The Arrow of Time

Many philosophers and physicists claim that time has an arrow that points in a special direction. The Roman poet Ovid may have referred to this one-way property of time when he said, “Time itself glides on with constant motion, ever as a flowing river.” However, understanding this arrow is not as straightforward as some believe. For instance, many researchers say a better illustration of time’s arrow should not mention “time itself,” as Ovid did, because time itself has no arrow, just as space itself has no arrow.

Experts divide into two broad camps on the question of the arrow’s foundation. Members of the intrinsic camp say time’s arrow is an intrinsic feature of time itself. Many of them describe the arrow as an uninterrupted passage or flow from the past to the future. Members of the extrinsic camp say the arrow is instead all the processes that happen to go regularly in only one time direction, such as heat flowing into adjacent cold objects and not out of them, balloons exploding but not imploding, and people becoming biologically older, not younger.

If the extrinsic position were correct, one might naturally expect that the underlying, fundamental laws of physics would reveal why all those processes are seen to go regularly in only one time direction; but the laws do not—at least the fundamental ones do not. A normal documentary movie, if shown in reverse, is surprising to the viewer, but it does not show anything that is not permitted by the fundamental laws. To explain this, some philosophers of physics point to the need to discover a new fundamental law that implies there is an arrow. Others suggest the arrow might be inexplicable, a brute fact of nature. Members of the “entropy camp” claim there is an explanation, but it does not need any new fundamental law because the arrow is produced by (i) entropy increasing plus (ii) the fact that the universe once had minimal entropy. Entropy can be a useful numerical measure of the randomness or disorder within a physical system or its closeness to equilibrium.

Sean Carroll said, “The arrow of time is all of the ways in which the past is different from the future.” Some of these ways, in addition to entropy increasing in the future, are causes never producing effects in the past, the universe’s continuing to expand in volume in the future, and our remembering the past but never the future. Can some of these ways be used to explain others, but not vice versa? This is called the taxonomy problem, and there are competing attempts to solve the problem.

Some philosophers even ask whether there could be distant regions of space and time having an arrow pointing in reverse compared to our arrow. If so, would adults there naturally walk backwards on their way to becoming infants while they remember the future?

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Intrinsic Theory
    1. Criticisms
  3. The Extrinsic Theory
    1. Criticisms
  4. The Entropy Arrow
    1. The Past Hypothesis
  5. Other Arrows
    1. The Memory Arrow
    2. The Cosmological Arrow
    3. The Causal Arrow
  6. Living with Arrow-Reversal
  7. Reversibility and Time-Reversal Symmetry
    1. Summary
    2. More Details
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

In 1927, Arthur Eddington coined the term time’s arrow when he said, “I shall use the phrase ‘time’s arrow’ to express this one-way property of time which has no analogue in space. It is a singularly interesting property from a philosophical standpoint.”

Writers use a wide variety of terms to characterize the arrow. They say time has a distinguished direction. The philosopher Max Black said:

Instead of saying that time has a “direction,” writers will sometimes say that time is “asymmetrical” or “irreversible”, or that the passing of time is “irrevocable.” Although these alternative expressions are not exact synonyms, they are closely connected in meaning, and may well be considered together….Those who say that time has a direction will often say, by way of contrast, that space has no direction, or that space is “symmetrical.” Or they will say that events are reversible with respect to their spatial locations, but not with respect to their temporal locations (Black 1959, 54, 57).

Time is like a straight line of instants or moments. Any line between two of those instants such as A and B has two directions, from A to B, and from B to A. Saying time has an arrow distinguishes one of those directions from the other. Expressed in the language of mathematical physics, the asymmetric relation of before-or-simultaneous-with provides a linear ordering of the instants.

Time’s arrow is somewhat like an arrow that is shot from an archer’s bow. It has an intrinsic difference between its head and its tail as you can tell just by looking at its shape. However, describing and explaining time’s arrow is more challenging and more interesting than describing and explaining an archer’s arrow.

Here is a long list of the issues to be resolved in formulating a philosophical theory of time’s arrow. The order on the list is not very important. There should be definitions of the terms “time’s arrow” and “arrow of time” and some decision on whether the arrow is objective or subjective. Is there more than one arrow? Is time’s arrow simply the fact that the future is different from the past, or is more involved? Where is the arrow pointing? Does it necessarily point there? What is the relationship between time reversal and arrow reversal? Was Hans Reichenbach correct when he said that “we cannot speak of a direction of time for the whole; only certain sections of time have directions, and these directions are not the same”? Is time’s arrow a local feature or instead a larger, perhaps global feature of the universe? If the universe had started out differently, but with time existing, might it never have had the arrow it has? How do we reconcile the fact that we always see one-way processes with the fact that the fundamental laws of physics allow processes to go the other way, even the dying of our ancestors? Researchers do not agree on what counts as evidence of the arrow nor on what is a good example of the presence of the arrow, so a resolution is required. There are some rare decay processes of mesons that do go only one way in time. Could these account for time’s arrow?  We also would like to know whether the arrow is intrinsic to time itself or instead only an extrinsic feature due to processes that happen to occur over time the way they do. Do the past and future happen to be different, or do they have to be different? Can it be shown that time’s arrow is natural and to be expected, or is its existence merely a primitive fact, as some have argued? Is the arrow fundamental, or can it be derived from something more fundamental? Does the existence of an arrow place special demands on the structure of spacetime other than what is required by relativity theory? Is it clear that temporal phenomena even seem to us to have an arrow? Researchers are divided on that question, too. So, this set of issues is fertile territory for philosophers. The issues need clarification as well as answers. The answers probably will not come by amassing more empirical data.

Much has been said on these issues in the academic literature. This article provides only introductions and clarifications of some of them, and it does not attempt to provide definitive analyses and treatments of any open issues.

Looking back over history since the late 1800s, it is clear that our civilization is continually learning more about the philosophical issues involving the arrow of time. The academic accomplishments here provide a paradigm counterexample to the carelessly repeated quip that there is no progress in the field of philosophy.

Regarding the issue of whether the arrow is a local or a global feature of the universe, the philosopher Geoffrey Matthews remarked that, “Much of the recent literature on the problem of the direction of time assumes…it must be solved globally, for the entire universe at once, rather than locally, for some small part or parts of the universe,” but he recommends that it be solved locally (Matthews 1979, 82). However, the cosmologist George Ellis has a different perspective. He says: “The direction of time is the cosmologically determined direction in which time flows globally.” (Ellis 2013).

Max Black claimed time has an arrow if but only if ordinary discourse about time such as “This event happens earlier than that event” is objectively true or false and is not dependent upon who is speaking. That approach to the arrow via ordinary language retained few followers into the twenty-first century.

To say the arrow exists objectively implies that it exists independently of what we think, feel, do, or say. This is often expressed briefly as saying the arrow is mind-independent. One might consider whether there is a sense in which the arrow is mind-independent and another sense in which it is not. Or perhaps there are two arrows, an objective one and a subjective one, or a physical one and a wholly phenomenological one. Or one for which clocks are relevant and one for which clocks are wholly irrelevant. It takes a conscious observer to notice time’s arrow, but is the arrow that is noticed dependent on that observer? Money is observer dependent. If there is no agreement to treat that piece of paper containing an ex-president’s picture on it as money, then it is not money and is merely a piece of paper. Is time’s arrow like money in this sense or in a sense that gives the arrow some other observer-dependent existence?

On this issue, Huw Price says that, when seen from the Archimedean point of view that objectively looks down upon all the past, present and future events, it becomes clear that just as the color blue is a subjective feature of external reality so also time’s arrow is merely a subjective or intersubjective projection onto an inherently time-symmetric external reality (Price 1996). It exists only in our collective imagination. Physical time is not subjective, but its arrow is, he says. Craig Callender objected to the use of the word “merely” here. He claimed Price tells only half the story. In addition to the subjective projection, there is also an objective asymmetry of time because, “Thermodynamic behaviour not only shapes asymmetric agents but also provides an objective asymmetry in the world” (Callender 1998, 157). The thermodynamic behavior Callender is talking about is entropy increase. Almost all physicists and a majority of philosophers of physics believe that in the primary sense of the term, time’s arrow is an objective feature of the world. But many others do not. The issue is open. See (Freundlich 1973) for a defense of the claim that “physical time acquires meaning only through phenomenological time.”

Physical time is what clocks are designed to measure. Phenomenological time or psychological time, unlike physical time, is private time. It is also called subjective time. Compared to physical time that is shown on a clock, our psychological time can change its rate depending on whether we are bored or intensively involved. Many philosophers in the twenty-first century believe psychological time is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time. Psychological time is what people usually are thinking of when they ask whether time is just a construct of the mind.

It is surprising to many people to learn that nearly all scientists believe a physical time that is independent of space does not actually exist. What has independent existence is spacetime, the scientists say who are drawing a conclusion from Einstein’s theory of relativity. Spacetime is an amalgam of space and time as described in the theory of relativity. According to relativity theory, the amount of time an event lasts is relative. It is relative to someone’s choice of a reference frame or coordinate system or vantage point. How long your dinner party lasted last night is very different depending on whether it is measured by a clock on the dinner table or by a clock in a spaceship speeding by at close to the speed of light. If no reference frame has been pre-selected, then it is a violation of relativity theory to say one clock’s measure of the duration is correct and the other is incorrect. In this article, advocates of the extrinsic theory presume time exists, but only as a feature of spacetime and only relative to a reference frame. Advocates of the intrinsic theory may or may not presume this.

This article takes it for granted that there is an external world with real objects that are independent of cognizing minds and that we need not rehearse the arguments against metaphysical idealism—that all reality is fundamentally mind-dependent. Also, this article assumes that we all can have robust, reliable knowledge of that world even though some experiences might be illusory.

Our fundamental theories of physics are relativity and quantum mechanics, and they are commonly supposed to have implications regarding the nature of time. For one example, it has been claimed by some philosophers such as Hans Reichenbach that the flow of time, also known as “becoming,” is produced by the quantum collapse process during measurement. However, the implications from quantum mechanics for time and its arrow are an open question and are not discussed further in this article.

2. The Intrinsic Theory

Philosophers ask whether there is an arrow of time or in time—that is, whether (i) there is an arrow of time itself in the sense of its being part of time’s intrinsic structure, or instead (e) there is only an arrow in time that is extrinsic to time itself and that is due to time’s contents, specifically to physical processes that evolve one way over time. The intrinsic theory is committed to claim (i), and the extrinsic theory is committed to claim (e). The intrinsic theory is interested in the asymmetry of time, over and above the asymmetry of things in time. This difference in the two philosophical theories is sometimes expressed as their differing on whether time’s arrow is due to time’s inherent form or to time’s content.

Defenders of both theories agree that the arrow of time reveals itself in the wide variety of one-way processes such as that people grow older and never younger, that balloons burst and never unburst, and so forth. But only those promoting the extrinsic theory suggest that time’s arrow is identical to, or produced by, the set of these one-way processes.

The image of time proposed by the class of intrinsic theories is closer to the commonsense understanding of time, to what Wilfrid Sellars called the “manifest image,” than it is to the scientific image of time, which is time as seen through the lens of contemporary science.

All who say the arrow is intrinsic to time believe that strong evidence for the arrow is found in personal experience, usually both internal and external experience. What motivates most persons in the intrinsic camp is that having an intrinsic arrow seems to be the best explanation for the everyday flux of their own temporal experiences plus the similar experiences of others. Some imagine themselves advancing through time; others, that they stand still while time flows like a river past them. The philosopher Jenann Ismael mentions “the felt whoosh of experience.” It is not simply that we all occasionally experience time as directed but that this is relentless. Time stops for no one, says the proverb.

Robin Le Poidevin points out that the experience of the arrow is both internal and external. He says, “we are not only aware of [time’s passage] when we reflect on our memories of what has happened. We just see time passing in front of us, in the movement of a second hand around a clock, or the falling of sand through an hourglass, or indeed any motion or change at all” (Le Poidevin 2007, 76).

Assuming those in the intrinsic camp are correct in claiming that there is strong evidence for the arrow being found in personal experience, the following question is relevant: “Did time’s arrow exist before consciousness evolved on Earth?”

Most twenty-first century experts in the intrinsic camp find the arrow not just within experience but also in what is experienced; it is found in what is experienced in the sense that it may require conscious creatures to detect the arrow, but what is detected is the kind of thing that was a feature of nature long before beings with a conscious mind evolved on Earth to detect it, and it deserves a central place in any temporal metaphysics. To briefly summarize this extended bit of argumentation, it seems to us that the external world has an arrow of time because it does, and it does because we all experience it. All members of the intrinsic camp say time has an intrinsic arrow but space does not.

When it is said the arrow is a feature of time’s intrinsic structure, what is meant by the term “structure”? That term is about overall form rather than specific content. The structure is not a feature of a single three-dimensional object, nor is it detectable in an experience that lasts for only an instant.

When it is said the arrow is intrinsic to time or to be a feature of time’s intrinsic structure, what is meant by the term “intrinsic”? Intrinsic is like internal or inherent. An extrinsic property is a relational property. Rather than presenting a technical, philosophical definition, here is an example from the metaphysician Theodore Sider. He reminds us that a person having long hair is very different from her having a long-haired brother. Having long hair is an intrinsic property she has without involving anyone else. But having a long-haired brother is not intrinsic to her. It is an extrinsic or relational property that she has because of her relationship to someone else, namely her brother. Notice that her having the intrinsic property of long hair does not imply that long hair is essential to her. David Lewis and Bernard Katz offer a deeper discussion of the difference between intrinsic and extrinsic in (Lewis 1983) and (Katz 1983).

Although the concept of being intrinsic is not the same as the concept of being essential, many researchers in the intrinsic camp believe the arrow is essential to time in the sense that time necessarily has an arrow, that it is not a contingent feature, and that there would not be real time without it. Thus, arrow reversal would imply time reversal, and vice versa. Those in the extrinsic camp are much less apt to hold this position, and they are content to say that the arrow is a contingent feature, but that time would be very strange without it. They also have a different definition of time reversal from that of the intrinsic camp.

Within the intrinsic camp there are different explanations of why time is intrinsically directed. The largest sub-camp is the dynamic camp that promotes a dynamic theory of time’s arrow. Members are commonly called “temporal dynamists.”

Diagram of theories

An Euler diagram of philosophical theories
of time’s arrow that are discussed below

There  is a wide variety of dynamic theories, and they can be based on any of these ontologies of time: presentism, the growing block, and the full block of the eternalist theories. Only present events exist, claims the presentist. The growing block accepts present and past events, but not future events. Eternalists accept the existence of past, present, and future events, so their full block contains future events.

Many theorists who promote a dynamic theory and who are not presentists and who are not in favor of a growing block are eternalists who describe their favored version of a dynamic theory by appeal  to McTaggart’s A-series. To understand this series, imagine each event is represented as a position somewhere along a timeline, with two simultaneous events having the same position. McTaggart said:

For the sake of brevity, I shall give the name of the A series to that series of positions which runs from the far past through the near past to the present, and then from the present through the near future to the far future, or conversely. The series of positions which runs from earlier to later, or conversely, I shall call the B series (McTaggart 1927, 10).

One influential treatment of McTaggart’s idea is to say a future event will shed its intrinsic, non-relational A-property of futureness to eventually acquire presentness, then shed that property in favor of some pastness, then shed that, too, in favor of even greater pastness, and so forth. (McTaggart himself did not accept this notion of shedding properties, and also he hoped sense could be made of A-properties being intrinsic to times, but most metaphysicians believe McTaggart’s hopes cannot be successfully realized.) A-theorists believe the present is a metaphysically-privileged instant that is fundamental, spatially-extended, and global (applying to the entire cosmos).

B-theorists say an event’s being present or past or future is not fundamental and is subjective. What is fundamental is one event happening before or after another in a given reference frame. A-theorists and B-theorists agree that it can make an important difference to you whether it is presently noon or presently midnight, and they have no problem with ordinary speakers using A-remarks such as “The year 1066 is past” and B-remarks such as “The year 1066 happened before you saw this sentence,” but the theorists differ about whether the A-series or B-series is objective, and ontologically fundamental, and semantically basic.

Others in the intrinsic camp accept a truncated A-series, the A-series without future events. This truncation is reflected semantically in rejecting any classical truth-value for any contingent sentence about the future, for example, the sentence “There will be a sea battle tomorrow.” The sentence falls into a truth-gap between true and false, and only contingent features of the world about the battle situation that we will learn about only tomorrow will allow us to say whether it is true or instead false.

Another sub-camp of the intrinsic camp does espouse a B-theory of time. This theory is a non-dynamic, eternalist theory and is commonly said to have a less robust sense of time’s passage. One example of such a theory is designated by the letter “m” in the diagram above.

Let’s consider the first sub-camp of the intrinsic theory, the dynamic sub-camp. Its members frequently say time has an internal structure that is robustly “dynamic” or “transitory” or “active.” What does this mean? In answering, some philosophers offer a very picturesque style of description and appeal to the idea of a “river of time” that is now gushing out of nothingness. Less picturesquely, most answer by saying time “passes” or “flows” or “has a flux” or “lapses” or “runs” or has a “moving present” or has a feature called “becoming.”

Here is an attempt to clarify the dynamic theory of time’s passing:

We take temporal passage to consist in (a) there being a fact of the matter regarding which entities are objectively present, and (b) there being changes in which [of the] entities are objectively present. Presentism, the growing block theory, the dropping branches theory and the moving spotlight theory are all theories according to which time passes (Miller and Norton 2021, 21).

How does one go about showing that a dynamic theory is true or false? George Schlesinger made an interesting remark about this. Think of what he calls the “transient theory of time” as what is called in this article the “dynamic theory” with an arrow of time:

There is no doubt that the transient theory of time is consistent and intelligible. Is it true? I do not believe that this is the kind of question to which a final conclusive answer is possible. As with all genuinely metaphysical theories, what we may reasonably expect is further clarification concerning its precise presuppositions and implications and an increasingly more detailed list of its advantages and disadvantages. (Schlesinger 1985, 92).

The various, prominent dynamic theories of time are presented in (Zimmerman 2005) and (Dainton 2020). The present article introduces a sample of them.

In 1927, C.D. Broad said becoming is the transitory aspect of time that must be added to the “mere” ordering of events via the B-series relations. The B-series is too static to capture the dynamic character of time, Broad claimed, because if one event happens before another then it always does, and this fact never changes. Yet facts do change. It was once a fact that dinosaurs exist. The B-series is a static representation. Broad said absolute becoming “seems to me to be the rock-bottom peculiarity of time, distinguishing temporal sequence from all other instances of one-dimensional order, such as that of points on a line, numbers in order of magnitude, and so on.” He believed the A-theory was needed to capture this objective, non-phenomenological sense of becoming. Arthur Eddington said, “we have direct insight into ‘becoming’ which sweeps aside all symbolic knowledge as being on an inferior plane.”

The specific transient theory of time Schlesinger was referring to is Broad’s moving spotlight theory. That theory is suggested with the following metaphor from the Spanish philosopher George Santayana: “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” The theory treats the dimension of time much like a single dimension of space with all the past, present, and future events arranged in temporal order along the time dimension (the fuse of time), and with simultaneous events having the same location. Promoting the moving spotlight theory as a way of clarifying what he meant by becoming, C.D. Broad said, “What is illuminated is the present, what has been illuminated is the past, and what has not yet been illuminated is the future” (Broad 1923, 59). The theory assumes eternalism in the sense that all past, present, and future events exist (in the tenseless sense of the term), but it has the extra assumptions that the present time is a metaphysically privileged time and that A-theory sentences about the past such as “The year 1955 is no longer our present year” are metaphysically basic, unlike the B-theory which might analyze that sentence as “The year 1955 happens before the year in which you are reading this sentence.” Most versions of the moving spotlight theory imply being present is primitive in the sense of being an unanalyzable feature of reality.  The idea that for the moving spotlight the present is metaphysically privileged implies for its advocates Timothy Williamson and Quentin Smith that future events are not spatial, but they shed this property and acquire the property of being spatial or in space as they become highlighted by the spotlight, then they shed this property and become non-spatial, past events. For an examination of the spotlight theory, see (Zimmerman 2005) and (Miller 2019).

Some dynamists such as C. D. Broad in his 1927 book Scientific Thought have explained time’s passage as reality’s growing by the continual accretion of new moments or new facts or the creation of more states of affairs. This is not an eternalist theory nor a presentist theory. It employs a growing-block model of events in Einstein’s sense of the technical term “block,” but without the actual future events that exist in their traditional block universe. That is, the growing-block consists of all real present and past point-events; and the latest moment that exists in the block is metaphysically privileged and called “the present” and “now.” All longer-duration events are composed of point-events. In classical physics, the block can have a four-dimensional Cartesian coordinate system of three spatial dimensions and one time dimension. The block grows in volume over time as more moments and events occur and more facts about the present and past are created. The direction of the arrow of time is the direction that the block grows.

Enamored of the idea of reality’s growing by the accretion of facts, Michael Tooley argued that “the world is dynamic, and dynamic in a certain way: it is a world where tenseless states of affairs come into existence, but never drop out of existence, and therefore a world where the past and the present are real, but the future is not.” A tenseless state of affairs is a fact in which any use of tense in its description is not semantically or ontologically significant. For instance, when someone says, “one plus two is three,” even though the word “is” occurs in the present tense, we ignore this and assume the speaker’s statement is not only about the present. See (Dainton 2020) to learn more about tenseless vs. tensed characteristics.

An important feature of Tooley’s and others’ growing-block theories is that they make what is real be dependent on what time it is. Adherents to the theory say one of its virtues is its promotion of the unreality of the future. It naturally allows the future to be “open” or indeterminate unlike the past and present that are “closed” and determinate and so cannot change. This openness is part of the manifest image of time that almost all persons hold, but this sometimes means different things to different people. It might mean the future is non-existent, or that it is not straightforwardly knowable as is the past, or that we human beings are able to shape the future but not the past. Some researchers say this openness shows itself semantically by the fact that a contingent proposition about the future such as “There will be a sea battle tomorrow” is neither true nor false presently. The eternalist is more apt to say the proposition has a truth value and is eternally true (that is, true at all times) or is eternally false but we just do not know which one it is.

See (Miller 2013) for a comparison of the growing-block ontology of time with its competitors: presentism and eternalism. For some subsequent research on the growing block, see (Grandjean 2022).

Let us turn to intrinsic theories that are promoted by those outside of the large, dynamic camp. One theory implies time has an intrinsic arrow because time is intrinsically anisotropic (that is, no direction is privileged compared to another), and sufficient evidence of time’s being intrinsically anisotropic would be the existence of time-anisotropic processes obeying time-anisotropic laws of nature. (The terms time-anisotropic and time-asymmetric and temporally directed have different senses, but they denote the same thing.)

Ferrel Christensen’s argument in favor of time’s being intrinsically asymmetric appealed to the evidence of there being so many kinds of one-way processes in nature, and the simplest explanation of this, he suggested, is that time itself is intrinsically asymmetric.

The bare fact that our experience of time is mediated by processes that take place in time doesn’t argue that any or all of the structural features of the latter aren’t also possessed by temporality in its own right. …Is it not plausible to suggest that a single asymmetry is responsible for them all, namely that of time itself? For reasons having to do with economy, the ability of a single feature to theoretically explain a diversity of phenomena is in general regarded in science as good evidence for the reality of that feature; it has the effect of unifying and organizing our picture of the world. Surely there must be some common reason, one is tempted to argue, for the evidence of the various asymmetries in time—what else might it be if not the asymmetry of time itself? (Christensen 1987, 238 and 243).

Tim Maudlin is a member of the intrinsic camp who also does not promote a dynamic theory of time’s arrow. See the letter “m” for Maudlin’s theory in the diagram above. He accepts the block universe theory in the sense that the past, present, and future are equally real, but he accepts the passage of time and does not characterize the block as static. Maudlin’s reasoning here is that the word “static” refers to objects that persist through time but never change. The block universe does not persist through time. Instead, time exists within it.

Maudlin says that time’s passage is an intrinsic or inherent asymmetry in the structure of space-time itself and that time passes objectively and independently of the material contents of spacetime and their processes. That is how he interprets “becoming.” Maudlin argues that the direction of time is primitive and so cannot be deduced or otherwise explained more deeply. He believes that “except in a metaphorical sense, time does not move or flow,” but it does pass. Maudlin adds that, “the passing of time…is the foundation of our asymmetrical treatment of the initial and final states of the universe” (Maudlin 2007, 142). Stephen Savitt, Dennis Dieks, and Mauro Dorato also have claimed that time passes in the block universe.

If passage were merely having a one-dimensional asymmetric continuum structure, then the real numbers would pass from less to greater numbers. Related to this point, Maudlin said, “The passage of time connotes more than just an intrinsic asymmetry; not just any asymmetry would produce passing … the passage of time underwrites claims about one state ‘coming out of’ or ‘being produced from’ another, while a generic spatial (or temporal) asymmetry would not underwrite such locutions….”

Maudlin believes he has pinpointed why so many physicists do not agree with him that it is a fundamental, irreducible fact of nature that time is an intrinsically directed object. Overly influenced by Einstein’s theory of relativity, they treat time as if it is a space dimension, then note that no space dimension has an arrow, so they conclude the time dimension has no arrow. Einstein, himself, never made such an argument. According to Maudlin:

I think the reason it’s hard for physicists to see the direction of time is they use the piece of mathematics that was developed to analyze space, and there is no direction in space. So, you have this mathematical theory built for something with no direction in it, you then try to analyze spacetime with it, and you say “Gosh, I don’t see a direction anymore; it must be an illusion.” …It’s not an illusion.

a. Criticisms

A variety of criticisms of the intrinsic theory have been offered. For example, those in the extrinsic camp often say there is an over-emphasis on the phenomenology of temporal awareness. In reply, those in the intrinsic camp often accuse those in the extrinsic camp of scientism due to their irresponsible rejection of our valid temporal intuitions.

One argument given for why the intrinsic theory improperly describes time is that relativity theory treats time as the fourth dimension, a one-dimensional subspace of spacetime, and we know space has no direction. To elaborate on this criticism, notice that people on earth sometimes believe space has a direction toward “down,” but that is a mistake. Space seems to have a down arrow only because we happen to live on the surface of a very massive object which pulls objects toward its center, but if we lived out in space away from any very massive objects, we would not be inclined to assign a direction to space. Similarly, people commonly suppose time has a direction because they experience so many one-way processes, but they experience these only because their past is associated with an extremely low entropy state, namely, the big bang. If this peculiar event were not in their past, then they would appreciate that time could just as well have had no arrow or had a reversed arrow. Once they free their minds from the influence of the presence of earth and the influence of a low-entropy big bang in their past, they could see more clearly that neither space nor time has an intrinsic arrow. Advocates of the intrinsic theory usually respond to this criticism by saying it makes too much of the weak analogy between time and space.

One other broad criticism claims the intrinsic theory is not coherent. Huw Price said, “I am not convinced that it is possible to make sense of the possibility that time itself might have a certain direction” (Price 2002, 87). Dynamists typically, but not universally, promote an A-theory of time in which the concept of time’s passage depends upon the coherence of the idea that pastness and presentness are intrinsic properties of events, properties that are gained and lost over time. This dependence is illustrated by the fact that, according to the A-theory, the birthday party occurred last week because the party event has a week’s degree of pastness, a degree that will keep increasing. Critics argue that these technical A-concepts are superficially coherent but ultimately not coherent and that B-concepts are sufficient for the task.

Nathan Oaklander criticized the moving-now theory or spotlight theory because it seems to be committed to the claim that the same NOW exists at every time, but he doubted anything sensible can be made of the NOW being the “same” (1985). For more discussion of this criticism, see (Prosser 2016).

Other critics of the intrinsic theory say the problem is not that the theory is inconsistent or nonsense but that it is obscure and unexplanatory.

Still others complain about subjectivity. They say the advocates of the intrinsic theory and its passage of time are relying ultimately on McTaggart’s A-series, but “A-series change and the passage of time are mind dependent in the sense of being merely matters of psychological projection,” unlike the B-theory with its arrow in time (Bardon 2013, 102).

Cognitive scientists and biochemists are naturally interested in learning more about the bodily mechanisms, including the mental mechanisms that allow people to detect time and also to detect time’s arrow. However, say the critics, they should attend more to the difference between the two. We see sand fall in the hourglass. Our detection of the change is correctly said to be evidence for us that time exists, but is it also evidence that the arrow of time exists, as Le Poidevin believes? No, say some critics from the extrinsic camp. What would be evidence would be noticing that the sand never falls up.

A motivation for adopting the dynamic theory is that it seems to them that they directly experience the dynamic character of time. “It would be futile to try to deny these experiences,” said D.C. Williams, who believed it seems to all of us that time passes. George Schlesinger said, “Practically all agree that the passage of time intuitively appears to be one of the most central features of reality.” Claims about their phenomenology of time do clearly motivate those experts in the intrinsic camp to say time passes, but it does not seem to be a strong motivation for the average person who is not an expert on issues of time’s arrow. Kristie Miller and her associates, “found that, on average, participants only weakly agreed that it seems as though time passes, suggesting that most people do not unambiguously have a phenomenology as of time passing.” Her results in experimental philosophy suggest “that ~70% of people represent actual time as dynamical and ~30% represent it as non-dynamical” (Miller 2020).

Some critics question the effectiveness of the argument that, if time intuitively seems to be dynamic, then it is. There are several very different ways this criticism is made. Many critics say that, even though much of our experience is not an illusion, our experience of the passage of time is merely an illusion—something we experience that should be explained away:

A moving spotlight theorist might…argue: his theory is superior because it is only in his theory that things are as they seem. But this is not a good argument. A B-theorist might have an excellent story to tell about why things are not as they seem. If he does, then it should not count against his theory that it says we are subject to an illusion (Skow 2011, 361).

In this spirit, other critics of dynamical time say that it seems to most of us that rocks are perfectly solid and contain no empty space; nevertheless, science rightly tells us we are mistaken. These critics say the intrinsic camp’s supposed intrinsic asymmetry of time that so many seem to find in their own experience and the experience of others is only a product of people, including certain philosophers of physics, overly relying on their intuitions and uncritical impressions, while misinterpreting their temporal experiences and being insufficiently sensitive to science. Their arguments do not take into account that science is properly in the business of precisification of concepts and of promoting concepts that are maximally useful for understanding nature. For more detailed criticism along these lines, see (Callender 2017).

Dennis Dieks argued that, “on closer inspection it appears that the scientific B-theory may explain our intuition better than the A-theory, even though the latter at first sight seems to completely mirror our direct experience…. There is becoming and change in this picture in the following sense: events occur after each other in time, displaying different qualities at different instants” (Dieks 2012, 103 and 111). Opponents of a dynamic sense of becoming often say that becoming is real only in the sense that an event comes into being out of others in its local past. So, the B-theorist need not deny temporal passage provided it is not the robust passage promoted by the A-theorist.

The intrinsic theory is commonly criticized for its language use, for its violation of what philosophers of language call “logical grammar.” For example, pointing out how those in the intrinsic camp use the word becoming, J.J.C. Smart said:

Events happen, things become, and things do not just become, they become something or other. “Become” is a transitive verb; if we start using it intransitively, we can expect nothing but trouble. This is part of what is wrong with Whitehead’s metaphysics; see, for example, Process and Reality, p. 111, where he says that actual occasions “become.” (Smart 1949, 486).

C.D. Broad does not make this mistake in his use of language, says Smart, but he makes another mistake with language: his use of the transitive phrase “become existent” is misleading philosophically. Emphasizing Broad’s faulty use of language, Smart declares:

With what sorts of words can we use the expressions “to change” and “to become “? …I think that if certain philosophers, notably Whitehead and McTaggart, had asked themselves this question…they would have saved themselves from much gratuitous metaphysics… (Smart 1949, 486).

One prominent complaint made against the growing-block theory (GBT) is that it cannot give us a good reason to believe that we are now in the objective present and Napoleon is not. Bourne says, “We are in no better epistemic position than thinking subjects located in the objective past who are wrongly believing that they are located in the objective present, since ‘[…] we would have all the same beliefs […] even if we were past'” (Bourne 2002, 362). Vincent Grandjean adds, “the epistemic objection does not merely concern GBT, but is equally applicable to every A-theory of time that distinguishes between the notions of existing at the present time and just existing. For example, the epistemic objection is equally applicable to the moving spotlight theorist.”

Another frequent complaint made against the growing-block theory is that it is not compatible with the theory of relativity because it presumes absolute simultaneity rather than simultaneity relative to a conventionally chosen reference frame.

For consideration of the variety of these and other philosophical objections that are made to the tensed account of the dynamic, growing block, see chapter 10 of (Tooley 1997). See (Dorato 2006) for an argument that the unreality of the future, a proclaimed virtue of Tooley’s theory, is not a necessary condition for temporal passage. See (Earman 2008) regarding the prospects for revisions of a growing-block model of the universe.

The role the fields of psychology and cognitive science can and should play in understanding time’s arrow is an interesting issue. The human mind and body have some clock-like features, but clearly there is no single neuron that tracks time’s arrow. There may be some mental and neuronal structures to be found that do track time’s arrow, but there is no consensus that these have been found. Presumably there would be multiple mental procedures involved, and the neuronal structures would be both complex and distributed around the brain. But researchers cannot simply presume that what accounts for our temporal phenomenology is, among other things, time’s arrow. It will not be if there are pervasive phenomenal illusions regarding the arrow. Perhaps the mechanisms that account for our phenomenology that is purported to be about time’s arrow do not actually track the arrow. So, there is much useful, future research ahead. For more about these issues, see (Braddon-Mitchell and Miller 2017).

There is a subtle sub-issue here about how things seem. A distinction can be made between phenomenal error and cognitive error:

Temporal non-dynamists hold that there is no temporal passage, but [they] concede that many of us judge that it seems as though time passes. Phenomenal Illusionists suppose that things do seem this way, even though things are not this way. They attempt to explain how it is that we are subject to a pervasive phenomenal illusion. More recently, Cognitive Error Theorists have argued that our experiences do not seem that way; rather, we are subject to an error that leads us mistakenly to believe that our experiences seem that way. …We aim to show that Cognitive Error Theory is a plausible competitor to Phenomenal Illusion Theory (Miller et. al. 2020).

Adolf Grünbaum complained that the main weakness of dynamic theories is that passage and becoming and the arrow have no appropriate place in the fundamental laws. He probably would have found support in Jill North’s remark that, “There is no more structure to the world than what the fundamental laws indicate there is.” Some members of the dynamic camp reacted to Grünbaum’s complaint by saying the intrinsic theory does not need a law of physics to recognize the arrow: “[T]here is in the world an asymmetric relation holding among events, the temporal priority relation, and…we can know when this relation holds or fails to hold, at least sometimes, without relying upon any features of the lawlike nature of the world in time” (Sklar 1974, 407-410).

Other members of the dynamic camp reacted very differently to Grünbaum’s complaint by saying the fundamental laws do need to be revised in order to recognize some extra structure that reveals time’s intrinsic arrow. This suggestion has faced fierce resistance. Frank Wilczek, a Nobel Laureate in physics, objected to any revision like this. Coining the term “Core theory” for the theories of relativity and quantum mechanics (including quantum field theory and the standard model of particle physics), which are our two currently accepted fundamental theories of physics, Wilczek declared:

The Core has such a proven record of success over an enormous range of applications that I can’t imagine people will ever want to junk it. I’ll go further: I think the Core provides a complete foundation for biology, chemistry, and stellar astrophysics that will never require modification. (Well, “never” is a long time. Let’s say for a few billion years.)

Some members of the intrinsic camp might say, “We are not junking it, just supplementing it so it can be used to explain even more.”

Many critics of dynamic theories of time’s arrow speak approvingly of the 1951 article, “The Myth of Passage,” in which Harvard University metaphysician D.C. Williams argued that the passage of time is a myth, and that time does not really move or flow or pass or have any inherent dynamic character whatsoever. According to Williams, all proponents of a dynamic theory of time believe that:

Over and above the sheer spread of events, with their several qualities, along the time axis, …there is something extra, something active and dynamic, which is often and perhaps best described as “passage.” This something extra I think is a myth…one which is fundamentally false, deceiving us about the facts, and blocking our understanding of them. The literature of “passage” is immense, but it is naturally not very exact and lucid, and we cannot be sure of distinguishing in it between mere harmless metaphorical phenomenology and the special metaphysical declaration which I criticize. But “passage” it would seem, is a character supposed to inhabit and glorify the present, “the passing present,” “the moving present,” the “travelling now….” It is James’s “passing moment.” It is what Broad calls “the transitory aspect” of time…. It is Bergson’s living felt duration. It is Heidegger’s Zeitlichkeit. It is Tillich’s “moment that is creation and fact….” It is “the dynamic essence which Professor Ushenko believes that Einstein omits from the world. It is the mainspring of McTaggart’s “A-series” which puts movement in time, and it is Broad’s pure becoming.

The dynamic theories lead to other troubles, says J.J.C. Smart. For instance, when we critically examine the metaphor of time’s passage and ask about the rate of flow of time:

We are postulating a second time-scale with respect to which the flow of events along the first time-dimension is measured…the speed of flow of the second stream is a rate of change with respect to a third time-dimension, and so we can go on indefinitely postulating fresh streams…. Sooner or later we shall have to stop thinking of time as a stream….

With respect to motion in space it is always possible to ask “how fast is it?” …Contrast the pseudo-question “how fast am I advancing through time?” or “How fast did time flow yesterday?” …We do not even know the sort of units in which our answer should be expressed. “I am advancing through time at how many seconds per ___?” we might begin, and then we should have to stop. What could possibly fill the blank? Not “seconds” surely. In that case the most we could hope for would be the not very illuminating remark that there is just one second in every second. (Smart 1949, 485).

D.C. Williams agreed with Smart, and he added:

Bergson, Broad, and some of the followers of Whitehead have tried to soften the paradoxes of passage by supposing that the present does not move across the total time level, but that it is the very fountain where the river of time gushes out of nothingness (or out of the power of God). The past, then, having swum into being and floated away, is eternally real, but the future has no existence at all. This may be a more appealing figure, but logically it involves the same anomalies of meta-happening and meta-time which we observed in the other version.

Huw Price has complained that, “A rate of second per second is not a rate at all in physical terms. It is a dimensionless quantity, rather than a rate of any sort. (We might just as well say that the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter flows at π seconds per second!).”

Tim Maudlin (who advocates an intrinsic theory but not a dynamic theory) and others have bit the bullet and argued that time actually does pass at the rate of one second per second. He claimed the belief that the seconds cancel out is a mistake. Critics of the intrinsic arrow ask: If the rate of one second per second does make sense, then so does a rate of two seconds per second, and what would that be like? It would be absurd. George Schlesinger claimed the rate of two seconds per second does make sense (Schlesinger 1985). See (Skow 2012) and (Miller and Norton 2021) for more discussion of differential passage and of time’s rate of passage with and without a hypertime against which time’s rate is compared.

An additional criticism of the dynamic camp’s position made by members of the extrinsic camp is that grounding time’s arrow on new nows being produced is a mistake because the concept of now, in the sense of a present for all of us, is inconsistent with scientific fact. According to the theory of relativity, if the reference frames of two observers, in which each observer is stationary in their own frame, are moving relative to each other, they must disagree on which events are happening now, with their having more disagreement the farther away that the events occur and the greater the relative speed between the two frames, so the concept of “now” cannot be objective. It is relative to a person’s favored frame of reference. The proper way to understand the word “now,” say most of these critics, is as an indexical that changes its reference from person to person and from time to time, as does the word “here;” and just as the changing reference of “here” indicates no arrow of space, neither does the changing reference of “now” indicate an arrow of time. For a defense of the moving spotlight theory against this criticism, see (Skow 2009).

For many members of the intrinsic camp, to explain time’s arrow is to explain the intrinsic difference between the past and the future. In this regard, some say there is something irrevocable or closed about past events that distinguishes them from future events. This is a deep and metaphysically significant fact. In response, Williams said in 1951, “As for the irrevocability of past time, it seems to be no more than the trivial fact that the particular events of 1902, let us say, cannot also be the events of 1952.”

Tim Maudlin promoted an intrinsic theory but not a dynamic theory, and he did not rely on there being tensed facts or a growing block. Maudlin, Oaklander, Tegtmeier and others believe it is a fundamental, irreducible fact that time is a directed object. Their critics say this makes it too difficult to answer the question: why is the arrow pointing in this direction rather than in that direction? A defense of the claim that time’s directionality is primitive also can be found in (Kajimoto, et. al. 2020).

Some other critics of Maudlin’s position claim that, when Maudlin says, “change and flow and motion all presuppose the passage of time,” he should have said instead that they all presuppose the existence of time, not its passage. Once, Maudlin was asked “What does it mean for time to pass? Is that synonymous with ‘time has a direction,’ or is there something in addition?” Maudlin responded: “There’s something in addition. ‘For time to pass’ means for events to be linearly ordered by earlier and later.” Maudlin’s opponent in the extrinsic camp can be expected to say, “Wait! That linear ordering is just what I mean by time existing.”

Focusing on undermining objections to his position that time passes, Maudlin said:

There are three sorts of objections to the passage of time, which we may group as logical, scientific, and epistemological. Logical objections contend that there is something incoherent about the idea of the passage of time per se. Scientific objections claim that the notion of the passage of time is incompatible with current scientific theory, and so would demand a radical revision of the account of temporal structure provided by physics itself. Epistemological objections contend that even if there were such a thing as the passage of time, we could not know that there was, or in which direction time passes (Maudlin 2002 260).

Maudlin proceeded from there to argue that there are adequate responses to all three kinds of objections. He praised Huw Price’s book Time’s Arrow & Archimedes’ Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time for carefully presenting these objections and the responses.

3. The Extrinsic Theory

What would you think if some morning you noticed a mess of several broken eggs on your kitchen floor and then saw the mess assemble spontaneously into unbroken eggs that rose up and landed on the nearby tabletop? You would think something is wrong here. Change doesn’t occur that way. Perhaps someone is secretly intervening to play a trick on you. If you could wait patiently for trillions and trillions of years, it is overwhelmingly probable you still would never witness eggs naturally behaving that way, yet those strange reverse-processes do not violate the fundamental laws, namely the equations of the fundamental theories of physics.

What if you could take a God’s eye view of the universe, and some morning you noticed that every process played out in a reverse direction to what you’ve learned to expect? You probably would conclude that time’s arrow had reversed. Appreciating this interpretation of the scenario provides a motivation for adopting the extrinsic theory of time’s arrow which implies that the arrow is due only to processes regularly showing one-way behavior, and it is not due to some inherent structure within time as those in the intrinsic camp believe. It is a real pattern in time’s content in Daniel Dennett’s sense of the term “real pattern.” The extrinsic theory is more popular among physicists than among philosophers.

The extrinsic theory is committed to the claims that time’s arrow (1) is extrinsic to time itself, (2) is identical to, or produced by, the presence of physical processes that are never observed to go the other way even if the laws allow them to go that way, and (3) if anything depends on our choice of reference frame—or our choice of coordinate system—it is thereby not an objective feature of the world. It is not “real.” Regarding point (3), time’s arrow does not have this frame dependence, which is why there can be a frame-free master arrow of time but not a frame-free master clock.

Those in the intrinsic camp disagree with clause (2) and say the one-way physical processes illustrate time’s arrow or indicate it or exemplify it, but they do not produce the arrow. The intrinsic camp and extrinsic camp also give different answers to the question, “What is the relationship between time’s direction and time’s arrow?” Those in the intrinsic camp are very likely to say they are the same. Those in the extrinsic camp are very likely to say they are not the same because time itself, like space itself, has no direction.

If you were in the extrinsic camp, and you were looking for science to tell you about time’s arrow, you would naturally look to confirmed theories of physics rather than to the theories of the special sciences such as geology and plant science. The theories of physics underlie or explain the proper use of the word “time” in all the sciences. Our two most comprehensive and fundamental theories of physics are the general theory relativity and quantum mechanics. They are fundamental because they cannot be inferred from other theories of physics. Time is primitive in all the fundamental theories. Surprisingly, their laws appear to be nearly oblivious to time’s arrow. Advocates of the extrinsic theory have concluded from this that time itself has no arrow or nearly no arrow. The need for the hedge term “nearly” is discussed in a later section.

The largest sub-group within the extrinsic camp constitutes the entropy camp. Its members believe they have uncovered a physical correlate to time’s arrow. It is entropy increase. Entropy-increase plus the fact that the universe had a minimal amount of entropy in the past is why our universe has our current B-relation rather than its inverse, they would say. A more detailed presentation of what entropy is and what role it plays in time’s arrow is provided later in this article, but loosely it can be said that entropy is a measure of an isolated system’s closeness to equilibrium or being run down or disordered or decayed. It is closer after the light bulb has burned out, the cup of hot coffee has cooled to room temperature, and the neat pile of leaves you just raked was scattered by a gust of wind. These processes are always found to run in only one direction in time. Here is a brief description of the key idea:

We all have the incontestable experience of the flow of time. The problem is to explain it in terms of physics; for we feel that the direction of time is not merely “subjective,” but rooted in the nature of things or “objective.” …Many physicists and philosophers believed it to be solved when the second law of thermodynamics was discovered. (Hutten 1959).

The second law provides a quantitative description of entropy increase.

Members of the entropy camp believe the presence of time’s arrow in a closed region such as the universe itself (that is, a volume of space over a time period in which no energy flows in or out) (a) can be explained or defined by the overall entropy increase in the region, (b) depends on the region having a very large number of atoms or molecules in motion so entropy can be well-defined, (c) emerges only at the macroscopic scale of description, and (d) depends on the fact that entropy was low earlier. (e) Rather than saying time’s arrow necessarily points towards the future, as members of the intrinsic camp say, members of the extrinsic camp say it points towards equilibrium, the state in which entropy has its maximum value and time’s arrow disappears and the average distribution of particles in the system stays the same for a very long time. (f) The direction toward equilibrium in the region is, as a matter of fact, the future direction, regardless of reference frame. (g) The informal remark that time flows, or passes, or lapses is explicated as time’s existing.

The term “region” is purposefully vague to allow different claims about the size of the region. Also, there is a slight vagueness in the concept of entropy because there is no minimum number of particles that need to be present for a dynamic system to have a definite value for its entropy, but there are more than enough atoms within whatever we can see with our eyes, even while looking in an ordinary microscope, so most experts believe the vagueness is irrelevant to philosophical issues involving time’s arrow, but there are experts who disagree, and this issue is discussed later.

Members of the extrinsic camp would say that, if you clean your messy room and so decrease its entropy, you are not reversing the arrow of time in the room. They would say the arrow of time applies to the room or is manifest in the room, but there is no “room’s arrow.” The arrow of time is overall entropy increase throughout the universe even though there can be entropy decrease in some smaller sub-systems.

According to the entropy camp, the arrow emerges as the scale increases. This kind of emergence is not a process in time such as when an oak tree emerges from an acorn. It is a coarse-graining feature. It is something that reveals itself as the information in the finer details is not taken into account. The arrow’s emergence is not strong emergence of something new and independent of whatever happens at the lower scale, but only weak emergence. Carroll explained the intended sense of the term “emergent”:

To say that something is emergent is to say that it’s part of an approximate description of reality that is valid at a certain (usually macroscopic) level and is to be contrasted with “fundamental” things, which are part of an exact description at the microscopic level…. Fundamental versus emergent is one distinction, and real versus not-real is a completely separate one.

The term “microscopic level” designates the atomic scale, the world at the level of atoms and molecules,  and it is not tied to the use of a microscope. Emergent features are those we posit because they transcend the obscuring details of the microscopic level and give us useful, succinct information that improves our understanding of the phenomena we are interested in. When you want to understand why you just heard a loud noise, as a practical matter you must ignore the information about positions and velocities of all the molecules (if you were to have such information) and focus on the more useful coarse-grained information that the room contained a glass of water which fell onto a hard floor and broke, thereby sending a loud sound throughout the room. However, the lower scale information about each molecule having this or that momentum and velocity can in principle be used to explain both any exceptions to the higher-level regularities and the limits of those regularities, for example, why a falling glass of water sometimes does not break when it hits the floor.

Because the law of entropy increase is a coarse-grained feature of nature, it is irrelevant to Laplace’s Demon.

How should one explain why the direction of entropy increase coincides with the direction of time? Perhaps it is an inexplicable fact. Perhaps it is a coincidence. Perhaps there is a deeper explanation. This is a bad question, said Julian Barbour: “It is wrong to seek to explain why the direction of entropy increase coincides with the direction of time. The direction of entropy increase is the direction of time.” Everyone in the intrinsic camp disagrees with Barbour.

Although adherents to the extrinsic theory often speak of the “ways” in which the past differs from the future as being “arrows,” this article often calls them “mini-arrows” in order to distinguish a mini-arrow from time’s master arrow that includes all the mini-arrows. The term “mini-arrow” is not a term commonly used in the literature. Typical mini-arrows recognized by the extrinsic camp are entropy increasing, causes always preceding their effects, space’s constantly expanding and never contracting, radiation flowing away from accelerated charges (such as in a candle flame or light bulb) and not into them, people having access to records of the past but not of the future, heat flowing naturally only from hot to cold, and our being able to intervene and affect the future but never the past. Explaining time’s arrow in more depth requires solving the problem of showing how these mini-arrows are related to each other. Perhaps some can be used to explain others but not vice versa. Huw Price called this the taxonomy problem. Attempts to solve the problem are explored in a later section.

The main goals of the entropy camp are (i) to describe how emergence works in more detail, (ii) to explain why the universe and its sub-systems have not yet reached equilibrium, (iii) to understand why entropy was lower in the past, and (iv) to solve the taxonomy problem.

Carroll commented:

In reality, as far as the laws of physics are concerned, all directions in space are created equal. If you were an astronaut, floating in your spacesuit while you performed an extravehicular activity, you wouldn’t notice any difference between one direction in space and another. The reason why there’s a noticeable distinction between up and down for us isn’t because of the nature of space; it’s because we live in the vicinity of an extremely influential object: the Earth…. Time works the same way. In our everyday world, time’s arrow is unmistakable, and you would be forgiven for thinking that there is an intrinsic difference between past and future. In reality, both directions of time are created equal. The reason why there’s a noticeable distinction between past and future isn’t because of the nature of time….

Instead, he would say, it is because of the nature of entropy change—a universal tendency to evolve toward equilibrium—and the fact that entropy was low in the distant past. Also, when he said, “both directions of time are created equal” he did not mean to imply that there was intentional creation involved.

Carroll’s position on the intrinsic theory and its appeal to our impression that time flows is that, “we can explain our impressions that time flows and that there is something more real about now than about other moments as consequences of the arrow of time, which is itself a consequence of increasing entropy” (Carroll 2022c, 136).

In his 1956 book The Direction of Time, Hans Reichenbach proposed an influential version of the entropy theory. He defined the future direction of time as the direction of the entropy increase of most branch sub-systems. These are sub-systems that become isolated temporarily from the main system of objects being analyzed. Very probably, these isolated branch systems undergo an entropy increase over time, and the overall direction they all go is toward equilibrium.

a. Criticisms

A variety of criticisms has been directed at the extrinsic theory of time’s arrow. A very popular one is that the theory is too static. It misses the dynamic feature of time that is the key feature of the intrinsic arrow. It misses time’s becoming and passage. A-theorists complain that the B-theorists of the extrinsic camp mistakenly promote a non-dynamic or static block theory of time in which insufficient attention is paid to change because the B-series of events is only about what events occur before what other events. For example, the B-theory fails to capture the dynamical fact that the present keeps moving along the A-series of events as time goes by.

Bertrand Russell was an influential promoter of the B-series. In response to Russell, his colleague McTaggart said:

No, Russell, no. What you identify as “change” isn’t change at all. The “B-series world” you think is the real world is…a world without becoming, a world in which nothing happens.

By “B-series world,” he means a world without an A-series. If Russell were to have lived in the twenty-first century, he might have responded to McTaggart by saying McTaggart’s mistake is to imply by analogy that a video file in a computer could never represent anything that changes because the file itself does not change.

Strictly speaking, the A-theory and the B-theory are theories about the ordering of events, not times. But if you think of a time as a set of simultaneous events, then the theories are about the ordering of times.

Members of the extrinsic camp have a responsibility to answer the following criticism: If, as they believe, objectively there is no dynamic flow or passage inherent in physical time, then why do so many people believe there is? Surely these people have gotten something right about the nature of time. Craig Callender has tried to defend the extrinsic theory against this criticism:

While physical time does not itself flow, we can explain why creatures like us embedded in a world like this one would nonetheless claim that it does…. In contrast to simply positing a primitive metaphysical flow and crossing one’s fingers in hope that somehow we sense it, the present theory advances independently suggested mechanisms, makes a number of specific claims, unifies some types of phenomena and theory, and suggests fruitful lines of inquiry. By any reasonable standard of theory choice, it is a better theory of passage than any currently on offer in metaphysics (Callender 2017, 227 and 263).

Let us turn now to criticisms that are more specific to the entropy camp. A critic might complain that members of the entropy camp cannot successfully defend their belief that the relation of earlier-than reduces to the lower-to-higher entropy relation rather than to the higher-to-lower entropy relation. At best they must presuppose what they need to prove.

Many say that, even though time’s arrow is directly correlated with the universe’s increase over time in its entropy, this is an interesting but merely contingent feature of the universe that is not crucial to characterizing or explaining time’s arrow, although it might be a sign of the arrow’s presence. Stop signs near intersections of roads are signs of the presence of cars in the world, but cars do not need stop signs in order to function properly. They do not need them in order to be cars.

Does time need an entropy arrow or any kind of extrinsic arrow at all? Ferrell Christensen has an interesting perspective on this. “It is puzzling that Boltzmann’s thesis of extrinsic temporal asymmetry is accepted so widely without question—it is virtually an article of faith among philosophers and physicists in certain quarters. I suggest that such an attitude is unjustified. At least for now, the assumption that time needs an extrinsic arrow is in error” (Christensen 1987, 247).

Castagnino and Lombardi argue that the arrow is intrinsic to relativistic spacetime, but it is not based on or reducible to entropy changes. They embrace:

Earman’s ‘Time Direction Heresy’, according to which the arrow of time, if it exists, is an intrinsic feature of spacetime which does not need and cannot be reduced to non-temporal features [such as entropy] (Earman 1974, 20) and it cannot be “defined” in terms of entropy…[and the] geometrical approach to the problem of the arrow of time has conceptual priority over the entropic approach, since the geometrical properties of the universe are more basic than its thermodynamic properties… (Castagnino and Lombardi 2009, 9).

Critics of the entropy theory also have complained that entropy is anthropomorphic and person-dependent, but time’s arrow is not. This criticism is explored later in this article after more has been said about the nature of entropy and after we consider the ideas of Edwin T. Jaynes.

Entropy change is not the same as complexity change. The state of the universe at the Big Bang was simple. Future state near equilibrium will be simple. Today’s state is quite complex. A leading alternative to the entropy theory among advocates of the extrinsic theory of time is Julian Barbour’s claim that it is complexity-change, that is at the heart of time’s arrow. See Barbour 2020.

Turning back to broader criticisms of the extrinsic theory that do not apply only to the entropy theory, Tim Maudlin and others complain that proponents of the extrinsic theory do not understand the nature of time-reversal symmetry and yet it is this mistake that causes so many of them to accept the following faulty argument that is at the heart of the extrinsic theory:

The fundamental physical laws are time-reversal invariant.
So, there is no direction of time in fundamental physics.

That issue is explored in the final section of this article.

4. The Entropy Arrow

The idea that entropy is intimately connected to time’s arrow originated from noticing that increases of entropy in closed and isolated systems are correlated with increases in time. The increases are directly correlated and highly correlated but not perfectly correlated because entropy increase is a strong tendency, not a certainty, although this difference between tendency and certainty was not clear to the physics community until thermodynamics became grounded in statistical mechanics. There are several background assumptions such as that the system has very many particles, and they readily change their configurations so that it looks as if chance is operating.

The word “entropy” is not part of the vocabulary of the ordinary person, but the concept is indispensable in modern science. It has many helpful characterizations depending on the situation. For example, in various situations it can be a useful numerical measure of disorder, randomness, the amount of useless energy, and nearness to equilibrium. In equilibrium, the system’s macroscopic properties are approximately constant. Think of energy as being the capacity of a system to do work. Entropy is not energy because, in isolated systems, the total energy is conserved over time (in a volume of space that is not expanding) while the total entropy tends to increase. Entropy is not a kind of substance that retains its identity over time. It is more like a property than a substance, a property of multi-particle systems that are able to change their configurations, most importantly any system with enough particles in motion. Like energy, what counts as real regarding entropy is differences in entropy.

In the 1870s, it was not known by physicists that there are atoms and molecules. Ludwig Boltzmann promoted the idea that matter is made of tiny corpuscles, but he believed this was merely a counterfactual assumption that was extremely helpful in describing thermodynamic behavior. Most all physicists believed at the time that matter is continuous, that it is infinitely divisible. Boltzmann had the fruitful insight that entropy can be characterized as a measure, namely the logarithm, of how many ways the constituent corpuscles of a closed and isolated physical system can be re-configured so that external observers cannot tell the difference macroscopically among all those configurations. It wasn’t until Einstein explained Brownian motion in terms of molecules in 1905 that the physics community came to believe in molecules.

Scientists never actually know the microstate at a given time of any macroscopic system, namely the positions and momenta of its massive number of molecules; they know only the values of some of the system’s useful, emergent, macroscopic variables such as volume, temperature, voltage, pressure, entropy, color, stiffness, center of mass, and so forth—or  much coarser-grained variables such as the number of cows that are present and whether one of them is being milked by a farmer. The values of those macro-variables constitute the system’s macrostate. The macrostate is an average over a great many microstates that would produce that same macrostate. There is multiple realizability of any macrostate, but at any point in time a macrostate is produced by only one microstate. Boltzmann’s insight was that, if seventy-seven molecules in a cup of coffee were shifted by a millionth of a meter, the microstate would change, but the macrostate would not. So, there are a great many microstates that will produce the very same macrostate.

The principal law in physics that involves entropy is the second law of thermodynamics. It has many different versions that are useful in different situations. The best, short, non-mathematical one for the philosophical considerations of this article is the following:

Second Law of Thermodynamics: There is a strong tendency for entropy to increase with time as a closed, isolated system moves towards equilibrium.

This is the case provided the system is not already at equilibrium, but if it is in equilibrium, then entropy would have a strong tendency to stay the same. This statement of the second law is from Richard Feynman. A system in which no matter and no energy can cross the system’s boundary is said to be closed and isolated, respectively. Another way to express the second law is to say that, for a closed system having a nonequilibrium initial condition, it is far more
likely to move to equilibrium than away from equilibrium. So, the proper answer to the question, “Why does total entropy increase?” is that this is what is most likely to happen.

The second law is not a fundamental law of physics. Physicists agree that it can be derived from the fundamental laws using the techniques of statistical mechanics. However, there is no consensus on the details of that derivation. From 1902 to 1905, Einstein worked unsuccessfully to derive the second law from basic physical features; and the derivation difficulty continues.

All other things being equal, physicists prefer exact laws to probabilistic laws, and the standard form of the second law is probabilistic. Expressed quantitatively, the second law is an inequality and not an equation. The second law is about a strong tendency or propensity, not a necessity, although in the early days of thermodynamics the law was mistakenly presented as a necessity—that entropy never decreases in a closed and isolated system. This mistake led others to make the inaccurate comment that the growth of life on Earth is inconsistent with the second law.

Regarding this notion of tendency, consider that when two dice are rolled, the likely result is to not get two sixes. The failure to roll two sixes is not a necessity, just very likely. Similarly for entropy. When the state of a system of many molecules changes, it has a propensity to change to a state with higher entropy because that is the most likely thing to happen—much, much more likely than becoming those two sixes. In closed and isolated systems, this entropy increase is enormously likely, almost certain in systems with a great many particles that frequently change their configurations.

Boltzmann was the first person to have this insight about likelihood. Since then, it has been considered a misunderstanding of the second law and of the concept of entropy to believe there is an asymmetric force or mechanism that causes entropy to increase.

The actual speed or rate with which a system increases its entropy is not specified by the second law. It depends on many factors that are not discussed in this article and that do not affect the philosophical claims about time’s arrow.

What the second law does not imply is that, for a single system that tends to increase its entropy, all of its sub-systems tend to increase their entropy, too. Entropy within some sub-system might decrease, but one can expect there will be an even greater entropy increase elsewhere in the system. For example, think of human civilization on Earth as a sub-system of the effectively isolated solar system. Civilization can thrive on Earth—but at the expense of entropy increase elsewhere in the solar system due to the sun’s continuing to burn its nuclear fuel.

The entropy camp must respond to the complaint that entropy is subjective or anthropomorphic. The influential physicist Edwin T. Jaynes remarked that:

Entropy is an anthropomorphic concept, not only in the well-known statistical sense that it measures the extent of human ignorance as to the microstate. Even at the purely phenomenological level, entropy is an anthropomorphic concept. For it is a property, not of the physical system, but of the particular experiments you or I choose to perform on it

because of our choice of what level of coarse-graining to use. Jaynes’ position is presented then attacked by the philosopher Adolf Grünbaum as misunderstanding the concept of entropy. Grünbaum’s point is that all the different ways of coarse-graining lead to nearly the same result, to the same value for the entropy. Thus, entropy is not significantly subjective (Grünbaum 1973 648-659). Roger Penrose agreed:

In view of these problems of subjectivity, it is remarkable that the concept of entropy is useful at all in precise scientific descriptions—which it certainly is! The reason for this utility is that the changes from order to disorder in a system, in terms of detailed particle positions and velocities, are utterly enormous, and (in almost all circumstances) will completely swamp any reasonable differences of viewpoint as to what is or is not ‘manifest order’ on the macroscopic scale (Penrose 1989, 310).

Not everyone adopted the position that Grünbaum and Penrose advocated. Carlo Rovelli and Huw Price did not. Rovelli said, “The directionality of time is…real but perspectival…: the entropy of the world in relation to us increases…and…the increase in entropy which we observe depends on our interaction with the universe….” For the entropy camp, the objectivity of time’s arrow turns on the outcome of this continuing debate.

Time’s arrow is not illustrated by the fact that tomorrow comes after today. That fact is true by definition. Instead, according to the entropy camp, the arrow of our universe is shown by the fact that today has a greater value of entropy than yesterday and so on for tomorrow and the foreseeable days ahead. The universe will never have a state just like it has today. Why is this? If things change, why can’t they change back? They can, but the probability that they will is insignificant.

According to the entropy camp, there are two ways to have time without an arrow. There would be no arrow if entropy were to stop changing; it would stop at equilibrium. There also would be no arrow if the entropy changes were to become randomly directed. Members of the intrinsic camp disagree with these two exceptions and say there is no way to have time without an arrow.  Even at equilibrium, time would continue to go  from past to future, they say.

For a not-too-mathematical introduction to entropy and some of its many sub-issues, see the chapter “Entropy and Disorder” in (Carroll 2010). For a more mathematical, but easy-to-understand introduction, see (Lebowitz 1993). For an examination of how entropy has been misunderstood in the literature, see (Lazarovici and Reichert 2015).

a. The Past Hypothesis

We would like to know why the universe’s entropy increases from past to future and not from future to past. Ludwig Boltzmann, with a little subsequent help from modern statistical mechanics, explained this by appealing to the second law of thermodynamics while assuming entropy was low in the past. But the entropy camp still needs to explain why the value of entropy was so low in the first place because this fact is not derivable from any of the fundamental laws, and it is not known a priori. Richard Feynman highlighted the need for this auxiliary assumption when he said in 1963:

So far as we know all the fundamental laws of physics, like Newton’s equations, are reversible. Then where does irreversibility come from? It comes from going from order to disorder, but we do not understand this till we know the origin of the order… for some reason the universe at one time had a very low entropy for its energy content, and since then the entropy has increased. So that is the way towards the future. That is the origin of all irreversibility, that is what makes the process of growth and decay, that makes us remember the past and not the future…. One possible explanation of the high degree of order in the present-day world is that it is just a question of luck. Perhaps our universe happened to have had a fluctuation of some kind in the past…. We would like to argue that this is not the case.

In 1965, Feynman said: “I think it necessary to add to the physical laws the hypothesis that in the past the universe was more ordered, in the technical sense, than it is today” (Feynman 1965, 116). In 2000, David Albert suggested that entropy was a minimum at the initial moment of the Big Bang (or, if there was no initial moment, then at a very early moment). This is the so-called Past Hypothesis. The hypothesis is not a dynamical law, but it is a law in the sense that it provides a lot of information in a compact and simple expression (which is all David Lewis requires of a law). Sean Carroll claimed:

You need the Past Hypothesis…. Now, to be fair, the story I am telling you here, this is the standard story that most physicists or philosophers would tell you. There are people who don’t go along with the standard story. There are people who…think that time just has a direction built into it…that there is a flow from the past to the future. I don’t think that. Most working physicists don’t think that, but there are people who think that.… Even if you believe that, it doesn’t by itself tell you whether the past had low entropy.

To me the logic goes in the following way. You might want to think that time fundamentally has a direction–or that time doesn’t fundamentally have a direction [and] it’s just that it started with low entropy and so we perceive it to have a direction macroscopically. But if you think that time fundamentally has a direction, you still need to explain why the early universe had low entropy. That doesn’t come for granted. There is no feature about saying time has a direction that then says if I take the current state of the universe and evolve it into the past, the entropy goes down. There is no connection there, right? So, even if you believe that time has a direction, you still need to have some past hypothesis. And once you have the past hypothesis, you don’t need to assume that time has a direction because it will have a direction macroscopically [because of the second law of thermodynamics] even if microscopically it’s completely reversible. I think that’s why most people like the Past Hypothesis package when it comes to explaining the asymmetry of time (Carroll 2022b).

In the above quotation, Carroll supported two claims: (1) The Past Hypothesis is needed in order to successfully use entropy to explain the existence of time’s arrow. (2) The extrinsic theory, especially the entropy theory, is more appropriate than any intrinsic theory for explaining time’s arrow.

Speaking for the community of cosmologists, Brian Greene issued a warning: The Past Hypothesis is “observationally motivated but theoretically unexplained.” Instead of merely adopting Albert’s hypothesis, cosmologists want a theoretical reason why the Big Bang began at a relatively low entropy macrostate, a reason that makes this low entropy natural and not merely assumed ad hoc. The search for that theoretical reason has turned out to be extremely difficult. About this search, Roger Penrose declared, “To me, it’s the greatest puzzle about the Big Bang.”

Craig Callender proposed a solution to Penrose’s puzzle: “It seems a philosophically respectable position to maintain that the Past Hypothesis doesn’t need explanation.” It is a brute fact, a rock-bottom truth.

Anything whatsoever could be explained by the right choice of unusual initial conditions. Is the Past Hypothesis true merely because of some random fluctuation? Remarking on what he believed is the weakness of that explanation, Carroll said:

The state of the early universe was not chosen randomly among all possible states. Everyone in the world who has thought about the problem agrees with that. What they don’t agree on is why the early universe was so special—what is the mechanism that put it in that state? And, since we shouldn’t be temporal chauvinists about it, why doesn’t the same mechanism put the late universe in a similar state? (Carroll 2010 301-2).

Motivated by this explanatory optimism, many cosmologists have produced speculative theories that appeal to special conditions long before the Big Bang that have led naturally to low entropy at the Big Bang. However, none of these theories has attracted many supporters.

Among cosmologists, the most widely supported explanation of why the Big Bang was at relatively low entropy is that this is implied by cosmic inflation, a special version of the Big Bang theory that supposes there was early, exponential inflation of space, a swelling that was much faster than the speed of light. This inflation theory establishes what direction the arrow of time points, and it is attractive also because it provides a ready explanation for many other unsolved problems in physics such as why the oldest and most distant microwave radiation arriving now on Earth from all directions is so uniform in frequency and temperature.

The leading theory for why this inflation began is that it was ignited by a fluctuation in a pre-existing inflaton field (not inflation field) that was at even lower entropy. It is believed that once all the energy of the universe was contained within the inflaton field. Unfortunately, there is no convincing reason why the inflaton field exists and why it fluctuated as it did and why entropy was lower before then—a convincing reason that this was natural and to be expected—other than that these assumptions help explain the value of entropy just as inflation began. So, the conclusion has to be accepted that Penrose’s puzzle remains unsolved.

5. Other Arrows

Time has many mini-arrows, and these are part of what constitutes time’s master arrow. This article has mentioned several, but there are others. These mini-arrows are deep and interesting asymmetries of nature, and philosophers and physicists would like to know how the mini-arrows are related to each other. Can some be used to explain others? This is the taxonomy problem.

Sean Carroll has a precisely expressed position on the taxonomy problem:

All of the macroscopic manifestations of the arrow of time…can be traced to the tendency of entropy to increase, in accordance with the Second Law of Thermodynamics.

So, that is the single thing that enables all these other asymmetries between past and future. The fact that entropy is increasing is the reason why there is an arrow of time. I would not say it is the arrow of time.

Not all members of the entropy camp agree with Carroll that entropy is the fundamental mini-arrow in terms of which all the other mini-arrows can be explained. Water on Earth naturally runs downhill and never uphill. Can this gravitational mini-arrow of time be accounted for by entropy change?

See (Maudlin 2007) for more discussion of which of time’s mini-arrows can be explained in terms of which others. The following sub-sections consider three of the many mini-arrows—the memory arrow, the cosmological arrow, and the causal arrow.

a. The Memory Arrow

The memory mini-arrow shows itself in the fact that we remember the past and never the future. The most popular explanation of this mini-arrow appeals to entropy. Past events often have present traces, but future events never have them. When you see a footprint in the sand, you think someone in the past stepped there, never that someone is coming. Past events also often leave present traces in our brains. Remembering an event is a mental process that interrogates the brain’s stored trace of the event. It is reviewing but not re-viewing the event. The trace in the sand requires the sand to increase its entropy; and the trace in our brains requires our neuron structure to increase its entropy.

Adrian Bardon offers a summary of the principal account:

In forming a memory, we reconfigure our neurons. This creates a local increase in order (within parts of our brain responsible for memory), but only at the expense of a slight expenditure of energy, a dissipation of bodily heat, and an overall entropy increase. Therefore, on this account, the formation of memories is relative to the larger thermodynamic trend. Our brains getting themselves into better order happens within the context of the trend towards overall heat dissipation. In a universe where systems necessarily decrease in entropy, our brains couldn’t be getting themselves into better order. According to the theory, then, the psychological order is dependent on the entropic arrow—and is thus just as contingent as the entropic arrow (Bardon 2013 121).

b. The Cosmological Arrow

In 1937, Arthur Eddington coined the phrase “cosmological arrow” as the name for the mini-arrow of time produced by the relentless increase in the volume of the universe over time.

The most-favored explanation of the cosmological mini-arrow, and why it is directly correlated with the increase in time, involves dark energy. In 1998, cosmologists discovered the universal presence of dark energy. It exerts a small, negative, repulsive pressure on space making it expand everywhere. For billions of years, space has slowly been increasing the rate of this expansion, namely the rate at which clusters of galaxies expand away from each other. As time goes on, it will never stop expanding because dark energy never dilutes away, so when the volume doubles, so does the amount of dark energy (or so it is predicted, but this has never been experimentally or observationally established). Things might have started out differently, but they did not. This is the standard explanation of why there is a cosmological mini-arrow.

The physicist Richard Muller argued that this cosmological arrow grounds time’s arrow. Muller is in the intrinsic camp. He said the problem of time’s arrow is really the problem of “why time flows forward rather than backward.” And: “The flow of time consists of the continuous creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space” during cosmic expansion. So, the arrow of time is cosmic expansion.

Most all cosmologists believe the Big Bang’s expansion is only of 3-D space and not 4-D spacetime. Muller challenged this popular position. He said, “The progression of time can be understood by assuming that the Hubble expansion takes place in 4 dimensions rather than in 3.” This is a version of the growing-block theory.

The usual assumption in cosmology is that 3D spatial expansion that is due to dark energy increases the universe’s energy but has no effect on the value of the universe’s entropy. According to Muller, this is not so; the 4-D expansion of spacetime produces not only new energy in violation of the conservation of energy but also entropy increase. See his article, “Throwing Entropy under the Bus.” Penrose believes Muller’s proposal about entropy lacks promise. Penrose has said, “There is a common view that the entropy increase in the second law is somehow just a necessary consequence of the expansion of the universe…. This opinion seems to be based on…misunderstanding” (Penrose 2004 701).

George Ellis also promoted the cosmological arrow as the key to understanding time’s arrow. He advocated an intrinsic theory of time’s arrow via a growing-block theory in which:

The cosmological direction of time…is set by the start of the universe. There is no mechanism that can stop or reverse the cosmological flow of time, set by the start of the universe. It sets the direction of flow of the time parameter t…; time starts at t = 0 and then increases monotonically…. The gravitational equations…are time symmetric (because the Einstein equations are time symmetric), but the actual universe had a start. This broke the time symmetry and set the master arrow of time: the universe is expanding, not contracting, because it started off from a zero-volume state. It had nowhere to grow but larger….

A ‘past condition’ cascades down from cosmological to micro scales, being realized in many microstructures and setting the arrow of time at the quantum level by top-down causation. This physics arrow of time then propagates up, through underlying emergence of higher-level structures, to geology, astronomy, engineering, and biology. …The overall picture that emerges is one of the arrow of time in physical systems being determined in a top-down manner, starting off from a special initial condition at the cosmological scale where the cosmological arrow of time sets the basic direction of causation, but then emerging in complex systems through bottom-up causation… (Ellis 2013).

c. The Causal Arrow

Noting that causes happen before their effects, some researchers have suggested that time’s arrow and its mini-arrows can be explained or defined in terms of the causal mini-arrow. This causal theory is a bold proposal for solving the taxonomy problem.

In his 1956 book The Direction of Time, Hans Reichenbach advocated a causal theory of time. Like Leibniz, he believed time order reduces to causal order. Reichenbach meant that macroscopic causality produces a temporal ordering on events, although it is insufficient for supplying time’s direction (that is, specifying which of the two possible orderings is actual). Think of a horizontal line. Its points are ordered from left to right but also from right to left. Intrinsically they have the same structure; one order is just as good as the other. What is needed in addition in order to distinguish one direction in time from the other, says Reichenbach, is entropy flow in branch systems. He does not rely on a hypothesis about entropy starting off at a minimum. For another causal theory of time, see chapters 10 and 11 of Real Time II by D.H. Mellor. For commentary on the effectiveness of the program of using causation to establish an ordering on time, see (Smart 1969) and “Time and Causation” by Mattias Frisch in (Dyke and Bardon 2013). Here are some highlights and background.

One issue is whether causes exist at both the microlevel and macrolevel. According to Sean Carroll, who is one of the principal advocates of the extrinsic theory of the arrow of time, our everyday notion of causation that is used in most philosophical discussions is a product of our living in a particular type of world, one in which there is a strong arrow of time at the macrolevel but not at the microlevel. He argues that, at the microlevel, the fundamental laws of physics imply there is no distinction between past and future and thus no causality. Yet particle physicists do speak of cause and effect when discussing the microlevel. However, according to Carroll, they are using a different notion of causality; they simply mean that signaling occurs slower than the speed of light and occurs only within light cones.

Many researchers have considered the concepts of cause and effect to be metaphysically dubious compared to the clearer concept of temporal order. Is it appropriate to assume that the concept of cause is even coherent? In the nineteenth century, the distinguished physicist Gustav Kirchhoff said the concept of cause is “infected with vagueness,” and Ernst Mach said the concept has no place in physics. In 1912, Bertrand Russell declared the concept to be a “relic of a bygone era” that is not useful in fundamental physics, and so physicists who aim to speak clearly about the foundations of physics should confine themselves to using differential equations and avoid causal discourse.

In the early twenty-first century, Nancy Cartwright, David Albert, and Judea Pearl supported at least the coherence and usefulness of causal discourse. Pearl remarked that, “Physicists write equations, but they talk cause and effect in the cafeteria.” But Huw Price declared that causal discourse is “perspectival” or subjective, and causal order is not an objective asymmetry of nature. He has made similar comments about entropy and time’s arrow.

Assuming for a moment that the concept of causality is in fact coherent and consistent and objective, how might it help us understand order relations for physical time? Some have said that to understand temporal precedence, it is sufficient to say:

Event C temporally precedes event E just in case event C could have been part of the cause of event E, the effect.

If this is correct, we can understand the “happens before” relation if we can understand the modal notion of “could have been part of the cause.” This proposal presupposes that we can be clear about how to distinguish causes from effects without relying on our knowledge of what happens before what. Can we? Mauro Dorato, among others, has argued that, “there is no physical property, attributable only to an event qua cause, that intrinsically (non-relationally) differentiates it from its effect” (Dorato 2000 S524). If causes can be distinguished from effects only by assuming causes happen before effects, then we have the fallacy of begging the question, which is a form circular reasoning.

Here are some suggestions that have been offered to avoid this circularity. The first comes from Frank Ransey, and it was adopted by Hans Reichenbach. Using a macroscopic concept of causality, we can know what causes what independently of knowing whether causes happen before effects by an:

Appeal to intervention:

Event C is a cause of event E if controlling C is an agent’s effective means of controlling E and not vice versa.

Appeal to probability:

One event is the cause of another if the appearance of the first event is followed with a high probability by the appearance of the second, and there is no third event that we can use to factor out the probability relationship between the first and second events and thereby declare the relationship to be spurious.

Appeal to conditional probability:

Fact C causes fact E if the chance of E, given C, is greater than the chance of E, given not-C.

Appeal to counterfactuals:

What “C causes E” means is that, if C had been different, but everything else had stayed the same, then E would have been different.

Appeal to possible worlds:

What “C causes E” means is that in a possible world like ours in which E doesn’t happen, C doesn’t happen.

Philosophers of physics must assess whether any of these appeals succeed, perhaps with revision.

Some other scholars such as Tim Maudlin recommend not relying upon any of these appeals because causal order and thus the distinction between cause and effect is a primitive feature of the universe and cannot be defined or explained in terms of anything more fundamental. This claim successfully avoids the charge of circular reasoning, but it faces other problems involving how our knowledge of patterns of events, such as how this kind of event being followed by that kind, ever produces our knowledge of causal relations.

For a detailed discussion of attempts to avoid the charge of circular reasoning when defining or explaining temporal precedence in terms of causes preceding their effects, see (Papineau 1996). See also (Woodward 2014). The philosophical literature on the nature of causation is voluminous, and here we touch briefly on only a few points, but a point of entry into the literature is this encyclopedia’s article on causation.

Can entropy increase be explained in terms of causality? Can the cosmological mini-arrow (the expansion of the universe) also be explained in terms of causality? These are difficult questions to answer positively, but some researchers are optimistic that this can be done as part of a broader program aimed at the taxonomy problem.

Instead of trying to define or explain time’s arrow in terms of the direction of causation, Ferrel Christensen suggested doing the reverse. Perhaps the features giving time its intrinsic arrow are what is responsible for the direction of causation. See (Christensen 1987) for more about this research program.

Or perhaps the features giving time its extrinsic arrow rather than intrinsic arrow are what is responsible for causation and its direction. That is a position taken by many members of the entropy camp. Sean Carroll offered a promissory note: “We should be able to trace the fact that causes precede effects to the fact that entropy is increasing over time” (with the help of the Past Hypothesis). He means all causes, not merely some causes.

Huw Price, who also is an advocate of a causal theory of time, has objected to Carroll’s position:

I argue that the asymmetry of causation cannot be reduced to any of the available physical asymmetries, such as the second law of thermodynamics. The basic problem for such a reduction is that the available physical asymmetries are essentially macroscopic, and therefore cannot account for causal asymmetry in microphysics (Price 1996, pp. 9-10).

Many physicists do not agree with Price’s assumption that there is causal asymmetry in microphysics. Brian Greene, for example, insists that a causal relationship is an emergent, macroscopic phenomenon.

6. Living with Arrow-Reversal

What would it be like to live with time’s arrow going in reverse to the way it actually does go? Before examining the many proposed answers to this question, remember that the phrase “arrow going in reverse” is ambiguous. The intrinsic camp and extrinsic camp agree that time reversal implies arrow reversal, but members of the intrinsic camp understand arrow-reversal to be about the reversal of time’s intrinsic passage, and members of the extrinsic camp understand it to be about process reversal such as explosions becoming implosions.

Sean Carroll said, “The thought experiment of an entire universe with a reversed arrow of time is much less interesting than that of some subsystem of the universe with a reversed arrow. The reason is simple: Nobody would ever notice…. If the whole thing ran in reverse, it would be precisely the same as it appears now.”

Roger Penrose claimed an entire universe with a reversed arrow of time is quite interesting. He said that, if we lived there, then we would ascribe teleological effects to omelets assembling themselves into unbroken eggs or water droplets distributed across the floor along with nearby broken shards of glass assembling themselves into an unbroken glass of water. According to Penrose, “‘Look!’, we would say, ‘It’s happening again. That mess is going to assemble itself into another glass of water!’”

There is a significant amount of empirical evidence that some processes in distant galaxies unfold in the same time direction as they do here on Earth, and there is no contrary empirical evidence. For example, light signals are received only after they are sent, never before. Nevertheless, Horwich said: “I will defend the idea that the ‘directional character’ of time might vary from one region to another” (Horwich 1987 42).

How about the “directional character” of time varying from one person to another? Ferrel Christensen said:

Conceivably, then, the earlier-later asymmetry of common experience is limited to our region of time or of space. Indeed, suppose it were so highly spatially localized that different persons could have opposite time-senses: then one would remember events which for another are still in the future (Christensen 1987 232-3).

In 1902 in his Appearance and Reality, the British idealist philosopher and member of the intrinsic camp F.H. Bradley said that when time runs backward, “Death would come before birth, the blow would follow the wound, and all must seem irrational.” The philosopher J.J.C. Smart disagreed about the irrationality. He said all would seem as it is now because memory would become precognition, so an inhabitant of a time-reversed region would feel the blow and then the wound, just as in our normal region.

Stephen Hawking, also in the extrinsic camp with Smart, speculated in 1988 in A Brief History of Time:

Suppose, however, that God decided that…disorder would decrease with time. You would see broken cups gathering themselves together and jumping back onto the table. However, any human beings who were observing the cups would be living in a universe in which disorder decreased with time. I shall argue that such beings would have a psychological arrow of time that was backward. That is, they would remember events in the future, and not remember events in the past.

Hilary Putnam investigated the possibility of communication between our region of space with a normal arrow and a region with a reversed arrow:

Suppose…there is a solar system X in which the people “live backwards in time” (relative to us). Then if we go and spy on these people (bringing our own radiation source, since their sun sucks radiation in, and doesn’t supply it), we will see the sort of thing we see when we watch a motion picture run backwards…. It is difficult to talk about such extremely weird situations without deviating from ordinary idiomatic usage of English. But this difficulty should not be mistaken for a proof that these situations could not arise.

Tim Maudlin disagreed with Putnam and argued that there is a convincing argument that these situations could not arise. Assuming naturalism and the supervenience of the mental on the physical, and introducing a creative use of the asterisk symbol, Maudlin said:

[G]iven the actual sequence of physical states of your body over the last ten minutes, the time-reversed sequence of time-reversed states is also physically possible…. Let’s call this sequence of states your time-reversed Doppelgänger. […Introducing an asterisk notation] I will speak of the Doppelgänger’s neuron*s; these are just the bits of the Doppelgänger which correspond, under the obvious mapping, to the original’s neurons. …[T]he physical processes going on the Doppelgänger’s brain* are quite unlike the processes going on in a normal brain. …The visual system* of the Doppelgänger is also quite unusual: rather than absorbing light from the environment, the retina*s emit light out into the environment. …In every detail, the physical processes going on in the Doppelgänger are completely unlike any physical processes we have ever encountered or studied in a laboratory, quite unlike any biological processes we have ever met. We have no reason whatsoever to suppose that any mental state at all would be associated with the physical processes in the Doppelgänger. Given that the Doppelgänger anti-metabolizes, etc., it is doubtful that it could even properly be called a living organism (rather than a living* organism*), much less conscious living organism.

Norbert Wiener claimed any attempt to communicate between the normal region and the arrow-reversed region would “ruin everything” because one of the regions would rapidly collapse—the one that is very delicately balanced so that the entropy flows in reverse compared to our region. Sean Carroll agreed. A microstate that leads to entropy decrease is extraordinarily unstable under small perturbations, and entropy increase would take over again very quickly.

Sean Carroll proposed an argument against there actually being any time-reversed regions. Throughout the universe, cosmic rays continually hurtle from one region into another, so if there were a time-reversed region it would continually be encountering cosmic rays, but they that would be anti-particles for that region. However, any encounter between particles and anti-particles creates large releases of energy, much larger than the energy arriving on Earth from any distant star. Those large releases have never been observed, but they would have been if they existed.

7. Reversibility and Time-Reversal Symmetry

a. Summary

Understanding reversibility and time-reversal symmetry can be difficult because of disagreement about how to use the relevant terminology. Here is a short summary of what is explained in the next section in more detail.

Physicists and philosophers of physics are interested in whether the universe is reversible. If it is, then from knowledge of the present state of an isolated system, we can both predict its future and retrodict its past—at least in principle. We can do this because of the conservation of information in a closed system.

Reversibility ≡ conservation of information.

Reversibility implies that, if your apartment burns down, then the information in the smoke, heat, light, and charred remains is sufficient for reconstructing your apartment. The apartment information is preserved, though it is not accessible practically. This reversibility is a feature we normally do not notice because at the macro-level we notice only one-way processes, such as a burned apartment never unburning.

Reversibility can be described without explicitly mentioning information. Reversibility, if it holds, is what allows us to say that if any process goes one way, it could in principle go the other way without violating any fundamental laws, even if it would violate a less fundamental law such as the second law of Thermodynamics. For example, if there is reversibility, then when a closed system changes from being in an instantaneous state 1 at time 1 to a new instantaneous state 2 at time 2 according to the fundamental laws, then those same laws imply that  if the system is in state 2 at time 2,  then it must have been in state 1 at time 1.

This notion of reversibility is sometimes informally called time-reversibility, and it is similar to another notion called time-reversal symmetry that is, unfortunately, also called time-reversibility. But,

Reversibility ≠ time-reversal symmetry.

The two are occasionally equated in the literature and one or the other might be meant when someone speaks of nature being “time reversible.” However, the first implies the second, but the second does not imply the first.

Both the intrinsic and extrinsic theories are committed to the position that time-reversal implies arrow-reversal even though they assign different meanings to both terms. They agree that time-reversal symmetry is invariance under the replacement of the time variable t by its negation -t in the equations.

Time-reversal symmetry ≡ time-reversal invariance under the time-reversal operation T.

But the T operation is ambiguous. The intrinsic theory says it is reversing time. The extrinsic theory says it is reversing the dynamics and not time itself and so it is misleading to call it the “time-reversal operation.” Nevertheless, adherents of the extrinsic theory continue to call it that because it has been customary to do so.

Intrinsic T ≡ time runs in reverse.

Extrinsic T ≡ processes run in reverse.

The extrinsic T is about event-order reversal. It would be a reversal of velocity if we were assuming that states are classical, but it would be a reversal of some other things if we were using quantum states. Informally, for an adherent of the extrinsic theory of time’s arrow, a theory is time-reversal symmetric just in case its laws do not indicate a time direction.

Ever since Isaac Newton, time-reversal symmetry was considered by scientists to be a brute feature of nature. It was presumed to be a universal symmetry that would hold in all fundamental theories. Then a direct failure of time-reversal symmetry was detected at the SLAC National Accelerator Laboratory in 2012. Nevertheless, most physicists and philosophers believe that this surprising discovery is very interesting but irrelevant to the problem of explaining the arrow of time. The entropy camp claims that time-reversal symmetry is irrelevant to time’s arrow because the symmetry has nothing to do with entropy.

b. More Details

What complicates the discussion of this topic is that often two people in disagreement will give different senses to the same term without explicitly mentioning this and perhaps not noticing it.

Let us delve into the details. There is a wide variety of entities that are described as being asymmetric. The literature speaks of a mathematical relation being asymmetric, a physical object being asymmetric, a time coordinate being asymmetric, a law of physics being asymmetric in time, a theory being asymmetric in time, time being asymmetric and there being time-reversal asymmetry. To navigate this maze of terminology, let’s begin with the word symmetry.

Symmetry is a special kind of pattern. It is about staying the same (staying invariant) in an important way despite a change. We won’t pause here to explore the many kinds of symmetry there are and what mathematicians and scientists have learned about symmetry. Instead, this section focuses on the two most relevant symmetries for time: time-translation symmetry and time-reversal symmetry.

There is nearly a consensus that, not counting a first moment if there were one, the universe is time-translation symmetric, although there is no consensus about the reasons for this. The symmetry is also called time-translation invariance and time’s homogeneity. Members of the intrinsic camp who say time passes would say the symmetry exists because time passes the same regardless of whether it is Tuesday or Friday or here or there. Members of the extrinsic camp would say, instead, that the symmetry exists because the allowable fundamental physical processes stay the same regardless of whether it is Tuesday or Friday or here or there. Members of both camps agree that specific physical systems within space-time need not have this symmetry; your body could be affected very differently if you walk across the traffic on the road on Tuesday instead of Friday.

Another symmetry, time-reversal symmetry, is the more important symmetry for discussions of time’s arrow, although many experts say it, too, is irrelevant to the arrow. Unsurprisingly, the two camps give different senses to the term “time-reversal symmetry,” although both camps would say that time-reversal symmetry requires time-translation symmetry.

The camps agree that time-reversal symmetry is the property of invariance under the time-reversal transformation, but they do not agree on what the time-reversal transformation T is. The intrinsic camp says it is about time running in reverse, but the extrinsic camp says it is about fundamental processes running in reverse and not time itself running in reverse. Both camps agree that time-reversal symmetry is not about time’s stopping and then reversing, and both agree that you cannot run experiments backward in time, regardless of the funding you are given.  But the two camps disagree about whether the universe’s being time-reversal asymmetric implies that time is intrinsically asymmetric. The intrinsic camp says it does. The extrinsic camp says it does not.

To explore the issue, consider what it means for a binary relation to be symmetric. Binary relations are two-argument or two-place relations. On the integers, the “=” relation is symmetric, the “<” relation is asymmetric, and the “≤” relation is neither. Symmetry and asymmetry are contraries of each other, so failure of asymmetry does not automatically produce symmetry.

A binary relation R on a set S of objects is symmetric if and only if, for any members of S, such as x and y, if xRy, then also yRx.

A binary relation R on a set S of objects is asymmetric if and only if, for any members of S, such as x and y, if xRy, then not also yRx.

The sequence of time coordinates in a coordinate system is always asymmetric and so is any space coordinate:

The time coordinates are asymmetric if and only if the binary relation “temporally less-than” is asymmetric on the set of time coordinates of point-events.

No disagreement here between the two camps.

A coordinate system is what the analyst places on a reference frame to help specify locations in the frame. Time coordinates are locations in time of point-events. “Noon” is a time coordinate, but it is an ambiguous one because it might be noon today or noon tomorrow. For mathematical usefulness, we want both our space and time axes and their parallel coordinate lines to be asymmetric regardless of whether space and time themselves are asymmetric. We ensure this usefulness via the choice of coordinate system that we add to a mathematical line. The geometric line without coordinates has no privileged direction. A continuous line from point x to point y is also a continuous line from y to x. Real numbers, the decimals, make good time coordinates on a mathematical line because in their natural order they have a greater-than direction that orients the points along the line, and because, if a point-event is moved continuously in time, its time coordinates also change continuously. These two features are crucial for an efficient application of calculus.

In describing time-reversal asymmetry (or anisotropy or invariance), the intrinsic camp says it crucially involves intrinsic properties, and the extrinsic camp says it involves only extrinsic properties. Here is the definition that the intrinsic camp uses:

(Intrinsic definition) Time is asymmetric if and only if time does not run backward (in any time period).

Asked what that means, they are likely to say:

Time does not run backward if and only if the “happens before” binary relation on the set of non-simultaneous point-events is asymmetric.

The reason given for why we should believe the “happens before” relation is asymmetric (and so time always runs one way and never runs backward) would likely mention the one-way character of passage or flow or becoming or perhaps now-ness running like fire along the fuse of time toward the future, with these being objective features of the universe. To  speak informally, but perhaps helpfully, if time fails to be asymmetric, this might be because it does not flow one way on Tuesday nights or does not flow one way on Mars, but otherwise flows one way. In those strange cases we would not say the failure of asymmetry implies symmetry of time, but that it implies failure of both symmetry and asymmetry.

Members of the extrinsic camp say any definition of time being asymmetric should not rely on the intrinsic character of the “happens before” relation. Instead, it should state whether every process that is described by the fundamental laws could have run backward. On this latter point, there is disagreement in the literature. A small number of experts say not to use that phrase “every process” and to replace it with “the most significant processes that produce time’s arrow as we encounter it in our normal lives outside a particle physics laboratory.”

Most members of the extrinsic camp prefer definitions such as these:

(Extrinsic definition) Time is symmetric if and only if all the fundamental theories are time-reversible symmetric.

(Extrinsic definition) A theory is time-reversal symmetric (or time-reversal invariant) if and only if, whenever a history, such as a sequence of instantaneous states S1, S2, … Sn, is physically possible according to that theory, then the temporally inverted sequence T(Sn ), T(Sn-1 )… T(S1) is also possible according to that theory.

n is a positive integer. T is the so-called “time-reversal operator” that reverses the dynamics, but not time itself. For any particle, its position is the same in T(Si) and Si, but its velocity and momenta are reversed. T(T) must be the identity operator. The point of creating the definition is to make more precise what it means to say “the same thing is happening backwards in time.” Note that the definition does not refer to a coordinate system. A coordinate system is not a feature of the physical world; it is not real. A theory is time-reversal invariant if and only if time reversal turns solutions into solutions and non-solutions into non-solutions of the theory’s equations.

A state at some instant is a complete description at that instant of the universe or of whatever system is the focus of attention. A possible history is a sequence of instantaneous states. A dynamical law, as opposed to other kinds of laws, says how one state is to be updated to another state over time. Assuming the dynamical laws are not probabilistic, the dynamic laws determine what new states will occur or have occurred. A state is often called a configuration, so when a system changes, what changes is its configuration. To perturb a system is to change its configuration. All states are mutually exclusive at a time in the sense that, if a system is in one state, then it cannot also be in another state at the same time. More succinctly, it is common to say that a theory is time-reversal symmetric if its laws do not indicate a time direction.

Reversal in the extrinsic sense for a classical system obeying Newton’s mechanics works like this. For arbitrary times t1 and tn, suppose the physical system evolves over a sequence of times from an initial time t1 to a final time tn. Time-reversal invariance, according to the extrinsic theory, implies that taking the state at tn and reversing all the velocities (or momenta) of the constituent particles (not only the speed but also the direction of motion), then evolving the system back to the initial time t1 according to the laws, and then flipping all the velocities (or momenta) again, will produce the original state at t1. What was done is undone. If she is walking forward up the steps in state, say, S3, with a velocity v3, then in T(S3), the result of applying time-reversal transformation to S3, she is walking backward down the steps at velocity -v3, which is what you’d see if the film of the sequence were shown to you in reverse.

Under the time-reversal transformation, gravity does not become repulsive, nor do two north poles of magnets attract each other. The fundamental laws stay the same. It is only the instances of sequences of actual processes that reverse in time.

For simplicity, the above definition of being time-reversal symmetric assumed a digital sequence of times for the process’ evolution even though in the real world the process may evolve continuously. That assumption does not affect the philosophical points being made. For how to define T in other theories such as electromagnetic theory and quantum field theory, see (Earman 2002). Another assumption was that we were using systems of identical point particles. In less ideal systems, the state needs to specify the mass, orientation and angular momentum of each elementary particle.

Time-reversal symmetry of all the fundamental laws implies determinism because the final state can be in the future, but determinism does not imply reversibility or even time-reversal symmetry. A deterministic theory can allow two different present states to evolve into the same future state. The theory of relativity is deterministic and time-reversal symmetric (except where singularities are involved). So is statistical mechanics. So is the evolution of the wave function in quantum mechanics, assuming no measurement is being made. There is no consensus on whether determinism and time-reversal symmetry hold during the quantum measurement process, so there is no consensus in the field of physics on whether the universe is deterministic.

Over the subsequent several hundred years, beginning with the acceptance of Newtonian mechanics, all the fundamental laws of physics were believed by all physicists to be time-reversal symmetric (assuming the quantum measurement process is an exception that is not covered by these laws). This was envisioned as being simply a very precise and very fundamental feature of reality. Then, in 1964, new experimental results suggested that the decay of some long-lived K0 mesons (called neutral kaons) very probably violated time-reversal symmetry. In 2012, the violation of time-reversal symmetry was more carefully confirmed for the B0 meson; for details, see (Lees et. al. 2012). Failure of symmetry, however, does not produce asymmetry because symmetry and asymmetry are contraries.

Although decays of these weak mesons occur very rarely and have no significant effects on our ordinary lives outside the physics laboratory, one cannot avoid the conclusion that there does exist a fundamental law involving the weak nuclear force that is sensitive to time’s direction and to the binary relation “happens before.” Those who accept what might be called the “single exception assumption”—the assumption that the existence of even a single time-asymmetric fundamental law of nature is a sufficient condition for a fundamental mini-arrow and for time overall to fail to be symmetric—are committed to the claim that our universe’s laws are actually not all time-reversal symmetric.

This is the position of most physicists. Some others do not accept the single exception assumption, believing it overemphasizes trivial exceptions, and they affirm that time is time-reversal symmetric. They cover up trivial exceptions so as not to mislead the reader with insignificant complications; they say the laws of fundamental physics are “not significantly sensitive to time’s direction.”

Despite the problem with T symmetry, there is another symmetry called CPT symmetry that has never been known to be violated. This is an amalgam of three transformations: charge reversal, parity reversal, and time reversal as a combined transformation. The combination has never been violated in any process. C is charge replacement (plus charge for minus and vice versa, or replacing particles by their anti-particles). P is parity reversal (reversing handedness or being the same as your mirror reflection), and T is time-reversal.

There is yet another, different notion called reversibility or sometimes time-reversibility. Failure to distinguish it from time-reversal symmetry under T occasionally leads to confusion. Reversibility says the information of a closed system is conserved over time. This implies time-reversal invariance, but the converse does not hold. We do not usually notice this reversibility because we almost always notice only macro-processes that normally go in only one way. For example, if we have a glass of cool water, we cannot tell whether it evolved from a glass of cool water or a glass of ice cubes with lukewarm water. Nevertheless, if the universe is reversible, then Laplace’s Demon could tell.

According to a member of the extrinsic camp:

Time-reversal invariance T has nothing to do with the arrow of time. That feature of particle physics [namely T], while important in its own right, leaves reversibility intact. The arrow of time stems from the fact that the macroscopic world does not appear reversible, even though the microscopic world seemingly is…What, then, is responsible for irreversibility, and thus for time’s arrow? The ultimate answer lies in the fact that the entropy of a closed system, including the universe as a whole, tends to increase over time (Carroll 2022c, 127 and 129).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Albert, David Z. 2000. Time and Chance. Harvard University Press. Cambridge, MA.
    • A technical treatise surveying the philosophical and physical issues involving time’s direction. The book never uses the word “arrow.” Reading between the lines, he says time has no intrinsic arrow, and that the arrow is basically due to processes taking place over time, but he is not optimistic that all the mini-arrows can be explained in terms of entropy change. On p. 11, Albert defines what it is for something to happen backward. On p. 20, he says, “classical electrodynamics is not time-reversal invariant.” Chapter 4 introduces his Past-Hypothesis that he calls a “fundamental…law of nature.” Albert describes a connection between the problem of time’s direction and the measurement problem in quantum mechanics.
  • Arntzenius, Frank. 1997. “Mirrors and the Direction of Time.” Philosophy of Science, December, Vol. 64, Supplement. Proceedings of the 1996 Biennial Meetings of the Philosophy of Science Association. Part II: Symposia Papers. The University of Chicago Press, pp. S213-S222.
    • Challenges an argument he had made two years earlier that if even one of the laws of nature is not time-reversal symmetric, then that is all that is required for us to infer that time has an objective direction. Assumes familiarity with quantum mechanics.
  • Arntzenius, Frank and Hilary Greaves. 2009. “Time Reversal in Classical Electromagnetism,” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, Volume 60, Number 3, pp. 557-584.
    • Surveys the debate between David Albert and David Malament regarding what time-reversal means, especially whether it always means reversing the order of states in a trajectory.
  • Augustynek, Zdzisla W. 1968. “Homogeneity of Time,” American Journal of Physics, 36, pp. 126-132.
    • A discussion of the physical equivalence of all time’s instants and the principles of invariance and symmetry involving time. The author worries about whether the principles of time symmetry are analytic or synthetic. Is time’s symmetry tautological or empirical? Explains why the principle of time’s symmetry implies, via Noether’s Theorem, the principle of the conservation of energy. Aimed at an audience of professional physicists.
  • Barbour, Julian B. 2020. The Janus Point: A New Theory of Time. Basic Books, New York.
    • Contains an argument that the Past Hypothesis is a necessary consequence of a new fundamental law of the universe yet to be discovered.
  • Bardon, Adrian. 2013. A Brief History of the Philosophy of Time. Oxford University Press.
    • Chapter five offers a brief analysis of the relationships among the psychological arrow, the causal arrow, and the entropic arrow.
  • Black, Max. 1959. “The Direction of Time.” Analysis, Vol. 19, No. 3, pp. 54-63.
    • Contains this philosopher’s proposal to explain the direction of time in terms of the objectivity of the truth values of ordinary language statements involving the temporal relation is-earlier-than.
  • Bourne. Craig. 2002. “When Am I? A tense time for some tense theorists?” Australasian Journal of
    Philosophy, 80, 359–371.

    • Criticizes the growing-block model for its inability to distinguish our own objective present.
  • Braddon-Mitchell, David and Kristie Miller. 2017. “On Time and the Varieties of Science.” Boston Studies in the Philosophy and History of Science, vol. 326, pp. 67-85.
    • A study of how physics and the other sciences should work together to understand time. The authors say, “The special sciences…tell us where, amongst a theory of the physical world, we should expect to locate phenomena such as temporality; they tell us what it would take for there to be time. Physical theory tells us whether there is anything like that in the world and what its hidden nature is.”
  • Broad, Charlie Dunbar. 1923. Scientific Thought. London: Kegan Paul.
    • C.D. Broad describes a version of the moving spotlight theory, a growing-block theory.
  • Broad, Charlie Dunbar. 1938. Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy, Volume II. Cambridge University Press.
    • Examines McTaggart’s proposals, including the existence of a universal now. Oaklander has written extensively on Broad’s treatment of time and how it changed during his lifetime. Broad’s 1938 position is considered to be his clearest and most defensible treatment.
  • Callender, Craig. 1998. “Review: The View from No-When” in The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 49, March. pp. 135-159.
    • This is a review of Huw Price’s book Time’s Arrow and Archimedes’ Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time. He says Price aims to answer the question: What does the world look like when we remove the effects of our temporally asymmetric prejudices?
  • Callender, Craig. 1999. “Reducing Thermodynamics to Statistical Mechanics: The Case of Entropy.” Journal of Philosophy vol. 96, pp. 348-373.
    • Examines the issue of how to explain thermodynamics in terms of statistical mechanics. The techniques of statistical physics are needed when systems are so complicated that statistical features are more useful than exact values of the variables—for example the statistical feature of average kinetic energy that is called temperature is more useful than trying to acquire knowledge of the position at a time of this or that molecule. From 1902 to 1905, Einstein worked unsuccessfully to derive the 2nd Law from basic physical features.
  • Callender, Craig. 2004. “There is No Puzzle About the Low Entropy Past.” In Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Science, edited by C. Hitchcock, pp. 240-55. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
    • Explores some critical comments made about the Past Hypothesis.
  • Callender, Craig. 2017. What Makes Time Special? Oxford University Press, Oxford, U.K.
    • A comprehensive monograph on the relationship between the manifest image of time and the scientific image. He claims philosophers who defend parts of the manifest image have created all sorts of technical models (that is, theories) that try to revise and improve the scientific image. According to Callender, “These models of time are typically sophisticated products and shouldn’t be confused with manifest time. Instead, they are models that adorn the time of physics with all manner of fancy temporal dress: primitive flows, tensed presents, transient presents, ersatz presents, Meinongian times, existent presents, priority presents, thick and skipping presents, moving spotlights, becoming, and at least half a dozen different types of branching! What unites this otherwise motley class is that each model has features that allegedly vindicate core aspects of manifest time. However, these tricked out times have not met with much success” (p. 29). Chapter 11 is devoted to the flow of time.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2008. “The Cosmic Origins of Time’s Arrow.” Scientific American.
    • Describes the thermodynamic arrow and speculates that to solve the problem of the direction of time, one should accept a multiverse in which in some universes time runs in reverse to how it does in ours.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2010. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time. Dutton/Penguin Group: New York.
    • A popular, lucid, and deep presentation of what can be learned from current science about the nature of time. Of all Carroll’s popular publications, this is the one that has the most to say about the arrow of time.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2016, The Big Picture. Dutton/Penguin Random House. New York.
    • “The parts address how a complex universe can emerge from basic physical laws, how we can discover these laws, what we already know about them, and what implications they have for the evolution of life, and for consciousness, and for human values,” says David Kordahl in his review in The New Atlantis. Carroll explains how entropy can rise even as a system becomes less complex.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2019. “Sean Carroll on Causality and the Arrow of Time, ” FQXI Foundational Questions Institute, August 21. Available on YouTube.
    • He sketches his program to explain how entropy increase can explain the causal arrow. He admits that his explanation is still a work in progress.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2020. “Why Boltzmann Brains are Bad,” in Current Controversies in Philosophy of Science, 1st Edition, edited by Shamik Dasgupta, Ravit Dotan, and Brad Weslake. Routledge. pp. 7-20.
    • Argues that theories predicting Boltzmann Brains cannot simultaneously be true and justifiably believed.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2022a. “The Arrow of Time in Causal Networks.” U.C. Berkeley Physics Colloquium, April 22. YouTube
    • Discussion of how the thermodynamic arrow can explain the causal arrow. This talk is aimed at mathematical physicists.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2022b. “Ask Me Anything,” Mindscape podcasts, April AMA and May AMA.
    • Carroll discusses time’s having no fundamental or intrinsic arrow, why we need to adopt the Past Hypothesis, and how to define the term “arrow of time.”
  • Carroll, Sean. 2022c. The Biggest Ideas in the Universe: Space, Time, and Motion. Dutton/Penguin Random House.
    • A sophisticated survey of what modern physics implies about space, time, and motion, especially relativity theory without quantum mechanics, with some emphasis on the philosophical issues. Introduces the relevant equations, but it is aimed at a general audience and not physicists. Chapter Five on Time is highly recommended. Treats time’s arrow in terms of entropy.
  • Castagnino, Mario and Olimpia Lombardi. 2009. “The Global Non-Entropic Arrow of Time: From Global Geometrical Asymmetry to Local Energy Flow,” Synthese, vol. 169, no. 1 July, pp. 1-25.
    • Challenges the claim that time’s arrow should not be explicated in terms of entropy. The authors’ goal is to show how to define a global arrow of time from the geometrical properties of spacetime and how this arrow can be “transferred to the local level, where it takes the form of a non-spacelike local energy flow that provides the criterion for breaking the symmetry resulting from the time-reversal invariant laws of local physics.”
  • Christensen, Ferrel. 1987. “Time’s Error: Is Time’s Asymmetry Extrinsic?” Erkenntnis March pp. 231-248.
    • Examination of whether time’s arrow is intrinsic or extrinsic. He claims, “there are no very strong arguments in favor of the view that time is only extrinsically anisotropic. Moreover, there are some serious arguments in opposition to the claim.” He is in the intrinsic camp, but he says the concept of time passing is nonsensical.
  • Dainton, Barry. 2020. Time and Space, Second Edition. McGill-Queens University Press. Ithaca, 2010.
    • An easy-to-read textbook that surveys the major philosophical issues about time and offers many arguments. It is not primarily about time’s arrow. Regarding time’s arrow, Dainton suggests the goal is “defining the direction of time in terms of entropy” (p. 49) rather than explaining the direction in terms of entropy.
  • Davies, Paul C. W. 1974. The Physics of Time Asymmetry. University of California Press. Berkeley and Los Angeles.
    • A survey by a proponent of the extrinsic theories of time.
  • Deng, Natalja M. 2017. “On ‘Experiencing Time’: A Response to Simon Prosser,” Inquiry: An Interdisciplinary Journal of Philosophy 61(3), pp. 281-301.
    • A chapter-by-chapter critique of (Prosser 2016). Explores the psychology of time.
  • Dieks, Dennis. 1975. “Physics and the Direction of Causation,” Erkenntnis, vol. 25, no. 1, July, pp. 85-110.
    • Explores how physics can recognize the direction of causation.
  • Dieks, Dennis. 2012. “The Physics and Metaphysics of Time, European Journal of Analytic Philosophy, pp. 103-119.
    • Surveys the physics and metaphysics of time and argues in favor of the B-theory over the A-theory. Confronts the claim that physics needs to be revised to account for the arrow and the claim that the B-theory cannot give an accurate description of our temporal experiences.
  • Dorato, Mauro. 2000. “Becoming and the Arrow of Causation.” Philosophy of Science, Sept., Vol. 67, Supplement. Proceedings of the 1998 Biennial Meetings of the Philosophy of Science Association. Part II: Symposia Papers September, pp. S523-S534.
    • The author focuses on what would be required to establish the objectivity of becoming.
  • Dorato, Mauro. 2006. “Absolute Becoming, Relational Becoming and the Arrow of Time: Some Non-Conventional Remarks on the Relationship Between Physics and Metaphysics,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics, 37, 3, 2006, 559–76. Reprinted in (Oaklander 2008).
    • Provides an in-depth analysis of becoming. Argues that the arrow of becoming is more fundamental than the arrow of entropy change. And he asserts that, because the conceptual link between becoming and the issue of the direction of time requires regarding the asymmetry of causation as fundamental, such an asymmetry cannot turn out to be merely extrinsically correlated to irreversible physical processes.
  • Dyke Heather & Adrian Bardon 2013. (eds.), A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Wiley-Blackwell.
    • A collection of academic articles on a wide variety of issues in the philosophy of time.
  • Earman, John. 1974. “An Attempt to Add a Little Direction to ‘The Problem of the Direction of Time.’” Philosophy of Science. 41: 15-47.
    • Comments on the role of semantic ambiguity in discussions of time’s arrow. Speculates on life in a time-reversed world. Argues that the arrow of time is an intrinsic feature of spacetime.
  • Earman, John. 2002. “What Time Reversal Invariance Is and Why It Matters.” International Studies in the Philosophy of Science, 16, 245-264.
    • Explains how the time reversal operator must be defined differently in different situations.
  • Earman, John. 2006. “The ‘Past Hypothesis’: Not Even False.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics 37, 399-430.
    • Criticizes the Past Hypothesis and the view that the asymmetry of entropy can be explicated through its role within cosmological theories.
  • Earman, John. 2008. “Reassessing the Prospects for a Growing Block Model of the Universe,” International Studies in the Philosophy of Science 22, 135-164.
    • Explains the growing-block model and examines arguments for and against it. Hermann Minkowski invented the block model in 1908. His block contains not all the future events that might happen but rather all the future events that will happen.
  • Ellis, George. 2013. “The Arrow of Time and the Nature of Spacetime.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part B: Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics 44 (3): 242-262.
    • Promotes a growing block theory with top-down causation due to a past condition of the universe. What he means by a past condition is the idea that global conditions determine the arrow of time by top-down causation. His ideas are developed with the tools of quantum field theory.
  • Falk, Dan. 2008. In Search of Time: The History, Physics, and Philosophy of Time. St. Martin’s Griffin. New York.
    • A popular survey by a reliable guide.
  • Farr, Matt and Alexander Reutlinger. 2013. “A Relic of a Bygone Age? Causation, Time Symmetry and the Directionality Argument.” Erkenntnis 78, Supplement 2, pp. 215-235.
    • An assessment of Russell’s argument that the time symmetry of fundamental physics is inconsistent with the time asymmetry of causation.
  • Freundlich, Yehudah. 1973. “‘Becoming’ and the Asymmetries of Time,” Philosophy of Science, Vol. 40, No. 4., pp. 496-517.
    • Examines the senses in which time’s arrow is mind-dependent, and the relationship between the possible asymmetries of phenomenological and physical time. He says, “We find that physical time acquires meaning only through phenomenological time, and that phenomenological time is fundamentally asymmetric. …The central thesis of this paper will be that merely to differentiate between appearance and reality is implicitly to assume a directed flow of time [from past to future]. …The focal point of any phenomenalist position is the assertion that the meaningful content of any physical statement is exhausted by the claims that statement makes as regards the ways we are appeared to.”
  • Frisch, Mathias. 2013. “Time and Becoming” in Dyke and Bardon 2013.
    • Endorses the dynamic theory and develops the causal theory.
  • Frisch, Mathias. 2014. Causal Reasoning in Physics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Explores the variety of issues involved in using causal reasoning in physics, including the relationship of the causal mini-arrow to other mini-arrows.
  • Grandjean, Vincent. 2022. The Asymmetric Nature of Time: Accounting for the Open Future and the Fixed Past. Synthese Library, volume 468. Springer.
    • This book develops and defends a version of the growing-block theory.
  • Greene, Brian. 2004. The Fabric of the Cosmos: Space, Time, and the Texture of Realty. Alfred A. Knopf. New York.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides a popular introduction to cosmology, relativity, string theory, and time’s arrow.
  • Greene, Brian. 2020. “Your Daily Equation #30: What Sparked the Big Bang?” May 20.
    • Describes repulsive gravity and cosmic inflation. Presupposes the viewer’s facility with partial differential equations.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. 1973. Philosophical Problems of Space and Time. Second edition. Alfred A. Knopf. New York.
    • His views on time’s arrow are chiefly presented in the two chapters “The Anisotropy of Time,” and “Is the Coarse-Grained Entropy of Classical Statistical Mechanics an Anthropomorphism?” The first edition of 1963 was expanded in 1973 with new material.
  • Horwich, Paul. 1987. Asymmetries in Time: Problems in the Philosophy of Science. The MIT Press. Cambridge.
    • An analysis of many theories of time’s arrow. Horwich claims there is no intrinsic difference between the past and the future. Time itself is symmetric and does not itself have an arrow. David Hume was correct, says Horwich, in asserting that causes happen before their effects only because of our human convention about what those words mean. Horwich has a unique solution to the taxonomy problem that gives special weight to the knowledge mini-arrow and its explanation in terms of the fork asymmetry. This book is written for experts in the field, but its long review in (Savitt 1991) is an easier, helpful first step into the Horwich treatise. So is the explanation of Horwich’s views in (Dainton 2000) on pages 55-62 and in many other places throughout the book.
  • Hutten, Ernest H. 1959. “Reviewed Work(s): The Direction of Time by H. Reichenbach.” Philosophy, Vol. 34, No. 128, January, pp. 65-66.
    • Briefly summarizes the main themes in Reichenbach’s causal theory of time. Hutten believes Reichenbach makes several serious, irrepairable mistakes in his argument.
  • Ismael, Jenann T. 2017. “Passage, Flow, and the Logic of Temporal Perspectives,” in Time of Nature and the Nature of Time: Philosophical Perspectives of Time in Natural Sciences. Ed. by Christophe Bouton and Philippe Huneman. Boston Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 326. Springer International Publishing. Pp. 23-38.
    • A careful examination of some of the formal features of temporal perspectives such as time’s passage. Explores the logic of the content of temporal experience rather than of the quality of that experience.
  • Kajimoto, Naoyuki and Kristie Miller and James Norton. 2020. “Primitive Directionality and Diachronic Grounding,” Acta Analytica, pp. 195-211.
    • Considers how to defend the claim that time’s directionality is primitive by using the concept of grounding.
  • Katz, Bernard D. 1983. “The Identity of Indiscernibles Revisited,” Philosophical Studies: An International Journal for Philosophy in the Analytic Tradition 44, July, pp. 37-44.
    • Explores the difficulties of distinguishing intrinsic properties from extrinsic properties.
  • Lazarovici, Dustin, and Peter Reichert. (2015). “Typicality, Irreversibility and the Status of Macroscopic Laws.” Erkenntnis 80:4. 689-716.
    • Examines how entropy and the second law have been misunderstood in the academic literature. Considers theories that imply the Past Hypothesis.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin. 2007. The Images of Time: An Essay on Temporal Representation, Oxford University Press. Oxford.
    • Explores temporal representation and temporal phenomenology.
  • Lebowitz, Joel L. 1993. “Boltzmann’s Entropy and Time’s Arrow.” Physics Today. September. Pp. 32-38.
    • A popular treatment of the entropy arrow aimed at high school and college undergraduate physics teachers.
  • Lees, J. P., et al. 2012. “Observation of Time-Reversal Violation in the B0 Meson System.” Physical Review Letters, 109, 211801.
    • SLAC National Accelerator Laboratory at Stanford University reported the first direct test of time-reversal symmetry without any dependence on charge reversal or parity reversal. B0 mesons failed to decay time-reversibly via the weak interaction.
  • Lewis, David. 1979. “Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow.” Noûs, 13, 455-476.
    • Explores the possibility of explaining time’s arrow in terms of the causal arrow.
  • Lewis, David. 1983. “New Work for a Theory of Universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61, pp. 343-377.
    • Explores the difficulties in distinguishing intrinsic properties from extrinsic properties.
  • Loew, Christian. 2018. “Fundamentality and Time’s Arrow.” Philosophy of Science, 85. July. Page 483.
    • Develops Maudlin’s views on time and develops Maudlin’s idea that causes produce their effects. Claims an intrinsic arrow better explains why there is asymmetry of entropy change.
  • Matthews, Geoffrey. 1979. “Time’s Arrow and the Structure of Spacetime,” Philosophy of Science, vol. 46, pp. 82-97.
    • Argues that time’s arrow is a local rather than a global feature of the universe.
  • Maudlin, Tim. 2002. “Remarks on the Passing of Time,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 2002, New Series, Vol. 102 (2002), pp. 259-274. Oxford University Press.
    • Defends his claim that the passage of time is an intrinsic asymmetry in the structure of spacetime itself, an asymmetry that is metaphysically independent of the material contents of spacetime such as the entropy gradient. Focuses not on the positive reasons to accept his claim but rather on the negative program of undermining arguments given against his claim.
  • Maudlin, Tim. 2007. The Metaphysics Within Physics. Oxford University Press. Oxford.
    • Argues that time passes. Maudlin says the fundamental laws of nature and the direction of time require no philosophical analysis, but causation does. He says spacetime has a fundamental, intrinsic, inexplicable temporal direction, and this explains why earlier states produce later states but not vice versa. He objects to the Humean program of analysis in philosophy of physics that implies (1) “laws are nothing but patterns in the physical state of the world,” and (2) the direction of time is “nothing but a matter of how physical systems are disposed to behave throughout the universe” (which is the extrinsic theory). Maudlin advocates a non-Humean primitivist approach to both the fundamental laws and time’s arrow.
  • Mellor, D. H. 1991. “Causation and the Direction of Time.” Also published in Erkenntnis 1975, 35, pp. 191–203.
    • A defense of a causal theory of time.
  • Mellor, D. H. 1995. The Facts of Causation. Routledge.
    • An influential analysis of the concept of causation that emphasizes singular causation, the causation of one fact by another.
  • Miller, Kristie. 2013. “Presentism, Eternalism, and the Growing Block,” in (Dyke and Bardon 2013, 345-364).
    • A careful presentation of the three main ontologies of time followed by an investigation of whether disagreements among advocates of the ontologies are involved in merely semantic disagreements and are “talking past” each other. The pros and cons of each ontology are considered.
  • Miller, Kristie. 2019. “The Cresting Wave: A New Moving Spotlight Theory.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 49, pp. 94-122.
    • A revision on the moving spotlight theory that adds a cresting wave of causal efficacy. Miller is not a temporal dynamist.
  • Miller, Kristie and A. Holcombe and A.J. Latham. 2020. “Temporal Phenomenology: Phenomenological Illusion versus Cognitive Error.” Synthese 197, pp. 751–771.
    • Our temporal phenomenology is our experience of temporal properties and relations such as order, succession, duration, and passage. The article defends the claim that a person can make a cognitive error in saying it seems to them that time passes because they fail to make a careful distinction between “how actual time is taken to be” and “a representation of what it is to be time: of what is essential to time.” Investigates how we represent time in all possible worlds.
  • Miller, Kristie and John Norton. 2021. “If Time Can Pass, Time Can Pass at Different Rates,” Analytic Philosophy Vol. 62, March, pp. 21–32.
    • Offers an explication of the notion of time passing and considers whether it always must pass at the same rate.
  • Muller, Richard A. 2016. Now: The Physics of Time, New York: W. W. Norton & Co.
    • Argues that the arrow of time is not due to entropy increase but is only correlated with it. The relevant chapter is titled “Throwing Entropy under the Bus.”
  • Muller, Richard A. and Shaun Maguire. 2016. “Now and the Flow of Time,” arXiv.
    • An original argument for why the thermodynamic arrow is not the fundamental arrow of time. The progression of time can be understood, they say, by assuming the flow of time consists of the continuous creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space. This is a version of the growing block theory of time.
  • Musser, George. 2017. “A Defense of the Reality of Time,” Quanta Magazine. May 16.
    • A condensed interview with Tim Maudlin.
  • North, Jill. 2002. “What Is the Problem about the Time-Asymmetry of Thermodynamics? A Reply to Price.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 53, No. 1, March, pp. 121-136.
    • Commentary and critique of the positions taken by Huw Price. “Price argues that there are two conceptions of the puzzle of the time-asymmetry of thermodynamics. He thinks this puzzle has remained unsolved for so long partly due to a misunderstanding about which of these conceptions is the right one and what form a solution ought to take.” North argues that it is Price’s understanding that is mistaken.”
  • North, Jill. 2008. “Two Views on Time Reversal.” Philosophy of Science, Vol. 75, No. 2, April, pp. 201-223.
    • Clearly addresses the issue of what we could and should mean by time reversal in the context of classical physics.
  • North Jill. 2009. “The ‘Structure’ of Physics: A Case Study,” Journal of Philosophy, vol. 106, pp. 57–88.
    • North asks what a fundamental theory of physics says about the structure of the world when the theory has two significantly different mathematical formulations, such as Newton’s mechanics in its Lagrangian and Hamiltonian versions. Each of the two has its own system of coordinates and equations of motion. North considers scenarios in which the two versions of a theory indicate different structures of the world itself versus when they indicate simply two different descriptions of the same underlying structure.
  • Oaklander, L. Nathan. 1985. “A Reply to Schlesinger.” The Philosophical Quarterly, Vo. 35, No. 138, January, pp. 93-94.
    • Criticizes the moving-now theory that was presented by Schlesinger. One criticism is that the theory is committed to the claim that the same NOW applies to all times, but that impales the theory on the horns of a dilemma: it is either incoherent or circular.
  • Oaklander, L. Nathan. 2008. Editor. The Ontology of Time. Routledge.
    • A collection of diverse, but influential, articles on the major issues about time.
  • Papineau, David. 1996. “Philosophy of Science,” in The Blackwell Companion to Philosophy edited by Nicholas Bunnin and E. P. Tsui-James, Blackwell Publishers Inc.: Oxford. pp. 290-324.
    • Discusses a variety of attempts to escape the circularity problem that arises in trying to define or explain time’s arrow.
  • Penrose, Oliver. 2001. “The Direction of Time.” in Chance in Physics: Foundations and Perspectives, edited by J. Bricmont, D. Dürr, M. C. Galavotti, G. C. Ghirardi, F. Petruccione and N. Zanghi. Springer Verlag.
    • Adopts an extrinsic theory of time’s arrow. Argues that Reichenbach’s principle of the common cause is the proper approach to understanding the time direction of asymmetric processes. Presumes a familiarity with advanced mathematics and physics.
  • Penrose, Roger. 1989. The Emperor’s New Mind: Concerning Computers, Minds, and The Laws of Physics. Oxford University Press: Oxford. Reprinted with corrections in 1990.
    • A wide-ranging, popular physics book that contains speculations on living in a time-reversed world plus other philosophical commentary by this future Nobel Prize winner.
  • Penrose, Roger. 2004. The Road to Reality: A Complete Guide to the Laws of the Universe. Alfred A. Knopf: New York.
    • An expert in general relativity, Penrose provides an advanced presentation of all the most important laws of physics, interspersed with philosophical comments.
  • Pooley, Oliver. 2013. “Relativity, the Open Future, and the Passage of Time,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, CXIII part 3: 321-363.
    • Discusses whether time passes according to the B-theory and the theory of relativity.
  • Price, Huw. 1996. Time’s Arrow & Archimedes’ Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time. Oxford University Press, Inc.: Oxford.
    • This book is filled with clear, expository material, but Price offers much original material. He is interested in more clearly separating subjective asymmetries from objective asymmetries. He argues that, objectively, time has no arrow, it has no direction, it does not flow, the future can affect the past, and philosophers of physics need to adopt an Archimedean point of view outside of time in order to discuss time in an unbiased way. Although Price admits we cannot literally step outside time, we can take the Archimedean point of view of “nowhen” from which we can view the timeless block universe and see that time’s arrow is inherently anthropomorphic, as is the directionality of causation. Makes a case that many arguments trying to show how and why temporal order exists presuppose that temporal order exists. He claims there is no good reason to rule out the possibility that what happens now can depend on what happens in the future, at least for microphysical phenomena. The book is reviewed in (Callender 1998).
  • Price, Huw. 2002. “Boltzmann’s Time Bomb,” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, March, Vol. 53, No. 1, pp. 83-119.
    • Price agrees that statistical arguments alone do not give us good reason to expect that entropy will always continue to increase because a past hypothesis is also needed. He clarifies the different assumptions being made in attempts to explain thermodynamic asymmetry, and he emphasizes that if thermodynamics were not time-asymmetric this could be for two different reasons: “The world might exhibit entropic gradients in both temporal directions, without a global temporal preference, at least on the large scale. For example, there might be a single long period of entropy ‘increase’, ‘followed’ by a matching period of entropy ‘decrease’.” Or, instead, “entropy might be approximately constant everywhere, and at all times” (pp. 89-90). Price’s position is challenged in (North 2002).
  • Prosser, Simon. 2016. Experiencing Time. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • Covers a broad range of topics in the interface between the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of time. Claims the A-theory is unintelligible. Says it is impossible to experience the passage of time. Argues that the present is not an ontologically privileged time. But see (Deng 2017).
  • Reichenbach, Hans. 1956. The Direction of Time. University of California Press: Berkeley.
    • An influential, technical treatise on the causal theory of time. One noteworthy feature is that it tries to establish the direction of time using the concept of entropy but without relying on a past hypothesis. Reichenbach died before being able to write his final chapter of the book that was to be on the relationship between time’s objective properties and our subjective experience of time.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. 2018. The Order of Time. Riverhead Books. New York.
    • A popular presentation of this physicist’s many original ideas about time. Claims that both entropy and the Past-Hypothesis are human-dependent.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1913. “On the Notion of Cause,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 13, pp. 1-26.
  • Russell argues that causes and causal relations should not be part of the fundamental physical description of the world.
  • Salmon, W. 1971. Statistical Explanation and Statistical Relevance. University of Pittsburgh Press: Pittsburgh.
    • Salmon argues that a good definition of causation should ward off counterexamples due to common causes.
  • Savitt, Steven F. 1991. “Asymmetries in Time: Problems in the Philosophy of Science by Paul Horwich,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Volume 21, no. 3, pp. 399-417.
    • A review of (Horwich 1987).
  • Savitt, Steven F. 1995. Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time.” Editor. Cambridge University Press. Cambridge.
    • A collection of independent research papers by distinguished investigators of the topic.
  • Savitt, Steven F. 2018. “In Search of Passing Time.”
    • Argues that time has an intrinsic arrow in the block universe.
  • Schlegel, Richard. 1968. Time and the Physical World. Dover Publications, Inc., New York. This Dover reprint was originally published by Michigan State University Press in 1961.
    • This book in the philosophy of physics compares the manifest image to the scientific image of physical time as it was understood in 1961.
  • Schlesinger, George. 1985. “How to Navigate the River of Time”, The Philosophical Quarterly. Vol. 35, No. 138. January. Pp. 91-92.
    • Presents and defends the moving-now theory. He agrees that time seems to everyone to pass. Schlesinger defends the claim that time can change its rate. In the same journal two years earlier, Oaklander had claimed Schlesinger’s position is incoherent.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. 1974. Space, Time, and Spacetime. University of California Press: Berkeley, CA.
    • Attacks the intrinsic theory of the arrow. Surveys the causal theory of time and various theories of time’s arrow. Pages 379-394 describe the changes in Boltzmann’s thinking about the second law.
  • Skow, Bradford. 2009. “Relativity and the Moving Spotlight,” The Journal of Philosophy 106, pp. 666-678.
    • Argues that the moving spotlight theory is consistent with special relativity, particularly with its implication that the present or the NOW is relative to a reference frame.
  • Skow, Bradford. 2011. “Experience and the Passage of Time.” Philosophical Perspectives, 25, Metaphysics, pp. 359-387.
    • An examination of the argument that the best explanation of our experience is that time passes. Focuses on the moving spotlight theory which he believes is the best A-theory of time.
  • Skow, Bradford. 2012. “One Second Per Second.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 85, pp. 377-389.
    • Analyzes various arguments for and against the coherence of the phrase “a rate of one second per second,” which has multiple interpretations.
  • Smart, J.J.C. 1949. “The River of Time.” Mind, October, Vol. 58, No. 232, pp. 483-494.
    • Provides a variety of arguments against the intrinsic theory of time’s arrow. He emphasizes that things change, and events happen, but events do not change except when they are described too vaguely. This article emphasizes the analysis and clarification of ordinary language using the techniques of “logical grammar.”
  • Smart, J.J.C. 1967. “Time” in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. by Paul Edwards, volume 8. Macmillan Publishing Co., Inc. & The Free Press: New York, pp. 126-134.
    • A survey of philosophical issues about time from a member of the extrinsic camp. The views of the intrinsic camp are not given much attention.
  • Smart, J.J.C. 1969. “Causal Theories of Time,” The Monist, Vol. 53, No. 3. July. Pp. 385-395.
    • Criticizes some of the early causal theories of time from Hans Reichenbach, Adolf Grünbaum, and Henryk Mehlberg.
  • Th´ebault, Karim P. Y. 2021. “The Problem of Time,” in Routledge Companion to the Philosophy of Physics, edited by Eleanor Knox and Alastair Wilson. Routledge: London.
    • Explores the representation of time in classical, relativistic, and quantum physics. Not written at the easy intellectual level of the present encyclopedia article, but it provides a broad, accurate introduction to the problem of time and its academic literature.
  • Tooley, Michael. 1997. Time, Tense, and Causation. Oxford University Press, Clarendon Press: Oxford.
    • A growing-block model. In his dynamic and tensed theory of time, facts are tenseless states of affairs that come into existence, never to go out of existence. Causation is primitive, and the theory of relativity needs modification to allow for our common present. Tooley believes that both the tenseless theory and the standard tensed theory are false.
  • Wallace, David. 2013. “The Arrow of Time in Physics,” in (Dyke and Bardon 2013).
    • In this chapter, Wallace concentrates on the arrow of time as it occurs in physics. He explores how the arrow can exist even though there is time symmetry in thermodynamics and statistical mechanics. He provides a broad discussion of arrows other than the entropy arrow.
  • Williams, Donald C. 1951. “The Myth of Passage,” Journal of Philosophy, volume 48, July 19, pp. 457-472.
    • Influential argument that time’s passage is a myth.
  • Woodward, James. 2014. “A Functional Account of Causation; or, A Defense of the Legitimacy of Causal Thinking by Reference to the Only Standard That Matters—Usefulness (as Opposed to Metaphysics or Agreement with Intuitive Judgment),” Philosophy of Science, volume 81, pp. 691–713.
    • A technically demanding treatment of the question “How does causation fit with physics?” and of the impact an appropriate answer has for understanding the metaphysical, descriptive, and functional roles of causation.
  • Zimmerman, Dean. 2005. “The A-Theory of Time, the B-Theory of Time, and ‘Taking Tense Seriously’.” Dialectica volume 59, number 4, pp. 401-457.
    • In exploring the issues mentioned in the title, Zimmerman considers different versions of the spotlight theory, those with a real future and those without, those having events shedding their A-properties and those without this shedding.
  • Zimmerman, Dean. 2011. “Presentism and the Space-Time Manifold”, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Time, ed. C. Callender, pp. 163–244, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Considers how to reconcile presentism with relativity theory by finding a privileged reference frame.


Author Information

Bradley H. Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.