Moral Perception

It is a familiar thought that many of our beliefs are directly justified epistemically by perception. For example, she sees what looks to her to be a cat on the mat, and from this she is justified in saying “There is a cat on the mat.” This article explores the idea that our moral beliefs can be justified empirically in a similar manner. More precisely, it focuses on canonical moral perception (CMP), which restricts perceptual experiences to sensory perceptual experiences, such as vision, touch, taste, smell, and sound. For ease of exposition, this article uses visual perceptual experiences as the sensory modality of choice.

We should be interested in the viability of such a thesis for several reasons. First, if CMP is a plausible epistemology of justification of moral beliefs, then it is uniform with a broader perceptual epistemology and therefore comes with ready-made responses to skeptical challenges to morality. Second, CMP avoids over-intellectualising moral epistemology, and it explains how it is that lay people have justified moral beliefs. Third, CMP, if true, has interesting implications for our methodology of investigating morality. In effect, CMP states that experience comes first, contrary to how some (but not all) rival views characterize moral epistemology as starting from the armchair.

First, the thesis of CMP in presented in detail. The following section considers prima facie arguments in favor of CMP, which are the considerations of epistemic uniformity and the role of experience in moral inquiry. Next, the article discusses prima facie arguments against CMP, which are the problems of counterfactual knowledge, the causal objection, and the ‘looks’ objection. Finally, the article presents arguments for CMP that draw from the philosophy of perception and the philosophy of mind, and it concludes that much of the debate surrounding CMP is continuous with debates in the general philosophy of perception and the philosophy of mind.

Table of Contents

  1. The Central Thesis
  2. The Prima Facie Case for Moral Perception
    1. Moral Perception and Epistemic Uniformity
    2. The Role of Experience in Moral Inquiry
  3. The Prima Facie Case Against Moral Perception
    1. Justification of Counterfactual Moral Beliefs
    2. The Causal Objection
    3. The ‘Looks’ Objection
  4. Arguments from Philosophy of Perception
    1. High-Level Contents in Perception
    2. Phenomenal Contrast Arguments
    3. Phenomenal Contrast and Parity Considerations
    4. Cognitive Penetration
    5. The Mediation Challenge
    6. Moral Perception and Wider Debates in The Philosophy of Perception
  5. Summary: Looking Forward
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Central Thesis

Suppose upon returning home one evening, someone encounters a stranger harming a senior citizen for entertainment. As they witness this act, they form the belief that what they are witnessing is morally wrong. Assuming that the belief is epistemically justified, it remains a question what the source of justification for this particular moral belief is. One answer is that perceptual states (such as sight and hearing) provide the justification. This thesis is called canonical moral perception:

CMP: Some moral beliefs are non-inferentially justified by sensory perceptual experiences.

To be clear, CMP claims that some moral beliefs are non-inferentially justified by sensory perceptual experiences. This leaves open the possibility of multiple sources for the justification of moral beliefs while showing that there is an interesting debate here regarding the possibility of CMP, since rivals of the view will deny that any moral beliefs are justified in such a way. For purposes of exposition, this article uses vision as the perceptual state of choice, but it should be kept in mind that this is not to convey that vision is the only source of perceptual justification for moral beliefs. Despite the fact that emotions are sometimes spoken of as if they are a kind of perception, this article does not consider emotional perception in any detail. Someone who endorses CMP may be called a ‘perceptualist.’

Fundamentally, the epistemic contribution of perception is to justify belief and play the role of a justificatory regress stopper. Given that justification for some beliefs bottoms out in perceptual experience, and that some moral beliefs are justified but not on the basis of other beliefs, CMP extends perceptual justification to the moral domain. CMP is a foundationalist theory of the justification of moral beliefs and this article treats it as such. Other foundationalist views, such as intuitionists and emotional perceptualists, will have their own ways of handling the regress problem that differs from Canonical Moral Perception. In particular, the perceptualist (at least) holds that what is essential to perception is its representational nature, the phenomenological character of perceptual experience, and its role as a non-inferential source of justification, and will offer a stopper to the regress problems based on those characteristics. Intuitionists and emotional perceptualists may agree that some of those characteristics are essential to their justificatory source as well, but the story for how their regress stoppers work will differ based on how emotions and intuitions differ from perception. For example, emotional perceptualists may say that what is special about emotional perceptual states is that they are valenced, and that this plays a special role in their justificatory story.

Furthermore, this paper assumes on behalf of the perceptualist a phenomenal dogmatist account of foundationalism of the kind espoused by Jim Pryor, where someone is immediately, but defeasibly, justified by their perceptual experience (Pryor 2000). Phenomenal dogmatism is not a very strong foundationalism in that it does not require an infallibly known belief to ground all the remaining knowledge one may possess. Rather, what phenomenal dogmatism grants us is the claim that representational seeming states justify beliefs based on those seeming states in virtue of having those seeming states. Insofar as one may be concerned about challenges to a general foundationalist picture, the perceptualist will follow Pryor in responding to those objections.

Some of the philosophers mentioned in this article will talk about theories of perceptual moral knowledge, and most of what this article says will be compatible with those theories. A perceptually justified moral belief in the absence of defeaters is perceptual moral knowledge, after all.

2. The Prima Facie Case for Moral Perception

a. Moral Perception and Epistemic Uniformity

Considerations of uniformity and economy within epistemology might push one towards adopting CMP over its more traditional rivals, such as intuitionism. CMP entails that the methodology of obtaining justified moral beliefs does not differ in any significant or substantial way from other kinds of justification gained by perceptual experiences. That is, just as one forms the justified belief that there is a cat in the room by seeing that there is in fact a cat in the room, one forms the justified belief that some act is wrong by perceiving the wrongness of the act. This leads us to the considerations of uniformity. If there is no special methodology that differentiates justified moral beliefs from other justified beliefs in different domains, then the need for positing a special source of justification, such as the intellectual seemings of the intuitionist is moot. Another advantage of CMP is that it gives us a foundationalist epistemology, thereby avoiding regress and circularity worries regarding justification. To be clear, the advantages mentioned are shared with some rival accounts of moral epistemology, so these are not unique advantages but rather considerations that keep it a live theory.

b. The Role of Experience in Moral Inquiry

CMP captures the role that experience seems to play in moral inquiry. If we consider how non-philosophers form most of their moral beliefs, it is unlikely that the sole basic source is a priori reasoning. Most people do not sit in an armchair and contemplate runaway trolleys, yet it seems that most individuals have justified basic moral beliefs. When an individual is asked to explain how they know that an action is wrong, a common answer among lay people is that they saw the wrongness of that action. CMP takes this statement at face value, and considering that moral philosophers are not different in kind from the typical human being, we might think that when engaging in a moral thought experiment the philosopher is making use of past moral observations.

If we are persuaded that experience plays a role in answering moral questions, then a natural thought is that particular moral beliefs are among the most epistemically basic; particular moral beliefs form part of our evidential bedrock. They are basic in the sense that, from justified particular moral beliefs we can infer additional justified moral beliefs, but we cannot make an inference in the opposite direction.  For example, one basic justified particular moral belief for the perceptualist may be a very specific claim such as, ‘The instance of a father hugging his child I witnessed yesterday is morally good.’ From this particular experience of goodness, once we return to the armchair and ponder if fathers hugging their children is good, we might inductively infer a more general statement such as ‘It is usually good for fathers to hug their children.’ In short, we draw from experience to reach conclusions about more abstract moral questions. Sarah McGrath, motivates CMP with these considerations in mind (2018, 2019). As McGrath explains:

[A] significant part of our most fundamental evidence for [moral] theorizing consists in singular moral judgments that we know to be true. But I also think that there is a fairly widespread tendency to neglect this fact, and to think that our evidence, or what we ultimately have to go on in our ethical theorizing, consists exclusively of judgments with more general content (2018).

To expand on this: it is a common self-conception of moral philosophers that the methodology of moral inquiry they perform is to consider cases or action types, form judgments about those cases and reach general moral principles (such as ‘It is usually good for fathers to hug their children’, or ‘All things being equal, it is wrong to intentionally cause harm’) that are broadly applicable. That is, judgments about very specific cases will be formed by way of considering the more general principles. As McGrath points out, when considering the morality of an action type, we often draw upon our past experiences of tokens of an action to make moral judgments.  To illustrate this, we can imagine an agent who yesterday saw the goodness of a father hugging a child, and then the next day is presented with a thought experiment that asks the agent to consider a near identical scenario. Presumably, this agent will judge the hugging once again to be good, and this judgment will be based on the past observations they made the day before. Thus, CMP denies that intuitions about general moral beliefs reached in the armchair are always methodologically prior to experience in moral theorizing.

If intuitions about general moral principles are epistemically basic, then making use of particular moral judgements is epistemically mistaken. However, drawing on past observations to reach judgements on thought experiments about fathers hugging their children, or even the trolley problem, is not obviously an epistemic misstep. In fact, we often draw on past observations and experiences to give advice on problems that our friends and family experience. Rather than draw on general principles to advise a friend to end her relationship, we usually appeal to previous relationships we have been through to make such a judgment. These are the common and legitimate ways we form moral beliefs, and CMP is the most natural epistemic explanation of our practice of moral inquiry as we find it.

That said, we may worry about cases where we have background knowledge informing our experience of a situation; it may seem strange that we can have the kind of experientially justified moral beliefs CMP promises while at the same time recognizing that background knowledge changes what we may justifiably believe about what our perceptual experiences. For example, we can imagine the father hugging child, but now know have the background information that the father has a criminal record of incest. There are two ways for the perceptualist to handle cases where there is background knowledge informing the observation in such cases. The first is to stick with the kind of Pryor style phenomenal dogmatism, in which the perceptual seeming of goodness delivers prima facie justification for believing the hugging is morally good, but this is defeated by the additional knowledge of the father’s criminal record. The second option is to lean into the phenomenon of cognitive penetration, and answer that the background knowledge does change the perceptual experience of the father hugging the child from one of goodness to one of badness, since our propositional attitude would contour our perceptual experience on this option. In sum, there are two possible ways for the perceptualist to answer this kind of concern, but adjudicating between the two options canvassed here is beyond the scope of this article.

3. The Prima Facie Case Against Moral Perception

a. Justification of Counterfactual Moral Beliefs

Although CMP provides a theory of justification in actual situations, situations in which you see a morally valenced act, we might wonder what the theory says about justification of moral beliefs gained via thought experiments or reading fiction. Call the kind of justification gained in these instances counterfactual justification. Both Hutton and Wodak challenge CMP to provide an account of how one can have counterfactual moral justification (Hutton 2021; Wodak 2019). The challenge takes the following general form: By hypothesis, CMP explains moral justification in localized, everyday cases. However, we do not receive justification for moral beliefs solely through sensory perception, since we can have counterfactual moral justification. So, CMP is an incomplete explanation of the sources of moral justification. Because CMP cannot capture cases where we receive justification through literature or thought experiments, an epistemological theory that can provide a unified explanation of both counterfactual justification and justification gained in everyday cases is preferable on the grounds of parsimony. The following two paragraphs present particular versions of this challenge.

Hutton asks us to consider a case of someone reading a book depicting the brutalities of slavery, stipulating that they have an emotional response to the scenarios depicted in the book. Here, no perception is present (other than of words on a page), but there is a strong emotional response and plausibly, Hutton claims, the individual reading the book forms the justified moral belief that slavery is wrong. The upshot of Hutton’s argument is that CMP cannot explain what the source of justification in the case of literature is, while emotion is able to both explain the source of justification in moral beliefs formed from reading literature and everyday cases.

Like Hutton, Wodak notes that much of our moral inquiry is a priori, and intuitionism is far better suited to capture instances where our justified moral beliefs come from imagining scenarios. When sitting in the armchair imagining a trolley scenario, when we form the justified moral belief that pulling the lever is the right action, we can ask what justifies the belief, and Wodak states “The intuitionist can explain this very easily: our intuitions can concern actual and hypothetical cases” (Wodak 2019). That is, the intuitionist’s story for justification stays the same between imagined cases and cases we encounter on the street. CMP cannot appeal to perceptual justification because in thought experiments there is no perception of the scenario. Because CMP lacks resources to explain the source of the justification, and intuitionism can explain the source of justification in both thought-experiments and everyday cases, Wodak concludes that intuitionism should be preferred on the grounds of parsimony.

While it is true that CMP by itself is unable to capture counterfactual justification and gives some prima facie considerations against the view, this should not be cause for alarm on the part of the advocate of CMP. Recall that CMP states that some of our moral beliefs are perceptually justified, not that all moral beliefs are justified in such a way. The advocate of CMP has the option to make a disjunctive response to challenges from counterfactual justification such as those made by Wodak and Hutton. This response needs to be done with care; the advocate of CMP should avoid introducing an account of counterfactual justification that suffices to explain actual justification as well. Even though the challenge for a story for counterfactual justification has yet to be fully answered, there are other considerations for adhering to CMP.

b. The Causal Objection

The causal objection argues that we cannot perceive moral properties because we cannot be put in a causal relation with them. That is, one might think that moral properties are causally inert, and for this reason we cannot perceive them. Put in the form of an argument, the causal objection appears as:

    1. To perceive some property, one must be placed in the appropriate causal relation with that property.
    2. One can never be put in the proper causal relation with moral properties.
    3. One cannot perceive moral properties.

McBrayer responds to the causal objection by pointing out that on three of the most popular realist accounts moral properties premise two comes out false (McBrayer 2010). These three proposals are (i) treating moral properties as secondary properties, (ii) treating moral properties as natural properties, and (iii) treating moral properties as non-natural properties.

When moral properties are held to be secondary properties, where secondary properties are properties that under appropriate viewing conditions are perceived as such, premise two fails as demonstrated by an analogy between colors and moral properties. We can imagine looking at a chair under midday light and perceiving it to be brown. What causally contributes to our perceptual experience is not the brownness of the chair (due to the nature of secondary properties), but the other properties of the chair. Nonetheless, perceiving the chair results in knowledge of the chair’s color, so we are still put in an appropriate causal relation with the property of brownness. In the case of moral properties, stipulated to be secondary properties, we will be placed in the same causal relation with them as we are with colors. Under ideal viewing circumstances, we will be placed in a causal relation with the base properties (such as a father hugging a child) and perceive the goodness of that action. In short, if we take moral properties to be secondary properties, the response to the causal objection is a common cause style of explanation.

If one takes a reductionist naturalist account of the moral properties, matters are even simpler. Because moral properties are identical to natural properties, the explanation as to how we are able to be in the proper causal relation with them is the same explanation as to how we are able to be in the proper causal relationship with chairs, cars, and human actions.

Finally, according to McBrayer, non-naturalism about moral properties avoids the causal objection as well. What the proponent of the causal objection wants is a non-accidental connection between our perceptual beliefs and the moral facts, and an account that delivers a non-accidental connection between our perceptual beliefs and the moral facts suffices to defuse the causal objection. This is so even if the connection is not causal, strictly speaking. To see this, first note that we are stipulating the supervenience principle, the moral facts necessarily supervene on the natural facts such that there is no change in the moral without a change in the natural. Assuming that we can see supervening properties, the accidentality is eliminated because whenever we see a supervening property we see its natural property that serves as its base, and the natural property serves as the proper causal relationship that satisfies the causal constraint.

The causal objection is an instance of a general challenge to the perception of high-level properties. In this case, the causal objection is an instance of explanatory superfluity. This challenge is as follows: One might think that we cannot be put in a causal relation with high-level properties, and so we do not perceive them. There is no need to claim that we are in a causal relation with trees when being in a causal relation with the lower-level properties of trees is sufficient for justified tree belief; further causal contact would be an instance of overdetermination. To put the objection in a slightly different way, if our perceptual states are in a causal relation with the property of being a pine tree, then the content of our perceptual experience of a pine tree would be causally overdetermined. There is no reason to think that our perceptual experiences are overdetermined, so our perceptual states are not in a causal relation with the property of being a pine tree. It is not clear how worried the defender of CMP should worry about this objection. Because the causal objection shares strong features with the causal exclusion problem of mind-body interaction which provides a framework for addressing these issues, the objection may not carry much weight (Kim 1993, Yablo 2003).

c. The ‘Looks’ Objection

If perception justifies some moral beliefs, then this is presumably because there is a phenomenological character, a what-it-is-likeness, when perceiving moral properties. The ‘looks objection’ claims that this is not the case: we do not have perceptual justification of moral beliefs because there is no phenomenological character for moral properties (Huemer 2005, Reiland 2021). The argument is commonly structured this way:

    1. A moral belief is perceptually justified if there is some way that a moral property looks.
    2. Moral properties have no look.
    3. No moral beliefs are perceptually justified.

We can deny the ‘looks’ objection by rejecting premises one or two, or arguing that the conclusion does not follow. Because ‘looks’ is ambiguous in the argument, one strategy for denying the objection is to interpret ‘looks’ in various ways and see if the argument remains valid. McBrayer (2010a) tackles the ‘looks’ objection by considering several possible readings of “looks” other than the phenomenal ‘looks’ mentioned above. The upshot of McBrayer’s strategy is that on all interpretations of “look” he considers, the objection is invalid. McBrayer settles on a possible reading of ‘looks’ which is supposed to provide the strongest version of the objection. This is the ‘normally looks’, which is understood as the way something resembles something else. If we substitute ‘normally look’ in premise two, we get:

2′. Moral properties do not normally look like anything.

Even with ‘normally looks’, the objection comes out invalid. This is for the following reasons. When ‘normally looks’ is read as normally looking a way to multiple people, the argument fails as many non-moral properties, assuming they have a normal look, do not appear the same way to multiple people. For example, imagine a group of individuals looking at a car from different viewpoints; there is no single way the car appears to all of them. Yet, if a car has a normal look but can appear different ways to different individuals, then there is no principled reason to think that rightness cannot appear different ways yet have a normal look as well. Understood in this cross-person sense, 2′ comes out false. Similarly, when 2′ is read as the way a thing normally looks to an individual, the objection is still invalid. Even if 2′ is true, it is only true of low-level properties such as colors, since no matter what angle you view red from, it would always look the same. Many high-level properties, such as danger, do not have a way of normally looking to an individual. But, assuming we are perceptually justified in judgments of danger despite its disparate looks, such as a rattlesnake looking dangerous and a loaded gun looking dangerous, premise 1 does not hold. We may still be perceptually justified in a belief about a property even if there is no particular look for that property. Finally, if an opponent argues that there is a complex and ineffable way that high-level properties normally look, then this strategy is open to the defender of moral perception as well, so 2′ again comes out false. On all readings McBrayer considers, the ‘looks’ objection is unsound.

Proponents of the ‘looks objection’ may be unsatisfied with McBrayer’s response, however. The kind of ‘looks’ that is likely intended by opponents of CMP is ‘phenomenal looks’. That is, the what-it-is-likeness of perceiving something, such as what it is like to perceive a car or a cat, is the intended meaning of “looks” in the argument. “Looks” in fact was characterized as the phenomenal kind in the opening paragraph of this section. However, McBrayer omits this reading of ‘looks’, and misses the most plausible and strongest reading of the objection. It remains up to contemporary defenders of CMP to provide an account of what the phenomenological ‘looks’ of moral properties are like. Until an account is provided, the looks objection remains a live challenge.

Whatever this account may be, it will also provide a general strategy for answering a general looks objection in the philosophy of perception. This objection is the same as the looks objection listed above, but with instances of ‘moral’ replaced with ‘high-level property’, and concludes that our high-level property beliefs are not perceptually justified (McGrath 2017). If an account is successful at articulating what the phenomenal looks of a higher-order property is, or motivating the belief that high-level properties have one, then this provides a framework for CMP to use in answering the moral looks objection.

4. Arguments from Philosophy of Perception

While the prima facie arguments provide initial motivation for CMP, the thesis is ultimately about the epistemic deliverances of our sensory faculty. Accordingly, much of the debate about the viability of CMP parallels debates in the general philosophy of perception. In this section, we will see the arguments for and against moral perception drawing from empirical perceptual psychology and general philosophy of perception.

a. High-Level Contents in Perception

A natural move for the moral perceptualist in defense of the claim that we are non-inferentially justified by perception is to argue that we see moral properties. The perceptualist here means to be taken literally, similar to how we see the yellow of a lemon or the shape of a motorcycle. If we do perceive moral properties, then a very straightforward epistemic story can be told. This story the perceptualist aims to explain how perceptual moral justification is the same for perceptual justification of ordinary objects. For example, the explanation for how someone knows there is a car before them is that they see a car and form the corresponding belief that there is a car. The story for justification of moral beliefs here will be that someone sees the wrongness of some action and forms the corresponding belief that the action is wrong (absent defeaters). The perceptualist will typically flesh out this move by assuming an additional epistemic requirement, called the Matching Content Constraint (MCC):

MCC: If your visual experience E gives you immediate justification to believe some external world proposition that P, then it’s a phenomenal content of E that P (Silins 2011).

The MCC states that one is non-inferentially justified only if there is a match in contents between a perceiver’s perceptual state and doxastic state (their belief). The reason perceptual contents matter to CMP is that if perceptual contents include moral properties, then one has a perceptual experience of those moral properties, and if one has an experience of those moral properties then a story for a non-inferential perceptual justification of moral beliefs is in hand, which is no different from our perceptual justification of other objects. On the other hand, if there is a mismatch between our perceptual contents and our moral beliefs, then we may find a non-inferentialist perceptual epistemology such as CMP to be implausible.

Given the MCC, the perceptualist needs it to be the case that perceptual experience includes high-level contents, such as being a car, being a pine tree, or being a cause of some effect. If perceptual experiences do contain high-level contents, then the inclusion of moral contents in perceptual experiences is a natural theoretical next-step, barring a principled reason for exclusion. After all, if we commit to arguing that we perceive causation and carhood, extending the contents of perception to rightness (and wrongness) does not appear to require too large a stretch of the imagination. The extension of perceptual experiences to include moral contents meets the matching content constraint, and it clears the way for arguing for CMP. However, if the contents of our perceptual experiences are restricted to low-level contents, which are colors, shapes, depth, and motion (although what counts a low-level content may vary between theorists), the defense of CMP becomes much trickier.

Holding onto CMP because one accepts a high-level theory of content comes with its own risk. If a thin view of contents turns out to be the correct account of perceptual content, such that what makes up the content of our perceptual states are color arrays, shapes, depth and motion, then CMP appears to lose much of its motivation. It would be theoretically awkward to insist that moral contents show up if content about cars, pine trees, and causation are incapable of doing so. And if moral properties do not appear in the contents of perceptual experience, then a simple story as to how we can have perceptual justification for moral beliefs is lost.

Even if perception does not have high-level contents, or nor moral contents, this does not mean that CMP is a failed theory of moral epistemology. Sarah McGrath , provides a story as to how we can have perceptual beliefs in the absence of high-level contents in perception (2018, 2019). This story is an externalist one; the source of the justification comes from a Bayesian account of the adjustment of priors (the probability that a belief is true) given non-moral observations, rather than any experiential contents of morality itself. Through perceptual training and experience our perceptual system is trained to detect morally relevant stimuli, such as detecting the whimper of pain a dog may voice when kicked. On McGrath’s view, then, one is perceptually justified in a moral belief when the perceptual system reliably tracks the moral facts. The upshot for the defender of CMP is that there is much theorizing to be done about the compatibility between CMP and the thin-content view, and McGrath’s view shows one way to reconcile the two.

b. Phenomenal Contrast Arguments

An argument for thinking that we do perceive moral properties, as well as other high-level properties, is the argument from phenomenal contrast. Susanna Siegel develops a kind of phenomenal contrast argument as a general strategy for arguing that the contents of our perception are far richer than a thin view of contents would allow (2006, 2011, 2017). How a phenomenal contrast argument works is as follows. We are asked to imagine two scenarios, one in which a property is present, and a contrast scenario where the same property is absent. If the intuition about these cases is that the perceptual phenomenology is different for a perceiver in these scenarios, then one can argue that what explains the difference in experience in these cases is the absence of the property, which makes a difference to what is perceptually experienced. The reason an advocate of CMP would want to use this strategy is that if there is a phenomenal contrast between two cases, then there is an explanatory gap that CMP fills; if there is a moral experience in one case but not in a different similar case, CMP can explain the difference by saying that a moral property is perceived one case but not in the other, thus explaining the phenomenal difference.

To better illustrate phenomenal contrast, here is a concrete example from Siegel arguing that causation appears in the contents of perception (2011). Imagine two cases both in which we are placed behind a shade and see two silhouettes of objects. In the control case, we see one silhouette of an object bump into another object, and the second object begins to roll. In the contrast case, whenever one silhouette begins to move towards the other silhouette, the other silhouette begins to move as well, keeping a steady distance from the first silhouette. If we have the intuition that these two cases are phenomenally different for a perceiver, then Siegel argues that the best explanation for this difference is that causation is perceptually represented in the former case and not the latter, whereas competitors deny that causation appears in the content would have to find some alternative, and more complicated, explanation for the contrast.

The phenomenal contrast argument has been wielded to argue for moral contents specifically by Preston Werner (2014). Werner asks us to imagine two different individuals, a neurotypical individual and an emotionally empathetic dysfunctional individual (EEDI), coming across the same morally-valenced scenario. Let this scenario be a father hugging a child. When the neurotypical individual comes upon the scene of the father hugging his child, this individual is likely to be moved and have a variety of physiological and psychological responses (such as feeling the “warm fuzzies”). When the EEDI comes upon the scene of the father hugging his child, however, they will be left completely cold, lacking the physiological and psychological responses the neurotypical individual underwent. This version of the phenomenal contrast argument purports to show that what best accounts for the experiential difference between these two individuals is that the neurotypical individual is able to perceptually represent the moral goodness of the father hugging the child, thus explaining the emotional reaction, whereas the EEDI was left cold because of their inability to perceptually represent moral goodness. If this argument is successful, then we have reason to think that moral properties appear in the contents of experience.

One might object here that Werner is not following the general methodology that Siegel sets out for phenomenal contrast. Werner  defends his case as a phenomenal contrast by arguing that making use of two different scenarios would be too controversial to be fruitful because of the difference between learning to recognise morally valenced situations and having the recognitional disposition to recognise pine trees, and that the two individuals in the scenario are sufficiently similar in that they both have generally functional psychologies, but interestingly different in that the EEDI lacks the ability to properly emotionally respond to situations. Similarly, we might wonder about the use of an EEDI in this phenomenal contrast case. Although the EEDI possesses much of the same cognitive architecture as the neurotypical individual, the EEDI is also different in significant aspects. First, an immediate explanation of the difference might appeal to emotions, rather than perceptual experiences; the EEDI lacks the relevant emotions requisite for moral experiences. Second, the EEDI makes for a poor contrast if they lack the moral concepts needed to recognise moral properties in the first place. Similarly, the use of an EEDI as a contrast may prove problematic due to the exact nature of an EEDI being unclear; claiming that the best explanation between the two individuals’ experiences is due to a representational difference may be premature in the face of numerous and conflicting theories about the pathology of an EEDI. That is, because an EEDI’s perceptual system is identical to that of the neurotypical individual, the EEDI may still perceptually represent moral properties but fail to respond or recognise them for some other reason. If this hypothesis is correct, then the use of an EEDI is illegitimate because it does not capture the purported experiential difference.

c. Phenomenal Contrast and Parity Considerations

Even if CMP gets the right result, this does not rule out that other views can explain the phenomenology as well. For example, Pekka Väyrynen claims that inferentialism provides a better explanation of moral experiences, particularly regarding explanations of different experiences in phenomenal contrast scenarios (2018). To show this, Väyrynen first provides a rival hypothesis to a perceptualist account, which is as follows. When we see a father hugging his child, our experience of moral goodness is a representation that “results from an implicit habitual inference or some other type of transition in thought which can be reliably prompted by the non-moral perceptual inputs jointly with the relevant background moral beliefs” (Väyrynen 2018). This rival hypothesis aims to explain the phenomenological experiences targeted by phenomenal contrast arguments by stating that rather than moral properties appearing in our perceptual contents, what happens when we have a moral experience is that past moral learning, in conjunction with the non-moral perceptual inputs, forms a moral belief downstream from perception.

To see how this might work in a non-moral case, we can consider the following vignette, Fine Wine (Väyrynen 2018):

Greg, an experienced wine maker, reports that when he samples wine he perceives it as having various non-evaluative qualities which form his basis for classifying it as fine or not. Michael, a wine connoisseur, says that he can taste also fineness in wine.

Väyrynen asks if Michael has a perceptual experience of a property, in this case, fineness, that Greg cannot pick up on, and argues that there is no difference in perceptual experience. Granting that Greg and Michael’s experiences of the wine can differ, we need not appeal to Michael being able to perceive the property of fineness in order to explain this difference. What explains the difference in phenomenology, according to Väyrynen, is that Michael’s representations of fineness are “plausibly an upshot of inferences or some other reliable transitions in thought…” (Väyrynen 2018). Väyrynen’s hypothesis aims to reveal the phenomenal contrast argument as lacking the virtue of parsimony. That is, the perceptualist is using more theoretical machinery than needed to explain the difference in phenomenal experiences. The phenomenal contrast argument explains the difference in phenomenology between two individuals by claiming that moral properties appear in the contents of perception. Väyrynen’s rival hypothesis is supposed to be a simpler and more plausible alternative that explains why we may think high-level contents are in perception. First, it explains what appears to be a difference in perceptual experience as a difference in doxastic experience (a difference in beliefs). Second, because the difference is in doxastic experience, Väyrynen’s hypothesis does not commit to high-level contents in perception. Everyone who is party to this debate agrees on the existence of low-level perceptual contents and doxastic experiences, so to endorse high-level contents is to take on board an extra commitment. All things being equal, it is better to explain a phenomenon with fewer theoretical posits. In other words, Väyrynen’s hypothesis gets better explanatory mileage than the perceptualist’s phenomenal contrast argument.

Consider a moral counterpart of fine wine, where Greg and Michael witness a father hugging his child. Greg rarely engages in moral theorizing, but he classifies the action as morally good based on some of the non-moral features he perceives. Michael, on the other hand, is a world class moral philosopher who claims he can see the goodness or badness of actions. The perceptualist will say that the latter individual perceives goodness, but the former individual is perceptually lacking such that they cannot pick up on moral properties. The perceptualist who makes use of phenomenal contrast arguments is committed to saying here that Michael’s perceptual system has been trained to detect moral properties and has moral contents in perceptual experience, whereas Greg has to do extra cognitive work to make a moral judgment. Väyrynen’s rival hypothesis, on the other hand, need not claim we perceptually represent moral properties, but rather can explain the difference in phenomenology by appealing to the implicit inferences one may make in response to non-moral properties to which one has a trained sensitivity. According to Väyrynen’s hypothesis, Michael’s cognitive system is trained to make implicit inferences in response to certain non-moral properties, whereas Greg needs to do a bit more explicit cognitive work to make a moral judgment. What seems like a difference in perceptual experience is explained away as a difference in post-perceptual experience.

Väyrynen’s hypothesis also challenges Werner’s phenomenal contrast argument above, as it has an explanation for the EEDI’s different phenomenological experience. The neurotypical has the moral experience because of implicit inferences being made, but the EEDI fails to have the same experience because the EEDI lacks a sensitivity to the moral properties altogether, failing to draw the inferences the neurotypical is trained to make. In short, the difference in one’s phenomenological experience is explained by this rival hypothesis by differences in belief, rather than in perception.

d. Cognitive Penetration

It is already clear how low-level contents make it into perception, as perceptual scientists are already familiar with the rod and cone cells that make up the retina and process incoming light, as well as how that information is used by the early visual system. Is less clear how high-level contents make their way into perceptual experience. If perception does contain high-level contents, then a mechanism is required to explain how such contents make it into perceptual experience. The mechanism of choice for philosophers of perception and cognitive scientists is cognitive penetration. Cognitive penetration is a psychological hypothesis claiming that at least some of an individual’s perceptual states are shaped by that individual’s propositional attitudes, such as beliefs, desires, and fears. Put another way, cognitive penetration is the claim that perceptual experience is theory-laden.

To understand how cognitive penetration is supposed to work, we should consider another phenomenal contrast case. Imagine that you are working at a nature conservation center, and are unfamiliar with the plant known as Queen Anne’s lace. While working at the conservation center, you are told by your supervisor that plants that look a certain way are Queen Anne’s Lace. After repeated exposure to the plant, that a plant is Queen Anne’s lace becomes visually salient to you. In other words, your perceptual experience of Queen Anne’s lace prior to learning to recognize it is different from the perceptual experience you have of the plant after you have learned to recognize it. Cognitive penetration explains this shift in perceptual experience as your Queen Anne’s lace beliefs shape your perceptual experience, such that the property of ‘being Queen Anne’s lace’ makes it into the content of your perception. In other words, the difference in perceptual experiences is explained by the difference in perceptual contents, which in turn is explained by perceptual experiences being mediated by propositional attitudes. We should take care to separate this from a similar thesis which claims that there is no change in perceptual experience after learning to recognize Queen Anne’s lace, but that the shift in the phenomenology (the what-it-is-likeness) of looking at Queen Anne’s lace is explained by changes in post-perceptual experience, such as having new beliefs about the plant. Cognitive penetration claims that the phenomenological difference is between perceptual experiences, and it is the beliefs about Queen Anne’s lace that changes the perceptual experience.

Cognitive penetration is an attractive option for the perceptualist because it provides a mechanism to explain how moral properties make their way into the contents of perception. Consequently, the perceptualist’s theory for how we see the rightness or wrongness of actions will be identical to the story about Queen Anne’s lace above: an individual learns about morality from their community and forms moral beliefs, which in turn prime the perceptual system to perceive moral properties. One the perceptualist has cognitive penetration, they then have a story for moral properties in the contents of perception, and then the perceptualist delivers an elegant epistemology of moral justification. This epistemology respects the matching content constraint, which states that in order for a belief to be justified by perception, the contents of a belief must match the contents of perception. The perceptualist may then say that we have foundational perceptual justification for our moral beliefs, in the same way that we have foundational perceptual justification for tree beliefs. Just as we see that there is a tree before us, we see that an action is wrong.

e. The Mediation Challenge

The perceptualist’s use of cognitive penetration has led to challenges to the view on the grounds that cognitive penetration, the thesis that propositional attitudes influence perceptual experiences, lead to counterintuitive consequences. One of the most prominent challenges to the possibility of moral perception comes from Faraci , who argues that if cognitive penetration is true, then CMP must be false (Faraci 2015). To motivate the argument that no moral justification is grounded in perception, Faraci defends a principle he calls mediation:

If perceptions of X are grounded in experiences as of Y, then perceptions of X produce perceptual justification only if they are mediated by background knowledge of some relation between X and Y. (Faraci 2015)

What mediation states is that one can only have perceptual justification of some high-level property if the experience of that higher level property is in some way informed by knowledge of its relation to the lower-level properties it is grounded in. To motivate the plausibility of mediation, Faraci appeals to the non-moral example of seeing someone angry. If Norm sees Vera angry, presumably he knows that she is angry because he sees her furrowed brow and scowl, and he knows that a furrowed brow and scowl is the kind of behavior that indicates that someone is angry. In an analogous moral case, someone witnessing a father hugging his child knows that they are seeing a morally good action only if they have the relevant background knowledge, the relevant moral beliefs, connecting parental affection with goodness. If the witness did not possess the moral bridge principle that parental affection was good, then the witness would not know that they had seen a morally good action. The thrust of the argument is that if mediation is plausible in the non-moral case, then it is plausible in the moral case as well. If mediation is plausible in the moral case, then CMP is an implausible account of moral epistemology because it will need to appeal to background moral knowledge not gained in perceptual experience to explain how we see that the father hugging the child is a morally good action.

Faraci considers three possible ways of avoiding appeal to background knowledge for the defender of moral perception. The first option is to claim that the moral bridge principles are themselves known through perceptual experiences. In the case of the child hugging the father, then, we antecedently had a perceptual experience that justified the belief that parental affection is good. The problem with this response is that it leads to a regress, since we would have to have further background knowledge connecting parental affection and goodness (such as parental affection causes pleasure, and pleasure is good), and experientially gained knowledge of each further bridge principle.

The second option is that one could already know some basic moral principles a priori. The problem with this response should be apparent, since if we know some background principles a priori, then this is to concede the argument to Faraci that none of our most basic moral knowledge is known through experience.

Finally, someone could try to argue that one comes to know a moral fact by witnessing an action multiple times and its correlation with its perceived goodness, but the problem with this is that if each individually viewed action is perceived as being good, then we already have background knowledge informing us of the goodness of that act. If so, then we have not properly answered the mediation challenge and shown that CMP is a plausible epistemology of morality.

One way to defend CMP in response to Faraci’s challenge is to follow Preston Werner’s claim that mediation is too strong and offer a reliabilist account of justification that is compatible with a weaker reading of mediation. Werner considers a weak reading and a strong reading of Faraci’s mediation condition (Werner 2018). Werner rejects the strong reading of mediation on the grounds that while it may make Faraci’s argument against the plausibility of moral perception work, it overgeneralises to cases of perception of ordinary objects. Werner points out that the strong reading of mediation requires that we be able to make explicit the background knowledge of perceptual judgements that we make; if we perceive a chair, the strong reading requires that we be able to articulate the ‘chair theory’ that is informing our perceptual experience, otherwise our perceptual judgment that there is a chair is unjustified. Because the vast majority of non-mereologists are not able to make explicit a ‘chair-theory’ informing their perception, the strong reading yields the verdict that the vast majority of us are unjustified in our perceptual judgment of there being a chair.

The weak reading that Werner offers is what he calls “thin-background knowledge”, which he characterizes as “subdoxastic information that can ground reliable transitions from perceptual information about some property Y to perceptual information as of some other property X” (Werner 2018). The upshot is that a pure perceptualist epistemology of morality is compatible with the thin-background knowledge reading of mediation: We do not need to have access to the subdoxastic states that ground our perceptual judgments in order for us to know that our perceptual judgments are justified. Werner’s response to Faraci, in summary, is that a pure perceptualist epistemology is plausible because thin-background knowledge gives us an explanation as to how our perceptual moral judgments are in good epistemic standing.

f. Moral Perception and Wider Debates in The Philosophy of Perception

A broader lesson from the mediation challenge, however, is that many of the issues facing CMP are the same arguments that appear in general debates regarding the epistemology and metaphysics of perception. In the case of Faraci , the argument is a particular instance of a wider concern about cognitive penetration (2015).

What the mediation challenge reflects is a general concern about epistemic dependence and epistemic downgrade in relation to cognitive penetration. In particular, the mediation principle is an instance of the general challenge of epistemic dependence:

A state or process, e, epistemically depends upon another state, d, with respect to content c if state or process e is justified or justification-conferring with respect to c only if (and partly because) d is justified or justification-conferring with respect to c. (Cowan 2014, 674)

The reason one might worry about epistemic dependence in connection with cognitive penetration is that the justification conferring state in instances of cognitive penetration might be the belief states shaping the perceptual experiences, rather than the perceptual experiences doing the justificatory work. If this is true, then a perceptual epistemology of all high-level contents is doubtful, since what does the justificatory work in identifying pine trees will be either training or reflecting on patterns shared between trees, neither of which lend them to a perceptual story.

There is another general worry for cognitive penetration: epistemic downgrade. Assuming cognitive penetration is true, even if one were able to explain away epistemic dependence one might still think that our perceptual justification is held hostage by the beliefs that shape our experiences. For illustration, let us say we have the belief that anyone with a hoodie is carrying a knife. If we see someone wearing a hoodie and they pull a cellphone out, our belief may shape our perceptual state such that our perceptual experience is that of the person in the hoodie pulling a knife. I then believe that the person is pulling a knife. Another example of epistemic downgrade is that of anger:

Before seeing Jack, Jill fears that Jack is angry at her. When she sees him, her fear causes her to have a visual experience in which he looks angry at her. She goes on to believe that he is angry (Siegel 2019, 67).

In both cases there appears to be an epistemic defect: a belief is shaping a perceptual experience, which in turn provides support to the very same belief that shaped that experience. It is an epistemically vicious feedback loop. The worry about epistemic downgrade and high-order contents should be clear. In the case of morality, our background beliefs may be false, which will in turn shape our moral perceptual experiences to be misrepresentative. This appears to provide a defeater for perceptual justification of morality, and it forces the perceptualist to engage in defense of the moral background beliefs which may turn out to be an a priori exercise, defeating the a posteriori character of justified moral beliefs the perceptualist wanted.

One way to avoid these epistemic worries is for the moral perceptualist to endorse some form of epistemic dogmatism, which is to claim that seemings (perceptual or doxastic) provide immediate prima facie, defeasible, justification for belief. The perceptualist who adopts this strategy can argue that the worry of epistemic dependence is misplaced because although the presence of high-level content is causally dependent on the influence of background beliefs, given their dogmatist theory justification for a belief epistemically depends only on the perceptual experience itself. To see this, consider the following analogy: If one is wearing sunglasses, the perceptual experience one has will depend on those sunglasses they are wearing, but one’s perceptual beliefs are not justified by the sunglasses, but rather by the perceptual experience itself (Pryor 2000). For concerns about epistemic downgrade, the perceptualist may give a similar response, which is to state that one is defeasibly justified in a perceptual belief until one is made aware of a defeater, which in this case is the vicious feedback loop. To be clear, no moral perceptualist has made use of this response in print, as most opt for a kind of externalist account of perceptual justification. We should keep in mind that the dogmatist response is made in debates in general perceptual epistemology, and because debates about the epistemic effects of cognitive penetration in moral perception are instances of the general debate, the dogmatist strategy is available should the moral perceptualist wish to use it.

Apart from the epistemic difficulties cognitive penetration incurs, because cognitive penetration is a thesis about the structure of human cognitive architecture it must withstand scrutiny from cognitive science and empirical psychology. A central assumption of the cognitive science and psychology of perception is that the perceptual system is modular, or informationally encapsulated. However, cognitive penetration assumes the opposite because it claims that beliefs influence perceptual experience. Because cognitive penetration holds that the perceptual system is non-modular and receives input from the cognitive system, it falls upon advocates of the hypothesis to show that there is empirical support for the thesis. The problem is that most empirical tests purporting to demonstrate effects of cognitive penetration are questionable. The results have been debunked as either being explainable by other psychological effects such as attention effects, or they have been dismissed on the grounds of poor methodology and difficult to replicate (Firestone and Scholl 2016). Furthermore, in the case of perceptual learning, cognitive penetration predicts changes in the neurophysiology of the cognitive system rather than in the perceptual system, as it would be new beliefs that explain learning to recognize an object. Research in perceptual neurophysiology shows the opposite: perceptual learning is accompanied by changes in the neurophysiology of the perceptual system (Connolly 2019). The viability of CMP, insofar as it depends on cognitive penetration for high-level contents, is subject not only to epistemic pressures, but also to empirical fortune.

5. Summary: Looking Forward

For moral epistemologists, a foundationalist epistemology that provides responses to skeptical challenges is highly desirable. While a variety of theories of moral epistemology do provide foundations, CMP provides an epistemology that grounds our justification in our perceptual faculty that we are all familiar with and provides a unified story for all perceptual justification.

The overall takeaway is that the arguments that are made by both defenders and challengers to CMP are instances of general issues in the philosophy of perception. The lesson to be drawn here for CMP is that the way forward is to pay close attention to the general philosophy of perception literature. Because the literature of CMP itself remains in very early development, paying attention to the general issues will prevent the advocate of CMP from falling into mistakes made in the general literature, as well as open potential pathways for developing CMP in interesting and novel ways.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Audi, Robert. 2013. Moral Perception. Princeton University Press.
    • A book length defense of CMP. A good example of the kind of epistemic ecumenicism a perceptualist may adopt.
  • Bergqvist, Anna, and Robert Cowan (eds.). 2018. Evaluative Perception. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Collection of essays on the plausibility of CMP and emotional perception.
  • Church, Jennifer. 2013. “Moral Perception.” Possibilities of Perception (pp. 187-224). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents a Kantian take on moral perception.
  • Crow, Daniel. 2016. “The Mystery of Moral Perception.” Journal Of Moral Philosophy 13, 187-210.
    • Challenges moral perception with a reliability challenge.
  • Connolly, Kevin. 2019. Perceptual Learning: The Flexibility of the Senses. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Discusses the findings of the neuroscience and psychology of perception in relation to theses in the philosophy of mind. Chapter 2 argues against cognitive penetration.
  • Cowan, Robert. 2014. “Cognitive Penetrability and Ethical Perception.” Review of Philosophy and Psychology 6, 665-682.
    • Discusses the epistemic challenges posed to moral perception by cognitive penetration. Focuses on epistemic dependence.
  • Cowan, Robert. 2015. “Perceptual Intuitionism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 90, 164-193.
    • Defends the emotional perception of morality.
  • Cowan, Robert. 2016. “Epistemic perceptualism and neo-sentimentalist objections.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 46, 59-81.
    • Defends the emotional perception of morality.
  • Faraci, David. 2015. “A hard look at moral perception.” Philosophical Studies 172, 2055-2072.
  • Faraci, David. 2019. “Moral Perception and the Reliability Challenge.” Journal of Moral Philosophy 16, 63-73.
    • Responds to Werner 2018. Argues that moral perception has a reliability challenge.
  • Firestone, Chaz, and Brian J. Scholl. 2016a. “Cognition Does Not Affect Perception: Evaluating the Evidence for ‘Top-down’ Effects.” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 39.
    • Challenges studies that purport to demonstrate the effects of cognitive penetration.
  • Firestone, Chaz, and Brian J. Scholl. 2016b. “‘Moral Perception’ Reflects Neither Morality Nor Perception.” Trends in Cognitive Sciences 20, 75-76.
    • Response to Gantman and Van Bavel 2015.
  • Fodor, Jerry. 1983. The Modularity of Mind. Cambridge, Massachusetts: MIT Press.
    • Argues for the informational encapsulation of the perceptual system.
  • Gantman, Ana P. and Jay J.Van Bavel. 2014. “The moral pop-out effect: Enhanced perceptual awareness of morally relevant stimuli.” Cognition, 132, 22-29.
    • Argues that findings in perceptual psychology support moral perception.
  • Gantman, Ana P. and Jay J. Van Bavel. 2015. “Moral Perception.” Trends in Cognitive Sciences 19, 631-633.
  • Hutton, James. 2022. “Moral Experience: Perception or Emotion?” Ethics 132, 570-597.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2005. Ethical Intuitionism. New York: Palgrave MacMillan.
    • Section 4.4.1 presents the ‘looks’ objection.
  • Kim, Jaegwon. 1993. Supervenience and Mind: Selected Philosophical Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A collection of essays discussing the causal exclusion problem.
  • McBrayer, Justin P. 2010a. “A limited defense of moral perception.” Philosophical Studies 149, 305–320.
  • McBrayer, Justin P. 2010b. “Moral perception and the causal objection.” Ratio 23, 291-307.
  • McGrath, Matthew. 2017. “Knowing what things look like.” Philosophical Review 126, 1-41.
    • Presents a general version of the ‘looks’ objection.
  • McGrath, Sarah. 2004. “Moral Knowledge by Perception.” Philosophical Perspectives 18, 209-228.
    • An early formulation of CMP, discusses the epistemic motivations for the view.
  • McGrath, Sarah. 2018. “Moral Perception and its Rivals.” In Anna Bergqvist and Robert Cowan (eds.), Evaluative Perception (pp. 161-182). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGrath, Sarah. 2019. Moral Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Chapter 4 is a presentation of CMP that does not require high-level contents. Chapter 1 is a criticism of some views on the methodology of moral inquiry.
  • Pylyshyn, Zenon. 1999. “Is Vision Continuous with Cognition? The Case for Cognitive Impenetrability of Visual Perception.” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 22, 341-365.
  • Pryor, James. 2000. “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist.” Noûs 34, 517-549.
    • Early presentation of phenomenal dogmatism. Responds to epistemic concerns about the theory-ladenness of perception.
  • Reiland, Indrek. 2021. “On experiencing moral properties.” Synthese 198, 315-325.
    • Presents a version of the ‘looks’ objection.
  • Siegel, Susanna. 2006. “Which properties are represented in perception.” In Gendler, Tamar S. & John Hawthorne (eds.), Perceptual Experience (pp. 481-503). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that perceptual experience includes high-level contents.
  • Siegel, Susanna. 2011. The Contents of Visual Experience. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Book length defense of high-level contents in perceptual experience.
  • Siegel, Susanna. 2012. “Cognitive Penetrability and Perceptual Justification.” Noûs 46.
    • Discusses the issue of epistemic downgrade.
  • Siegel, Susanna. 2019. The Rationality Of Perception. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Chapter 4 is a discussion of epistemic downgrade and responds to criticisms of the problem.
  • Siegel, Susanna & Byrne, Alex. 2016. “Rich or thin?” In Bence Nanay (ed.), Current Controversies in Philosophy of Perception (pp. 59-80). New York: Routledge-Taylor & Francis.
    • Byrne and Siegel debate whether or not there are high-level perceptual contents.
  • Väyrynen, Pekka. 2018. “Doubts about Moral Perception.”  In Anna Bergqvist and Robert Cowan (eds.), Evaluative Perception (pp. 109-128). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Werner, Preston J. 2016. “Moral Perception and the Contents of Experience.” Journal of Moral Philosophy 13, 294-317.
  • Werner, Preston J. 2017. “A Posteriori Ethical Intuitionism and the Problem of Cognitive Penetrability.” European Journal of Philosophy 25, 1791-1809.
    • Argues that synchronic cognitive penetration is a problem for CMP, but diachronic cognitive penetration is epistemically harmless.
  • Werner, Preston J. 2018. “Moral Perception without (Prior) Moral Knowledge.” Journal of Moral Philosophy 15, 164-181.
    • Response to Faraci 2015.
  • Werner, Preston J. 2018. “An epistemic argument for liberalism about perceptual content.” Philosophical Psychology 32, 143-159.
    • Defends the claim that there are high-level contents in perception by arguing that it best explains some findings in perceptual psychology, such as facial recognition.
  • Werner, Preston J. 2020. “Which Moral Properties Are Eligible for Perceptual Awareness?” Journal of Moral Philosophy 17, 290-319.
    • Discusses which moral properties we can perceive, concludes that we perceive at least pro-tanto evaluative properties.
  • Wodak, Daniel. 2019. “Moral perception, inference, and intuition.” Philosophical Studies 176, 1495-1512.
  • Yablo, Stephen. 2005. “Wide Causation” In Stephen Yablo (ed.), Thoughts: Papers on Mind, Meaning, and Modality. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents a solution to the causal exclusion problem. Argues that mental states are causally efficacious in a ‘wide’ sense in that they would still be explanatorily valuable even if the ‘thin’ causes, the physical states, were different.


Author Information

Erich Jones
The Ohio State University
U. S. A.