Mémoire de Madame de Valmont sur l’ingratitude et la cruauté de la famille de Flaucourt (Memoir of Mme de Valmont) (1788), Gouges publishes letters purported to be transcriptions from Pompignan taking pains to distance himself from Valmont/Gouges. These letters stop short of unequivocal denial of his paternity.

She was married at 16 or 17 in 1765, unhappily, to Louis Aubrey (an associate of Pierre’s), with whom she had a son (also) Pierre, and by the age of 18 or 19 was widowed.  Denouncing marriage due to her recent past experience and disguising her widowhood (which would have given her a modicum of social and legal status), she adopted her mother’s middle name and the more aristocratic-sounding “de Gouges” and moved to Paris. Literate (schooled likely by Ursuline nuns in Montauban) but not particularly well-read, she spent the next decade informing herself on intellectual and political matters and integrating into Parisian society, supported by Jacques Biétrix de Roziéres, a wealthy weapons merchant, whom she may have met in Montauban shortly after the death of her husband or through her married sister, Jeanne Raynart. Biétrix insured her circumstances until the decline in his family’s resources in 1788. The year of her first published work is 1778, and it marks the end of her first decade in Paris.

She had begun to write in earnest around 1784. A literary compatriot and admirer of hers was Louis-Sébastien Mercier (1740-1814), with whom she shared many political views, including clemency for the King and a general abhorrence of violence. Mercier helped her navigate the tricky internal politics of the Comédie Française—the prestigious national theater of France—assisting her to publish several of her plays, and  to stage a handful. Charlotte Jeanne Be’raud de la Haye de Riou, Marchioness of Montesson (1739-1806), wife of the Duke of Orleans, a playwright herself and a woman of much influence and wealth, was among a list of other friends who came to her aid.

With little formal education and as a woman boldly unconventional, once she began her life of letters, her detractors were eager to find fault. She was often accused of being illiterate, yet her familiarity with Moliere, Paine, Diderot, Rousseau, Voltaire, and many others, the breadth of her interests, and the speed with which she replied to published criticism, all attest to the unlikelihood of the accusation. As French was not her native tongue and since her circumstances permitted, she maintained secretaries for most of her literary career.

2. Intellectual Pursuits

a. Literary

All of her plays and novels carry the theme of her life’s work: indignation at injustice. Her literary pursuits began with playwriting. Gouges wrote as many as 40 plays, as inventoried at her arrest. Twelve of those plays survived, and four found the requisite influential, wealthy, mostly male backing needed for their staging. Ten were published. While many of the plays by the dozen women playwrights that had been staged at the Comédie Française were published anonymously or under male pseudonyms, those playwrights who were successful on stage in their own names (most notably Julie Candielle) stuck to themes seen as suitable to their gender. Gouges broke with this tradition—publishing under her own name and pushing the boundaries of what was deemed appropriate subject matter for women playwrights—and withstood the consequences. Reviews of her early productions were mixed—some fairly favorable, others patronizing and condescending or skeptical of her authorship. Those of her plays read by the Comédie Française were often ridiculed by the actors themselves. Her later plays, more strongly political and controversial, were met with outright sarcasm and hostility by some reviewers: “[t]o write a good play, one needs a beard” wrote one critic.

Her first play, written in 1785, never produced for the stage, but published the following year, L’Homme Généreux [The Generous Man] explored the political powerlessness of women through representation of a socially privileged man’s struggle with sexual desire. The play also shines a light on the injustice of imprisonment for debt. Le Mariage Inattendu de Chérubin [Cherubin’s Unexpected Marriage] (1786), one of the several homages of the time written after Beaumarchais’ critically acclaimed Le Mariage de Figaro [The Marriage of Figaro] (1784), is a sequel to Figaro. Intent to rape is a theme in this play as it was in L’Homme Généreux; a privileged husband’s misplaced lust brings damage to the family, while the suffering of the victim is given significant attention. Gouges’s first staged production was originally titled Zamore et Mirza; ou L’Heureux Naufrage [Zamore and Mirza; or, The Happy Shipwreck] (1788). Written in 1784 and later revised, it was finally performed in 1789 under the title L’Esclavage de Nègres, ou l’Heureux naufrage [Black Slavery; or the Happy Shipwreck]. Accepted by the Comédie Française when submitted anonymously in 1785, it was then shelved for four years once the identity (and gender) of the playwright was confirmed. Winning praise from abolitionist groups, it was the first French play to focus on the inhumanity of slavery; it is, not surprisingly, also the first to feature the first person perspective of the slave. It saw three performances before it was shut down by sabotaging actors and protests organized by enraged French colonists who, deeply reliant on the slave trade, hired hecklers to wreak havoc on the production. Gouges fought back through the press, her social and literary connections and through the National Assembly. Understanding that her gender was connected to her lack of success, she called for a second national theatre dedicated solely to women’s productions, and she called for reforms within the Comédie Française itself.

Le Philosophe corrigé, ou le cocu supposé [The Philosopher Chastised, or the Supposed Cockold] (1787) represents women, despite expectations, as capable of agency around their own sexual desire, and of uniting and supporting each other, giving voice to the phenomenon that Simone de Beauvoir would address much later in The Second Sex with the observation that “women do not say ‘we’.” The play also depicts a male, the titular husband, as capable of acquiring moral knowledge through an evaluation of emotional response. Sympathy for his inexperienced wife and, later, an innocent baby, gives him insights he uses for moral reflection, a theme found in David Hume (1711-1776), Josiah Royce (1855-1916), and much modern feminist ethics. When French theatre in the decade of the Revolution turned to lighter vaudevillian fare, Gouges tried her hand at light comedy; La Bienfaisance récompense ou la vertu couronée [Beneficence Rewarded, or Virtue Crowned] (1788), a one-act comedy, portrayed the then-current Duc d’Orléans, an anti-royalist, as a doer of good.

But most of Gouges’s playwriting was dedicated to crafting principally dramatic—if melodramatic by today’s standards—pieces, responding to the issues of the day. And, she had a unique voice on many matters. Moliére chez Ninon ou e siécle de grands hommes [Moliére at Ninon’s, or the Century of Great Men] (1788), for instance, challenges the double standard between the sexes by depicting the famous, fiercely independent, literary courtesan, Ninon de Lenclos (1620-1705), as a noble person positively influencing the male intellectuals in her circle, including Moliére, all of whom are present to honor a visit by another notable intellectual, Queen Christina of Sweden (1626-1689).

Playwriting for Gouges was a political activity. In addition to slavery, she highlighted divorce, the marriageability of priests and nuns, girls forcibly sent to convents, the scandal of imprisonment for debt, and the sexual double-standard, as social issues, some repeatedly. Such activism was not unheard-of on the stage, but Gouges carried it to new heights. By 1790, her writings had become more explicitly political. She had three plays published:  Les Démocrates et les Aristocrates; ou le Curieux du Champ de Mars [The Democrats and the Aristocrats], a satire of political extremists on both sides; Le Nécessité du Divorce [The Necessity of Divorce], again illustrating the powerlessness of women trapped in marriage, and written simultaneously with a debate on the topic in the National Assembly (France would be the first Western country to legalize divorce two years later); and Le Couvent ou les Vœux Forces [The Convent, or Vows Compelled]. The Convent was her second play to see the light of day, and her greatest success. In the year of its publication it saw approximately 80 performances. Highlighting the political impotence of women, it illuminated the injustice of the Church’s complicity in male relatives’ right to force females into convents against their will.

Gaining momentum on the political front, her next play to be produced for the stage was Mirabeau aux Champs-Elysées [Mirabeau in the Elysian Fields] (1791). Depicting the Enlightenment philosophers Baron d’Montesquieu (1689-1755), Voltaire (1694-1778), and Rousseau, along with Benjamin Franklin (1706-1790), and, Madame Deshoulieres (1638-1694), Marquise de Sévigné (1626-1696) and Ninon de Lenclos—the latter three major female influences in France during the Enlightenment—Mirabeau awakens numerous notable historical figures to welcome Mirabeau (1749-1791) as a hero to the afterlife, in effect honoring his stance as a supporter of constitutional monarchy. Most notable, perhaps, is the appearance of the three women as worthy of a place of honor and a voice, platforms they use to assert, among other things, that the success of the Revolution pivots on the inclusion of women. (This is also the year Gouges wrote The Rights of Woman, discussed separately below.)

In 1792, one year before her trial and execution, she worked on two plays: the unfinished La France Sauvée, ou le Tyran détrôné [France Preserved, or the Tyrant Dethroned] and the completed L’Entrée de Dumourier [sic] à Bruxelles [Dumouriez’s Entry into Brussels].  The former, confiscated at her arrest, was used as proof of sedition at her trial because of its sympathetic depiction of Marie-Antoinette, even as Gouges used it to demonstrate support for her own case.  The latter depicted General Dumouriez’s defense of the Revolution against foreign anti-royalists, assisted by male and female warriors, and challenged her own privileging of aristocracy by suggesting that commoners were the true nobles. It was also the fourth and final play to be staged during Gouges’s lifetime.

The publication of Memoir of Madame de Valmont (1788) ironically begins, rather than summarizes, her political career. This fictionalized self-examination grappled with idealized father figures and fragmented selves, and served to package and compartmentalize her pre-Parisian life and move her forward wholly into a literary existence. Using a version of her (Gouges’s) personal story to make a political point, the narrator of the story sees clearly how gender works to constrain women. Mme de Valmont’s father’s refusal to acknowledge paternity raises issues of legitimacy for Valmont with financial and social repercussions. While he also expressed no patience for women’s forays into traditional male arenas such as writing, the narrator’s solution is to call for women to stop undermining other women and work to support each other. Rejection of the symbolic paternal voice of the culture has political power, and the Memoir presents an 18th century illustration of making the personal political—a vivid theme in 20th century feminism.

Gouges’s second novel Le Prince Philosophe (The Philosopher Prince), also written in 1788 but not published until 1792, reconceives monarchical rule, positing the best kind of ruler as one who would prefer not to rule, and proposing that all rule must be founded on the obligation not to take life. Scholars are mixed on whether she maintained her monarchist stance throughout her life.  Her literary output and her pamphleteering often suggest some version of a monarchy as her default position.  However, Azoulay (2009) suggests, at least in Gouges’s later writings (and perhaps in this second novel as well), her supposed attention to the monarchy is rather an attention to the preservation of the state and to the injustice of taking a life—namely, the King’s. Gouges’s depiction of the cause of the friction between the sexes in this novel is commentary on gender relations that here appears more conservative than will later be the case. The male characters still hesitate to share the reins with women. Yet, women are encouraged to develop reason rather than charm, and one female character submits a carefully drawn up plan advocating education and job opportunities for females, eventually winning a small victory by receiving permission to run a women’s academy.

Gabrielle Verdier (1994) notes several distinguishing features of Gouges’s plays:  (1) young women have active roles to play, (2) women of any age have agency, (3) female rivalry is absent, (4) mature women are protectors, benefactors, and mentors, (5) and the abuses that women experience are inevitably tied to larger social injustices. While not prepared to offer up a fully formed theory of oppression, Gouges is readying the space where that work can be done.

In all of her writings, both literary and political, one finds an unflinching self-confidence and a desire for justice. What Lisa Beckstrand (2009) refers to as the “theme of the global family” also runs through Gouges’s literary work. Familial obligations dominate and are responses to the inadequacies of the state. The plight of the illegitimate child, the unmarried mother, the poor, the commoner (at least by 1792), the orphan, the unemployed, the slave, even the King when he is most vulnerable, are all brought to light, with family connection and sympathy for the most disadvantaged as the pivotal plot points. Women characters regularly displace men at center stage. It is women, unified with each other and winning the recognition of men, that most characterizes what Gouges conveys in her work. She is the first to bring several taboo issues to the stage, divorce and slavery among them. Especially prolific in the four years from 1789 to her death in 1793, her political passion, labeled conservative by many, is still astonishing for its persistence in a culture working strenuously too often to stifle women’s voices.

b. Political

The impact of Olympe de Gouges’s political activism is commemorated by her inclusion as the only French woman on revolutionary and abolitionist Abbé Henri Grégoire’s (1750-1831) list of “all those men [sic] who have had the courage to plead the cause” of abolition.  The list is included in the introduction to his On the Cultural Achievements of Negroes (1808), which was written as a counter to Thomas Jefferson’s less admiring look at race in Notes on the State of Virginia (1782). As with so much that came to prominence with modern feminism, indignation at injustice must have started for Gouges with her own marginalization as a woman, but it shifted to the external world with a recognition of the inhumanity of slavery. While she was not an immediatist like some in the next generation of abolitionists such as William Lloyd Garrison (1805-1879) in the U.S., abolitionist thought permeated her understanding of the world and of herself as a writer, and soon grounded her thinking on women. The French Revolution itself transformed Gouges’s thinking further when the rights of citizens, despite pleas from the Girondins, were not applied to the female citizen. In fact, female political participation of all kinds was formally banned by the French National Assembly in 1793, after one of several uprisings led by women. Gouges’s political tenacity showed itself most virulently in prison where she “mounted the rostrum” at least two final times, smuggling out pamphlets that condemned prison conditions and that accepted—indeed recklessly demanded—responsibility for her ideas, challenging how the rights of freedom of speech were embodied in the new Constitution.

Her path from social nonconformist, to political activist and reformer, to martyr was one untrodden by women.  Many of the most influential eighteenth century intellectuals—with a few exceptions—were convinced women did not have the intellectual capacity for politics. Gouges challenged that perception, while also problematizing it by writing hastily, sometimes dictating straight to the printer. While her uneven education opened her to ridicule, it gave her a critical affinity for Rousseauean ideas, as will be discussed below. Both playwriting and her productivity as a pamphleteer gained her celebrity which she used as a podium for her advocacy of the marginalized, and for drawing attention to the importance of the preservation of the state.

Gouges’s formal petitions to the National Assembly, and her public calls for governmental and social reform through the press and through her pamphleteering (common in France), went far beyond the The Rights of Woman of 1791 (see next section) and her stance on slavery. Among her many calls for change in this medium were: (as mentioned above) a demand for a national theatre dedicated to the works of women; a voluntary tax system (one of the few demands she published anonymously and which saw implementation the following year); state-sponsored working-groups for the unemployed; social services for widows, the elderly and orphans; civil rights for illegitimate children and unmarried mothers; suppression of the dowry system; regulation of prostitution; sanitation; rights of divorce; rights to marriage for priests and nuns; people’s juries for criminal trials; and the abolition of the death penalty.  She petitioned the National Assembly on a number of occasions on these and other matters. Whether or not related to her efforts, the National Assembly did pass laws in 1792 giving illegitimate children some of the civil rights for which she fought and granting women the right to divorce, even while women remained legal nonentities overall.

She is frequently touted as a (sometimes the) founder of modern feminism for her unrelenting advocacy for women’s rights in writing and in action. While the historical record is more complicated than that, in historian John R. Cole’s accounting (2011), “she published on current affairs and public policy more often and more boldly than any other woman. . . and [s]he made a more formal and sweeping demand for the extension of full civil and political rights to women than any prior person, male or female, French or foreign” (231). Her call for women to identify as women and band together in support of each other can also be considered a contribution to the revolutionary and to the concept of citizenship, and remains today an important focus for modern feminism. Others in France were also proposing feminist ideas, although none as actively and comprehensively as Gouges: most notably, François Poulain de la Barre (1647-1725) in the 17th century and Marie Madeleine Jodin (1741-90), Louise de Keralio-Robert (1758?-1822), Nicholas de Condorcet (1743-1794), and Etta Palm d’Aelders (Dutch, 1732-1799), in the 18th century. The latter two petitioned the National Assembly unsuccessfully in 1790 to ensure legal rights for women.

Gouges’s writings share many themes with what would become classic texts in the feminist movement of the 20th century:  independence of mind and body, access to political rights and political voice, education, and elimination of the sexual double standard.  Her awareness of these themes spring from her experience as a woman, solidified by her unhappy early marriage, her unapologetic and ostensibly scandalous first years in Paris, through to her sometimes-thwarted, oft-derided, attempts at participation in cultural, literary and political realms. She experienced firsthand how the rights of the citizen were denied women. Her early history, her frustration at being denied, or dismissed as, a voice in the public sphere, and the ridicule she withstood, aimed at her gender, gave shape to insights emblematic of much later feminist theory and concretized for her an understanding of the link between the public and private realms. Gouges contributed markedly to the depth and breadth of the discourse on women’s rights in late 18th century France, and on the plight of the underprivileged in general. As Cole summarizes: “she tried to rally other women behind a radical extension of liberty and equality into domestic relationships . . . and she [advocated for] the extension of rights to free persons of color and free blacks and to vindicate the full humanity of slaves in the Caribbean colonies” (231).

Perhaps most indicative of Gouges’s political courage and intellectual self-reliance was the stance which led to her death. Her decision to continue to publish works deemed seditious even as the danger of arrest grew shows courage and commitment to her advocacy of the less fortunate and exemplifies her self-definition as a political activist. She was the only woman executed for sedition during the Reign of Terror (1793-1794). That fact, along with comments such as those of Pierre Chaumette: “[r]emember the shameless Olympe de Gouges, . . . who abandoned the cares of her household to involve herself in the republic, and whose head fell under the avenging blade of the laws. Is it for women to make motions? Is it for women to put themselves at the head of our armies?” (Andress, 234), suggests that her outspoken views were greeted with increased hostility because of her gender. In May or June of 1793 her poster The Three Urns [or Ballot Boxes] appeared, calling for a referendum to let the people decide the form the new government should take. Proposing three forms of government: republic, federalist or constitutional monarchy, the essay was interpreted as a defense of the monarchy and used as justification for her arrest in September. Her continuing preference for a constitutional monarchy was likely propelled in part by her disappointment with the Revolution, but more specifically by her opposition to the death penalty and her general humanitarian inclinations. She appears to have had no elemental dispute with monarchy per se, problematizing any philosophical understanding of her commitment to human rights. The Rights of Woman, for instance, is dedicated to the Queen—as a woman, but presumably because she is the Queen.

c. The Rights of Woman (1791)

By far her most well-known and distinctly feminist work, The Rights of Woman (1791) was written as a response to The Declaration of the Rights of Man and of the Citizen, written in 1789 but officially the preamble to the French Constitution as of September 1791. Despite women’s participation in the Revolution and regardless of sympathies within the National Assembly, that document was the death knell for any hopes of inclusion of women’s rights under the “Rights of Man.” The patriarchal understanding of female virtue and sexual difference held sway, supported by Rousseau’s perspective on gender relations, perpetuating the view that women’s nurturing abilities and responsibilities negated political participation. Political passivity was itself seen as a feminine responsibility.

The Rights of Woman appeared originally as a pamphlet printed with five parts:  1) the dedication to the Queen, 2) a preamble addressed to “Man,” 3) the Articles of the Declaration, 4) a baffling description of a disagreement about a fare between herself and a cab driver, and 5) a critique of the marriage contract, modeled on Rousseau’s Social Contract. It most often appears (at least in English translation) without the fourth part (Cole, 2011). Forceful and sarcastic in tone and militant in spirit, its third section takes up each of the seventeen Articles of the Preamble to the French Constitution in turn and highlights the glaring omission of the female citizen within each article. Meant to be a document ensuring universal rights, the Declaration of the Rights of Man and the Citizen is exposed thereby as anything but. The immediacy of the implications of the Revolution finally fully awakened Gouges to the ramifications of being denied equal rights, but her entire oeuvre was aiming in this direction. Gouges wrote a document that highlights her personal contradictions (her own monarchist leanings as they hinder full autonomy most obviously), while bringing piercing illumination to contradictions in the French Constitution. Despite the lack of attention Gouges’s pamphlet received at the time, her greatest contribution to modern political discourse is the highlighting of the inadequacy of attempts at universality during the Enlightenment. The demands contained within the original document assert the universality of “Man” while denying the specificity required for “Woman,” therefore collapsing—at least logically—of its own efforts. Alert to the powerlessness of women and the injustice such a condition implies, Article 4 of The Rights of Woman, for instance, particularly calls for protection from tyranny, as “liberty and justice” demand; that is, as nature and reason demand in personal as well as political terms. To harmonize this document with her devotion to the monarchy for most of her political career takes significant effort.

For Gouges, the most important expression of liberty was the right to free speech; she had been exercising that right for almost a decade. Access to the rostrum required more than an early version of “add women and stir.” While Gouges’s Rights is rife with such pluralizing—extending any right of Man to Woman as well—there is also a clear acknowledgement that blind application of universal principles is insufficient for the pursuit of equality. Article XI, for example, demands the right of women to name the father of their children. The peculiarity of the need for this right on the part of women stands out because of its specificity and demonstrates the contradictions created by blindness to gender. The citizen of the French Revolution–the idealistic universal—is the free white adult male, leaving in his wake many injustices peculiar to individuals excluded from that “universal.” The Rights of Woman unapologetically highlights that problem.

The Enlightenment presumption of the “natural rights” of the citizen (as in “inalienable rights” in the U.S. Declaration of Independence) is in direct contradiction to the equally firmly-held belief in natural sexual differences—both of which are so-called “founding principles of nature.” While Gouges is not fully aware of the implications of this conflict, she holds unequivocally in The Rights of Woman that those natural rights do indeed grant equality to all, just as the French Declaration states but does not intend. The rights such equality implies need to be recognized as having a more far-reaching application; if rights are natural and if these rights are somehow inherent in bodies, then all bodies are deserving of such rights, regardless of any particularities, like gender or color.

Marriage, as the center for political exploitation, is thoroughly lambasted in the postamble, Part 5, to The Rights of Woman. Gouges describes marriage as the “tomb of trust and love,” and the place of “perpetual tyranny.” The primary site of institutionalized inequality, marriage creates the conditions for the development of women’s unreliability and capacity for deception. Just as Mary Wollstonecraft (1759-1797) does in A Vindication of the Rights of Woman (1792), Gouges points to female artifice and weakness as a consequence of woman’s powerless place in this legalized sexual union. Gouges, much like Wollstonecraft, attempts to combat societal deficiencies: the vicious circle which neglects the education of its females and then offers their narrower interests as the reason for the refusal of full citizenship. Both, however, see the resulting fact of women’s corruption and weak-mindedness as a major source of the problems of society, but herein also lies the solution. Borrowing from Rousseau, Gouges proposes a “social contract” as replacement for traditional marriage, reformulating his social contract with a focus that obliterates his gendered conception of citizen, and create the conditions for both parties to flourish. In the “Form for a Social Contract Between Man and Woman,” Gouges offers a kind of civil union based on equality, which will create the “moral means of achieving the perfection of a happy government!”. The state is a (reconceived) marriage writ large, for Gouges. What ails government are fixed social hierarchies impossible to maintain.  What heals a government is an equal balance of powers and a shared virtue (consistent with her continuing approval of a constitutional monarchy). Marriages are to be voluntary unions by equal rights-bearing partners who hold property and children mutually and dispense of same by agreement. All children produced during this union have the right to their mother’s and father’s name, “from whatever bed they come.”

Having been a monarchist almost to the end, her authorship of this document and her lack of formal education suggests Gouges possessed less than full comprehension of what we now view as the discourse on universal human rights. That said, the production of this document has influenced exactly that conversation, and thus her presence in the list of historical figures who matter philosophically has to be acknowledged. Even Wollstonecraft, in her Vindication of 1792, does not call for the complete reinvention of women as political selves, as does Gouges in 1791.

d. Philosophical

As with most Enlightenment thinking, a natural rights tradition—although not any kind of comprehensive theory of natural rights—can be found in Gouges’s views on the origins of citizenship and rights for women and blacks. By 1791, she is arguing that equality is natural; it “had only to be recognized.” It appears that Gouges did not see any contradiction in her royalist leanings; nevertheless, she may no longer have been a monarchist by this point. She held that the human mind has no sex, an idea traceable in the modern era as far back as Poulain de la Barre (1673); men and women are equally human, therefore capable of the same thoughts. While her lack of education precluded the use of any systematic methodology, the consistency of her advocacy for the powerless, of pacifism, and (eventually) for the universal application of moral and legal rights is of great merit, and remains, if not based in rigorous philosophical analysis, yet philosophically astute. Her writings, both literary and political, point in directions contemporary feminist philosophy traversed for much of the twentieth century and beyond. She presciently foreshadows the “masculine universal” of liberal democracy identified by much contemporary feminist thought. She rejected the perceptions of sexual difference used to drive women out of the political arena, while she advocated for women’s “special interests.” Echoing Plato’s attention to gender in The Republic, she saw natural differences between genders, but not of a kind relevant to the tasks of the citizens of the state.  Despite appearing after the French constitution being decreed and constitutionally frozen, Gouges’s The Rights of Woman was aimed at expanding, even supplanting, the official French Declaration.  Focusing on women as human and thus equal, but with pregnancy and motherhood as special differences, Gouges seemed comfortable with the resulting conceptual dissonance.

On the heels of The Rights of Woman, she published The Philosopher Prince (1792), a novel where ideas in the realm of political philosophy (perhaps influenced by the historical events of the previous three years) are most on display. With the marriage contract from The Rights of Woman as a template, she unpacks reasons for the lack of solidarity between the sexes; she depicts women living in a mythical society where education becomes a requirement for civic virtue; access to reason is necessary so that women grow up equal to men and engaged in public life. Azoulay (2009) gives the most scholarly attention to date to this novel, arguing that it provides evidence that Gouges was a monarchist only insofar as monarchy was the best means to preserve the nation. “Gouges did not seek the preservation of the monarchy but rather the revival of the kingdom” (43).

Earlier, in 1789, the pamphlet Le Bonheur primitif de l’homme [The Original Happiness of Man] also gives hints of a political philosophy. Gouges imagines a society where women were granted an education and encouraged in the development of their agency. Individual happiness depends on collective happiness, but collective happiness comes from the natural qualities found within families (Beckstrand’s “theme of the global family”). While agreeing with Rousseau that civilization corrupts, she parts ways with him on the education of females. While never directly critical of Rousseau, the implication here is that the corruptibility of civilization can be countered only if we raised “Sophie” within a nurturing egalitarian family with as much freedom and natural exploration as Rousseau proposes for “Emile.” The happiness of all requires, among many other things, that “[g]irls will go to the fields and guard the animals” (tr. Harth, 1992, 222). This pamphlet also contains her call for a national theatre for women.

We find fragments of a larger philosophical perspective wherever we look.  The female as subject rather than object, especially in political discourse, is among the most important and prevalent. Her understanding of the value of her own voice creates an understanding of self that challenges gender norms head on, withstands all public criticism, and refuses to collapse under the weight of taboo. A nascent moral philosophy can be unearthed by considering her lifelong attention to the plight of the disadvantaged. An early example is the postface to the second printing of her first play, written prior to its first staging, but after a long battle with the Comédie Française to have it staged. Réflexions sur les hommes négres [Reflections on Black Men] raises questions about personhood and race. Gouges identifies race as a social construct insofar as slavery condemns blacks to being bought and sold “like cows at market.” She is horrified at what privileged men will do in the name of profit. “It is only color” that differentiates the African from the European. And, difference in color is simply the beauty of nature. If “they are animals, are we not like they?” There is explicit criticism here of a binary way of seeing the world.

An atheist, she critiques religion—particularly Catholicism—by focusing on its oppressiveness, especially towards women. Religion should not prohibit one from listening to reason or encourage one to be “deaf to nature.” The celibacy of priests and nuns lays the ground for corruption and plays a role in religion’s oppressiveness as well, she proclaimed. Throughout her writings, respect for the individual appears more vividly than Enlightenment philosophers generally could conceive, grounds her pacifism, inspires her attention to children, and underscores her political vision. And, in part, through her reverence for Rousseau, she sees problems with the separation, both devastating in its implications in practice and invigorating in its theoretical possibilities, between the private and the public spheres.

i. Gouges and Rousseau

The writings of Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778) were a major influence on the French Revolution, as was the then-recent success of the American Revolution (1776). Among Gouges’s lost plays is one titled Les Rêveries de Rousseau, la Mort de Jean-Jacques à Ermenonville [Reveries of Rousseau, the Death of Jean-Jacques of Ermenonville] (1791)—she was an ardent admirer, calling him her “spiritual father”. While it is clear Rousseau’s philosophy as a systematizable whole was ignored by the revolutionaries, his idea that the power of the government should come from “the consent of the governed” inspired the overthrow of an absolutist monarchy. His advocacy of rule by the general will helped inspire the French to shed their monarchist allegiances and take to the streets.  His theory of education for boys promoted non-interference and encouraged conditions that would allow nature to take its course. That this was the most direct route to virtue and would produce the best kind of self was aimed at the man a boy like Emile would become, and was taken seriously by men and women alike in France and beyond.

Gouges described herself as a “pupil of pure nature,” embracing a Rousseauian perspective on education while imposing on it her own perspective on gender. The education Rousseau proposed for girls was mind-numbingly stifling; they were to be raised to understand they were “made for man’s delight.”

“They must be subject, all their lives, to the most constant and severe restraint, which is that of decorum: it is, therefore, necessary to accustom them early to such confinement, that it may not afterwards cost them too dear; and to the suppression of their caprices, that they may the more readily submit to the will of others” (Emile, or On Education, V:1297).

Rousseau claimed virtues for the male arose most purely when the individual was not constrained by civilization. He proposed that boys turn out best when left to themselves. He advocated freedom for Emile. But when it came to females, a system of cultural constraints was necessary in order to ensure the properly compliant nature for a companion for Emile. “[A]mong men, opinion is the tomb of virtue; among women it is the throne” (Emile, V:1278). Universal principles and the “masculine virtues” applied only to those dominant men.  In terms of gender, Rousseau was influencing the Revolution in just the way Gouges was finding fault with it.

Gouges agreed with Rousseau’s understanding of how education of the citizenry could transform society. Yet, seeing well beyond Rousseau in terms of gender, she proclaimed in The Rights of Woman that the failure of society to educate its women was the “sole cause” of the corruption of government. Gouges, in a number of documents, as has been noted, anticipated contemporary feminist philosophy’s claim that modern liberal democracy operated with a deficient notion of the universal because it lacked inclusiveness. Historically, woman is seen as the complementary and contrasting counterbalance to man; if man is a political animal, woman is a domestic one. While the prominent French revolutionaries worked to apply Rousseauean themes to, among other things, the exclusion of women from political participation, Gouges fought to raise awareness of what is largely the misapplication of Rousseau’s social critique while never naming Rousseau. According to her, if social systems are human-made and they tend to cause the evils of the world because they interfere with nature, then just as it is for males, so must it be for females. Despite his intentions, Rousseau’s egalitarian vision had immense feminist implications. Men’s tyranny over women, for Gouges, is clearly contrary to nature, not in sync with it. Her use of “social contract” in the postscript to the Declaration is a direct appropriation of Rousseau. Her social contract proclaims that the right in marriage to equal property and parental and inheritance rights is the only way to build a society of “perfect harmony.” As with Beauvoir a century and a half later, Gouges calls women to take responsibility for their condition, and demand equality. She conceived of it in the masculine, and applied it to herself. She accepted Rousseau’s understanding of “nature” and his discourse on rights. She wrote The Original Happiness of Man in 1789 as a demonstration of her debt to Rousseau. There, she acknowledges her lack of formal education (as she often did in her writings), suggesting that she could see some things more clearly because of that deficit (she is “at once placed and displaced in this enlightened age . . .”). Her freedom comes from her lack of constraint, originating, in part, in her lack of formal education. The artificial constraints she encounters are unjustly thrust upon her by her society.

Rousseau’s condemnation of class distinctions also spoke directly to Gouges’s experience. But he did not question the right of the sovereign over the governed and Gouges, despite her monarchism, does at times do so with vigor. (When that sovereign is in one’s own household–all the more need for vigor.) For instance, in her pamphlet containing a proposal for a female national guard (Sera-t-il Roi, ne le sera-t-il pas? [Will he, or will he not, be King?] (1791), she criticizes a sovereign who would ask its citizenry to go to war, suggesting that such a request contradicts the very essence of citizenship. Being a citizen requires one to honor one’s relationship to the state, not to deliberately put that relationship in jeopardy. At the center of an understanding of political life should be a commitment not to take life–that is, to preserve the polis as a whole.

3. Relevance and Legacy

In addition to the political activism just mentioned, Gouges foreshadowed Henry David Thoreau (1817-1862), Mahatma Gandhi (1869-1948) and Martin Luther King, Jr. (1929-1968), by calling for disobedience to obviously unjust laws. Her argument for protections for the deposed French king comes, not so much from her royalist tendencies, but from her understanding of the “global family” and from her pacifism, as well as from her understanding of the separability of sovereign power from the individual who inhabits that power. Once the sovereignty is removed, the individual, she believed, was no longer synonymous with that figurehead. Putting to death the man who held that title but has since relinquished it, is a miscarriage of justice.

Through the several articles of the third part of The Rights of Woman she helped to problematize the notion of universalizability as a moral good, and has helped to formulate and to popularize the notion that the word ‘man’ when used generically may be problematic

Gouges critiqued the principle of equality touted in France because it gave no attention to who it left out, and she worked to claim the rightful place of women and slaves within its protection.  She moved Querelle des Femmes (“the woman question”)—which had its origin in France in the middle ages and pivoted around what role(s) women should rightly play in society—out of the abstract and into the political arena. She moved the discussion of slavery from an abstract distant one (an issue for the colonies only) literally to center stage and specifically highlighted the moral irrelevance of color. The “color of man is nuanced,” she wrote; and she  questioned why, if blonds are not superior to brunettes, and mulattos not superior to Negroes, how whites can be any different.  Color cannot be a criterion for dehumanization. Her challenge to traditional binaries wherever she found them may be the culminating arc of her work and where we can find our greatest debt to her. Her fictional characters all strain against the straightjackets of their identities:  strong women vie for their independence in conversation with sympathetic men rather than pitting themselves against each other in rivalry over men; men and women bond together to right some significant wrong; women seek strength in other women and unify to accomplish morally worthy goals; men often relinquish their arbitrary right to power over women to work in tandem to accomplish just goals. Men are depicted applauding women’s success. Her political pamphlets demonstrate her commitment to an overhaul of society. Revolutions, she insisted, could not succeed without the inclusion of women. And, since blacks demonstrated their humanity with every step and every breath in her plays, their enslavement was an indictment of French society.

While silenced for a time by history, Gouges scholarship has increased steadily since the publication of Oliver Blanc’s first biography in 1981 (no English translation; supplanted by his 2003 publication). A singular figure in the French Revolution and a founding influence on the direction of women’s and human rights, Gouges’s resistance to gendered social norms and her insistence on the revolutionary nature of the application of women’s rights makes her an important historical figure. If not herself a philosopher, she had the stamina and the intellect to shape ideas that have been and continue to be philosophically relevant and valuable. Her ability to attain status and power and the public rostrum despite her background and her gender is astonishing. Her refusal to be silent in the face of injustices, both personal and social, contains the roots of her legacy.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Extant Works by Olympe de Gouges (in French)

  • Théâtre politique I, preface by Gisela Thiele-Knobloch (Paris: Côté-femmes éditions, 1992)–includes Le Couvent, Mirabeau aux Champs-Elysées, and L’Entrée de Dumourier à Bruxelles.
  • Oeuvres complétes Théâtre, Félix-Marcel Castan, ed. Montauban: Cocagne, 1993 (comprises the twelve extant plays, including two in manuscript).
  • Théâtre politique II, preface by Gisela Thiele-Knobloch (Paris: Côté-femmes éditions, 1993)—comprises L’Homme généreux, Les Démocrates et les aristocrates, La Nécessité du divorce, La France sauvée ou le tyran détrôné, and Le Prélat d’autrefois, ou Sophie et Saint-Elme.
  • Ecrits politiques, 1788-1791, volume 1, preface by Olivier Blanc (Paris: Côté-femmes éditions, 1993).
  • Action héroïque d’une françoise, ou La France sauvée par les femmes. Paris: Guillaume Junior, 1789.
  • L’entrée de Dumouriez à Bruxelles, ou Les vivendiers. gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Ecrits politiques, 1792-1793, volume 2, preface by Blanc (Paris: Côté-femmes éditions, 1993).
  • Mémoire de Madame de Valmont, 1788, roman (Paris: Côté-femmes éditions, 1995).
  • La France sauvée, ou Le tyran détrôné. //gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Mon dernier mot à mes chers amis. //gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Oeuvres, ed. Benoite Groult.  Paris:  Mercure de France, 1986.
  • Repentir de Madame de Gouges. 1791, //gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Les fantômes de l’opinion publique, 1791? //gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Pour sauver la patrie, il faut respecter les trois ordes : c’est le seul moyen de conciliation qui nous reste. (1789). //gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Le cri du sage, par une femme. (1789 ?). //gallica.bnf.fr.
  • Dialogue allégorique entre la France et la vérité, dédié aux états généraux. 1789. //gallica.bnf.fr.

b. On-line English Translations of Gouges’s Original Works

  • On-going translation project by Clarissa Palmer:  Available at www.olympedegouges.eu.
  • The Rights of Woman (1791) [titled here Declaration of the Rights of Women and the Female Citizen, 1791]: www.fordham.edu/halsall/mod/1791degouge1.asp.
  • Transcript of her trial:  chnm.gmu.edu/revolution/d/488/.
  • “Reflections on Negroes” (trans. Sylvie Molta) www.uga.edu/slavery/texts/literary_works/reflections.pdf.
  • “Response to the American Champion” (trans. Maryann DeJulio) www.uga.edu/slavery/texts/literary_works/reponseenglish.pdf.
  • Additional material: www.uga.edu/slavery/texts/other_works.htm#1789.

c. Secondary Sources in English (except Blanc)

  • Andress, David. The Terror: the Merciless War for Freedom in Revolutionary France. New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 2006.
  • Azoulay, Ariella. “The Absent Philosopher-Prince: Thinking Political Philosophy with Olympe de Gouges.” Radical Philosophy 158 (Nov/Dec 2009).
  • Beckstrand, Lisa.  Deviant Women of the French Revolution and the Rise of Feminism. Verlag:  Associated University Presse, 2009.
  • Beauvoir, Simone de. The Second Sex. Trans. H. M. Parshley. Vintage Books (Random House) (1989) [1952].
  • Blanc, Oliver. Une Femme de Libertés: Olympe de Gouges. Syros: Alternatives, 1989.
  • Blanc, Oliver. Marie-Olympe de Gouges: Une Humaniste à la fin du XVIIIe siècle.  Paris; Editions René Viénet, 2003.
  • Brown, Gregory S. “The Self-Fashionings of Olympe de Gouges, 1784-1789.” Eighteenth-Century Studies, 34(3) (2001), 383-401.
  • Cole, John. Between the Queen and the Cabby. Montreal, Quebec, Canada:  McGill-Queen’s University Press, 2011 (contains the only full length translation of all five parts of The Rights of Woman).
  • Diamond, Marie Josephine. “The Revolutionary Rhetoric of Olympe de Gouges.” Feminist Issues, 14(1) (1994), 3-23.
  • Fraisse, Genevieve, and Michelle Perrot, eds. A History of Women in the West, Vol. 4: Emerging Feminism from Revolution to World War. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1993.
  • Garrett, Aaron.  “Human Nature.” Cambridge History of Eighteenth-century Philosophy, Volumes 1, ed. Knud Haakonssen.  New York, NY:  Cambridge University Press, 2006.  160-233.
  • Green, Karen.  A History of Women’s Political Thought in Europe, 1700-1800. New York, NY:  Cambridge University Press, 2014.  (Especially Chapter 9: “Anticipating and experiencing the revolution in France,” 203-234.)
  • Groult, Benoîte, ed. (French) “Olympe de Gouges: la première feminist moderne,” in Olympe de Gouges: Oeuvres. Paris: Mercure de France, 1988.
  • Harth, Erica. Cartesian Women: Versions and Subversions of Rational Discourse in the Old Regime.  Ithaca, NY:  Cornell University Press, 1992.
  • Levy, Darline Gay, Harriet Branson Applewhite and Mary Durham Johnson. Women in Revolutionary Paris: 1789-1795: Selected Documents Translated with Notes and Commentary. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1979.
  • Mattos, Rudy Frederic de. The Discourse of Women Writers in the French Revolution: Olympe de Gouges and Constance de Salm. 2007.  Unpublished dissertation.  University of Texas at Austin Electronic Theses and Dissertations.
  • Maclean Marie.  “Revolution and Opposition:  Olympe de Gouges and the Déclaration des droits de la femme.” In Literature and Revolution. Ed. David Beven. Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1989.
  • Melzer, Sara E. and Leslie W. Rabine, eds. Rebel Daughters:  Women and the French Revolution. New York: Oxford University Press, USA, 1992.
  • Miller, Christopher L. The French Atlantic Triangle:  Literature and Culture of the Slave Trade.  Durham, NC:  Duke University Press, 2008.
  • Monedas, Mary Cecilia.  “Neglected Texts of Olympe de Gouges, Pamphleteer of the French Revolution of 1789,” Advances in the History of Rhetoric 1.1 (1996).  43-54.
  • Montfort-Howard, Catherine, ed. Literate Women and the French Revolution of 1789. Birmingham, AL: Summa Publications, 1994.
  • Mousset, Sophie.  Women’s Rights and the French Revolution: a Biography of Olympe de Gouges. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 2007.
  • Nielson, Wendy C. “Staging Rousseau’s Republic:  French Revolutionary Festivals and Olympe de Gouges.” Eighteenth-Century: Theory and Interpretation, 43(3) (Fall 2003), 265-85.
  • Nielson, Wendy C. Women Warriors in Romantic Drama. Lanham, MD: The University of Delaware Press, 2013.
  • O’Neill, Eileen. “Early Modern Women Philosophers and the History of Philosophy.” Hypatia 20(3) (2005), 185-197.
  • Scott, Joan Wallach. “French Feminists and the Rights of ‘Man’: Olympe de Gouges’s Declarations.” History Workshop 28 (1989), 1-21.
  • Scott, Joan Wallach. Only Paradoxes to Offer:  French Feminists and the Rights of Man. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1996.
  • Sherman, Carol L.  Reading Olympe de Gouges. New York, NY:  Palgrave Macmillan, 2013.
  • Spencer, Samia I., ed.  French Women and the Age of Enlightenment. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1984.
  • Trouille, Mary Seidman. “Eighteenth-Century Amazons of the Pen: Stéphanie de Genlis & Olympe de Gouges.” Femmes Savants et Femmes d’Esprit: Women Intellectuals of the French Eighteenth Century. Eds. Roland Bonnel and Catherine Rubinger. New York: Peter Lang, 1994.
  • Trouille, Mary Seidman. Sexual Politics in the Enlightenment: Women Writers Read Rousseau. Albany: State U of New York Press, 1997.
  • Vanpée, Janie.  La Déclaration des Droits de la Femme: Olympe de Gouges’s Re-Writing of La Déclaration des Droits de l’Homme. In Montfort-Howard, Catherine, ed. Literate Women and the French Revolution of 1789. Birmingham, AL: Summa Publications, 1994. 55-80.
  • Verdier, Gabrielle. “From Reform to Revolution: The Social Theater of Olympe de Gouges.” In Montfort-Howard, Catherine, ed. Literate Women and the French Revolution of 1789. Birmingham, AL: Summa Publications, 1994. 189-224.


Author Information

Joan Woolfrey
Email: jwoolfrey@wcupa.edu
West Chester University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.