Frequently Asked Questions about Time
This supplement provides background information about many of the topics discussed in both the main Time article and its companion article What Else Science Requires of Time. It is not intended that this article be read in order by section number.
Table of Contents
- What Are Durations, Instants, Moments, and Points of Time?
- What Is an Event?
- What Is a Reference Frame?
- What Is an Inertial Frame?
- What Is Spacetime?
- What Is a Minkowski Diagram?
- What Are Time’s Metric and Spacetime’s Interval?
- How Does Proper Time Differ from Standard Time and Coordinate Time?
- Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
- Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
- How Is Time Relative to the Observer?
- What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
- What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
- What are the Absolute Past and the Absolute Elsewhere?
- What Is Time Dilation?
- How Does Gravity Affect Time?
- What Happens to Time near a Black Hole?
- What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox?
- What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
- How Are Coordinates Assigned to Time?
- How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
- What Is Essential to Being a Clock?
- What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?
- What Is Our Standard Clock or Master Clock?
- Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
- What Is a Field?
A duration is a measure of elapsed time. It is a number with a unit such as seconds. The second is the agreed-upon standard unit for the measurement of duration in the S.I. system (the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d’Unités). How to define the term second is discussed later in this supplement.
Geologists prefer to mark off durations in larger units than seconds, such as epochs, periods, eras, and, largest of all, eons. Some physicists might prefer a unit much smaller than a second, such as a nanosecond, which is a billionth of a second, or a jiffy, which is the time it takes light to travel one centimeter in a vacuum.
In informal conversation, an instant or moment is a very short duration. In physics, however, an instant is even shorter. It is instantaneous; it has zero duration. This is perhaps what the poet T.S. Eliot was thinking of when he said, “History is a pattern of timeless moments.”
The interval of time between two events is the elapsed time between the two. The measure of this interval is called the duration of time between the two. A duration always needs a unit. “4” is not a duration, but “4 seconds” is. The term interval in the phrase spacetime interval is a different kind of interval.
There is another sense of the words instant and moment which means, not a very short duration, but rather a time, as when we say it happened at that instant or at that moment. Midnight could be such a moment. This is the sense of the word moment meant by a determinist who says the state of the universe at one moment determines the state of the universe at another moment.
It is assumed in physics (except in some proposed theories of quantum gravity) that any interval of time is a linear continuum of the points of time that compose it, but it is an interesting philosophical question to ask how physicists know time is a continuum. Nobody could ever measure time that finely, even indirectly. Points of time cannot be detected. That is, there is no physically possible way to measure that the time is exactly noon even if it is true that the time is noon. Noon is 12 to an infinite number of decimal places, and no measuring apparatus is infinitely precise. But given what we know about points of time, we should not be trying to detect points of time. Belief in the existence of points of time is justified holistically by appealing to how they contribute to scientific success, that is, to how the points give our science extra power to explain, describe, predict, and enrich our understanding. But, to justify belief in the existence of points, we also need confidence that our science would lose too many of these virtues without the points.
Consider what a point in time really is. Any interval of time is a real-world model of a segment of the real numbers in their normal order. So, each instant corresponds to just one real number and vice versa. To say this again in other words, time is a line-like structure on sets of point events. Just as the real numbers are an actually infinite set of decimal numbers that can be linearly ordered by the less-than-or-equal relation, so time is an actually infinite set of instants or instantaneous moments that can be linearly ordered by the happens-before-or-at-the-same-time-as relation in a reference frame. An instant or moment can be thought of as a set of point-events that are simultaneous in a reference frame.
Although McTaggart disagrees, all physicists would claim that a moment is not able to change because change is something that is detectable only by comparing different moments.
There is a deep philosophical dispute about whether points of time actually exist, just as there is a similar dispute about whether spatial points actually exist. The dispute began when Plato said, “[T]his queer thing, the instant, …occupies no time at all….” (Plato 1961, p. 156d). Some philosophers wish to disallow point-events and point-times. They want to make do with intervals, and want an instant always to have a positive duration. The philosopher Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), said time is not made of point-times but rather is a composition of overlapping intervals, that is, non-zero durations. Dummett required the endpoints of those intervals to be the initiation and termination of actual physical processes. This idea of treating time without instants developed a 1936 proposal of Bertrand Russell and Alfred North Whitehead. The central philosophical issue about Dummett’s treatment of motion is whether its adoption would negatively affect other areas of mathematics and science. It is likely that it would. For the history of the dispute between advocates of point-times and advocates of intervals, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).
In the manifest image, the universe is more fundamentally made of objects than events. In the scientific image, the universe is more fundamentally made of events than objects.
In ordinary discourse, an event is a happening lasting some duration during which some object changes its properties. For example, this morning’s event of buttering the toast is the toast’s changing from having the property of being unbuttered this morning to having the property of being buttered this morning.
The philosopher Jaegwon Kim suggested that an event should be defined as an object’s having a property at a time. So, two events are the same if they are both events of the same object having the same property at the same time. This suggestion captures much of our informal concept of event, but with Kim’s suggestion it is difficult to make sense of the remark, “The vacation could have started an hour earlier.” On Kim’s analysis, the vacation event could not have started earlier because, if it did, it would be a different event. A possible-worlds analysis of events might be the way to solve this problem of change.
Physicists use the term event this way, but they also speak of events composed of point-events in which no value is intended for any physical variable, and this is another sense of the word event. Point events are simply locations in spacetime with zero duration, so it would be less misleading to call these sorts of events “event locations.” All fundamental laws of physics are written in terms of point-events.
The scientific notion of point-event also has its own two meanings. A point-event can be a point of spacetime plus a property at the point, that is, the value of some variable such as mass. But a point-event can also be simply the spacetime location itself. Hopefully, when a possible ambiguous use of the term event occurs, the context is there to help disambiguate.
The point-event is fundamental in science in the sense that, to a non-quantum physicist, any object is just a series of its point-events and the values of their properties. For example, the process of a ball’s falling down is a continuous, infinite series of point-events along the path in spacetime of the ball. The reason for the qualification about “non-quantum” is discussed at the end of this section.
A physical space is different from a mathematical space. Mathematical space is a collection of points, and these points need not represent points in any real, physical space. Depending on the mathematical space, a point might represent anything. For example, a point in a two-dimensional mathematical space might be an ordered-pair consisting of an item’s sales price in dollars and a salesperson’s name.
The physicists’ notion of point-event in physical space, rather than mathematical space, is metaphysically unacceptable to some philosophers, in part because it deviates so much from the way the word event is used in ordinary language and in our manifest image. For other philosophers, it is unacceptable because of its size, its infinitesimal size. In 1936, in order to avoid point-events altogether in physical space, Bertrand Russell and A. N. Whitehead developed a theory of time that is based on the assumption that all events in spacetime have a finite, non-zero duration. They believed this definition of an event is closer to our common sense beliefs, which it is. Unfortunately, they had to assume that any finite part of an event is an event, and this assumption indirectly appeals to the concept of the infinitesimal and so is no closer to common sense than the physicist’s assumption that all events are composed of point-events.
McTaggart argued early in the twentieth century that events change. For example, he said the event of Queen Anne’s death is changing because it is receding ever farther into the past as time goes on. Many other philosophers (those of the so-called B-camp) believe it is improper to consider an event to be something that can change, and that the error is in not using the word change properly. This is still an open question in philosophy, but physicists use the term event as the B-theorists do, namely as something that does not change.
In non-quantum physics, specifying the state of a physical system at a time involves specifying the masses, positions and velocities of each of the system’s particles at that time. Not so in quantum mechanics. The simultaneous precise position and velocity of a particle—the key ingredients of a classical event—do not exist according to quantum physics. The more precise the position is, the less precise is the velocity, and vice versa.
More than half the physicists in the first quarter of the 21st century believe that a theory of quantum gravity will require (1) quantizing time, (2) having time or spacetime be emergent from a more fundamental entity, (3) having only a finite maximum number of events that can occur in a finite volume. Current relativity theory and quantum theory allow an infinite number.
The ontology of quantum physics is very different than that of non-quantum physics. The main Time article intentionally overlooks this. But, says the physicist Sean Carroll, “at the deepest level, events are not a useful concept,” and one should focus on the wave function.
For more discussion of what an event is, see the article on Events.
A reference frame is a standard point of view or a perspective that is usually intended to display quantitative measurements about places of interest in a space and the phenomena that take place there. To be suited for this quantitative purpose, a reference frame needs to include a coordinate system that is given an origin and orientation in the space and that provides sets of numbers as names of points. Each number is one of the point’s coordinates. To add a coordinate system to a reference frame for a space is to add an arrangement of reference lines (or curves) to the space so that all points of space have names. Reference lines (or curves) going through the origin are designated as “axes.” It is usually assumed that an observer is located at the origin. This origin can be designated non-ostensively, that is, without pointing and saying “This event is the origin event” or “That event occurs five minutes after t=0.” This claim was denied in 1949 by the influential theoretical physicist Hermann Weyl in his Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science.
The name of a point in a two-dimensional space is an ordered set of two numbers (coordinates) for the point’s signed distance along each axis from the origin point, which is customarily named (0,0). A coordinate “-3 meters” represents a distance of six meters from the coordinate “+3 meters.” For a four-dimensional space, a point is named with a set of four numbers. A coordinate system for n-dimensional space is a mapping from each point to an ordered set of its n coordinate numbers. Usually these numbers are real numbers.
If a space has a coordinate system, then it has an infinite number of them because there can be variations in the choice of an origin, or an orientation of the axes, or the scale.
To represent events and not simply places in space, a time axis is needed in addition to a space axis. The notion of a reference frame is modern; Newton did not know about reference frames. If one of the dimensions of the coordinate system is to be time, then the coordinate system for space should be imagined as also having tiny, non-influential, synchronized clocks available at each spatial location that report the standard times when events occur there. These ideal clocks are at rest in the frame. What it means for them to be synchronized is that they report the same time and click at the same rate. A real, physical clock that was once synchronized with these imaginary, ideal clocks is likely not to stay synchronized, due to time dilation. There are many choices for reference frames, although the Cartesian coordinate system is the most popular. Its coordinate axes are mutually perpendicular.
Reference frames can be created for physical space, or for time, or for both, or for things having nothing to do with real space and time, such as a two-dimensional graph of the price of rice grown in China vs. weight of rice exported from China into Pakistan. Even if the space represented by the coordinate system is real physical space, its coordinates are never physically real; you can add two numbers but not two points. From this fact it can be concluded that not all the mathematical structures in the coordinate system are also reflected in what the system represents.
Below is a picture of a reference frame spanning a space that contains a solid ball. More specifically, there is a 3-dimensional Euclidean space that uses a Cartesian coordinate system with three mutually perpendicular axes fixed to a 3-dimensional (3-D) solid ball representing the Earth:
The origin of the coordinate system is at the center of the ball, and the coordinate system is oriented by specifying that the y-axis be a line going through the north pole and the south pole. Two of the three coordinate axes intersect the blue equator. The red line represents a typical longitude. The three coordinates of any point in this space form an ordered set (x,y,z) of the x, y, and z coordinates of the point, with commas separating each from the other coordinate labels for the point. There are points on the Earth, inside the Earth, and outside the Earth. For 3-D space, the individual coordinates normally would be real numbers. For example, we might say a point of interest has the three coordinates (4.1,π,0), where it is assumed all three numbers have the same units, such as meters. It is customary in a three-dimensional space to label the three axes with the letters x, y, and z, and for (4.1,π,0) to mean that 4.1 meters is the x-coordinate of the point, π meters is the y-coordinate of the same point, and 0 meters is the z-coordinate of the point. The center of the Earth in this graph is located at the origin of the coordinate system; the origin of a frame always has the coordinates (0,0,0). Mathematical physicists frequently suppress talk of the units and speak of π being the y-coordinate, although strictly speaking the y-coordinate is π meters. The x-axis is all the points (x,0,0); the y-axis is all the points (0,y,0); the z-axis is all the points (0,0,z), for all possible values of x, y, and z.
In a coordinate system, the axes need not be mutually perpendicular, but to be a Cartesian coordinate system, the axes must be mutually perpendicular, and the coordinates of a point in spacetime must be the values along axes of the perpendicular projections of the point onto the axes. All Euclidean spaces can have Cartesian coordinate systems. If the space were the surface of the sphere above, not including its insides or outside, then this two-dimensional space could not have a two-dimensional Cartesian coordinate system because all the axes could not lie within the space. The 2D surface could have a 3D Cartesian coordinate system, though. A more useful coordinate system than either Cartesian system might be a 3D spherical coordinate system.
Changing from one reference frame to another does not change any phenomenon in the real world being described with the reference frame, but is merely changing the perspective on the phenomena. If an object has certain coordinates in one reference frame, it usually has different coordinates in a different reference frame, and this is why coordinates are not physically real—they are not frame-free. Durations are not frame-free. Neither are positions, directions, and velocities.
The word reference is often dropped from the phrase reference frame, and the term frame and coordinate system are often used interchangeably. A frame for the physical space in which an object has zero velocity is called the object’s rest frame or proper frame.
When choosing to place a frame upon a space, there are an infinite number of legitimate choices. Choosing a frame carefully can make a situation much easier to describe. For example, suppose we are interested in events that occur along a highway. We might orient the z-axis by saying it points up away from the center of Earth, while the x-axis points along the highway, and the y-axis is perpendicular to the other two axes and points across the highway. If events are to be described, then a fourth axis for time would be needed, but its units would be temporal units and not spatial units. It usually is most helpful to make the time axis be perpendicular to the three spatial axes, and to require successive seconds along the axis to be the same duration as seconds of the standard clock. By applying a coordinate system to spacetime, a point of spacetime is specified uniquely by its four independent coordinate numbers, three spatial coordinates and one time coordinate. The word independent implies that knowing one coordinate of a point gives no information about the point’s other coordinates.
Coordinate systems of reference frames have to obey rules to be useful in science. No accepted theory of physics allows a time axis to be shaped like a figure eight. Frames need to honor the laws if they are to be perspectives on real events. For all references frames allowed by relativity theory, if a particle collides with another particle, they must collide in all allowed reference frames. Relativity theory does not allow reference frames in which a photon is at rest. Quantum mechanics does. A frame with a time axis in which your shooting a gun is simultaneous with your bullet hitting a distant target is not allowed by relativity theory.
How is the time axis oriented in the world? This is done by choosing t = 0 to be the time when a specific event occurs such as the big bang, or the birth of Jesus, or the beginning of an experiment. A second along the t-axis usually is required to be congruent to a second of our civilization’s standard clock, especially for clocks not moving with respect to that clock.
Reference frames have dimensions. A smooth space of any number of dimensions is called a manifold. Newtonian mechanics, special relativity, general relativity, and quantum mechanics all require the set of all events to form a four-dimensional manifold. Informally, what it means to be four-dimensional is that points are specified with four independent, real numbers. The actual, more formal definition of dimension is somewhat complicated.
Treating time as a special dimension is called spatializing time, and doing this is what makes time precisely describable mathematically in a way that treating time only as becoming does not. It is a major reason why mathematical physics can be mathematical.
One needs to be careful not to confuse the features of time with the features of the mathematics used to describe time. Einstein admitted [see (Einstein 1982) p. 67] that even he often made this mistake of failing to distinguish the representation from the object represented, and it added years to the time it took him to create his general theory of relativity. Note that “7:00” is not a time, but 7:00 is, although a typical coordinate system uses real numbers for times instead of the notation with a colon.
The main time article states that the laws of physics are time-translation symmetric. It follows that all time points are physically equivalent, relative to the laws of physics. There are some additional assumptions involved. It is assumed that in any coordinate system each instant of time I is assigned a unique numerical coordinate, say t. Nearby times are assigned nearby coordinates. Times are not numbers, but time coordinates are. When a time-translation occurs with a magnitude of t0, the instant I at coordinate t is now associated with another instant I’ at coordinate t’ and this equality holds: t’ = t + t0. If the laws of physics are time-translation symmetric, then the laws of mathematical physics are invariant relative to the group of transformations of time coordinate t expressed by t = t + t0 where t0 is an arbitrarily chosen constant real number.
The Cartesian coordinate system can handle all sorts of curved paths and curved objects, but it fails whenever the space itself curves. What we just called “the space” could be real physical space or an abstract mathematical space or spacetime or just time.
A reference frame fixed to the surface of the Earth cannot have a Cartesian coordinate system because the surface curves. Spaces with a curved geometry require curvilinear coordinate systems in which the axes curve as seen from a higher dimensional Euclidean space in which the lower-dimensional space is embedded. Any Euclidean space can have a Cartesian coordinate system.
If the physical world were two-dimensional and curved like the surface of a sphere, then a two-dimensional Cartesian coordinate system for that space must fail to give coordinates to most places in the world. To give all the points of the 2D world their own Cartesian coordinates, one would need a 3D Cartesian system, and each point in the world would be assigned three coordinates, not merely two. For the same reason, if we want an arbitrary point in our real, curving 4D-spacetime to have only four coordinates and not five, then the coordinate system must be curvilinear and not Cartesian. But what if we are stubborn and say we want to stick with the Cartesian coordinate system and we don’t care that we have to bring in an extra dimension and give our points of spacetime five coordinates instead of four? In that case we cannot trust the coordinate system’s standard metric to give correct answers.
Let’s see why this is so. Although the coordinate system can be chosen arbitrarily for any space or spacetime, different choices usually require different metrics. Suppose the universe is two-dimensional and shaped like the surface of a sphere when seen from a higher dimension using a 3D Cartesian coordinate system. The 2D sphere has no inside or outside; the extra dimension is merely for our visualization purposes. Then when we use the 3D system’s metric, based on the 3D version of the Pythagorean Theorem, to measure the spatial distance between two points in the space, say, the North Pole and the equator, the value produced is too low. The correct value is higher because it is along a longitude. The 3D Cartesian metric says the shortest line between the North Pole and a point on the equator cuts through the Earth and so leaves the universe. The correct metric would compute distance within the space along a geodesic line (a great circle in this case) that is confined to the sphere’s surface. Also, this great circle is not intrinsically curved in the 2D space, although it looks curved to a 3D being viewing it from a flat 3D Euclidean space in which the curved 2D space is embedded. However, to a 2D being in the space following the great circle from the North Pole to a point on the equator, the path would be the shortest distance between the two points and so wouldn’t look curved to the 2D being. But it would be longer than the shortest distance computed between the same two points by the 3D being using a 3D Cartesian coordinate system.
The orbit of the earth around the Sun is curved in 3D space, but “straight” in 4D spacetime. The scare quotes are present because the orbit is straight only in the sense that a geodesic is straight. A geodesic path between two points of spacetime is a path of shortest spacetime interval between the points.
One could cover a curved 4D-spacetime with a special Cartesian-like coordinate system by breaking up the spacetime into infinitesimal regions, giving each region its own Cartesian coordinate system, and then stitching the coordinate systems all together where they meet their neighbors. The result would be what is customarily called an atlas. Each point would have its own four unique coordinates, but when the flat Cartesian metric is used to compute intervals, lengths, and durations from the coordinate numbers of the atlas, the values will be incorrect.
Instead of considering a universe that is the surface of a sphere, consider a universe that is the surface of a cylinder. This 2D universe is curved when visualized from a 3D Euclidean space in which the cylinder is embedded. Surprisingly, it is not intrinsically curved at all. The measures of the three angles of any triangle sum to 180 degrees. Circumferences of its circles always equal pi times their diameters. We say that, unlike the sphere, the surface of a cylinder is extrinsically curved but intrinsically flat.
Section 20 offers some more discussion of reference frames, and so does the next section on inertial frames. For a more sophisticated treatment of reference frames and coordinates, see Coordinate Systems. For an introduction to the notion of curvature of space, see chapter 42 in The Feynman Lectures on Physics by Richard Feynman.
What makes a reference frame an inertial reference frame is that Newton’s first law is obeyed by all objects and fields within the frame. Einstein described his special theory of relativity in 1905 by saying it requires the laws of physics to have the same form in any inertial frame. Unfortunately, the universe actually has no inertial frames.
Newton would say an inertial frame is a reference frame moving at constant velocity relative to absolute space. Einstein, instead, would say an inertial frame is a reference frame in which Newton’s first law holds. Newton’s first law of motion says an isolated object, that is, an object affected by no total extrinsic force, has a constant velocity over time. So, in an inertial frame, any two separate objects that are moving in parallel and coasting along with no outside forces on them, will remain moving in parallel forever. A so-called “inertial observer” feels no acceleration and no gravitational field.
Basically, the first law can be thought of as providing a definition of the concept of zero total external force; an object has zero total external force if it is moving with constant velocity. Unfortunately, in the real world no objects behave this way; they cannot be isolated from the force of gravity. Gravity cannot be turned off, and so Newton’s first law fails and there are no inertial frames.
Even though the first law is false in general and needs to be replaced by Einstein’s law of gravity, it does hold well enough for our purposes in many situations. It holds in any infinitesimal region. In larger regions, if spacetime curvature can be ignored for a certain phenomenon of interest, then one can find an inertial frame for the phenomenon. A Cartesian coordinate system fixed to Earth will serve as an inertial frame for racing a car or describing a tennis match but not for voyaging to Mars. A coordinate frame for space that is fixed on the distant stars and is used by physicists only to describe phenomena far from any of those stars, and far from planets, and from other massive objects, is very nearly an inertial frame in that region. Given that some frame is inertial, any frame that accelerates or rotates relative to this first frame is non-inertial.
Computations and descriptions are simpler when using special relativity if one can choose an inertial frame. Nevertheless, special relativity applies to accelerated particles and frames; it is just than the physics is more complicated.
Newton’s theory requires a flat, Euclidean geometry for space and for spacetime. Special relativity requires a flat Euclidean geometry for space but a flat, non-Euclidean geometry for spacetime. General relativity allows all these but also allows curvature for both space and spacetime. Think of “flat” as requiring axes to be straight lines. If we demand that our reference frame’s coordinate system span all of spacetime, then a flat frame does not exist for the real world. The existence of gravity requires there to be curvature of space around any object that has mass, thereby making a flat frame fail to span some of the space near the object.
In any infinitesimal region of spacetime obeying the general theory of relativity, special relativity does hold, and there is an inertial frame filling the infinitesimal region.
Spacetime can be considered to be the set of locations of all actual and possible events, or it can be considered to be a field where all events are located. Either way, it is a combination of space and time. A four-dimensional spacetime has a single time dimension and three space dimensions. It is science’s best candidate for real, physical spacetime. Locations in space and time are, of course, invisible.
Hermann Minkowski, in 1908, was the first person to say that spacetime is fundamental and that space and time are just aspects of spacetime. And he was the first to say different reference frames will divide spacetime differently into their time part and space part.
The force of gravity over time is actually manifested as the curvature of spacetime:
Gravity is not a force that propagates through space but a feature of spacetime itself. When you throw a ball high into the air, it arcs back to the ground because Earth distorts the spacetime around it, so that the paths of the ball and the ground intersect again. — George Musser, physicist
Spacetime is dynamic and not static. That is, its structure, such as its geometry, changes over time as the distribution of matter-energy changes. In special relativity and in Newton’s theory, spacetime is not dynamic.
The overall, cosmic curvature of space is unknown, but there is good empirical evidence that cosmic curvature of spacetime is evolving toward a positive value.
In general relativity, spacetime is assumed to be a fundamental feature of reality. It is very interesting to investigate whether this assumption is true. There have been serious attempts to construct theories of physics in which spacetime is not fundamental but rather emerges at a higher level or larger scale from more basic entities, but none of these attempts have stood up to any empirical observations or experiments that could show the new theories to be superior to the presently accepted theories. So, it is still safe to say that the concept of spacetime is ontologically fundamental.
The metaphysical question of whether spacetime is a substantial object or a relationship among events, or neither, is considered in the discussion of the relational theory of time. For other philosophical questions about what spacetime is, see What is a Field?
Something’s speed is different in different reference frames, with one exception. The upper limit on the speed of any object in space is c, the speed of light in a vacuum. This claim is not relative to a reference frame. This speed c is the upper limit on the speed of transmission from any cause to its effect. This c is the c in the equation E = mc2. It is the speed of any particle with zero rest mass, and it is the speed of all particles at the big bang before the Higgs field turned on and slowed down many kinds of particles. The notion of speed of travel through spacetime rather than space, is not sensible. Ditto for the notion of speed through time.
A spacetime diagram is a graphical representation of the coordinates of events in spacetime. Think of the diagram as a picture of a reference frame. One designated coordinate axis is for time. The other axes are for space. A Minkowski spacetime diagram is a special kind of spacetime graph, one that represents phenomena that obey the laws of special relativity. A Minkowski diagram allows no curvature of spacetime itself, although objects themselves can have curving paths in space. Any object represented with a curving path in the diagram is accelerating.
Here is an example of a three-dimensional Minkowski spacetime diagram containing two spatial dimensions (and straight lines for the two axes) and a time dimension (with a vertical line for the time axis). Emerging upward and downward from of the event of you the observer being here now, are your future and past light cones. The cones are composed of paths of possible unimpeded light rays emerging from the observer or converging into the observer. The light cone of a point of space exists even if there is no light there.
Attribution:Stib at en.wikipedia, CC BY-SA 3.0, Link
In a Minkowski spacetime diagram, a Cartesian (rectangular) coordinate system is used, the time axis is shown vertically, and one or two of the spatial dimensions are suppressed (that is, not included).
If the Minkowski diagram has only one spatial dimension, then a flash of light in a vacuum has a perfectly straight-line representation, but it is has a cone-shaped representation if the Minkowski diagram has two spatial dimensions, and it is a sphere if there are three spatial dimensions. Because light travels at such a high speed, it is common to choose the units along the axes so that the path of a light ray is a 45 degree angle and the value of c is 1 light year per year with light years being the units along any space axis and years being the units along the time axis. Or the value of c could have been chosen to be one light nanosecond per nanosecond. The careful choice of units for the axes in the diagram is important in order to prevent the light cones’ appearing too flat to be informative.
Below is an example of a Minkowski diagram having only one space dimension, so a future light cone has the shape of the letter “V.”
This Minkowski diagram represents a spatially-point-sized Albert Einstein standing still midway between two special places, places where there is an instantaneous flash of light at time t = 0 in coordinate time. Einstein cannot see the flashes at this time because they are too far away for the light to reach him yet. The directed arrows represent the path of the four light rays from the flashes. In a Minkowski diagram, a physical point-object is not represented as occupying a point but as occupying a line containing all the spacetime points at which it exists. That line is called the worldline of the object. All worldlines of spatially-point-sized objects are continuous, one-dimensional paths in spacetime. In the spacetime diagram, the representation of an accelerating object has a worldline that is never straight, but the path of an accelerating object in space rather than in spacetime can be straight.
Events on the same horizontal line of the Minkowski diagram are simultaneous in the reference frame. The more tilted an object’s worldline is away from the vertical, the faster the object is moving. Given the units chosen for the above diagram, no worldline can tilt down more than 45 degrees, or else that object is moving faster than c.
In the above diagram, Einstein’s worldline is straight, indicating no total external force is acting on him. If an object’s worldline meets another object’s worldline, then the two objects collide.
The set of all possible photon histories or light-speed worldlines going through a specific point-event defines the two light cones of that event, namely its past light cone and its future light cone. The future cone or forward cone is called a cone because, if the spacetime diagram were to have two space dimensions, then light emitted from a flash would spread out in the two spatial dimensions in a circle of ever-growing diameter, producing a cone shape. In a diagram for three-dimensional space, the light’s wavefront is an expanding sphere and not an expanding cone, but sometimes physicists still will informally speak of its cone.
Every point of spacetime has its own pair of light cones, but the light cone has to do with the structure of spacetime, not its contents, so the light cone of a point exists even if there is no light there.
Whether a member of a pair of events could have had a causal impact upon the other event is an objective feature of the universe and is not relative to a reference frame. A pair of events inside the same light cone are said to be causally-connectible if they could have affected each other by a signal going from one to the other at no faster than the speed of light, provided there were no obstacles that would interfere. For two causally-connectible events, the relation between the two events is said to be timelike. If you were once located in spacetime at, let’s say, (x1,y1,z1,t1), then for the rest of your life you cannot affect or participate in any event that occurs outside of the forward light cone whose apex is at (x1,y1,z1,t1). Light cones are an especially helpful tool because different observers in different rest frames should agree on the light cones of any event, despite their disagreeing on what is simultaneous with what and the duration between two events. So, the light-cone structure of spacetime is objectively real.
Not all spacetimes can be given Minkowski diagrams, but any spacetime satisfying Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity can. Einstein’s Special Theory applies to mass but not to its gravitation; the theory falsely assumes that physical processes, such as gravitational processes, have no effect on the structure of spacetime. When attention needs to be given to the real effect of these processes on the structure of spacetime, that is, when general relativity needs to be used, then Minkowski diagrams become inappropriate for spacetime. General relativity assumes that the geometry of spacetime is locally Minkowskian, but not globally Minkowskian. That is, spacetime is locally flat in the sense that in any infinitesimally-sized region one always finds spacetime to be 4D Minkowskian (which is 3D Euclidean for space but not 4D Euclidean for spacetime). When we say spacetime is curved and not flat, we mean it deviates from 4D Minkowskian geometry.
A Minkowski spacetime diagram with three spatial dimensions and a single time dimension is treating time somewhat as a dimension of space, but Minkowski spacetime is radically different from a Euclidean space with four dimensions. This difference shows up in the fact that the Minkowski metric (and the topology based on the metric) is very unlike that of the metric of a Euclidean four-space, as is shown in the next section. So, there are many ways in which time is not like a fourth spatial dimension.
A spacetime diagram is a diagram of what the main article “Time” called a block universe.
In simple situations in which events occur at different times at the same place, the metric is simple. It says that in order to find out how long an event lasts, subtract its starting time from its ending time. More specifically, this simple metric for time says that, in order to compute the duration between point event a that occurs at time t(a) and point event b that occurs at time t(b), then one should compute |t(b) – t(a)|, the absolute value of their difference. This is the standard way to compute durations when curvature of spacetime is not involved. When it is involved, a more general metric is required, and the computation can be extremely complicated.
The metric for spacetime implies the metric for time. The spacetime metric tells the spacetime interval between two point events. The interval has both space aspects and time aspects. Two events in the life of a photon have a zero interval. So, intervals are not ordinary spatial distances. The interval is the measure of the spacetime separation between two point events along a specific spacetime path. Let’s delve into this issue a little more deeply.
In what follows, note the multiple senses of the word space. A physicist often calls time a one-dimensional space. A spacetime is also represented as a four-dimensional space. More generally, a metric for any sort of space is an equation that says how to compute the distance (or something distance-like, as we shall soon see) between any two points in that space, given their location coordinates.
In a one-dimensional Euclidean space along a straight line from point location x to a point location y, the metric says the distance d between the two points is |y – x|. It is assumed both locations use the same units, perhaps meters or inches.
The duration t(a,b) between an event a that occurs at time t(a) and an event b that occurs at time t(b) is given by the metric equation:
t(a,b) = |t(b) – t(a)|.
This is the standardly accepted way to compute durations when curvature is not involved. Philosophers have asked whether one could just as well have used half that absolute value, or the square root of the absolute value. More generally, is one definition of the metric the correct one or just a more useful one? That is, philosophers are interested in the underlying issue of whether the choice of a metric is natural in the sense of being objective or whether its choice is a matter of convention.
Let’s bring in more dimensions. In a two-dimensional plane satisfying Euclidean geometry, the formula for the metric in is:
d2 = (x2 – x1)2 + (y2 – y1)2.
It defines what is meant by the distance d between an arbitrary point with the Cartesian coordinates (x1 , y1) and another point with the Cartesian coordinates (x2 , y2), assuming all the units are the same, such as meters. The x numbers are values in the x dimension, that is, parallel to the x-axis, and the y numbers are values in the y dimension. The above equation is essentially the Pythagorean Theorem of plane geometry. The equation needs to be solved to get the value of d. Here is a visual representation of this for the two points:
If you imagine this graph is showing you what a crow would see flying above a square grid of streets, then the metric equation d2 = (x1 – x2)2+ (y1 – y2)2 gives you the distance d as the crow flies. But if your goal is a metric that gives the distance only for taxicabs that are restricted to travel vertically or horizontally, then a taxicab metric would compute the taxi’s distance this way:
|x2 – x1| + |y2 – y1|.
So, a space can have more than one metric, and we choose the metric depending on the character of the space and what our purpose is.
Usually for a physical space there is a best or intended or conventionally-assumed metric. If all we want is the shortest distace between two points in a two-dimensional Euclidean space, the conventional metric is:
d2 = (x2 – x1)2 + (y2 – y1)2
But if we are interested in distances along an arbitrary path rather than just the shortest path, then the above metric is correct only infinitesimally, and a more sophisticated metric is required by using the tools of calculus. In this case, the above metric is re-expressed as a difference equation using the delta operator symbol Δ to produce:
(Δs)2 = (Δx)2+ (Δy)2
where Δs is the spatial distance between the two points and Δx = x1 – x2 and Δy = y1 – y2. The delta symbol Δ is not a number but rather is an operator on two numbers that produces their difference. If the differences are extremely small, infinitesimally small, then they are called differentials instead of differences, so Δs becomes ds, and Δx becomes dx, and Δy becomes dy, and we have entered the realm of differential calculus. The letter d in a differential stands for an infinitesimally small delta operation, and it is not like the number d in the diagram above.
Let’s generalize this idea from 2D-space to 4D-spacetime. Because we are shifting from a space to a spacetime, the metric we are now looking for is about the interval between two arbitrary point-events. Although there is neither a duration between New York City and Paris, nor a spatial distance between noon today and midnight later, nevertheless there is a spacetime interval between New York City at noon and Paris at midnight. This interval is distance-like, but it is not a spatial distance.
Unlike temporal durations and spatial distances, intervals are objective in the sense that the spacetime interval is not relative to a reference frame. Physicists require that objective magnitudes be frame-free. All observers measure the same value for an interval, assuming they measure it correctly. The value of an interval between two point events does not change if the reference frame changes. Alternatively, acceptable reference frames are those that preserve the intervals between points.
Any space’s metric says how to compute the value of the separation s between any two points in that space. In special relativity, the four-dimensional abstract space that represents spacetime is indeed special. It’s 3-D spatial part is Euclidean and its 1-D temporal part is Euclidean, but as a whole 4D space it is not Euclidean, and its metric is exotic. Its metric is defined between two infinitesimally close points of spacetime to be:
ds2 = c2dt2 – dx2
where ds is an infinitesimal interval (or a so-called differential displacement of the spacetime coordinates) between two nearby point-events in the spacetime; c is the speed of light; the differential dt is the infinitesimal duration between the two time coordinates of the two events; and dx is the infinitesimal spatial distance between the two events. Notice the negative sign. Because there are three dimensions of space in a four-dimensional spacetime, say dimensions 1, 2, and 3, the differential spatial distance dx is defined to be:
dx2 = dx12 + dx22 + dx32
This equation is obtained in Cartesian coordinates by using the Pythagorean Theorem for three-dimensional space. The differential dx1 is the displacement along dimension 1 of the three dimensions. Similarly, for 2 and 3. This is the spatial distance between two point-events, not the interval between them. That is, ds is not usually identical to dx.
With these differential equations, the techniques of calculus can then be applied to find the interval between any two point-events even if they are not nearby in spacetime, so long as we have the information about the worldline s, the path in spacetime, such as its equation in the coordinate system.
In special relativity, the interval between two events that occur at the same place, such as the place where the clock is sitting, is very simple. Since dx = 0, the interval is:
t(a,b) = |t(b) – t(a)|.
This is the absolute value of the difference between the real-valued time coordinates, assuming all times are specified in the same units, say, seconds, and assuming no positive spatial distances are involved.
Now let us generalize this notion in order to find out how to use a clock for events that do not occur at the same place. The infinitesimal proper time dτ, rather than the differential coordinate-time dt, is the duration shown by a clock carried along the infinitesimal spacetime interval ds. It is defined in any spacetime obeying special relativity to be:
In general, dτ ≠ dt. They are equal only if the two point-events have the same spatial location so that dx = 0.
Because spacetime “distances” (intervals) can be negative, and because the spacetime interval between two different events can be zero even when the events are far apart in spatial distance (but reachable by a light ray if intervening material were not an obstacle), the term interval here is not what is normally meant by the term distance.
There are three kinds of spacetime intervals: timelike, spacelike, and null. In spacetime, if two events are in principle connectable by a signal moving from one event to the other at less than light speed, the interval between the two events is called timelike. There could be no reference frame in which the two occur at the same time. The interval is spacelike if there is no reference frame in which the two events occur at the same place, so they must occur at different places and be some spatial distance apart—thus the choice of the word spacelike. Two events connectable by a signal moving exactly at light speed are separated by a null interval, an interval of magnitude zero.
Here is an equivalent way of describing the three kinds of spacetime intervals. If one of the two events occurs at the origin or apex of a light cone, and the other event is within either the forward light cone or backward light cone, then the two events have a timelike interval. If the other event is outside the light cones, then the two events have a spacelike interval [and are in each other’s so-called absolute elsewhere]. If the two events lie on the same light cone, then their interval is null or zero.
The spacetime interval between any two events in a human being’s life must be a timelike interval. No human being can do anything to affect an event outside their future light cone. Such is the human condition according to relativity theory.
The information in the more complicated metric for general relativity enables a computation of the curvature at any point. This more complicated metric is the Riemannian metric tensor field. This is what you know when you know the metric of spacetime.
A space’s metric provides a complete description of the local properties of the space, regardless of whether the space is a physical space or a mathematical space representing spacetime. By contrast, the space’s topology provides a complete description of the global properties of the space such as whether it has external curvature like a cylinder or no external curvature as in a plane; these two spaces are locally the same.
The metric for special relativity is complicated enough, but the metric for general relativity normally is extremely complicated and is expressed in terms of action on displacements. Unlike in special relativity, the metric equation of general relativity is not the same across space and time; it can change its character in exotic ways from one spacetime point to another due to a change in the distribution over time or space of matter and energy.
The discussion of the metric continues in the discussion of time coordinates. For a helpful and more detailed presentation of the spacetime interval and the spacetime metric, see (Maudlin 2012), especially chapter 4.
Proper time is personal, and standard time is public. Every properly functioning clock measures its own proper time, the time along its own worldline, no matter how the clock is moving or what forces are acting upon it. Under normal circumstances where everyone one moves at very slow speed compared to light speed, there is no difference between your proper time, which is the time shown on your own clock, and your civilization’s standard time. Loosely speaking, standard time is the time shown on a designated clock in Paris, France that we agree to be the correct time. But the faster your clock moves compared to the standard clock or the greater the gravitational force on it compared to the standard clock, then the more your clock will deviate from standard time.
Your proper time and my proper time might be different, but both are correct. That is one of the most surprising implications of the theory of relativity. The claim that two different times can be correct would be called an inconsistency in Newtonian physics, but the problem is that Newtonian physics is inconsistent with how time really works.
Coordinate time is the time of an event as shown in some chosen coordinate system. For a given event, there are potentially an infinite number of coordinate times that disagree about the time when the event occurs. Coordinate time is very likely to be different from both standard time and your personal time if the coordinate system is fixed to a satellite or to a rocket in space. The clocks also are likely to disagree because it is unlikely that the time t = 0 in the coordinate system is the time t = 0 of the standard clock, which might be the time of some event in the life of Jesus or Mohammad. What is desired, though, is that duration of any second on all three clocks be congruent.
The proper time interval between two events (on a world line) is the change in proper time. Consider two point-events. The standard time duration between them is the time elapsed between them as represented on the conventional Paris clock. A proper time, say your own proper time, between them is the duration between the two events as measured along the world line of your clock that is transported between the two events. Because there are so many physically possible ways to do the clock transporting, for example at slow speed or high speed and near a large mass or far from it, there are so many different proper time intervals for the same two events. The slowest transport method takes the most time.
Here is a way to maximize the difference between proper time and standard time. If you and your clock pass through the event horizon of a black hole and fall toward the hole’s center, you will not notice anything unusual about your proper time, but external observers using Earth’s standard time will measure that you took an extremely long time to pass through the horizon.
Authors and speakers who use the word time often do not specify whether they mean proper time or standard time or coordinate time. They assume the context is sufficient to tell us what they mean. Usually a lack of contextual information suggests they intend to refer to standard time.
See the article Proper Time for more about proper time.
Yes and no; it depends on what is meant by the question. It is correct to say time is a dimension but not a spatial dimension. Time is the fourth dimension of 4D spacetime, but time is not the fourth dimension of physical space because that space has only three dimensions. In 4D spacetime, the time dimension is special and differs in a fundamental way from the other three dimensions.
Mathematicians have a broader notion of the term space than the average person. In their sense, a space need not contain any geographical locations nor any times, and it can have any number of dimensions, even an infinite number. Such a space might be two-dimensional and contain points for the ordered pairs in which a pair’s first member is the name of a voter in London and its second member is the average monthly income of that voter. Not paying attention to the two meanings of the term space is the source of all the confusion about whether time is the fourth dimension.
Newton treated space as three dimensional and treated time as a separate one-dimensional space. He could have used Minkowski’s 1908 idea, if he had thought of it, namely the idea of treating spacetime as four-dimensional.
The mathematical space used by mathematical physicists to represent physical spacetime that obeys the laws of relativity is four-dimensional; and in that mathematical space, the space of places is a 3D sub-space, and time is another sub-space, a 1D one. The mathematician Hermann Minkowski was the first person to construct such a mathematical space, although in 1895 H. G. Wells treated time informally as the fourth dimension in his novel The Time Machine.
In 1908, Minkowski remarked that “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” Many people mistakenly took this to mean that time is partly space, and vice versa. The philosopher C. D. Broad countered that the discovery of spacetime did not break down the distinction between time and space but only their independence or isolation.
The reason why time is not partly space is that, within a single frame, time is always distinct from space. Another way of saying this is to say time always is a distinguished dimension of spacetime, not an arbitrary dimension. What being distinguished amounts to, speaking informally, is that when you set up a rectangular coordinate system on a spacetime with an origin at, say, some important event, you may point the x-axis east or north or up or any of an infinity of other directions, but you may not point it forward in time—you may do that only with the t-axis, the time axis.
For any coordinate system on spacetime, mathematicians of the early twentieth century believed it was necessary to treat a point-event with at least four independent numbers in order to account for the four dimensionality of spacetime. Actually this appeal to the 19th-century definition of dimensionality, which is due to Bernhard Riemann, is not quite adequate because mathematicians have subsequently discovered how to assign each point on the plane to a point on the line without any two points on the plane being assigned to the same point on the line. The idea comes from the work of Georg Cantor. Because of this one-to-one correspondence between the plane’s points and the line’s points, the points on a plane could be specified with just one number instead of two. If so, then the line and plane must have the same dimensions according to the Riemann definition of dimension. To avoid this result, and to keep the plane being a 2D object, the notion of dimensionality of space has been given a new, but rather complex, definition.
Dinnertime is a kind of event but not a kind of time. Are there kinds of time? Perhaps there is one for every reference frame. Although every reference frame on physical spacetime does have its own physical time, our question is intended in another sense. At present, physicists measure time electromagnetically. They define a standard atomic clock using periodic electromagnetic processes in atoms, then use electromagnetic signals (light) to synchronize clocks that are far from the standard clock. In doing this, are physicists measuring “electromagnetic time” but not also other kinds of physical time?
In the 1930s, the physicists Arthur Milne and Paul Dirac worried about this question. Independently, they suggested there may be very many time scales. For example, there could be the time of atomic processes and perhaps also a time of gravitation and large-scale physical processes. Clocks for the two processes might drift out of synchrony after being initially synchronized without there being a reasonable explanation for why they do not stay in synchrony. Ditto for clocks based on the pendulum, on superconducting resonators, and on other physical principles. Just imagine the difficulty for physicists if they had to work with electromagnetic time, gravitational time, nuclear time, neutrino time, and so forth. Current physics, however, has found no reason to assume there is more than one kind of time for physical processes.
In 1967, physicists did reject the astronomical standard for the atomic standard because the deviation between known atomic and gravitation periodic processes such as the Earth’s rotations and revolutions could be explained better assuming that the atomic processes were the most regular of these phenomena. But this is not a cause for worry about two times drifting apart. Physicists still have no reason to believe a gravitational periodic process that is not affected by friction or impacts or other forces would ever drift out of synchrony with an atomic process such as the oscillations of a quartz crystal, yet this is the possibility that worried Milne and Dirac.
The rate that a clock ticks is relative to the observer. Given one event, the first observer’s clock can measure one value for its duration, but a second clock can measure a different value if it is moving or being affected differently by gravity. Yet, says Einstein, both measurements can be correct. That is what it means to say time is relative to the observer. This relativity is quite a shock to our manifest image of time. According to Newton’s physics, in principle there is no reason why observers cannot agree on what time it is now or how long an event lasts or when some distant event occurred, so the notion of observer is not as important as it is in modern physics.
The term “observer” in physics has multiple meanings. The observer is normally distinct from the observation itself. Informally, an observer is a conscious being who can report an observation and who has a certain orientation to what is observed, such as being next to the measured event or being light years away. An observation is the result of the action of observing. It establishes the values of one or more variables as in “It was noon on my spaceship’s clock when the asteroid impact was seen, so because of the travel time of light I compute that the impact occurred at 11:00.” An observer ideally causes no unnecessary perturbations in what is observed. If so, the observation is called objective.
In physics, the term “observer” is used in this informal way. Call it sense (1). In a second sense (2), in relativity theory an observer might be an entire reference frame, and an observation is a value measured locally, perhaps by a human spectator or perhaps by a machine. Think of an observer as being an omniscient reference frame.
In sense (1), an ordinary human observer cannot directly or indirectly observe any event that is not in its backward light cone. There is a sense (3). This is an observer in quantum theory, but that sense is not developed here.
Consider what is involved in being an omniscient reference frame. Information about any desired variable is reported from a point-sized spectator at each spacetime location. The point-spectator who does the observing and measuring has no effect upon what is observed and measured. All spectators are at rest in the same, single, assumed reference frame. A spectator is always accompanied by an ideal, point-sized, massless, perfectly functioning clock that is synchronized with the clocks of other spectators at all other points of spacetime. The observer has all the tools needed for reporting values of variables such as voltage or the presence or absence of grape jelly.
For a distant place, there is no objectively correct answer to the question, “What is happening there now?” The answer can be different in different reference frames.
In our ordinary lives, we can neglect the time required for signals from sources or events to reach our clocks, our eyes, and our consciousness. And we can neglect whether those signals come from stationary sources or moving sources. Not so, in principle.
The relativity of simultaneity is the feature of spacetime in which two different reference frames moving relative to each other will disagree on which events are simultaneous. A large percentage of both physicists and philosophers of time suggest that this implies simultaneity is not objectively real, and they conclude also that the present is not objectively real. These arguments are discussed in the main Time article, but a bit more detail on the subject is added here.
Consider the question: How do we tell the time of occurrence of an event that is very far away from us? We assign the time of the distant event by subtracting, from the time when we first detect the event, the time it took the signal to travel to us.
For example, we see a flash of light at time t arriving from a distant place P. When did the flash occur back at P? Let’s call that time tp. Here is how to compute tp. Suppose we know the distance x from us to P. Then the flash occurred at t minus the travel time for the light. That travel time is x/c. So,
tp = t – x/c.
If we see an explosion on the Sun at t, then we know to say it really occurred about eight minutes before, because x/c is approximately eight minutes, where x is the distance from Earth to the Sun. In this way, we know what events on the distant Sun are simultaneous with what clicks on our Earth clock.
The deeper problem is that other observers will not agree with us that the event on the Sun occurred when we say it did. The diagram below illustrates the problem. Let’s assume that our spacetime obeys the special theory of relativity.
There are two light flashes that occur simultaneously, with Einstein at rest midway between them in this diagram.
The Minkowski diagram represents Einstein sitting still in the reference frame (marked by the coordinate system with the thick black axes) while Lorentz is not sitting still but is traveling rapidly away from him and toward the source of flash 2. Because Lorentz’s worldline is a straight line, we can tell that he is moving at a constant speed. The two flashes of light arrive at Einstein’s location simultaneously, at spacetime event B. However, Lorentz sees flash 2 before flash 1. That is, the event A of Lorentz seeing flash 2 occurs before event C of Lorentz seeing flash 1. So, Einstein will readily say the flashes are simultaneous, but Lorentz will have to do some computing to figure out that the flashes are simultaneous in the Einstein frame because they are not simultaneous to him in a reference frame in which he is at rest. They are not simultaneous in Lorentz’s reference frame. However, if we’d chosen a different reference frame from the one above, one in which Lorentz is not moving but Einstein is, then Lorentz would be correct to say flash 2 occurs before flash 1 in that new frame. So, whether the flashes are or are not simultaneous depends on which reference frame is used in making the judgment. It’s all relative.
The relativity of simultaneity is philosophically less controversial than the conventionality of simultaneity. To appreciate the difference, consider what is involved in making a determination regarding simultaneity. The central problem is that you can measure the speed of light only for a roundtrip, not a one-way trip.
Given two events that happen essentially at the same place, physicists assume they can tell by direct observation whether the events happened simultaneously. If we cannot detect that one of them is happening first, then we say they happened simultaneously, and we assign them the same time coordinate in our reference frame. The determination of simultaneity is very much more difficult if the two events happen very far apart. A way to measure (operationally define) simultaneity at a distance is to say that two events are simultaneous in our reference frame, that is, in a reference frame in which we are stationary, if unobstructed light signals from the two events would reach us simultaneously when we are midway between the two places where they occur, as judged in that frame. This is the operational definition of simultaneity used by Einstein in his theory of special relativity.
This midway method has a significant presumption: that the light beams travel at the same speed regardless of direction. Einstein and the philosophers of time Hans Reichenbach and Adolf Grünbaum have called this a reasonable convention because any attempt to experimentally confirm it presupposes that we already know how to determine simultaneity at a distance. Here is why. Suppose the event of our here-and-now is A, and suppose some distant event B is in our absolute elsewhere. Einstein noticed that there is no physical basis for judging the simultaneity or lack of simultaneity between A and B without presupposing that light travels at the same speed from A to B as from B to A. The presumption of the equality of speeds is a convention.
Hilary Putnam, Michael Friedman, and Graham Nerlich object to calling it a convention—on the grounds that to make any other assumption about light’s speed would unnecessarily complicate our description of nature, and we often make choices about how nature is on the basis of simplification of our description of nature.
To understand the dispute, notice that the midway method above is not the only way to define simultaneity. Consider a second method, the mirror reflection method. Select an Earth-based frame of reference, and send a flash of light from Earth to Mars where it hits a mirror and is reflected back to its source. The flash occurred at 12:00 according to a correct Earth clock, let’s say, and its reflection arrived back on Earth 20 minutes later. The light traveled the same empty, undisturbed path coming and going. At what time did the light flash hit the mirror? The answer involves the conventionality of simultaneity. All physicists agree one should say the reflection event occurred at 12:10. It took ten minutes going to Mars, and ten minutes coming back. The controversial philosophical question is whether this way of calculating the ten minutes is really a convention. Einstein pointed out that there would be no inconsistency in our saying that the flash hit the mirror at 12:17, provided we live with the awkward consequence that light was relatively slow getting to the mirror, but then traveled back to Earth at a faster speed.
Suppose we want to synchronize a Mars clock with our clock on Earth. Let’s draw a Minkowski diagram of the situation and consider just one spatial dimension in which we are at location A on Earth with the standard clock used for the time axis of the reference frame. The distant clock on Mars that we want to synchronize is at location B. See the diagram.
The fact that the worldline of the B-clock is parallel to the time axis shows that the clock there is stationary. We send light signals in order to synchronize the two clocks. Send a light signal from A at time t1 to B, where it is reflected back to us, arriving at time t3. Then the reading tr on the distant clock at the time of the reflection event should be t2, where:
t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1).
If tr = t2, then the two clocks are synchronized.
Einstein noticed that the use of the fraction 1/2 in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) rather than the use of some other fraction implicitly assumes that the light speed to and from B is the same. He said this assumption is a convention, the so-called conventionality of simultaneity, and is not something we could check to see whether it is correct. If t2 were (1/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B faster and return more slowly. If t2 were (2/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B relatively slowly and return faster. Either way, the average travel speed to and from would be c. Only with the fraction (1/2) are the travel speeds the same going and coming back.
Notice how we might try to check whether the two light speeds really are the same. We would send a light signal from A to B, and see if the travel time was the same as when we sent it from B to A. But to trust these durations we would already need to have synchronized the clocks at A and B. But that synchronization process will use the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1), with the (1/2) again, so we are arguing in a circle.
As noted, not all philosophers of science agree with Einstein that the choice of (1/2) is a convention, nor with those philosophers such as Putnam who say the messiness of any other choice shows that the choice of 1/2 must be correct. Everyone does agree, though, that any other choice than (1/2) would make for messy physics.
However, some researchers suggest that there is a way to check on the light speeds and not simply presume they are the same. Create two duplicate clocks at A. Transport one of the clocks to B at an infinitesimal speed. Going this slow, the clock will arrive at B without having its own time reports deviate from that of the A-clock. That is, the two clocks will be synchronized even though they are distant from each other. Now the two clocks can be used to find the time when a light signal left A and the time when it arrived at B. The difference of the two time reports on the A and B clocks can be used to compute the light speed, given the distance of separation. This speed can be compared with the speed computed with the midway method. The experiment has never been performed, but the recommenders are sure that the speeds to and from will turn out to be identical, so they are sure that the (1/2) in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) is correct and not a convention. For more discussion of this controversial issue of conventionality in relativity, see (Callender 2017, p. 51) and pp. 179-184 of The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, edited by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, Inc., 2002.
What does it mean to say the human condition is one in which you never will be able to affect an event outside your forward light cone? Here is a visual representation of the human condition according to the special theory of relativity, whose spacetime can always be represented by a Minkowski diagram of the following sort:
The absolutely past events (the green events in the diagram above) are the events in or on the backward light cone of your present event, your here-and-now. The backward light cone of event Q is the imaginary cone-shaped surface of spacetime points formed by the paths of all light rays reaching Q from the past.
The events in your absolute past are those that could have directly or indirectly affected you, the observer, at the present moment. The events in your absolute future are those that you could directly or indirectly affect.
An event’s being in another event’s absolute past is a feature of spacetime itself because the event is in the point’s past in all possible reference frames. This feature is frame-independent. For any event in your absolute past, every observer in the universe (who is not making an error) will agree the event happened in your past. Not so for events that are in your past but not in your absolute past. Past events not in your absolute past are in what Eddington called your absolute elsewhere. The absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime containing events that are not causally connectible to your here-and-now. Your absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime that is neither in nor on either your forward or backward light cones. No event here and now, can affect any event in your absolute elsewhere; and no event in your absolute elsewhere can affect you here and now.
A single point’s absolute elsewhere, absolute future, and absolute past form a partition of all spacetime into three disjoint regions. If point-event A is in point-event B’s absolute elsewhere, the two events are said to be spacelike related. If the two are in each other’s forward or backward light cones they are said to be time-like related or to be causally connectible. We can affect or be affected by events that are time-like related to us. The order of occurrence of a space-like event (before or after or simultaneous with your here-and-now) depends on the chosen frame of reference, but the order of occurrence of a time-like event and our here-and-now does not. Another way to make the point is to say that, when choosing a reference frame, we have a free choice about the time order of two events that are space-like related, but we have no freedom when it comes to two events that are time-like related because the causal order determines their time order. That is why the absolute elsewhere is also called the extended present. There is no fact of the matter about whether a point in your absolute elsewhere is in your present, your past, or your future. It is simply a conventional choice of reference frame that fixes what events in your absolute elsewhere are present events.
For any two events in spacetime, they are time-like, space-like, or light-like separated, and this is an objective feature of the pair that cannot change with a change in the reference frame. This is another implication of the fact that the light-cone structure of space-time is real and objective, unlike features such as durations and lengths.
The past light cone looks like a cone in small regions in a spacetime diagram with one dimension of time and two of space. However, the past light cone is not cone-shaped in a large cosmological region, but rather has a pear-shape because all very ancient light lines must have come from the infinitesimal volume at the big bang.
Time dilation occurs when two synchronized clocks get out of synchrony due either to their relative motion or due to their being in regions of different gravitational field strengths. An observer always notices that it is the other person’s clock that is behaving oddly, never that their own clock is behaving oddly. When two observers are in relative motion, each can see that the other person’s clock is slowing down relative to their own clock. It’s as if the other person’s time is stretched or dilated. There is philosophical controversy about whether the dilation is literally a change in time itself or only a change in how durations are measured using someone else’s clock as opposed to one’s own clock.
The specific amount of time dilation depends on the relative speed of one clock toward or away from the other. If one clock circles the other, there relative speed is zero, so there is no time dilation due to speed, regardless of how fast the rotational speed.
The sister of time dilation is space contraction. The length of an object changes in different reference frames to compensate for time dilation so that the speed of light c in a vacuum is constant in any frame. The object’s length measured perpendicular to the direction of motion is not affected by the motion, but the length measured in the direction of the motion is affected. If you are doing the measuring, then moving sticks get shorter if moving toward you or away from you. The length changes not because of forces, but rather because space itself contracts. What a shock this is to our manifest image! No one notices that the space around themselves is contracting, only that the space somewhere else seems to be affected.
Here is a picture of the visual distortion of moving objects due to space contraction:
The picture describes the same wheel in different colors: (green) rotating in place just below the speed of light; (blue) moving left to right just below the speed of light; and (red) remaining still.
To give some idea of the quantitative effect of time dilation:
Among particles in cosmic rays we find protons…that move so fast that their velocities differ infinitesimally from the speed of light: the difference occurs only in the twentieth (sic!) non-zero decimal after the decimal point. Time for them flows more slowly than for us by a factor of ten billion, If, by our clock, such a proton takes a hundred thousand years to cross our stellar system—the Galaxy—then by ‘its own clock’ the proton needs only five minutes to cover the same distance (Novikov 1998, p. 59).
According to the general theory of relativity, gravitational differences affect time by dilating it—in the sense that observers in a less intense gravitational potential field find that clocks in a more intense gravitational potential field run slow relative to their own clocks. It’s as if the time of the clock in the intense gravitational field is stretched out and not ticking fast enough. People in ground floor apartments outlive their twins in penthouses, all other things being equal. Basement flashlights will be shifted toward the red end of the visible spectrum compared to the flashlights in attics. All these phenomena are the effects of gravitational time dilation.
Spacetime in the presence of gravity is curved, according to general relativity. So, time is curved, too. When time curves, clocks do not bend in space as if in a Salvador Dali painting. Instead they undergo gravitational time dilation.
Information from the Global Positioning System (GPS) of satellites orbiting Earth is used by your cell phone to tell you whether to turn right at the next intersection. The curvature of spacetime near Earth is significant enough that gravitational time dilation must be accounted for in clocks that are part of the GPS. The gravitational time dilation plus the time dilation due to satellite speed makes time in the satellites run about seven microseconds faster compared to Earth’s standard surface time. Therefore, these GPS satellites are launched with their clocks adjusted ahead of Earth clocks and then are periodically readjusted ahead so that they stay synchronized with Earth’s standard time. The less error in the atomic clock the better the GPS, and that is one reason physicists keep trying to build better clocks. (In 2018, gravitational time dilation was measured in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. so carefully that it detected the difference in ticking of two atomic clocks that differed in height by only a centimeter.)
When a metaphysician asks the question, “What is gravity?” there are three legitimate, but very different, answers. Gravity is (1) a force, (2) intrinsic curvature of spacetime, and (3) particle exchanges. All three answers have their uses. When speaking of spilling milk or designing a rocket to visit the moon, the first answer is most appropriate to use. In the context of general relativity, the second answer is most appropriate. In the context of a future theory of quantum gravity that incorporates gravity into quantum mechanics and the standard model of particle physics, the third answer is best for many purposes. At this more fundamental level, forces are features of field activity. Gravity particles called gravitons are fluctuations within the gravitational field, and what is happening with the spilled milk is that pairs of virtual entangled particles bubble up out of the relevant fields. Normally one member of the pair has normal positive momentum, and the other member has negative momentum. Those particles with negative momentum are exchanged between the milk and the Earth, thereby causing the milk to be attracted to the floor in analogy to how a thrower’s returning boomerang that hits you will push you closer to the thrower. The collection of all the force-carrying particles, that is, all the boomerangs, are called “bosons.” Answer (2) was quite a surprising step away from the manifest image, but answer (3) is a giant leap away.
A black hole is a very dense region of extremely warped spacetime. Most black holes that still exist are probably the product of the collapse of a star due to its being crushed by its own gravitation after its nuclear fuel has been used up. Here is a processed photograph of a black hole surrounded by its accretion disk that is radiating red and orange and yellow light as nearby particles crash into each other:
Actually the colors are artifacts added by a computer because the real light is white and because humans can detect differences of these colors better than differences of brightness of white. The black hole is a sphere, but its accretion disk is a disk because it is rotating just like a spinning pizza thrown into the air.
Any black hole is highly compressed matter-energy whose gravitational field strength out to a certain distance, called the event horizon, is strong enough that it warps spacetime so severely that no object that falls into the hole can get back out intact beyond the horizon. Think of the event horizon as a spherical envelope, and to cross the event horizon is to cross a point of no return back to the outside world. This applies even to light. According to relativity theory, any light coming from inside the horizon cannot reach us on the outside—thus the name black hole. However, because of the fact that the accretion disk can eject a quasar just outside the event horizon, some black holes are the most luminous objects in the universe. Black holes are called “holes” not because they are empty but because so many things fall in. They fall in unless they do not have enough angular momentum to go into orbit around the event horizon.
The event horizon is a two-dimensional fluid-like surface separating the inside from the outside of the black hole. If you were unlucky enough to fall through the event horizon, you could see out, but you could not send a signal out, nor could you yourself escape even if your spaceship had an extremely powerful thrust. The space around you increasingly collapses, so you would be squeezed on your way in—a process called “spaghettification”—and eventually you would be crushed into an ultra-microscopic volume.
According to relativity theory, if you were in a spaceship approaching a black hole and getting near its event horizon, then your time warp would become very significant as judged by clocks back on Earth. The warp (the slowing of your clock relative to clocks back on Earth) would be more severe the longer you stayed in the vicinity and also the closer you got to the event horizon. Viewers from outside would see your spaceship progressively slow its speed during its approach to the horizon. Reports sent back toward Earth of the readings of your spaceship’s clock would become dimmer and lower in frequency (due to gravitational red shift), and these reports would show that your clock’s ticking was slowing down (dilating) when compared to Earth clocks.
Any macroscopic object can become a black hole if sufficiently compressed. Although cosmologists believe our Sun is not quite big enough for it to be compressed by its gravity into a black hole when its fuel is burned up, if our Earth were somehow compressed until its radius is less than 1.5 centimeters, it would become a black hole.
The black hole M87 is pictured above. It has a mass of about 6.5 billion of our suns, and it is not in the Milky Way. There is a monstrous black hole at the center of the Milky Way, but it is not powerful enough to suck in all the stars of the Milky Way, just as the sun will never suck in all the planets of our solar system even after it burns out.
It was not until after Einstein died that it was clear his theory predicted black holes. It is sometimes said that relativity theory implies an infalling spaceship suffers an infinite time dilation at the event horizon and so does not fall through the horizon in a finite time. This is not true because experts now realize the gravitational field produced by the spaceship itself acts on the black hole. This implies that, as the ship gets very, very close to the event horizon, the time dilation does radically increase, but the event horizon slightly expands enough to swallow the spaceship in a finite time—a trivially short time as judged from the spaceship, but a very long time as judged from Earth. This occurrence of slight expansion is one sign that the event horizon is fluidlike.
Apply quantum theory to black holes, Stephen Hawking discovered that every black hole radiates some energy and will eventually evaporate, although stellar black holes take about 1064 years before evaporating away. Because every black hole absorbs the cosmic background radiation, a black hole will not start evaporating until the background temperature of the universe becomes so cool that it is below the temperature of the black hole.
According to Stephen Hawking, quantum mechanics implies that faint Bekenstein-Hawking electromagnetic radiation of many different frequencies is produced just outside the event horizon of every black hole, so black holes should not look black to external observers even if they had no fiery accretion disk surrounding them. But the predominant wavelength of this radiation is approximately the diameter of the black hole, so the bigger the black hole the bigger the wavelength and the colder it is. A typical celestial black hole has a temperature of only a small fraction of a degree. In the picture above, the red and yellow colors are due to collisions as all nearby particles get drawn by gravity towards the event horizon. These particles form an accretion disk outside the event horizon with a temperature of about a billion degrees, and this radiation is much stronger than the faint Bekenstein-Hawking radiation.
According to relativity theory, if a black hole is turning or twisting, as most are, then inside the event horizon there inevitably will be closed time-like curves, and so objects within the black hole can undergo past time travel, although they cannot escape the black hole by going back to a time before they were within the black hole.
Black holes produce startling visual effects. A light ray can circle a black hole once or many times depending upon its angle of incidence to the event horizon. A light ray grazing a black hole can leave at any angle, so a person viewing a black hole from outside can see multiple copies of the rest of the universe at various angles. See http://www.spacetimetravel.org/reiseziel/reiseziel1.html for some of these visual effects.
Nearly all black holes are very cold objects; the bigger, the colder. However, quantum theory suggests they get warmer as they shrink. They get smaller by absorbing particles with negative mass. When a black hole becomes the size of a bacterium, its outgoing radiation becomes white-colored, producing a white black-hole. At the very last instant of its life, it evaporates as it explodes in a flash of extremely hot, high-energy particles.
Every spherical black hole has the odd geometric feature that its diameter is very much larger than its circumference.
Some popularizers have said that the roles of time and space are reversed within a black hole, but this is not correct.
The term “black hole” was first published in Science News Letter in 1964. John Wheeler subsequently promoted use of the term. Earlier, in 1958, David Finkelstein had proposed that general relativity theory implies there could be dense regions of space from which nothing can escape. Much earlier, in 1783, John Michell had proposed that there may be a star with a large enough diameter that the velocity required to escape its gravitational pull would be so great that not even Newton’s particles of light could escape. He called them “dark stars.” The first evidence that black holes actually exist began to be acquired in the second half of the 20th century, and by a decade or two into the 21st century black holes reached the epistemological status of having been discovered. Physicists now know that the bright beacons called quasars are powered by black holes that are “feeding.”
A white hole behaves as a time-reversed black hole. Outside of a white hole, objects would be observed radiating away from the hole. This would look as if something is coming from nothing. The big bang is almost a white hole except that white holes have event horizons with both an inside and an outside, but the big bang did not have that feature, so far as is known. No white holes have been detected in our universe. Although white holes are consistent with the theory of relativity, they violate the Second Law of Thermodynamics.
The paradox is an argument about time dilation that uses the theory of relativity to produce an apparent contradiction. Before giving that argument, let’s set up a typical situation that can be used to display the paradox. Consider two twins at rest on Earth with their clocks synchronized. One twin climbs into a spaceship, and flies far away at a high, constant speed, then stops, reverses course, and flies back at the same speed. An application of the equations of special relativity theory implies that because of time dilation the twin on the spaceship will return and be younger than the Earth-based twin. Now that the situation has been set up, notice that relativity theory implies that either twin could say they are the stationary twin. The paradoxical argument is that either twin could regard the other as the traveler and thus as the one whose time dilates. If the spaceship were considered to be stationary, then would not relativity theory imply that the Earth-based twin could race off (while attached to the Earth) and return to be the younger of the two twins? If so, then when the twins reunite, each is younger than the other. That result is paradoxical.
In brief, the solution to this paradox is that the two situations are not sufficiently similar, and that in both situations, for reasons to be explained in a moment, the twin who stays home outside of the spaceship maximizes his or her own time (that is, proper time) and so is always the older twin when the two reunite. This solution to the paradox has nothing to do with a proper or improper choice of the reference frame; and it has nothing to do with acceleration although a twin does accelerate in the situation. The solution instead has to do with the fact that some paths in spacetime must take more proper time to complete than do other paths.
Herbert Dingle was the President of London’s Royal Astronomical Society in the early 1950s. He famously argued in the 1960s that the twins paradox reveals an inconsistency in special relativity. Almost all philosophers and scientists disagree with Dingle and say the twin paradox is not a true paradox, in the sense of revealing an inconsistency within relativity theory, but is merely a complex puzzle that can be adequately solved within relativity theory.
There have been a variety of suggestions on how to understand the paradox. Here is one, diagrammed below.
The principal suggestion for solving the paradox is to note that there must be a difference in the time taken by the twins because their behaviors are different, as shown by the number and spacing of nodes along their two worldlines above. The nodes represent ticks of their clocks. Notice how the space traveler’s time is stretched or dilated compared to the coordinate time, which also is the time of the stay-at-home twin. The coordinate time, that is, the time shown by clocks fixed in space in the coordinate system is the same for both travelers. Their personal times are not the same. The traveler’s personal time is less than that of the twin who stays home.
The key idea for resolving the paradox is not that one twin accelerates and the other does not, though that does happen, although this claim is very popular in the literature in philosophy and physics. It’s that their worldlines in spacetime have different proper times. Relativity theory requires that for two paths that begin and end at the same point, the longer the path in spacetime (and thus the longer the worldline in the spacetime diagram) the shorter the elapsed proper time along that path. That difference is why the spacing of nodes is so different for the two travelers. This is counterintuitive, but it is well-confirmed by experiment.
A free-falling clock ticks faster and more often than any other accurate clock that is used to measure the duration between pairs of events. It is so for the event of the twins leaving each other and reuniting. This is illustrated graphically by the fact that the longer worldline in the graph represents a greater distance in space and a greater interval in spacetime but a shorter duration along that worldline. The number of dots in the line is a correct measure of the time taken by the traveler. The spacing of the dots represents the durations between ticks of a personal clock along that worldline. If the spaceship approached the speed of light, that twin would cover an enormous amount of space before the reunion, but that twin’s clock would hardly have ticked at all before the reunion event.
To repeat this solution in other words, the diagram shows how sitting still on Earth is a way of maximizing the trip time, and it shows how flying near light speed in a spaceship away from Earth and then back again is a way of minimizing the time for the trip, even though if you paid attention only to the shape of the worldlines in the diagram and not to the dot spacing within them you might mistakenly think just the reverse. This odd feature of the geometry is one reason why Minkowski geometry is different from Euclidean geometry. So, the conclusion of the analysis of the paradox is that its reasoning makes the mistake of supposing that the situation of the two twins can properly be considered to be essentially the same.
Richard Feynman famously, but mistakenly, argued in 1975 that acceleration is the key to the paradox. As (Maudlin 2012) explains, the acceleration that occurs in the paths of the example above is not essential to the paradox because the paradox could be expressed in a spacetime obeying special relativity in which neither twin accelerates yet the twin in the spaceship always returns younger. The paradox can be described using a situation in which spacetime is compactified in the spacelike direction with no intrinsic spacetime curvature, only extrinsic curvature. To explain that remark, imagine this situation: All of Minkowski spacetime is like a very thin, flat cardboard sheet. Then roll it into a cylinder, like the tube you have after using the last paper towel on the roll. Do not stretch, tear, or otherwise deform the sheet. Let the time axis be parallel to the tube length, and let the (one-dimensional) space axis be a circular cross-section of the tube. The universe is flat intrinsically, as required by special relativity, but curved extrinsically (which is allowed by special relativity). The travelling twin’s spaceship circles the universe at constant velocity. The stay-at-home twin sits still and also circles the universe. The spaceship twin travels in a spiral as viewed from a higher dimensional Euclidean space in which the tube is embedded. Neither twin accelerates. There need be no Earth nor any mass for either twin. The spaceship twin who circles the universe comes back younger.
More time elapses for the stay-at-home twin, so when the two reunite, the stay-at-home twin will have read farther in the book they were both reading, all other things being equal. The moral: All other things being equal, if you wish to be more productive, then stay at home.
For more discussion of the paradox, see (Maudlin 2012), pp. 77-83, and p. 157.
See the article “Zeno’s Paradoxes” in this encyclopedia.
The answer to this question presupposes the reader has understood the section above on what the term reference system means, and the section on metrics and intervals.
A single point of time is not a number, but it has a number when a coordinate system is applied to time. When coordinate systems are assigned to spaces, coordinates are assigned to points. The space can be physical space or mathematical space. The coordinates hopefully are assigned in a way that a helpful metric can be defined for computing the distances between any pair of point-places, or, in the case of time, the duration between any pair of point-times. Points, including times, cannot be added, subtracted, or squared, but their coordinates can be. Coordinates applied to the space are not physically real; they are tools used by the analyst, the physicist; and they are invented, not discovered. The coordinate systems gives each instant a unique name.
Technically, the question, “How do time coordinates get assigned to points in spacetime?” presupposes knowing how we coordinatize the four-dimensional manifold that we call spacetime. The manifold is a collection of points (technically, it is a topological space) which behaves as a Euclidean space in neighborhoods around any point. The focus in this section is on its time coordinates.
There is very good reason for believing that time is one-dimensional, and so, given any three different point events, one of them will happen between the other two. This feature is reflected in the fact that when real number time coordinates are assigned to three point events, and one of the three coordinates is between the other two.
Every event on the world-line of the standard clock is assigned a t-coordinate by that special clock. The clock also can be used to provide measures of the duration between two point events that occur along the coordinate line. In order to extend the t-coordinate to events that do not occur where the standard clock is located, we can imagine having a stationary, calibrated, and synchronized clock at every other point in the space part of spacetime at t = 0, and we can imagine using those clocks to tell the time along their worldlines. In practice we do not have so many accurate clocks, so the details for assigning time to these events is fairly complicated, and it is not discussed here. The main issue is whether simultaneity may be defined for anywhere in the universe. The sub-issues involve the relativity of simultaneity and the conventionality of simultaneity. Both issues are discussed in previous sections of this supplement.
Isaac Newton conceived of points of space and time as absolute in the sense that they retained their identity over time. Modern physicists do not have that conception of points; points are identified relative to events, for example, the halfway point in space between this object and that object, and ten seconds after that point-event.
In the late 16th century, the Italian mathematician Rafael Bombelli interpreted real numbers as lengths on a line and interpreted addition, subtraction, multiplication, and division as “movements” along the line. His work eventually led to our assigning real numbers to instants.
To assign numbers to instants (the numbers being the time coordinates or dates), we use a system of clocks and some calculations, and the procedure is rather complicated the deeper one probes. For some of the details, the reader is referred to (Maudlin 2012), pp. 87-105. On pp. 88-89, Maudlin says:
Every event on the world-line of the master clock will be assigned a t-coordinate by the clock. Extending the t-coordinate to events off the trajectory of the master clock requires making use of…a collection of co-moving clocks. Intuitively, two clocks are co-moving if they are both on inertial trajectories and are neither approaching each other nor receding from each other. …An observer situated at the master clock can identify a co-moving inertial clock by radar ranging. That is, the observer sends out light rays from the master clock and then notes how long it takes (according to the master clock) for the light rays to be reflected off the target clock and return. …If the target clock is co-moving, the round-trip time for the light will always be the same. …[W]e must calibrate and synchronize the co-moving clocks.
The master clock is the standard clock. Co-moving inertial clocks do not generally exist, according to general relativity, so the issue of how to assign time coordinates is complicated in the real world. This article highlights only a few aspects of the assignment process, and it repeats, and elaborates on, some points made above in section 3.
Here is a principal reason for the complications. The main point of having a time coordinate is to get agreement from others about which values of time to use, namely which time coordinates to use. Relativity theory implies every person and even every object has their own proper time, which is the time of the clock they are “carrying;,” but unfortunately these personal clocks do not usually stay in synchrony with other well-functioning clocks. If you were to synchronize two perfectly-performing clocks and give one of them a speed relative to the other, then the two clocks readings must differ, so once you’ve moved it away from the standard clock you can no longer trust the clock to report the correct coordinate time at its new location.
The process of assigning time coordinates assumes that the structure of the set of instantaneous events is the same as, or is embeddable within, the structure of our time numbers. Showing that this is so is called solving the representation problem for our theory of time measurement. The problem has been solved. This article does not go into detail on how to solve this problem, but the main idea is that the assignment of coordinates should reflect the structure of the space of instantaneous times, namely its geometrical structure, which includes its topological structure, differential structure, affine structure, and metrical structure. It turns out that the structure of our time numbers is adequately represented by the structure of the real numbers.
The features that a space has without its points being assigned any coordinates whatsoever are its topological features, its differential structures, and its affine structures. The topological features include its dimensionality, whether it goes on forever or has a boundary, and how many points there are. The affine structure is about lines, the geodesic lines.
If the space has a certain geometry, then the procedure of assigning numbers to time must reflect this geometry. If event A occurs before event B, then the time coordinate of event A, namely t(A), must be less than t(B). If event B occurs after event A but before event C, then we should assign coordinates so that t(A) < t(B) < t(C).
Consider a space as a class of fundamental entities: points. The class of points has “structure” imposed upon it, constituting it as a geometry—say the full structure of space as described by Euclidean geometry. [By assigning coordinates] we associate another class of entities with the class of points, for example a class of ordered n-tuples of real numbers [for a n-dimensional space], and by means of this “mapping” associate structural features of the space described by the geometry with structural features generated by the relations that may hold among the new class of entities—say functional relations among the reals. We can then study the geometry by studying, instead, the structure of the new associated system [of coordinates]. (Sklar, 1976, p. 28)
But we always have to worry that there is structure among the numbers that is not among the entities numbered. The goal in assigning coordinates to a space is to create a reference system; this is a reference frame plus (or that includes [the literature is ambiguous on this point]) a coordinate system. For 4D spacetime obeying special relativity with its Lorentzian geometry, a Lorentzian coordinate system is a grid of smooth timelike and spacelike curves on the spacetime that assigns to each point three space-coordinate numbers and one time-coordinate number. No two distinct points of the spacetime can have the same set of four coordinate numbers. Technically, being continuous is a weaker requirement than being smooth, but the difference won’t be of concern here.
As we get more global, we have to make adjustments. Consider two coordinate systems in adjacent regions. For the adjacent regions, we make sure that the ‘edges’ of the two coordinate systems match up in the sense that each point near the intersection of the two coordinate systems gets a unique set of four coordinates and that nearby points get nearby coordinate numbers. The result is an atlas on spacetime. Inertial frames can have global coordinate systems, but in general, we have to use atlases for other frames. If we are working with general relativity where spacetime can curve and we cannot assume inertial frames, then the best we can do without atlases is to assign a coordinate system to a small region of spacetime where the laws of special relativity hold to a good approximation. General relativity requires special relativity to hold locally, that is, in any infinitesimal region, and thus for space to be Euclidean locally. That means that locally the 3-d space is correctly described by 3-d Euclidean solid geometry. Adding time is a complication. Spacetime is not Euclidean in relativity theory.
Regarding anywhere in the the atlas, we demand that nearby events get nearby coordinates. When this feature holds everywhere, the coordinate assignment is said to be monotonic or to “obey the continuity requirement.”
The metric of spacetime in general relativity is not global but varies from place to place due to the presence of matter and gravitation. So, spacetime cannot be given its coordinate numbers without our knowing the distribution of matter and energy. That is the principal reason why the assignment of time coordinates to times is so complicated.
To approach the question of the assignment of coordinates to spacetime points more philosophically, consider this challenging remark:
Minkowski, Einstein, and Weyl invite us to take a microscope and look, as it were, for little featureless grains of sand, which, closely packed, make up space-time. But Leibniz and Mach suggest that if we want to get a true idea of what a point of space-time is like we should look outward at the universe, not inward into some supposed amorphous treacle called the space-time manifold. The complete notion of a point of space-time in fact consists of the appearance of the entire universe as seen from that point. Copernicus did not convince people that the Earth was moving by getting them to examine the Earth but rather the heavens. Similarly, the reality of different points of space-time rests ultimately on the existence of different (coherently related) viewpoints of the universe as a whole. Modern theoretical physics will have us believe the points of space are uniform and featureless; in reality, they are incredibly varied, as varied as the universe itself.
—From “Relational Concepts of Space and Time” by Julian B. Barbour, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 33, No. 3 (Sep., 1982), p. 265.
For a sophisticated and philosophically-oriented approach to assigning time coordinates to times, see Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time by Tim Maudlin, pp. 24-34.
The following discussion presupposes the discussion in the previous section.
Our purpose in choosing a coordinate system or atlas is to express time-order relationships (Did this event occur between those two or before them or after them?) and magnitude-duration relationships (How long after A did B occur?) and date-time relationships (When did event A itself occur?). The date of a (point) event is the time coordinate number of the spacetime coordinate of the event. We expect all these assignments of dates to events to satisfy the requirement that event A happens before event B iff t(A) < t(B), where t(A) is the time coordinate of A, namely its date. The assignments of dates to events also must satisfy the demands of our physical theories, and in this case we face serious problems involving inconsistency if a geologist gives one date for the birth of Earth, an astronomer gives a different date, and a theologian gives yet another date.
Ideally for any reference frame, we would like to partition the set of all actual events into simultaneity equivalence classes by some reliable method. All events in one equivalence class happen at the same time in the frame, and every event is in some class or other.
Can this be done, and if so, how do we go about doing it? We should be able to say what event near the supergiant star Betelgeuse is happening now (at the same time as our now). More generally, how do we determine whether a nearby event and a very distant event occurred simultaneously? Here we face the problem of the relativity of simultaneity and the problem of the conventionality of simultaneity.
How do we calibrate and synchronize our own clock with the standard clock? Less fundamentally, attention must also be paid to the dependency of dates due to shifting from Standard Time to Daylight Savings Time, to crossing the International Date Line, to switching from the Julian to the Gregorian Calendar, and to recognizing leap years and leap seconds.
Let’s design a coordinate system for time. Suppose we have already assigned a date of zero to the event that we choose to be at the origin of our coordinate system. To assign dates (that is, time coordinates) to other events, we must have access to information from the standard clock or master clock and be able to use this information to declare correctly that the time intervals between any two consecutive ticks of our own clock are the same. The second is our conventional unit of time measurement, and it is defined to be the duration required for a specific number of ticks of the standard clock.
We then synchronize other clocks with the standard clock so the clocks show equal readings at the same time. The time or date at which a point-event occurs is the number reading on the clock at rest there. If there is no clock there, the assignment process is more complicated. One could transport a synchronized clock to that place, but any clock speed or influence by a gravitational field during the transport will need to be compensated for. If the place is across the galaxy, then any transport is out of the question, and other means must be used.
Because we want to use clocks to assign a time coordinate even to very distant events, not just to events in the immediate vicinity of the clock, and because we want to do this correctly, some appreciation of Einstein’s theory of relativity is required. A major difficulty is that two nearby synchronized clocks, namely clocks that have been calibrated and set to show the same time when they are next to each other, will not in general stay synchronized if one is transported somewhere else. If they undergo the same motions and gravitational influences, they will stay synchronized; otherwise, they will not. There is no privileged transportation process that we can appeal to. For more on how to assign dates to distant events, see the discussions of the relativity of simultaneity and the conventionality of simultaneity.
As a practical matter, dates are assigned to events in a wide variety of ways. The date of the birth of the Sun is assigned very differently from dates assigned to two successive crests of a light wave in a laboratory laser. For example, there are lasers whose successive crests of visible light waves pass by a given location in the laboratory every 10-15 seconds. This short time is not measured with a stopwatch. It is computed from measurements of the light’s wavelength. We rely on electromagnetic theory for the equation connecting the periodic time of the wave to its wavelength and speed. Dates for other kinds of events, such as the birth of Mohammad or the origin of the Sun, are computed from historical records rather than directly measured with a clock.
What does it take to tell time? Clocks are designed to measure and report to external observers what time it is. To achieve this, they are required to specify some event as time zero (or some other very specific time) and also to count recurring events. To do the counting, a clock always has two internal processes. (1) There is a regular cyclic process: tick, tock, tick, tock, and so forth. Each cycle of the clock is regular in the sense that it is like the previous cycle; this implies their durations are congruent, or sufficiently congruent. This point is sometimes expressed by saying the clock’s frequency is constant or sufficiently constant. (2) Also, there is an irreversible process that can be used to count these ticks in order to produce an output display regarding what time it is. (So, thermodynamically you can consider a clock to be a flow meter for entropy.)
A calendar alone is not a clock in this sense because it has no cyclic process. A pendulum alone is not a clock because it has no counting. Your circadian rhythm is not a clock because it just tells you to sleep and wake up without counting the completed cycles. In almost all the sections of the current article about time, the term clock refers to clocks designed to measure physical time by counting regular events and displaying the count. Stopwatches and timers are not of this sort. A stopwatch is designed to display only the duration between when it is turned on and turned off. A timer is a clock-like mechanism designed only to measure a given duration, usually by counting down.
Here are some examples of repetitive processes for clocks: the swings of a pendulum, repeated sunrises, daily movements of a shadow in a sundial, the falling of all the sand inside an hourglass each time it is turned over, bouncing mechanical springs, vibrations of a quartz crystal, radioactive decay that occurs at a predictable rate, and repeated bounces of a photon between relatively stationary mirrors. Regularity of the repetitive process is essential because we want a second today to be equal to a second tomorrow, although as a practical matter we have to accept some margin of error or frequency drift. Note that all these repetitive processes for clocks are absolute physical quantities in the sense that they do not depend upon assigning any coordinate system.
The larger enterprise of practical time-keeping for our civilization requires that clock readings be available throughout the world. This availability can be accomplished in various ways. A standard clock sitting in a room in Paris is a practical standard only if either its times can be broadcast quickly throughout the world, or the clock can be copied and calibrated so that the copies stay adequately synchronized even though they are transported to different places throughout the world. If the copies cannot always stay sufficiently synchronized (calibrated) with the clock back in Paris, then we’d like to know how we can compensate for this deviation from synchrony.
The count of a clock’s ticks is normally converted and displayed in seconds or in some other standard unit of time such as nanoseconds, hours, or years. This counting of ticks can be difficult if there are very many ticks per second, such as in our civilization’s 1964 standard clock that ticks 9,192,631,770 times per second. That standard clock continued to be used during the first decades of the twenty-first century.
It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers. It is also a convention that we re-set our clock by one hour as we move across a time-zone on the Earth’s surface, or that we add leap days and add or subtract leap seconds to keep our time counting in synch with astronomical time, which changes while atomic time does not. We do not want noon to occur when the Sun is setting. However, it is no convention that the duration from instantaneous event A to instantaneous event B plus the duration from B to instantaneous event C is equal to the duration from A to C. It is one of the objective characteristics of time, and failure for this to work out numerically for your clock is a sure sign your clock is faulty.
Any clock must use entropy increase in quantifying time. Some entropy must be created to ensure that the clock ticks forward and does not suffer a fluctuation that causes an occasional tick backward. The more entropy produced the less likely such an unwanted fluctuation occurs.
In addition to our clocks being regular and precise, we also desire our clocks to be accurate. What that means is discussed in the next section.
A group of clock readings are very precise if they are very close in agreement, even if they all are wildly inaccurate. Technically, what makes a clock accurate is that it correctly measures the interval along its own trajectory in spacetime, its so-called proper time. The interval is the length of its trajectory, so a clock is analogous to an odometer for spacetime, as the philosopher of physics Tim Maudlin has emphasized (Maudlin 2012, p. 76). Just as a car’s odometer can give a different reading if the car takes a different route between two locations, so also an accurate clock can give different measures of the time between two events if the clock takes different spacetime trajectories between them.
An accurate clock is in synchrony with the standard clock. But this synchrony must be judged by relying on imperfect measurements.
One philosophical issue is whether the standard clock itself is accurate. Realists will say that the standard clock is our best guess as to what time it really is, and we can make incorrect choices for our standard clock. Anti-realists will say that the standard clock cannot, by definition, be inaccurate, so any choice of a standard clock, even the choice of the president’s heartbeat as our standard clock, will yield a standard clock that is accurate. Leibniz would qualify as an anti-realist because he said the best we can do in setting our clocks is to place them in synchrony with each other. Newton would disagree and say that for the standard clock to be accurate it must tick in synchrony with time itself.
What is meant by accurate is agreeing with the average of the many standard clocks, about 200 of them. Any one of the 200 could fail to stay in sync with the average, and when this happens it is re-set (that is, re-calibrated, or re-synchronized with the average). The re-setting occurs about once a month.
In light of this, reconsider the answer to the question: Can the time shown on a standard clock be inaccurate? Here are some competing suggestions for how to answer to this question.
- No, because the goal for accuracy is to find the best clock, and that is just the average of our current standard clocks.
- Yes, because the goal for accuracy is absolute time.
- Yes, because the goal for accuracy is the best possible clock, and we do not know what that is yet; we would need to see into the future.
Of the three answers, most physicists prefer answer (1).
Because clocks are intended to be used to measure events external to themselves, another goal in clock building is to ensure there is no difficulty in telling which clock tick is simultaneous with which far away events. For most nearby situations and nearby clocks, the sound made by the ticking helps us make this determination. We hear the tick just as we see the event occur that we desire to measure. Using this procedure for synchronization presupposes that we can ignore the difference between the speed of sound and the speed of light.
In our discussion so far, we have assumed that the clock is very small, that it can count any part of a second, and that it can count high enough to provide information for our calendars and longer-term records. These aren’t always good assumptions. Despite those practical problems, there is the theoretical problem of there being a physical limit to the shortest duration measurable by a given clock because no clock can measure events whose duration is shorter than the time it takes light to travel between the components of that clock, the components in the part that generates the sequence of regular ticks. This theoretical limit places a lower limit on the margin of error of any measurement made with that clock.
Every physical motion of every clock is subject to disturbances. So, to be an accurate clock, one that is in synchrony with the standard clock, we want our clock to be adjustable in case it drifts out of synchrony a bit. To achieve this goal, it helps to keep the clock isolated from environmental influences such as heat, dust, unusual electromagnetic fields, physical blows (such as dropping the clock), and immersion in liquids. And it helps to be able to predict how much a specific influence affects the drift out of synchrony so that there can be an adjustment for this influence, a recalibration.
Finding a sufficiently accurate clock was how 18th and 19th century sailors eventually were able to locate themselves when they could not see land. At sea at night the numerical angle of the North Star above the horizon is their latitude. Without a clock, they had no way to determine longitude except by dead reckoning, which is very error-prone. If they had an accurate mechanical clock with them that wasn’t affected by choppy seas, they could synchronize it with the standard clock before setting sail. Out on the ocean, this clock would tell them the time back at zero degrees longitude. Then at sea, the sailors could wait until the Sun was at its highest point and know the local time is 12 noon. If at that moment their clock read 1500 (that is, 3 P.M.), then they would know their clock is off by 3 hours from the time at zero degrees longitude. Because our Earth turns 15 degrees on its axis around the North Pole every hour, the sailors could compute that they were 3 x 15 degrees west of zero degrees, namely at 45 degrees west longitude. A pendulum clock is not reliable for doing this because choppy seas throw it off. An accurate clock for longitude purposes was invented by British clockmaker John Harrison in 1727. It was accurate to one second a month. When mariners adopted similarly accurate clocks, the number of ships that crashed into rocks and ran ashore plummeted.
It has been speculated that there exists a theoretical limitation on all possible clocks such that a clock can have low accuracy and a high tick rate or high accuracy but a low tick rate [https://www.ox.ac.uk/news/science-blog/heatstroke-why-hotter-clock-more-accurate-its-timekeeping].
Our civilization’s standard clock or master clock is the clock that other clocks are synchronized with. By convention, it reports “the time.” This standard clock drifts less than a second over the age of the universe, and this precision is increasing as better clocks are invented over the years. Your cell phone synchronizes its internal clock with this standard clock about once a week. Synchronizing clocks located in various places on earth usually requires transmitting their reports via one or more artificial satellites in order to minimize the variation in the transmitted signal’s speed due to the signal’s passing through the earth or through the atmosphere.
The standard clock reports the proper time for an observatory in Greenwich, England at zero degrees longitude, even though the report is created in a laboratory near Paris, France. For most countries, standard time is called Coordinated Universal Time. Other names for it are UTC, and zulu time. It once was named Greenwich Mean Time (GMT). However, some countries prefer their own name. Standard time is also the time of any coordinate system that is at rest with respect to the standard clock. So-called coordinate time is the time along the time-axis of any coordinate system. Normally, a duration of one second along the time axis of a coordinate system is also one second of standard time.
Physicists have chosen what they believe is a clock that they can be reasonably confident will tick regularly in the sense that all periods between adjacent ticks are sufficiently congruent, that is, the same duration. Choosing a standard clock that is based on the beats of a president’s heart would be a poor choice because clocks everywhere would suddenly get out of synchrony with the standard clock when the president goes jogging. Our standard clock once depended on the Earth’s rotations and revolutions, but we now estimate the Earth clock has lost more than three hours in the last 2,000 years.
The standard clock of Coordinated Universal Time uses an atomic clock. There are many kinds of atomic clock, but the one adopted worldwide in 1964 relied on the very regular behavior of cesium-133 atoms, in particular, the frequency of the light emitted or absorbed when the atom’s outer electron changes its spin state to be the same as, or opposite to, the nucleus. The spectral line of this light has a very sharp central peak. The advantage of using an atomic clock that relies on, say, cesium-133 is that (1) all cesium-133 atoms behave exactly alike, (2) the clock’s ticking is very regular, (3) it ticks at a fast rate (high frequency), and (4) the clock can easily be copied and constructed elsewhere. According to the U.S. National Institute of Standards and Technology, the advantages of cesium atomic clocks are that their:
resonant frequencies are natural properties (not human-made) and that they are very high frequencies, in the billions of Hertz. If an atomic clock was off by 1 Hz and the frequency was 1 GHz (1 billion Hz), then it would be off by one second in 31.7 years or, roughly, 86 microseconds (0.000086 s) per day. The best cesium oscillators…can produce frequency with an uncertainty of about 3 x 10-16, which translates to a time error of about 0.03 nanoseconds per day, or about one second in 100 million years.
The details of how standard time is reported to the rest of the world are somewhat complicated. What gets reported to the rest of the world is U.T.C. time. The international time standard is called Coordinated Universal Time (or U.T.C. time, for the initials of the French name). The report of U.T.C. time is based on computations and revisions made from the time reports of the Atomic Time (A.T.) of many cesium clocks.
Coordinated Universal Time or U.T.C. time is, by agreement, the time at zero degrees longitude. This longitude is an imaginary great circle that runs through a certain observatory is Greenwich England, although the report is produced in Paris, France. U.T.C. time is informally called Zulu Time, and it is the time used by the Internet and by the aviation industry throughout the world.
U.T.C. time is produced from T.A.I. time by adding or subtracting some appropriate integral number of leap seconds. T.A.I. time is computed, in turn, from A.T. time or Atomic Time, the time of a single standard cesium-based atomic fountain clock. All A.T. times are reported in units called S.I. seconds.
An S.I. second or Système International second or second of Le Système International d’Unités is defined to be the numerical measure of the time it takes for a motionless (relative to the Greenwich observatory), designated, standard cesium atomic clock to emit exactly 9,192,631,770 cycles of radiation of a certain color of light that is emitted from the clock’s cloud of cesium-133 atoms during their transition between the two hyperfine levels of the ground state of the atom. This microwave frequency is very stable. All Cs-133 atoms of this isotope are exactly alike, in the sense that they have the same intrinsic properties; their locations are different, but those are relational properties. Two pendulum clocks are never so much alike. The number “9,192,631,770” was chosen so the second would be as close as scientists could come to the duration of what was called a “second” back in 1957 when the initial measurements were made on cesium-133.
The T.A.I. scale, from which U.T.C. time is computed is the average of the reports of A.T. time from 200 official cesium atomic clocks that are distributed around the world in about fifty selected laboratories, all reporting to Paris. One of those laboratories is the National Institute of Standards and Technology (NIST) in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. This calculated average time of the 200 reports is called T.A.I. time, the abbreviation of the French phrase for International Atomic Time. The International Bureau of Weights and Measures (BIPM) near Paris performs the averaging about once a month. If your laboratory in the T.A.I. system had sent in your clock’s reading for certain events that occurred in the previous month, then in the present month the BIPM calculates the average answer for the 200 clock readings and sends you a report of how inaccurate your report was from the average, so you can make adjustments to your atomic clock.
A.T. time, T.A.I. time, and U.T.C. time are not kinds of physical time but rather are kinds of reports of physical time.
At the 13th General Conference on Weights and Measures in 1967, the definition of a second was changed from a certain fraction of a solar day to a specific number of periods of radiation produced by an atomic clock (actually, the average of the 200 standard atomic clocks). This second is the so-called standard second or the S.I. second. It is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods (cycles, oscillations, vibrations) of a certain kind of microwave radiation emitted in the standard cesium atomic clock. More specifically, the second is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods of the microwave radiation required to produce the maximum fluorescence of a small cloud of cesium-133 atoms (that is, their radiating a specific color of light) as the single outer-shell electron in the atom makes a transition between two specific hyperfine energy levels of the ground state of the atom. This is the internationally agreed-upon unit for atomic time in the T.A.I. system. The old astronomical system (Universal Time 1 or UT1) defined a second to be 1/86,400 of an average solar day. As of 2021, this standard for time tied to cesium atomic clocks had not been changed despite intervening general conferences, although all metrologists expect there to be a change eventually to higher frequency clocks, that is, clocks that tick faster.
For this “atomic time,” or time measured atomically, the atoms of cesium gas are cooled to near absolute zero and given a uniform energy while trapped in an atomic fountain or optical lattice and irradiated with microwaves. The frequency of the microwave radiation is tuned until maximum fluorescence is achieved. That is, it is adjusted until the maximum number of cesium atoms flip from one energy level to another, showing that the microwave radiation frequency is precisely tuned to be 9,192,631,770 vibrations per second. Because this frequency for maximum fluorescence is so stable from one experiment to the next, the vibration number is accurate to this many significant digits. For more details on how an atomic clock works, see (Gibbs, 2002).
Leap years (with their leap days) are needed as adjustments to the standard clock’s count in order to account for the fact that the number of the Earth’s rotations per Earth revolution does not stay constant from year to year. The Earth is spinning slower every day, but not uniformly. Without an adjustment, the time called “midnight” eventually would drift into the daylight. Leap seconds are needed for another reason. The Earth’s period changes irregularly due to earthquakes and hurricanes and other phenomena. This effect on the period is not practically predictable, so, when the irregularity occurs, a leap second is added or subtracted every six months as needed.
The meter depends on the second, so time measurement is more basic than space measurement. It does not follow, though, that time is more basic than space. In 1983, scientists agreed that the best way to define and to measure length between any two points A and B is to do it via measuring the number of periods of a light beam reaching from A to B. This is for three reasons: (i) light propagation is very stable or regular; its speed is either constant, or when not constant (such as its moving through water of different density or moving at 38 miles per hour through a Bose-Einstein condensate) we know how to compensate for the influence of the medium; (ii) a light wave’s frequency can be made extremely stable; and (iii) distance cannot be measured more accurately in other ways. The actual definition of the meter did not change until 199.
In 1999, the meter was defined in terms of the (pre-defined) second as being the distance light travels in a vacuum in an inertial reference frame in exactly 0.000000003335640952 seconds, or 1/299,792,458 seconds. That number is picked by convention so that the new meter is very nearly the same distance as the old meter that was once defined to be the distance between two specific marks on a platinum bar kept in the Paris Observatory.
Time can be measured not only more accurately than distance but also more accurately than voltage, temperature, mass, or anything else.
So why bother to improve atomic clocks? The duration of the second can already be measured to 14 or 15 decimal places, a precision 1,000 times that of any other fundamental unit. One reason to do better is that the second is increasingly the fundamental unit. Three of the six other basic units—the meter, lumen and ampere—are defined in terms of the second. (Gibbs, 2002)
One subtle implication of the standard definition of the second and of the meter is that they fix the speed of light in a vacuum in all inertial frames, assuming the prior decision has been made to measure distance in meters and time in seconds. The speed is exactly one meter per 0.000000003335640952 seconds or 299,792,458 meters per second. There can no longer be any direct measurement to check whether that is how fast light really moves; it is defined to be moving that fast. Any measurement that produced a different value for the speed of light is presumed initially to have an error. The error would be in, say, its measurements of lengths and durations, or in its assumptions about being in an inertial frame, or in its adjustments for the influence of gravitation and acceleration, or in its assumption that the light was moving in a vacuum. This initial presumption of where the error lies comes from a deep reliance by scientists on Einstein’s theory of relativity. However, if it were eventually decided by the community of scientists that the speed of light should not have been fixed as it was, then the scientists would call for a new world convention to re-define the second.
Other clocks ideally are calibrated by being synchronized to “the” standard clock. However, some choices of standard clock are better than others. Some philosophers of time believe one choice is better than another because it is closer to what time it really is. Other philosophers of time argue that there is no access to what time it really is except by first having selected the standard clock.
Let’s consider the various goals we want to achieve in choosing one standard clock rather than another. One goal is to choose a clock that does not drift very much. That is, we want a clock that has a very regular period—so the durations between ticks are congruent. Many times throughout history, scientists have detected that their currently-chosen standard clock seemed to be drifting. In about 1700, scientists discovered that the time from one day to the next, as determined by the duration between sunrises, varied throughout the year. They did not notice any variation in the duration of a year, so they began to speak of the duration of the year and of the mean day throughout the year.
As more was learned about astronomy the definition of the second was changed. Before the 1950s, the standard clock was defined astronomically in terms of the mean rotation of the Earth upon its axis (solar time). For a short period in the 1950s and 1960s, the standard clock was defined in terms of the revolution of the Earth about the Sun (ephemeris time). The second was defined to be 1/86,400 of the mean solar day, which is the average throughout the year of the rotational period of the Earth with respect to the Sun. But all these clocks were soon discovered to drift.
To solve these drift problems, physicists chose a certain kind of atomic clock (which displays so-called atomic time). All atomic clocks measure time in terms of the natural resonant frequencies of certain atoms or molecules. The dates of adoption of these standard clocks is omitted in this section because different international organizations adopted different standards in different years. The U.S.A.’s National Institute of Standards and Technology’s F-1 atomic fountain clock, that is used for reporting standard time in the U.S.A. (after adjustment so it reports the average from the other laboratories in the T.A.I. network), is so accurate that it drifts by less than one second every 30 million years. We know there is this drift because it is implied by the laws of physics, not because we have a better clock that measures this drift.
Atomic clocks use the frequency of a specific atomic transition as an extremely stable time standard. While the second is currently defined by caesium-based clocks that operate at a microwave frequencies, physicists have built much more accurate clocks that are based on light. These optical clocks tick at much higher frequencies than microwave clocks and can keep time that is accurate to about one part in 1018, which is about 100 times better than the best caesium clocks.
The international metrology community aims to replace the microwave time standard with an optical clock, but first must choose from one of several clock designs being developed worldwide.” –Hamish Johnston, Physics World, 26 March 2021 .
Optical clocks resonate at light frequencies rather than microwave frequencies, so the optical atomic clocks vibrate about 100,000 faster than the microwave atomic clocks.
To achieve the goal of restricting drift, any clock chosen to become the standard clock should be maximally isolated from outside effects. That is, a practical goal in selecting a standard clock is to find a clock that can be well insulated from environmental impacts such as comets impacting the Earth, earthquakes, stray electric fields, trucks driving on nearby roads, and the presence of dust within the clock. The clock can be shielded from electrical fields, for example, by enclosing it in a metal box. If not insulation, then compensation. If there is some theoretically predictable effect of an environmental influence upon the standard clock, then the clock can be regularly adjusted to compensate for this effect.
Consider the insulation problem we would have if we were to use as our standard clock the mean yearly motion of the Earth around the Sun. Can we compensate for all the relevant disturbing effects on the motion of the Earth around the Sun? Not easily. The problem is that the Earth’s rate of spin varies in a practically unpredictable manner. Meanwhile, we believe that the relevant factors affecting the spin (mainly friction caused by tides rubbing on continental shelves, but also shifts in winds, comet bombardment, earthquakes, and convection in Earth’s molten core) are affecting the Earth’s rotational speed and its period of revolution around the Sun, but not affecting the behavior of the atomic clock.
Leap days and leap seconds and leap microseconds are added or subtracted occasionally in order to keep our atomic-based calendar in synchrony with the rotations and revolutions of the Earth. We do this because we want to keep atomic-noons occurring on astronomical-noons and ultimately because we want to prevent Northern hemisphere winters from occurring in some future July. These changes do not affect the duration of a second, but they do affect the duration of a year because not all years last the same number of seconds. In this way, we compensate for the Earth-Sun clocks falling out of synchrony with our standard clock.
Another desirable feature of a standard clock is that reproductions of it stay in synchrony with each other when environmental conditions are the same. Otherwise, we may be limited to relying on a specifically-located standard clock that can not be trusted elsewhere and that can be broken, vandalized or stolen. Cesium clocks in a suburb of Istanbul work just like cesium clocks in New York City.
The principal goal in selecting a standard clock is to reduce mystery in physics by finding a periodic process that, if adopted as our standard, makes the resulting system of physical laws simpler and more useful, and allows us to explain phenomena that otherwise would be mysterious. Choosing an atomic clock as standard is much better for this purpose than choosing the periodic dripping of water from our goatskin bag or even the periodic revolution of the Earth about the Sun. If scientists were to have retained the Earth-Sun clock as the standard clock and were to say that by definition the Earth does not slow down in any rotation or in any revolution, then when a comet collides with Earth, tempting the scientists to say the Earth’s period of rotation and revolution changed, the scientists instead would be forced to alter, among many other things, their atomic theory and say the frequency of light emitted from cesium atoms mysteriously increases all over the universe when comets collide with Earth. By switching to the cesium atomic standard, these alterations are unnecessary, and the mystery vanishes.
To make this point a little more simply, suppose the President’s heartbeats were chosen as our standard clock and so the count of heartbeats always showed the correct time, then it would be a mystery why pendulums (and cesium radiation in atomic clocks) changed their frequency whenever the President went jogging, and scientists would have to postulate some new causal influence that joggers have on pendulums across the globe.
To achieve the goal of choosing a standard clock that maximally reduces mystery, we want the clock’s readings to be consistent with the accepted laws of motion, in the following sense. Newton’s first law of motion says that a body in motion should continue to cover the same distance during the same time interval unless acted upon by an external force. If we used our standard clock to run a series of tests of the time intervals as a body coasted along a carefully measured path, and we found that the law was violated and we could not account for this mysterious violation by finding external forces to blame and we were sure that there was no problem otherwise with Newton’s law or with the measurement of the length of the path, then the problem would be with the clock. Leonhard Euler (1707-1783) was the first person to suggest this consistency requirement on our choice of a standard clock. A similar argument holds today but with using the laws of motion from Einstein’s theory of relativity.
What it means for the standard clock to be accurate depends on your philosophy of time. If you are a conventionalist, then once you select the standard clock it can not fail to be accurate in the sense of being correct. On the other hand, if you are an objectivist, you will say the standard clock can be inaccurate. There are different sorts of objectivists. Suppose we ask the question, “Can the time shown on a properly functioning standard clock ever be inaccurate?” The answer is “no” if the target is synchrony with the current standard clock, as the conventionalists believe, but “yes” if there is another target. Objectivists can propose at least three other distinct targets: (1) absolute time (perhaps in Isaac Newton’s sense that he proposed in the 17th century), (2) the best possible clock, and (3) the best-known clock. We do not have a way of knowing whether our current standard clock is close to target 1 or target 2. But if the best-known clock is known not yet to have been chosen to be the standard clock, then the current standard clock can be inaccurate in sense 3.
When you want to know how long a basketball game lasts, why do you subtract the start time from the end time? The answer is that we accept a metric for duration in which we subtract the two time numbers. Why do not we choose another metric and, let’s say, subtract the square root of the start time from the square root of the end time? This question is implicitly asking whether our choice of metric can be incorrect or merely inconvenient.
Let’s say more about this. When we choose a standard clock, we are choosing a metric. By agreeing to read the clock so that a duration from 3:00 to 5:00 is 5-3 hours, and so 2 hours, we are making a choice about how to compare any two durations in order to decide whether they are equal, that is, congruent. We suppose the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 as shown by yesterday’s reading of the standard clock was the same as the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 on the readings from two days ago and will be the same for today’s readings and tomorrow’s readings.
Philosophers of time continue to dispute the extent to which the choice of metric is conventional rather than objective in the sense of being forced on us by nature. The objectivist says the choice is forced and that the success of the standard atomic clock over the standard solar clock shows that we were more accurate in our choice of the standard clock. An objectivist says it is just as forced on us as our choosing to say the Earth is round rather than flat. Taking the conventional side on this issue, Adolf Grünbaum argued that time is metrically amorphous. It has no intrinsic metric. Instead, we choose the metric we do in order only to achieve the goals of reducing mystery in science, but satisfying those goals is no sign of being correct.
The conventionalist, as opposed to the objectivist, would say that if we were to require by convention that the instant at which Jesus was born and the instant at which Abraham Lincoln was assassinated are to be only 24 seconds apart, whereas the duration between Lincoln’s assassination and his burial is to be 24 billion seconds, then we could not be mistaken. It is up to us as a civilization to say what is correct when we first create our conventions about measuring duration. We can consistently assign any numerical time coordinates we wish, subject only to the condition that the assignment properly reflects the betweenness relations of the events that occur at those instants. That is, if event J (birth of Jesus) occurs before event L (Lincoln’s assassination) and this, in turn, occurs before event B (burial of Lincoln), then the time assigned to J must be numerically less than the time assigned to L, and both must be less than the time assigned to B so that t(J) < t(L) < t(B). A simple requirement. Yes, but the implication is that this relationship among J, L, and B must hold for events simultaneous with J, and for all events simultaneous with K, and so forth.
It is other features of nature that lead us to reject the above convention about 24 seconds and 24 billion seconds. What features? There are many periodic processes in nature that have a special relationship to each other; their periods are very nearly constant multiples of each other, and this constant stays the same over a long time. For example, the period of the rotation of the Earth is a fairly constant multiple of the period of the revolution of the Earth around the Sun, and both these periods are a constant multiple of the periods of a swinging pendulum and of vibrations of quartz crystals. The class of these periodic processes is very large, so the world will be easier to describe if we choose our standard clock from one of these periodic processes. A good convention for what is regular will make it easier for scientists to find simple laws of nature and to explain what causes other events to be irregular. It is the search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery that leads us to adopt the conventions we do for the numerical time coordinate assignments and thus leads us to choose the standard clock we do choose. Objectivists disagree and say this search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery is all fine, but it is directing us toward the correct metric, not simply the useful metric.
For additional discussion of some of the points made in this section, including the issue of how to distinguish an accurate clock from an inaccurate one, see chapter 8 of (Carnap 1966).
Particles are not ontologically fundamental. The universe at a time is approximately a system of particles in spacetime, but, more accurately, it is a system of co-existing quantum fields.
A field in physics is something filling the universe that takes on values everywhere, and those values might change over time. The value might be a number with a unit, or perhaps an ordered set of them, or something else. Fields can vary in both space and time. A field at a time is analogous to a colored fluid filling all space, with different fields having different colors. A blue field at a single time might vary in space from light blue to dark blue in various regions.
For one example of a real field, think of a room filled with air as having an air density field, with sound waves in the room being oscillations of this field due to changing air density in different places at different times. The particle associated with this field is called a phonon (not a photon). This field is real but not fundamental.
In the early years of using the concept of fields, the fields were considered something added to systems of particles, but the modern viewpoint is that particles themselves are local vibrations of fields—but vibrations that are fairly stable in the sense of persisting (for the particle’s lifetime). The key ontological point is that the fields are fundamental and the particles supervene on the fields. It is as if the particles are epiphenomena.
The propagation of basic particles from one place to another is due to the fact that any change in a field’s value induces nearby changes a little later. Think of points in the field as interacting only with their nearest neighbors, which in turn interact with their own neighbors, and so forth. Field theory has the advantage that, if you want to know what will happen next at a place, you do not have to consider the influence of everything everywhere in the universe but only the field values at the place of interest and the rates of change of those values.
Unlike with Newton’s mechanics, two distant objects do not act on each other directly, but only indirectly via the field between them. However, Newton’s theory of gravity without fields is sometimes more practical to use because gravitational forces get weaker with distance, and the influence of distant particles can be ignored.
The concept of a field originated with Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) in about 1800. He suggested treating Newton’s theory of gravity as a field theory. In Laplace’s field theory of gravity, the notion of action at a distance was eliminated. Newton would have been happy with the idea of a field because he always doubted that gravity worked by one particle acting directly on another distant particle instantaneously. In a letter to Richard Bentley, he said:
It is inconceivable that inanimate brute matter should, without the intervention of something else which is not material, operate upon and affect other matter, and have an effect upon it, without mutual contact.
In Laplace’s theory, the force of gravity in a direction is proportional to the rate of change of the field in that direction. But Newton still would have been unhappy with Laplace’s field theory because it required any gravitational force or any change in a gravitational force to be propagated instantaneously throughout all space. Newton wished to avoid instantaneous actions.
Instantaneous actions were removed from electromagnetic fields by Maxwell in the 1860s when he created his theory of electromagnetism as a field theory. Changes in electromagnetic forces were propagated, not instantaneously, but at the speed of light. Instantaneous actions were eventually removed from gravitational theory in Einstein’s general theory of relativity in 1915. According to Einstein,
As the Earth moves, the direction of its gravitational pull does not change instantly throughout the universe. Rather, it changes right where the Earth is located, and then the field at that point tugs on the field nearby, which tugs on the field a little farther away, and so on in a wave moving outward at the speed of light. (Carroll 2019, p. 249)
Depending upon the field, a field’s value at a point in space might be a simple number (as in the Higgs field), or a vector (as in the classical electromagnetic field), or a tensor (as in Einstein’s gravitational field), or a matrix. Fields obey laws, and these laws usually are systems of partial differential equations that hold at each point.
With the rise of quantum field theory, instead of a particle being treated as a definite-size object within spacetime it is treated as a localized disturbance of the field itself. For example, an electron is a localized disturbance in the electron field. The anti-electron is a localized disturbance in this field, too. A photon is a localized disturbance in the electromagnetic field (which is the same thing as the photon field). The disturbance is a fuzzy bundle of quantized energy occupying a region of space bigger than a single point. Here is an analogy. Think of a quantum field as a farmer’s field. A particle is a little hill in the field. These hills can be stationary or moving. The hills can pass by each other or pass through other hills or bounce off them, depending on the kinds of hills. Moving hills can carry information and energy from one place to another.
Particles according to quantum theory are really non-pointlike. They are distributed concentrations of certain values. So, the manifest image of a particle cannot easily be reconciled with the quantum mechanical image of a particle. Although fields, not particles, are ontologically basic, it does not follow from this that particles are not real. They are just odd in not having a well-defined diameter. Although an electron does have a greater probability of being detected at some places than at others, in any single detection the electron is detected only at a point, not a region. The electron is a disturbance that spreads throughout space, although the high-amplitude parts are in a small region. Despite its having no sharp boundary, the electron is physically basic in the sense that it has no sub-structure. The proton is not basic because it is made of quarks and gluons. Particles with no sub-structure are called elementary particles.
One unusual feature of quantum mechanics is the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle. It implies that any object, such as an electron, has complementary features. For example, it has values for its position and for the rate of change of its position, but the values are complementary in the sense that the more precisely one value is measured the less precisely the other value can be measured. Fields are objects, too, and so the Heisenberg’s Uncertainty Principle applies also to fields. Fields have complementary features. The more precisely the value of a field is measured at one location in space, the less precisely its rate of change at that location can be measured. Thus the word “uncertainty” in the name Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle.
There are many basic quantum fields that exist together. Of these, there are four basic matter fields. Two of these are the electron field and the quark field. There are five basic force-carrying fields, such as the electromagnetic field, the gravitational field, and the Higgs field. All physicists believe there are more, as yet unknown, fields. There might be a dark matter field, for example.
Fields often interact with other fields. The electromagnetic field interacts with the electron field whenever an energetic photon transitions into an electron and a positron. Physicists presuppose that two fields can interact with each other only when they are at the same point. If this presupposition were not true, our world would be a very spooky place.
According to quantum field theory, once one of these basic fields comes into existence it cannot be removed from existence; the field exists everywhere. Magnets create magnetic fields, but if you were to remove all the magnets, there would still be a magnetic field, although it would be at its minimum strength. Sources of fields are not essential for the existence of fields.
Because of the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle, even when a field’s value is the lowest possible (called the vacuum state or unexcited state) in a region, there is always a non-zero probability that its value will spontaneously deviate from that value in the region. The most common way this happens is via virtual-pair production. This occurs when a particle and its anti-particle spontaneously come into existence in the region, then rapidly annihilate each other in a small burst of energy. You can think of space in its smallest regions as being a churning sea, a sea of pairs of these particles and their anti-particles that are continually coming into existence and then being rapidly annihilated. So, even if all universe’s fields were to be at their lowest state, empty space always would have some activity and energy. This energy of the vacuum state is inaccessible to us; we can never use it to do work. Clearly, the empty space of physics is not the metaphysician’s nothingness. So, there is no region of empty space where there could be empty time or changeless time in the sense meant by a Leibnizian relationist.
Because all these fields are quantum fields, their disturbances or excitations can occur only in quantized chunks, namely integer multiples of some baseline energy, the so-called zero-point energy, which is the lowest possible positive energy. It is these chunks that make the theory be a quantum theory.
Although fields that exist cannot go out of existence, they can wake up from their slumbers and turn on. Soon after the big bang, the Higgs field, which had a value of zero everywhere, began to increase in value as the universe started cooling. When the universe’s temperature fell below a certain critical value, the field grew spontaneously and at that point any particle that interacted with the Higgs field acquired a mass. Before that, all particles were massless. The more a particle interacts with the Higgs field, the heavier it is. The photon does not interact at all with the Higgs field.
What is the relationship between spacetime and all these fields? Are the fields in space or, as Einstein once said, are they properties of space, or is there a different relationship? Some physicists believe the gravitational field resides within spacetime. Proponents of string theory, for example, believe all particles are made of strings and these strings move within a pre-existing spacetime. Other physicists who are proponents of the theory of loop quantum gravity say spacetime is the gravitational field itself; so it is a mistake, they say, to think of the gravitational field as existing within space or within spacetime.
Many physicists believe that the universe is not composed of many fields; it is composed of a single field, the quantum field, which has a character such that it appears as if it is composed of various different fields. And a great number of other physicists say quantum theory should be a string theory, which is a kind of higher-dimensional field theory whose smallest locations are not points but rather open or closed strings of finite, but tiny, extension.
For an elementary introduction to quantum fields, see the video https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=X5rAGfjPSWE.
Back to the main “Time” article for references.
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