British Empiricism

 ‘British Empiricism’ is a name traditionally used to pick out a group of eighteenth-century thinkers who prioritised knowledge via the senses over reason or the intellect and who denied the existence of innate ideas. The name includes most notably John Locke, George Berkeley, and David Hume. The counterpart to British Empiricism is traditionally considered to be Continental Rationalism that was advocated by Descartes, Spinoza, and Leibniz, all of whom lived in Continental Europe beyond the British Isles and all embraced innate ideas. This article characterizes empiricists more broadly as those thinkers who accept Locke’s Axiom that there is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience. It includes British-Irish Philosophy from the seventeenth, eighteenth, and nineteenth century. As well as exploring the traditional connections among empiricism and metaphysics and epistemology, it examines how British empiricists dealt with issues in moral philosophy and the existence and nature of God. The article identifies some challenges to the standard understanding of British Empiricism by including early modern thinkers from typically marginalised groups, especially women. Finally, in showing that there is nothing uniquely British about being an empiricist, it examines a particular case study of the eighteenth-century philosopher Anton Wilhelm Amo, the first African to receive a doctorate in Europe.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Historiography
  2. The Origins of Empiricism
    1. Precursors to Locke
    2. Locke
  3. Our Knowledge of the External World and Causation
    1. Berkeley on the Nature of the External World
    2. Hume on the Nature of Causation
    3. Shepherd on Berkeley and Hume
  4. Morality
    1. Hutcheson and the Moral Sense
    2. Hume on Taste and the Moral Sense
    3. Newcome on Pain, Pleasure, and Morality
  5. God and Free-Thinking
    1. Anthony Collins
    2. John Toland
    3. George Berkeley
  6. Anton Wilhelm Amo: A Case Study in the Limits of British Empiricism
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

This article is called ‘British Empiricism’, but it could just as accurately have been titled ‘British-Irish Philosophy from the seventeenth to the nineteenth century and the Lockean Axiom’. The article focuses on the commitment to the Lockean version of the Peripatetic axiom that is shared by many British and Irish thinkers in the seventeenth, eighteenth, and nineteenth centuries. Following John Locke (1632–1704), virtually all the empiricist thinkers considered in this article accept that “nothing is in the intellect that was not first in the senses” (De veritate q. 2 a. 3 arg. 19), to use Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) phrasing of what is known as the Peripatetic Axiom (see Cranefield 1970 for more on the origin of the phrase).

While the shared acceptance of this axiom is a unifying feature for the thinkers considered in this article, it is worth starting off with some problematization of the term ‘British Empiricism’. The term ‘British’ here is used in a sense common in the early modern period which includes both what in the early twenty-first century was the United Kingdom of Great Britain and North Ireland and the Republic of Ireland—and thus includes thinkers such as the Ardagh-born John Toland (1670–1722) and the Kilkenny-born George Berkeley (1685-1753). The term ‘British’ here also excludes the many British colonies, meaning that this is not a global but is Western European. The term ‘empiricism’ considered here is neither exhaustive nor confined to ‘Britain’. In other words, this article does not discuss all British thinkers who are committed to the Peripatetic axiom. Nor do we claim that such a commitment only exists among British thinkers (see also section 6.1). We further problematize the term by discussing its historiography (section 1.1). This helps to explain why we chose to keep (and use) the term and how the issues and thinkers considered in this article were selected. After all, it is important to be transparent about the fact that an article like this, which focuses on a philosophical tradition, tells a particular story. This will inevitably involve choices by the authors that are shaped by factors like their own introduction to that tradition and which concern the protagonists and the content considered; both of which we outline below.

Section 2 considers the history of the Peripatetic axiom and Locke’s interpretation of it, which here is called the Lockean Axiom.

Lockean Axiom: There is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience.

Subsequent sections consider how this axiom, accepted in some form by all the thinkers below, was applied to a variety of questions. Section 3 discusses its application to our knowledge of the external world, focusing on George Berkeley (1685–1753), David Hume (1711–1776), and Mary Shepherd (1777–1847). Section 4 focuses on how the axiom influenced moral philosophy in the period, focusing on Hume, Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746), and Susanna Newcome (1685–1763). Section 5 examines the application of the axiom to our knowledge of God, and its focuses on Berkeley, Toland, and Anthony Collins (1676–1729). The final section (section 6) focuses on the limitations of the narrative developed here by considering the case of Anton Wilhelm Amo (c. 1703–1759). Amo is committed to a version of the Lockean Axiom and thus there is a strong reason to consider him within the narrative developed here. However, including Amo comes at the price of challenging the moniker ‘British’ and thus of another feature that determined the selection.

In other words, the purpose of including Amo is twofold. First, it highlights the limits of our narrative. Second, it points to the arbitrary nature of any historical narrative concerning ‘British Empiricism.’ This results from the fact, which we highlight in the next section, that (‘British’) ‘Empiricism’ is an external ascription applied by scholars to certain philosophers – and not a self-expression of a common identity these philosophers took themselves to have shared. In other words, it is an analyst’s category and not an actors’ one. As such, any narrative using this category is always, more or less explicitly, guided by the assumptions, interests, values, and goals of the scholar or analyst employing it. In an attempt to be as transparent as possible about these assumptions, as well as to bolster the case of our arbitrariness-claim, we consider the historiography of the term ‘empiricism’ in the next section. This will also serve to shed further light on the nature and scope of the narrative we develop here, and the ways in which it deviates from the standard narrative.

a. Historiography

A crucial thing to note about both the term ‘British Empiricism’ and what is traditionally thought of as its counterpart ‘Continental Rationalism’ is that they are both anachronisms in the previously introduced sense of being analysts’, and not actors’, categories. To put it differently, none of the thinkers considered in this article, nor thinkers like René Descartes (1596–1650), Baruch Spinoza (1632–1677), or Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646-1716), who are usually thought of as ‘rationalists,’ used these terms to describe themselves. These thinkers did not think of themselves as working in unified traditions that were opposed to each other. Take the case of Berkeley for instance: while Berkeley critically reacts to Descartes (for example, Letter 44), he is even more critical of Locke. As a case in point, consider his rejection of the existence of abstract ideas in the Introduction to A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge. In fact, we know of no place in Berkeley’s work where he would clearly suggest that he sees himself working in some sort of tandem with Locke, against the likes of Descartes or Leibniz. Leibniz even writes about Berkeley’s Principles that “[t]here is much here that is correct and close to my own view” (AG 307). At the same time Leibniz defends the notion of innate ideas against Locke (see New Essays, G VI), but he also has a critical attitude towards Cartesianism on a variety of issues (see, for example, Anfray 2019 for a concise overview). In summary, the interrelations between these various actors (Berkeley, Locke, Descartes, and Leibniz in this instance) are complex; and it would be a stretch to suggest they saw themselves in two opposing camps.

The fact that it is highly doubtful that ‘empiricists’ (and ‘rationalists’) perceived themselves as such is important. This raises the question of why it is still often taken to be the case that there are two antagonistic philosophical traditions in early modern Europe epitomized by, on the one hand, Descartes, Leibniz, and Spinoza, and Berkeley, Hume, and Locke on the other. What is more, there is evidence that the contrast between these traditions, as we know it today, was invented in the 1850’s by the German historian Kuno Fischer (1824–1907) (see Mercer 2020, 73; for more on the rise of these labels see also Loeb 2010, Norton 1981, Vanzo 2016).

However, despite its complicated history, and further potential challenges which we discuss towards the end of this section, we believe retaining the label ‘British Empiricism’ is fruitful as long as one is fully aware of the fact that it is an analyst’s category. Importantly, there needs to be transparency about the criteria that are used to group certain thinkers together. In our case, the group of thinkers considered here are all, with one exception, British or Irish in the previously outlined sense and share a commitment to the Lockean Axiom, that ‘there is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience’. This axiom was developed in response to the notion that humans possess innate ideas or innate knowledge (whether that be of mathematical/geometrical truths, or of God), which had previously been endorsed by Plato, was defended by thinkers like Descartes, later Cartesians such as Nicholas Malebranche (1638–1715), and Leibniz, in the seventeenth-century (for Locke’s metaphysics and epistemology, see, for example, Ayers 1991, Bennet 1971, Chappell 1992, Jolley 1999, Mackie 1976, Yolton 1956, Wilson 1999).

Locke, and subsequent thinkers who would go on to be characterised as empiricists, rejected this innatist notion. Indeed, it is standard to view responses to this question, of whether there are innate ideas in the human mind, as a central dividing line between empiricists and rationalists more generally. Thus, in an attempt to bridge the gap between the old standard narrative and new ways of speaking about the history of early modern philosophy, we keep this starting point, yet use it to tell a different story in terms of actors and issues considered. This we deem to be important because of exclusionary tendencies of the traditional early modern canon. By this we mean the fact that the voices of women and other marginalized groups were often systematically excluded when the early modern canon was formed (not to mention that many of the philosophers that became part of the canon have problematic views on issues pertaining sex, gender, class, race, or species) (see for example, O’Neill 1998; Conley 2006, Shapiro 2016; Hutton 2021; Lapointe and Heck 2023). Thus, it is crucial that any new narrative about ‘British Empiricism’ considers non-canonical (that is, traditionally underrepresented) thinkers as well. With that in mind, our decision to focus on the Lockean Axiom is significant because it allows us to integrate non-canonical thinkers such as Collins, Toland, Shepherd, or Newcombe alongside the traditional ‘big three’ of Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Additionally, focusing on this axiom enables us to consider a larger variety of issues compared to the standard narrative, which focuses primarily on our knowledge of the external world (covered in section 2). For, as will become evident in the subsequent sections, the interests of even Berkeley, Locke, and Hume go well beyond this epistemological issue and encompass, for example, theological and moral questions.

Yet, even if our narrative is more inclusive than the standard story, it is nonetheless important to note its limitations. In closing this section, we illustrate this point with the case of comparatively well-known British women philosophers from the early modern period who do not neatly fall into the category of ‘empiricism’ – either in our use of the term or in its more traditional sense.

It might seem obvious that an article focusing on the Lockean Axiom, as we have called it, does not discuss Margaret Cavendish (1623-1673). After all, Cavendish died over decade before the Essay was published. However, a comprehensive account of philosophy in early modern Britain cannot afford to neglect such a prolific writer. Over her lifetime, Cavendish wrote numerous philosophical treatises, plays, and poems, as well as novels (perhaps most famously The Blazing World in 1668). Yet, Cavendish, perhaps at this stage the most ‘canonical’ woman in early modern philosophy, does not fit neatly into either the ‘empiricist’ or ‘rationalist’ camp. She is critical of Descartes on several issues, including his views on the transfer of motion (which she rejects in favor of an account of self-motion as ubiquitous throughout nature) and his dualism (see her Observations upon Experimental Philosophy and Grounds of Natural Philosophy (both published in 1668); for discussion of Cavendish’s system of nature see Boyle 2017, Lascano 2023, Detlefsen 2006, Cunning 2016). But she is also committed to some (possibly weak) form of ‘innatism’ (discussed in section 2.2), whereby all parts of nature, including humans, have an innate knowledge of God’s existence. Note that (as discussed in section 2.1), there is version of the story of ‘empiricism’ that can be told that brings Thomas Hobbes into the fold. Despite being contemporaneous with Hobbes, Cavendish’s metaphysical and epistemological commitments make it difficult to do the same with her. Thus, by framing the story of early modern British philosophy as one concerned with ‘empiricism’, there is a danger of excluding Cavendish. As recent scholars like Marcy Lascano (2023), have argued, this motivates developing alternative stories – ones that might focus on ‘vitalism’, for instance – alongside more traditional narratives, which feature Cavendish and other women as protagonists.

Another case in point is Mary Astell (1666-1731). One way of telling the story of ‘empiricism’ is as a tradition that formed in opposition to Cartesianism. But if an opposition to Cartesianism is over emphasized, then a thinker like Astell is likely to fall through the cracks. For even though Astell was writing during Locke’s lifetime and critically engages with him when developing her views on education, love, and theology (see for example, Proposal to the Ladies, Parts I and II. Wherein a Method is offer’d for the Improvement of their Minds from 1694 and 1697 or The Christian Religion, As Profess’d by a Daughter Of the Church of England from 1705), she is quite explicitly committed to a form of substance dualism that shares many features in common with that of Descartes (see Atherton 1993 and Broad 2015).

While it may be hard, as we have suggested, to incorporate Cavendish or Astell into a traditional ‘empiricist’ narrative, there are several thinkers that might more easily fit under that label. Take the case of Anne Conway (1631–1679), who is as critical of ‘rationalists’ like Descartes and Spinoza (along with other figures like Hobbes) in her Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy (for example, chap. 7) as any of the ‘usual suspects’, such as Berkeley or Locke (for more on Conway’s philosophical system, see Hutton 2004; Thomas 2017; Lascano 2023). But since Conway is not focused on the Peripatetic axiom but wants to offer a philosophical system that can explain how the nature of mind and matter as well as how God and the creation are related, it is hard to place her in the narrative developed in this article. (For a more thorough consideration of Conway’s philosophy, see for instance Hutton 2004; Thomas 2017; Lascano 2023.)  This also holds for someone like Damaris Masham (1658-1708) who – despite knowing Locke and corresponding with Leibniz and Astell – is not overly concerned with the Lockean Axiom. Rather, Masham focuses on moral issues as well as love and happiness (see for example, Discourse Concerning the Love of God in 1696 and her Occasional Thoughts in 1705) arguing for a notion of humans as social and rational beings (for more on Masham’s social philosophy, see Broad 2006, and 2019; Frankel 1989; Hutton 2014 and 2018; Myers 2013). Finally, our focus on the Lockean Axiom means that even someone like Mary Wollstonecraft is hard to incorporate into the narrative. While Wollstonecraft is deeply influenced by Locke’s views on education and love, which play an important role in the background of her Vindication of the Rights of Women from 1792, her focus is on women’s rights. There is no obvious sense in which she is an ‘empiricist’ – on either a traditional conception of that term or the way we have conceived it in this article (that is, as committed to the Lockean Axiom) (see Bahar 2002; Bergès 2013; Bergès and Coffee 2016; Falco 1996; Sapiro 1992).

Wollstonecraft’s case is of particular interest because it illustrates that one can even be a Lockean of sorts and still not fit the bill, as it were. In turn, this emphasizes that any narrative that scholars develop will have to make tough choices about who to include, which is why it is so important to be transparent about the reasoning behind these choices. We strongly believe that this must be kept in mind when reading this article and engaging in both teaching and scholarship in the history of philosophy more generally.

In sum, we have strived to present here a narrative that does justice to the existing tradition while correcting some of its main flaws (in particular, its exclusionary tendencies) in terms of issues and thinkers considered. Nonetheless, it is important to be mindful of the fact that this narrative is just one of many stories that could be told about British philosophy from the seventeenth to the nineteenth century. After all, each narrative – no matter its vices and virtues – will have to deal with the fact that it is arbitrary in the sense of being the product of a particular analyst’s choices. It might well be the case that other scholars deem it better to forgo these labels altogether in research and teaching (see, for example, Gordon-Roth and Kendrick 2015).

2. The Origins of Empiricism

a. Precursors to Locke

As noted in the previous section, this article on ‘British Empiricism’ will focus on a particular narrative that takes Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding as a starting point for the ‘British empiricist’ tradition. Inevitably, there is a degree of arbitrariness in this decision – as we suggested in the previous section, such is the case with any historical narrative that chooses some thinkers or ideas and not others. Nonetheless, we think that this particular narrative has the theoretical virtue of allowing us to expand the canon of ‘British empiricism’ and discuss a greater range of topics (covering moral philosophy and theology, for example, as well as epistemology and metaphysics).

Even if ‘empiricism’ is tied to an acceptance of some version of the ‘Peripatetic Axiom’ (as it is in this article), it is important to note that ‘empiricism’ is neither uniquely British nor a uniquely early modern phenomenon, and Locke was not the first early modern thinker to draw heavily from the ‘Peripatetic Axiom’ in his approach to knowledge. In this section, we briefly outline the history of the ‘Peripatetic Axiom’ prior to Locke before introducing Locke’s usage of it as espoused in the Essay. We do so by charting the emergence of this ‘Peripatetic Axiom’ which, in a very general form, is as follows:

Peripatetic Axiom: there is nothing in the intellect not first in the senses.

The name comes from the axiom’s association with Aristotle (see Gasser-Wingate 2021), the ‘Peripatetic’ philosopher; so-called because he liked to philosophise while walking. We will argue that, in the hands of Locke, the Peripatetic Axiom, which has a long history, was turned into the Lockean Axiom: There is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience (which we discuss in greater detail in section 2.2).

Prior to Locke, the axiom can be found in the writings of medieval Aristotelian writers including Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) and Roger Bacon, other early modern writers like Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), and perhaps even in the work of Ancient Greek thinkers like Aristotle (ca. 384-322 BCE) and Heraclitus (ca. 500 BCE). Our contention is that, in Locke’s Essay, the Peripatetic Axiom took on a particular shape that would go on to be hugely influential in seventeenth- and eighteenth-century philosophy, especially in Britain. One reason for this is that Locke’s Essay was extremely widely read in Britain; for example, it was a standard set text for philosophy in British universities.

For the purposes of the discussion in this article, we take empiricists to be those thinkers who are committed, in some form or another, to the view that all knowledge (everything that is ‘in the mind’) can be traced back to some kind of experience. Often, ‘experience’ is construed in terms of sense-perception, although, as we will find, in Locke’s Essay, ‘experience’ covers both outward sense experience and inward, introspective experience of the operations and contents of one’s own mind – what Locke calls ‘reflection’ (Essay 2.1.2). Thus, Locke can be thought of as having expanded the scope of what can be ‘experienced’, compared to many of his early modern, medieval, and ancient predecessors.

There is some evidence of something close to a commitment to ‘empiricism’ – perhaps a kind of ‘proto-empiricism’ – in Pre-Socratic writers such as Heraclitus, Empedocles (ca. 495–435 BCE), or Xenophanes (ca. 570–475 BCE). Although their writings make it hard to determine whether they are committed to a recognisable form of the Peripatetic Axiom or are simply resistant to thinkers like Parmenides (ca. 515–445 BCE), who argued that the senses are unreliable and that a priori reasoning is the only appropriate way to grasp the nature of reality. Similarly, Aristotle rejects his teacher Platos (427–347 BCE) account of knowledge as recollection and the theory of innate ideas that follows from it. Plato had argued that our knowledge of, for example, mathematical principles is in fact knowledge of the Forms (Republic 510c1–511b2). The Forms – perfect, idealised, abstract entities which inhabit a ‘Realm of Forms’ distinct from our own world of sense experience—can be accessed, according to Plato, by recollection or intuition. Aristotle rejects this account of knowledge as recollection (for example, APo. 100a)—a move that would later be repeated by Locke in his own discussion of innate ideas in Book I of the Essay. Instead, Aristotle claims that “to gain light on things imperceptible we must use the evidence of perceptible things” (EN 1104a13–14). Similarly, Aristotle rejects the idea, found in thinkers like Parmenides and Plato, that reality can be understood through a priori reasoning, claiming instead that “we should accept what is evident to the senses rather than reasoning” (GA 760b29–33). Like later thinkers who accept the Peripatetic axiom, like Locke and Hume, Aristotle argues that – since inquiry is limited by what we are able to experience – when it comes to certain observable phenomena, we may, at best, be able to arrive at possible causes (Meteor 344a5–7).

In medieval thought, we begin to find explicit formulations of the Peripatetic Axiom. Note that, despite being called ‘Peripatetic’, the axiom is more explicitly articulated by later followers of Aristotle. Perhaps the most famous follower of Aristotle in Western philosophy, Thomas Aquinas, claims that “without sense perception no one can either learn anything new, nor understand matters already learned” (In DA 3.13 [para. 791]). In other words, according to Aquinas, we only learn new things via sense-perception. Clearly, this implies that there is nothing (new) in the mind that is not first in the senses. Similarly, another medieval thinker who pre-empts some of the ideas that would go on to be central to Locke’s view, Roger Bacon (1215–1292), writes that “without experience nothing can be sufficiently known” (OM 6.1). This is not quite the same as the claim that there is no knowledge (at all) without experience, but is still an endorsement of the crucial, necessary role that experience plays in knowledge acquisition that is central to the empiricist tradition.

Perhaps the most significant, imminent pre-cursor to Locke – in the context of the history of the Peripatetic Axiom – is Thomas Hobbes. Hobbes commits himself to the Peripatetic Axiom when he writes, in Leviathan (1651), that “there is no conception in a man’s mind, which hath not at first, totally, or by parts, been begotten upon the organs of Sense” (Leviathan, 1.1). Indeed, arguably one could tell a somewhat different story of early modern (or even ‘British’) ‘empiricism’ that takes Hobbes as its starting point. As Peter Nidditch explains, Hobbes (along with the French philosopher Pierre Gassendi (1592-1655)) “first produced in the modern era, especially in his Leviathan and De Corpore, a philosophy of mind and cognition that built on empiricist principles” (Nidditch 1975, viii). Nidditch goes on to suggest, speculatively, that it is most likely Hobbes’ reputation – as a highly unorthodox thinker, at best, and a secret atheist, at worst – that prevented him, retrospectively, from being seen as the ‘father of empiricism’ in the standard narrative. Whatever the explanation, it is Locke rather than Hobbes who would go on to be widely read and highly influential in Britain, and elsewhere, in the seventeenth- and eighteenth-century. As Nidditch puts it: “The Essay gained for itself a unique standing as the most thorough and plausible formulation of empiricism – a viewpoint that it caused to become an enduring powerful force” (Nidditch 1975, vii). Due to the Essay’s widespread influence, we focus on the role that Locke, rather than Hobbes, played in the development of British thought during these centuries; a role which would go on to be seen as so important that it even becomes possible, in hindsight, to speak of a more or less unified group and label it ‘British empiricism’. As we have suggested, there is a story to be told about Hobbes and empiricism, but it is one that, for the most part, we do not tell here (see section 1).

b. Locke

As was noted in the introduction, the question of whether there are innate ideas in the human mind is often seen as a central dividing line between empiricism and rationalism as they are standardly construed. While we pointed out the various issues of this standard narrative, our narrative also makes use of the issue of innatism. Though, crucially, our focus is less on finding a dividing line and more on finding a common denominator in the views of mainly ‘British’ and ‘Irish’ philosophers (for more on issues concerning the ‘British’ moniker see § 6). With that in mind, let us turn to the issue of innatism and the way Locke deals with it.

Locke characterises his innatist opponents’ position like so: “It is an established Opinion amongst some Men, That there are in the Understanding certain innate Principles; some primary Notions…as it were stamped upon the Mind of Man, which the Soul receives in its very first Being; and brings into the world with it,” (Essay, 1.2.5).

Whether or not this is a fair characterisation of his opponents’ views, as Locke sees it, the term ‘innate’ suggests that, on the innatist account, human beings are quite literally born with some in-built knowledge – some principles or propositions that the mind need not acquire but already possesses. In short, on this view, prior to any experience – that is, at the very first instant of its having come into existence – the human mind knows something. Locke develops two lines of argument against the innatist position, which will be referred to in what follows as (1) the Argument from Superfluousness and (2) the Argument from Universal Assent.

The Argument from Superfluousness proceeds as follows:

It would be sufficient to convince unprejudiced Readers of the falseness of this Supposition, if I should only shew (as I hope I shall in the following Parts of this Discourse) how Men, barely [that is, only] by the Use of their natural Faculties, may attain to all the Knowledge they have, without the help of any innate Impressions. (Essay, 1.2.1)

Locke’s point here is that all it takes to convince an ‘unprejudiced reader’ (that is, one who is willing to be swayed by reasonable argument) of the falseness of innatism is evidence that all knowledge can be traced back to instances in which our human “natural Faculties” – that is, our faculties of sense-perception and reflection – were in use. This argument thus depends upon the plausibility of Locke’s claim that all knowledge can be traced back to some kind of experience. We leave aside the Argument from Superfluousness for the moment since we discuss this claim in greater detail below.

In contrast, the Argument from Universal Assent is a standalone argument that does not depend upon any additional claims about the sources of human knowledge. Locke claims that if the human mind possessed certain principles innately then there would surely have to be certain spoken or written propositions that all human beings would assent to. In other words, if there were an innate principle X such that all human beings, regardless of their lives and experiences, knew X, then when confronted with a written or verbal statement of X (“X”), all human beings would agree that “X” is true. For example, let us assume for the moment that murder is wrong is a principle that is innately known to the human mind. Locke’s point is that, if presented with a written or verbal statement of “murder is wrong”, surely all human beings would assent to it.

And yet, Locke argues, this does not seem to be true of this or any other principle (evidenced, for example, by the fact that people do, in fact, commit murder). He writes: “[this] seems to me a Demonstration that there are none such [innate principles of knowledge]: Because there are none to which all Mankind gives an Universal assent” (Essay, 1.2.4). If by ‘demonstrates’, here, Locke means that it logically follows that, since there are no universally assented-to propositions, there must not be any innately known principles, he is not quite right. For there might be other reasons why certain propositions are not universally assented to—perhaps not everyone understands the statements they are being presented with, or perhaps they are lying (perhaps murderers know murder is wrong, but commit it nonetheless). At best, the Argument from Universal Assent provides a probable case against innatism, or places the burden proof on the innatist to explain why there are no universally assented-to propositions, or else neutralises the converse view (which Locke thinks his opponents subscribe to; see Essay, 1.2.4) that the existence of innate principles can be proven by appealing to the existence of universally assented-to propositions. And, of course, Locke’s reasoning also depends upon the truth of the claim that there are, in fact, no universally assented=to propositions (perhaps people have just not had the chance to assent to them yet, because they have not yet been articulated). Given all these mitigating factors, it seems most charitable to suggest that Locke is simply hoping to point out the implausibility, or even absurdity, of the innatist position – especially given an increasing societal awareness of cultural relativity in different societies and religions outside Europe in the seventeenth century (Essay, 1.4.8), not to mention the fact that neither Plato or Aristotle, or any other pre-Christians, would have assented to propositions like ‘God exists’ or ‘God is to be worshipped’ which, Locke claims, are paradigm cases of so-called ‘innate principles’ (Essay, 1.4.8).

Having, to his own satisfaction at least, provided one argument against the innatist position, Locke develops an account of the sources of human knowledge that supports the Argument from Superfluousness – by showing how all human knowledge can be traced back to some kind of experience. In contrast to innatists, Locke maintains that at birth the human mind is a blank slate or ‘tabula rasa’. If we picture the mind as a “white Paper, void of all characters”, Locke asks, “How comes it to be furnished?” (Essay, 2.1.2). His response is that: “I answer, in one word, From Experience: In that, all our Knowledge is founded; and from that ultimately derives itself” (Essay, 2.1.2).

Locke then divides experience into two subcategories with respective mental faculties: ‘sensation’ and ‘reflection’ (Essay, 2.1.2). Concerning sensation, he writes:

Our Senses, conversant about particular sensible Objects, do convey into the Mind, several distinct Perceptions of things, according to those various ways, wherein those Objects do affect them: And thus we come by those Ideas, we have of Yellow, White, Heat, Cold, Soft, Hard, Bitter, Sweet, and all those which we call sensible qualities. (Essay, 2.1.3)

Our ideas of sensation, Locke explains, are those which pertain to the qualities of things we perceive via the (five) external senses: the objects of vision, touch, smell, hearing, and taste. But of course, this does not exhaust the objects of the mind – we can also have ideas of things that are not perceived by the ‘outward’ senses. As Locke writes:

The other Fountain, from which experience furnisheth the Understanding with Ideas, is the Perception of the Operations of our own Minds within us, as it is employ’d about the Ideas it has got; which Operations, when the Soul comes to reflect on, and consider, do furnish the Understanding with another set of Ideas, which could not be had from the things without: and such are, Perception, Thinking, Doubting, Believing, Reasoning, Knowing, Willing, and all the different actings of our own Mind. (Essay 2.1.4)

In a sense, then, Locke’s point is this: While we standardly talk as though we ‘experience’ only those things that can be perceived by the senses, in actual fact we also experience the operations of our own mind as well as things external to it. We can, that is, observe ourselves thinking, doubting, believing, reasoning, and so on – and we can observe ourselves perceiving, too (this claim is contentious: Do we really observe ourselves perceiving, or are we simply aware of ourselves perceiving?).

Locke’s aim is to establish that no object of knowledge, no ‘idea’ (Essay, 1.1.8), can fail to be traced back to one of these two ‘fountains’ of knowledge. In doing so, Locke thus commits himself to a particular formulation of the ‘Peripatetic Axiom’ (discussed in section 2.1). While the ‘Peripatetic Axiom ‘– found in medieval Aristotelians and in Hobbes – states that ‘there is nothing in the intellect not first in the senses,’ Locke’s claim, which is central to the way ‘empiricism’ is construed in this article, is:

Lockean Axiom: There is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience.

The Lockean Axiom would go on to very influential in seventeenth- and eighteenth-century thought, especially in Britain.

3. Our Knowledge of the External World and Causation

This section focuses on the application of the Lockean Axiom (there is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience) to our knowledge of the external world. In doing so it most closely resembles the standard narrative of ‘British empiricism’ because the focus rests on Berkeley’s rejection of materialism and Hume’s denial of necessary connection. However, in contrast to the standard narrative, we close this section by emphasizing how Mary Shepherd, who is said to have read Locke’s Essay when she was eight years old (Jeckyl 1894, 217), rejects both positions. Although, as will become evident, in doing so she does not draw from the Lockean Axiom but from two causal principles.

a. Berkeley on the Nature of the External World

 In A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710/34) and Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713/34), Berkeley defends the doctrine he is most famous for: Immaterialism. In a nutshell, Berkeley holds that everything that exists is either an immaterial mind or idea (for example, PHK §§ 25–27). Thus, his commitment to the notorious dictum esse est percipi aut percipere (“To be is to be perceived or to perceive”) (compare NB 429, 429a; PHK § 3).

Two key features of his argument for immaterialism are Berkeley’s claims that the “existence of an idea consists in being perceived” (PHK § 3) and that “an idea can be like nothing but an idea” (PHK § 8). Since Berkeley is convinced that sense perception works via resemblance (for example, Works II, 129; TVV § 39) (see Fasko and West 2020; Atherton 1990; West 2021) and because we know that (most) objects of human knowledge are ideas – either “imprinted on the senses” or “formed by help of memory and imagination” (PHK § 1), he argues that we can infer that the objects in the external world also must be ideas or collections of ideas (PHK §§ 1–8). After all, according to Berkeley, when we say something like the table exists, we mean that it can be perceived. And what is perceived is, after all, an idea (PHK § 3) (Daniel 2021, Fields, 2011, Jones 2021, Rickless 2013, Saporiti 2006).

It is important to note that, in developing this argument, Berkeley, implicitly, draws on the Lockean Axiom that there is no idea that cannot be traced back to some particular experience. For Berkeley’s point is that our experience of the external world and its objects clearly suggests that they only exist when they are perceived. That is, when we trace back our ideas of things in the external world to the experiences we have of them, we come to understand that these ‘things’ are also ideas.

Berkeley fortifies his case for immaterialism by rejecting what is, to his mind, the only viable alternative: Materialism. More specifically, Berkeley argues against the existence of a (Lockean) material substance. In doing so, he, again, draws from the Lockean Axiom – and, in that sense, uses Locke’s own claim against him – by raising the question of whether we even have an idea of material substance in the first place. Berkeley then claims that even materialists, like Locke on his reading, must accept that we do not; for, as they themselves admit, there is nothing we can say about it (DHP 261). The reason we do not have an idea of material substance, Berkeley contends, is that there is no such thing in the first place and, thus, no experience of such a thing (and where there is no experience, there can be no idea). In fact, Berkeley believes that the very notion of such a thing would be “repugnant” (DHP 232; PHK § 17). As he puts it:

I have no reason for believing the existence of matter. I have no immediate intuition thereof: neither can I mediately from my sensations, ideas, notions, actions or passions, infer an unthinking, unperceiving, inactive substance, either by probable deduction, or necessary consequence. (DHP 233)

Even worse, assuming the existence of a material substance leads to skepticism concerning the existence of the external world and ultimately also God’s existence (that is, it leads to atheism, compare also PHK § 92) because it leads one to become “ignorant of the true nature of every thing, but you know not whether any thing really exists, or whether there are any true natures at all” (DHP 229). When challenged by his imagined opponent with the argument that we also have no idea of God or other minds (see also section 4.3) – and thus no reason to assume they exist – Berkeley appeals to the (first personal) experience we can have of these entities (DHP 233). This is consistent with the Lockean Axiom which, while it does entail that every idea can be traced back to an experience, does not entail that every experience must lead to an idea.

In sum, in arguing for his immaterialism Berkeley makes implicit use of the Lockean Axiom inasmuch as he draws from it to establish that the external world and its objects must consist of ideas because our experience of the external world and its objects are such that it consists of perceivable things. The Lockean Axiom also plays a role in Berkeley’s argument against the existence of material substance, in that the lack of experience of matter is taken to explain the lack of a corresponding idea – and an analysis of the idea shows its repugnancy.

b. Hume on the Nature of Causation

 At least in the context of contemporary Western thought, Hume’s account of causation is perhaps one of the best known and most discussed theories to have come out of the early modern period (see, for example, Garrett 2015; Bell 2008; Beauchamp and Rosenberg 1981). In An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748), Hume sets out to demonstrate that causal relations – or what he calls ‘necessary connections’ – are not something that we experience in the world around us (see Noxon 1973 or Traiger 2006 for a discussion of the development of Hume’s thought and the relation between the Treatise and the EHU). Rather, Hume claims, we form the idea or concept of causation in our mind as a result of repeated experiences of ‘causes’ preceding ‘effects’, and the ‘sentiment’ that such repeated experiences generate in us (EHU 7). In other words, on Hume’s view, we feel as though certain events or objects (like smoke and fire) are necessarily connected, by a causal relation, because we see them occur in conjunction with one another repeatedly. But, strictly speaking, Hume argues, we do not experience any such causal relations and thus cannot know with certainty that the two things are necessarily connected – at best, we can have probable knowledge. What is important, for the concerns of this article, is that Hume’s reasoning for this view is premised upon a version of the Lockean Axiom: There is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience. In other words, it is Hume’s ‘empiricism’ (in the sense that we have used the term in this article) that leads him to arrive at his skeptical account of causation. For an ‘empiricist’, knowledge is dependent upon experience – and Hume’s point in the EHU is that we cannot experience causation. We run through Hume’s argument in more detail below.

Hume begins section 2 of the EHU (where his discussion of the origin of ideas takes place) by establishing what has come to be known as ‘the Copy Principle’ (for further discussion, see Coventry and Seppalainen 2012; Landy 2006 and 2012). The Copy Principle concerns the relation between what Hume calls ‘impressions’ and ‘ideas.’ The crucial thing for our purposes is that, for Hume, ‘impression’ refers (amongst other things) to any direct experience or sense-perception we have of an external object. When I look outside my window and see the sun, for instance, I am receiving an ‘impression’ of the sun. That is, the sun is ‘impressing’ itself upon my sense organs, similarly to a stamp that impresses an insignia upon wax. ‘Ideas,’ on the other hand, are what are left behind, in the mind, by such impressions; Hume’s use of the term ‘idea’ is thus slightly different to that of Locke or Berkeley,   who both use ‘idea’ in a way that also encompasses Humean impressions. When I remember the sun, as I lie in bed at night, I am having an ‘idea’ of the sun. And, similarly, if I lie in bed and imagine tomorrow’s sun, I am also forming an ‘idea’ of it. In terms of our experiences of them, impressions and ideas are differentiated by their degrees of vividness and strength: my impression of the sun, for instance, will be stronger and more vivid (perhaps brighter) than my idea of the sun. As Hume puts it:

These faculties [of memory and imagination] may mimic or copy the perceptions of the senses; but they never can entirely reach the force and vivacity of the original sentiment. The utmost we say of them, even when they operate with greatest vigour, is, that they represent their object in so lively a manner, that we could almost say we feel or see it: But, except the mind be disordered by disease or madness, they never can arrive at such a pitch of vivacity, as to render these perceptions altogether undistinguishable. (EHU 2.1, 17)

An idea might somewhat resemble the strength or vividness of an impression but, Hume claims, an idea of the sun and the sun itself (unless one’s mind is ‘disordered’) will never be entirely indistinguishable.

The Copy Principle entails that every (simple) idea is a copy of an impression. Hume writes:

It seems a proposition, which will not admit of much dispute, that all our ideas are nothing but copies of our impressions, or, in other words that it is impossible for us to think of anything which we have not antecedently felt, either by our external or internal senses. (EHU 7.1.4, 62)

This principle is strongly empiricist in character and closely related to both the Lockean Axiom and the Peripatetic Axiom, which entails that there is nothing in the mind not first in the senses. Like the Lockean Axiom, the Copy Principle (as articulated in this passage) tells us that if I have an idea of X, then I must previously have had an experience, or ‘impression’, of X.

For Hume, all of this makes the issue of where we get our idea of causation extremely pressing. Hume denies that we do in fact have any impressions of causation or ‘necessary connections’ between things:

When we look about us to external objects…we are never able in a single instance, to discover any power of necessary connexion; any quality which binds the effect to the cause, and renders one an infallible consequence of the other. We only find that one does actually, in fact, follow the other. (EHU 7.1.6, 63)

Consider the case of a white billiard ball rolling along a table and knocking a red ball. Hume asks: can you in fact experience or perceive the ‘necessary connection’ (or causal relation) that makes it the case that when the white ball knocks the red ball the red ball moves away? His answer is no: what you experience, strictly speaking, is a white ball moving and then a red ball moving. But if we do not have an impression of causation, in such instances, why do we have an idea of causation?

Hume concludes that while we do not have an outward impression of causation, because we repeatedly experience uniform instances of for example, smoke following fire, or red balls moving away from white balls, we come to feel a new impression which Hume calls a ‘sentiment’. That is, we feel as though we are experiencing causation – even though, in strict truth, we are not. This new feeling or sentiment is “a customary connexion in the thought or imagination between one object and its usual attendant; and this sentiment is the original of that idea which we seek for” (EHU 7.2.30, 78). In other words, while our idea of causation or necessary connection cannot be traced back to a specific impression, it can nonetheless be traced back to experience more generally. Repeated uniform experience, Hume claims, induces us to generate the idea of causation – and is the foundation of our ‘knowledge’ of cause-and-effect relations in the world around us. In line with the Lockean Axiom, then, Hume’s view is that we would have no idea of causation, were it not for our experience of certain events or objects (‘causes’) regularly preceding others (‘effects’).

c. Shepherd on Berkeley and Hume

 The previous subsections have established that Berkeley and Hume both draw on the Lockean Axiom that there is no idea that cannot be traced back to some particular experience in important ways. Both thinkers draw on this principle inasmuch as they take the absence of particular experiences (about the external world or causation) not only to entail that there is no idea but that the things in question (material substance or necessary connections) do not exist. In this section we consider how Mary Shepherd rejects both Berkeley’s immaterialism and Hume’s skeptical account of causation. As will become evident, however, Shepherd does so not by drawing on the Lockean Axiom – which does not play any role in her account of the mind – but by using two causal principles that she introduces in her works. Shepherd is thus an example of the limits of the narrative developed here. For even though she conceives of Locke as her closest ‘philosophical ally’ (LoLordo 2020, 9), Shepherd concludes that one needs, in order to refute Berkeley and Hume, to consider the issue of causation first – and not issues concerning (mental) representation. For Shepherd believes that even (mental) representation and the mental content it allows for ought ultimately to be understood in causal terms.

Shepherd’s first causal principle, the so-called CP, holds that “nothing can ‘begin its own existence’” (for example, ERCE 94). Second, the Causal-Likeness-Principle (CLP) states that “like causes, must generate like Effects” (for example, ERCE 194). It is important to note that the CLP is a biconditional, as Shepherd claims in her second book Essays on the Perception of an External Universe (1827) that “like effects must have like causes” (EPEU 99).

Shepherd defends both principles in her first book, Essay on the Relation of Cause and Effect (1824). The main aim of this work is to refute a Humean account of causation as constant conjunction. In particular, Shepherd wants to establish, against Hume, that causes and effects are necessarily connected (ERCE 10). While the details of Shepherd’s argument can be put aside for now, the crucial thing to note is that she does not draw from the Peripatetic Axiom or the Lockean Axiom. Instead, Shepherd focuses on rejecting Hume’s theory of mental representation and his claim that the possibility of separating cause and effect in thought tells us something about their actual relation (Bolton 2010 & 2019; Landy 2020a & 2020b). Crucially, this rejection of Hume, in turn, fortifies her case for her two causal principles – both of which play a crucial role in arguing against Berkeley.

Meanwhile, in rejecting Berkeley’s version of immaterialism, Shepherd contends that we have sensations of solidity and extension (EPEU 218), and drawing from the CP, we know that these must have a cause. Since we know the mind to be a cause for sensations (for example, EPEU 14–15), there must also be another cause for these sensations. Thus, we can come to know that matter (which she also calls ‘body’) is the “continually exciting cause, for exhibition of the perception of extension and solidity on the mind in particular” (EPEU 155) and matter is “unperceived extended impenetrability” (LMSM 697). In other words, the causal connection between our mental content and the external world allows Shepherd to draw inferences about its objects, which show them not to be ideational, that is, not to merely consist of ideas as Berkeley, for instance, would have it (while Shepherd thus clearly rejects a Berkeleyan brand of immaterialism (see Atherton 1996, Rickless 2018), it is not clear whether she is opposed to all kinds of immaterialism whatsoever; as Bolye (2020, 101) points out ‘(im-)material’ seems to be a “label” for capacities and it is unclear whether more than capacities exist in Shepherd’s metaphysics).

In sum, Shepherd is a fitting end point for this part of the narrative because she not only closely engages with Berkeley and Hume (and their applications of the Lockean Axiom) but also because Locke is such a close philosophical ally for her—although, scholars have noted that Shepherd sometimes advances an idiosyncratic reading of Locke (Boyle 2023; LoLordo 2022). Even more to the point, Shepherd suggests that her theory is a ‘modified Berkeleian theory’ (LMSM 698) and thus aligns herself explicitly with a key figure of the ‘standard’ narrative of British empiricism.

Thus, despite the fact that the Lockean Axiom does not play a role in Shepherd’s argumentation, and in fact it is unclear what she thinks about it, there are good reasons to consider her within this narrative. For Shepherd’s philosophy focuses on key figures within this narrative to the point where she aligns herself implicitly and explicitly with at least two of them.

4. Morality



One of the most interesting upshots of the widespread acceptance of the Lockean Axiom, or what we might call his ‘empiricist’ philosophy, in Britain and Ireland during the eighteenth century is the effect it had on theorising about morality; specifically concerning the question of where we get our moral ideas (like good, bad, right, wrong, virtuous, and vicious) from. The Lockean Axiom dictates that there is no idea that cannot be traced back to some particular experience. While that might fit nicely with how we get our ideas of concepts like colour, sound, or touch (and any other ideas that can be traced to sense perception), ideas like justice/injustice, good/bad, or right/wrong, do not seem to be easily traceable to some particular experience. It does not seem controversial to suggest that ‘redness’ or ‘loudness’ are qualities we can experience in the world around us, but it is much less obvious that we experience qualities such as ‘goodness’, ‘badness’, ‘rightness’, or ‘wrongness’. For a start, while – barring cases of, for example, blindness, deafness, or any other sensory deficiency – there is likely to be agreement about an object’s colour or the volume of a sound. There is, however, generally speaking, considerable disagreement when it comes to the goodness/badness or rightness/wrongness of an action. The same applies in the case of beauty and other aesthetic qualities, and there is a great deal that could be said about ‘empiricist’ approaches to aesthetics (we do not discuss these issues here but for discussion of Hume’s aesthetics see, for example, Costello 2007, Gracyk 1994, Townsend 2001, and for discussion of Hutcheson’s aesthetics, see, for example, Shelley 2013, Michael 1984, Kivy 2003).

This section looks at three thinkers’ views on morality and examine the role that the Lockean Axiom played in their theorising. All three are important figures in the history of (Western) ethics. Francis Hutcheson was one of the first philosophers to apply the Lockean Axiom to questions of morality and, though he was Irish born, would go on to be known as a central figure in the so-called ‘Scottish Enlightenment’ (his parents were Scottish Presbyterian and he would spend most of his career in Scotland). David Hume pre-empts discussions of utility in ethical theorising that would come to the fore in the work of Mill and Bentham and develops the idea of a sense of ‘taste’ which allows us to perceive the moral characteristics of persons and actions. Meanwhile, Susanna Newcome (1685-1763) has recently been identified (Connolly 2021) as one of the earliest thinkers to defend what is recognisably a form of utilitarianism.

a. Hutcheson and the Moral Sense

In An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725), Francis Hutcheson explicitly acknowledges the indebtedness of his discussion of morality (as well as beauty) to Locke (for example, Inquiry, 1.VII). His begins the Inquiry by defining sensations as “[t]hose Ideas which are rais’d in the Mind upon the presence of external Objects, and their acting upon our Bodys” and adds that “We find that the Mind in such Cases is passive, and has not Power directly to prevent the Perception or Idea” (Inquiry, 1.I). A little later, Hutcheson explains that “no Definition can raise any simple Idea which has not been before perceived by the Senses” (Inquiry, 1. IV). In making these claims, Hutcheson is committing himself to a version of the Lockean Axiom, the claim that there is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced to some particular experience – strictly speaking, this should read ‘simple idea’, since Hutcheson’s view is that all simple ideas must be traced back to some experience – compound ideas might be the product of reason.

Hutcheson’s commitment to the Lockean Axiom leads him to conclude that humans have a “Moral Sense” (see Frankena 1955; Harris 2017) as well as external senses of seeing, hearing, touching, tasing, and smelling. In fact, in his Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections (1742), Hutcheson claims we have a range of ‘internal’ senses including a “Publick Sense”, concerned with the happiness of others, a “Sense of Honour”, and a sense of “decency and dignity” (Essay, 5-30). This is understandable given that, for Hutcheson, a sensation is ‘an idea raised in the mind upon the presence of external objects’ – and it is external objects, or more often external people (and their actions), that raise in us ideas of right, wrong, good, bad, justice, or injustice.

In the Essay, Hutcheson lays out a line of reasoning which justifies this view: “If we may call every Determination of our Minds to receive Ideas Independently on our Will, and to have Perceptions of Pleasure and Pain, A SENSE, we shall find many other Senses besides those commonly explained” (Essay, 5). His point is this: a sense is a ‘determination’ or faculty of the mind by means of which it receives (passively) certain kinds of ideas. Our sense of vision, for instance, is where we get our visual ideas, for example, ideas of colour or brightness/darkness. Our olfactory sense is where we get our ideas of smell such as sourness, putridness, and so on. However, if we can identify ideas that cannot be traced back to one of the five external senses – vision, hearing, taste, touch, smell – Hutcheson argues, then there must be another sense, an internal sense, by means of which the mind has received that idea. Such is the case with our ideas of good, bad, right, wrong, and so on. Since these ideas cannot be traced to any of the five external senses – because we do not literally see, hear, taste, touch, or smell good or bad, or right or wrong – we can infer that there must be a moral sense by which the mind has received them. Hutcheson describes this moral sense as that by which “we perceive Virtue, or Vice in our selves, or others” (Essay, 20). That is, through our naturally built-in moral sense, humans can detect virtue and vice. Note that this view implies that virtue and vice, and relatedly notions like good, bad, right, wrong, justice, and injustice, are qualities out there to be sensed. But what is it exactly that we are perceiving with our moral sense? And how does the human mind perceive virtue and vice in ourselves and other people?

For Hutcheson, the answer is that our ideas of virtue, vice, and other moral concepts are grounded in perceptions of pleasure and pain. Indeed, as the quotation above suggests, for Hutcheson, all perceptions are accompanied by a feeling of pleasure or pain. Some objects excite pleasure or pain in us, Hutcheson explains, even when we cannot see any “Advantage or Detriment the Use of such Objects might tend: Nor would the most accurate Knowledge of these things vary either the Pleasure or Pain of the Perception” (Inquiry, 1.VI). That is, some objects are naturally pleasurable or painful to sense – and such objects, according to Hutcheson, are beautiful or ugly, respectively. Similarly, the actions of some people generate pleasure or pain in us, and this is what determines whether we characterise those people are virtuous or vicious. Hutcheson maintains that it is a moral sense that generates our ideas of virtue or vice (just as it is an aesthetic sense that generates ideas of beauty or ugliness), rather than, say, a judgement or act of reason, because those ideas do “not arise from any Knowledge of Principles, Proportions, Causes, or of the Usefulness of the Object” (Inquiry, 1.XII). Instead, just as we are ‘struck’ with the colour of an object or the pitch of a sound, we are ‘struck’ by the rightness or wrongness, or virtuousness or viciousness, of a person or action.

In short, Hutcheson’s view is that we feel a kind of pleasure or displeasure in response to certain character traits or actions which determines whether we characterise them as virtuous or vicious. For example, one might feel pleasure witnessing an act of charity, or displeasure witnessing an action of cruelty. In the former case, an idea of virtue (or goodness, or rightness) is raised in our minds, while in the latter it is an idea of vice (or badness, or wrongness). In so doing, Hutcheson provides an empiricist  account of the origins of ideas concerning moral concepts, that is, one that draws on Lockean Axiom.

b. Hume on Taste and the Moral Sense

Like Hutcheson, Hume is interested in identifying the source of our ideas of moral concepts like virtue, vice, justice, injustice, right, and wrong. And, like Hutcheson, Hume arrives at the view that such ideas are derived from some kind of moral sense, which he calls ‘taste’ (see, for example, T 3.3.6; Shelley 1998). (Another similarity with Hutcheson is that many of Hume’s claims about our sense of morality are paralleled in his discussion of beauty—including the claim that we have a sense of beauty.) In An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1751), Hume’s account of moral sense, or taste, is part of a wider discussion of whether it is reason or sentiment, that is, feeling, that gives us our principles of morality. Hume lays out the debate like so:

There has been a controversy started of late…concerning the general foundation of MORALS; whether they can be derived from REASON, or from SENTIMENT; whether we attain the knowledge of them by a chain of argument and induction, or by an immediate feeling and finer internal sense; whether, like all sound judgment of truth and falsehood, they should be the same to every rational intelligent being; or whether, like the perception of beauty and deformity, they be founded entirely on the particular fabric and constitution of the human species. (EPM 1.3, 170)

In other words, the question is: do we reach conclusions about what is right or wrong in the same way we reach the conclusion of a mathematical formula, or do we reach such conclusions in the way we arrive at judgements about what counts as beautiful? The question is significant because, Hume claims, if our moral principles are more like judgements of beauty, then they might not, strictly speaking, be objective. They might instead be grounded in specific human values, concerns, desires, and judgements. Whereas if they are more like conclusions arrived at using reasoning, such as mathematical conclusions, Hume claims, then they can be more appropriately described as objective.

Hume opts for a decidedly ‘empiricist’ approach, that is, he draws from the Lockean Axiom, in answering this question, which ultimately leads him to reject the claim that moral principles are the product of reason. He explains that in the sciences, or ‘natural philosophy’, thinkers “will hearken to no arguments but those which are derived from experience” (EPM 1.10, 172). The same ought to be true, he claims, in ethics. In line with the Lockean Axiom, Hume then suggests that we ought to “reject every system of ethics, however subtile [that is, subtle] or ingenious, which is not found in fact and observation” (ibid.)—that is, the previously mentioned experience which underlies the arguments must be tied to the world we can perceive by our senses. Thus, like the natural philosophers of the Royal Society in London (the natural scientists he is referring to here), who rejected armchair theorising about nature in favour of going out and making observations, Hume’s aim is to arrive at an account of the origin of our moral principles that is based on observations of which traits or actions people do, in practice, deem virtuous or vicious—and why they do so.

What Hume claims to find is that traits like benevolence, humanity, friendship, gratitude, and public spirit—in short, all those which “proceed from a tender sympathy with others, and a generous concern for our kind and species” (EPM 2.1.5, 175)—receive the greatest approbation, that is, approval or praise. What all these character traits, which Hume calls the ‘social virtues’, have in common is their utility (see also Galvagni 2022 for more on Hume’s notion of virtue). This is no coincidence, Hume argues, for “the UTILITY, resulting from the social virtues, forms, at least, a part of their merit, and is one source of that approbation, and regard so universally paid to them” (EPM 2.2.3, 176). This leads Hume to develop the following line of reasoning: There are a set of traits, or ‘social virtues’, that are deemed the most praiseworthy by society. People who exhibit these traits are characterised as ‘virtuous.’ What these virtuous traits have in common is that they promote the interests of—that is, are useful to—society at large. Thus, Hume concludes, utility is at the heart of morality. This conclusion would go on to influence later thinkers like Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill and is central to the normative ethical theory utilitarianism—which we also discuss in section 4.3 in relation to Susanna Newcome.

What role does the moral sense, or taste, play in Hume’s account of the origins of morality? His answer is that taste serves to motivate us to action, based on the pleasure that comes with approbation or the displeasure that comes with condemnation. He writes: “The hypothesis which we embrace is plain. It maintains that morality is determined by sentiment. It defines virtue to be whatever mental action or quality gives to a spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation; and vice the contrary,” (EPM, Appendix 1, I, 289). In other words, Hume’s point is that we enjoy responding to a person or action with approval and do not enjoy, and may even take displeasure from, responding to persons or actions with blame or condemnation. Thus, like Hutcheson, Hume thinks that ideas we receive via our moral sense are accompanied by feelings of pleasure or pain. This is a claim about human psychology and, again, an idea that would go on to play an important role in the utilitarian ethics of Bentham and Mill—especially the idea, known as ‘psychological hedonism’, that humans are driven by a desire for pleasure and to avoid pain. Hume himself seems to endorse a kind of psychological hedonism when he claims that if you ask someone “why he hates pain, it is impossible he can ever give any [answer]” (EPM, Appendix 1, V, 293).

In line with the Lockean Axiom, Hume concludes that it cannot be reason alone that is the source of our moral principles. Again, like Hutcheson, Hume thinks that we sense—immediately, prior to any rational judgement—rightness or wrongness, or virtue or vice, in certain persons or actions. What is more, he argues, reason alone is “cool and disengaged” and is thus “no motive to action”, whereas taste, or moral sense, is a motive for action since it is involves a feeling of pleasure or pain (EPM, Appendix 1, V, 294). For that reason, Hume concludes that, in morality, taste “is the first spring or impulse to desire or volition” (ibid.).

c. Newcome on Pain, Pleasure, and Morality

There is no explicit commitment to the Lockean Axiom in the writings of Susanna Newcome. However, what we do find in Newcome is a development of the idea, also found in Hutcheson and Hume, that moral theorising is rooted in experiences of pleasure and pain—ideas which, as we found in sections 4.1 and 4.2, are themselves premised upon an acceptance of the Lockean Axiom. Thus, in Newcome (as in Shepherd), we find a thinker deeply influenced by the work of others who did adhere to the Lockean Axiom. In a sense, then, Newcome’s work is indirectly influenced by that Axiom. What we also find in Newcome is a bridge between the ‘empiricism’ of Locke, and thinkers like Hutcheson and Hume, who accept the Lockean Axiom, and the later utilitarianism of Jeremy Bentham and John Start Mill. For these reasons, Newcome’s ethical thinking merits inclusion in this article on ‘empiricism’ and the story of the development of the Lockean Axiom we have chosen to tell (see section 1).

In An Enquiry into the Evidence of the Christian Religion (1728/1732), Newcome provides the basis for a normative ethical theory that looks strikingly similar to the utilitarianism later, and more famously, defended by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. For this reason, Connolly (2021) argues that Newcome—whose work pre-dates that of both Bentham and Mill—could plausibly be identified as the first utilitarian. Newcome bases her claims about ethics on claims about our experiences of pleasure and pain. What is also interesting, for our present purposes, is that Newcome identifies ‘rationality’ with acting in a way that maximises pleasure or happiness. Consequently, on Newcome’s view, we can work out what actions are rational by paying attention to which actions lead to experiences of pleasure or happiness—and the same applies to irrational actions, which lead to experiences of pain or unhappiness. In the remainder of this section, we outline Newcome’s views on pleasure and pain, happiness and unhappiness, and rational and irrational action.

Newcome begins her discussion of ethics by claiming that pleasure and pain cannot be defined (Enquiry, II.I). She explains that happiness and misery are not the same as pleasure and pain. Rather, she claims, happiness is “collected Pleasure, or a Sum Total of Pleasure” while misery is “collected Pain, or a Sum Total of Pain” (Enquiry, II.II–III). In other words, happiness is made up of feelings of pleasure, and misery is made up of feelings of pain. One is in a state of happiness when one is experiencing pleasure, and one is in a state of misery when one is experiencing pain. Newcome then goes on to commit herself to what has come to be known as ‘psychological hedonism’ (see section 4.2): the view that humans are naturally driven to pursue pleasure and avoid pain. As she puts it, “To all sensible Beings Pleasure is preferable to Pain” (Enquiry, III.I) and “If to all sensible Beings Pleasure is preferable to Pain, then all such Beings must will and desire Pleasure, and will an Avoidance of Pain” (Enquiry, III.II). Newcome then moves from these claims about what humans naturally pursue or avoid to a claim about what is most ‘fit’ for us. Like later utilitarians such as Bentham and Mill, Newcome thus bases her normative ethical theory—that is, her account of how we ought to act—on psychological hedonism, an account of how we naturally tend to act. She writes: “What sensible Beings must always prefer, will, and desire, is most fit for them” (Enquiry, III.III) and “What sensible Beings must always will contrary to, shun and avoid, is most unfit for them” (Enquiry, III.IV). She concludes: “Happiness is then in its own Nature most fit for sensible Beings” and “Misery is in its own Nature most unfit for them” (Enquiry, III.V–VI).

As we noted at the beginning of this section, Newcome does not explicitly commit herself to the Lockean Axiom that there is no idea in the mind that cannot be traced back to some particular experience. Nonetheless, it is true to say that Newcome arrives at her conception of how humans ought to act on the basis of claims about experience. As we saw, Newcome’s view is that pleasure and pain cannot be defined. Her view seems to be that we all just know what it is to feel pleasure and experience pain, through experience. In much the same way that one could not convey an accurate notion of light or darkness to someone blind from birth or loud and quiet to someone deaf from birth, Newcome’s view seems to be that the only way to know what pleasure and pain are is to have pleasurable and painful experiences. And it is on the basis of such experiences that Newcome, in turn, arrives at her conception of happiness, misery, and ‘fit’ or ‘unfit’ actions—that is, the kinds of actions that it are ‘right’ or ‘wrong’, respectively, for us to perform. As we suggested above, Newcome’s moral philosophy is also noteworthy in that she identifies rational actions with those which are conducive to pleasure. She explains: “As Reason is that Power of the Mind by which it finds Truth, and the Fitness and Unfitness of Things, it follows, that whatever is True or Fit, is also Rational, Reasonable, or according to Reason,” (Enquiry, IV).

And she adds that “all those Actions of Beings which are Means to their Happiness, are rational” (Enquiry, IV.V). In Newcome, then, we find not only a normative ethical theory but also an account of rational action that is grounded, ultimately, in our experience of things. Rational action is action conducive to happiness, and happiness is the accumulation of pleasure. We work out what actions are rational or irrational, then, by appealing to our experience of pleasure or pain.

5. God and Free-Thinking

This section focuses on the application of the Lockean Axiom to questions concerning the existence of God and the divine attributes of wisdom, goodness, and power—a crucial issue for philosophers during the early modern period, when theological issues were seen as just as important as other philosophical or scientific issues.

If you accept the Lockean Axiom, this seems to pose a problem for talk of God and his attributes (although it is worth noting that Locke does seem not see it that way; rather, he thinks the idea of God is on the same epistemic footing as our idea of other minds (Essay 2.23.33–35)). As the ‘free-thinking’ philosopher Anthony Collins (1676–1729) argues, if all the ideas in our minds can be traced back to some particular experience, and if we cannot experience God directly (as orthodox Christian teachings, particularly in the Anglican tradition, would have it), then it seems impossible that we could have an idea of God. But if we cannot have an idea of the deity, one might worry, how we can know or learn anything about God? And what does that mean for the Bible, which is supposed to help us do just that? Thus, thinkers like Collins would argue, while you can have faith in God’s existence, whether this is a reasonable or justified belief is an entirely different question.

A potential rebuttal to Collins’ way of arguing, however, is to point to divine revelations in the form of miracles or other Christian mysteries. Perhaps miracles do constitute instances in which those present can, or could, experience God, or divine actions. This kind of response is attacked by another free-thinker, John Toland (1670–1722), who argues that religious mysteries cannot even be an object of believing because they are inconceivable. For example, the idea that God is father, son, and holy spirit all at once is something that seems both inconceivable and contrary to reason. Against these lines of reasoning, more orthodox thinkers like George Berkeley, who, crucially, accepts the Lockean Axiom as well (see section 3.1), argues that even though we cannot have an idea of God, we can nonetheless experience the deity through our experience of the divine creation, nature. We outline Collins, Toland, and Berkeley’s views on God, and their relation to ‘empiricism’, in the subsections below.

a. Anthony Collins

Anthony Collins had a close friendship with Locke, but he adopted the Lockean Axiom to advance his free-thinking agenda. Like Toland (see 5.2), Collins is concerned with defending the right to make “use of the understanding, in endeavouring to find out the meaning of any proposition whatsoever, in considering the nature of evidence for or against it, and in judging of it according to the seeming force or weakness of the evidence” (Discourse, 3).

Crucially, this process ought not to be interfered with by authority figures, particularly non-religious ones. Rather, everyone needs to be able to judge the evidence freely on their own (Discourse 3–21).

When it comes to applying the Lockean Axiom to questions concerning God’s existence and the divine attributes, Collins takes a concession by an orthodox cleric, archbishop William King (1650–1729), as his starting point. King writes that “it is in effect agreed on all hands, that the Nature of God, as it is in it self, is  incomprehensible by human Understanding; and not only his Nature, but likewise his Powers and Faculties” (Sermon § 3). While experience is not explicitly mentioned here, the underlying thought is that God is mysterious because we cannot experience God himself or the divine attributes. In other words, we do not have an idea of God because we cannot experience God. Thus, Collins argues that the word ‘God’ is empty (that is, does not denote anything in the world) and that when we say something like ‘God is wise,’ this is basically meaningless (Vindication, 12–13). In particular, Collins emphasizes that because of this lack of experience and the subsequent emptiness of the term, it becomes impossible to prove the existence of God against atheists. For the term cannot refer to more than a “general cause or effect” (Vindication, 13)—something that, he thinks, even atheists agree exists (Vindication, 14). They would only deny that this cause is wise, or would refuse the notion that this cause is immaterial, equating it instead with the “Material Universe” (Vindication, 14). To put it differently, Collins comes close to using the Lockean Axiom to advance atheism. At the very least, he makes it evident that accepting this axiom undermines fundamental theological commitments, because God and the divine attributes are generally held to be beyond the realm of creaturely experience and thus whatever idea we have of God must be empty (for discussion of Collins’ philosophy and the question of whether he is an atheist see O’Higgins 1970, Taranto 2000, and Agnesina 2018.) As we discuss in the next subsection, a similar way of arguing can also be found in John Toland’s Christianity not Mysterious (1696), which might have been an influence on Collins’ thinking. In contrast to Collins, though, Toland puts more emphasis on the connection between the Lockean Axiom and language, something that he also adopts from Locke.

b. John Toland

John Toland was an Irish-born deist who was raised as a Roman Catholic but converted to Anglicanism (the predominant denomination in Britain at the time) in his twenties. Throughout his writing career, Toland challenged figures in positions of authority. In Christianity not Mysterious, Toland takes aim at the Anglican clergy; this, ultimately, led to a public burning of several copies of the book by a hangman and Toland fleeing Dublin.

As mentioned in the previous section, Toland has a similar way of arguing compared to Collins in Christianity not Mysterious. This is no surprise if we consider that Toland highly esteemed Locke and accepts the Lockean Axiom. In fact, and, again, similarly to Collins, he implicitly draws from the axiom (or rather its contraposition) to argue against the religious mysteries of Christianity, such as the virgin birth of Jesus Christ or the latter’s resurrection from the dead. These events are mysterious in the sense that they cannot be explained without invoking a supernatural power because they conflict with the way things ‘naturally’ are. In line with such an understanding, Toland defines mysteries as “a thing of its own Nature inconceivable, and not to be judg’d by our ordinary Faculties and Ideas” (CNM, 93). The underlying idea is that mysteries are beyond the realm of our experience and that we cannot have an idea of any mystery because we cannot experience them—and so Toland says that “a Mystery expresses Nothing by Words that have no Ideas at all” (CNM, 84). In saying this, Toland is intending to follow Locke in holding that every meaningful word must stand for an idea and as such can be traced to some experience. As Locke says: “He that hath Names without Ideas, wants meaning in his Words, and speaks only empty Sounds’ (Essay 3.10.31). On this basis Toland argues that terms referring to mysteries are empty or meaningless because there can be no experiences of them. For instance, Toland criticises the doctrine of the Holy Trinity on this ground as well as arguing that it is neither supported by the bible nor any other form of divine revelation (CNM, § 3)—the existence of which is not rejected outright (compare CNM, 12).

In keeping with his critical attitude towards (religious) authorities, Toland claims that the Holy Trinity and other mysteries are an invention of “priest-craft” (CNM, 100) and nothing but a tool for submission. This point ties into his overall emancipatory aim of arguing for the right of everyone to use their reason in order to interpret the bible on their own, without interference by religious authorities (CNM, 5–14). For Toland believes that every reasonable person is capable of understanding the bible because reason is God-given. As Toland puts this point when addressing a potential clerical reader: “The uncorrupted Doctrines of Christianity are not above their [that is, the lay people’s] Reach or Comprehension, but the Gibberish of your Divinity Schools they understand not” (CNM, 87).

In short, Toland makes use of Lockean insights to tackle what were difficult and important theological questions of the day. By implicitly drawing on the Lockean Axiom and a broadly Lockean understanding of meaning, he argues against an overreach of clerical authority and against the existence of religious mysteries. For Toland, it holds that if something is really part of Christianity, it must also be accessible by our God-given reason (see also Daniel 1984 and the essays in Toland 1997 for more on Toland’s position).

c. George Berkeley

Throughout his life, Berkeley was very concerned with battling atheism or ideas which he thought undermined Christian teachings. His Principles of Human Knowledge was dedicated to identifying and rejecting the “grounds” for “Atheism and Irreligion” (Works II, 20). He also defends the idea that vision (NTV1709 § 147) or nature (NTV1732 § 147) is a divine language in his New Theory of Vision. Yet his most elaborate defense of the idea that we can experience God through nature is found in the fourth dialogue of Alciphron; or the Minute Philosopher (1732/52), which is a set of philosophical dialogues. In a nutshell, Berkeley argues that we have no direct access or experience of any other mind, including our fellow human beings or rational agents. Nonetheless most of us believe that other rational agents exist. The reason for this, Berkeley contends, is that these agents exhibit “signs” of their rationality which we can experience. Most notably, they communicate with us using language (AMP 4.5–7). Berkeley then argues (AMP 4.8–16) that nature—that is, everything we see, hear, smell, taste, and touch—literally forms a divine language (there are competing interpretations of how to best interpret this divine language; see, for example Fasko 2021 and Pearce 2017). This language not only shows that God (as a rational agent) exists, but also displays the divine goodness by providing us with “a sort of foresight which enables us to regulate our actions for the benefit of life. And without this we should be eternally at a loss” (PHK § 31). For example, God ensures that where there is fire there is smoke and, in the way, ‘tells’ us there is fire nearby, when we see smoke. In this way, Berkeley objects to the line of reasoning introduced at the beginning of this section—that we cannot have an idea of God because we cannot experience the deity—by showing that there is a sense in which we experience God, via the divine language that constitutes nature. Thus, Berkeley not only accepts the Lockean Axiom, but also accepts Collins’s point that we immediately experience God. What he rejects is the notion that there are no mediate signs for God’s existence because nature, as a divine language, is abundant with them.

While Alciphron provides evidence of God’s existence, Berkeley’s account of how we know (something) about God’s nature can be found in the Three Dialogues. There, he explains:

[T]aking the word ‘idea’ in a large sense, my soul may be said to furnish me with an idea, that is, an image or likeness of God, though indeed extremely inadequate. For all the notion I have of God is obtained by reflecting on my own soul, heightening its powers, and removing its imperfections. (DHP 231–32)

In other words, by reflecting on my own mind, but endeavoring to remove my imperfections, I can get a sense of what God’s mind must be like. Combined with the claims in Alciphron, Berkeley thus offers an account of knowledge of God’s existence and nature.

In the seventh dialogue of Alciphron, Berkeley tackles the challenge issued by Toland. Berkeley argues that it is not problematic that some words do not signify ideas and thus their meaning cannot be traced back to some experience. In fact, Berkeley argues, our everyday language is full of such words. These words still have a meaning because they serve a purpose:

[T]here may be another use of words besides that of marking and suggesting distinct ideas, to wit, the influencing our conduct and actions, which may be done either by forming rules for us to act by, or by raising certain passions, dispositions, or emotions in our minds (AMP 7.5).

Berkeley thus deems it irrelevant for the meaningfulness of a term whether it refers to ideas that are ultimately grounded in experience. Rather, its meaning needs to be judged by the function it serves. When it comes to the mysteries that Toland attacked, Berkeley argues it is irrelevant that we cannot experience them, as long as talking about them serves the right function, that is, it is still meaningful (AMP 7.14–31) (see Jakapi 2002; West 2018).

6. Anton Wilhelm Amo: A Case Study in the Limits of British Empiricism

We argued in the first section of this article that considering the Peripatetic axiom, or more precisely the Lockean Axiom, allows for a more inclusive and diverse alternative story than the standard narrative of ‘British Empiricism’ which solely focuses on Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. This was our motivation for moving away from the standard narrative and focusing on the Lockean Axiom. The advantages of the narrative presented here are that it can incorporate a wider variety of issues and thinkers. However, we also pointed out that the narrative told here is neither exclusive nor exhaustive. Rather than this being a fault specific to our chosen narrative, we think this is an inevitable consequence of developing narratives that include some figures or ideas and exclude others.

This final section’s aim is to further put this narrative into perspective—not least, to make it abundantly clear that we do not intend to replace the standard narrative with the ‘correct’ story of ‘British Empiricism’. Rather, our aim is to illustrate that we are forced to tell stories that involve difficult choices, which ought to be, nonetheless, deliberate (and transparent) and to show what kind of stories can be told and what the limitations of narratives, such as the one developed here, are. In the following, we therefore first introduce a fringe case—that is, a thinker who could, on certain readings, be read as an ‘empiricist’—in the form of Anton Wilhelm Amo (1703–1756), the first African to receive a doctorate in Europe and a figure who is increasingly of interest to Early Modern scholars (for example, Wiredu 2004, Emma-Adamah 2015, Meyns 2019, Menn and Smith 2020, Smith 2015, Walsh 2019, West 2022).

The aim in doing so is to demonstrate that the Peripatetic Axiom transcended the boundaries of early modern Britain and that it was quite possible for thinkers on the continent to have just as much (if not more) in common with, for example, Locke than Descartes (in turn, this indicates that the traditional story of ‘empiricism versus rationalism’ cannot simply be replaced with ‘Lockeanism versus Cartesianism’). The case of Amo also puts pressure on the cohesiveness of the concept of ‘British Empiricism’—in short, there is nothing uniquely British about being an ‘empiricist’ (that is, accepting the Peripatetic Axiom or the Lockean Axiom). We begin with a very brief overview of Amo’s philosophy before drawing out the tension between, on the one hand, Amo’s commitment to the Peripatetic Axiom and, on the other, the difficulty that arises if we try to place him in the ‘empiricist’ tradition. The case of Amo, we think, shows that there simply is not—in any realist sense—any fact of the matter about whether this or that philosopher is or is not an ‘empiricist.’

Anton Wilhelm Amo wrote four texts during his life time: the Inaugural Dissertation on the Impassivity of the Human Mind, the Philosophical Disputation Containing a Distinct Idea of those Things that Pertain either to the Mind or to Our Living and Organic Body (both written in 1734), a Treatise on the Art of Philosophising Soberly and Accurately, and On the Rights of Moors in Europe (his first text, published in 1729, which, sadly, is now lost). The three surviving texts outline Amo’s account of the mind-body relation, which is substance dualist, and his theory of knowledge. Specifically, the Inaugural Dissertation and the Philosophical Disputation both defend a roughly Cartesian account of the mind-body relation and mind-body interaction. Amo is critical of certain elements of Descartes’ view—in particular, the idea that the mind can ‘suffer’ with (that is, passively experience sensations) the body (ID, 179–81). Yet, while he is critical, Amo’s aim is not to dismiss but to fix these kinds of issues with Descartes’ dualism (Nwala 1978, 163; Smith 2015, 219). While it is not clear cut, there is therefore a case to be made for thinking of Amo as a ‘Cartesian’—if, by ‘Cartesian’, we mean something like a thinker who sets out to augment Descartes’ worldview in order to defend or support it. He is certainly not an outright critic. At the very least, it would be difficult to place Amo in the ‘empiricist’ tradition—at least as it is typically construed—given the underlying Cartesian flavour of his philosophical system.

What makes Amo an interesting ‘fringe’ case for ‘empiricism’—and, indeed, Cartesianism too—is his explicit commitment to the Peripatetic Axiom (see, for example, Treatise, 139, 141, 146). Like Hobbes and Locke—as well as Aristotelian scholastics like Aquinas before them (see section 2.1)—Amo maintains that there is nothing in the intellect not first in the senses. Other Cartesians, like Antoine Arnauld for example, explicitly rejected the Peripatetic Axiom. As Arnauld puts it, “It is false…that all of our ideas come through our senses” (Arnauld 1970, 7). Now, it is worth noting that Amo is not a lone outlier. Other Cartesians, like Robert Desgabets or Pierre-Sylvain Régis, also accepted the Peripatetic Axiom—thus, there are further fringe cases. Nonetheless, Amo’s body of work is greatly suited to illustrate the limitations of our narrative and, in fact, any narrative that makes use of ‘empiricism’, or related notions like ‘Cartesianism’, as labels. For, on the one hand, Amo has in common with traditional ‘empiricists’, like Locke, a commitment to the Peripatetic Axiom. But on the other, he wants to defend and improve the philosophical system of someone (that is, Descartes) who has come to epitomize like no other what ‘rationalism’ is about.

One might demand to know: ‘Well, is Amo an empiricist or not?’ But what this discussion shows, we contend, is that when it comes to Amo, or others like Desgabet or Régis, there is no simple (or ‘right’) answer. The answer depends on what is meant by ‘empiricist’—and this, in turn, might depend upon the context in which that concept is being employed or the use to which it is being put.

In that sense, Amo’s body of work is illustrative of the very fundamental problem or ‘danger’ that the attribution of any “-ism”—that is, analyst’s rather than actor’s categories—runs, particularly if these positions are taken to be dichotomous to others: such attributions risk obfuscating important similarities or differences between thinkers’ ideas or simply omitting interesting thinkers or ideas just because they do not fit the story—and, crucially, not because they are underserving of attention.

There are other reasons to think of someone like Amo as a particularly significant figure when it comes to examining, and revising, the historical canon—and categories like ‘empiricism’ in particular. In light of growing interest in and demand for non-Western figures, and thinkers from typically marginalised backgrounds, both in teaching and scholarship, Amo—the first African to receive a doctorate in Europe—has picked up considerable attention. But in what context should we teach or write about Amo? Continuing to think in terms of the standard narrative of ‘British Empiricism’ versus ‘Continental Rationalism’ will, as the above discussion showed, not make it easy to incorporate Amo’s work into syllabi or research—precisely because there is no objective fact of the matter about whether he is one or the other. And, as we have already suggested, Amo is not alone; this is true of many figures who, not coincidentally, have never quite found a place in the standard early modern canon. We think there are ways to incorporate figures like Amo into our familiar narratives—for instance, construing ‘empiricism’ in terms of an adherence to the Peripatetic Axiom does, in that sense, make Amo an ‘empiricist’—but such cases also provide reasons to think that we ought to take a serious look at what purpose those narratives serve and whether we, as scholars and educators, want them to continue to do so. New narratives are available and might better serve our aims, and correspond with our values, in teaching and scholarship going forward.

7. References and Further Reading

When citing primary sources, we have always aimed to use the canonical or most established forms. In the cases where there are no such forms, we used abbreviations that seemed sensible to us. Also, if the text is not originally written in English, we have utilized standardly used translations. Finally, we want to note that on each of these figures and issues there is way more high-quality scholarship than we were able to point towards in this article. The references we provide are merely intended to be a starting point for anyone who wants to explore these figures and issues in more detail.

a. Primary Sources

  • Amo, Anton Wilhelm. Anton Wilhelm Amo’s Philosophical Dissertations on Mind and Body. Edited by Smith, Justin EH, and Stephen Menn. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2020.
  • The first critical translation of Amo’s work espousing his philosophy of mind.

  • Amo, Anton Wilhelm. Treatise on the art of philosophising soberly and accurately (with commentaries). In T. U. Nwala (Ed.), William Amo Centre for African Philosophy. University of Nigeria, 1990.
  • Amo’s most systematic text in which he offers a guide to logic and fleshes out his account of the mind-body relation and philosophy of mind.

  • Aristotle. [APo.], Posterior Analytics, trans. Hugh Tredennick, in Aristotle: Posterior Analytics, Topica, Loeb Classical Library, Cambridge, MA; London: William Heinemann, 1964, pp. 2–261.
  • One of the most prominent English translations of Aristotle’s famous work on science.

  • Aristotle. [EN], The Nicomachean Ethics, trans. H. Rackham, Loeb Classical Library, London: William Heinemann, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1947.
  • One of the most prominent English translations of Aristotle’s famous work on ethics.

  • Aristotle. [GA], De la génération des animaux, ed. Pierre Louis, Collection des Universités de France, Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1961; trans. A. L. Peck, in Aristotle, Generation of Animals, Loeb Classical Library, London: William Heinemann, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1953.
  • One of the most prominent English translations of Aristotle’s famous work on biology.

  • Aristotle. [Meteor.], Meteorologica, trans. H. D. P. Lee, Loeb Classical Library, London: William Heinemann, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1962.
  • One of the most prominent English translations of Aristotle’s famous work on the elements.

  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle. Edited by Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Standard English translation used by scholars of Aristotle’s complete works.

  • Arnauld, Antoine. La Logique, ou L’Art de penser. Flammarion, 1970.
  • Edition of Arnauld and Nicole’s logic textbook.

  • Arnauld, Antoine and Nicole, Pierre. Logic, or, The art of thinking in which, besides the common, are contain’d many excellent new rules, very profitable for directing of reason and acquiring of judgment in things as well relating to the instruction of for the excellency of the matter printed many times in French and Latin, and now for publick good translated into English by several hands. London: Printed by T.B. for H. Sawbridge, 1685.
  • Early English translation of this important text for the so-called Port-Royal Logic; an influential logic textbook.

  • Aquinas, Thomas. [DA] A Commentary on Aristotle’s De anima. Edited by Robert Pasnau. New Haven, CN: Yale University Press, 1999.
  • English translation of Aquinas’ commentary on Aristotle’s famous text on the soul.

  • Aquinas, Thomas. Truth.Translated by Mulligan, Robert W., James V. McGlynn, and Robert W. Schmidt. 3 volumes. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
  • English translation of Aquinas commentary on Aristotle’s famous text on the soul.

  • Astell, Mary. A Serious Proposal to the Ladies. Parts I and II. Edited by P. Springborg. Ontario: Broadview Literary Texts, 2002.
  • Argues for women’s education and offers a way for women to improve their critical thinking skills.

  • Astell, Mary. The Christian Religion, As Profess’d by a Daughter of the Church of England. In a Letter to the Right Honourable, T.L. C.I., London: R. Wilkin, 1705.
  • Introduces Astell’s religious and philosophical views and continues her feminist project.

  • Bacon, Francis. The Works. Edited by J. Spedding, R. L. Ellis, and D. D. Heath. 15 volumes. London: Houghton Mifflin, 1857–1900.
  • First edition of Bacon’s works, still in use by scholars.

  • Bacon, Roger. [OM] The ‘Opus Maius’ of Roger Bacon. Edited Robert Belle Burke. 2 volumes. New York: Russell & Russell, 1928.
  • One if not the most important works of Bacon, attempting to cover all aspects of natural science .

  • Berkeley, George. The Correspondence of George Berkeley. Edited by Marc A. Hight. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013.
  • Most comprehensive edition of Berkeley’s correspondence with friends, family, and contemporaries thinkers.

  • Berkeley, George. The Works of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne. Edited by A. A. Luce and T. E. Jessop. 9 volumes. London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, 1948-1957
  • Currently the standard scholarly edition of Berkeley’s writings.

  • Cavendish, Margaret. Observations upon Experimental Philosophy, Edited by Eileen O’Neill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Cavendish’s critique of the experimental philosophy of the Royal Society in London, and a defence of her own philosophical system.

  • Cavendish, Margaret. Grounds of Natural Philosophy. Edited by Anne M. Thell. Peterborough, Canada: Broadview Press, 2020.
  • The most detailed articulation of Cavendish’s ‘vitalist’ philosophical system of nature.

  • Cavendish, Margaret. The Blazing World and Other Writings. London: Penguin Classics, 1994.
  • Cavendish’s fantasy novel, with critiques the Royal Society and was published alongside her Observations

  • Collins, Anthony. A Discourse of Free-thinking: Occasion’d by the Rise and Growth of a Sect Call’d Free-thinkers. London,1713.
  • A defence of the right to think for oneself on any question.

  • Collins, Anthony. A vindication of the divine attributes In some remarks on his grace the Archbishop of Dublin’s sermon, intituled, Divine predestination and foreknowledg consistent with the freedom of man’s will. H. Hills, and sold by the booksellers of London and Westminster, 1710.
  • A critique of Archbishop King’s sermon, arguing that King’s position is effectively no different from atheism.

  • Conway, Anne. The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy. Translated by J. C[lark]. London, 1692.
  • First English translation of Conway’s only known book introducing her metaphysics and system of nature.

  • Hobbes, Thomas. Leviathan, with selected variants from the Latin edition of 1668. Edited by Edwin Curley. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994
  • Hobbes’ influential political treatise, in which he also defends materialism and an ‘empiricist’ theory of knowledge.

  • Hume, David. Enquiries concerning Human Understanding and concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 3rd ed. revised by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Standard scholarly edition of Hume’s famous work in which he lays out his moral and political philosophy.

  • Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. Edited by L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd edition revised by P. H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Standard scholarly edition of Hume’s famous work in which he lays out his account of human nature and begins to develop an account of the human mind.

  • Hutcheson, Francis. An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. Edited by Wolfgang Leidhold. Indianapolis: Liberty Fun, 2004.
  • Hutcheson’s influential texts on ethics and aesthetics, in which he argues that we have both a moral sense and a sense of beauty.

  • Hutcheson, Francis. An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions, with Illustrations on the Moral Sense. Edited by Aaron Garret. Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 2002.
  • A text outlining Hutcheson’s moral philosophy.

  • King, William. Archbishop King’s Sermon on Predestination. Edited by David Berman and Andrew Carpenter. Cadenus Press: Dublin, 1976.
  • A sermon on predestination that revolving around the issue of divine attributes and the way we can meaningfully talk about these attributes and God’s nature.

  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm. Die philosophischen Schriften. Edited by Carl Immanuel Gerhardt. 7 volumes. Weidmann: Berlin, 1875–90.
  • Standard scholarly edition of all of Leibniz’s works.

  • Locke, John. An Essay concerning Human Understanding. Edited by Peter H. Nidditch. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Standard scholarly edition of Locke’s most famous work, providing his description of the human mind.

  • Masham, Damaris. Occasional Thoughts in Reference to a Vertuous or Christian Life, London: A. and J. Churchil, 1705.
  • Masham’s second book develops the views of the Discourse in relation to practical morality.

  • Masham, Damaris. A Discourse Concerning the Love of God, London: Awsnsham and John Churchill, 1696.
  • Argues that humans are social and rational as well as motivated by love of happiness.

  • Newcome, Susanna. An Enquiry into the Evidence of the Christian Religion. By a Lady [ie S. Newcome]. The second edition, with additions. London: William Innys, 1732.
  • Newcome’s book espousing her views on morality and a defence of the Christian religion.

  • Plato. Plato: Complete Works. Edited by John M. Cooper. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997.
  • A standard English edition of Plato’s complete works.

  • Shepherd, Mary. Essays on the Perception of an External Universe, and Other Subjects connected with the Doctrine of Causation. London: John Hatchard and Son, 1827.
  • Shepherd’s second book introducing her metaphysics by establishing that there is an independently and continuously existing external world.

  • Shepherd, Mary. An Essay upon the Relation of Cause and Effect, controverting the Doctrine of Mr. Hume, concerning the Nature of the Relation; with Observations upon the Opinions of Dr. Brown and Mr. Lawrence, Connected with the Same Subject. London: printed for T. Hookham, Old Bond Street, 1824.
  • Shepherd’s first book introducing her notion of causation by way of rejecting a Humean notion of causation.

  • Toland, John. John Toland’s Christianity Not Mysterious: Text, Associated Works, and Critical Essays. Edited by Philip McGuinness, Alan Harrison, and Richard Kearney. Dublin: Liliput Press, 1997.
  • Critical edition of one of Toland’s most famous works which argues that nothing that is above or beyond reason that is part of Christianity.

  • Wollstonecraft, Mary. A Vindication of the Rights of Woman with Strictures on Political and Moral Subjects. Edited by Sylvana Tomaselli, in A Vindication of the Rights of Men with A Vindication of the Rights of Woman and Hints, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Critical edition of Wollstonecraft’s groundbreaking work arguing for women’s rights.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Agnesina, Jacopo. The philosophy of Anthony Collins: free-thought and atheism. Paris: Honoré Champion, 2018.
  • Consideration of Collins’ philosophy with a focus on the question whether he is an atheist.

  • Anfray, Jean-Pascal. “Leibniz and Descartes.”In The Oxford Handbook of Descartes and Cartesianism edited by Steven Nadler, Tad M. Schmaltz, and Delphine Antoine-Mahut, 721–37, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2019.
  • Essay considering the complicated relationship between two rationalists.

  • Atherton, Margaret. “Lady Mary Shepherd’s Case Against George Berkeley. ” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 4 (1996): 347–66. Doi: 10.1080/09608789608570945
  • First article to discuss and evaluate Shepherd’s criticism of Berkeley.

  • Atherton, Margaret, ed. Women philosophers of the early modern period. Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett, 1994.
  • Groundbreaking volume that contains various women philosophers and present excerpts of their works, intended for their inclusion in the classroom.

  • Atherton, Margaret. “Cartesian reason and gendered reason.” In A mind of one’s own edited by Louise Antony and Charlotte Witt, 21-37, Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1993.
  • Argues against first generation feminist critiques for the emancipatory potential that Cartesianism held for some female thinkers.

  • Atherton, Margaret. Berkeley’s Revolution in Vision. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • The most comprehensive study of Berkeley’s theory of vision/ philosophy of perception.

  • Ayers, Michael. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. London: Routledge, 1991.
  • An in-depth discussion of Locke’s theory of knowledge and metaphysics.

  • Bahar, Saba. Mary Wollstonecraft’s Social and Aesthetic Philosophy: An Eve to Please Me. New York: Palgrave, 2002.
  • Sustained discussion of the way that aesthetic considerations (pertaining to the presentation of women) play a crucial role for Wollstonecraft’s feminist project.

  • Beauchamp, T.L. and A. Rosenberg. Hume and the Problem of Causation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Classical study of the Humean notion of causation and its problems.

  • Bell, Martin. “Hume on Causation.” In The Cambridge Companion to Hume’s Treatise, edited by Donald C. Ainslie, and Annemarie Butler, 147–76, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015.
  • Consideration of Hume’s view of causation, highlighting the centrality of this issue for understanding his philosophical system.

  • Bennett, Jonathan. Locke, Berkeley, Hume: Central Themes. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
  • Classical story of the three so-called empiricist which highlights issues discussed by all of these thinkers.

  • Bergès, Sandrine, and Coffee, Alan. The Social and Political Philosophy of Mary Wollstonecraft. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2016.
  • Essays that distinctively consider Wollstonecraft as a philosopher and relate her to her intellectual context as well as contemporary debates.

  • Bergès, Sandrine. The Routledge guidebook to Wollstonecraft’s A Vindication of the Rights of Woman. London: Routledge, 2013.
  • Contributions introducing readers to Wollstonecraft’s famous work of women’s rights and hence also to the origins of feminist thought.

  • Bolton, Martha Brandt. “Lady Mary Shepherd and David Hume on Cause and Effect.” Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women’s Philosophical Thought edited by Eileen O’Neill & Marcy P. Lascano, 129–52, Cham: Springer, 2019.
  • Sustained discussion of the different understanding of causation by Hume and Shepherd.

  • Bolton, Martha. “Causality and Causal Induction: The Necessitarian Theory of Lady Mary Shepherd. ” In Causation and Modern Philosophy, edited by Keith Allen and Tom Stoneham, 242–61. New York: Routledge, 2010.
  • Classical article on Shepherd’s idiosyncratic notion of causation and the way she departs from Hume.

  • Boyle Deborah. Mary Shepherd: A Guide. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2023.
  • First book length treatment of Shepherd’s metaphysics, discussing her core commitments and pointing to helpful secondary literature.

  • Boyle, Deborah. “Mary Shepherd on Mind, Soul, and Self.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 58, no. 1 (2020): 93–112. Doi: 10.1353/hph.2020.0005
  • First sustained discussion of Shepherd’s philosophy of mind.

  • Boyle, Deborah A. The well-ordered universe: The philosophy of Margaret Cavendish. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2018.
  • In-depth discussion of Cavendish’s metaphysics.

  • Broad, Jacqueline. “Damaris Masham on Women and Liberty of Conscience.” Feminist History of Philosophy: The Recovery and Evaluation of Women’s Philosophical Thought edited by Eileen O’Neill & Marcy P. Lascano, 319–36, Cham: Springer, 2019.
  • One of the first considerations of the role and of the ethics of toleration.

  • Broad, Jacqueline. The philosophy of Mary Astell: An early modern theory of virtue. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015.
  • Argues that Astell’s ethical goals are at the center of her philosophical project and help to unite some of her seemingly diverging commitments.

  • Broad, Jacqueline. “A woman’s influence? John Locke and Damaris Masham on moral accountability.” Journal of the History of Ideas 67, no. 3 (2006): 489–510. Doi:
  • Considers the influence Masham had on Locke’s notion of moral accountability.

  • Chappell, Vere Ed. Essays on Early Modern Philosophy, John Locke—Theory of Knowledge. London: Garland Publishing, 1992.
  • Contributions on a broad variety of issues that pertain to Locke theories of knowledge ranging from triangles to memory.

  • Conley, John J. “Suppressing Women Philosophers: The Case of the Early Modern Canon.” Early Modern Women: An Interdisciplinary Journal 1, no. 1 (2006): 99-114. Doi: 10.1086/EMW23541458
  • Consideration of the exclusion of women from the history of philosophy with a focus on the challenges of their reintegration.

  • Connolly, Patrick J. “Susanna Newcome and the Origins of Utilitarianism.” Utilitas 33, no. 4 (2021): 384–98. Doi: 10.1017/S0953820821000108
  • One of the few scholarly works on Newcome arguing that she occupies a noteworthy position at the dawn of utilitarianism.

  • Costelloe, Timothy M. Aesthetics and morals in the philosophy of David Hume. London: Routledge, 2013.
  • A broad discussion of Hume’s ethics and aesthetics.

  • Cranefield, Paul F. “On the Origin of the Phrase NIHIL EST IN INTELLECTU QUOD NON PRIUS PUERIT IN SENSU.” Journal of the history of medicine and allied sciences 25, no. 1 (1970): 77–80. Doi: 10.1093/jhmas/XXV.1.77
  • Early article looking into the origin of the Peripatetic axiom as found in Locke.

  • Cruz, Maité. “Shepherd’s Case for the Demonstrability of Causal Principles.” Ergo: An Open Access Journal of Philosophy (forthcoming).
  • Argues that Shepherd endorses a broadly Lockean or Aristotelian substance metaphysics.

  • Cunning, David. Cavendish. London: Routledge, 2016.
  • An introduction to Cavendish’s life and philosophical contributions.

  • Daniel, Stephen H. George Berkeley and Early Modern Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2021.
  • Book length treatments of Berkeley, relating his views to many other Early Modern figures and Ramism.

  • Daniel, Stephen Hartley. John Toland: His methods, manners, and mind. Kingston/Montreal: McGill-Queen’s Press-MQUP, 1984.
  • Only one of few book length studies of Toland and his philosophy.

  • Detlefsen, Karen. “Atomism, Monism, and Causation in the Natural Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish. ” Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy 3 (2006): 199–240. Doi: 10.1093/oso/9780199203949.003.0007
  • A paper covering Cavendish’s rejection of atomism and commitment to monism, and her theory of causation.

  • Emma-Adamah, Victor U. “Anton Wilhelm Amo (1703-1756) the African‐German philosopher of mind: an eighteen-century intellectual history.” PhD diss., University of the Free State, 2015.
  • A doctoral dissertation on Amo’s account of the mind-body relation.

  • Falco, Maria J., ed. Feminist Interpretations of Mary Wollstonecraft. University Park PA: Penn State Press, 2010.
  • Includes contributions on the political and social impact of Wollstonecraft’s views.

  • Fasko, Manuel. Die Sprache Gottes: George Berkeleys Auffassung des Naturgeschehens. Basel/Berlin: Schwabe Verlag, 2021.
  • Detailed discussion of Berkeley’s divine language hypothesis arguing, contra Pearce, that only vision is the language of God.

  • Fasko, Manuel, and Peter West. “The Irish Context of Berkeley’s ‘Resemblance Thesis.’ ” Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplements 88 (2020): 7–31. Doi 10.1017/S1358246120000089
  • Arguing for the importance of the notion that representation requires resemblance in Berkeley’s intellectual context.

  • Fields, Keota. Berkeley: Ideas, Immateralism, and Objective Presence. Lanham: Lexington Books, 2011.
  • Discussion of Berkeley’s immaterialism in context of Descartes’ notion of objective presence that requires causal explanations of the content of ideas .

  • Frankel, Lois. “Damaris Cudworth Masham: A seventeenth century feminist philosopher.” Hypatia 4, no. 1 (1989): 80–90. Doi: 10.1111/j.1527-2001.1989.tb00868.x
  • Early art icle showing that Masham is a philosopher in her own right by espousing her feminist views.

  • Frankena, William. “Hutcheson’s Moral Sense Theory.” Journal of the History of Ideas (1955): 356-375. Doi:
  • Classic article on Hutcheson’s notion that we have a moral sense (much like a sense for seeing).

  • Galvagni, Enrico. “Secret Sentiments: Hume on Pride, Decency, and Virtue.” Hume Studies 47, no. 1 (2022): 131–55. Doi: 10.1353/hms.2022.0007
  • Discusses Hume’s account of decency and argues that it challenges standard virtue ethical interpretations of Hume.

  • Garrett, Don. “Hume’s Theory of Causation.” In The Cambridge Companion to Hume’s Treatise, edited by Donald C. Ainslie, and Annemarie Butler, 69–100, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015.
  • An introductory overview of Hume’s controversial theory of causation.

  • Gasser-Wingate, Marc. Aristotle’s Empiricism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2021.
  • An in-depth discussion of Aristotle’s view that all knowledge comes from perception.

  • Gordon‐Roth, Jessica, and Nancy Kendrick. “Including Early Modern Women Writers in Survey Courses: A Call to Action.” Metaphilosophy 46, no. 3 (2015): 364–79. Doi: 10.1111/meta.12137
  • Arguing for the importance of including women philosopher’s not in the least because of the current underrepresentation of women in the discipline.

  • Gracyk, Theodore A. “Rethinking Hume’s standard of taste.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 52, no. 2 (1994): 169–82.
  • A novel reading of Hume’s account of our knowledge of beauty.

  • Harris, James A. “Shaftesbury, Hutcheson and the Moral Sense. ” In The Cambridge History of Moral Philosophy, edited by Sacha Golob and Jens Timmermann, 325–37. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2017. Doi: 10.1017/9781139519267.026
  • An introductory overview of Hutcheson’s account of the moral sense.

  • Hutton, Sarah. “Women, philosophy and the history of philosophy.” In Women Philosophers from the Renaissance to the Enlightenment, edited by Ruth Hagengruber and Sarah Hutton 12–29. New York: Routledge, 2021.
  • A discussion of why and how women are omitted from many histories of philosophy.

  • Hutton, Sarah. “Liberty of Mind: Women Philosophers and the Freedom to Philosophize.” In Women and liberty, 1600-1800: philosophical essays edited by Jacqueline Broad, and Karen Detlefsen,123–37. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017.
  • A paper arguing that women in early modern philosophy construed liberty as ‘freedom of the mind.’

  • Hutton, Sarah. “Religion and sociability in the correspondence of Damaris Masham (1658–1708).” In Religion and Women in Britain, c. 1660-1760, edited by Sarah Apetrei and Hannah Smith, 117–30. London: Routledge, 2016.
  • A discussion of Masham’s religious and social views, as espoused in her correspondences.

  • Hutton, Sarah. Anne Conway: A woman philosopher. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Detailed discussion of Conway’s philosophy and her intellectual context

  • Jakapi, Roomet. “Emotive meaning and Christian mysteries in Berkeley’s Alciphron.” British journal for the history of philosophy 10, no. 3 (2002): 401–11. Doi:
  • Discusses the notion that Berkeley has an emotive theory of meaning.

  • Jolley, Nicholas. Locke, His Philosophical Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • A broad discussion of Locke’s philosophical project.

  • Jones, Tom. George Berkeley: A Philosophical Life. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2021.
  • The most comprehensive study of Berkeley’s life and intellectual context.

  • Kivy, Peter. The Seventh Sense: Francis Hutchenson and Eighteenth-Century British Aesthetics. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2003.
  • An in-depth discussion of Hutcheson’s account of the sense of beauty.

  • Landy, David. “Shepherd on Hume’s Argument for the Possibility of Uncaused Existence.” Journal of Modern Philosophy 2 no. 1: 2020a. Doi: 10.32881/jomp.128
  • Discusses Shepherd’s criticism of Hume’s argument.

  • Landy, David. “A Defense of Shepherd’s Account of Cause and Effect as Synchronous.” Journal of Modern Philosophy 2, no. 1 (2020). Doi: 10.32881/jomp.46
  • Important discussion of Shepherd’s. account of synchronicity, defending this account against Humean worries.

  • Landy, David. “Hume’s theory of mental representation.” Hume Studies 38, no. 1 (2012): 23–54. Doi: 10.1353/hms.2012.0001
  • A novel interpretation of Hume’s account of how the mind represents external objects.

  • Landy, David. “Hume’s impression/idea distinction.” Hume Studies 32, no. 1 (2006): 119–39. Doi: 10.1353/hms.2011.0295
  • A discussion of Hume’s account of the relation between impressions and ideas.

  • Lascano, Marcy P. The Metaphysics of Margaret Cavendish and Anne Conway: Monism, Vitalism, and Self-Motion. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2023.
  • Comprehensive discussion and comparison of Cavendish and Conway on three major themes in their philosophy.

  • Loeb, Louis E. Reflection and the stability of belief: essays on Descartes, Hume, and Reid. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010.
  • A discussion of the connections between Descartes, Hume, and Reid’s philosophies.

  • LoLordo, Antonia. Mary Shepherd. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2022.
  • A broad overview of Shepherd’s philosophy, suitable for beginners.

  • LoLordo, Antonia, ed. Mary Sheperd’s Essays on the Perception of an External Universe. Oxford: Oxford Univeristy Press, 2020.
  • First critical edition of Shepherd’s 1827 book and 1832 paper.

  • Mackie, J. L. Problems from Locke, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1971.
  • A discussion of the philosophical problems, relevant even today, that arise in Locke’s writing.

  • Mercer, Christia. “Empowering Philosophy.” In Proceedings and Addresses of the APA, vol. 94 (2020): 68–96.
  • An attempt to use philosophy’s past to empower it’s present and to promote a public-facing attitude to philosophy.

  • Meyns, Chris. “Anton Wilhelm Amo’s philosophy of mind.” Philosophy Compass 14, no. 3 (2019): e12571. Doi: 10.1111/phc3.12571
  • The first paper to provide a reconstruction of Amo’s philosophy of mind, suitable for beginners.

  • Michael, Emily. “Francis Hutcheson on aesthetic perception and aesthetic pleasure.” The British Journal of Aesthetics 24, no. 3 (1984): 241–55. Doi: 10.1093/bjaesthetics/24.3.241
  • A discussion of the sense of beauty and the feeling of pleasure in Hutcheson.

  • Myers, Joanne E. “Enthusiastic Improvement: Mary Astell and Damaris Masham on Sociability.” Hypatia 28, no. 3 (2013): 533–50. Doi: 10.1111/j.1527-2001.2012.01294.x
  • A discussion of the social philosophy of two early modern women.

  • Nwala, T. Uzodinma. “Anthony William Amo of Ghana on The Mind-Body Problem.” Présence Africaine 4 (1978): 158–65. Doi: 10.3917/presa.108.0158
  • An early attempt to reconstruct Amo’s response to the mind-body problem.

  • Influential paper since it is one of the first to discuss the problems and limits of the standard narrative that contrasts empiricism and rationalism.

  • Noxon, J. Hume’s Philosophical Development. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1973.
  • A discussion of the development and changes in Hume’s philosophy over his lifetime.

  • O’Higgins, James. Anthony Collins the Man and His Works. The Hague : Martinus Nijhoff, 1970.
  • Still one of the most detailed discussions of Collins philosophy and intellectual context in English.

  • O’Neill, Eileen. “HISTORY OF PHILOSOPHY: Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and Their Fate in History.” Philosophy in a Feminist Voice: Critiques and Reconstructions, edited by Janet A. Kourany, 17-62. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998.
  • Groundbreaking paper demonstrating how women thinkers have eradicated from the history of philosophy.

  • Pearce, Kenneth L. Language and the Structure of Berkeley’s World. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017.
  • Detailed consideration of Berkeley’s divine language hypothesis (that is, the notion that nature is the language of God).

  • Rickless, Samuel C. “Is Shepherd’s pen mightier than Berkeley’s word?.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy26, no. 2 (2018): 317–30. Doi: 10.1080/09608788.2017.1381584
  • Discussion of Shepherd’s criticism of Berkeley.

  • Rickless, Samuel C. Berkeley’s argument for idealism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013.
  • Critically discusses Berkeley’s arguments for idealism.

  • Sapiro, Virginia. A vindication of political virtue: The political theory of Mary Wollstonecraft. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
  • One of the first detailed discussions of Wollstonecraft’s’ political thought.

  • Saporiti, Katia. Die Wirklichkeit der Dinge. Frankfurt a. M.; Klostermann, 2006.
  • Critical examination of Berkeley’s metaphysics.

  • Seppalainen, Tom, and Angela Coventry. “Hume’s Empiricist Inner Epistemology: A Reassessment of the Copy Principle.” In The Continuum Companion to Hume, edited by Alan Bailey, Daniel Jayes O’Brie 38–56, London: Continuum, 2012.
  • Looks at exactly how Hume’s ‘copy principle’ (the claim that all ideas are copies of impressions) works.

  • Shapiro, Lisa. “Revisiting the early modern philosophical canon.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association 2, no. 3 (2016): 365–83. Doi: 10.1017/apa.2016.27
  • Critical consideration of the standard narrative arguing for a more inclusive story in terms of figures and issues considered.

  • Shelley, James. “Empiricism: Hutcheson and Hume.” In The Routledge companion to aesthetics, edited by Berys Gaut and Dominic Lopes, 55–68. London: Routledge, 2005.
  •  An overview of Hutcheson and Hume’s ‘empiricist’ approach to beauty and aesthetics.

  • Shelley, James R. “Hume and the Nature of Taste.” The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 56, no. 1 (1998): 29–38. Doi: 10.2307/431945
  • Focuses on the ‘normative force’ in Hume’s conception of taste.

  • Smith, Justin EH. Nature, human nature, and human difference: Race in early modern philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2015.
  • Investigates the rise of the category of race in the Early Modern period.

  • Taranto, Pascal. Du déisme à l’athéisme: la libre-pensée d’Anthony Collins. Paris: Honoré Champion, 2000.
  • Discusses Collins’ writings and the question whether he is a (covert) atheist.

  • Thomas, Emily. “Time, Space, and Process in Anne Conway.” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 25, no 5 (2017): 990–1010. Doi: 10.1080/09608788.2017.1302408
  • Discussion of Conway’s views in relation to Leibniz, arguing that Conway is ultimately closer to Henry More.

  • Townsend, Dabney. Hume’s aesthetic theory: Taste and sentiment. London: Routledge, 2013.
  • Close examination of Hume’s aesthetic theory.

  • Traiger, Saul  Ed. The Blackwell Guide to Hume’s “Treatise”. Oxford: Blackwell, 2006. Student guide to Hume’s famous work . Doi: 10.1353/jhi.2016.0017
  • Arguing for the emergence of the standard narrative in 20th century based on its simplicity and aptness for teaching.

  • Walsh, Julie. “Amo on the Heterogeneity Problem.” Philosophers’ Imprint 19, no. 41 (2019): 1–18. Doi:
  • A discussion of a problem facing Amo’s philosophy, about how the mind and body can be in unison if they are heterogeneous entities.

  • West, Peter. “Why Can An Idea Be Like Nothing But Another Idea? A Conceptual Interpretation of Berkeley’s Likeness Principle” Journal of the American Philosophical Association 7, no. 4 (2021): 530-548. Doi: doi:10.1017/apa.2020.34
  • An account of why Berkeley thinks an idea can be like nothing but another idea.

  • West, Peter. ‘Mind-Body Commerce: Occasional Causation and Mental Representation in Anton Wilhelm Amo” Philosophy Compass 17, no. 9 (2022). Doi:
  • An overview of secondary literature on Amo’s philosophy of mind so far, and a new reading of how his theory of mental representation works.


Author Information

Manuel Fasko
University of Basel


Peter West
Northeastern University London
United Kingdom