Niccolò Machiavelli (1469—1527)
Machiavelli was a 16th century Florentine philosopher known primarily for his political ideas. His two most famous philosophical books, The Prince and the Discourses on Livy, were published after his death. His philosophical legacy remains enigmatic, but that result should not be surprising for a thinker who understood the necessity to work sometimes from the shadows. There is still no settled scholarly opinion with respect to almost any facet of Machiavelli’s philosophy. Philosophers disagree concerning his overall intention, the status of his sincerity, the status of his piety, the unity of his works, and the content of his teaching.
His influence has been enormous. Arguably no philosopher since antiquity, with the possible exception of Kant, has affected his successors so deeply. Indeed, the very list of these successors reads almost as if it were the history of modern political philosophy itself. Bacon, Descartes, Spinoza, Bayle, Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, Hume, Smith, Montesquieu, Fichte, Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche number among those whose ideas ring with the echo of Machiavelli’s thought. Even those who apparently rejected the foundations of his philosophy, such as Montaigne, typically regarded Machiavelli as a formidable opponent and deemed it necessary to engage with the implications of that philosophy.
Table of Contents
- Philosophical Themes
- Machiavelli’s Corpus
- Possible Philosophical Influences on Machiavelli
- Contemporary Interpretations
- References and Further Reading
It is customary to divide Machiavelli’s life into three periods: his youth; his work for the Florentine republic; and his later years, during which he composed his most important philosophical writings.
Most of Machiavelli’s diplomatic and philosophical career was bookended by two important political events: the French invasion of Italy in 1494 by Charles VIII; and the sack of Rome in 1527 by the army of Emperor Charles V.
In what follows, citations to The Prince refer to chapter number (e.g., “P 17”). Citations to the Discourses and to the Florentine Histories refer to book and chapter number (e.g., “D 3.1” and “FH 4.26”). Citations to the Art of War refer to book and sentence number in the Italian edition of Marchand, Farchard, and Masi and in the corresponding translation of Lynch (e.g., “AW 1.64”).
a. The Youth (1469-1498)
Machiavelli was born on May 3, 1469, to a somewhat distinguished family. He grew up in the Santo Spirito district of Florence. He had three siblings: Primavera, Margherita, and Totto. His mother was Bartolomea di Stefano Nelli. His father was Bernardo, a doctor of law who spent a considerable part of his meager income on books and who seems to have been especially enamored of Cicero. So, at a young age, Machiavelli was exposed to many classical authors who influenced him profoundly; as he says in the Discourses, the things that shape a boy of “tender years” will ever afterward regulate his conduct (D 3.46). We do not know whether Machiavelli read Greek, but he certainly read Greek authors in translation, such as Thucydides, Plato, Xenophon, Aristotle, Polybius, Plutarch, and Ptolemy. He was studying Latin already by age seven and translating vernacular works into Latin by age twelve. Among the Latin authors that he read were Plautus, Terence, Caesar, Cicero, Sallust, Virgil, Lucretius, Tibullus, Ovid, Seneca, Tacitus, Priscian, Macrobius, and Livy. Among Machiavelli’s favorite Italian authors were Dante and Petrarch.
When he was twelve, Machiavelli began to study under the priest Paolo da Ronciglione, a famous teacher who instructed many prominent humanists. Machiavelli may have studied later under Marcello di Virgilio Adriani, a professor at the University of Florence.
The diaries of Machiavelli’s father end in 1487. For the next ten years, there is no record of Machiavelli’s activities. In 1497, he returns to the historical record by writing two letters in a dispute with the Pazzi family.
During this period, there were many important dates during this period. The Pazzi conspiracy against the Medici occurred in 1478. Savonarola began to preach in Florence in 1482. In 1492, Lorenzo the Magnificent died and Rodrigo Borgia ascended to the papacy as Alexander VI. In 1490, after preaching elsewhere for several years, Savonarola returned to Florence and was assigned to San Marco. In 1494, he gained authority in Florence when the Medici were expelled in the aftermath of the invasion of Charles VIII. Machiavelli’s mother passed away in 1496, the same year that Savonarola would urge the creation of the Great Council. On May 12, 1497, Savonarola was excommunicated by Alexander VI. On May 23, 1498, almost exactly a year later, he was hung and then burned at the stake with two other friars in the Piazza della Signoria.
b. The Official (1498-1512)
Not long after Savonarola was put to death, Machiavelli was appointed to serve under Adriani as head of the Second Chancery. Machiavelli was 29 and had no prior political experience. A month after he was appointed to the Chancery, he was also appointed to serve as Secretary to the Ten, the committee on war.
In November 1498 he undertook his first diplomatic assignment, which involved a brief trip to the city of Piombino. In March 1499, he was sent to Pontedera to negotiate a pay dispute involving the mercenary captain, Jacopo d’Appiano. In July of the same year, he would visit Countess Caterina Sforza at Forli (P 3, 6, and 20; D 3.6; FH 7.22 and 8.34; AW 7.27 and 7.31).
His first major mission was to the French court, from July 1500 to January 1501. There he would meet Georges d’Amboise, the cardinal of Rouen and Louis XII’s finance minister (P 3). In 1501, he would take three trips to the city of Pistoia, which was being torn to pieces by factional disputes (P 17). Over the next decade, he would undertake many other missions, some of which kept him away from home for months (e.g., his 1507 mission to Germany).
In August 1501 he was married to Marietta di Ludovico Corsini. Machiavelli and Marietta would eventually have several children, including Bernardo, Primerana (who died young), an unnamed daughter (who also died young), Baccina, Ludovico, Piero, Guido, and Totto. Machiavelli was also romantically linked to other women, such as the courtesan La Riccia and the singer Barbera Salutati.
In 1502, Machiavelli met Cesare Borgia for the first time (e.g., P 3, 7, 8, and 17; D 2.24). In the same year, Florence underwent a major constitutional reform, which would place Piero Soderini as gonfaloniere for life (previously the term limit had been two months). Soderini (e.g., D 1.7, 1.52, 1.56, 3.3, 3.9, and 3.30) allowed Machiavelli to create a Florentine militia in 1505-1506. The militia was an idea that Machiavelli had promoted so that Florence would not have to rely upon foreign or mercenary troops (see P 12 and 13). In 1507, Machiavelli would be appointed to serve as chancellor to the newly created Nine, a committee concerning the militia.
Between 1502 and 1507, Machiavelli would collaborate with Leonardo da Vinci on various projects. The most notable was an attempt to connect the Arno River to the sea; to irrigate the Arno valley; and to cut off the water supply to Pisa.
In the summer of 1512, Machiavelli’s militia was crushed at the city of Prato. Soderini was exiled, and by September 1 Giuliano de’ Medici would march into Florence to reestablish Medici control of the city. Machiavelli’s tenure for the Florentine government would last from June 19, 1498 to November 7, 1512. He was one of the few officials from the republic to be dismissed upon the return of the Medici.
During this period, Cesare Borgia became the Duke of Valentinois in the late summer of 1498. Machiavelli’s father, Bernardo, died in 1500. Alexander VI died in August 1503 and was replaced by Pius III (who lasted less than a month). Julius II would ascend to the papacy later in November 1503.
c. The Philosopher (1513-1527)
In late 1512, Machiavelli was accused of participating in an anti-Medici conspiracy. In early 1513, he was imprisoned for twenty-two days and tortured with the strappado, a method that painfully dislocated the shoulders. He was released in March and retired to a family house (which still stands) in Sant’Andrea in Percussina.
It was a profound fall from grace, and Machiavelli felt it keenly; he complains of his “malignity of fortune” in the Dedicatory Letter to The Prince. He seems to have commenced writing almost immediately. By 10 December 1513, he wrote to his friend, Francesco Vettori, that he was hard at work on what we now know as his most famous philosophical book, The Prince. He also began to write the Discourses on Livy during this period.
During the following years, Machiavelli attended literary and philosophical discussions in the gardens of the Rucellai family, the Orti Oricellari. He wrote poetry and plays during this period, and in 1518 he likely wrote his most famous play, Mandragola.
Friends such as Francesco Guicciardini and patrons such as Lorenzo di Filippo Strozzi attempted, with varying degrees of success, to restore Machiavelli’s reputation with the Medici. Something must have worked. In 1520, Machiavelli was sent on a minor diplomatic mission to Lucca, where he would write the Life of Castruccio Castracani. Impressed, Giuliano de’ Medici offered Machiavelli a position in the University of Florence as the city’s official historiographer. Giuliano would also commission the Florentine Histories (which Machiavelli would finish by 1525).
In 1520, Machiavelli published the Art of War, the only major prose work he would publish during his lifetime. It was well received in both Florence and Rome. He directed the first production of Clizia in January 1525.
Machiavelli died on June 21, 1527. His body is buried in the Florentine basilica of Santa Croce.
During this period, Giovanni de’ Medici became Pope Leo X upon the death of Julius II, in 1513. He was the first Florentine ever to become pope. In October 1517, Martin Luther sent his 95 Theses to Albert of Mainz. In 1521, Luther was excommunicated by Leo X. In 1522, Piero Soderini died in Rome. In 1523, Giuliano de’ Medici became Pope Clement VII. In 1527, Clement refused Henry VIII’s request for an annulment. Five years later, on May 6, 1527, Rome was sacked by Emperor Charles V.
2. Philosophical Themes
If to be a philosopher means to inquire without any fear of boundaries, Machiavelli is the epitome of a philosopher. Although it is unclear exactly what “reason” means for Machiavelli, he says that it is “good to reason about everything” (bene ragionare d’ogni cosa; D 1.18). And he says: “I do not judge nor shall I ever judge it to be a defect to defend any opinion with reasons, without wishing to use either authority or force for it” (D 1.58). He claims that he will not reason about certain topics but then does so, anyway (e.g., P 2, 6, 11, and 12; compare D 1.16 and 1.58). And he suggests that a prince should be a “broad questioner” (largo domandatore) and a “patient listener to the truth” (paziente auditore del vero; P 23).
But what more precisely might Machiavelli mean by “philosophy”? It is worth noting that the word “philosophy” (filosofia) never appears in The Prince or the Discourses (but see FH 7.6). The word “philosopher(s)” (filosofo / filosofi) appears once in The Prince (P 19) and three times in the Discourses (D 1.56, 2.5, and 3.12; see also D 1.4-5 and 2.12, as well as FH 5.1 and 8.29). Machiavelli occasionally refers to other philosophical predecessors (e.g., D 3.6 and 3.26; FH 5.1; and AW 1.25).
For the sake of presentation, this article presumes that The Prince and the Discourses comprise a unified Machiavellian philosophy. Readers should note that other interpreters would not make this presumption. Regardless, what follows is a series of representative themes or vignettes that could support any number of interpretations.
The most fundamental of all of Machiavelli’s ideas is virtù. This word has several valences but is reliably translated in English as “virtue” (sometimes as “skill” or “excellence”). Although difficult to characterize concisely, Machiavellian virtue concerns the capacity to shape things and is a combination of self-reliance, self-assertion, self-discipline, and self-knowledge.
With respect to self-reliance, a helpful way to think of virtue is in terms of what Machiavelli calls “one’s own arms” (arme proprie; P 1 and 13; D 1.21), a notion that he links to virtue. This phrase at times refers literally to one’s soldiers or troops. But it can also refer to a general sense of what is one’s own, that is, what does not belong to or depend upon something else. Minimally, then, virtue may mean to rely upon one’s self or one’s possessions. Maximally, it may mean to disavow reliance in every sense—such as the reliance upon nature, fortune, tradition, and so on. To be virtuous might mean, then, not only to be self-reliant but also to be independent. In this way, Machiavelli is perhaps the forerunner of various modern accounts of substance (e.g., that of Descartes) that characterize the reality of a thing in terms of its independence rather than its goodness.
With respect to self-assertion, those with virtue are dynamic and restless, even relentless. Machiavellian virtue thus seems more closely related to the Greek conception of active power (dynamis) than to the Greek conception of virtue (arete). Consequently, the idiom of idleness or leisure (ozio) is foreign to most, if not all, of the successful characters in Machiavelli’s writings, who instead constantly work toward the achievement of their aims. The Romans, ostensibly one of the model republics, always look for danger from afar; fight wars immediately if it is necessary; and do not hesitate to employ fraud (P 3; D 2.13). Cesare Borgia, ostensibly one of the model princes, labors ceaselessly to lay the proper foundations for his future (P 7). Machiavelli urges his readers to think of war always, especially in times of peace (P 14); never to fail to see the oncoming storm in the midst of calm (P 24); and to beware of Fortune, who is like “one of those raging rivers” that destroys everything in its path (P 25). He laments the idleness of modern times (D 1.pr; see also FH 5.1) and encourages potential founders to ponder the wisdom of choosing a site that would force its inhabitants to work hard in order to survive (D 1.1). Machiavelli says that a wise prince should never be idle in peaceful times but should instead use his industry (industria) to resist adversity when fortune changes (P 14).
With respect to self-discipline, virtue involves a recognition of one’s limits coupled with the discipline to work within those limits. The Prince, for instance, is occasionally seen as a manual for autocrats or tyrants. But in fact it is replete with recommendations of moderation and self-discipline. Machiavelli insists, for example, that a prince should use cruelty sparingly and appropriately (P 8); that he should not seek to oppress the people (P 9); that he should not spend his subjects’ money (P 16) or take their property or women (P 17); that he should appear to merciful, faithful, honest, humane, and, above all, religious (P 18); that he should be reliable, not only as a “true friend” but as a “true enemy” (P 21); and so forth. And although Machiavelli rarely discusses justice in The Prince, he does say that “victories are never so clear that the winner does not have to have some respect [qualche respetto], especially for justice” (giustizia; P 21; see also 19 and 26). For Machiavelli, virtue includes a recognition of the restraints or limitations within which one must work: not only one’s own limits, but social ones, including conventional understandings of right and wrong.
Finally, with respect to self-knowledge, virtue involves knowing one’s capabilities and possessing the paradoxical ability to be firmly flexible. It is not enough to be constantly moving; additionally, one must always be ready and willing to move in another direction. Nor is it enough simply to recognize one’s limits; additionally, one must always be ready and willing to find ways to turn a disadvantage into an advantage. Success is never a permanent achievement. Time sweeps everything before it and brings the good as well as the bad (P 3); fortune varies and can ruin those who are obstinate (P 25). Virtue requires that we know how to be impetuous (impetuoso); that we know how to recognize fortune’s impetus (impeto); that we know how to move quickly in order to seize an opportunity before it evaporates. Virtue involves flexibility—but this is both a disciplined and an optimistic flexibility. Furthermore, it is a flexibility that exists within prudently ascertained parameters and for which we are responsible. What it means to be virtuous involves understanding ourselves and our place in the cosmos. In this way, Machiavelli’s conception of virtue is linked not only with his conception of fortune but also with necessity and nature. Furthermore, it raises the question of what it means to be wise (savio), an important term in Machiavelli’s thought.
It should be emphasized that Machiavellian virtue is not necessarily moral. At first glance and perhaps upon closer inspection, Machiavellian virtue is something like knowing when to choose virtue (as traditionally understood) and when to choose vice. As he puts it, we must learn how not to be good (P 15 and 19) or even how to enter into evil (P 18; compare D 1.52), since it is not possible to be altogether good (D 1.26). Machiavelli is sensitive to the role that moral judgment plays in political life; there would be no need to dissimulate if the opinions of others did not matter. But his point seems to be that we do not have to think of our own actions as being excellent or poor simply in terms of whether they are linked to conventional moral notions of right and wrong. Praise and blame are levied by observers, but not all observers see from the perspective of conventional morality.
Some scholars point to Machiavelli’s use of mitigating rhetorical techniques and to his reading of classical authors in order to argue that his notion of virtue is in fact much closer to the traditional account than it first appears. Crucial for this issue are the central chapters of The Prince (P 15-19). Some scholars highlight similarities between Machiavelli’s treatment of liberality and mercy in particular and the treatments of Cicero (De officiis) and Seneca (De beneficiis and De clementia). They argue that Machiavelli’s understanding of these virtues is not in principle different from the classical understanding and that Machiavelli’s concern is more with the manner in which these virtues are perceived or “held” (tenuto). Other scholars argue that these chapters of The Prince completely overturn the classical and Christian understanding of these virtues and that Machiavelli intends a new account that is actually “useful” in the world (utile; P 15). The scholarly disagreement over the status of the virtues in the central chapters of The Prince, in other words, reflects the broader disagreement concerning Machiavelli’s understanding of virtue as such.
Lastly, it is worth noting that virtù comes from the Latin virtus, which itself comes from vir or “man.” It is no accident that those without virtue are often called weak, pusillanimous, and even effeminate (effeminato)—such as the Medes, who are characterized as effeminate as the result of a long peace (P 6). Neither is it an accident that fortune, with which virtue is regularly paired and contrasted, is female (e.g., P 20 and 25).
Fortuna stands alongside virtù as a core Machiavellian concept. It is reliably translated as “fortune” but it can also mean “storms at sea” in both Latin and Italian.
Machiavelli often situates virtue and fortune in tension, if not opposition. At times, he suggests that virtue can resist or even control fortune (e.g., P 25). But he also suggests that fortune cannot be opposed (e.g., D 2.30) and that it can hold down the greatest of men with its “malignity” (malignità; P Ded.Let and 7, as well as D 2.pr). Fortune accompanies good with evil and evil with good (FH 2.30). Thus, one of the most important questions to ask of Machiavelli concerns this relationship between virtue and fortune.
One way of engaging this question is to think of fortune in terms of what Machiavelli calls the “arms of others” (arme d’altri; P 1 and 12-13; D 1.43). This phrase at times refers literally to soldiers who are owned by someone else (auxiliaries) and soldiers who change masters for pay (mercenaries). But it can also refer to a general sense of what is not one’s own, that is, what belongs or depends upon something else. Minimally, then, fortune means to rely upon outside influences—such as chance or God—rather than one’s self. Maximally, it may mean to rely completely upon outside influences and, in the end, to jettison completely the idea of personal responsibility. Few scholars would argue that Machiavelli upholds the maximal position, but it remains unclear how and to what extent Machiavelli believes that we should rely upon fortune in the minimal sense.
A second way of engaging this question is to examine the ways in which Machiavelli portrays fortune. In one passage, he likens fortune to “one of those violent rivers” (uno di questi fiumi rovinosi) which, when enraged, will flood plains and uproot everything in its path (P 25). This image uses language similar to the description of successful princes in the very same chapter (as well as elsewhere, such as P 19 and 20). Three times in the Prince 25 river image, fortune is said to have “impetus” (impeto); at least eight times throughout Prince 25, successful princes are said to need “impetuosity” (impeto) or to need to be impetuous (impetuoso). This linguistic proximity might mean various things: that virtue and fortune are not as opposed as they first appear; that a virtuous prince might share (or imitate) some of fortune’s qualities; or that a virtuous prince, in controlling fortune, takes over its role.
Even more famous than the likeness to a river is Machiavelli’s identification of fortune with femininity. This characterization has important Renaissance precedents—for instance, in the work of Leon Battista Alberti, Giovanni Pontano, and Enea Silvio Piccolomini. But Machiavelli’s own version is nuanced and has long resisted easy interpretation. In The Prince, fortune is identified as female (P 20) and is later said to be a woman or perhaps a lady (una donna; P 25). This image is echoed in one of Machiavelli’s poetic works, Dell’Occasione. There he is more specific: fortune is a woman who moves quickly with her foot on a wheel and who is largely bald-headed, except for a shock of hair that covers her face and prevents her from being recognized. Finally, in his tercets on fortune in I Capitoli, Machiavelli characterizes her as a two-faced goddess who is harsh, violent, cruel, and fickle.
It is worth looking more closely at The Prince’s image of una donna, which is the most famous of the feminine images. Machiavelli makes at least two provocative claims. Firstly, he says that it is necessary to beat and strike fortune down if one wants to hold her down. This hypothetical claim is often read as if it is a misogynistic imperative or at least a recommendation. But it is worth noting that Machiavelli does not claim that it is possible to hold fortune down at all; he instead simply remarks upon what would be necessary if one had the desire to do so. Secondly, Machiavelli says that fortune allows herself to be won more by the impetuous than by those who proceed in a cold or cautious manner. Thus, she is a friend of the young, “like a woman” (come donna; now a likeness rather than an identification). Here, too, it is worth noting that the emphasis concerns the agency of fortune. She is not conquered. Rather, she relents; she allows herself to be won. It is far from clear that the young men who come to her manage to subdue her in any meaningful way, with the implication being that it is not possible to do so without her consent.
On this point, it is also worth noting that recent work has increasingly explored Machiavelli’s portrayal of women. Although Machiavelli in at least one place discusses how a state is “ruined” because of women (D 3.26), he also seems to allow for the possibility of a female prince. The most notable ancient example is Dido, the founder and first queen of Carthage (P 20 and D 2.8). The most notable modern example is Caterina Sforza, who is called “Countess” six times (P 20; D 3.6; FH 8.34 [2x, but compare FH 7.22]; and AW 7.27 and 7.31) and “Madonna” twice (P 3 and D 3.6). Other possibilities include women who operate more indirectly, such Epicharis and Marcia—the respective mistresses of Nero and Commodus (D 3.6). In other words, Machiavelli seems to allow for the possibility of women who act virtuously, that is, who adopt manly characteristics. It may be that a problem with certain male, would-be princes is that they do not know how to adopt feminine characteristics, such as the fickleness or impetuosity of Fortune (e.g., P 25).
A third way of engaging the question of fortune’s role in Machiavelli’s philosophy is to look at what fortune does. One of fortune’s most important roles is supplying opportunity (e.g., P 6 and 20, as well as D 1.10 and D 2.pr). Even the most excellent and virtuous men appear to require the opportunity to display themselves. Figures as great as Moses, Romulus, Cyrus, and Theseus are no exception (P 6), nor is the quasi-mythical redeemer whom Machiavelli summons in order to save Italy (P 26). They all require the situation to be amenable: for a people to be weak or dispersed; for a province to be disunited; and so forth. However, some scholars have sought to deflate the role of fortune here by pointing to the meager basis of many opportunities (e.g., that of Romulus) and by emphasizing Machiavelli’s suggestion that one can create one’s own opportunities (P 20 and 26).
It is worth noting that Machiavelli writes on ingratitude, fortune, ambition, and opportunity in I Capitoli; notably, he omits a treatment of virtue. This pregnant silence may suggest that Machiavelli eventually came to see fortune, and not virtue, as the preeminent force in human affairs. In The Prince, he says: “I judge that it might be true” (iudico potere essere vero) that fortune governs half our actions and leaves the other half, or “close to it,” for us to govern (P 25; compare FH 7.21 and 8.36). But surely here Machiavelli is encouraging, even imploring us to ask whether it might not be true.
What Machiavelli means by “nature” is unclear. At times, it seems related to instability, as when he says that the nature of peoples is variable (P 6); that it is possible to change one’s nature with the times (P 25; D 1.40, 1.41, 1.58, 2.3, and 3.39); that worldly things by nature are variable and always in motion (P 10 and FH 5.1; compare P 25); that human things are always in motion (D 1.6 and 2.pr); and that all things are of finite duration (D 3.1). Elsewhere, it seems related to stability, as when he says that human nature is the same over time (e.g., D 1.pr, 1.11, and 3.43). At least once Machiavelli speaks of “natural things” (cose della natura; P 7); at least twice he associates nature with God (via spokesmen; see FH 3.13 and 4.16). In the only chapter in either The Prince or the Discourses which has the word “nature” (natura; D 3.43) in the title, the word surprisingly seems to mean something like “custom” or “education.” And the “natural prince” (principe naturale; P 2) seems to be a hereditary prince rather than someone who has a princely nature.
The question of nature is particularly important for an understanding of Machiavelli’s political philosophy, as he says that all human actions imitate nature (D 2.3 and 3.9). The following remarks about human nature will thus be serviceable signposts. For if human actions imitate nature, then it is reasonable to believe that Machiavelli’s account of human nature would gesture toward his account of the cosmos.
One of the key features of Machiavelli’s understanding of human beings is that they are fundamentally acquisitive and appetitive. The root human desire is the “very natural and ordinary” desire to acquire (P 3), which, like all desires, can never be fully satisfied (D 1.37 and 2.pr; FH 4.14 and 7.14). Human beings enjoy novelty; they especially desire new things (D 3.21) or things that they do not have (D 1.5). It is worth noting that, while these formulations are in principle compatible with the acquisition of intellectual or spiritual things, most of Machiavelli’s examples suggest that human beings are typically preoccupied with material things. For example, he says that human beings forget a father’s death more easily than the loss of patrimony (P 17). In other words, they love property more than honor.
Human beings are generally susceptible to deception. They are generally ungrateful and fickle liars (P 17) who judge by what they see (P 18). They tend to believe in appearances (P 18) and also tend to be deceived by generalities (D 1.47, 3.10, and 3.34). It is easy to persuade them of something but difficult to keep them in that persuasion (P 6).
This susceptibility extends to self-deception. Human beings deceive themselves in pleasure (P 23). They are taken more by present things than by past ones (P 24), since they do not correctly judge either the present or the past (D 2.pr). They have little prudence (D 2.11) but great ambition (D 2.20). They always hope (D 2.30; FH 4.18) but do not place limits on their hope (D 2.28), such that they will willingly change lords in the mistaken belief that things will improve (P 3). They share a common defect of overlooking the storm during the calm (P 24), for they are “blind” in judging good and bad counsel (D 3.35). They often act like “lesser birds of prey,” driven by nature to pursue their prey while a larger predator fatally circles above them (D 1.40).
Machiavelli’s remarks upon human nature extend into the moral realm. He says that human beings are envious (D 1.pr) and often controllable through fear (P 17). Consequently, they hate things due to their envy and their fear (D 2.pr). They do not know how to be either altogether bad or altogether good (D 1.30); are more prone to evil than to good (D 1.9); and will always turn out to be bad unless made good by necessity (P 23). In something of a secularized echo of Augustinian original sin, Machiavelli even goes so far at times as to say that human beings are wicked (P 17 and 18) and that they furthermore corrupt others by wicked means (D 3.8). Unlike Augustine, however, he rarely (if ever) upbraids such behavior, and he furthermore does not seem to believe that any redemption of wickedness occurs in the next world.
For Machiavelli, human beings are generally imitative. In other words, they almost always walk on previously beaten paths (P 6). Especially in The Prince, imitation plays an important role. Machiavelli regularly encourages (or at least appears to encourage) his readers to imitate figures such as Cesare Borgia (P 7 and P 13) or Caesar (P 14), as well as certain models (e.g., D 3.33) and the virtue of the past in general (D 2.pr). However, it should be noted that recent work has called into question whether these recommendations are sincere. Machiavelli for instance decries the imitation of bad models in “these corrupt centuries of ours” (D 2.19); and some scholars believe that his recommendations regarding Cesare Borgia and Caesar in particular are attenuated and even completely subverted in the final analysis.
Finally, it is worth noting that some scholars believe that Machiavelli goes so far as to subvert the classical account of a hierarchy or chain of being—either by blurring the boundaries between traditional distinctions (such as principality / republics; good / evil; and even man / woman) or, more radically, by demolishing the account as such. On such a reading, Machiavelli might believe that substances are not determined by their natures or even that there are no natures (and thus no substances).
d. History and Necessity
History (istoria / storia) and necessity (necessità) are two important terms for Machiavelli that remain particularly obscure.
Machiavelli is among the handful of great philosophers who is also a great historian. Although he was interested in the study of nature, his primary interest seemed to be the study of human affairs. He urges the study of history many times in his writings (e.g., P 14, as well as D 1.pr and 2.pr), especially with judicious attention (sensatamente; D 1.23; compare D 3.30). He implies that the Bible is a history (D 2.5) and praises Xenophon’s “life of Cyrus” as a history (P 14; D 2.13, 3.20, 3.22, and 3.39). The Discourses is presented as a philosophical commentary on Livy’s History. And Machiavelli wrote several historical works himself, including the verse Florentine history, I Decannali; the fictionalized biography of Castruccio Castracani; and the Medici-commissioned Florentine Histories. There is no question that he was keenly interested in the historian’s craft, especially the recovery of lost knowledge (e.g., D 1.pr and 2.5).
But what exactly does the historian study? What is history? It is not clear in Machiavelli’s writings whether he believes that time is linear or cyclical. Both accounts are compatible with his suggestions that human nature does not change (e.g., D 1.pr, 1.11, and 3.43) and that imitating the ancients is possible (e.g., D 1.pr). In some places in his writings, he gestures toward a progressive, even eschatological sense of time. His call for a legendary redeemer to unite Italy is a notable example (P 26). In other places, he gestures toward the cyclical account, such as his approximation of the Polybian cycle of regimes (D 1.2) or his suggestion that human events repeat themselves (FH 5.1; compare D 2.5). Scholars thus remain divided on this question. History for Machiavelli might be a process that has its own purposes and to which we must submit. Alternatively, it might be a process that we can master and turn toward our own ends.
In his major works, Machiavelli affords modern historians scant attention. He suggests in the first preface to the Discourses that the readers of his time lack a “true knowledge of histories” (D 1.pr). In the preface to the Florentine Histories, he calls Leonardo Bruni and Poggio Bracciolini “two very excellent historians” but goes on to point out their deficiencies (FH Pref). Machiavelli was friends with the historian Francesco Guicciardini, who commented upon the Discourses. Their philosophical engagement occurred primarily through correspondence, however, and in the major works Machiavelli does not substantively take up Guicciardini’s thought.
Machiavelli speaks more amply with respect to ancient historians. Recent work has pointed to provocative connections between Machiavelli’s thoughts and that of Greek historians, such as Herodotus (quoted at D 3.67), Thucydides (D 3.16 and AW 3.214), Polybius (D 3.40), Diodorus Siculus (D 2.5), Plutarch (D 1.21, 2.1, 2.24 [quoted], 3.12, 3.35, and 3.40), and Xenophon (P 14; D 2.2, 2.13, 3.20, 3.22 [2x], and 3.39 [2x]). Among the Latin historians that Machiavelli studied were Herodian (D 3.6), Justin (quoted at D 1.26 and 3.6), Procopius (quoted at D 2.8), Pliny (FH 2.2), Sallust (D 1.46, 2.8, and 3.6), Tacitus (D 1.29, 2.26, 3.6, and 3.19 [2x]; FH 2.2), and of course Livy.
In 1476, when Machiavelli was eight years old, his father obtained a complete copy of Livy and prepared an index of towns and places for the printer Donnus Nicolaus Germanus. It is therefore fitting that one of Machiavelli’s two most widely known books is ostensibly a commentary on Livy’s History. Machiavelli mentions and quotes Livy many times in his major works. With only a few exceptions (AW 2.13 and 2.24), his treatment of Livy takes place in Discourses. However, Machiavelli regularly alters or omits Livy’s words (e.g., D 1.12) and on occasion disagrees with Livy outright (e.g., D 1.58). There is even a suggestion that working with Livy’s account is akin to working with marble that has been badly blocked out (D 1.11). Only three chapters begin with epigraphic quotations from Livy’s text (D 2.3, 2.23, and 3.10), and in all three cases Livy’s words are modified in some manner. It remains an open question to what extent Machiavelli’s thought is a modification of Livy’s.
As with “history,” the word “necessity” has no univocal meaning in Machiavelli’s writings. Recent work has attempted to explore Machiavelli’s use of this term, with respect not only to his metaphysics but also to his thoughts on moral responsibility. Machiavelli frequently returns to the way that necessity binds, or at least frames, human action. Sometimes, Machiavelli seems to mean that an action is unavoidable, such as the “natural and ordinary necessity” (necessità naturale e ordinaria; P 3) of a new prince offending his newly obtained subjects. He suggests that there are certain rules of counsel that “never fail” (e.g., P 22). He speaks of the necessity that constrains writers (FH 7.6; compare D Ded. Let and D 1.10). And at least twice he mentions an “ultimate necessity” (ultima necessità; D 2.8 and FH 5.11). Sometimes, however, Machiavelli seems to mean that an action is a matter of prudence—meaning a matter of choosing the lesser evil (P 21)—such as using cruelty only “out of the necessity” (per la necessità; P 8) to secure one’s self and to maintain one’s acquisitions. And he suggests that there are rules which “never, or rarely, fail” (e.g., P 3)—that is, rules which admit the possibility of failure and which are thus not strictly necessary.
Machiavelli speaks of the necessities to be alone (D 1.9), to deceive (D 2.13), and to kill others (D 3.30). A Lucchese citizen in the Florentine Histories argues that “things done out of necessity neither should nor can merit praise or blame” (FH 5.11). And in one of the most famous passages concerning necessity, Machiavelli uses the word two different times and, according to some scholars, with two different meanings: “Hence it is necessary [necessario] to a prince, if he wants to maintain himself, to learn to be able not to be good, and to use this and not use it according to necessity” (la necessità; P 25).
Necessity might be a condition to which we must submit ourselves. Alternatively, it might be a condition that we can alter, implying that we can alter the meaning of necessity itself. If what is necessary today might not be necessary tomorrow, then necessity becomes a weaker notion. At the very least, necessity would not be directly opposed to contingency; instead, as some scholars maintain, necessity itself would be contingent in some way and therefore shapeable by human agency.
The beginning of Prince 25 merits close attention on this point. There Machiavelli reports a view that he says is widely held in his day: the belief that our lives are fated or determined to such an extent that it does not matter what we choose to do. Though he admits that he has sometimes been inclined to this position, he ponders a different possibility “so that our free will not be eliminated” (perché il nostro libero arbitrio non sia spento). On this question, some scholars highlight Renaissance versions of the Stoic notion of fate, which contemporaries such as Pietro Pomponazzi seem to have held. Other scholars highlight Machiavelli’s concerns, especially in his correspondence, with astrological determinism (a version of which his friend, Vettori, seems to have held). Two years before he wrote his famous 13-21 September 1506 letter to Giovan Battista Soderini—the so-called Ghiribizzi al Soderini (Musings to Soderini)—Machiavelli wrote a now lost letter to Batolomeo Vespucci, a Florentine teacher of astrology at the University of Padua. In his response to Machiavelli, Vespucci suggests that a wise man can affect the influence of the stars not by altering the stars (which is impossible) but by altering himself.
Still other scholars propose a connection with the so-called Master Argument (kurieon logos) of the ancient Megarian philosopher, Diodorus Cronus. Diodorus denies the possibility of future contingencies, that is, the possibility that future events do not already have a determined truth value. Aristotle famously argues against this view in De Interpretatione; Cicero and Boethius also discuss the issue in their respective treatments of divine providence. Some scholars have suggested that the beginning of Prince 25 not only problematizes Machiavelli’s notion of necessity but also engages with this ancient controversy.
Machiavelli makes a remark concerning military matters that he says is “truer than any other truth” (D 1.21). However, he is most famous for his claim in chapter 15 of The Prince that he is offering the reader what he calls the “effectual truth” (verità effettuale), a phrase he uses there for the only time in all of his writings. Although the effectual truth may pertain to military matters (e.g., P 14 and P 17), it is comprehensive in that it treats all the things of the world and not just military things (P 18). Surprisingly, there is still relatively little work on this fundamental Machiavellian concept. What exactly is the effectual truth?
One way to address this question is to begin with Chapter 15 of The Prince, where Machiavelli introduces the term. Given his stated intention there to “write something useful for whoever understands it,” Machiavelli claims that it is more conveniente to go after the effectual truth than the imagination of things that have never been seen or known “to be in truth” (vero essere; compare FH 8.29). Conveniente is variously rendered by translators as “fitting,” “convenient,” “suitable,” “appropriate,” “proper,” and the like (compare Romulus’ opportunity in P 6). Two things seem to characterize the effectual truth in Chapter 15. Firstly, it is distinguished from what is imagined, particularly imagined republics and principalities (incidentally, this passage is the last explicit mention of a “republic” in the book). Though Machiavelli often appeals to the reader’s imagination with images (e.g., fortune as a woman), the effectual truth seems to appeal to the reader in some other manner or through some other faculty. Whatever it is, the effectual truth does not seem to begin with images of things. Secondly, the effectual truth is more fitting for Machiavelli’s intention of writing something useful for the comprehending reader. The implication seems to be that other (more utopian?) intentions might find the imagination of things a more appropriate rhetorical strategy.
Another way to address this question is to begin with the Dedicatory Letter to The Prince. Machiavelli suggests that those who want to “know well” the natures of princes and peoples are like those who “sketch” (disegnano) landscapes. These sketchers place themselves at high and low vantage points or perspectives in order to see as princes and peoples do, respectively. Scholars have highlighted at least two implications of Machiavelli’s use of this image: that observers see the world from different perspectives; and that it is difficult, if not impossible, to see oneself from one’s own perspective. Machiavelli’s politics, meaning the wider world of human affairs, is always the realm of the partial perspective because politics is always about what is seen. “Everyone sees how you appear,” he says, meaning that even grandmasters of duplicity—such as Pope Alexander VI and the Roman emperor Septimius Severus—must still reveal themselves in some sense to the public eye. The truth begins in ordinary apprehension (e.g., D 1.3, 1.8, 1.12, 2.2, 2.21, 2.27, and 3.34). No one can engage in politics without submitting themselves to what Machiavelli calls “this aspect of the world” (P 18), which to say that no one can act in the world at all without displaying themselves in the very action (if not the result). But precisely because perspective is partial, it is subject to error and indeed manipulation (e.g., D 1.56, 2.pr, and 2.19).
Another way to put this point is to say that the “effect” (effetto) of the effectual truth is always the effect on some observer. Milan is not a wholly new principality as such but instead is new only to Francesco Sforza (P 1). Hannibal’s inhuman cruelty generates respect in the “sight” of his soldiers; by contrast, it generates condemnation in the sight of writers and historians (P 17). Unlike Machiavelli himself, those who damn the tumults of Rome do not see that these disorders actually lead to Roman liberty (D 1.4). It is worth noting that perspectives do not always differ. Sometimes multiple perspectives align, as when Severus is seen as “admirable” both by his soldiers and by the people (P 19; compare AW 1.257). Although the cause in each case differs—the people are “astonished” and “stupefied” (presumably through fear), whereas the soldiers are “reverent” and “satisfied” (presumably through love)—the same effect occurs. Or does it? Some scholars believe that differing causes cannot help but modify effects; in this case, admiration itself would be stained and colored by either love or fear and would be experienced differently as a result.
Machiavelli’s concern with appearance not only pertains to the interpretation of historical events but extends to practical advice, as well. Machiavelli says that a prince should desire to be held merciful and not cruel (though he immediately insists that a prince should take care not to “use this mercy badly”; P 17). And Machiavelli says that what makes a prince contemptible is to be held variable, light, effeminate, pusillanimous, or irresolute (P 19). What matters in politics is how we appear to others—how we are held (tenuto) by others. But how we appear depends upon what we do and where we place ourselves in order to do it. A wise prince for Machiavelli is not someone who is content to investigate causes—including superior causes (P 11), first causes (P 14 and D 1.4), hidden causes (D 1.3), and heavenly causes (D 2.5). Rather, it is someone who produces effects. And there are no effects considered abstractly. Some commentators believe that effects are only effects if they are seen or displayed. They thus see the effectual truth as proto-phenomenological. Others take a stronger line of interpretation and believe that effects are only effects if they produce actual changes in the world of human affairs. Touching rather than seeing might then be the better metaphor for the effectual truth (see P 18).
f. Politics: The Humors
Machiavelli is most famous as a political philosopher. Although he studied classical texts deeply, Machiavelli appears to depart somewhat from the tradition of political philosophy, a departure that in many ways captures the essence of his political position. At least at first glance, it appears that Machiavelli does not believe that the polity is caused by an imposition of form onto matter.
Given that Machiavelli talks of both form and matter (e.g., P 6 and D 1.18), this point deserves unpacking. Aristotle’s position is a useful contrast. For Aristotle, politics is similar to metaphysics in that form makes the city what it is. The difference between a monarchy and a republic is a difference in form. This is not simply a question of institutional arrangement; it is also a question of self-interpretation. Aristotelian political form is something like a lens through which the people understand themselves.
Firstly, it matters whether monarchs or republicans rule, as the citizens of such polities will almost certainly understand themselves differently in light of who rules them. A monarchical “soul” is different from a republican “soul.” Secondly, the factions of the city believe they deserve to rule on the basis of a (partial) claim of justice. Justice is thus the underlying basis of all claims to rule, meaning that, at least in principle, differing views can be brought into proximity to each other. Concord, or at least the potential for it, is both the basis and the aim of the city.
With respect to the first implication, Machiavelli occasionally refers to the six Aristotelian political forms (e.g., D 1.2). He even raises the possibility of a mixed regime (P 3; D 2.6 and 3.1; FH 5.8). But usually he speaks only of two forms, the principality and the republic (P 1). The lines between these two forms are heavily blurred; the Roman republic is a model for wise princes (P 3), and the people can be considered a prince (D 1.58). Machiavelli even at times refers to a prince of a republic (D 2.2). Finally, he says that virtuous princes can introduce any form that they like, with the implication being that form does not constitute the fundamental reality of the polity (P 6).
One explanation is that the reality that underlies all form is what Machiavelli nebulously calls “the state” (lo stato). On this account, political form for Machiavelli is not fundamentally causal; it is at best epiphenomenal and perhaps even nominal. Instead, Machiavelli assigns causality to the elements of the state called “humors” (umori) or “appetites” (appetiti). Some scholars focus on possible origins of this idea (e.g., medieval medicine or cosmology), whereas others focus on the fact that the humors are rooted in desire. Still others focus on the fact that the humors arise only in cities and thus do not seem to exist simply by nature.
Machiavelli says that the city or state is always minimally composed of the humors of the people and the great (P 9 and 19; D 1.4; FH 2.12 and 3.1, but contrast FH 8.19); in some polities, for reasons not entirely clear, the soldiers count as a humor (P 19). The polity is constituted, then, not by a top-down imposition of form but by a bottom-up clash of the humors. And as the humors clash, they generate various political effects (P 9)—these are sometimes good (e.g., “liberty”; D 1.4) and sometimes bad (e.g., “license”; P 17 and D 1.7, 1.37, 3.4 and 3.27; FH 4.1). It is worth noting that a third possibility is “principality,” which according to some scholars looks suspiciously like the imposition of form onto matter (e.g., P 6 and 26; see also FH Pref. and 3.1; compare the “wicked form” of D 3.8). Furthermore, Machiavelli does attribute certain qualities to those who live in republics—greater hatred, greater desire for revenge, and restlessness born from the memory of their previous liberty—which might be absent in those who live in principalities (P 4-5; D 1.16-19 and 2.2; FH 4.1). Such passages appear to bring him in closer proximity to the Aristotelian account than first glance might indicate.
The humors are also related to the second implication mentioned above. Machiavelli distinguishes the humors not by wealth or population size but rather by desire. These desires are inimical to each other in that they cannot be simultaneously satisfied: the great desire to oppress the people, and the people desire not to be oppressed (compare P 9, D 1.16, and FH 3.1). Discord, rather than concord, is thus the basis for the state. Consequently, Machiavelli says that a prince must choose to found himself on one or the other of these humors. Most interpreters have taken him to prefer the humor of the people for any number of reasons, not the least of which may be Machiavelli’s work for the Florentine republic. It is worth noting, though, that Machiavelli’s preference may be pragmatic rather than moral. Government means controlling one’s subjects (D 2.23), and “good government” might mean nothing more than a scorched-earth, Tacitean wasteland which one simply calls peace (P 7).
Although many aspects of Machiavelli’s account of the humors are well understood, some remain mysterious. Firstly, it is unclear what desire characterizes the humor of the soldiers, a third humor that occurs, if not always, at least in certain circumstances. Secondly, in the preface to the Florentine Histories Machiavelli suggests that Florence’s disintegration into multiple “divisions” (divisioni) is unique in the history of republics, but it is unclear how or why the typical humors of the people drove this great subdivide further in Florence (though FH 2 and 3 may offer important clues). Thirdly, it is unclear whether a “faction” (fazione; e.g., D 1.54) and a “sect” (setta; e.g., D 2.5)—each of which plays an important role in Machiavelli’s politics—ultimately reduce to one of the fundamental humors or whether they are instead oriented around something other than desire. Finally, it should be noted that recent work has questioned whether the humors are as distinct as previously believed; whether an individual or group can move between them; and whether they exist on something like a spectrum or continuum. For example, it may be the case that a materially secure people would cease to worry about being oppressed (and might even begin to desire to oppress others in the manner of the great); or that an armed people would effectively act as soldiers (such that a prince would have to worry about their contempt rather than their hatred).
g. Politics: Republicanism
Some scholars claim that Machiavelli is the last ancient political philosopher because he understands the merciless exposure of political life. By contrast, others claim that Machiavelli is the first modern political philosopher because he understands the need to found one’s self on the people. Either position is compatible with a republican reading of Machiavelli. The status of Machiavelli’s republicanism has been the focus of much recent work.
Many scholars focus on Machiavelli’s teaching as it is set forth in the Discourses (though many of the same lessons are found in The Prince). As in The Prince, Machiavelli attributes qualities to republican peoples that might be absent in peoples accustomed to living under a prince (P 4-5; D 1.16-19 and 2.2; FH 4.1). He also distinguishes between the humors of the great and the people (D 1.4-5; P 9). However, in the Discourses he explores more carefully the possibility that the clash between them can be favorable (e.g., D 1.4). He associates both war and expansion with republics and with republican unity; conversely, he associates peace and idleness with republican disunity (D 2.25). He notes the flexibility of republics (D 3.9), especially when they are ordered well (D 1.2) and regularly drawn back to their beginnings (D 3.1; compare D 1.6). He ponders the political utility of public executions and—as recent work has emphasized—courts or public trials (D 3.1; compare the parlements of P 3 and P 19 and Cesare’s court of P 7). He even considers the possibility of a perpetual republic (compare D 3.17 with D 1.20, 1.34, 2.30, 3.1, and 3.22). Like many other authors in the republican tradition, he frequently ponders the problem of corruption (e.g., D 1.17, 1. 18, 1.55, 2.Pr, 2.19, 2.22, 3.1, 3.16, and 3.33).
However, it remains unclear exactly what Machiavelli means by terms such as “corruption,” “freedom,” “law,” and even “republic.” It is therefore not surprising that the content of his republicanism remains unclear, as well. In order to provide a point of entry into this problem, it would be helpful to offer a brief examination of three rival and contemporary positions concerning Machiavelli’s republicanism. Although what follows are stylized and compressed glosses of complicated interpretations, they may serve as profitable beginning points for a reader interested in pursuing the issue further.
One interpretation might be summed up by the Machiavellian phrase “good laws” (e.g., P 12). It holds that Machiavelli is something of a neo-Roman republican. What matters the most, politically speaking, are robust institutions and deliberative participation in public life (e.g., D 1.55). Freedom is the effect of good institutions. Corruption is a moral failing and more specifically a failing of reason. This interpretation focuses upon the stability of public life. A strength of this interpretation is the emphasis that it places upon the rule of law as well as Machiavelli’s understanding of virtue. A possible weakness of this view is that it seems to overlook Machiavelli’s insistence that freedom is a cause of good institutions, not an effect of them (e.g., D 1.4); and that it seems to conflate the Machiavellian humor of the people with a more generic and traditional understanding of “people,” that is, all those who are under the law.
A second interpretation might be summed up by the Machiavellian term “tumults” (e.g., D 1.4). It holds that Machiavelli is something of a radical or revolutionary democrat whose ideas, if comparable to anything classical, are more akin to Greek thought than to Roman. What matters the most, politically speaking, is non-domination. Freedom is a cause of good institutions; freedom is not obedience to any rule but rather the continuous practice of resistance to oppression that undergirds all rules. Corruption is associated with the desire to dominate others. This interpretation focuses upon the instability—and even the deliberate destabilization—of political life. A strength of this interpretation is the emphasis that it places upon tumults, motion, and the more “decent” end of the people (P 9; see also D 1.58). A possible weakness is that it seems to understand law in a denuded sense, that is, as merely a device to prevent the great from harming the people; and that it seems to overlook the chaos that might result from factional strife (e.g., P 17) or mob justice (e.g., FH 2.37 and 3.16-17).
A third interpretation, which is something of a middle position between the previous two, might be summed up by the Machiavellian phrase “wise prince” (e.g., P 3). It holds that Machiavelli advocates for something like a constitutional monarchy. What matters the most, politically speaking, is stability of public life and especially acquisitions, coupled with the recognition that such a life is always under assault from those who are dissatisfied. Freedom is both a cause and effect of good institutions. Corruption is associated with a decline (though not a moral decline) in previously civilized human beings. This interpretation focuses both on the stability and instability of political life (e.g., D 1.16). A strength of this interpretation is its emphasis upon understated features—such as courts, public trials, and even elections—in Machiavelli’s thought, and upon Machiavelli’s remarks concerning the infirmity of bodies which lack a “head” (e.g., P 26; D 1.44 and 1.57). A possible weakness is that it seems to downplay Machiavelli’s remarks on nature and consequently places outsized importance upon processes such as training (esercitato), education (educazione), and art (arte).
Glory is one of the key motivations for the various actors in Machiavelli’s corpus. Some scholars go so far as to claim that it is the highest good for Machiavelli. Others deflate its importance and believe that Machiavelli’s ultimate aim is to wean his readers from their desire for glory.
Machiavelli’s understanding of glory (gloria) is substantially beholden to that of the Romans, who were “great lovers of glory” (D 1.37; see also D 1.58 and 2.9). Ancient Romans attained prominence through the acquisition of dignitas, which can be translated as “dignity” but which also included the notion of honors or trophies awarded as recognition of one’s accomplishments. Possessions, titles, family achievements, and land could all contribute to dignitas. But what was most important was gloria, one’s glory and reputation (or lack thereof) for greatness. Plebeians, who did not possess as much wealth or family heritage as patricians, could still attain prominence in the Roman Republic by acquiring glory in speeches (e.g., Cicero) or through deeds, especially in wartime (e.g., Gaius Marius). Typically, this quest for glory occurred “within the system.” A Roman would begin his political career with a lower office (quaestor or aedile) and would attempt to rise to higher positions (tribune, praetor, or consul) by pitting his ambition and excellence in ferocious competition against his fellow citizens.
The destabilization of the Roman Republic was in part due to individuals who short-circuited this system, that is, who achieved glory outside the conventional political pathway. A notable example is Scipio Africanus. At the beginning of his ascendancy, Scipio had never held any political positions and was not even eligible for them. However, by his mid-twenties he had conducted major military reforms. By his mid-thirties, he had defeated no less a general than Hannibal, the most dangerous enemy the Romans ever faced and the “master [or teacher] of war” (maestro di guerra; D 3.10). This unprecedented achievement gained Scipio much glory—at least in the Senate, as Machiavelli notes (though not with Fabius Maximus; P 17 and D 3.19-21). Indeed, Scipio gained so much glory that he catapulted past his peers in terms of renown, regardless of his lack of political accomplishments. Consequently, his imitation was incentivized, which partly led to the rise of the warlords—such as Pompey and Julius Caesar—and the eventual end of the Republic.
Machiavelli’s understanding of glory is beholden to this Roman understanding in at least three ways: the dependence of glory upon public opinion; the possibility of an exceptional individual rising to prominence through nontraditional means; and the proximity of glory to military operations. One useful example of the concatenation of all three characteristics is Agathocles the Sicilian. Agathocles became king of Syracuse after rising from “a mean and abject fortune” (P 8). If one considers the “virtue of Agathocles,” Machiavelli says, one does not see why he should be judged inferior to “any most excellent captain.” Agathocles rose to supremacy with “virtue of body and spirit” and had no aid but that of the military. Indeed, there is little, if anything, that can be attributed to fortune in his ascent. It seems clear for all of these reasons that Agathocles is virtuous on the Machiavellian account. But Machiavelli goes on to say that “one cannot call it virtue” to do what Agathocles did. One cannot call it virtue to keep to a life of crime constantly; to slaughter the senators and the rich; to betray one’s friends; to be without faith, without mercy, without religion. Although such acts are compatible with Machiavellian virtue (and might even comprise it), they cannot be called virtuous according to the standards of conventional morality. Agathocles’ savage cruelty, inhumanity, and infinite crimes do not “permit him to be celebrated” among the most excellent human beings (compare P 6). In general, force and strength easily acquire reputation rather than the other way around (D 1.34). But Machiavelli concludes that Agathocles paid so little heed to public opinion that his virtue was not enough. In the end, Agathocles’ modes enabled him to acquire “empire but not glory” (P 8).
Glory for Machiavelli thus depends upon how you are seen and upon what people say about you. Many of the successful and presumably imitable figures in both The Prince and the Discourses share the quality of being cruel, for example. But even “cruelties well-used” (P 8) are insufficient to maintain your reputation in the long run. This is at least partly why explorations of deceit and dissimulation take on increasing prominence as both works progress (e.g., P 6, 19, and especially 26; D 3.6). One must learn to imitate not only the force of the lion but also the fraud of the fox (P 7, 18, and 19; D 2.13 and 3.40). Doing so might allow one to avoid a “double shame” and instead achieve a “double glory”: beginning a new regime and adorning it with good laws, arms, and examples (P 24).
Whether veneration (venerazione) and reverence (riverenzia) are ultimately higher concepts than glory remains an important question, and recent work has taken it up. Those interested in this question may find it helpful to begin with the following passages: P 6, 7, 11, 17, 19, 23, and 26; D 1.10-12, 1.36, 1.53-54, 2.20, 3.6 and 3.22; FH 1.9, 3.8, 3.10, 5.13, 7.5, and 7.34; and AW 6.163, 7.215, 7.216, and 7.223.
The place of religion in Machiavelli’s thought remains one of the most contentious questions in the scholarship. His brother Totto was a priest. His father appeared to be a devout believer and belonged to a flagellant confraternity called the Company of Piety. When Machiavelli was eleven, he joined the youth branch of this company, and he moved into the adult branch in 1493. From 1500 to 1513, Machiavelli and Totto paid money to the friars of Santa Croce in order to commemorate the death of their father and to fulfill a bequest from their great-uncle. Machiavelli’s actual beliefs, however, remain mysterious. He did write an Exhortation to Penitence (though scholars disagree as to his sincerity; compare P 26). And he did accept the last rites upon his deathbed in the company of his wife and some friends. But evidence in his correspondence—for instance, in letters from close friends such as Francesco Vettori and Francesco Guicciardini—suggests that Machiavelli did not take pains to appear publicly religious.
As with many other philosophers of the modern period, interpretations of Machiavelli’s religious beliefs can gravitate to the extremes: some scholars claim that Machiavelli was a pious Christian, while others claim that he was a militant and unapologetic atheist. Still others claim that he was religious but not in the Christian sense. It remains unclear what faith (fide) and piety (or mercy, pietà) mean for Machiavelli. Perhaps the easiest point on entry is to examine how Machiavelli uses the word “religion” (religione) in his writings.
Machiavelli variously speaks of “the present religion” (la presente religione; e.g., D 1.pr), “this religion” (questa religione; e.g., D 1.55), “the Christian religion” (la cristiana religione; e.g., FH 1.5), and “our religion” (nostra religione; e.g., D 2.2). Machiavelli says that “our religion [has shown] the truth and the true way” (D 2.22; cf. D 3.1 and 1.12), though he is careful not to say that it is the true way. “Our religion” is also contrasted to the curiously singular “ancient religion” (religione antica; D 2.2). Recent work has suggested that Machiavelli’s notion of the ancient religion may be analogous to, or even associated with, the prisca theologia / philosophia perennis which was investigated by Ficino, Pico, and others.
Machiavelli speaks of religious “sects” (sette; e.g., D 2.5), a type of group that seems to have a lifespan between 1,666 and 3,000 years. Species of sects tend to be distinguished by their adversarial character, such as Catholic versus heretical (FH 1.5); Christian versus Gentile (D 2.2); and Guelf versus Ghibelline (P 20). They also generally, if not exclusively, seem to concern matters of theological controversy. It is not clear whether and to what extent a religion differs from a sect for Machiavelli.
Machiavelli suggests that reliance upon certain interpretations—“false interpretations” (false interpretazioni)—of the Christian God has led in large part to Italy’s servitude. Such interpretations implore human beings to think more of enduring their beatings than of avenging them (D 2.2 and 3.27). He seems to allow for the possibility that not all interpretations are false; for example, he says that Francis and Dominic rescue Christianity from elimination, presumably because they return it to an interpretation that focuses upon poverty and the life of Christ (D 3.1). And one of the things that Machiavelli may have admired in Savonarola is how to interpret Christianity in a way that is muscular and manly rather than weak and effeminate (compare P 6 and 12; D 1.pr, 2.2 and 3.27; FH 1.5 and 1.9; and AW 2.305-7).
Some scholars have emphasized the various places where Machiavelli associates Christianity with the use of dissimulation (e.g., P 18) and fear (e.g., D 3.1) as a form of social control. Other scholars believe that Machiavelli adheres to an Averroeist (which is to say Farabian) understanding of the public utility of religion. On such an understanding, religion is necessary and salutary for public morality. The philosopher should therefore take care not to disclose his own lack of belief or at least should attack only impoverished interpretations of religion rather than religion as such.
Finally, recent work has emphasized the extent to which Machiavelli’s concerns appear eminently terrestrial; he never refers in either The Prince or the Discourses to the next world or to another world.
Machiavelli’s very name has become a byword for treachery and relentless self-interest. His ethical viewpoint is usually described as something like “the end justifies the means” (see for instance D 1.9). Is this a fair characterization?
The easiest point of entry into Machiavelli’s notion of ethics is the concept of cruelty. At least since Montaigne (and more recently with philosophers such as Judith Skhlar and Richard Rorty), this vice has held a special philosophical status. Indeed, contemporary moral issues such as animal ethics, bullying, shaming, and so forth are such contentious issues largely because liberal societies have come to condemn cruelty so severely. It is all the more striking to readers today, then, when they confront Machiavelli’s seeming recommendations of cruelty. Such recommendations are common throughout his works. In the Discourses, Machiavelli appears to recommend a cruel way which is an enemy to every “Christian,” and indeed “human,” way of life (D 1.26); furthermore, he appears to indirectly attribute this way of life to God (via David). In The Prince, he speaks of “cruelties well-used” (P 8) and explicitly identifies almost every imitable character as cruel (e.g., P 7, 8, 19, and 21). He even speaks of “mercy badly used” (P 17).
The fact that seeming vices can be used well and that seeming virtues can be used poorly suggests that there is an instrumentality to Machiavellian ethics that goes beyond the traditional account of the virtues. One could find many places in his writings that support this point (e.g., D 1.pr and 2.6), although the most notable is when he says that he offers something “useful” to whoever understands it (P 15). But what exactly is this instrumentality?
Partly, it seems to come from human nature. We have a “natural and ordinary desire” to acquire (P 3) which can never in principle be satisfied (D 1.37 and 2.pr; FH 4.14 and 7.14). Human life is thus restless motion (D 1.6 and 2.pr), resulting in clashes in the struggle to satisfy one’s desires. It is thus useful as a regulative ideal, and is perhaps even true, that we should see others as bad (D 1.3 and 1.9) and even wicked beings (P 17 and 18) who corrupt others by wicked means (D 3.8). In order to survive in such a world, goodness is not enough (D 3.30). Instead, we must learn how not to be good (P 15 and 19) or even how to enter into evil (P 18; compare D 1.52), since it is not possible to be altogether good (D 1.26). Even “the good” itself is variable (P 25). Thus, virtues and vices serve something outside themselves; they are not purely good or bad. Recognizing this limitation of both virtue and vice is eminently useful.
Another way to put this point is in terms of imitation. While we should often imitate those greater than us (P 6), we should also learn how to imitate those lesser than us. For example, we should imitate animals in order to fight as they do, since human modes of combat, such as law, are often not enough—especially when dealing with those who do not respect laws (P 18). More specifically, we should imitate the lion and the fox. The lion symbolizes force, perhaps to the point of cruelty; the fox symbolizes fraud, perhaps to the point of lying about the deepest things, such as religion (P 18). Everything, even one’s faith (D 1.15) and one’s offspring (P 11), can be used instrumentally.
The mention of the fox brings us to a second profitable point of entry into Machiavellian ethics, namely deception. Machiavelli’s moral exemplars are often cruel, but they are also often dissimulators. One of the clearest examples is Pope Alexander VI, a particularly adroit liar (P 18). Throughout his writings, Machiavelli regularly advocates lying (e.g., D 1.59 and 3.42; FH 6.17), especially for those who attempt to rise from humble beginnings (e.g., D 2.13). He even at one point suggests that it is useful to simulate craziness (D 3.2).
Because cruelty and deception play such important roles in his ethics, it is not unusual for related issues—such as murder and betrayal—to rear their heads with regularity. If Machiavelli possessed a sense of moral squeamishness, it is not something that one easily detects in his works. However, it should be noted that recent work has suggested that many, if not all, of Machiavelli’s shocking moral claims are ironic. If this hypothesis is true, then his moral position would be much more complicated than it appears to be. Does Machiavelli ultimately ask us to rise above considerations of utility? Does he, of all people, ask us to rise above what we have come to see as Machiavellianism?
3. Machiavelli’s Corpus
In what follows, Machiavelli’s four major works are discussed and then his other writings are briefly characterized.
a. The Prince
The Prince is Machiavelli’s most famous philosophical book. It was begun in 1513 and probably completed by 1515. We possess no surviving manuscript copy of it in Machiavelli’s own handwriting. We first hear of it in Machiavelli’s 10 December 1513 letter to his friend, Francesco Vettori, wherein Machiavelli divulges that he has been composing “a little work” entitled De Principatibus. Machiavelli also says that Filippo Casavecchia, a longtime friend, has already seen a rough draft of the text.
Evidence suggests that other manuscript copies were circulating among Machiavelli’s friends, and perhaps beyond, by 1516-17. These manuscripts, some of which we do possess, do not bear the title of The Prince. That title did not appear until roughly five years after Machiavelli’s death, when the first edition of the book was published with papal privilege in 1532.
Which title did Machiavelli intend: the Latin title of De Principatibus (“Of Principalities”); or the Italian title of Il Principe (“The Prince”)? That the book has two purported titles—and that they do not translate exactly into one another—remains an enduring and intriguing puzzle. The structure of The Prince does not settle the issue, as the book begins with chapters that explicitly treat principalities, but eventually proceeds to chapters that explicitly treat princes. Nor does the content settle the issue; the chapter titles are in Latin but the body of each chapter is in Italian, and the words “prince” and “principality” occur frequently throughout the entire book. Lastly, the Discourses offer no easy resolution; Machiavelli there refers to The Prince both as “our treatise of principalities” (nostro trattato de’ principati; D 2.1) and “our treatise of the Prince” (nostro trattato de Principe; D 3.42).
The Prince is composed of twenty-six chapters which are preceded by a Dedicatory Letter to Lorenzo de’ Medici (1492-1519), the grandson of Lorenzo the Magnificent (1449-92). As we learn from the aforementioned letter to Vettori, Machiavelli had originally intended to dedicate The Prince to Lorenzo the Magnificent’s son, Giuliano. At some point, for reasons not entirely clear, Machiavelli changed his mind and dedicated to the volume to Lorenzo. We do not know whether Giuliano or Lorenzo ever read the work. There is an old story, perhaps apocryphal, that Lorenzo preferred a pack of hunting dogs to the gift of The Prince and that Machiavelli consequently swore revenge against the Medici. At any rate, the question of the precise audience of The Prince remains a key one. Some interpreters have even suggested that Machiavelli writes to more than one audience simultaneously.
The question of authorial voice is also important. Machiavelli himself appears as a character in The Prince twice (P 3 and 7) and sometimes speaks in the first person (e.g., P 2 and P 13). However, it is not obvious how to interpret these instances, with some recent scholars going so far as to say that Machiavelli operates with the least sincerity precisely when speaking in his own voice. This issue is exacerbated by the Dedicatory Letter, in which Machiavelli sets forth perhaps the foundational image of the book. He compares “those who sketch [disegnano]” landscapes from high and low vantage points to princes and peoples, respectively. And he suggests that “to know well” the nature of peoples one needs to a prince, and vice versa. The suggestion seems to be that Machiavelli throughout the text variously speaks to one or the other of these vantage points and perhaps even variously speaks from one or the other of these vantage points. At the very least, the image implies that we should be wary of taking his claims in a straightforward manner. The sketcher image becomes even more complicated later in the text, when Machiavelli introduces the perspectives of two additional “humors” of the city, that is, the great (i grandi; P 9) and the soldiers (i soldati; P 19).
An additional interpretative difficulty concerns the book’s structure. In the first chapter, Machiavelli appears to give an outline of the subject matter of The Prince. But this subject matter appears to be exhausted as early as Chapter 7. What, then, to make of the rest of the book? One possibility is that The Prince is not a polished work; some scholars have suggested that it was composed in haste and that consequently it might not be completely coherent. An alternative hypothesis is that Machiavelli has some literary or philosophical reason to break from the structure of the outline, keeping with his general trajectory of departing from what is customary. A third hypothesis is that the rest of the book is somehow captured by the initial outline and that what Machiavelli calls “threads” (orditi; P2) or “orders” (ordini; P 10) flow outward, if only implicitly, from the first chapter.
Whatever interpretation one holds to, the subject matter of the book seems to be arranged into roughly four parts: Chapters 1-11 treat principalities (with the possible exception of Chapter 5); Chapters 12-14 treat the art of war; Chapters 15-19 treat princes; and Chapters 20-26 treat what we may call the art of princes. The first three sections, at least, are suggested by Machiavelli’s own comments in the text. In Chapter 12, Machiavelli says that he has previously treated the acquisition and maintenance of principalities and says that the remaining task is to discourse generally on offensive and defensive matters. Similarly, in Chapter 15, Machiavelli says that what remains is to see how a prince should act with respect to subjects and friends, implying minimally that what has come previously is a treatment of enemies.
Almost from its composition, The Prince has been notorious for its seeming recommendations of cruelty; its seeming prioritization of autocracy (or at least centralized power) over more republican or democratic forms; its seeming lionization of figures such as Cesare Borgia and Septimius Severus; its seeming endorsements of deception and faith-breaking; and so forth. Indeed, it remains perhaps the most notorious work in the history of political philosophy. One should be wary, however, of resting with what seems to be the case in The Prince, especially given Machiavelli’s repeated insistence that appearances can be manipulated. But the meaning of these manipulations, and indeed of these appearances, remains a scholarly question. Interpreters of the caliber of Rousseau and Spinoza have believed The Prince to bear a republican teaching at its core. Some scholars have gone so far as to see it as an utterly satirical or ironic work. Others have insisted that the book is even more dangerous than it first appears. At any rate, how The Prince fits together with the Discourses (if at all) remains one of the enduring puzzles of Machiavelli’s legacy.
b. Discourses on Livy
There is reason to suspect that Machiavelli had begun writing the Discourses as early as 1513; for instance, there seems to be a reference in The Prince to another, lengthier work on republics (P 2). And since the Discourses references events from as late as 1517, it seems to have still been a work in progress by that point and perhaps even later.
Evidence suggests that manuscript copies were circulating by 1530 and perhaps earlier. We do not possess any of these manuscripts; in fact, we possess no manuscript of the Discourses in Machiavelli’s handwriting except for what is now known as the preface to the first book. It bears no heading and begins with a paragraph that our other manuscripts do not have. There is still debate over whether this paragraph should be excised (since it is not found in the other manuscripts) or whether it should be retained (since it is found in the only polished writing we have of the Discourses in Machiavelli’s hand). It is typically retained in English translations.
Roughly four years after Machiavelli’s death, the first edition of the Discourses was published with papal privilege in 1531. As with The Prince, there is a bit of mystery surrounding the title of the Discourses. The book appeared first in Rome and then a few weeks later in Florence, with the two publishers (Blado and Giunta, respectively) seemingly working with independent manuscripts. Both the Blado and Giunta texts give the title of Discorsi sopra la prima deca di Tito Livio. The reference is to Livy’s History of Rome (Ab Urbe Condita) and more specifically to its first ten books. Machiavelli refers simply to Discorsi in the Dedicatory Letter to the work, however, and it is not clear whether he intended the title to specifically pick out the first ten books by name. Additionally, some of Machiavelli’s contemporaries, such as Guicciardini, do not name the book by the full printed title. Today, the title is usually given as the Discourses on Livy (or the Discourses for short).
The number of chapters in the Discourses is 142, which is the same number of books in Livy’s History. This is a curious coincidence and one that is presumably intentional. But what is the intent? Scholars are divided on this issue. A second, related curiosity is that the manuscript as we now have it divides the chapters into three parts or books. However, the third part does not have a preface as the first two do.
As with the dedicatory letter to The Prince, there is also a bit of mystery surrounding the dedicatory letter to the Discourses. The work is dedicated to Zanobi Buondelmonti and Cosimo Rucellai, two of Machiavelli’s friends, of whom Machiavelli says in the letter that they deserve to be princes even though they are not. It is noteworthy that the Discourses is the only one of the major prose works dedicated to friends; by contrast, The Prince, the Art of War, and the Florentine Histories are all dedicated to potential or actual patrons.
Machiavelli makes his presence known from the very beginning of the Discourses; the first word of the work is the first person pronoun, “Io.” And indeed the impression that one gets from the book overall is that Machiavelli takes fewer pains to recede into the background here than in The Prince. The Discourses is, by Machiavelli’s admission, ostensibly a commentary on Livy’s history. In the preface to the first book, Machiavelli laments the fact that there is no longer a “true knowledge of histories” (vera cognizione delle storie) and judges it necessary to write upon the books of Livy that have not been intercepted by “the malignity of the times” (la malignità de’ tempi). He claims that those who read his writings can “more easily draw from them that utility [utilità] for which one should seek knowledge of histories” (D I.pr). However, it is a strange kind of commentary: one in which Machiavelli regularly alters or omits Livy’s words (e.g., D 1.12) and in which he disagrees with Livy outright (e.g., D 1.58).
Clues as to the structure of the Discourses may be gleaned from Machiavelli’s remarks in the text. At the end of the first chapter (D 1.1), Machiavelli distinguishes between things done inside and outside the city of Rome. He further distinguishes between things done by private and public counsel. Finally, he claims that the first part or book will treat things done inside the city by public counsel. The first part, then, primarily treats domestic political affairs. Machiavelli says that the second book concerns how Rome became an empire, that is, it concerns foreign political affairs (D 2.pr). If Machiavelli did in fact intend there to be a third part, the suggestion seems to be that it concerns affairs conducted by private counsel in some manner. It is noteworthy that fraud and conspiracy (D 2.13, 2.41, and 3.6), among other things, become increasingly important topics as the book progresses. At first glance, it is not clear whether the teaching of the Discourses complements that of The Prince or whether it militates against it. Scholars remain divided on this issue. Some insist upon the coherence of the books, either in terms of a more nefarious teaching typically associated with The Prince; or in terms of a more consent-based, republican teaching typically associated with the Discourses. Others see the Discourses as a later, more mature work and take its teaching to be truer to Machiavelli’s ultimate position, especially given his own work for the Florentine republic. At any rate, how the books fit together remains perhaps the preeminent puzzle concerning Machiavelli’s philosophy. The Discourses nevertheless remains one of the most important works in modern republican theory. It had an enormous effect on republican thinkers such as Rousseau, Montesquieu, Hume, and the American Founders. (See “Politics: Republicanism” above.)
c. Art of War
The Art of War is the only significant prose work published by Machiavelli during his lifetime and his only attempt at writing a dialogue in the humanist tradition. It was probably written in 1519. The first edition was published in 1521 in Florence under the title Libro della arte della Guerra di Niccolò Machiavegli cittadino et segretario fiorentino. It takes the literary form of a dialogue divided into seven books and preceded by a preface. Like The Prince, the work is dedicated to a Lorenzo—in this case, Lorenzo di Filippo Strozzi, “Florentine Patrician.” Strozzi was either a friend (as has been customarily held) or a patron (as recent work suggests). It is worth noting in passing that we possess autograph copies of two of Strozzi’s works in Machiavelli’s hand (Commedia and Pistola).
The action of the Art of War takes place after dinner and in the deepest and most secret shade (AW 1.13) of the Orti Oricellari, the gardens of the Rucellai family. These gardens were cultivated by Bernardo Rucellai, a wealthy Florentine who was a disciple of Ficino and who was also the uncle of two Medici popes, Leo X and Clement VII (via his marriage to Nannina, the eldest sister of Lorenzo the Magnificent). Bernardo filled the gardens with plants mentioned in classical texts (AW 1.13-15) and intended the place to be a center of humanist discussion. Ancient philosophy, literature, and history were regularly discussed there, in addition to contemporary works on occasion (for example, some of Machiavelli’s Discourses on Livy). Visitors included Machiavelli, Guicciardini, and members of Ficino’s so-called Platonic Academy. Notably, the gardens were the site of at least two conspiracies: an aristocratic one while Florence was a republic under the rule of Soderini (1498-1512); and a republican one, headed up by Cosimo Rucellai, after the Medici regained control in 1512. Conspiracy is one of the most extensively examined themes in Machiavelli’s corpus: it is the subject of both the longest chapter of The Prince (P 19) and the longest chapter of the Discourses (D 3.6; see also FH 2.32, 7.33, and 8.1).
One of the interlocutors of the Art of War is Bernardo’s grandson, Cosimo Rucellai, who is also one of the dedicatee of the Discourses. The other dedicatee of the Discourses, Zanobi Buondelmonti, is also one of the interlocutors of the Art of War. Two of the other young men present are Luigi Alammani (to whom Machiavelli dedicated the Life of Castruccio Castracani along with Zanobi) and Battista della Palla. But perhaps the most important and striking speaker is Fabrizio Colonna. Colonna was a mercenary captain—notable enough, given Machiavelli’s insistent warnings against mercenary arms (e.g., P 12-13 and D 1.43). However, Colonna was also the leader of the Spanish forces that compelled the capitulation of Soderini and that enabled the Medici to regain control of Florence.
In the preface to the work, Machiavelli notes the vital importance of the military: he compares it to a palace’s roof, which protects the contents (compare FH 6.34). And he laments the corruption of modern military orders as well as the modern separation of military and civilian life (AW Pref., 3-4). Roughly speaking, books 1 and 2 concern issues regarding the treatment of soldiers, such as payment and discipline. Books 3 and 4 concern issues regarding battle, such as tactics and formation. Book 5 concerns issues regarding logistics, such as supply lines and the use of intelligence. Book 6 concerns issues regarding the camp, including a comparison to the way that the Romans organized their camps. Book 7 concerns issues regarding armament, such as fortifications and artillery. Like The Prince, the Art of War ends with an indictment of Italian princes with respect to Italy’s weak and fragmented situation.
Many Machiavellian themes from The Prince and the Discourses recur in the Art of War. Some examples are: the importance of one’s own arms (AW 1.180; P 6-9 and 12-14; D 2.20); modern misinterpretations of the past (AW 1.17; D 1.pr and 2.pr); the way that good soldiers arise from training rather than from nature (AW 1.125 and 2.167; D 1.21 and 3.30-9); the need to divide an army into three sections (AW 3.12ff; D 2.16); the willingness to adapt to enemy orders (AW 4.9ff; P 14; D 3.39); the importance of inspiring one’s troops (AW 4.115-40; D 3.33); the importance of generating obstinacy and resilience in one’s troops (AW 4.134-48 and 5.83; D 1.15); and the relationship between good arms and good laws (AW 1.98 and 7.225; P 12).
Strong statements throughout his corpus hint at the immensely important role of war in Machiavelli’s philosophy. In The Prince, Machiavelli says that a prince should focus all of his attention upon becoming a “professional” in the art of war (professo; compare the “professions” of AW Pref. and P 15), for “that is the only art which is of concern to one who commands” (P 14). In the Discourses, he says that it is “truer than any other truth” that it is always a prince’s defect (rather than a defect of a site or nature) when human beings cannot be made into soldiers (D 1.21). And his only discussion of science in The Prince or the Discourses comes in the context of hunting as an image of war (D 3.39). Such statements, along with Machiavelli’s dream of a Florentine militia, point to the key role of the Art of War in Machiavelli’s corpus. But the technical nature of its content, if nothing else, has proved to be a resilient obstacle for scholars who attempt to master it, and the book remains the least studied of his major works.
d. Florentine Histories
This is the last of Machiavelli’s major works. It was not his first attempt at penning a history; Machiavelli had already written a two-part verse history of Italy, I Decennali, which covers the years 1492-1509. But the Florentine Histories is a greater effort. It is written in prose and covers the period of time from the decline of the Roman Empire until the death of Lorenzo the Magnificent in 1434.
The Florentine Histories was commissioned in 1520 by Pope Leo X, on behalf of the Officers of Study of Florence. The intervention of Cardinal Giulio de’ Medici was key; the Histories would be dedicated to him and presented to him in 1525, by which time he had ascended to the papacy as Clement VII. Machiavelli presented eight books to Clement and did not write any additional ones. They were not published until 1532.
Although Giulio had made Machiavelli the official historiographer of Florence, it is far from clear that the Florentine Histories are a straightforward historiographical account. Machiavelli says in the Dedicatory Letter that he is writing of “those times which, through the death of the Magnificent Lorenzo de’ Medici, brought a change of form [forma] in Italy.” He says that he has striven to “satisfy everyone” while “not staining the truth.” In the Preface, Machiavelli says that his intent is to write down “the things done inside and outside [the city] by the Florentine people” (le cose fatte dentro e fuora dal popolo fiorentino) and that he changed his original intention in order that “this history may be better understood in all times.”
Though Book 1 is ostensibly a narrative concerning the time from the decline of the Roman Empire, in Book 2 he calls Book 1 “our universal treatise” (FH 2.2), thus implying that it is more than a simple narrative. Books 2, 3, and 4 concern the history of Florence itself from its origins to 1434. Books 5, 6, 7, and 8 concern Florence’s history against the background of Italian history.
In Book 1, Machiavelli explores how Italy has become disunited, in no small part due to causes such as Christianity (FH 1.5) and barbarian invasions (FH 1.9). The rise of Charlemagne is also a crucial factor (FH 1.11). Machiavelli notes that Christian towns have been left to the protection of lesser princes (FH 1.39) and even no prince at all in many cases (FH 1.30), such that they “wither at the first wind” (FH 1.23).
In Book 2, Machiavelli famously calls Florence “[t]ruly a great and wretched city” (Grande veramente e misera città; FH 2.25). Scholars have long focused upon how Machiavelli thought Florence was wretched, especially when compared to ancient Rome. But recent work has begun to examine the ways in which Machiavelli thought that Florence was great, as well; and on the overlap between the Histories and the Discourse on Florentine Affairs (which was also commissioned by the Medici around 1520). Book 2 also examines the ways in which the nobility disintegrates into battles between families (e.g., FH 2.9) and into various splinter factions of Guelfs (supporters of the Pope) and Ghibellines (supporters of the Emperor). The rise of Castruccio Castracani, alluded to in Book 1 (e.g., FH 1.26), is further explored (FH 2.26-31), as well as various political reforms (FH 2.28 and 2.39).
Books 3 and 4 are especially notable for Machiavelli’s analysis of the class conflicts that exist in every polity (e.g., FH 3.1), and some scholars believe that his treatment here is more developed and nuanced than his accounts in either The Prince or the Discourses. Machiavelli also narrates the rise of several prominent statesmen: Salvestro de’ Medici (FH 3.9); Michele di Lando (FH 3.16-22; compare FH 3.13); Niccolò da Uzzano (FH 4.2-3); and Giovanni di Bicci de’ Medici (FH 4.3 and 4.10-16), whose family is in the ascendancy at the end of Book 4.
Books 5 and 6 ostensibly concern the rise of the Medici, and indeed one might view Cosimo’s ascent as something of the central event of the Histories (see for instance FH 5.4 and 5.14). Yet in fact Machiavelli devotes the majority of Books 5 and 6 not to the Medici but rather to the rise of mercenary armies in Italy (compare P 12 and D 2.20). Among the topics that Machiavelli discusses are the famous battle of Anghiari (FH 5.33-34); the fearlessness of mercenary captains to break their word (FH 6.17); the exploits of Francesco Sforza (e.g., FH 6.2-18; compare P 1, 7, 12, 14, and 20 as well as D 2.24); and the propensity of mercenaries to generate wars so that they can profit (FH 6.33; see also AW 1.51-62).
Books 7 and 8 principally concern the rise of the Medici—in particular Cosimo; his son, Piero the Gouty; and his son in turn, Lorenzo the Magnificent. Cosimo (though “unarmed”) dies with great glory and is famous largely for his liberality (FH 7.5) and his attention to city politics: he prudently and persistently married his sons into wealthy Florentine families rather than foreign ones (FH 7.6). Cosimo also loved classical learning to such an extent that he brought John Argyropoulos and Marsilio Ficino to Florence. Additionally, Cosimo left a strong foundation for his descendants (FH 7.6). Piero is highlighted mainly for lacking the foresight and prudence of his father; for fomenting popular resentment; and for being unable to resist the ambition of the great. Nonetheless, Machiavelli notes Piero’s “virtue and goodness” (FH 7.23). Lorenzo is noted for his youth (F 7.23); his military prowess (FH 7.12); his desire for renown (FH 8.3); his eventual bodyguard of armed men due to the Pazzi assassination attempt (FH 8.10); and his many amorous endeavors (FH 8.36). The Histories end with the death of Lorenzo.
The Histories has received renewed attention in recent years, and scholars have increasingly seen it as not merely historical but also philosophical—in other words, as complementary to The Prince and the Discourses.
e. Other Works
Machiavelli’s other writings are briefly described here. Every single work is not listed; instead, emphasis has been placed upon those that seem to have philosophical resonance.
Some of Machiavelli’s writings treat historical or political topics. In the early 1500s, he wrote several reports and speeches. They are notable for their topics and for the way in which they contain precursors to important claims in later works, such as The Prince. Among other things, Machiavelli wrote on how Duke Valentino killed Vitellozzo Vitelli (compare P 7); on how Florence tried to suppress the factions in Pistoia (compare P 17); and how to deal with the rebels of Valdichiana.
In 1520, Machiavelli wrote a fictionalized biography, The Life of Castruccio Castracani. Many important details of Castruccio’s life are changed and stylized by Machiavelli, perhaps in the manner of Xenophon’s treatment of Cyrus. The most obvious changes are found in the final part, where Machiavelli attributes to Castruccio many sayings that are in fact almost exclusively drawn from the Lives of Diogenes Laertius. Some scholars believe that Machiavelli’s account is also beholden to the various Renaissance lives of Tamerlane—for instance, those by Poggio Bracciolini and especially Enea Silvio Piccolomini, who would become Pope Pius II and whose account became something of a genre model.
Also around 1520, Machiavelli wrote the Discourse on Florentine Affairs. Recent work has suggested the proximity in content between this work and the Florentine Histories. Also of interest is On the Natures of Florentine Men, which is an autograph manuscript which Machiavelli may have intended as a ninth book of the Florentine Histories.
Toward the end of his tenure in the Florentine government, Machiavelli wrote two poems in terza rima called I Decennali. The first seems to date from 1504-1508 and concerns the history of Italy from 1492 to 1503. It is the only work that Machiavelli published while in office. The second seems to date from around 1512 and concerns the history of Italy from 1504 to 1509. Among other things, they are precursors to concerns found in the Florentine Histories.
In general, between 1515 and 1527, Machiavelli turned more consciously toward art. He wrote a play called Le Maschere (The Masks) which was inspired by Aristophanes’ Clouds but which has not survived. Three of Machiavelli’s comedies have survived, however. L’Andria (The Girl from Andros) is a translation of Terence and was probably written between 1517 and 1520. Mandragola was probably written between 1512 and 1520; was first published in 1524; and was first performed in 1526. While original, it hearkens to the ancient world especially in how its characters are named (e.g., Lucrezia, Nicomaco). It is by far the most famous of the three and indeed is one of the most famous plays of the Renaissance. It contains many typical Machiavellian themes, the most notable of which are conspiracy and the use of religion as a mask for immoral purposes. The last of Machiavelli’s plays, Clizia, is an adaptation of Plautus. It was probably written in the early 1520s. In recent years, scholars have increasingly treated all three of these plays with seriousness and indeed as philosophical works in their own right.
In addition to I Decannali, Machiavelli wrote other poems. I Capitoli contains tercets which are dedicated to friends and which treat the topics of ingratitude, fortune, ambition, and opportunity (with virtue being notably absent). The Ideal Ruler is in the form of a pastoral. L’Asino (The Golden Ass) is unfinished and in terza rima; it has been called an “anti-comedy” and was probably penned around 1517. Between 1510 and 1515, Machiavelli wrote several sonnets and at least one serenade.
There are some other miscellaneous writings with philosophical import, most of which survive in autograph copies and which have undetermined dates of composition. Machiavelli wrote a Dialogue on Language in which he discourses with Dante on various linguistic concerns, including style and philology. Articles for a Pleasure Company is a satire on high society and especially religious confraternities. Belfagor is a short story that portrays, among other things, Satan as a wise and just prince. An Exhortation to Penitence unsurprisingly concerns the topic of penitence; the sincerity of this exhortation, however, remains a scholarly question.
Lastly, Machiavelli’s correspondence is worth noting. Some of his letters are diplomatic dispatches (the so-called “Legations”); others are personal. The Legations date from the period that Machiavelli worked for the Florentine government (1498-1512). The personal letters date from 1497 to 1527. Machiavelli’s nephew, Giuliano de’ Ricci, is responsible for assembling the copies of letters that Machiavelli had made. Particularly notable among the personal letters are the 13-21 September 1506 letter to Giovanbattista Soderini, the so-called Ghiribizzi al Soderini (Musings to Soderini); and the 10 December 1513 letter to Francesco Vettori, wherein Machiavelli first mentions The Prince.
4. Possible Philosophical Influences on Machiavelli
Machiavelli insists upon the novelty of his enterprise in several places (e.g., P 15 and D 1.pr). It is true that Machiavelli is particularly innovative and that he often appears to operate “without any respect” (sanza alcuno rispetto), as he puts it, toward his predecessors. As a result, some interpreters have gone so far as to call him the inaugurator of modern philosophy. But all philosophers are to some degree in conversation with their predecessors, even (or perhaps especially) those who seek to disagree fundamentally with what has been thought before. Thus, even with a figure as purportedly novel as Machiavelli, it is worth pondering historical and philosophical influences.
a. Renaissance Humanism
Although Machiavelli studied ancient humanists, he does not often cite them as authorities. In his own day, the most widely cited discussion of the classical virtues was Book 1 of Cicero’s De officiis. But Cicero is never named in The Prince (although Machiavelli does allude to him via the images of the fox and the lion in P 18-19) and is named only three times in the Discourses (D 1.4, 1.33, and 1.52; see also D 1.28, 1.56, and 1.59). Other classical thinkers in the humanist tradition receive similar treatment. Juvenal is quoted three times (D 2.19, 2.24, and 3.6). Virgil is quoted once in The Prince (P 17) and three times in the Discourses (D 1.23, 1.54, and 2.24). This trend tends to hold true for later thinkers, as well. Petrarch, whom Machiavelli particularly admired, is never mentioned in the Discourses, although Machiavelli does end The Prince with four lines from Petrarch’s Italia mia (93-96). One may see this relative paucity of references as suggestive that Machiavelli did not have humanist concerns. But it is possible to understand his thought as having a generally humanist tenor.
It is worth remembering that the humanists of Machiavelli’s day were almost exclusively professional rhetoricians. Though they did treat problems in philosophy, they were primarily concerned with eloquence. The revival of Greek learning in the Italian Renaissance did not change this concern and in fact even amplified it. New translations were made of ancient works, including Greek poetry and oratory, and rigorous (and in some ways newfound) philological concerns were infused with a sense of grace and nuance not always to be found in translations conducted upon the model of medieval calques. A notable example is Coluccio Salutati, who otherwise bore a resemblance to medieval rhetoricians such as Petrus de Vineis but who believed, unlike the medievals, that the best way to achieve eloquence was to imitate ancient style as concertedly as possible.
Machiavelli’s writings bear the imprint of his age in this regard. But what exactly is this imprint? What exactly is Machiavellian eloquence? Fellow philosophers have differed in their opinions. Adam Smith considered Machiavelli’s tone to be markedly cool and detached, even in discussions of the egregious exploits of Cesare Borgia. By contrast, Nietzsche understood Machiavelli’s Italian to be vibrant, almost galloping; and he thought that The Prince in particular imaginatively transported the reader to Machiavelli’s Florence and conveyed dangerous philosophical ideas in a boisterous “allegrissimo.” It is not unusual for interpreters to take one or the other of these stances today: to see Machiavelli’s works as dry and technical; or to see them as energetic and vivacious.
Recent work has examined not only Machiavelli’s eloquence but also his images, metaphors, and turns of phrase. “At a stroke” (ad un tratto) and “without any respect” (sanza alcuno rispetto) are two characteristic examples that Machiavelli frequently deploys. There has also been recent work on the many binaries to be found in Machiavelli’s works—such as virtue / fortune; ordinary / extraordinary; high / low; manly / effeminate; principality / republic; and secure / ruin. Machiavelli’s wit and his use of humor more generally have also been the subjects of recent work. Finally, increasing attention has been paid to other rhetorical devices, such as when Machiavelli speaks in his own voice; when he uses paradox, irony, and hyperbole; when he modifies historical examples for his own purposes; when he appears as a character in his narrative; and so forth. And some scholars have gone so far as to say that The Prince is not a treatise (compare D 2.1) but rather an oration, which follows the rules of classical rhetoric from beginning to end (and not just in Chapter 26). In short, it is increasingly a scholarly trend to claim that one must pay attention not only to what Machiavelli says but how he says it.
b. Renaissance Platonism
There is still a remarkable gap in the scholarship concerning Machiavelli’s possible indebtedness to Plato. One reason for this lacuna might be that Plato is never mentioned in The Prince and is mentioned only once in the Discourses (D 3.6). But there was certainly a widespread and effervescent revival of Platonism in Florence before and during Machiavelli’s lifetime.
What exactly is meant here, however? “Platonism” itself is a decidedly amorphous term in the history of philosophy. There are few, if any, doctrines that all Platonists have held, as Plato himself did not insist upon the dogmatic character of either his writings or his oral teaching. To which specific variety of Platonism was Machiavelli exposed? The two most instrumental figures with respect to transmitting Platonic ideas to Machiavelli’s Florence were George Gemistos Plethon and Marsilio Ficino.
Plethon visited Florence in 1438 and 1439 due to the Council of Florence, the seventeenth ecumenical council of the Catholic Church (Plethon himself opposed the unification of the Greek and Latin Churches). Cosimo de’ Medici was also enormously inspired by Plethon (as was John Argyropoulos; see FH 7.6); Ficino says in a preface to ten dialogues of Plato, written for Cosimo, that Plato’s spirit had flown from Byzantium to Florence. And he says in a preface to his version of Plotinus that Cosimo had been so deeply impressed with Plethon that the meeting between them had led directly to the foundation of Ficino’s so-called Platonic Academy.
The son of Cosimo de’ Medici’s physician, Ficino was a physician himself who also tutored Lorenzo the Magnificent. Ficino became a priest in 1473, and Lorenzo later made him canon of the Duomo so that he would be free to focus upon his true love: philosophy. Like Plethon, Ficino believed that Plato was part of an ancient tradition of wisdom and interpreted Plato through Neoplatonic successors, especially Proclus, Dionysius the Areopagite, and St. Augustine. Ficino died in 1499 after translating into Latin an enormous amount of ancient philosophy, including commentaries; and after writing his own great work, the Platonic Theology, a work of great renown that probably played no small role in the 1513 Fifth Lateran Council’s promulgation of the dogma of the immortality of the soul.
In the proem to the Platonic Theology, Ficino calls Plato “the father of philosophers” (pater philosophorum). In the Florentine Histories and in the only instance of the word “philosophy” (filosofia) in the major works, Machiavelli calls Ficino himself the “second father of Platonic philosophy” (secondo padre della platonica filosofia [FH 7.6]; compare FH 6.29, where Stefano Porcari of Rome hoped to be called its “new founder and second father” [nuovo fondatore e secondo padre]). And Machiavelli calls the syncretic Platonist Pico della Mirandola “a man almost divine [uomo quasi che divino]” (FH 8.36). Some scholars believe that Machiavelli critiques both Plato and Renaissance Platonism in such passages. Others, especially those who have problematized the sincerity of Machiavelli’s shocking moral claims, believe that this passage suggests a proximity between Machiavellian and Platonic themes.
Finally, Machiavelli’s father, Bernardo, is the principal interlocutor in Bartolomeo Scala’s Dialogue on the Laws and appears there as an ardent admirer of Plato.
c. Renaissance Aristotelianism
Aristotle is never mentioned in The Prince and is mentioned only once in the Discourses in the context of a discussion of tyranny (D 3.26). This has led some scholars to claim that Machiavelli makes a clean and deliberate break with Aristotelian philosophy. Other scholars, particularly those who see Machiavelli as a civic humanist, believe that Aristotle’s notions of republicanism and citizenship inform Machiavelli’s own republican idiom.
As with the question concerning Plato, the question of whether Aristotle influenced Machiavelli would seem to depend at least in part on the Aristotelianism to which he was exposed. Scholars once viewed the Renaissance as the rise of humanism and the rediscovery of Platonism, on the one hand; and the decline of the prevailing Aristotelianism of the medieval period, on the other. But, if anything, the reputation of Aristotle was only strengthened in Machiavelli’s time.
Italian scholastic philosophy was its own animal. Italy was exposed to more Byzantine influences than any other Western country. Furthermore, unlike a country such as France, Italy also had its own tradition of culture and inquiry that reached back to classical Rome. It is simply not the case that Italian Aristotelianism was displaced by humanism or Platonism. Indeed, perhaps from the late 13th century, and certainly by the late 14th, there was a healthy tradition of Italian Aristotelianism that stretched far into the 17th century. The main difference between the Aristotelian scholastics and their humanist rivals was one of subject matter. Whereas the humanists were rhetoricians who focused primarily on grammar, rhetoric, and poetry, the scholastics were philosophers who focused upon logic and natural philosophy. In Machiavelli’s day, university chairs in logic and natural philosophy were regularly held by Aristotelian philosophers, and lecturers in moral philosophy regularly based their material on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Politics. And the Eudemian Ethics was translated for the first time.
Assessing to what extent Machiavelli was influenced by Aristotle, then, is not as easy as simply seeing whether he accepts or rejects Aristotelian ideas, because some ideas—or at least the interpretations of those ideas—are much more compatible with Machiavelli’s philosophy than others. It seems likely that Machiavelli did not agree fully with the Aristotelian position on political philosophy. But Alexander of Aphrodisias’ interpretation that the soul was mortal might be much more in line with Machiavelli’s position, and this view was widely known in Machiavelli’s day. Another candidate might be Pietro Pomponazzi’s prioritization of the active, temporal life over the contemplative life. A third candidate might be any of the various and so-called Averroist ideas, many of which underwent a revival in Machiavelli’s day (especially in places like Padua). Recent work has explored this final candidate in particular.
Xenophon is mentioned only once in The Prince (P 14). However, he is mentioned seven times in the Discourses (D 2.2, 2.13, 3.20, 3.22 [2x], and 3.39 [2x]), which is more than any other historian except for Livy. Machiavelli refers the reader explicitly to two works of Xenophon: the Cyropaedia, which he calls “the life of Cyrus” (la vita di Ciro; P 14; see also D 2.13); and the Hiero, which he calls by the alternate title, Of Tyranny (De tyrannide; D 2.2; see also the end of P 21).
In The Prince, Machiavelli lists Cyrus (along with Moses, Romulus, and Theseus) as one of the four “most excellent men” (P 6). He also names Cyrus—or least Xenophon’s version of Cyrus (D 3.22)—as the exemplar that Scipio Africanus imitates (P 14). Machiavelli says that whoever reads “the life of Cyrus” will see in the “life of Scipio” how much glory Scipio obtained as a result of imitating Cyrus. And he says that Scipio’s imitation consisted in the chastity, affability, humanity, and liberality outlined by Xenophon.
This kind and gentle vision of Cyrus was not shared universally by Renaissance Italians. Dante, Petrarch, and Boccaccio all characterize Cyrus as a monstrous ruler who was defeated and killed by Queen Tomyris (one of the stories of Cyrus’ demise which is related by Herodotus). Although Machiavelli at times offers information about Cyrus that is compatible with Herodotus’ account (P 6 and 26; AW 6.218), he appears to have a notable preference for Xenophon’s fictionalized version (as in P 14 above).
Machiavelli’s preference is presumably because of Xenophon’s teaching on appearances. Xenophon’s Cyrus is chaste, affable, humane, and liberal (P 14). At least two of these virtues are mentioned in later chapters of The Prince. Liberality is characterized as a virtue that consumes itself and thus cannot be maintained—unless one spends what belongs to others, as did “Cyrus, Caesar, and Alexander” (P 17). Similarly, humanity (umanità) is named as a trait that one may have to disavow in times of necessity (P 18). For example, Agathocles is characterized by inhumanity (inumanità; P8), and Hannibal was “inhumanely cruel” (inumana crudeltà; P 17; see also D 3.21-22). Nonetheless, humanity is also one of the five qualities that Machiavelli explicitly highlights as a useful thing to appear to have (P 18; see also FH 2.36). Machiavelli makes it clear that Xenophon’s Cyrus understood the need to deceive (D 2.13). Thus, Machiavelli may have learned from Xenophon that it is important for rulers (and especially founders) to appear to be something that they are not. This might hold true whether they are actual rulers (e.g., “a certain prince of present times” who says one thing and does another; P 18) or whether they are historical examples (e.g., Machiavelli’s altered story of David; P 13).
But it is worth wondering whether Machiavelli does in fact ultimately uphold Xenophon’s account. Immediately after praising Xenophon’s account of Cyrus at the end of Prince 14, Machiavelli in Prince 15 lambasts those who have presented imaginary objects of imitation. He says that he will leave out what is imagined and will instead discuss what is true. Could it be that Machiavelli puts Xenophon’s Cyrus forward as an example that is not to be followed? It is worth noting that Scipio, who imitates Cyrus, is criticized for excessive mercy (or piety; P 17). This example is especially remarkable since Machiavelli highlights Scipio as someone who was very rare (rarissimo) not only for his own times but “in the entire memory of things known” (in tutta la memoria delle cose che si fanno; P 17; compare FH 8.29). It also raises the question as to whether Machiavelli writes in a manner similar to Xenophon (D 3.22).
Lastly, it is worth noting that Xenophon was a likely influence on Machiavelli’s own fictionalized and stylized biography, The Life of Castruccio Castracani.
Ninth century manuscripts of De rerum natura, Lucretius’ poetic account of Epicurean philosophy, are extant. However, the text was not widely read in the Middle Ages and did not obtain prominence until centuries later, when it was rediscovered in 1417 by Poggio Bracciolini. It seems to have entered broader circulation in the 1430s or 1440s, and it was first printed in 1473. De rerum natura was one of the two texts which led to a revival of Epicurean philosophy in Machiavelli’s day, the other being the life of Epicurus from Book 10 of Diogenes Laertius’ Lives (translated into Latin in 1433). These two works, along with other snippets of Epicurean philosophy already known from Seneca and Cicero, inspired many thinkers—such as Ficino and Alberti—to ponder the return of these ideas.
With respect to Machiavelli, Lucretius was an important influence on Bartolomeo Scala, a lawyer who was a friend of Machiavelli’s father. Additionally, Lucretius was an important influence on Marcello di Virgilio Adriani, who was a professor at the University of Florence; Scala’s successor in the chancery; and the man under whom Machiavelli was appointed to work in 1498. Adriani deployed Lucretius in his Florentine lectures on poetry and rhetoric between 1494 and 1515. Machiavelli may have received a substantial part of his classical education from Adriani and was likely familiar with Adriani’s lectures, at least.
Lucretius also seems to have been a direct influence on Machiavelli himself. Although Machiavelli never mentions Lucretius by name, he did hand-copy the entirety of De rerum natura (drawing largely from the 1495 print edition). Machiavelli’s transcription was likely completed around 1497 and certainly before 1512. He omits the descriptive capitula—not original to Lucretius but common in many manuscripts—that subdivide the six books of the text into smaller sections. He also adds approximately twenty marginal annotations of his own, almost all of which are concentrated in Book 2. Machiavelli’s annotations focus on the passages in De rerum natura which concern Epicurean physics—that is, the way that the cosmos would function in terms of atomic motion, atomic swerve, free will, and a lack of providential intervention. Recent work has noted that it is precisely this section of the text that received the least attention from other Renaissance annotators, many of whom focused instead upon Epicurean views on love, virtue, and vice.
Recent work has also highlighted stylistic resonances between Machiavelli’s works and De rerum natura, either directly or indirectly. To give only one example, Machiavelli says in the Discourses that he desires to “take a path as yet untrodden by anyone” (non essendo suta ancora da alcuno trita) in order to find “new modes and orders” (modi ed ordini nuovi; D 1.pr). Lucretius says that he will walk paths not yet trodden (trita) by any foot in order to gather “new flowers” (novos flores; 4.1-5). Among other possible connections are P 25 and 26; and D 1.2, 2.pr, and 3.2.
Machiavelli does not seem to have agreed with the classical Epicurean position that one should withdraw from public life (e.g., D 1.26 and 3.2). But what might Machiavelli have learned from Lucretius? One possible answer concerns the soul. Machiavelli never treats the topic of the soul substantively, and he never uses the word at all in either The Prince or the Discourses (he apparently even went so far as to delete anima from a draft of the first preface to the Discourses). For Lucretius, the soul is material, perishable, and made up of two parts: animus, which is located in the chest, and anima, which is spread throughout the body. But each part, like all things in the cosmos, is composed only of atoms, invisibly small particles of matter that are constantly in motion. From time to time, these atoms conglomerate into macroscopic masses. Human beings are such entities. But when they perish, there is no longer any power to hold the atoms of the soul together, so those atoms disperse like all others eventually do.
A second possible aspect of Lucretian influence concerns the eternity of the cosmos, on the one hand, and the constant motion of the world, on the other. Lucretius seems to have believed that the cosmos was eternal but that the world was not, whereas some thinkers in Machiavelli’s day believed that both the cosmos and the world were eternal. Machiavelli ponders the question of the eternity of the world (D 2.5). He at times claims that the world has always remained the same (D 1.pr and 2.pr; see also 1.59). He also at times claims that worldly things are in motion (P 10 and FH 5.1; compare P 25) and that human things in particular are “always in motion” (D 1.6 and 2.pr).
As recent work has shown, reading Lucretius in the Renaissance was a dangerous game. By Machiavelli’s time, Petrarch had already described Epicurus as a philosopher who was held in popular disrepute; and Dante had already suggested that those who deny the afterlife belong with “Epicurus and all his followers” (Inferno 10.13-15). In 1513, the Fifth Lateran Council condemned those who believed that the soul was mortal; those who believed in the unity of the intellect; and those who believed in the eternity of the world. It also made belief in the afterlife mandatory. Lucretius was last printed in the Italian Renaissance in 1515 and was prohibited from being read in schools by the Florentine synod in late 1516 / early 1517.
There is no comprehensive monograph on Machiavelli and Savonarola. While there has been some interesting recent work, particularly with respect to Florentine institutions, the connection between the two thinkers remains a profitable area of research.
Girolamo Savonarola was a Dominican friar who came to Florence in 1491 and who effectively ruled the city from 1494 to 1498 from the pulpits of San Marco and Santa Reparata. He was renowned for his oratorical ability, his endorsement of austerity, and his concomitant condemnation of excess and luxury. The effectiveness of his message can be seen in the stark difference between Botticelli’s Primavera and his later, post-Savonarolan Calumny of Apelles; or in the fact that Michelangelo felt compelled to toss his own easel paintings onto the so-called bonfires of the vanities. Savonarola’s influence in Florentine politics grew to immensity, and Pope Alexander VI would eventually excommunicate Savonarola after a lengthy dispute. As a result, Florence would hang and then burn Savonarola (with two others) at the stake, going so far as to toss his ashes in the Arno afterward so that no relics of him could be kept.
Machiavelli attended several of Savonarola’s sermons, which may be significant since he did not seem inclined otherwise to attend services regularly. There are interesting possible points of contact in terms of the content of these sermons, such as Savonarola’s understanding of Moses; Savonarola’s prediction of Charles VIII as a new Cyrus; and Savonarola’s use of the Biblical story of the flood.
In The Prince, Machiavelli discusses Savonarola by name only a single time, saying that he is an “unarmed prophet” who has been ruined because he does not have a way either to make believers remain firm or to make unbelievers believe (P 6). Machiavelli later acknowledges that Savonarola spoke the truth when he claimed that “our sins” were the cause of Charles VIII’s invasion of Italy, although he does not name him and in fact disagrees with Savonarola as to which sins are relevant (P 12; compare D 2.18). In the Discourses, Machiavelli is more expansive and explicit in his treatment of the friar. Savonarola convinces the Florentines, no naïve people, that he talks with God (D 1.11); helps to reorder Florence but loses reputation after he fails to uphold a law that he fiercely supported (D 1.45); foretells the coming of Charles VIII into Florence (D 1.56); and understands what Moses understands, which is that one must kill envious men who oppose one’s plans (D 3.30). Machiavelli conspicuously omits any explicit mention of Savonarola in the Florentine Histories.
It is also worth noting two other important references in Machiavelli’s corpus. The lengthiest discussion of Savonarola is Machiavelli’s 9 March 1498 letter to Ricciardo Becchi. Many commentators have read this letter as a straightforward condemnation of Savonarola’s hypocrisy, but some recent work has stressed the letter’s rhetorical nuances. To give only one example, Machiavelli discusses how Savonarola colors his “lies” (bugie). While it is true that Machiavelli does use bugie only in a negative context in the Discourses (D 1.14 and 3.6), it is difficult to maintain that Machiavelli is opposed to lying in any principled way.
Secondly, in his 17 May 1521 letter to Francesco Guicciardini, Machiavelli has been interpreted as inveighing against Savonarola’s hypocrisy. But, again, nuances and context may be important. Machiavelli does indeed implicate two other friars: Ponzo for insanity and Alberto for hypocrisy. But he simply calls Savonarola versuto, which means something like “crafty” or “versatile” and which is a quality that he never denounces elsewhere in his corpus.
g. The Bible and Its Traditions
To what extent the Bible influenced Machiavelli remains an important question. He laments that histories are no longer properly read or understood (D 1.pr); speaks of reading histories with judicious attention (sensatamente; D 1.23); and implies that the Bible is a history (D 2.5). Furthermore, he explicitly speaks of reading the Bible in this careful manner (again sensatamente; D 3.30)—the only time in The Prince or the Discourses that he mentions “the Bible” (la Bibbia). Recent work has explored what it might have meant for Machiavelli to read the Bible in this way. Additionally, recent work has explored the extent to which Machiavelli engaged with the Jewish, Christian, and Islamic traditions.
Machiavelli quotes from the Bible only once in his major works, referring to someone “. . . who filled the hungry with good things and sent the rich away empty” (D 1.26; Luke 1:53; compare I Samuel 2:5-7). The passage is from Mary’s Magnificat and refers to God. Machiavelli, however, uses the passage to refer to David.
David is one of two major Biblical figures in Machiavelli’s works. Elsewhere in the Discourses, Machiavelli attributes virtue to David and says that he was undoubtedly a man very excellent in arms, learning, and judgment (D 1.19). In a digression in The Prince, Machiavelli refers to David as “a figure of the Old Testament” (una figura del Testamento vecchio; P 13). Machiavelli offers a gloss of the story of David and Goliath which differs in numerous and substantive ways from the Biblical account (see I Samuel 17:32-40, 50-51).
Moses is the other major Biblical figure in Machiavelli’s works. He is mentioned at least five times in The Prince (P 6 [4x] and 26) and at least five times in the Discourses (D 1.1, 1.9, 2.8 [2x], and 3.30). Moses is the only one of the four most excellent men of Chapter 6 who is said to have a “teacher” (precettore; compare Achilles in P 18). In the Discourses, Moses is a lawgiver who is compelled to kill “infinite men” due to their envy and in order to push his laws and orders forward (D 3.30; see also Exodus 32:25-28).
Machiavelli sparsely treats the “ecclesiastical principality” (P 11) and the “Christian pontificate” (P 11 and 19). He calls Ferdinand of Aragon “the first king among the Christians” (P 21) and says that Cosimo Medici’s death is mourned by “all citizens and all the Christian princes” (FH 7.6).
Chapter 6 of The Prince is famous for its distinction between armed and unarmed prophets. In Chapter 26, Machiavelli refers to extraordinary occurrences “without example” (sanza essemplo): the opening of the sea, the escort by the cloud, the water from the stone, and the manna from heaven. It has long been noted that Machiavelli’s ordering of these events does not follow the order given in Exodus (14:21, 13:21, 17:6, and 16:4, respectively). However, recent work has noted that it does in fact follow exactly the order of Psalms 78:13-24.
Lastly, scholars have recently begun to examine Machiavelli’s connections to Islam. For example, some scholars believe that Machiavelli’s notion of a sect (setta) is imported from the Averroeist vocabulary. Machiavelli speaks at least twice of the prophet Mohammed (FH 1.9 and 1.19), though conspicuously not when he discusses armed prophets (P 6). He discusses various Muslim princes—most importantly Saladin (FH 1.17), who is said to have virtue. Machiavelli compares the Pope with the Ottoman “Turk” and the Egyptian “Sultan” (P 19; compare P 11). He also compares “the Christian pontificate” with the Janissary and Mameluk regimes predominant under Sunni Islam (P 19; see also P 11). On occasion he refers to the Turks as “infidels” (infideli; e.g., P 13 and FH 1.17).
5. Contemporary Interpretations
The main aim of this article is to help readers find a foothold in the primary literature. A second, related aim is to help readers do so in the secondary literature.
In the spirit of bringing “common benefit to everyone” (D 1.pr), what follows is a rough outline of the scholarly landscape. It has followed the practice of many recent Machiavelli scholars—for whom it is not uncommon, especially in English, to say that the views on Machiavelli can be divided into a handful of camps. Many of the differences between these camps appear to reduce to the question of how to fit The Prince and the Discourses together. Five are outlined below, although some scholars would of course put that number either higher or lower. Readers who are interested in understanding the warp and woof of the scholarship in greater detail are encouraged to consult the recent and more fine-grained accounts of Catherine Zuckert (2017), John T. Scott (2016), and Erica Benner (2013).
The first camp takes The Prince to be a satirical or ironic work. The 16th century Italian jurist Alberico Gentili was one of the first interpreters to take up the position that The Prince is a satire on ruling. Rousseau and Spinoza in their own respective ways also seemed to hold this interpretation. Members of this camp typically argue that Machiavelli is a republican of various sorts and place special emphasis upon his rhetoric. The most notable recent member of this camp is Erica Benner (2017a, 2017b, 2013, and 2009), who argues that The Prince is thoroughly ironic and that Machiavelli presents a shocking moral teaching in order to subvert it.
The second camp also places emphasis upon Machiavelli’s republicanism and thus sits in proximity to the first camp. However, members of this camp do not typically argue that The Prince is satirical or ironic. They do typically argue that The Prince presents a different teaching than does the Discourses; and that, as an earlier work, The Prince is not as comprehensive or mature of a writing as the Discourses. This camp also places special emphasis upon Machiavelli’s historical context. The most notable member of this camp is Quentin Skinner (2017, 2010, and 1978). J. G. A. Pocock (2010 and 1975), Hans Baron (1988 and 1966), and David Wootton (2016) could be reasonably placed in this camp. Maurizio Viroli (2016, 2014, 2010, 2000, and 1998) could also be reasonably placed here, though he puts additional emphasis on The Prince.
The third camp argues for the unity of Machiavelli’s teaching and furthermore argues that The Prince and the Discourses approach the truth from different directions. In other words, members of this camp typically claim that Machiavelli presents the same teaching or vision in each book but from different starting points. The most notable members of this camp are Isaiah Berlin (1981 ), Sheldon Wolin (1960), and Benedetto Croce (1925).
The fourth camp also argues for the unity of Machiavelli’s teaching and thus sits in proximity to the third camp. However, members of this camp do not typically argue that The Prince and Discourses begin from different starting points. And while they typically argue for the overall coherence of Machiavelli’s corpus, they do not appear to hold a consensus regarding the status of Machiavelli’s republicanism. The most notable member of this camp is Leo Strauss (1958). Harvey C. Mansfield (2017, 2016, 1998, and 1979), Catherine Zuckert (2017 and 2016), John T. Scott (2016, 2011, and 1994), Vickie Sullivan (2006, 1996, and 1994), Nathan Tarcov (2015, 2014, 2013a, 2013b, 2007, 2006, 2003, 2000, and 1982), and Clifford Orwin (2016 and 1978) could be reasonably placed here.
The fifth camp is hermeneutically beholden to Hegel, which seems at first glance to be an anachronistic approach. But Hegel’s notion of dialectic was itself substantially beholden to Proclus’ commentary on the Parmenides—a work which was readily available to Machiavelli through Ficino’s translation and which was enormously influential on Renaissance Platonism in general. The most notable member of this camp is Claude Lefort (2012 ). Miguel Vatter (2017, 2013, and 2000) could be reasonably placed here and additionally deserves mention for his familiarity with the secondary literature in Spanish (an unusual achievement for Machiavelli scholars who write in English). Additionally, interpreters who are indirectly beholden to Hegel’s dialectic, via Marx, could also be reasonably placed here. Miguel Abensour (2011 ), Louis Althusser (1995), and Antonio Gramsci (1949) are examples.
6. References and Further Reading
Below are listed some of the more well-known works in the scholarship, as well as some that the author has found profitable but which are perhaps not as well-known. They are arranged as much as possible in accordance with the outline of this article. Given the article’s aim, the focus is almost exclusively upon works that are available in English. It goes without saying that there are many important books that are not mentioned.
Regarding Machiavelli’s life, there are many interesting and recent biographies. Some examples include Benner (2017a), Celenza (2015), Black (2013 and 2010), Atkinson (2010), Skinner (2010), Viroli (2010, 2000, and 1998), de Grazia (1989), and Ridolfi (1964). Vivanti (2013) offers an intellectual biography. Pesman (2010) captures Machiavelli’s work for the Florentine republic. Butters (2010), Cesati (1999), and Najemy (1982) discuss Machiavelli’s relationship with the Medici. Landon (2013) examines Machiavelli’s relationship with Lorenzo di Filippo Strozzi. Masters (1999 and 1998) examines Machiavelli’s relationship with Leonardo da Vinci.
For an understanding of Machiavelli’s overall position, Zuckert (2017) is the most recent and comprehensive account of Machiavelli’s corpus, especially with respect to his politics. Other good places to begin are Nederman (2009), Viroli (1998), Mansfield (2017, 2016, and 1998), Skinner (2017 and 1978), Prezzolini (1967), Voegelin (1951), and Foster (1941). Johnston, Urbinati, and Vergara (2017) and Fuller (2016) are recent, excellent collections. Lefort (2012) and Strauss (1958) are daunting and difficult but also well worth the attempt.
Skinner (2017), Benner (2009), and Mansfield (1998) discuss virtue. Spackman (2010) and Pitkin (1984) discuss fortune, particularly with respect to the image of fortune as a woman. Saxonhouse (2016), Tolman Clarke (2005), and Falco (2004) discuss Machiavelli’s understanding of women. Benner (2017b and 2009) and Cox (2010) treat Machiavelli’s ethics.
On religion, see Parsons (2016), Tarcov (2014), Palmer (2010a and 2010b), Lynch (2010), and Lukes (1984). Biasiori and Marcocci (2018) is a recent collection concerning Machiavelli and Islam. Nederman (1999) examines free will. Blanchard (1996) discusses sight and touch.
Rahe (2017) and Parel (1992) discuss Machiavelli’s understanding of humors. Regarding various other political themes, including republicanism, see McCormick (2011), Slade (2010), Barthas (2010), Rahe (2017, 2008, and 2005), Patapan (2006), Sullivan (2006 and 1996), Forde (1995 and 1992), Bock (1990), Hulliung (1983), Skinner (1978), and Pocock (1975).
Recent works concerning The Prince include Benner (2017b and 2013), Scott (2016), Parsons (2016), Viroli (2014), Vatter (2013), Rebhorn (2010 and 1998), M. Palmer (2001), and de Alvarez (1999). Tarcov’s essays (2015, 2014, 2013a, 2013b, 2007, 2006, 2003, 2000, and 1982) are especially fine-grained analyses. Connell (2013) discusses The Prince’s composition. On deception, see Dietz (1984) and Langton and Dietz (1987). On Cesare Borgia, see Orwin (2016) and Scott and Sullivan (1994).
Recent works concerning the Discourses include Duff (2011), Najemy (2010), Pocock (2010), Hörnqvist (2004), Vatter (2000), Coby (1999), and Sullivan (1996). Mansfield (1979) and Walker (1950) are the two notable commentaries.
Regarding the Art of War, see Hörnqvist (2010), Lynch (2010 and 2003), Lukes (2004), and Colish (1998).
Regarding the Florentine Histories, see McCormick (2017), Jurdjevic (2014), Lynch (2012), Cabrini (2010), and Mansfield (1998).
Regarding Machiavelli’s poetry and plays, see Ascoli and Capodivacca (2010), Martinez (2010), Kahn (2010 and 1994), Atkinson and Sices (2007 ), Patapan (2003), Sullivan (2000), and Ascoli and Kahn (1993).
Anyone who wants to learn more about the intellectual context of the Italian Renaissance should begin with the many writings of Kristeller (e.g., 1979, 1961, and 1965), whose work is a model of scholarship. See also Hankins (2000), Cassirer (2010 ), and Burke (1998).
Regarding humanist educational treatises, see Kallendorf (2008). Regarding Ficino, see the I Tatti series edited by James Hankins (especially 2015, 2012, 2008, and 2001). Hankins’ examination of the “myth” of the Platonic Academy in Florence is also worth mentioning (1991). Regarding Xenophon, see Nadon (2001) and Newell (1988). Regarding Lucretius, see A. Palmer (2014), Brown (2010a and 2010b), and Rahe (2008). Norbrook, Harrison, and Hardie (2016) is a recent collection concerning Lucretius’ influence upon early modernity. The most comprehensive recent treatment of Savonarola can be found in Jurdjevic (2014).
Much of Machiavelli’s important personal correspondence has been collected in Atkinson and Sices (1996). Najemy has examined Machiavelli’s correspondence with Vettori (1993).
Those interested in the Italian scholarship should begin with the seminal work of Sasso (1993, 1987, and 1967). Careful studies of Machiavelli’s word choice can be found in Chiappelli (1974, 1969, and 1952).
Lastly, Ruffo-Fiore (1990) has compiled an annotated bibliography of Machiavelli scholarship from 1935 to 1988.
a. Primary Sources
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- Machiavelli, Niccolò. The Comedies of Machiavelli, ed. and trans. David Sices and James B. Atkinson. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2007 .
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