Francisco Suárez (1548—1617)
Sometimes called the “Eminent Doctor” after Paul V’s designation of him as doctor eximius et pius, Francisco Suárez was the leading theological and philosophical light of Spain’s Golden Age, alongside such cultural icons as Miguel de Cervantes, Tomás Luis de Victoria, and El Greco. Although initially rejected on grounds of deficient health and intelligence when he attempted to join the rapidly growing Society of Jesus, he attained international prominence within his lifetime. He taught at the schools in Segovia, Valladolid, Rome, Alcalá, Salamanca, and finally at Coimbra, the last at Philip II’s insistence.
Not all of the attention Suárez received was positive. His Defensio fidei, published in 1613, defended a theory of political power that was widely perceived to undermine any monarch’s absolute right to rule. He explicitly permitted tyrannicide and argued that even monarchs who come to power legitimately can become tyrants and thereby lose their authority. Such views led to the book being publically burned in London and Paris.
Suárez was clearly a scholastic in style and temperament, despite coming after the rise of humanism and living on the cusp of what is usually identified as the era of modern philosophy. His writings are sometimes said to contain the whole of scholastic philosophy because in addressing a question he surveys the full range of scholastic positions—Thomist, Scotist, nominalist, and others—before affirming one of those positions or presenting his own variant. The position he ultimately settles on is likely to be a via media.
Suárez’s greatness as a philosopher comes precisely from his magisterial weighing of all the competing positions across an extraordinarily broad range of theological and philosophical issues. The combination of broad systematicity, detailed elaboration, and thorough argumentation for his preferred view and against contrary views finds few rivals. He is a philosopher’s philosopher.
The even-handed presentation of the panoply of scholastic positions also explains why Suárez’s writing served as one of the key conduits through which medieval philosophy influenced early modern philosophy. Descartes, Leibniz, and Wolff, among others, learned scholasticism at least in part from reading Suárez, a scholasticism from which they then borrowed in developing their own philosophical theories.
Table of Contents
- References and Further Reading
Francisco Suárez was born on January 5, 1548 in Granada to Gaspar Suárez de Toledo and Antonia Vázquez de Utiel, a mere half-century after the Catholic Monarchs, Ferdinand and Isabella, wrested the city from eight centuries of Muslim control. The family was prosperous, although members of earlier generations on the maternal side ran into trouble with the Inquisition due to Jewish lineage, and several members were burned at the stake. Suárez’s uncle, Francisco Toledo de Herrera, was a prominent professor of philosophy who became the first Jesuit cardinal. His extended family included others of some note, including an arch-bishop cardinal and a viceroy of Peru.
Suárez was the second son of eight children. His brother Baltasar also joined the Jesuit order and was sent to the Philippines but died en route. Another brother became a priest, and three sisters joined a Jeronymite convent. Whether these facts indicate an exceptionally devout family or an attempt to mitigate some converso ancestry is less clear.
His childhood seems to have been unexceptional. He was schooled in Latin and rhetoric until thirteen, at which point he went to Salamanca to study canon law for three years. His academic performance at this point was lackluster. During his time at Salamanca he heard the legendary sermons of the Jesuit Juan Ramirez and felt the call to join the Jesuit order. Stunning in retrospect, Suárez was rejected from the then-fledgling order on grounds of insufficient intellectual aptitude. Suárez persisted, and finally, after numerous appeals, he was admitted to the order in 1564 as an indifferent, that is, provisionally accepted with the understanding that he might be refused entry into the priesthood.
At this point, Suárez’s academic abilities seem to have flowered so suddenly that some biographers attribute the flowering to the miraculous invention of Mary, the Mother of God. His newfound academic abilities did not go unnoticed, and he was sent to study theology at the University of Salamanca, then one of the most prestigious universities at the height of its glory and at the center of the Iberian revival of scholasticism. In 1570 he performed the “Grand Act” at Salamanca, something done only by the most gifted students. The Grand Act was a public academic exercise, resembling a medieval quodlibetal dispute, in which the student needed to be able to answer questions and resolve difficulties posed by professors and visitors. Suárez had enough of a reputation already to ensure prominent guests and a full hall. His new reputation also led his superiors to have him start teaching philosophy rather than first teaching grammar or rhetoric as was usually the case. Between 1570 and 1580, Suárez taught at several institutions around Spain: Salamanca, Segovia, Valladolid, and Avila. His earliest works come from this period.
Charges of novelty also started in this period. On Suárez’s telling, the problem was that he refused to teach by dictation from copy books but rather searched “for truth at its very roots.” The resulting controversy may have factored into his new position. In 1580 Suárez was called to Rome to join the Collegio Romano and to contribute to the development of the famous Jesuit pedagogical document, the Ratio Studiorum. The Roman College was an intellectually stimulating place to be, including such luminaries as the humanist Francisco Sanches, the theologians Robert Bellarmine and Gregory of Valencia, and the mathematician Christopher Clavius. Suárez also became a close colleague of the extraordinarily young general of the Jesuit order, Claudio Acquaviva.
In 1585 Suárez started teaching at the University of Alcalá. His seven years there were marked by strife with other theologians, including, notably, with his colleague Gabriel Vasquez, a dispute that left its mark on Jesuit philosophical history for generations. Suárez was unhappy with the distraction of all these conflicts and requested release from his position. Finally, in 1592, he was sent back to the university of his student days, Salamanca, where he wrote his best-known work, the Disputationes metaphysicae.
In 1597, the same year that Disputationes metaphysicae was published, Suárez moved yet again, this time to Coimbra in Portugal at the behest of Philip II. The first time Philip asked Suárez to move to Coimbra, in 1596, Suárez declined since he feared Coimbra’s teaching responsibilities would keep him from his writing projects. Because Spain had claimed Portugal during the 1580 Portuguese succession crisis, Suárez may also have feared the political situation, since the Portuguese were likely to be less than welcoming of a Spanish professor appointed by a Spanish king (even if the Spanish king was also Philip I of Portugal). Furthermore, Suárez would have occupied a new Jesuit chair at a Dominican university and tensions were running high between the two orders. Philip was disinclined to accept Suárez’s declination, but granted it after a personal visit. Unfortunately, the person appointed in his stead died at the end of 1596, raising the issue all over again. This time Philip insisted that Suárez move to Coimbra. An amusing consequence was that Suárez now needed to acquire a doctoral degree, since the Coimbra faculty objected to Suárez’s post without one. The Jesuit Provincial in Lisbon was happy to confer one, but this failed to satisfy. Finally, Suárez made a trip to the University of Evora in southern Portugal, where he directed a public theological debate and was rewarded with a doctorate.
Suárez stayed at Coimbra until his retirement in 1613, although this was a retirement only from teaching. Among other projects, Suárez hoped to revise an earlier set of lecture notes into a commentary on Aristotle’s De anima. The revision remained unfinished, however, at Suárez’s death on September 25, 1617.
By Suárez’s time, Aquinas’s Summa theologiae (henceforth, ST) had to some extent replaced Lombard’s Sentences as the standard theological textbook and subject of commentaries. Many of Suárez’s works are offered as commentaries on particular sections of ST. Suárez generally does not, however, offer line-by-line comments on Aquinas’s texts; still, the arrangement of subjects in his work mirrors that in Aquinas’s text, the questions he considers often grow out of it, and he constantly cites passages from it.
In correspondence to ST Ia (that is, the First Part), Suárez wrote De Deo uno et trino (“On God, One and Triune”), De angelis (“On Angels”), De opere sex dierum (“On the Work of the Six Days [of Creation]”), and De anima (“On the Soul”). The last work, in particular, has received significant attention from Suárez scholars and is the primary source for his psychological views. One should also note in passing that titles are apt to be a source of confusion for those less familiar with Suárez’s works, since scholars will sometimes use titles for smaller or larger divisions of his work. For example, references to De divina substantiae ejusque attributis, De divino praedestinatione, and De SS. Trinitatis mysterio are all to treatises that make up the De Deo uno et trino mentioned above. Conversely, the latter three works mentioned above are sometimes gathered under the title De Deo effectore creaturarum omnium, though they are more commonly cited individually. Listing all the variations would be tedious, but readers should note that a citation of a seemingly unfamiliar work of Suárez’s might simply be using the title of a collection of treatises or the title of a part of a larger collection.
In correspondence to ST IaIIae (that is, the First Section of the Second Part), Suárez wrote De ultimo fine hominis (“On the Ultimate End of Man”), De voluntario et involuntario (“On the Voluntary and Involuntary”), De bonitate et malitia actuum humanorum (“On the Goodness and Evil of Human Acts”), De pasionibus et habitibus (“On Passions and Habits”), and De vitiis atque peccatis (“On Vices and Sins”), all published together in one volume under the title Tractatus quinque ad primam secundae D. Thomae. These works have received less scholarly attention, although they are obviously of great relevance for determining Suárez’s ethical views. De legibus seu de Deo legislatore (“On Laws or on God the Lawgiver”) also corresponds to IaIIae and has received more attention as one of Suárez’s greatest and most influential works. Seeing De legibus as a commentary on Aquinas’s ST helps to understand it properly, as well. It is sometimes read as a comprehensive presentation of Suárez’s ethical views, but Suárez himself conceives of it as corresponding to questions 90-108 of ST IaIIae. Those questions, of course, constitute a small fraction of Aquinas’s ethical thought. Finally, Suárez’s massive De gratia (“On Grace”) and some of the shorter theological works he wrote in connection with the controversy De auxiliis (to be addressed later) present an extraordinarily detailed account of grace and connected theological matters.
Suárez wrote fewer works on ST IIaIIae (a fact that is grist for the scholarly mill), but De fide theologica (“On Theological Faith”), De spe (“On Hope”), De caritate (“On Charity”), and the again massive De virtute et statu religionis (“On the Virtue and State of Religion”) do correspond to it. The last work offers a defense of the Society of Jesus along with a detailed examination of its principles. These works generally have received rather little scholarly attention, with the exception of the well-known disputation on war included in De caritate. That disputation is the main source for Suárez’s just-war theory.
Corresponding to ST IIIa are De verbo incarnato (“On the Incarnate Word”), De mysteriis vitae Christi (“On the Mysteries of Christ’s Life”), De sacramentis (“On the Sacraments”), and De censuris (“On Censures”). These works have received little attention from recent philosophers, but slightly more from theologians. De mysteriis vitae Christi, in particular, is significant for including several hundred pages of discussion of questions related to the Blessed Virgin Mary. It is this work that has earned Suárez a prominent place in the history of systematic Mariology.
Not all of Suárez’s works fit into the ST framework, especially those of his works sparked by religious and political controversies of his day. The famous controversy De auxiliis raged between the Dominicans and Jesuits during Suárez’s lifetime and he contributed a number of works defending the Jesuit position. The central issue was how to explain human free will on the one side and divine foreknowledge, providence, and grace on the other side in such a way that they were compatible with each other and without falling into one heresy or another. Suárez contributed a number of works dealing with these matters: De vera intelligentia auxilii efficacis (“On the True Understanding of Efficacious Aid”), De concursu, motione et auxilio Dei (“On God’s Concurrence, Motion, and Aid”), De scientia Dei futurorum contingentium (“On God’s Knowledge of Future Contingents”), De auxilio efficaci (“On Efficacious Aid”), De libertate divinae voluntatis (“On the Freedom of the Divine Will”), De meritis mortificatis, et per poenitentiam reparatis (“On Merits Destroyed and Revived through Penance”), and De justitia qua Deus reddit praemia meritis, et poenas pro peccatis (“On the Justice by Which God Gives Rewards for Merits and Punishment for Sins”).
More political in nature is the treatise De immunitate ecclesiastica a Venetis violata (“About the Ecclesiastical Immunity Violated by the Venetians”), a work written in defense of the papal position in the dispute between the papacy and the Republic of Venice about the extent of papal jurisdiction.
Best-known of Suárez’s controversial works is his response to the English monarch James I, Defensio fidei catholicae adversus anglicanae sectae errores (“A Defense of the Catholic Faith Against the Errors of the Anglican Sect”), written at the request of the papal nuncio in Madrid. Suárez’s initial aim was to respond to James I’s arguments for requiring Catholic subjects to take an oath of loyalty. The work became much more than that, however, and offers much of interest to theorists of political power. In it, Suárez opposes the absolute right of monarchs, argues that the papacy has indirect power over temporal rulers, and, perhaps most inflammatory, argues that there are situations in which citizens may legitimately resist a tyrannical monarch to the point of tyrannicide. The work was promptly condemned by the English king and publically burned in London. James tried to enlist the support of other European monarchs in condemning Suárez and the Jesuit order more generally with some success, especially in France.
Last but certainly not least, Suárez’s best-known and most influential work is his Disputationes metaphysicae (“Metaphysical Disputations”; henceforth, DM). The work is meant to cover the questions pertaining to the twelve books of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, but part of its significance lies in its not being a commentary on Aristotle’s work and not following its organization. Suárez is unhappy with Aristotle’s organization and so writes a large, two-volume work in which he sets out a comprehensive treatment of metaphysics in systematic fashion, organized into fifty-four disputations. The work is widely credited with being the first work to offer a comprehensive, systematically organized metaphysics and with initiating a long tradition of such works. DM was immediately and extraordinarily popular, widely reprinted all over Europe and quickly became the standard work to consult on metaphysical matters.
DM is divided into two main parts. The first part deals with the object of metaphysics, the concept of being, the transcendentals (that is, the essential properties of being as such, namely, unity, truth, and goodness), and the causes of beings. The second part deals with the divisions of being, first into infinite and finite. Finite being is then divided into substance and accident, with the latter then divided into the nine categories familiar from Aristotle. The last disputation concerns beings of reason, which, strictly speaking, fall outside the scope of metaphysics on Suárez’s conception, but an understanding of which is helpful for understanding metaphysics.
Aside from its systematic scope, few readers of DM have failed to be impressed by the extraordinary erudition displayed in its discussions. Each section includes a careful cataloguing of all the different positions that have been—and might be—taken with respect to the issue under question. DM’s two volumes include thousands of citations of hundreds of authors: Christian scholastic, Muslim, Patristic, ancient, and others. This may be the feature Schopenhauer has in mind when he characterizes DM as the “authentic compendium of the whole of scholastic wisdom.”
It is worth noting at this point that Suárez comes after centuries of a continuous tradition of professional theology and philosophy and consequently inherits a formidable accumulation of distinctions, technical terminology, and the like. Standard arguments and positions are often assumed or indicated in summary fashion. The resulting work is exceptionally sophisticated and can be highly rewarding to a reader with some familiarity with that tradition, but it can also be forbidding and alien to readers not so familiar.
The situation is not helped by the fact—astonishing in light of Suárez’s caliber and influence—that very little of his work is available either in critical edition or translation. Suárez’s works suffer far fewer textual issues than many medieval works do, so the lack of critical editions impedes less than it might. A significant number of his works were published posthumously, however, and the editorial decisions of his literary executor, Baltasar Alvarez, sometimes leave something to be desired. The value of translations, of course, is evident, yet aside from significant portions of DM very little has been translated into English (or any other language, for that matter). As the preceding presentation should have made clear, of course, Suárez was awe-inspiringly prolific, so a complete translation would be a monumental task. Furthermore, in addition to the mentioned works, there are still several unedited and unpublished works.
The first thing to note when trying to get one’s bearings with Suárez’s thought is that he, like many other scholastic authors, is a Christian Aristotelian. His thought is so thoroughly imbued with both Christianity and Aristotelianism that it would be difficult to find a single page in his writings not containing obvious traces of both. As is well-known, Aristotle says some things incompatible with orthodox Christianity, such as that the world had no beginning, so an orthodox Christian must modify Aristotelianism to some degree. Nonetheless, one can better understand what Suárez says and why he says it once recognizing that he is committed to orthodox Christian doctrines—more particularly, Roman Catholic doctrines—and that his philosophical framework and conceptions are rooted in Aristotle.
On the Christianity side, Suárez is committed to there being a God, a God who created and sustains human beings and the world they inhabit. God is a Trinity of Father, Son, and Holy Spirit, but also One, indeed, utterly simple. God exists necessarily, is infinite, immutable, and eternal. God is perfectly good, omniscient, and omnipotent, and orders everything in the universe providentially. Nevertheless, human beings sinned, consequently requiring God’s grace to attain their salvation and their ultimate end, that is, God. A central part of this story is the Incarnation of the second member of the Trinity, in which Christ assumes a human nature in addition to his divine nature. A moment’s reflection suffices to see that these doctrines raise a host of philosophical issues; much of Suárez’s work is devoted to such issues.
On the Aristotelian side, the most notable inheritances are hylomorphism (the view that objects are composed of matter and form); the four-causes explanatory paradigm (material, formal, efficient, and final); the categorial scheme of substance and nine categories of accidents; the view that the human soul is the form of the body; and the language of ultimate ends, happiness, and virtue in ethics. As scholars of medieval philosophy well know, this Aristotelian legacy leaves considerable room for philosophical disputes, in part due to unanswered questions, in part due to answers susceptible to differing interpretations.
The three authors most frequently cited by Suárez are Aristotle, Aquinas, and Scotus, in that order. Counting citations is not generally an infallible guide to influence, but in this case the citations seem an accurate reflection of influence. Aristotle’s influence is pervasive. Suárez claims to follow Aquinas throughout, though he no doubt exaggerates his fidelity to Aquinas. (The Jesuit order of which he was a member required fairly close adherence to Aristotle in matters of philosophy and Aquinas in matters of theology.) The number of references to Scotus, however, suggest that Suárez also had great respect for his thought. How much this respect led to influence is a matter of some controversy. Detecting such influence is made more difficult by Suárez’s practice of presenting his own view as that of Aquinas (properly interpreted), even where one might doubt their harmony. Closer examination of Suárez’s views confirms that his respect for Scotus at least occasionally led to adopting broadly Scotistic views.
The enormous range of issues addressed in Suárez’s writings ensures the impossibility of surveying all of them in an encyclopedia entry. What follows is a sampling of the issues that have received at least some scholarly attention, but it should be noted that a variety of significant topics, for example, his just war theory and his psychological views, have been omitted. The order roughly follows the order of DM with several issues drawing primarily on other works appended at the end.
a. Metaphysics and Theology
There are at least two issues concerning Suárez’s conception of metaphysics that have been the source of some controversy. Both issues also relate to the perennially enticing question of whether Suárez is the last medieval or the first modern.
Suárez opens his systematically ordered Disputationes metaphysicae by asking what the object of metaphysics is. The question received much discussion in scholastic philosophy, no doubt in part because Aristotle suggests several candidates that do not look equivalent in his Metaphysics. Suárez canvasses and criticizes six answers before giving his own answer: “being insofar as it is real being” (DM 1.1.26). Real being includes both infinite being (God) and finite being, both substances and real accidents. What it excludes, notably, is beings of reason, that is, beings that cannot exist other than as objects of thought. Note the “cannot.” On Suárez’s conception, real being includes both actual being and possible being. It does not, however, include privations, for example, blindness, and other such beings of reason.
Suárez considers metaphysics a unified science in the Aristotelian sense. The function of a science is to demonstrate the properties of its object through the latter’s principles and causes (DM 1.1.27 and 1.3.1). The term “properties” here is not being used in its wide contemporary sense but rather to refer to features necessarily possessed by the members of a kind yet not essential to them. The classic example is the capacity to laugh, which scholastics generally deem a feature necessarily possessed by human beings yet do not deem an essential feature, as rationality is. The function of metaphysics, then, is to identify the properties of being insofar as it is real being, and to demonstrate their necessary possession by appeal to the principles and causes of being insofar as it is real being.
The immediate objection is that being, insofar as it is real being, has neither necessary features that can be demonstrated nor principles and causes (DM 1.1.27). Consequently, it fails to make a suitable object for metaphysics. With respect to the first part, the thought is that being insofar as it is real being is so far abstracted that it has no properties. Trees, rocks, angels, and so forth all have properties, but what property does the being common to every being have? With respect to the second part, on the view that Suárez shares, the being par excellence is God, and God has no causes. Suárez, however, denies both claims. Being insofar as it is real being may not have any properties really distinct from it, but it does have properties that are at least distinct in reason, namely, the transcendentals: unity, truth, and goodness. In a similar move, Suárez denies that a science need appeal to causes, strictly speaking. Rather, appeal to principles or cause in a looser sense is sufficient. His example is that we can demonstrate God’s unity from God’s perfection, even though the latter is not strictly speaking a cause of the former (DM 1.1.28-29).
This conception of metaphysics might seem much narrower than more recent conceptions. It might suggest that all Suárez needed to do to finish DM is to demonstrate being’s unity, truth, and goodness and he would be done. As the size of DM attests, however, Suárez addresses a great many more topics. In the first place, he also includes disputations on the contraries of the transcendentals, namely distinction, falsity, and evil. Secondly, he includes one of the most thorough treatments of causation ever written on grounds (i) that even if being insofar as it is real being does not have a cause, most beings do and (ii) that all being is in some way a cause even if not itself caused. Finally, the entire second half of DM deals with the divisions of beings and includes lengthy disputations about the nature of particular kinds of beings such as substances, qualities, and so forth. In practice, then, the range of subjects discussed in DM comes much closer to the range of subjects that would be discussed in a modern metaphysics textbook.
Turning to the two matters of controversy mentioned earlier, the first question one may ask is how realist Suárez’s account of metaphysics is. An oft-told narrative has it that Aristotle and his medieval followers held metaphysics to concern the real rather than the mental, while at some point in the modern era metaphysics came to be about structures of thought (or something similarly mental) rather than about the extramental world. On the face of it, Suárez’s account seems impeccably realist. After all, metaphysics’ object is being insofar as it is real being. Despite seeming this way, Suárez has often been identified as one of the key figures in the transition to a non-realist approach to metaphysics. The room for debate comes with a later passage in which Suárez says that metaphysics’ object is “the objective concept of being as such” (DM 2.1.1). This is not obviously contradictory to the earlier statements that the object is being insofar as it is real being, but neither is it obviously in harmony. The question now becomes how Suárez understands objective concepts. If objective concepts borrow their ontological status from their objects, so to speak, then Suárez can readily be read as a realist. (And note that on Suárez’s view, objective concepts are concepts by extrinsic denomination; they are not really distinct from the objects. See, for example, DM 2.1.1 and 6.5.3.) On the other hand, if an objective concept is a mental item, then this later passage opens the door to less realist readings. Resolving this protracted dispute in the literature is obviously beyond the scope of this article.
The second question concerns the relationship of metaphysics to theology. Suárez makes it perfectly clear in the preface to DM that he adheres to the standard medieval view that metaphysics, albeit perfective of the human mind in its own right, ought to be in service of theology. He is, however, frustrated with piecemeal metaphysical discussions scattered throughout theological treatises, and so he writes DM to present a comprehensive metaphysics in the proper “order of teaching.” In this project, some detect a distinctly modern attitude and an early example of an increasing trend to see metaphysics as a separate discipline from theology. Others, however, are skeptical and think that Suárez sees metaphysics as distinct in the same way that his medieval predecessors did (namely, insofar as metaphysics proceeds by the “natural light of reason” apart from divine revelation) but in no additional way (for example, not by thinking that metaphysics should be conducted wholly autonomously).
The question of whether one item is distinct from another comes up in many contexts. One such place was already seen; namely, whether objective concepts are distinct from their objects. A naïve approach might just ask whether two items, A and B, are distinct or not. Is the human mind distinct from the brain? Are relations distinct from their relata? Is God’s mercy distinct from God’s justice? And so forth. Sustained philosophical reflection soon shows, however, that different sorts of distinctions might be posited between entities. Perhaps God’s mercy is identical to God’s justice in one sense but not distinct in another sense. Suárez’s scholastic predecessors frequently felt the need for a distinction between distinctions, so to speak, and so posited a plethora of distinctions. Suárez also recognizes the need for different distinctions but aims to prune the list down to three basic kinds: real, modal, and of reason. He argues in DM 7 that all other putative distinctions are actually one of these three kinds.
The two most obvious kinds of distinction are real distinctions and distinctions of reason (the two kinds that already made a showing in the previous section). As might be expected, a real distinction is the sort one expects between one thing and another thing. It is crucially an extramental distinction, one whose sign is mutual separability, that is, the possibility of either thing existing without the other. Distinctions of reason are distinctions in mind only. There may be a distinction of reason between Mark Twain and Samuel Clemens but there is no real distinction. A notable context in which Suárez wishes to appeal to distinctions of reason is when discussing God’s attributes. The doctrine of divine simplicity entails that the divine attributes can only be distinct in reason. One complication for the notion of distinctions of reason is that Suárez thinks some of them have some sort of foundation in reality while others do not.
Suárez argues that in addition to real distinctions and distinctions of reason there is a third kind of distinction, intermediate between the other two. The mark of a real distinction is mutual separability while the mark of a modal distinction is one-way separability. On Suárez’s view, for example, the union of form and matter cannot exist without the form and matter, but form and matter can exist without their union. If the union itself were a really distinct thing, Suárez thinks, then a further union would be needed to unite the union to the form and matter, and so an infinite regress would have started. So union is not some really distinct thing. But union is not merely distinct in reason, since the form and matter can exist without being united. Consequently, an intermediate kind of distinction is needed.
The reason mutual separability and one-way separability are marks or signs of the corresponding distinctions rather than simply constituting those distinctions is because of some important exceptions. On Suárez’s view there is only a one-way separability between God and creatures. God can exist without creatures but not vice versa. Assuming one is not a monist à la Spinoza, that requires granting a case of real distinction without mutual separability.
c. Esse and Essentia
In Being and Some Philosophers, Etienne Gilson famously distinguishes four fundamental traditions in metaphysics on the basis of how being is understood, two of which are existentialism and essentialism. Both terms have been used in an unhelpfully wide array of senses, but for Gilson an existentialism privileges existence over essence while an essentialist does the converse. In Gilson’s story, Thomas Aquinas is the hero who recognizes being as the very act of existing and metaphysics as the science of being insofar as it is being. Suárez, however, he sees as the paradigmatic essentialist in whose philosophy existence is no longer significant and for whom metaphysics becomes the science of essences. One may recall here that Suárez identifies being insofar as it is real being, but includes both actual and merely possible being in real being. Gilson thinks, furthermore, that this essentialism gives Suárez a pivotal role in history, albeit a malignant one, since essentialism leads to a variety of further philosophical ills.
Suárez’s conception of metaphysics figures in this story, but so does his account of the distinction between esse (“being,” meaning here actual existence) and essentia (“essence,” meaning here an individual nature), a matter related to a variety of issues regarding necessary versus contingent existence, eternal truths, the possibility of Aristotelian science about contingent things, and so forth. The usual Thomist view—how precisely to understand Thomas himself is a matter of some controversy—is that there is an actual or real distinction between essentia and esse. Or, rather, there is such a distinction for created things, which exist contingently. God, however, exists necessarily and from himself (a se); in God there is no distinction between essentia and esse.
Suárez, however, rejects a real distinction between esse and essentia and, furthermore, rejects a modal distinction. This is, in part, because of his understanding of real and modal distinctions: a real distinction would suggest that an essentia could exist without esse and esse without essentia, and a modal distinction would suggest at least the former (one source of confusion in these discussions is that a Thomist real distinction is probably not the same as a Suárezian real distinction). There were some who were willing to bite one or both of those bullets, but Suárez argues at length for their unacceptability. On Suárez’s view, then, even in created beings there is only a distinction of reason between esse and essentia. Since he is committed to the Christian doctrine of creation ex nihilo, the consequence is that an uncreated essentia is absolutely nihil, while, as expected, in a created essentia its essentia and esse are really the same, albeit conceptually distinct.
Much more would need to be said, and has been said by various scholars, to establish how significant this Suárezian claim is especially with respect to Aquinas’s position or even whether it is significant at all. Inter-school polemics and differing terminologies have resulted in more heat than light on this issue.
d. Efficient and Final Causation
Suárez’s extraordinarily detailed explication of the four kinds of Aristotelian causes—material, formal, efficient, and final—has received increasing attention in the early 21st century, perhaps in part because seven of the relevant disputations have finally been published in English translation. The resulting scholarly discussions have often been tied up with questions about Suárez’s place in the history of philosophy. Is he a loyal member of the medieval guild or is he setting the stage for mechanism or modernity? Or, perhaps both? On one reading of his account of formal causation, Suárez is the tragic hero making a valiant attempt to defend substantial forms, but in the course of doing so he alters the conception of substantial forms from the traditional model, thereby inadvertently making substantial forms more susceptible to mechanist critique and dismissal. If so, then he is a loyal member of the medieval guild and yet sets the stage for the modern mechanical philosophy. Not all scholars think it is so, however; some think he actually offers remarkably persuasive arguments on behalf of a more or less traditional conception of substantial forms, arguments to which the early modern mechanists would have done well to pay more attention.
Similar issues arise with Suárez’s account of final causality and its relationship to efficient causality. Ends are that for the sake of which an agent acts, as good health is the end for the sake of which a doctor prescribes medicine and finding small invertebrates to eat is the end for the sake of which curlews push their long curved bills into mud. Aristotle—and Aquinas—famously take ends to be a kind of cause, namely, final causes. Appeal to final causes is essential for offering complete explanations. In fact, Aquinas goes so far as to say that all the other kinds of causation, including efficient causation, presuppose final causation. Without final causation there would be no efficient causation on his view. Some scholars, however, have argued that Suárez departs from Aquinas on this score and prioritizes efficient causation, perhaps even reducing final causation to efficient causation. If so, this would make Suárez look like an intermediate between Aquinas’s position and the widespread dismissal of final causation in early modern philosophy.
At first glance, one might think Suárez straightforwardly endorses a traditional picture. He divides his discussion of causation according to the Aristotelian fourfold classification, explicitly defends the status of all four causes as real causes (DM 12.3), and, most importantly, defends at length the claim that ends are real causes (DM 23.1) and argues that final causation is present in the actions of God, rational created agents, and natural agents (that is, non-rational agents such as cows and oak trees).
But a closer look reveals some grounds for those wishing to argue that Suárez emphasizes efficient causation at the expense of final causation. First, he explicitly states that the definition of “cause” applies most properly to efficient causes (DM 12.3.3). Second, when talking about efficient causation he uses the term “real motion,” but when talking about final causation he uses the term “metaphorical motion.” Third, final causality depends on efficient causality, since an end is an actual final cause only if an efficient cause acts on its behalf. Fourth, an end is a final cause only if cognized by a rational agent (see DM 23.7 and 23.10.6); this stands in contrast with Aristotle’s confidence in final causation without the thought and intention of a rational agent. Besides, Suárez devotes far more pages to efficient causation than to final causation.
Nonetheless, scholars who wish to attribute a more traditional view to Suárez can also find support from a closer look at Suárez’s text. Taking the previous paragraph’s points in turn, one may first note that the term “cause” most properly applying to efficient causes is entirely compatible with the term properly applying to final causes, and that the significance of saying that the term applies most properly in one case but not the other is not immediately obvious. Second, it is true that Suárez uses the term “metaphorical motion” when describing the motion of final causes, but he is simply following well-entrenched terminological practice. Also, when pressed, he explicitly denies that metaphorical motion is so-called because it fails to be real motion (DM 23.1.14). Third, on Suárez’s view, actual final causation does seem to depend on efficient causation, but the converse is true as well. He grants Aquinas’s point that efficient causation presupposes final causation, that efficient causes would not act were they not to have ends for the sake of which to act. At the very least, there seems to be a sort of mutual dependence. In some passages, Suárez appears also to endorse the priority of final causation, though whether his view licenses that conclusion is a more complicated matter.
The fourth issue cannot be fully addressed without drawing in a number of other philosophical issues. One may briefly note, however, that, while Suárez does demand that ends be cognized in order to final-cause, he thinks this condition is satisfied even in the case of natural agents. This is a result of his concurrentism, according to which all actions of created things also have God as a concurring agent. That is, one and the same action has two agents, at least one of which is a rational agent. Of course, this account leaves final causation in the natural realm dependent on final causation in the divine realm. But final causation in the latter realm is not unproblematic. A central scholastic assumption, which Suárez shares, is that God is never subject to causation. So how can a final cause move God? And if it cannot, then how can natural actions inherit final causes from God? Suárez is well aware of this problem (DM 23.9.1). His response is to concede that there is no final causality in the case of God’s immanent actions, but that there is no problem with saying that God’s transeunt actions, that is, actions not located in God, have final causes. Whether this answer can be made to work in light of the details of his account of metaphorical motion in DM 23.4 is a further matter. With respect to the fourth issue, there is also a historical question whether the cognition requirement represents a change just from Aristotle or also a change from Aquinas.
These questions about how to fit Suárez’s account of causation into a broader history exemplify a common approach to Suárez. His place in time ensures that it is always tempting to read him as a transitional figure, as standing between the medieval view—where the “medieval view” typically means the view of Aquinas—and the views of the early modern mechanists. Consequently, a strand running through much Suárez scholarship concerns whether he in fact holds transitional views or not.
e. Existence of God
In DM 28, Suárez argues that the best primary division of being is into infinite and finite being, a division he considers equivalent to a number of other divisions including between necessary and contingent being, essential and participated being, and uncreated and created being. It is worth noting, however, that he does not take the term “being” to be used univocally when predicated of both infinite and finite being (DM 28.3). Nor does he go to the opposite extreme and consider it equivocal. Rather, he argues that “being” is used analogously in this case in virtue of the intrinsic characters of both infinite being and finite being.
As Suárez notes, the arguments of DM 28, assuming they work, already go a long way towards establishing the existence of God, since they purport to show that there must be some uncreated being. He devotes an entire disputation, however, to the question of God’s existence. His goal in DM 29 is to prove by natural reason, without any appeal to special revelation, that God exists, a goal that he thinks can be achieved.
His optimism about the possibility of demonstrating that God exists does not result in an uncritical attitude to previous efforts to do so. He rejects, for example, versions of the ontological argument that claim God’s existence to be evident from the fact that necessarily existing is part of what it means to be God (De Deo uno et trino 184.108.40.206). Of course, so did Aquinas. Perhaps more surprising, given Suárez’s debt to Aquinas, is that he also rejects the cosmological argument from motion made by Aristotle and made famous as Aquinas’s first way (Summa theologiae Ia.2.3). This argument starts from the motion or change that we observe, claims that whatever is moved is moved by another, but that there cannot be an infinite chain of moved movers, and so concludes that there must be an unmoved mover at the foundation. A key reason for Suárez to worry about this argument is that he not only thinks the status of the Aristotelian principle that whatever is moved is moved by another uncertain, he thinks that we ourselves provide counterexamples via our free actions. Consequently, he thinks the physical cosmological argument (“physical” because motion pertains to physics) relies on a false premise.
Instead, he turns to a metaphysical version of the cosmological argument (“metaphysical” because being is the object of metaphysics). This argument starts from the observation that there are things that exist, notes that every being either is made by something else or is not (that is, is created or is uncreated), argues that not every being can be made by another being, and concludes that there must be some being that is uncreated (DM 29.1.20-40). The alternatives to the claim that not every being can be made by another being would be either that there is an infinite chain of beings, each made by a prior being, or that there is a circle of beings, each making the next one in the circle. Suárez argues that these alternatives are impossible.
Long before Hume, Suárez recognizes that this cosmological argument hardly suffices to show that there is an uncreated being that merits being called God. Multiple worries might be raised, but Suárez focuses on the observation that for all that the cosmological argument shows, there might be many uncreated beings making other beings. In response, he moves to the next stage of his argument and enlists the aid of teleological arguments, arguing that attending to the order, structure, and beauty of the world shows that there is only one uncreated being (DM 29.2). He considers a variety of objections, ranging from the claim that the order only indicates at most that there is one governor of the world to the possibility of the world having been created and governed by a committee of uncreated beings working in consensus to the possibility that our world is only one of many worlds, each with its own uncreated creator. Suárez argues that some of these objections fail, but he concedes that the teleological or a posteriori argument he is considering cannot show that there are not other worlds with their own creators.
For the final stage, then, he turns to what he calls an a priori argument (DM 29.3). Strictly speaking, there can be no a priori arguments for God’s existence on the scholastic understanding of a priori arguments. For such arguments are arguments from causes to effects and God has no causes. Suárez accepts this point, but suggests that once we have an a posteriori demonstration of a divine attribute, it is possible to demonstrate a priori further attributes from that attribute (cf. the aforementioned example of using God’s perfection to demonstrate God’s unity. Suárez then proposes to demonstrate that there can be only one uncreated being from an uncreated being’s existing necessarily and a se (from itself). The resulting stretch of arguments is complex and relies on premises whose truth is not always obvious. Suárez himself is modest about the force of the argument, granting at the start that the proposed project is difficult and noting at the end that not all of the steps are immune to evasions. He does, however, think that the whole argument taken together will have some persuasive force for a reader who is not obstinate.
f. Categories and Genera
Thanks to the Aristotelian legacy, category theory was a prominent feature of scholastic philosophical discussions. Aristotle famously enumerated ten categories but left it unclear what the justification was for listing ten rather than fewer or more categories. A project that occasioned significant interest among medieval philosophers, then, was to provide the argument that would establish ten and only ten categories; such arguments were called sufficientiae. Deference to Aristotle was not universal, however, and so other philosophers argued that there are fewer than ten categories. There was also disagreement about what the categories are classifying. Extramental objects? Words? Concepts?
In these discussions, the terms “categories” (“praedicamenta”) and “highest genera” (“generalissima” or “suprema genera”) are often used interchangeably. At least some of the time, however, Suárez distinguishes between categories and genera and says that it is the business of logicians to deal with categories, since logic is concerned with the mind’s concepts, while it is the business of metaphysics to deal with the highest genera of beings, revealing their natures and essences (DM 39.pr.1). This suggests a view in which there is a kind of correspondence between the classification of concepts and the classification of extramental beings.
Be that as it may, Suárez qua metaphysician devotes the bulk of the second half of DM to dividing finite being (God falls outside the scope of this division) into the ten highest genera and discussing each genus in turn. Substance, of course, occupies a special role in Aristotelianism, and so Suárez first divides finite being into substance and accident and discusses substance at some length. He then turns to a discussion of the division of accidents, that is, the remaining nine genera on Aristotle’s view.
The first question he considers is whether nine genera of accidents—or ten genera in total—is too many (DM 39.1). He ends up affirming Aristotle’s number but gives a somewhat deflationary spin. He concedes that a variety of intermediate genera can be devised: real accidents versus accidents that are mere modes, absolute accidents versus respective accidents, and so forth. This concession raises questions about the significance of Aristotle’s ten genera, if they are not the most basic or immediate divisions. Suárez, however, thinks Aristotle’s division is nonetheless “most apt.”
The second question concerns the sufficiency of the nine genera of accidents (DM 39.2). Suárez divides this into two issues: (i) are there genera beyond these nine? and (ii) are all nine genera distinct from each other? As usual, Suárez has great respect for his philosophical forebears and says that it would be “rash” to doubt Aristotle’s number. That said, when he discusses the sufficientiae of Aquinas and Scotus, he is obviously dissatisfied. He concludes that a proper a priori demonstration of the sufficiency of the ten highest genera cannot be given. This, he claims, should be no surprise, since a science presupposes its subject rather than demonstrating it.
But what sort of distinction is there between the genera? One would be surprised to find that a given bird belongs to two different genera, say, Ara and Tangara. Similarly, one might be surprised to find that Aristotle’s genera overlap or even coincide entirely. Yet Suárez quickly rejects the view that there is always a real distinction between items belonging to two or more of the highest genera. He is more sympathetic to the view that there is a modal distinction. There are, however, cases that keep him from accepting that view as well.
Relations, the fourth highest genus, are of special concern. There is evidence that at one point in his career Suárez took relations to be modally distinct from their foundations. It is also a view to which he gives more time and attention when he gives an explicit treatment of relations in DM 47, though ultimately he rejects the view in that disputation. Instead, he concludes that relations are only distinct in reason from their foundations. For example, if Socrates and Plato are similar to each other in virtue of each being white, then the foundation for Socrates’s relation of similarity to Plato is Socrates’s whiteness. On Suárez’s mature view, Socrates’s similarity relation is neither really nor modally distinct from Socrates’s whiteness. The relation and quality are only conceptually distinct. There is a persuasive reason for such a reductionist account of relations. If God creates a world with nothing but substances and absolute qualities, it seems the relations would ipso facto follow. No separate creative act would be needed to ensure that white Socrates and white Plato were similar.
Consequently, Suárez concludes that a distinction of reason suffices for a separate highest genus (DM 39.2.22 and 47.2.22). Sometimes there in fact is a real distinction. Suárez thinks items in the second and third genera, quality and quantity, are really distinct from substance and from each other. In the remainder of the cases, however, there is either only a modal distinction or only a distinction of reason. He does stress that the distinction of reason needs to be one with a foundation in reality, which raises challenging questions about what that foundation is. The standard example of distinctions of reason with a foundation in reason in scholastic philosophy is the distinction between God’s attributes. That example may have been dialectically effective insofar as it was widely accepted, but it is not thereby an illuminating example. In the case of action and passion, two genera only distinct in reason, Suárez seems to suggest that the foundation in reality can be comparisons to extrinsic things. He says that action is distinct from passion insofar as action is compared to the principle that acts and passion to the principle that undergoes (DM 39.2.23).
It is worth noting in passing that Suárez thinks “being” is used analogically across the nine highest genera of accidents (DM 39.2.3). Consequently, one of the key texts relevant to the controversies about Suárez’s doctrine of the analogy of being is found in his discussion of the division of accidental being.
g. Beings of Reason
A moment’s reflection shows that we not only think and talk about existent objects such as stars and oak trees, we also think and talk about non-existent objects and even objects that could not exist, such as square circles or goat-stags. But, to use one of Suárez’s examples, what is one talking about if one says that two chimeras are similar but that goat-stags and chimeras are different? Ordinarily one might think that propositions are made true by beings. The proposition that many oaks have lobate leaves is made true by the many real oak trees with lobate leaves. But what makes the proposition that goat-stags and chimeras are different true? Besides, how can a thought be directed at one non-existent object rather than another?
Suárez calls such objects of thought “beings of reason,” and he ends DM with a disputation devoted to them (DM 54). The inclusion of this disputation might come as a surprise, given the systematic nature of the work and given that Suárez has carefully defined the object of metaphysics as “real being.” Well aware of his earlier definition, Suárez opens DM 54 with a prologue defending the treatment of beings of reason. Given that our thought inevitably involves beings of reason, someone needs to give an account of them. Suárez thinks the metaphysician is best suited to the task, since beings of reason are “shadows of being” and consequently should be treated in analogy to real being. Since real being is metaphysics’ object, metaphysicians are well-positioned to give an account of beings of reason also. Suárez’s is a controversial claim; some scholastics thought beings of reason the logician’s domain. Note, too, that the analogy between real being and being of reason is a rather weak one. Not only do the analogates not fall under any unitary concept, but beings of reason do not even have in themselves anything proportional to real beings (beings of reason have nothing in themselves). Suárez, however, points out that beings of reason are thought of as having a proportion to real beings, and insists that is sufficient for a kind of analogy of proportionality (DM 54.1.10).
As is his wont, Suárez attempts to thread a middle course. There are those who deny that there are beings of reason or that beings of reason are needed in order to teach about or conceive of real beings. On the other side are those who grant beings of reason and, furthermore, claim that there is a single concept of being that includes both real beings and beings of reason. Suárez’s own view is that there are beings of reason but that the “are” in that claim does not indicate the same thing as the “are” in the sentence “there are oak trees.” There is no single concept covering both real beings and beings of reason.
When first introducing his own view of beings of reason, Suárez characterizes them as “not true real beings, since they are not capable of true and real existence” (DM 54.1.4). It is worth noting the modal force in that characterization and recalling that for Suárez real being includes both actual and possible being. What Suárez has in mind when talking about beings of reason are things that cannot exist. That class turns out to be rather motley. Mythical beasts, negations, privations (for example, blindness), and even logical concepts such as genus and species are all beings of reason.
Suárez’s explicit definition comes two paragraphs later: “a being of reason is usually, and rightly, defined as that which has being only objectively in the intellect or as that which is thought by reason as a being even though it has no entity in itself” (DM 54.1.6; italics in the original). One issue in Suárez scholarship concerns whether the two disjuncts amount to equivalent definitions or not. If Suárez also thinks that it is possible to think of non-beings in the manner of non-beings, then it would look like there can be things that satisfy the first disjunct without satisfying the second disjunct. Another issue concerns how to understand the talk of being objectively in the intellect. On the traditional interpretation, Suárez’s view is that beings of reason have a peculiar mode of being, namely, as pure objects of thinking. Consequently, their being depends on minds actually thinking about them. That interpretation can and has been challenged, however, by a more eliminativist account that denies that “being only objectively in the intellect” is any sort of being at all. Rather, it just describes the state of affairs where an intellect has a contentful thought about something that simply fails to exist.
Most of the interest in Suárez’s account of beings of reason concerns his general characterization. DM 54, however, goes on to ask what sorts of causes, if any, beings of reason have and whether the traditional division of beings of reason into negations, privations, and relations of reason is right and sufficient. He answers that, rightly understood, it is.
Questions concerning beings of reason go back at least to the ancient Greek philosophers, but Suárez’s discussion is a landmark in its detail and systematicity. It also leaves some matters unclear, however, and of course other philosophers found things with which to disagree. The result was a train of similarly extended, sophisticated discussions of beings of reason after Suárez. Some offered what might be seen as developments of Suárez’s account, for example, Bartolomeo Mastri and Bonaventura Belluto, while others argues against Suárez and offered contrasting accounts, for example, Pedro Hurtado de Mendoza and John Punch.
h. Middle Knowledge, Grace, and Providence
As mentioned earlier, Suárez contributed to the raging debate about how to reconcile human free will with divine grace, foreknowledge, providence, and predestination that is known as the controversy De auxiliis. One of the developments for which he is best-known, albeit more in theological circles than philosophical circles, is a doctrine called Congruism. Suárez and Robert Bellarmine are the two Jesuits usually credited with formulating Congruism in detail.
To understand Congruism, it helps to step back and first look at the Molinism of which it is a species. A relatively straightforward way of reconciling human free will with the various theological doctrines in question is to provide a compatibilist account of free will, that is, an account of free will compatible with determinism. Luis de Molina, also a Jesuit, rejects that method, vigorously defending a libertarian account of free will. To be free means to be able to choose and able not to choose an option once all the prerequisites for acting have been posited. Related to this emphasis on libertarian freedom is the belief that the divine grace (whereby sinful humans can attain salvation) is not intrinsically efficacious. Rather, God’s grace is rendered efficacious by a human being’s free consent. These beliefs naturally raise questions about compatibility with traditional doctrines such as God’s foreknowledge and providential control. Molina famously proposes middle knowledge (scientia media) to show their compatibility. Middle knowledge—“middle” because it falls between the natural and free knowledge traditionally ascribed to God—is God’s prevolitional knowledge of what any possible free creature would do in any scenario. This ensures God’s foreknowledge, even of free actions, and allows God the appropriate providential control.
Suárez wholeheartedly agrees with Molina on the importance of libertarian freedom (DM 19.2-9). If, for example, God determines Peter to steal, then Peter cannot be held responsible for stealing. Suárez also agrees with the Molinist strategy of appealing to middle knowledge (De scientia Dei futurorum contingentium 2). There are, however, disagreements on this as well.
Molina argues that the reason God knows what creatures would freely do is because God’s infinitely surpassing the finite nature of creatures allows God to “super-comprehend” their natures, and thereby to know what they would do in given situations. Suárez, however, denies that any special explanation is needed for God’s middle knowledge. To know whether God can do something, we do not need to investigate God’s omnipotence. Rather, we merely need to establish that the thing is possible. Similarly, he thinks that to find out whether God can know something, we do not need to investigate God’s abilities. All we need to do is establish that the claim in question is true. If it is, then God’s omniscience ensures God’s knowledge of that claim. God knows propositions about what free creatures would do in the same way he knows any other proposition: by a simple intuition of its truth (De scientia Dei futurorum contingentium 1.8).
But Congruism’s main dispute with Molina concerns the reason for the efficaciousness of divine grace and the place of predestination. According to Molina, God bestows grace on, say, Mary and Martha, knowing that Mary will freely act so as to render the grace efficacious while Martha will not. Mary’s free acceptance is the sole extrinsic reason rendering the grace given to her efficacious, while Martha’s free failure to accept the grace is the sole extrinsic reason the grace given to her is sufficient rather than efficacious. Furthermore, God predestines Mary to salvation on the basis of his knowledge that she will freely accept his grace.
Suárez, however, attempts to carve out a position that is broadly Molinist but closer to the position of the Jesuits’ Thomist opponents. On his view, Mary’s free acceptance is not the only extrinsic reason rendering the grace efficacious. Nor does God predestine her to salvation on the basis of his middle knowledge. Rather, God antecedently elects some people to salvation but does not elect others. This election is gratuitous in the sense that it does not rest on God’s knowledge of any human merits. Having thus elected Mary, he then knows, thanks to his middle knowledge, what graces to bestow such that Mary will freely accept. If God had known that the grace given to Mary would not be such that Mary would freely accept it, then he would have given some other grace to her such that she would. In other words, the grace is efficacious not only because Mary freely accepts it, but also because of God’s antecedent decision to give whatever grace is needed to ensure Mary’s free acceptance, that is, his antecedent decision to give her a “congruous” grace (De concursu et auxilio Dei 3.14.9).
Suárez’s and Bellarmine’s Congruist version of Molinism was declared the official doctrine of the Jesuit order in 1613, supplanting Molina’s own version.
i. Natural Law and Obligation
A central question in the history of ethics goes back to Socrates in Plato’s Euthyphro: do the gods love the pious because it is pious or is it pious because the gods love it? Suárez directly addresses a variant of this question, albeit in a section whose title might not immediately reveal its philosophical significance: “Is the natural law truly a preceptive divine law?” (De legibus 2.6; henceforth, DL).
Scholastics customarily distinguish between natural and positive law. Explaining this distinction in neutral terms is made difficult by the widely varying theories of law given, but perhaps the central feature of natural law is an epistemological one. Natural law is law that is accessible to all human beings, regardless their access to some holy text or other special revelation. As Suárez puts it, natural law “is that law which sits within the human mind in order to distinguish the fine from the wicked” (DL 1.3.9 or 10, depending on edition). Other features often associated with natural law are universality (that is, applicability across times and places) and being grounded in nature rather than in an arbitrary will. Positive law, on the other hand, is in some sense arbitrary law that is added to natural law and that is not, in principle, accessible apart from special promulgation or communication. A paradigm example is a law that requires people to drive on the right-hand side of the road. One might well think the choice between that law and the law requiring people to drive on the left is arbitrary and one certainly cannot figure out which side of the road to drive on in a given country by introspecting. It is worth noting that Suárez recognizes two species of positive law: human and divine. In some contemporary discussions, positive law is characterized as human law and natural law as divine law. Understanding the terms in that way makes a hash of Suárez’s discussion, as well as those of other scholastics.
Now we can see why natural law is of special interest with respect to the question Socrates posed to Euthyphro. All scholastic theorists of law think that there are at least some cases where laws get their obligatory force solely from a legislator. That is what positive law is like, including divine positive law. A standard example is the ceremonial law of the Old Testament, which Christians thought obligatory in one time and place but not in another. The question is whether all law is like that. Natural law is, of course, the place to look if one is wondering if there are obligations that are not grounded in a superior’s command or prohibition.
Suárez stresses that the question to be asked is whether natural law is divine law in the sense that it is grounded in God qua legislator. He deems it entirely obvious that God is the cause of natural law in some sense, since God is the creator of everything, including any nature in which natural law might be grounded (DL 2.6.2). But even if God is the cause in that sense, there is still the question whether created nature already indicates what ought to be done and what ought to be avoided or whether a further legislative act prescribing or forbidding actions is needed. Suárez calls law in the former sense indicative law and law in the latter sense preceptive law.
One position is extreme naturalism or intellectualism, which Suárez attributes to Gregory of Rimini and several others (DL 2.6.3). On this view, no legislative act on God’s part is needed. Rather, natural law simply indicates what should be done or not done on the basis of what is intrinsically good or bad. Loss of life, for example, is bad: murdering King Duncan deprives him of life, and so Macbeth ought not to stab Duncan. On the extreme naturalism espoused by Gregory, Macbeth’s duty not to murder Duncan would obtain even if God had not given the Ten Commandments and even if God had not existed at all.
On the other side is an extreme voluntarism that says that natural law consists entirely in a command or prohibition coming from God’s will, a view that Suárez attributes to William of Ockham (DL 2.6.4). On this view, what one ought or ought not to do is wholly determined by God’s legislative acts and, furthermore, God’s legislative acts are unconstrained. That is, there is no act that is intrinsically bad such that God is compelled to prohibit it or even prevented from commanding it and no act that is intrinsically good such that God is compelled to command it. Had God commanded us to murder and steal, then doing so would have been obligatory and good.
Characteristically, Suárez charts a middle course. He first agrees with the extreme voluntarists that natural law is genuinely preceptive law, and argues that for a law to be genuine law and not just law in name it must be grounded in the legislative act of a superior (DL 2.6.5-10). The obligatory force of natural law comes from God’s will. Contra Gregory of Rimini, that obligation would not be present had God not legislated or not existed at all.
But then comes the crucial qualification that ends Suárez’s agreement with extreme voluntarism: “Second, I say that this will of God—that is, this prohibition or precept—is not the whole reason for the goodness and badness that is found in observing or transgressing the natural law, but that the natural law presupposes in the acts themselves a certain necessary fineness or wickedness and adjoins to these a special obligation of divine law” (DL 2.6.11). The extreme voluntarist thinks that God is free to command as he wishes, unconstrained by the natures of things. Suárez, on the other hand, thinks that God’s commands and prohibitions are constrained by natural goodness and badness. As befits a perfect being, God prohibits some actions precisely because they are evil. Suárez thinks it absurd to suggest that there are no actions such that they are too evil for God to command or even just to permit. To this extent, then, Suárez agrees with the naturalist; the obligations of natural law are rooted in natural goodness and badness.
That Suárez attempts to chart a middle course of this sort is uncontroversial. There are, however, controversies about how much Suárez allows on the natural, pre-legislative side, as well as how what is allowed on the natural side relates to the “special obligation” resulting from God’s legislative acts. On one interpretation, Suárez’s account is incoherent, because he gives a voluntarist account of obligation and yet grants that performing an action naturally bad is sufficient for blameworthiness. Since being blameworthy requires violating an obligation, Suárez is thereby implicitly committed to saying that natural badness is sufficient to give rise to obligations. But this contradicts his voluntarist account of obligation. One way to avoid the charge of incoherence would be to understand Suárez as giving a voluntarist account of the “special obligation” imposed by natural law, and understanding that obligation as an additional obligation. In other words, the natural goodness and badness intrinsic to actions is sufficient to give rise to one sort of obligation and consequently sufficient to make agents who observe the obligations praiseworthy and agents who violate them blameworthy. Natural law then adds a further obligation to that natural obligation in the same way that human legislators might add further obligation by prohibiting what is already morally prohibited. As Suárez notes, there is nothing incoherent about adding one obligation to another (DL 2.6.12).
Noting that Suárez uses both the terms “duties” (“debita”) and “obligations” (“obligationes”), an alternative strategy is to interpret him as giving a voluntarist account of all obligation while granting that natural goodness and badness give rise to duties. In other words, natural goodness and badness would be sufficient to give rational agents duties to act in certain ways and not in other ways, but none of this would count as genuine obligation. Obligation, on this view, is a peculiar sort of force that arises from someone with legitimate authority issuing a command or prohibition to some subject to that authority. A task for defenders of this interpretation is to spell out what duties and obligations are, such that being subject to a duty is not sufficient for being under obligation.
j. Political Authority
One could hold the view that what gives some individuals political power over other people is that God bestowed such authority on them directly. Suárez rejects that view. He insists that men are by nature free and subject to no one (DL 3.1.1). (I shall use the term “men” in this section, since Suárez does not grant the same natural liberty to women and children. See DL 3.2.3.) Europeans had, of course, stumbled into the Americas shortly before Suárez’s time and so one of the questions that exercised his contemporaries concerned the standing of Native Americans, especially in light of Aristotle’s infamous claim that some human beings are natural slaves. Suárez has no use for the suggestion that Native Americans are natural slaves. Men are naturally disposed to be free and being free is one of their perfections; suggesting that all the people in some region or other happen to have been born “monsters,” that is, with defective natures, is incredible.
Suárez does, however, think that some rulers have legitimate authority over men. Where does that authority come from? The short answer is that political communities are needed and so men consent to join together in such communities, and in a political community the power to govern and to look after the common good of the community must be vested in an authority. Suárez gives two primary reasons why political communities are needed (DL 3.1.3). First, he agrees with Aristotle that human beings are social animals that desire to live in community. The most natural community is a family, but this is an imperfect community, insufficient to include within it all the skills and knowledge needed for life. Consequently, multiple families need to join together in a perfect (that is, complete) community. Second, anticipating Hobbes’ famous point, Suárez notes that individual families not joined together in a political community would be unlikely to remain at peace and would have no means of averting or avenging wrongs (see also Defensio fidei catholicae 3.1.4).
A lively question in Suárez’s day was whether human beings in the state of innocence would have lived in political communities or whether such communities only became necessary after the Fall with its introduction of sin. The second reason given above, in particular, would not seem to apply in the state of innocence. Suárez, however, is confident that political communities would have formed even in the state of innocence, had it continued (De opere sex dierum 5.7). Human beings are social animals, whether in the state of innocence or not. Furthermore, Suárez thinks that even in the state of innocence some people would surpass others in virtue and knowledge. So even though joining together in a political community might not be necessary for mere survival in that state, it would, nonetheless, be most useful for the sharing of knowledge and for encouragement to greater virtue.
That political community requires some authority to govern it Suárez takes as well-nigh self-evident (DL 3.1.4-5). He does note, however, that one reason a governing authority is needed is because each individual of a political community looks after his or her own good. Individuals’ goods, however, sometimes conflict with the common good. Consequently, a government looking after the common good is needed. Following Aristotle, Suárez thinks that a monarchy best fills the role of governing authority (DL 3.4.1). He does not think that monarchy is dictated by natural law, however, and grants that other forms of government, including democracy, may be “good and useful.” Which form of government to adopt is left to human choice.
A political community does not result merely from a group of families living in proximity, even if they consequently become familiar friends. The formation of a political union requires an “explicit or tacit pact” to help each other and a subordination of the families and individuals to some governing authority (De opere sex dierum 5.7.3; cf. DL 3.2.4). The details of how this works are subject to scholarly dispute. Some commentators argue that on Suárez’s view, the community’s consent creates a political community but does not directly cause obligation to a political authority. Others argue that that the consent does directly cause the obligation and authority.
An important feature of Suárez’s view is that political power does not just reside in the community initially. It always remains there. As he puts it, “after that power has been transferred to some individual person, even if it has been passed on to a number of people through various successions or elections, it is still always regarded as possessed immediately by the community” (DL 3.4.8). Suárez is, of course, aware that the needed stability of political communities would be in question if communities could withdraw their transfer of power to the government at every whim. So even though in some sense the power always remains in the community, Suárez argues that the transferred power may not ordinarily be withdrawn (DL 3.4.6). Suárez recognizes exceptions, however. Should the government become tyrannical, the door may be opened to legitimate revolt and even tyrannicide (Defensio fidei catholicae 6.4 and De charitate 13.8). This is the doctrine that gained Suárez the ire of James I of England.
Although largely unknown among non-specialists (at least in Anglo-American philosophy), Suárez’s influence has never been in doubt among historians of early modern philosophy. There are difficulties with establishing the extent of his influence. First, many of the canonical early modern figures seldom cite their sources. Descartes is perhaps best-known for this, but citations are hardly abundant in any of the other extrascholastic early moderns such as Spinoza, Malebranche, and Locke. The absence of citations is, of course, especially striking in comparison to the texts of Suárez and his fellow scholastics, which are replete with them. Second, encountering an idea or term in a modern text that looks very much like something in Suárez is insufficient to establish Suárezian influence, since there were hundreds of other scholastic theologians and philosophers, many of them also quite influential and many, especially Suárez’s Jesuit confrères, saying things more or less similar to what Suárez is saying and making use of the same terms and distinctions standard in scholastic circles.
Consequently, there is substantial debate about just how indebted Descartes, for example, is to Suárez. Some historians emphasize that his philosophical formation would have occurred in his education at the Jesuit La Flèche and that he himself writes in a letter that the first seeds of everything he learned came from the Jesuits. Other historians, however, point out that in a different letter he claims to remember only two Jesuits, Antoñio Rubio and Francisco de Toledo, and that he generally does seem to have been a very attentive reader.
However much uncertainty there may be about the extent of Suárez’s influence, it is certain that Hobbes, Descartes, Malebranche, Leibniz, and Berkeley all mention Suárez explicitly at least once and say a variety of things that might well be thought to borrow from or be inspired by Suárez. Wolff, too, cites Suárez and thought highly of him, to the extent that Wolff has been characterized as begotten of Suárez. Insofar as there is a path from Wolff to Kant, there might, then, reasonably be thought a path from Suárez to Kant as well.
The story of influence just told is the one most frequently encountered. It omits, however, Suárez’s main influence. Due to the vagaries of academic fashion and dubious historiographies, large swaths of early modern philosophy receive virtually no attention today. Yet Suárez was most influential in these neglected realms, which saw the rise of a Suárezian school of philosophy.
Suárez and Gabriel Vasquez were seen as rival fathers of Jesuit theology and philosophy, leading to near endless discussion of Suárez’s views by early modern Jesuits. Pedro Hurtado de Mendoza and Rodrigo de Arriaga, for example, discuss Suárez extensively in their own work (in fact, they are sometimes treated as faithful Suárezians, although that is a mistake). It must be remembered, too, that the Jesuits were active worldwide, leading to a remarkably wide dissemination of Suárez’s views. His influence was perhaps most profound in the early modern universities of Latin America, but Jesuit missionaries also spread his work to Africa and Asia, even starting a Chinese translation of DM in the seventeenth-century.
Outside the Jesuit order, Suárez’s stature in Scotism—at its height in early modern Europe—is also striking. Texts by Scotist authors often include frequent and detailed discussion of Suárez’s views. His influence even transcended the main religious division of modern Western Europe. Protestant scholastics such as Francis Turretin and David Hollaz, departing from Luther’s contempt for scholasticism, borrowed freely from Suárez. Suárez is sometimes described as providing the received metaphysics for seventeenth-century Lutheran universities.
Contemporary readers usually come to Suárez via the canonical early modern philosophers such as Descartes and Leibniz, but noting these additional lines of influence does two things. In the first place, it helps provide a more accurate picture of the extent of Suárez’s influence. But, second, it also gives some indication of how many philosophers and theologians identified in Suárez a thinker of the highest caliber, with whose work it was worth engaging at length.
5. References and Further Reading
a. Primary Sources
- Suárez, Francisco. Opera omnia. Paris: Louis Vivès, 1856-78.
- This standard edition is the most readily available, including freely online. It is not, however, a critical edition and does not include quite all of Suárez’s works. All major philosophical works are included. No English translation of a complete work has been published. Significant portions of some works, especially Disputationes metaphysicae (DM), have been published, however, and additional translations in various stages of polish are available online.
b. Secondary Sources
This abbreviated bibliography focuses on English works published in the last several years.
- Doyle, John P. Collected Studies on Francisco Suárez, S. J. (1548-1617). Edited by Victor M. Salas. Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2010.
- Doyle has perhaps done more than anyone else for Suárez studies in the U.S.A. This is a collection of essays drawn from forty years of work. The theme that receives the most attention is Suárez’s conception of metaphysics and being, but the volume also includes several papers on Suárez’s account of law and human rights.
- Fichter, Joseph H. Man of Spain: Francis Suárez. New York: MacMillan, 1940.
- Still the standard English biography of Suárez, although it is rather hagiographical by contemporary standards.
- Freddoso, Alfred J. “God’s General Concurrence with Secondary Causes: Why Conservation Is Not Enough.” Philosophical Perspectives 5 (1991): 553-85.
- A superb account of Suárez’s arguments in DM 22 against mere conservationism, that is, his arguments for God’s constant concurrence with the actions of created things.
- Freddoso, Alfred J. “Introduction: Suárez on Metaphysical Inquiry, Efficient Causality, and Divine Action.” On Creation, Conservation, and Concurrence: Metaphysical Disputations 20-22, xi-cxxi. By Francisco Suárez. South Bend: St. Augustine’s Press, 2002.
- The focus is on Suárez’s account of creation, conservation, and concurrence, but the incisive introduction to Suárez’s metaphysics in general and account of efficient causation more particularly makes this an especially valuable essay.
- Gracia, Jorge J. E. “Suárez’s Conception of Metaphysics: A Step in the Direction of Mentalism?” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 65.3 (1991): 287-309.
- Argues for a realist interpretation of Suárez’s account of metaphysics.
- Gracia, Jorge J. E. “Francisco Suárez: The Man in History.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 65.3 (1991): 259-66.
- A brief, accessible introduction to Suárez, setting him in his historical context.
- Heider, Daniel. Universals in Second Scholasticism: A Comparative Study with Focus on the Theories of Francisco Suárez S. J. (1548-1617), Joao Poinsot O. P. (1589-1644), and Bartolomeo Mastri da Meldola O. F. M. Conv. (1602-1673)/Bonaventura Belluto O. F. M. Conv. (1600-1676). New York: John Benjamins Publishing Company, 2014.
- The title is an accurate guide. Exemplary historical scholarship, but challenging reading for those unfamiliar with scholastic terminology.
- Hill, Benjamin, and Henrik Lagerlund, eds. The Philosophy of Francisco Suárez. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2012.
- One of the first volumes that a student of Suárez should turn to; includes papers on a variety of topics.
- Novotný, Daniel D. Ens rationis from Suárez to Caramuel: A Study in Scholasticism of the Baroque Era. New York: Fordham University Press, 2013.
- A fine study of Suárez’s account of beings of reason, followed by discussions of the accounts offered subsequently by Hurtado, Mastri/Belluto, and Caramuel. Novotný’s work is marked by both erudite historical scholarship and keen philosophical analysis.
- Penner, Sydney. “Suárez on the Reduction of Categorical Relations.” Philosophers’ Imprint 13 (2013): 1-24.
- Argues that Suárez gives a realist but reductionist account of relations, albeit with some problematic results.
- Perler, Dominik. “Suárez on Consciousness.” Vivarium 52.3-4 (2014): 261-86.
- An illuminating examination of Suárez’s account of our access to our own acts of perception and thinking. Looks at his distinction between first-order sensory consciousness and second-order intellectual consciousness, as well as what explains the unity of consciousness.
- Salas, Victor and Robert Fastiggi, eds. A Companion to Francisco Suárez. Brill’s Companions to the Christian Tradition 53. Leiden: Brill, 2015.
- Covers a number of areas that are neglected by the Schwartz and Hill/Lagerlund collections.
- Schwartz, Daniel, ed. Interpreting Suárez: Critical Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
- An excellent set of essays on Suárez, treating a selection of key topics.
- Shields, Christopher. “Virtual Presence: Psychic Mereology in Francisco Suárez.” In Partitioning the Soul: Ancient, Medieval, and Early Modern Debates, edited by K. Corcilius and D. Perler, 199-219. Berlin: W. de Gruyter, 2014.
- Examines Suárez’s account of the soul and its parts and what the talk of parts comes to.
- Shields, Christopher and Daniel Schwartz. “Francisco Suárez.” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Edward N. Zalta. 2014. Accessed 30 Mar. 2015.
- A fine survey of Suárez’s life and philosophy that covers some topics neglected in the present entry.
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