The Meaning of Life: Early Continental and Analytic Perspectives
The question of the meaning of life is one that interests philosophers and non-philosophers alike. The question itself is notoriously ambiguous and possibly vague. In asking about the meaning of life, one may be asking about the essence of life, about life’s purpose, about whether and how anything matters, or a host of other things.
Not everyone is plagued by questions about life’s meaning, but some are. The circumstances in which one does ask about life’s meaning include those in which: one is well off but bothered by either a sense of dissatisfaction or the prospect of bad things to come; one is young at heart and has a sense of wonder; one is perplexed by the discordant plurality of things and wants to find some unity in all the diversity; or one has lost faith in old values and narratives and wants to know how to live in order to have a meaningful life.
We may read our ancestors in such a way that warrants the claim that the meaning of life has been a human concern from the beginning. But it was only early in the nineteenth century that writers began to write directly about “the meaning of life.” The most significant writers were: Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy. Schopenhauer ended up saying that the meaning of life is to deny it; Kierkegaard, that the meaning of life is to obey God passionately; Nietzsche, that the meaning of life is the will to power; and Tolstoy, that the meaning of life lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called “faith.”
In the twentieth century, in the Continental tradition, Heidegger held that the meaning of life is to live authentically or (alternatively) to be a guardian of the earth. Sartre espoused the view that life is meaningless but urged us nonetheless to make a free choice that would give our lives meaning and responsibility. Camus also thought that life is absurd and meaningless. The best way to cope with this fact, he held, is to live life with passion, using everything up, and with an attitude of revolt, defiance, or scorn.
In the Anglo-American tradition, William James held that life is meaningful and worth living because of a spiritual order in which we should believe, or else that it is meaningful when there is a marriage of ideals with pluck, will, and the manly virtues; Bertrand Russell argued that to live a meaningful life one must abandon private and petty interests and instead cultivate an interest in the eternal; Moritz Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found in play; and A. J. Ayer asserted that the question of the meaning of life is itself meaningless.
All of these set the table for a veritable feast of philosophical writing on the meaning of life that began in the 1950s with Kurt Baier’s essay “The Meaning of Life,” followed in 1970 by Richard Taylor’s influential essay on the same topic, followed shortly by Thomas Nagel’s important 1971 essay on “The Absurd.” See “Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective” for more on the course of the debate in analytic philosophy about the meaning of life.
Table of Contents
- Nineteenth Century Philosophers
- Early Twentieth Century Continental Philosophers
- Early Twentieth Century Analytic, American, and English-Language Philosophers
- References and Further Reading
The English term “meaning” dates back to the fourteenth century C.E. Its origins, according to the Oxford English Dictionary (OED), lie in the Middle English word “meenyng” (also spelled “menaynge,” “meneyng,” and “mennyng”).
In its earliest occurrences, in English original compositions as well as in English translations of earlier works, meaning is most often what, on the one hand, sentences, utterances, and stories, and, on the other hand, dreams, visions, signs, omens, and rituals have or might have. One asks about the meaning of some puzzling utterance, or of the writing on the wall, or of the vision that appeared to somebody in the night, or of the ritual performed on a hallowed occasion. Meaning is often conceived of as something non-obvious and somewhat secretive, discernible only by a seer granted with special powers.
It is much later that life is spoken of as something that might, or might not, have meaning in this sense. Such speech would have to wait upon the development of the concept of life as something like a word, a linguistic utterance, a narrative, a story, a gesture, a puzzling episode, a sign, a dream, a vision, or a surface phenomenon that points to some deep inner essence, to which it would be proper to inquire into its meaning, or to apply epithets like “meaningful” or “meaningless.” One of the earliest instances of the occurrence of the concept “life” as such a thing, as signifying something that might or might not have something like meaning, appears in Shakespeare’s Macbeth (c. 1605), where Macbeth characterizes life as “a tale told by an idiot, full of sound and fury, signifying nothing.” But notice that even here the words “meaning” and “life” are not linked.
The OED‘s definition of “meaning” in something like our sense is “The significance, purpose, underlying truth, etc., of something.” Further elaboration of early uses of the word gives us, “That which is indicated or expressed by a (supposed) symbol or symbolic action; spec. a message, warning, idea, etc., supposed to be symbolized by a dream, vision, omen, etc.” A bit later, in one of its senses, meaning takes on the sense in which it is the “signification; intention; cause, purpose; motive, justification,” . . . “[o]f an action, condition, etc.” Finally we get the sense that most nearly concerns us here: “Something which gives one a sense of purpose, value, etc., esp. of a metaphysical or spiritual kind; the (perceived) purpose of existence or of a person’s life. Freq. in the meaning of life.” (All this is from the OED.)
The first English use of the expression “the meaning of life” appeared in 1834 in Thomas Carlyle’s (1795-1881) Sartor Resartus II. ix, where Teufelsdrockh observes, “our Life is compassed round with Necessity; yet is the meaning of Life itself no other than Freedom.” The usage shortly caught on, and over the next century and a half the phrase “the meaning of life” became common. The adjective “meaningful” did not appear until 1852, the noun “meaningfulness” until 1904.
The most familiar form of the question(s) about the meaning of life is simply, “What is the meaning of life?” Although the form of the question is one, when it is asked, any one (or more) of several different senses may be intended. Here are some of the more common of them.
(1) In some cases, what the seeker seeks is the kernel, the inner reality, the core, or the essence, underlying some phenomenon. Thus one might ask what his essence, his true self is, and then feel that he has found the meaning of his life if he discovers that true self.
(2) In other cases, the question is about the point, aim, object, purpose, end, or goal of life, typically one’s own. Here, in some cases, the question is about some pre-existing purpose that the questioner might (or might not) discover; in other cases, the question might be about some end or purpose the agent might invent or create and give her life. The latter questioner, when she is successful, may believe that her life has a meaning because she herself has given it one.
(3) In yet other cases, the question of the meaning of life is that of whether our lives, and anything we do within them, matter, or have any sort of importance. If one can show that they matter, and in virtue of what they do, one will have provided a substantive answer to the question of the meaning of life. A common, but not universal, assumption on this score is that our lives have significance and importance only if they issue in some lasting achievement the ravages of time will not destroy.
(4) In still other cases, what bothers the questioner is the discord, plurality, and chaotic nature of his apparent empirical life as it is actually lived. He can make no sense of it; there is no rhyme or reason to it. The drive here, one might well think, is to see one’s life as intelligible, as something that makes sense. The discovery or invention of some kind of unity in his life would amount to an answer to his question, “What is the meaning of life?”
(5) Yet another thing the question about the meaning of life can be is a request for a narrative or picture, a way of seeing life (perhaps a metaphorical one) that enables one to make sense of it and achieve a sense of meaning while living it. And so we get “Life is a bowl of cherries” and various and sundry religious narratives.
(6) Sometimes what the questioner is really wondering is whether it makes sense to go on and his question is “Is life worth living?” He may actually be contemplating suicide. His predicament has to do with meaning if he is assuming that it makes sense to continue living only if (his) life has a suitable meaning, something which, at the moment, he can’t see it as having.
(7) Finally, the question of the meaning of life can be the question of how one should live in order to have a meaningful life, or, if such a life is impossible, then what the best way to live meaninglessly is.
The seven questions just distinguished may be, but need not be, discrete and self-contained. A given seeker may very well be interested in several of them at once and see them as intimately connected. For example, a person may be interested in his core or essence because he thinks that knowledge of that may reveal the goal or purpose of his life, a purpose that makes his life seem important and intelligible, and gives him a reason for going on, as well as insight into how he must live in order to have a meaningful life. It is commonly the case that several of the questions press themselves on the seeker all at the same time.
One or more of these questions were of concern to the philosophers discussed below. Some were concerned with nearly all of them. Distinct from all the above are second-order, analytic, conceptual questions of the sort that dominate current philosophical discussion of the issue in analytic circles. These questions are not so much about the meaning of life as about the meaning of “the meaning of life” and its component concepts (“meaning,” “life”), or related ones (“meaningfulness,” “meaninglessness,” “vanity,” “absurdity,” and so forth).
Although nineteenth century thinkers were the first in the West to put the question precisely in the form “What is the meaning of life?” concern with questions in what may be called “the meaning-of-life family,” that is, ultimate questions about life, the world, existence, and its purpose may be found, in the East and the West alike, almost as far back as we can trace human thought about anything. Thus Gilgamesh (c. 2000 B.C.E.) asked why he must die; the composers of The Rig Veda (c. 1200 B.C.E.) wondered where everything came from; Job (c. 500 B.C.E.) asked why he must suffer; the ancient Taoists (Laozi c. 500 B.C.E. and Zhuangzi c. 300 B.C.E.) asked what the origin or principle of everything is, and how one must live to be in accord with it; ancient Upanishadic seekers (500-300 B.C.E.) were much vexed with the nature of the true self and its end or goal; the Buddha (c. 500 B.C.E.), before he became the Buddha, sought an understanding of life that would enable one to overcome suffering; the author of The Bhagavad Gita (c. 200 B.C.E.) was concerned, as other Indian thinkers tended to be, with the identity and nature of the true self, and also with the question of how to live; the ancient Greeks of the classical period (c. 430-320 B.C.E.) talked about the goal or end of life and how to reach it; Epicurus (341-270 B.C.E.) followed suit and developed his own unique take on these matters; Qoheleth, the author of Ecclesiastes (c. 200 B.C.E.), was struck by the vanity or futility of everything and wondered how to deal with it; Greek and Roman Hellenistic philosophers (c. 300 B.C.E. – 250 C.E.)—Epicurean, Stoic, Cynic, Skeptic, and Neo-Platonist—wondered about the good and how to achieve it; Marcus Aurelius (121-180 C.E.) mused on his cosmic insignificance.
The Christian-dominated medieval period did not produce thinkers who asked in any radical way about the meaning of life, because everyone already had a perfectly good answer, the one provided by the Christian story. Still, even in medieval times, there was room for at least three questions in the meaning-of-life family. First, there was occasion for the questions when things ran counter to the Christian story, or to what one expected. Thus Boethius (480-525) was perplexed by the deep questions when, after a life of honor, piety, and power, he fell into disgrace, had everything stripped from him unaccountably and unjustly, and found himself faced with imprisonment that lead eventually to his execution. Second, though the great Christian philosopher-theologians thought they knew the meaning of life in outline, they still asked and answered questions about the details of the final or highest good of man. Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274), for example, who accepted with unblinking assurance the general answer supplied by Christianity, found himself wondering about the exact nature of the summum bonum (the highest good) and about how to square the Christian view of it with that of Aristotle. Third, other Christian believers, medieval ones as well as present-day ones with medieval outlooks, committed to an overall view of what is going on, may be vexed by the question of what God intends for them specifically and may worry about their “calling,” the particular purpose, role, or plan God has especially for them. Hence we find confirmed believers worried deeply about the question, “What is the meaning of my life?”
In any event, since the early modern period, there has been a resurgence of interest in fundamental meaning-of-life questions. Writers as diverse as Shakespeare (1564-1616), Pascal (1623-1662), Dr. Johnson (1709-84), Kant (1724-1804), and Hegel (1770-1831) have asked, in different forms, questions about life’s ultimate point, goal, or purpose, and they are just a few of the many religious, philosophical, and literary figures who have raised and (sometimes) answered ultimate questions in the meaning-of-life family prior to Schopenhauer’s work early in the nineteenth century. There have been philosophers too since Schopenhauer’s time who have addressed the big questions, but not explicitly in terms of “the meaning of life.” This article will confine itself largely to those philosophers who have explicitly put their concerns in those terms.
The standard explanation of the rise of questions about life’s meaning in the early modern period points to three or four distinct but related things: (1) the scientific revolution; (2) the Protestant Reformation; (3) voyages and travels of exploration and discovery, in which were encountered peoples with very different outlooks on the nature of the universe and the meaning of life; and (4), as a result of all of these, the evaporation of a widely held, firmly believed Christian conception of the nature of things.
Let us turn now to the story of what philosophers from Schopenhauer in the early 1800s to Ayer and Camus in the 1940s have had to say about the meaning of life.
The first Western philosopher to link the ideas of life and meaning, and to ask expressly “What is the meaning of life?” was the great German pessimist Arthur Schopenhauer (1788-1860). At least he was the first to ask the question and get it noticed by other philosophers. Schopenhauer, a contemporary of Carlyle, wrote in German, in which “the meaning of life” is “der Sinn des Lebens.” Profoundly influencing the thought of both Nietzsche and Tolstoy, Schopenhauer’s work may be regarded as the springboard that launched modern Western philosophical inquiry into the problem of the meaning of life. Here is the passage in which Schopenhauer explicitly asked the question:
Since a man does not alter, and his moral character remains absolutely the same all through his life; since he must play out the part which he has received, without the least deviation from the character; since neither experience, nor philosophy, nor religion can effect any improvement in him, the question arises, What is the meaning of life at all? (1860b) [emphasis added]
The circumstances under which concern with the problem of the meaning of life were, in Schopenhauer’s case, not merely academic but real and personal. Well off financially, but struggling with personal misery and a sense of loneliness and isolation, he felt driven to find some understanding of himself and of the world around him that seemed so bleak and senseless.
Schopenhauer’s philosophy begins with a metaphysical structure he inherited from Kant and more or less simply decrees. There is a difference between the thing-in-itself and the phenomenal world of appearances. The thing-in-itself is the will to live, or, more simply, the will. It is the fundamental power and reality that underlies all things. The world we know and live in, with its stupendous abundance of things and forms, is merely the phenomena of the will, the objectification of it, its mirror, something not entirely real, or not real at all. (There is also a pure, will-less subject of knowledge whose metaphysical status is unclear: sometimes it seems to be in the very realm of the will, the realm of true reality, of things-in-themselves; at other times it seems to be something like the first creation and objectification of the will.)
The will itself just wills. It is pretty nasty, perhaps demonic. It is a blind striving, craving, and grasping, aiming at nothing in the end, except to go on willing and aggrandizing itself. It has in itself an inner contradiction, manifest in the constant struggle and strife between the billions of individual objectifications of itself in the phenomenal world. I am one such objectification; you are another. My true self, my inner essence, is the will; the same is true of you: my essence and yours are one and the same. When we fight (as we usually do), the will is engaged in a battle with itself.
The phenomenal world is an awful place. It is full of misery, pain, suffering. Little happiness is found anywhere. The twin poles of human life are pain (want, desire, stress) and boredom. Almost everyone lives a life that, from without, is meaningless and insignificant and, from within, dull and senseless.
But what is the meaning of life? The question is appropriate because life as we know it is something like Macbeth’s tale told by an idiot, a “farce.” If the question is about life’s inner essence, Schopenhauer’s answer is simply “the will-to-live.” The meaning of life is the will.
Another way of taking the question “What is the meaning of life?” is to construe it as a question about the goal, point, aim, end, or purpose of life. When Schopenhauer explicitly asks the question (in On Human Nature), it is this sense of it he appears to have in mind. His answer is depressing. The point or purpose of life is to suffer. We are being punished for the crime of being born, punished for who we are, namely, the nasty thoroughly egoistic will. The meaning of life in this sense, then, is to suffer, to be punished for our sin.
Schopenhauer suggests a number of ways of thinking about our phenomenal, experienced life. All of them are pretty bleak. He recommends that we look upon our life: as an unprofitable episode interrupting the blessed calm of nothingness; as on the whole a disappointment, nay, a cheat; as Hell, in which on the one hand men are the tormented souls and on the other the tormenting devils; as a place of atonement, a sort of penal colony; as some kind of mistake; and as a process of disillusionment. Any or all of these could be taken as answers to the question “What is the meaning of life?” (or to the question “What is life?”)
If we ask what we should do, how we can give our lives worth and meaning, Schopenhauer does have an answer. “Salvation” lies in the total denial of the will. Knowledge of the will and its horrific phenomena can and should function as a quieter of the will, bringing it to a state in which it stops willing and effectively abolishes itself. Thinking in this vein, a Schopenhauerian might say that the meaning of life is to deny, quiet, and eventually abolish the will to live that is essentially oneself.
One naturally wants to know whether this is not just suicide—whether the cessation of willing simply means that one passes into a state of nothingness. Schopenhauer’s answer is “No.” The state of the will-less individual after death seems to be nothing to us; but our present state would seem to be nothing to him. His state is wonderful and blessed, but what it is like is inconceivable to us.
In our current state, when one denies the will in herself, she does not literally commit suicide. Suicide doesn’t work because it is itself a powerful act of willing. Instead, she practices self-denial and asceticism, cultivates detachment, stops wanting and pursuing the things most people go for; and although there is still some struggle with the dying will in her, on the whole her life becomes full of peace and joy. The will is quieted and eventually abolishes itself in the individual. Very few people are capable of doing this heroic thing, Schopenhauer says, but he himself does not claim to be one of these people.
For all the darkness of his philosophy, the moral for all of us—even those of us who are not prepared to totally deny the will—which Schopenhauer derives in the end is very much in the Christian/Buddhist vein. We should not be competitive or grasping or villainous, but rather we should show compassion and kindness to everyone, since everyone is always having a bad day in this hell we are all living in, and what we all need above all are love, compassion, help, and consideration. The fundamental principle of morality, which you should follow, is: Don’t hurt anyone; help everyone you can. Following this principle, one can achieve, short of complete denial of the will, a kind of half-way salvation.
Another of Schopenhauer’s points about meaning in life should be mentioned. It is that the meaningfulness of one’s life depends not on one’s outer circumstances but rather on the way one looks at life. People look at life differently, and so the meaningfulness of her life varies considerably from person to person. To one person life is barren, dull, and superficial; to another rich, interesting, and full of meaning.
A major nineteenth century European philosopher who continued the tradition of thought on the meaning of life was the Danish philosopher Soren Kierkegaard (1813-1855). Kierkegaard was not an academic. The sources of his interest in problems of meaning seem to have been his not having to work for a living, his personal demons, his Nordic gloom, his congenital tendencies toward guilt, depression, anxiety, and dread, his awareness of increasing doubt all around him of the teachings of his inherited Christianity, and his agonizing failure to live up to his own Christian ideals, primarily because of his embodiment and its concomitant proclivity for the things of the flesh, especially sensuousness and sex. Out of all that emerged what appears to be a severe case of self-loathing, which in turn prompted serious inquiry into the meaning of (his) life.
It is difficult to determine what Kierkegaard’s own views were on just about everything because he constantly used humor, satire, paradox, and irony, and even more because he spoke in different voices and wrote from different perspectives under different pseudonyms.
Nonetheless, the standard view is that Kierkegaard was fundamentally a Christian. He claimed that one’s life can be meaningful and worth living only if one believes genuinely and passionately in the Christian God.
And then there is the leap. Christian belief goes beyond rational evidence, and even conflicts with it. One must make a leap from knowledge to Christian faith—the only thing in which one can find true meaning—a leap over the confines of common sense and reason. One is to accept Christian faith even if (or just because?) it is absurd. For it is the only adequate source of the kind of meaning a human being has to have to keep on going with a sense that life is worthwhile.
Another way to describe Kierkegaard’s overall philosophy is to characterize it in terms of his three stages or levels of life. One should make an ascent from the lowest stage, the aesthetic (sensuous, even sensual), through the higher ethical stage, and on to the highest stage of all, the religious, which somehow baptizes and incorporates the two lower stages into itself. Only one who has reached the religious stage can have a truly meaningful life and thus a life worth living.
Whatever Kierkegaard’s own view was, we can make the following observations about things Kierkegaard (or one or other of his pseudonymous authors) said about the meaning of life.
(1) One thing is that life can seem meaningless. In the early work, Either/Or (1843), we find this passage: “How empty and meaningless life is.” Elsewhere in Either/Or we get similar thoughts and questions, for instance, “What, if anything, is the meaning of this life?” and “My life is utterly meaningless.” Perhaps, though, the idea is that, though life is often meaningless, it need not be so, and, when it is, it is because of some kind of failure of the liver (of the life, not the organ).
(2) A second interesting idea in Kierkegaard is that meaning has something to do with unity. In a meaningful life all the diverse aspects of it come together to form some kind of coherent whole. One pursues some one goal, to which everything in one’s life is subordinated.
(3) A third point, an important one, is that, though meaning is a good thing, it is possible for there to be too much meaning in one’s life, or in its parts. Kierkegaard observes:
No part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he cannot forget it any moment he wants to; on the other hand, every single part of life ought to have so much meaning for a person that he can remember it at any moment. (Either/Or)
To have one’s life full of meaning to the brim, to regard life and everything one does in it as infinitely significant, brings with it so much pressure and stress that one’s life becomes unbearable.
To me [says Kierkegaard] it seems . . . that to be known in time by God makes life enormously strenuous. Everywhere where he is present each half hour is of infinite importance. Yet to live like that for sixty years is unsupportable. It is difficult enough putting up even with the three years’ hard study for an examination, and those are still not as strenuous as half an hour like this. (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)
(4) A fourth idea about meaning in Kierkegaard is the idea that one can give one’s life meaning, or that one can acquire meaning in life, by doing something like devoting oneself to something. Of Antigone he says, “her life acquires meaning for her in its devotion to showing him [her father, after his death] the last honors daily, almost hourly, by her unbroken silence.” (Either/Or)
(5) Meaning does not come from abstract, objective knowledge of any kind, whether philosophical, or scientific, or historical, or even theological. It comes from some kind of faith, a faith that is passionately acquired and lived daily.
(6) One twentieth century approach to the problem of the meaning of life is to see, accept, and bask more or less happily in the absurdity of life. Kierkegaard anticipated this approach prophetically in his characterization of the “humorist.” Kierkegaard writes: “Weary of time and its endless succession, the humorist runs away and finds humorous relief in stating the absurd.” (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)
(7) Kierkegaard’s humorist also at one point expresses a view which is surprisingly rare, namely, the view that one’s life may have a meaning, but one doesn’t know what it is. Kierkegaard writes: “[L]et a humorist say what he has in mind and he will speak, for example, as follows: What is the meaning of life? Yes, good question. How should I know?” (Concluding Unscientific Postscript)
(8) Although Kierkegaard himself was a Christian who viewed meaning as ultimately grounded in religious faith, in one’s personal relation to a supernatural God, yet, paradoxically perhaps, and certainly in an admirable spirit of non-exclusivity, he said:
It is possible both to enjoy life and to give it meaning and substance outside Christianity, just as the most famous poets and artists, the most eminent of thinkers, even men of piety, have lived outside Christianity (Concluding Unscientific Postscript).
(9) One finds in Kierkegaard the idea that life has meaning only insofar as it is related in some way to the Infinite. Nothing finite can supply the meaning of life.
On the whole, if for no other reason, Kierkegaard’s work is valuable because of its suggestiveness. Under one pseudonym or another, Kierkegaard made many important points which were taken up, or unfortunately overlooked, by subsequent philosophers concerned with the meaning of life.
Friedrich Nietzsche (1844-1900) cut his philosophical teeth on Schopenhauer and devoted himself in his later works—from 1883 up to the onset of insanity in January 1889—to struggle with, among other things, the meaning of life.
Nietzsche’s grand project was the revaluation of all values. Part of this project was that of giving to life a new meaning. Nietzsche’s interest in the matter was not merely academic. Coming up with new values and giving life a new meaning was a project that involved a total transformation of Nietzsche’s own self, early versions of which he became dissatisfied with. One thing Nietzsche wanted to do was to produce an affirmative philosophy of life to replace Schopenhauer’s pessimistic, life-denying philosophy.
Nietzsche rejected Schopenhauer’s picture of life as suffering, or punishment for one’s sin, together with its ethic of compassion toward the poor and the sick. Such a picture belonged to a weak, sick, decadent, nay-saying mode of being in decline. Nietzsche himself wanted to produce a positive, healthy, life-affirming philosophy, one suitable for life in the ascendant.
Sometimes, particularly early in his writings, Nietzsche seemed to think some end or other is required to make things meaningful. At times, both early and late, Nietzsche spoke as though the very concept of the meaning of something is the concept of its end, object, or goal.
In other places, however, Nietzsche spoke as if the meaning of life lies in freedom from, not in the achievement of, ends. Perhaps this should be construed as the rejection of given ends to be discovered, not in the rejection of all ends, particularly those one creates. Moritz Schlick—whose thought we will consider in more detail later—claimed that Nietzsche saw that life has no meaning so long as it stands wholly under the domination of purposes. In Nietzsche’s Zarathustra, “Sir Hazard,” expressing Nietzsche’s own considered view, says, “I have saved them from the slavery of ends.” (Klemke, 3rd ed., 63).
Nietzsche sometimes spoke as if life, before he came into it, or before he revaluated all values, had no meaning: “Sombre is human life, and as yet without meaning: a buffoon may be fateful to it” (Thus Spake Zarathustra, 1883). There is no meaning “out there” to be discovered, no meaning in the essences of things, apart from human will, desire, perspective. In fact, apart from perspective, there is no world out there at all, no “thing-in-itself,” no “facts-in-themselves.” But a psychologically strong person can do without things in themselves and meaning (already there) to be discovered in them. That is because he can organize a small part of the world himself and thus create meaning. In The Will to Power, Nietzsche speaks of “the creative strength to create meaning,” and he says:
It is a measure of the degree of strength of will to what extent one can do without meaning in things, to what extent one can endure to live in a meaningless world because one organizes a small portion of it oneself. (The Will to Power)
Whatever the meaning of life is, or is to be, it is terrestrial, not celestial. Meaning must not be placed in some fabricated “true world” but in this very earth in which we live and have our being. And the meaning of life is to be created, not discovered.
Still, somehow, man is not the meaning and measure of all things, though he has posited himself as such.
All the values by means of which we have tried so far to render the world estimable for ourselves and which then proved inapplicable and therefore devaluated the world—all these values are, psychologically considered, the results of certain perspectives of utility, designed to maintain and increase human constructs of domination—and they have been falsely projected into the essence of things. What we find here is still the hyperbolic naiveté of man: positing himself as the meaning and measure of the value of things. (The Will to Power)
The mistake lies in projecting our own values onto reality, in thinking that our meaning and values are present in things as such. But our meaning does not lie in “things-in-themselves.” It is created by us. If we then give things out there such and such a meaning, we should recognize that it is not a meaning we have found in the things themselves, but rather one that we have given them.
We can still ask, What is the meaning of life? What is the meaning we shall give to life? Nietzsche gives two different answers. One is that the meaning of life is the Übermensch (sometimes translated as ‘Superman’), Nietzsche’s post-human creator of meaning, affirmer of life, and bearer of values.
I want to teach men the sense of their existence, which is the Superman, the lightning out of the dark cloud—man. (Thus Spake Zarathustra)
The Superman is the meaning of the earth. Let your will say: The Superman SHALL BE the meaning of the earth! (Thus Spake Zarathustra)
The other answer is that the meaning of life is the will to power.
All meaning is will to power. (The Will to Power)
On the surface these two answers are different. But perhaps they are consistent. Perhaps what the will to power generates is the Superman, or what the Superman represents is the will to power. Again, perhaps the will to power is the meaning of life in the sense of its kernel or essence, while the Superman is its meaning in the sense of its end or goal.
Nietzsche’s view has some aspects or consequences that should be noted. One consequence of Nietzsche’s view is that the meaning of life is absent in the old and the sick. He acknowledged the fact. Another consequence (or perhaps component) of Nietzsche’s view is that nihilism, the denial of all value, is a transitional stage, not the finale. Yet another consequence is that the meaning of life is not about the predominance of pleasure over pain. Concern with that evidences only nihilism. Finally, it may be conjectured that Nietzsche would probably regard with scorn those of us in the current debate among academic philosophers about the meaning of life. He would consider us “minute” philosophers:
The study of the minute philosophers is only interesting for the recognition that they have reached those stages in the great edifice of philosophy where learned disquisitions for and against, where hair-splitting objections and counter-objections are the rule: and for that reason they evade the demand of every great philosophy to speak sub specie aeternitatis. (Nietzsche, 1874)
One of the next thinkers in the Western intellectual tradition to ask seriously the question, “What is the meaning of life?” was the great Russian novelist and moralist Count Leo Tolstoy (1828-1910). He asked the question and offered part of an answer in A Confession, written in Russian in 1879, circulated in 1882, and translated and published in 1884. Tolstoy’s reflections on the question stimulated a great deal of subsequent debate on the issue.
Although characters in his earlier works, such as War and Peace, sometimes talked about the meaning of life and felt the problem deeply, Tolstoy himself raised serious questions about it only as part of a psychological crisis he underwent in the mid to late 1870s. Despite having everything anyone could ever want—wealth, fame, status, love, physical strength, and so forth—Tolstoy found himself severely disturbed. His symptoms were depression, psychological paralysis, obsession with suicide, and the continual recurrence in his head of the question of the meaning of life.
Tolstoy put his question about the meaning of life in several different ways. Here are some of them, listed in order of their occurrence in his Confession:
What is it for? What does it lead to? Why? What then? What for? But what does it matter to me? What of it? Why go on making any effort? How go on living? What will come of what I am doing today or shall do tomorrow? What will come of my whole life? Why should I live, why wish for anything, or do anything? Is there any meaning in my life that the inevitable death awaiting me does not destroy? What am I, with my desires? Why do I live? What must I do? What is the meaning of my life? Why do I exist?
Several of these seem to be quite different questions, but Tolstoy regarded them all as the same question put in different ways.
Tolstoy said explicitly that his question was not about the composition, origin, and fate of the universe, nor again about the question, “What is the life of the whole?” That question, Tolstoy said, is unanswerable for a single man, and it is “stupidity” to think an individual must first answer the question about the meaning of the universe or the whole of humanity before he can answer the question of the meaning of his own life.
Tolstoy came to think that he should not expect to find the answers to his questions in philosophy. The legitimate task of philosophy is merely to ask the question and perhaps refine and clarify it, not to answer it, which it cannot do.
This view of philosophy as incapable of providing answers to the questions of life must have been one Tolstoy came to some way into his crisis. At another point, apparently earlier, Tolstoy did try to find answers in philosophy (as well as in the mathematical, physical, biological, and social sciences). The philosophers he studied were Socrates, the Buddha, “Solomon” (the author of Ecclesiastes), and Schopenhauer.
All of these he interpreted as providing a negative answer. The gist of Socrates’ thought is that the true philosopher seeks death, because the life of the body, with all its ailments and desires, is an impediment to what he is really all about, namely, the quest for truth. The individual life of the physically discrete individual is pretty meaningless, something one would rather do without. The Buddha, as Tolstoy read him, teaches that life is the greatest of evils and works as hard as he can to free himself from it. “Solomon” teaches that it’s all “vanity.” And Schopenhauer, as Tolstoy understood him, wishes for, and advocates, annihilation.
In a nutshell, Tolstoy’s problem was this: since I will suffer, die, be forgotten, and make no difference (leave no trace) in the long run, how does my life, or anything I do, have any meaning? It was a problem he felt deeply. He had to have an answer to go on living. Tolstoy’s concern with the issue was not merely theoretical.
The solution to the problem that Tolstoy eventually came to was one he thought had been known all along by the unlearned peasants. The solution lies in a kind of irrational knowledge called “faith.” Faith is faith in God, and lived faith involves some kind of relation to the Infinite. Meaning is found in the appropriate relationship to God, the Infinite. Tolstoy’s solution bears obvious resemblances to Kierkegaard’s and is very much in the same spirit.
Tolstoy spent the rest of his life working out the details of, or variations on, this solution. The progress of his thought can be traced in What I Believe and On Life, as well as in his late short fiction (The Death of Ivan Ilych, Father Sergius, and so forth). To the end Tolstoy held that faith in God, work, service to others, unselfishness, and love are essential parts of a meaningful life. He taught that the things ordinarily pursued by many—wealth, status, power, fame—contribute nothing to the meaningfulness of life.
Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Tolstoy all had lives which rendered them virtual breeding grounds for problems with the meaning of life. (1) All of them were well off and did not have to work for a living; there is no evidence that any of them ever felt a real threat of, say, homelessness or starvation. Nietzsche was the one that wasn’t exactly wealthy, but in his case his early retirement (in his late twenties) provided him with a pension for life sufficient to meet his material needs and free him up for a life of thought and writing. (2) All of them suffered from psychological illness of one sort or another—at the very least, a sense of gloom or melancholy, and in some cases a sense of worthlessness and a preoccupation with suicide, or feelings of dread and anxiety, or the encroachment of outright madness. (3) All of them grew up in religious environments, the tenets of which they lost faith in when they reached adulthood, and the lack of which they struggled with throughout their lives (eventually regaining, in the cases of Kierkegaard and Tolstoy, some portion of what they had lost). (4) None of them was a professional academician, except for Nietzsche in his youth.
From these four, and from our own experiences of life, we have inherited, to the extent that we have it, our preoccupation with the meaning of life.
In the early twentieth century questions about the meaning of life continued to be of interest to leading European or “Continental” philosophers.
The great German philosophy professor Martin Heidegger (1889-1976) was certainly concerned with the meaning of life. He presented two different outlooks, which we may call “early Heidegger” and “later Heidegger.”
For early Heidegger (that is, the Heidegger of Being and Time, 1927), the question of the meaning of life is the question how we can live an “authentic” life, one that is our life, not just the life for us that has been fixed by the community we live in. His answer is that to live a meaningful life is to live a life of authenticity. To live a life authenticity is to live a life that one oneself chooses, not the life that is prescribed for one by one’s social situation. To live a life of authenticity, one must have a plan, something that unifies one’s life into an organic whole. This is one’s own plan. So a meaningful life is one of focused authenticity. “Authenticity is Heidegger’s accounted of what it is to live a meaningful life.”
Living authentically, it turns out, is a matter of living in a way that is true to your heritage. “Being true to heritage is being true to your own, deepest self.” In the end, the content of authenticity is not something you freely choose ex nihilo, but rather something you discover in the conjunction of heritage and facticity.
Early Heidegger’s thought seems to be a kind of pantheism, and it is possible that Heidegger subscribed to some such view all his life.
Later Heidegger proposes a somewhat different view. In this philosophy of his, we are given the task, in which our meaning lies, of being “guardians of the world.” The world is a holy place. To understand and appreciate that fact is to exhibit not just a certain intellectual and practical stance toward the world, but to live with an attitude of respect and reverence toward the world, toward the natural world especially. Later Heidegger saw exploitation of the natural world, as in mining and highway-building, as deplorable, as contrary to the very meaning of life. The meaning of life is guardianship of the world.
The French philosopher Jean-Paul Sartre (1905-1980) changed his views over the course of his life. In his work Being and Nothingness (1943), advocated an outlook from which life is absurd. We more or less seriously pursue goals which, from a detached standpoint, we can see don’t really matter. But we continue to act as though they do, and hence our lives are absurd. The Sartrean project is to overcome this detached standpoint, or to incorporate it into our lives.
The problem is other people. They insist on their own reality. They tend to get in the way of our pursuit of our own goals.
Later on, Sartre espoused a somewhat different view. On this new view, “our fundamental goal in life is to overcome our ‘contingency’,” to become the foundation of our own being. The main obstacle (again) is other people who, on the one hand, pursue their own (different) goals and, on the other, propose a real (military) threat to one’s way of life and one’s homeland.
In his 1944 play, No Exit, there is the famous line: “Hell is other people.” Other people do not cooperate with my projects, and I do not cooperate with theirs. The result is war, in something like Schopenhauer’s sense. People are always at war, or at least at odds, with each other.
In both his early and his later thought, Sartre ends up being pretty pessimistic and depressing. Life is meaningless. We can, by our free choice, give life some meaning or other. But the decision to do so is itself a matter of ungrounded free choice, which is such that it doesn’t matter whether that decision or some other one is made.
Albert Camus (1913-1960), a Frenchman born in Algeria, was one of the leading existentialists (though he himself disowned the label) and one of the more influential writers of the first half of the twentieth century. He was familiar with the work of Nietzsche, and greatly influenced by it.
On our theme, Camus’s starting point was the perception of the absurd. Human life, he felt, was absurd, meaningless, and senseless. The way in which it is, or the reason it is, lies in an inevitable clash between the needs and aspirations of human beings and the cold, meaningless world.
This clash has at least four facets. First, we seek—demand, even—a rational understanding of things, some way of seeing the world as familiar to us. But the world does not cooperate: to us, it is ultimately unintelligible. Second, we long for some kind of unity underlying and organizing the manifest diversity we find all around us. But again, the world is heedless of our longings. The world that presents itself to our senses is nothing but disjointed plurality. Third, we long for a higher reality (a God, for example), something transcendent, some cosmic meaning of everything. But no such meaning can be discerned. Fourth, we strive for continued life, or at least to achieve something permanent in the end. But our efforts are pointless, everything will come to nothing, and all that lies ahead is death and oblivion.
Our situation is like that of the mythical Greek of old, Sisyphus. We are condemned, as it were, to pushing a rock up a hill, over and over only to see it roll back down again, every time, when it reaches the top. Pointless labor is Sisyphus’ lot, and ours too.
The pointlessness and absurdity of life raise the question of suicide. Should we kill ourselves? Camus’s answer is that, no, we should not. Suicide is escapist. To kill yourself is to give in, to lose. If we were prisoners of war—which is something like what we are—our captor and tormentor would want us to do exactly that—confess that things are too much for us and kill ourselves. That would be his ultimate victory, which would bring him a chuckle, or perhaps even a hearty guffaw.
How then should we live? The first thing to do is to insist that life is better if there is no meaning. That would really irritate our tormentor. Second, we should cultivate a mindset of honesty and lucidity. We should not indulge in denial, or evasion, or imaginings of an eventual escape into an afterlife where everything will be put right. We should acknowledge that life is awful—but then, perhaps, add “and I love it” or “all is well.” Third, we should take up an attitude of revolt, defiance, and scorn. Camus observes, “There is no fate that cannot be surmounted by scorn.” Surely such an attitude would vex our hypothetical tormentor beyond measure. Fourth, we should live for now, stop worrying about the future, stop striving to achieve future goals. Nothing is going to come of anything we do in the long run anyway. Fifth, we should “use everything up”: work hard, play hard, approach everything with zest and passion, expend energy to the human limit. This amounts to a kind of perverse “Yes!” to life. Finally, we may ask why anyone would want to live like this? Is it something that would appeal only to the French? What are the advantages of such an attitude toward life?
Camus has answers to these queries, three in fact. First, living as he recommends is a way of salvaging our dignity, and it is a way to which a certain majesty adheres. Second, surprisingly perhaps, such a way of living brings with it a “curious joy.” Third, it is the way of freedom. Camus’s scornful existentialism is the best conception we have of a truly free human being, one who does not allow himself to be shaped and determined by the mindless, meaningless world that surrounds him.
Anglo-American philosophers in the very late eighteenth and early twentieth centuries continued to be interested in problems of the meaning of life as well.
The American pragmatist philosopher William James (1842-1910), a Harvard professor, wrote a couple of interesting essays on our theme in the late 1890s. Both essays were written as addresses to be delivered to live audiences. They demand some discussion and consideration.
In “Is Life Worth Living?” (1895), James reveals deep, probably first-person, familiarity, with the existential source of concern with the issues of the meaning and worthwhileness of life. He calls it the “profounder bass-note of life” and suggests that it is to be found, or heard, somewhere in all of us: “In the deepest heart of all of us there is a corner in which the ultimate mystery of things works sadly.” (1895: 32)
Some people are so naturally optimistic and in love with life that they are constitutionally incapable of being much bothered by the bass-note and pay it little attention. James’s example of such a person is Walt Whitman; and one thinks of the English. James finds no fault—intellectual, moral, or otherwise—with such people. It is rare good fortune to be blessed with such a temperament. If everyone were, the question of the worthwhileness of life would never arise.
But for every Whitman, there is a suicide, and a thinker of the dreary constitution of the poet James Thomson, author of “The City of Dreadful Night.”
In his address, James imagines himself in discussion with a would-be suicide whom he tries to persuade to take up his burden and see life through to its natural end. James acknowledges that some of these suicides—perhaps the majority of them—are too far gone to have anything said to them, for instance, those whose suicidal impulses are due to insanity or sudden fits of frenzy. It is to the class of reflective would-be suicides—those disposed to kill themselves because of their thinking, reading, and brooding on the darker side of life—that James directs his remarks. It is these he wants to cheer up (or comfort) and keep alive.
James speaks of two stages of recovery from suicidal illness. The first stage includes three elements, three palliatives, for the suicidal condition. First, there is the thought, “You can end it whenever you will.” This strikes one as a strange thought to recommend to one contemplating suicide. But James thinks the thought can be a comfort. It means there’s no particular guilt or stigma attached to suicide. It means one won’t have to put up with this miserable world forever; one can opt out whenever one wants. It may delay the act by encouraging the thought, “Why kill myself today when I can always do it tomorrow?” Second, James points out, there is in human beings a natural sense of curiosity. It is worth hanging around a while longer in order to see the headlines of tomorrow’s newspaper. Third, there is a certain fighting instinct in human beings. James thinks the normal man has a reason to go on, even if the whole thing is worthless and meaningless, as long as there is some injustice to be put right, some villain to be put down, or some evil to overcome in the little corner of the universe he inhabits. The three things just mentioned all lie in the first stage of recovery, one that is partial and inferior to what lies in the second stage.
The second stage is one of full recovery. It is the religious stage. It gives one assurance of a fully worthwhile and meaningful life.
James’s injunction is to believe—to believe in a supernatural, spiritual order of things which overcomes and makes right the deficiencies of the natural order as we know it. We do not have rational or evidential proof that such a supernatural order exists. But Kant proved that natural science cannot prove that such an order does not exist. To make one’s life worthwhile and meaningful, all one has to do is to posit faith in such an order, to believe that there is a spiritual realm in which all the wrongs of the natural order are righted. In that case, one will view the natural order as an inadequate representation of the spiritual, or as a veil through which the true and wonderful nature of the spiritual is hidden or obscured.
One need have little conception of what the spiritual realm is like. The content of the belief in it can be quite minimal. All one needs to affirm is that there is such a realm and that its reality makes life worthwhile. James draws on two of the tenets of his pragmatism to support such an approach to the meaning and worthwhileness of life. One is the right to believe what we need to believe, even though it goes beyond belief warranted by empirical and rational evidence. His classic case for the right of such belief is in his essay, “The Will to Believe.”
Another tenet of pragmatism on which James draws is the idea that belief is a matter of action. To believe something is not so much to have a certain mental state as to act in a certain way. Whatever is in one’s mind, to act as though life is worthwhile and has meaning is to believe that it does
In “What Makes a Life Significant” (1899), James expressly addressed the question of the significance or meaning of life. What he said in this essay was rather different from what he had said in the previous one. The essay was in part a response to the deification of the uneducated, hard-working peasants in Tolstoy’s Confession. James admired Tolstoy a great deal but felt he went a bit overboard in his praise of peasant life and in his tendency to identify it as the very locus of meaning. James held that the lives of Tolstoy’s peasants were full of one ingredient necessary for a meaningful life—toil, struggle, pluck, will, suffering, manly virtues—but that they lacked the other necessary ingredient for a fully meaningful life, namely, what James called “ideals.”
Toward the end of the essay, James gives his own view. He states it in two or three different ways, the sense of which seems to be the same. “[I]deal visions” must be backed “with what the laborers have, the sterner stuff of manly virtue.”
[T]o redeem life from insignificance, [c]ulture and refinement all alone are not enough. . . . Ideal aspirations are not enough, when uncombined with pluck and will. . . . There must be some sort of fusion, some chemical combination among these principles, for a life objectively and thoroughly significant to result. (1899: 877)
The solid meaning of life is always the same eternal thing,—the marriage, namely, of some unhabitual ideal, however special, with some fidelity, courage, and endurance; with some man’s or woman’s pains.—And, whatever or wherever life may be, there will always be the chance for that marriage to take place. (1899: 878)
James is rather vague about what the “ideals” are, or even what they are like. In at least some cases they have something to do with culture and refinement, but it seems that they can and will vary from person to person, and may reside in some form in the uncultured and unrefined. In any event, it is noteworthy that James does not bring up the subject of religion. There is no suggestion that belief in God or a spiritual world is necessary for a fully meaningful life. An ideal wedded to manly virtue is enough.
The British philosopher Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) is often portrayed as one of those early twentieth century analytic philosophers who had no patience for big questions, such as that of the meaning of life. The portrayal is often reinforced by the famous story of Russell and the cab-driver, to whom Russell had nothing to say about the meaning of life.
It is true that Russell sometimes expressed a dismissive attitude toward the question: to Hugh Moorhead he said, “Unless you assume a God, the question (of life’s meaning) is meaningless” (Metz 2013b: 23), and to the taxi-driver he had indeed nothing to say about the meaning of life. But elsewhere he seems to have taken the question very seriously.
In “A Free Man’s Worship,” he begins with a fairly gloomy, despairing picture of the world science reveals to us, the only world there is, really. It is purposeless, void of meaning. The causes that produced us had no prevision of the end they were achieving. We ourselves, and everything precious to us, are the outcome of the accidental collocations of atoms. There is no life for the individual beyond the grave. The existence of our very species, along with all its achievements, will eventually be extinguished in the death of the solar system and “buried beneath the debris of a universe in ruins.”
But the thing for us to do is to maintain our ideals against the hostile universe. That universe knows the value of raw power, and not much else. Let us not worship it, as did Nietzsche. In exalting the will to power, Nietzsche was failing to maintain the highest human ideals in the face of the cruel world; he was, in a sense, giving in, capitulating, prostrately submitting to evil, sacrificing his best to Moloch.
Let us be clear-sighted and honest. Let us recognize that the facts are often bad, that in the world we know there are many things that would have been better otherwise, that our ideals are not in fact realized in the world.
But, again, in our minds and hearts, even though the whole business may be futile, let us tenaciously cling to our ideals, loving truth and beauty. Let us renounce power. Let us worship only the God created by our own love of the good. Let us live constantly in the vision of the good.
One trap we must guard against falling into is that which (Russell would think) Camus fell into some decades later. We should not cultivate and live in a spirit of fiery revolt, of fierce hatred of the senseless universe. Why not? Because indignation is still a kind of bondage, for it compels our thoughts to be occupied with the evil world. Give up the indignation so that your thoughts can be free. From freedom of thought comes art, philosophy, and the vision of beauty.
To achieve this we must develop a kind of detachment from our own personal happiness, must learn to free ourselves from the burden of concern for petty things and personal goods.
To abandon the struggle for private happiness, to expel all eagerness of temporary desire, to burn with passion for eternal things–this is emancipation, and this is the free man’s worship. (Russell 1903: 61)
In The Conquest of Happiness Russell makes a couple of remarks about the meaning of life that are worthy of note. The first is this:
The habit of looking to the future and thinking that the whole meaning of the present lies in what it will bring forth is a pernicious one. There can be no value in the whole unless there is value in the parts. Life is not to be conceived on the analogy of a melodrama in which the hero and heroine go through incredible misfortunes for which they are compensated by a happy ending. (1930: 29)
The second is odd but interesting, perhaps not the kind of thought that would occur to most people:
the human heart as modern civilisation has made it is more prone to hatred than to friendship. And it is prone to hatred because it is dissatisfied, because it feels deeply, perhaps even unconsciously, that it has somehow missed the meaning of life, that perhaps others, but not we ourselves, have secured the good things which nature offers man’s enjoyment. (1930: 75)
The thought seems to be that people hate each other because they think others have achieved (or know?) the meaning of life and they don’t. If that is true, one should be careful not to let on that he knows the meaning of life, even if he does.
Several writers have advocated focus and have thought of a life organized by one big project or goal as the paradigm case of a meaningful one. Russell rejects the idea.
All our affections are at the mercy of death, which may strike down those whom we love at any moment. It is therefore necessary that our lives should not have that narrow intensity which puts the whole meaning and purpose of our life at the mercy of accident. For all these reasons the man who pursues happiness wisely will aim at the possession of a number of subsidiary interests in addition to those central ones upon which his life is built. (1930: 177)
Finally, in “The Place of Science in a Liberal Education,” Russell makes the now familiar point that the meaning of life must come not from without but from within.
The search for an outside meaning that can compel an inner response must always be disappointed: all “meaning” must be at bottom related to our primary desires, and when they are extinct no miracle can restore to the world the value which they reflected upon it. (Mysticism and Logic, ch. 2, “The Place of Science in a Liberal Education”)
That is not to say that the meaning of life is created or chosen as opposed to discovered. For our primary desires are something largely given, something (if we are lucky) we simply find in ourselves.
Moritz Schlick (1882-1936) was one of the central figures of the logical positivist movement. Thinkers in the movement are commonly said to have been dismissive of such “metaphysical” questions as that of the meaning of life. Yet Schlick for one was in no way dismissive. He described himself as a seeker of the meaning of life and wrote an extremely interesting essay on the topic in 1927.
Schlick’s contribution to the debate is (to some) one of the most appealing writings in the whole of the literature. Schlick was aware of Schopenhauer’s musings and was concerned to escape his dire conclusions. Schlick found his answer in (his interpretation of) Nietzsche’s Thus Spake Zarathustra. The answer is that life can be meaningful only if it is freed from its subjugation to ends and purposes. The suggestion is radical: a life has meaning only if it does not have some end or purpose to which everything is subordinated.
Schlick argued that the meaning of life is to be found not in work but in play. Work, in the philosophical sense, is always something done not for its own sake but for the sake of something else, some end or purpose that is to be achieved. Most often that end is the survival and perpetuation of life—that is, more work functioning only to perpetuate the life of the species. But it is absurd to take the meaning of life to lie in the continued survival of the species, or in the work required to make that survival possible. The meaning of life must lie in the content of existence, not in bare existence as such.
What then is the meaning of life? One candidate that suggests itself is feelings of pleasure and happiness. But Schlick rejects that candidate, partly on the grounds that pleasure is likely only to lead to the satiety and boredom which Schopenhauer so vividly made us aware of. Schlick also rejects the ideal of happiness as the meaning of life by way of the observation that man is essentially an active creature for which a life of idle pleasure is by no means suitable. What Schlick ends up saying is that the meaning of life is to be found in play, that is, in activity engaged in for its own glorious sake and not for the furtherance of some further end or goal. Doing something only in order to produce some further end or goal is work, and work cannot be the meaning of life. Of course, work is necessary for human existence and thriving, but it is meaningful only if it can—and it can be—turned into play, something one would do with delight even if nothing came of it in the end.
Schlick backs off from saying that the meaning of life is play. Instead, he says that the meaning of life is youth, since youth is the period of life in which play predominates. A nice consequence of this position is the fact that a life cut short in its infancy or youth is a meaningful life. If you are killed when you are ten years old, it is likely that you lived a life full of meaning.
One other aspect of Schlick’s view should be mentioned. It is that youth is not literally a matter of how long one has lived on this earth. If an old fellow turns his work into play, if he performs it primarily for the sake of the sheer joy of doing it, then he is young in the sense that matters. The key to a fully meaningful life would be to stay forever young.
The Bengali Indian poet, short-story writer, novelist, dramatist, artist, sage, and philosopher Rabindranath Tagore (1861-1941), often credited with a major role in the cross-fertilization of East and West, won the Nobel Prize in literature in 1919. He wrote in English (sometimes). He knew the works of Einstein, Yeats, Wordsworth, and a host of other Western thinkers. In 1930 he delivered the Hibbert Lectures at Oxford, published the next year as The Religion of Man (1931), a remarkable volume containing much reflection on the meaning of life. This article will limit itself to consideration of a couple of points in that book.
Tagore is interesting because his interest in the question of the meaning of life did not arise out of anything like the circumstances which seemed to create the interest in so many Western thinkers. Tagore was not well-off and bored, he did not suffer from depression and existential angst, he did not worry about the importance of his personal life in the vast scheme of things, he was not a professional academic philosopher.
Tagore’s tendency was to view the question of the meaning of life as the question, “What is man?” or “What am I?” His answer seems to have been that the true human is the universal self, or the true Man represented by the life of the species, or even by the life of all beings.
If he had a problem, it lay in the chaotic, hodgepodge nature of this everyday life. Not exactly seeking for a solution to the predicament, one came to him on an ordinary day on which he was just living his everyday life in east India. He gives a gripping and poetic account of it in chapter six of The Religion of Man. He writes:
Suddenly I became conscious of a stirring of soul within me. My world of experience in a moment seemed to become lighted, and the facts that were detached and dim found a great unity of meaning. The feeling which I had was like that which a man, groping through a fog without knowing his destination, might fee when he suddenly discovers that he stands before his own house. (Tagore 1931, 95)
One thing that is noteworthy in this is that Tagore felt he had seen the meaning of life, not when he realized that his life really mattered, or added up to something sub specie aeternitatus, nor when he came up with a view of things that rid him of his angst and depression, but rather when he found that his life was part of a great unity of meaning. He saw meaning when everything, including his individual life, was one unified whole.
A second feature of Tagore’s conception of the meaning of life is the role he gives to detachment. The detachment that is relevant seems to be something like non-attachment to the petty concerns of one’s own individual life. It is not a lack of concern for anything and everything. It is lack of concern for how one’s own individual, personal life fares. The appropriately detached person places his interest in how Man as the eternal being, or beings of any sort ultimately fare. (There is an admirable concern for all life, not just human life in the thought of Tagore.) The appropriately detached man loses concern for his personal triumphs and failures and cultivates an enlivening interest in the life of the whole, with which, instead of his personal life, he identifies himself. The result is a vast increase in the sense of meaningfulness in his own life.
A very different approach to the problem of the meaning of life was taken by the prominent logical positivist English philosopher A. J. Ayer (1910-1989).
Ayer argued, in an important 1947 paper, that “there is no sense in asking what is the ultimate purpose of our existence, or what is the real meaning of life” (Ayer 1947: 201). His argument is that there is no reason to believe in anything like a God who created us and intended us for a specific purpose. And even if there were such a God, his purposes could not give life meaning unless we agreed with them and accepted them. Thus the meaning of life always comes back to what we as individuals purpose, value, and aim at. There is no meaning out there to be discovered.
Ayer insists that the meaninglessness of life is nothing to cry about. One’s life has whatever meaning one gives it. It just doesn’t make sense to ask about the meaning of life because there is not, and could not be, such a thing. The question “What is the meaning of life?” is illogical and unanswerable. But a person can give his life a meaning, and if he does, it will be meaningful to him. It will come down to the value judgments the person makes. And these are a matter of personal choice and preference. There is no sense in saying that one person’s value judgments are true and another’s false. Give your life a meaning, and that’s the meaning it will have.
The dismissal of the question about the meaning of life which was characteristic of Ayer and his generation, and Camus’s idea that meaninglessness doesn’t matter, may be what ironically sparked the recent interest in the question. The natural philosophical response is that surely the question of the meaning of life is meaningful and important: in light of the remarks of Ayer, Camus, and their ilk, how is that so? A sense that the meaning of life must be a philosophical problem that matters has motivated work on the question of what the question of the meaning of life is all about, if we do not take Ayer’s dismissive attitude and Camus’s stance toward it. The work of Richard Taylor, Robert Nozick, Thomas Nagel, Joel Feinberg, Harry Frankfurt, Susan Wolf, Thaddeus Metz, Joshua Seachris, Julian Young, John Cottingham, David Benatar, and Garrett Thomson (among others) are attempts to answer this question.
The preceding survey brings us up to around 1950, just before a veritable explosion of works on the meaning of life took place in philosophy, especially in the Anglo-analytic tradition. Those interested in this explosion should begin by consulting the excellent overviews in Thaddeus Metz’s article in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Metz 2013) and Joshua Seachris’s article in The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Seachris 2012).
- Ayer, A. J. “The Claims of Philosophy.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, 3rd Ed.. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 199-202. (Originally published in 1947)
- Baier, K. “The Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 81-117. (Originally published in 1947.)
- Camus, A. “The Myth of Sisyphus.” J. O’Brien (tr.). Reprinted in part in Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Steve Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 244-255. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
- Carlyle, T. 1834. Fraser’s Magazine. available online at Project Gutenberg.
- Heidegger, M. Being and Time. J. Macquarrie and J. Robinson (trs.). Oxford: Blackwell, 1973. (Originally published in German in 1927.)
- James, W. “Is Life Worth Living?.” in The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, New York: Dover Publications, 1956: 32-62. (Originally published in 1895.)
- James, W. “What Makes a Life Significant?.” in On Some of Life’s Ideals. New York: Henry Holt and Company, 1899: 49–94. Reprinted in William James: Writings 1878-1899. New York: The Library of America, 1992: 861-80.
- Kierkegaard, S. Concluding Unscientific Postscript. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1846.)
- Kierkegaard, S. Either/Or: A Fragment of Life. (Available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in Danish in 1843.)
- Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. New York: Oxford University Press, 1981.
- Klemke, E. D. (ed.). The Meaning of Life. 2nd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
- Klemke, E. D. & Cahn, S. (eds.). The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed. New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
- Metz, T. “The Meaning of Life.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition). Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
- Nagel, T. “The Absurd,” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 151-161. (Originally published in 1971.)
- Nietzsche, F. Ecce Homo. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1889.)
- Nietzsche, F. On the Genealogy of Morals. Ian Johnston (tr.). 2009.
- Nietzsche, F. Thus Spake Zarathustra. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1883-1885.)
- Nietzsche, F. Twilight of the Idols. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally written in German in 1888-1899.)
- Nietzsche, F. The Will to Power. (available free online and in several print editions.) (Originally published in German in 1901-1911.)
- The Oxford English Dictionary. Oxford: Oxford University Press: 2014.
- Russell, B. “A Free Man’s Worship.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life. E. D. Klemke (ed.). New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 55-62. (Originally published in 1903.)
- Russell, B. The Conquest of Happiness. London: Liveright, 1930.
- Sartre, J. P. Being and Nothingness. H. E. Barnes (tr.). New York: Philosophical Library, 1956. (Originally published in French in 1943.)
- Sartre, J. P. “Existentialism and Humanism.” B. Frechtman (tr.). 1956. Reprinted in Ways of Wisdom. S. Smith (ed.). Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1983: 234-43.
- Schlick, M. 1927. “On the Meaning of Life.” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life: A Reader, 3rd Ed., E. D. Klemke & S. Cahn (eds.). P. Heath (tr.). New York: Oxford University Press, 2008: 62-71. (Originally published in 1927.)
- Schopenhauer, A. 1840. On the Basis of Morality. (available free online and in several editions)
- Schopenhauer, A. “On the Suffering of the World.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 41-50. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
- Schopenhauer, A. “On the Vanity of Existence.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 51-54. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
- Schopenhauer, A. “On Affirmation and Denial of the Will to Live.” in Essays and Aphorism., R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 61-65. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
- Schopenhauer, A. “On Suicide.” in Essays and Aphorisms. R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). New York: Penguin Books, 1970: 77-79. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
- Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: The Wisdom of Life. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. rpr. in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004.
- Schopenhauer, A. The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer: On Human Nature. T. B. Saunders (tr.). 1860. Reprinted in The Project Gutenberg EBook of The Essays of Arthur Schopenhauer, 2004,
- Schopenhauer, A. The World as Will and Representation. 2 Vols. E. F. J. Payne (tr.). 1969. New York: Dover Publications. (Vol. 1 first appeared in 1818, Vol. 2 in 1844, in German.)
- Schopenhauer, A. Essays and Aphorisms, R. J. Hollingdale (tr.). 1970. New York: Penguin Books. (Originally published in German in 1851.)
- Seachris, J., 2012, “Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective,” The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy,
- Smith, S., (ed.), 1983, Ways of Wisdom: Readings on the Good Life, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
- Tagore, R., 1961, The Religion of Man, London: George Allen & Unwin Co., Reprinted Boston: Beacon Press. (Originally published in 1930.)
- Taylor, R., 1970, “The Meaning of Life,” Reprinted in The Meaning of Life, E. D. Klemke (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press, 1981: 141-150.
- Tolstoy, L., 2005, A Confession, Aylmer Maude (tr.), Reprinted Mineola, NY: Dover Publications. (Originally published in 1884.)
- Young, J. 2014, The Death of God and the Meaning of Life, 2nd ed., New York & London: Routledge.
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