clock2Time is what a clock is used to measure. Information about time tells the durations of events, when they occur, and which events happen before which others. So, time plays a very significant role in the universe’s structure. Nevertheless, there are many unresolved issues, both philosophical and scientific.

Consider this issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing philosophical theories. Presentism implies that necessarily only present objects and present events are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experiences compared to our relatively dimmer memories of past experiences and relatively dim expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not, because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory, eternalism, is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective, that is, person-dependent. An eternalist will say Adolf Hitler’s rise to power in Germany is not simply in the past, as the first two theories imply; instead, it is in the past for you, but in the future for Aristotle, and it is equally real for both of you.

In no particular order, here is a list of other issues about time that are discussed in this article:

•Whether there was a moment without an earlier one.
•Whether time exists when nothing is changing.
•What kinds of time travel are possible.
•Whether time has an arrow, but space does not.
•How time is represented in the mind.
•Whether time itself passes or instead the passage of time is a feature of how minds experience time.
•How to distinguish an accurate clock from an inaccurate one.
•Whether time is an individual thing or instead only a relationship among things.
•Which events are present.
•Which features of our ordinary sense of the word time are, or should be, captured by the concept of time in physics.
•Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth-values now.
•Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically fundamental.
•The proper formalism or logic for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning.
•Whether there are points of time with zero duration.
•What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time.
•Whether time is objective or subjective.
•Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.
•Whether time is unreal either by being an illusion, or wholly conventional, or merely a mathematical construct.
•Which specific aspects of time are conventional.
•How to settle the disputes between proponents of McTaggart’s A-theory and B-theory of time.

This article does not explore how time affects different cultures differently, how persons can more efficiently manage their time, or what is timeless.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Physical Time, Psychological time, and Biological Time
  3. What Time Really Is
  4. Why There Is Time Instead of No Time
  5. What Science Requires of Time
  6. Time and Change (Relationism vs. Substantivalism)
    1. History of the Debate up to Kant
    2. History of the Debate after Kant
  7. Is There a Beginning or End to Time?
    1. The Beginning
    2. The End
    3. Historical Answers
  8. Emergence
  9. Convention
  10. Arguments That Time Is Not Real
  11. Time Travel
    1. To the Future
    2. To the Past
  12. McTaggart’s A-Theory and B-Theory
  13. The Passage or Flow of Time
  14. The Past, Present, and Future
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. The Present
    3. Persistence, Four-Dimensionalism, and Temporal Parts
    4. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences
    5. Essentially-Tensed Facts
  15. The Arrow of Time
  16. Temporal Logic
  17. Time, Mind, and Experience
  18. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Else Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  19. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Philosophers of time want to build a robust and defensible philosophical theory of time, one that resolves the issues on the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary.

In doing this, one philosophical goal is to properly analyze the very complicated relationship between the common sense image of time and the scientific image of time. This is the relationship between beliefs about time held by ordinary speakers of our language and beliefs about time as understood through the lens of contemporary science, particularly physics. The common sense image is normally expressed with non-technical terms such as now, flow, and past and not with technical scientific terms such as continuum, proper time, and reference frame.

The common sense image of time is what philosophers call the manifest image of time. The concept is vague. A reasonable way to make it a little more precise is to say it contains these beliefs about time: (1) The world was not created five minutes ago. (2) Time exists everywhere. (3) You can stop in space but not in time. (4) Every event has a duration, a length of time it lasts . (5) No event fails to occur at some time or other. (6) A present event cannot cause a distant present event. (7) The past is fixed, but the future is not, so the past cannot be changed. (8) Time is continuous rather than a sequence of discrete moments. (9) Time has an arrow. (10) Given any two events, they have some objective order such as one happening before the other, or their being simultaneous. (11) Time passes; it flows like a river, and we directly experience this flow. (12) There is a present that is objective, that every living person shares, and that divides everyone’s past from their future. (13) The correct measurement of time is independent of the presence or absence of physical objects.

Items 1 to 6 on this list are part of both images, so it can be said this part of the manifest image has withstood the impact of science. There is no consensus among scientists about whether 8 and 9 are part of the scientific image. Items 10 to 13 definitely are not features of the scientific image. See (Callendar 2017) for a more detailed description and discussion of the controversies about the manifest image.

A popular methodology used by metaphysicians is to start with the common sense image and then change it only if there are good reasons that suggest changing it. Unfortunately, there is no consensus among philosophers of time about what counts as a good reason, although there is among physicists. Does conflict with relativity theory count as a good reason? Yes, say physicists, but Husserl’s classic 1936 work on phenomenology, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, criticized the scientific image because of its acceptance of so many of the implications of relativity theory, and in this spirit A. N. Prior said that the theory of relativity is for this reason not about real time.

Ever since the downfall of the Logical Positivists‘ program of requiring all meaningful, non-tautological statements to be reducible to, or definable in terms of, common sense statements about what is given in our sense experiences (via seeing, hearing, feeling, and so forth), few philosophers of science would advocate any reduction of statements expressed in the scientific image to statements expressed in the common sense image, or vice versa, but the proper relationship between the two is an open question.

Sean Carroll’s attitude about the proper relationship can be expressed succinctly this way: “Our direct experience of reality is overrated.” Defenders of the manifest image have created all sorts of more technical theories that try to revise and improve the manifest image. Regarding these attempts, the philosopher of physics Craig Callender said:

These models of time are typically sophisticated products and shouldn’t be confused with manifest time. Instead they are models that adorn the time of physics with all manner of fancy temporal dress: primitive flows, tensed presents, transient presents, ersatz presents, Meinongian times, existent presents, priority presents, thick and skipping presents, moving spotlights, becoming, and at least half a dozen different types of branching! What unites this otherwise motley class is that each model has features that allegedly vindicate core aspects of manifest time. However, these tricked out times have not met with much success (Callender 2017, p. 29).

In some very loose and coarse-grained sense, manifest time might be called an illusion without any harm done. However, for many of its aspects, it’s a bit like calling our impression of a shape an illusion, and that seems wrong (Callender 2017, p. 310).

Some issues listed in the opening summary are intimately related to others, so it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because the camps are on the opposite sides of so many controversial issues about time.

The next two paragraphs summarize the two camps. The technical terms used in the summaries are explained in more detail later in the article. Briefly, the two camps can be distinguished by saying the members of the A-camp believe McTaggart’s A-theory is the fundamental way to understand time; and they accept a majority of the following claims: past events are always changing as they move farther into the past; this change is the only genuine, fundamental kind of change; the present or “now” is objectively real; so is time’s passage or flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental, not untensed facts; the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional; and at least some A-predicates are not semantically reducible to B-predicates without loss of meaning.

Members of the B-camp reject all or at least most of the claims of the A-camp. They believe McTaggart’s B-theory is the fundamental way to understand time; and they accept a majority of the following claims: events never undergo genuine change; the present or now is not objectively real and neither is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; the fundamental objects are 4-dimensional, not 3-dimensional; and A-predicates are reducible to B-predicates or at least the truth conditions of sentences using A-predicates can be adequately explained in terms of the truth conditions of sentences using only B-predicates.

This article provides an introduction to the philosophical controversy between the A and B camps, as well as an introduction to many other issues about time.

To what extent is time understood? This is a difficult question, not simply because the word understood is notoriously vague. There have been a great many advances is understanding time over the last two thousand years, especially over the last 125 years, as this article explains, so we can definitively say time is better understood than it was. Nevertheless, in order to say time is understood there remain too many other unanswered questions and questions whose answers are not agreed upon by the experts. Can we at least say only the relatively less important questions are left unanswered? No, not even that. So, this is the state of understanding time at the end of the first quarter of the twenty-first century. It is certainly less than a reader might wish to have.

2. Physical Time, Biological Time, and Psychological Time

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time is indicated by regular biological processes, and by signs of aging. The ticks of a human being’s biological clock are produced by regular heartbeats, the rhythm of breathing, cycles of sleeping and waking, and menstruation, although there is no conscious counting. Biological time is not another kind of time, but rather is best understood as the body’s recording of physical time, in the sense that biological time is physical time measured with a biological process.

Psychological time is private time. It is also called subjective time and phenomenological time and perceived time; and it is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time. Psychological time is the physical time measured by a mental clock. Our psychological time can change its rate (compared to physical time) depending on whether we are bored or instead intensively involved. Psychological time is what the phenomenologist Henri Bergson was referring to when he said, “Duration is the stuff out of which conscious existence is made.” Psychological time is the kind of time people usually are thinking of when they ask whether time is just a construct of the mind.

There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of mental awareness, or by the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is often called objective time and scientific time. The scientific image of time is the product of science’s attempt to understand physical time.

When a physicist defines speed to be distance traveled divided by the duration (or, more accurately, the rate of change of position with respect to time), the term time in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science; but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena.

Psychological time and biological time are explored in more detail in Section 17.

3. What Time Really Is

Suppose in some time zone our standard clock says the time is 7:00. Here, “7:00” is a mathematical object, but 7:00 is not. Times are not mathematical objects, but time coordinates are.

Sometimes, when we ask what time really is, we are asking for the meaning of the word. A first step in that direction might be to clarify the difference between its meaning and its reference. The temporal word now changes its reference every instant but not its meaning. The term time has several meanings. It can mean the duration between events, as when we say the trip from home to work took too much time because of all the traffic. It can mean, instead, the temporal location of an event, as when we say he arrived at the time they specified. It also can mean the temporal structure of the universe, as when we speak of investigating time rather than space. This article uses the word in all these senses.

Ordinary Language philosophers have carefully studied time talk. This is what Ludwig Wittgenstein called the language game of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953, “For a large class of cases—though not for all—in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined this way: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.” Perhaps an examination of all the uses of the word time would lead us to the meaning of the word. Someone, following the lead of Wittgenstein, might also say we would then be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions about time. That methodology of dissolving a problem was promoted by Wittgenstein in response to many other philosophical questions.

However, most philosophers of time in the twenty-first century are not interested in dissolving the problems about time nor in precisely defining the word time but rather are interested in what time’s important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. When Newton discovered that both the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the Moon were caused by gravity, this was not a discovery about the meaning of the word gravity, but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want some advances like this for time?

To emphasize this idea, notice that a metaphysician who asks, “What is a ghost?” already knows the meaning in ordinary language of the word ghost, and does not usually want a precise definition of ghost but rather wants to know what ghosts are, something that is provided by having a more-detailed theory of ghosts. This theory ideally would provide the following things: a consistent characterization of the most important features of ghosts, a claim regarding whether they do or do not exist and how they might be reliably detected if they do exist, what principles or laws describe their behavior, how they typically act, and what they are composed of. This article takes a similar approach to the question, “What is time?” In short, the full nature of physical time can be revealed only by developing a philosophical theory of time that addresses what science has discovered about time plus what should be said about the many philosophical issues that practicing scientists usually do not concern themselves with. In short, the goal of both a philosopher and a scientist is not just to discover the meaning of the word “time” but rather the best concept of time to use in understanding the world.

The exploration ahead adopts a realist perspective on accepted scientific theories. That is, it interprets them to mean what they say, even in their highly theoretical aspects, and it does not take a fictionalist perspective on them, nor treat them as merely useful instruments, nor treat them operationally. It assumes scientific theories can be true and approximately true. All these assumptions have been challenged in some philosophical literature, and if one of the challenges is correct, then some of what is said below will require reinterpretation or rephrasing.

The claim that physical time is what clocks measure is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having clocks. Clocks have regular, periodic behavior. We are lucky to live in a universe with so many different regular, periodic processes that can be used for clocks. However, the claim that time is what clocks are measuring is not without its opponents. Some philosophers of physics claim that there is nothing more to time than whatever numbers are displayed on our clocks. The vast majority of philosophers of physics disagree. They say time is more than those numbers; it is what we intend to measure with those numbers.

This article’s section called “What Science Requires of Time” explores what scientists have claimed to have learned about time. But let us turn in this section to how our question “What is time?” has been answered in different ways throughout the centuries. Aristotle emphasized that the word time is not simply another word for change. He said, “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time….” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. (Einstein’s theory of relativity implies a moving clock can tick faster or slower than another clock, but time itself isn’t faster or slower.) Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12) of things. He never said space is the measure of anything. In developing his conception of time, Aristotle proposed what has come to be called the relational theory of time when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11).

René Descartes answered the question, “What is time?” by claiming that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation (“Third Meditation” in Meditations on First Philosophy, published in 1641). Descartes’ worry is analogous to that of Buddhist logicians who say, “Something must explain how the separate elements of the process of becoming are holding together to produce the illusion of a stable material world.” The Buddhist answer was causality. Descartes probably would have answer that it is God’s actions.

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves. Time and space are, to use his terminology, forms of human sensible intuition. Time is not a property of things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s remarks that time is “the form of inner sense” and that time  “is an a priori condition of all appearance whatsoever” are probably best understood as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only have the ability to experience individual things and events in time.

Kant claimed to know a priori that space obeys the principles of Euclidean geometry. After the discovery of different non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century, and with the implication from Albert Einstein’s general theory of relativity that the geometry of our physical space is non-Euclidean, the Kantian claim that synthetic truths about time are knowable a priori lost a great many of its advocates. In the twenty-first century, some synthetic a priori knowledge is still accepted by certain groups of philosophers. However, considerably more philosophers say we have a priori beliefs (“I should not swallow it if it tastes bad”) but not a priori knowledge.

In the early 20th century, the philosophers Alfred North Whitehead and Martin Heidegger said time is essentially the form of becoming, an idea that excited a great many philosophers but not scientists because the remark seems to give ontological priority to the manifest image of time over the scientific image.

This ends our short list of what some important philosophers have said about time. It is noteworthy that they are all talking about time. Each person is  not changing the subject. They simply have different conceptions from those of other philosophers.

Whatever time is, it is interesting to consider whether time has causal powers. The musician Hector Berlioz said, “Time is a great teacher, but unfortunately it kills all its pupils.” Everyone knows not to take this joke literally because, when you are asleep and then your alarm clock rings at 7:00, it is not the time itself that wakes you. Nevertheless, there are more serious reasons to believe that time has causal powers. In the early twentieth century, the general theory of relativity was developed, confirmed, and discovered to imply that, “spacetime tells matter how to move” (John Wheeler). The time aspect of spacetime is an important contributor to motion. This remark by Wheeler is discussed further in later sections.

There is no consensus among the experts regarding what time really is. There is disagreement on whether time exists, and on whether, if it does exist, it is fundamental or emergent. Perhaps it emerges from our fundamentally unchanging and timeless universe, as the philosopher John Earman and the physicist Carlo Rovelli have argued.

4. Why There Is Time Instead of No Time

The fundamental theories of physical science imply that time exists, but not why it exists. Theologians have a ready answer to the question of why time exists. It is the same answer they give to most any fundamental why question. Among physicists, there is no agreed-upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, or why it contains physical laws instead of no physical laws, or why it contains the fundamental laws that it does contain, or why there is a universe instead of no universe, although there has been interesting speculation on these issues.

Here is one explanation for why time exists. All explanations have assumptions. When steam cools, it suddenly undergoes a phase transition into liquid water. Some cosmologists suspect that the universe contains laws which imply that in a certain situation a phase transition occurs during which four-dimensional space emerges, then after more cooling another phase transition occurs during which one of the four dimensions of primeval space collapses to become a time dimension. The previous sentence is a bit misleading because of its grammar which might suggest that something was happening before time began, but that is a problem with the English language, not with the suggestion about the origin of time. However, one might well ask, “Why those laws instead of laws that do not imply the phase transitions?”  A response to this question might be, “They are the most elegant laws from a human perspective,” but that leads on to the question, “Why is elegance privileged?”

There is a multiverse answer to the question, “Why does time exist?” The reason why our universe exists with time instead of no time is that nearly every kind of universe exists throughout the multiverse; there are universes with time and universes without time. Like all the other universes, our particular universe came into existence by means of a random selection process without a conscious selector, a process in which every physically possible universe is overwhelmingly likely to arise as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards makes it overwhelmingly likely that any specific ordering of the cards will eventually appear. Opponents complain that this anthropic explanation is shallow. To again use the metaphor of a card game, they wish to know why their poker opponent has four aces, and they are not satisfied with the shallow explanation that four aces are inevitable with enough deals or that it is just a random result. Nevertheless, perhaps there is no better explanation.

6. Time and Change (Relationism vs. Substantivalism)

Does physical time necessarily depend on change existing? Classical relationists say yes, and substantivalists say no. Classical substantivalism implies space and time exist always and everywhere regardless of what else exists, and space and time provide a large, invisible, inert container within which matter exists and moves independently of the container. The container provides a rest frame, and motion relative to that frame is real motion, not merely relative motion. Relationism (also called relationalism) implies space and time are not like this. If you take away matter’s motions, you take away time, and if you take way the matter itself, you also take away space.

Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.

Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist always and everywhere independently of physical material and its events.

Relationism is inconsistent with substantivalism. Substantivalism implies there can be empty time, time without the existence of physical events. Relationism does not allow empty time. It says time requires change. That is, necessarily, if time exists, then change exists.

Everyone agrees that clocks do not function without change, and time cannot be measured without there being changes, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. Can we solve this issue by testing? Could we, for instance, turn off all changes and then look to see whether time still exists? No, the issue has to be approached more indirectly.

Relationists and substantivalists can agree that perhaps as a matter of fact change is pervasive and so is time. Their disagreement is whether time exists even if, perhaps contrary to fact, nothing is changing.

This question of whether time requires change is not the question of whether change requires time, nor is it the question of whether time is fundamental or elementary. To make progress on the key question, more clarity is needed regarding the word change. The meaning of the word is philosophically controversial. It is used here in the sense of ordinary change—an object changing its ordinary properties over time. A leaf changes its location if it drops off a branch and lands on the ground. This ordinary change is very different from the following three extraordinary kinds of change. (1) The leaf changes by being no longer admired by Donald. (2) The leaf changes by moving farther into the past. (3) The leaf changes across space from being brown at its base to green at its tip, all at one time. So, a reader needs always to be alert about whether the word change means ordinary change or one of these three extraordinary kinds of change.

There is a fourth kind of change that also is not ordinary. Consider what the ordinary word properties means when we say an object changes its properties over time. The word properties is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if, during the time that it exists, it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We naturally would react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is odd, not an ordinary change in the chlorophyll.

Classical substantival theories are also called absolute theories. The term absolute here means to exist without dependence on anything except perhaps God. The relationist believes time’s existence depends upon material events.

Centuries ago, the manifest image of time was relationist, but due to the influence of Isaac Newton upon the teaching of science in subsequent centuries and then this influencing the average person who is not a scientist, the manifest image has become substantivalist.

a. History of the Debate up to Kant

The first proponents of a relational theory was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, Book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). Aristotle’s position is a predecessor to Leibniz’s relationism. Opposing relationism, the ancient Greek atomists were a predecessor to Newton on this topic. Democritus spoke of there being an existing space within which matter’s atoms move, implying space is substance-like rather than relational.

The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were drawn more clearly in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for relationism and Newton argued against it. Leibniz claimed that space is a network of objects. It is nothing but the “order of co-existing things,” so without objects there is no space. “I hold space to be something merely relative, as time is; that I hold it to be an order of coexistences, as time is an order of successions.” Leibniz would say time is abstracted from changes of things, namely events, with the paradigm kind of change being motion. Expressed more technically, we can say Leibniz’s relational world is one in which spatial relationships are ontologically prior to space itself, and relationships among changes (or events) are ontologically prior to time itself. Aristotle would have found himself within the relationist camp because he would say time is the measure of change, so of course time requires change.

Opposing Leibniz, Newton returned to a Democritus-like view of space as existing independently of material things; and he similarly accepted a substantival theory of time, with time being independent of all motions and other changes or events. Newton’s actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.

In 1670 in his Lectiones Geometricae, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected any necessary linkage between time and change. He said, “Whether things run or stand still, whether we sleep or wake, time flows in its even tenor.” Barrow also said time existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. In his unpublished manuscript De gravitatione, written while he was composing Principia, he said, “we cannot think that space does not exist just as we cannot think there is no duration” (Newton 1962, p. 26). This suggests that he believed time exists necessarily.

Newton believed time is not a primary substance, but is like a primary substance in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant of pre-existing time at which to create the physical world. From these initial conditions, including the forces acting on the material objects, the timeless scientific laws took over and guided the material objects, with God intervening only occasionally to perform miracles. If it were not for God’s intervention, one might properly think of the future as a logical consequence of the present.

Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton’s substantival or absolute time because it is undetectable, which he believed made the concept incoherent. Leibniz argued that time should be understood not as an entity existing independently of actual, detectable events. He complained that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events, the “successive order of things,” such as one event happening two seconds after another or four weeks before another. This is why time needs events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. He proposed this relationism and rejected Newton’s substantivalism (also called absolutism). It is clear that Leibniz and Newton had very different answers to the question, “Given some event, what does it mean to say it occurs at a specific time?” Newton would says events occur at some absolute time that is independent of what other events occur, but Leibniz would say we can properly speak only about the event occurring before or after or simultaneous with some other events, and that is what it means to occur at a specific time. Leibniz and Newton had a similar disagreement about space. Newton believed objects had absolute locations that need not reference other objects’ locations, but Leibniz believed objects can be located only via spatial relations between other material objects—by an object being located above or below or three feet from another object.

One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory of absolute space and absolute time is that it violates Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really identical; they are just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that if God had shifted the entire world some distance east and its history some minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world. Leibniz. Leibniz claimed claimed there would be no discernible difference in the two, so there would be just one world here, not two, and so Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty.

Regarding Leibniz’s complaint using the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, Newton suggested the principle is correct but God is able to discern differences in absolute time or space that mere mortals cannot.

Leibniz offered another criticism. Newton’s theory violates Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is a sufficient reason why any aspect of the universe is the way it is and not some other way. Leibniz complained that, since everything happens for a reason, if God shifted the world in time or space but made no other changes, then He surely would have no reason to do so.

Newton responded that Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason but is incorrect to suppose there is a sufficient reason knowable to humans. God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given absolute place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reason.

Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response to Leibniz was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree that if Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate.

However, Newton found a much better argument. He suggested a thought experiment in which a bucket’s handle is tied to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Do not let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, the bucket is spinning, and there is a concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.

How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water’s surface in the two situations? It cannot, said Newton. Here is his argument. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of their water surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the change in shape. Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory could not be used to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and so space itself must be exerting a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force pushing away from the center of the bucket is called centrifugal force, and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.

Because Leibniz had no counter to this thought experiment, for over two centuries Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. Consider two nearly identical gloves except that one is right-handed and the other is left-handed. In a world containing only a right-hand glove, said Kant, Leibniz’s theory could not account for its handedness because all the internal relationships among parts of the glove would be the same as in a world containing only a left-hand glove. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a space itself, then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This indirectly suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though Christiaan Huygens (in the 17th century) and George Berkeley (in the 18th century) had argued in favor of Leibniz. See (Huggett 1999) and (Arthur 2014) for a clear and more detailed discussion of the opposing positions of Leibniz and Newton on the nature of time.

During all this time, it was assumed without much thought that space had a Euclidean geometry.

b. History of the Debate after Kant

Newton and subsequent substantivalists hoped to find a reference for defining motion without having to appeal to the existence and location of ordinary material objects. In the late 19th century, physicists believed in time without change. They not only believed in Newton’s absolute space and time, but also had a favorite candidate for absolute space, Maxwell’s luminiferous aether. Maxwell had discovered that light is an electromagnetic wave. Since all known waves required a medium to wave, all physicists and philosophers of science believed Maxwell at the time when he said the aether was needed as a medium for the propagation of electromagnetic waves and also said that it did exist even if it had never been directly detected. Yet this was Maxwell’s intuition speaking; his own equations did not require a medium for the propagation.

In the nineteenth century, physicists assumed the earth was rushing through the aether, thereby creating a continual aether wind. Near the end of the century, the physicist A. A. Michelson and his chemist colleague Edward Morley set out to experimentally detect the wind, and thus the aether. Their interferometer experiment was very sensitive, but somehow it failed to detect it. Some physicists, including Michelson himself, believed the problem was that he needed a better experimental apparatus. Other physicists believed that the aether was somehow corrupting the apparatus. Most others, however, believed the physicist A. J. Fresnel who said the Earth is dragging the aether with it, so the Earth’s nearby aether is moving in concert with the Earth itself. If so, this would make the aether undetectable by the Michelson-Morley experimental apparatus, as long as the apparatus was used on Earth and not in outer space. No significant physicist said there was no aether to be detected.

However, these ad hoc rescues of the aether hypothesis did not last long. In 1893, the physicist-philosopher Ernst Mach offered an original argument that attacked Newton’s bucket argument, promoted relationism and did not assume the existence of absolute space, an aether. Mach said Newton’s error was not considering the presence or absence of stars or, more specifically, the combined gravitational influence of all the matter throughout space.

If a female  ballet dancer were to pirouette in otherwise empty space, then would her arms would splay out from her body? And if we were to spin Newton’s bucket in otherwise empty space, then would friction eventually cause the surface of the water to become concave? Leibniz would answer “no.” Newton would answer “yes.” Mach would say the question makes no sense because the very notion of spin must be spin relative to some object. Mach would add that, if the distant stars were retained, then there would be spin relative to them, and he would change his answer to “yes.” Newton believed the presence or absence of the distant stars is irrelevant. Unfortunately, Mach did not provide any detailed specification of how the distant stars exerted their influence on Newton’s bucket, and he had no suggestion for an experiment to test his answer, so most physicists were not convinced by Mach’s reasoning.

However, a young physicist named Albert Einstein was intrigued by Mach’s remarks. He at first thought Mach was correct, and even wrote him a letter saying so, but he eventually rejected Mach’s position and took a third position.

In 1905, Einstein proposed his special theory of relativity that does not require the existence of either Newton’s aether or Maxwell’s aether. Ten years later he added a description of gravity and produced his general theory of relativity, which had the same implication. The theory was immediately understood by the leading physicists, and when experimentally confirmed, it caused the physics and philosophy communities to abandon classical substantivalism. The tide quickly turned against what Newton had said in his Principia, namely that “Time exists in and of itself and flows equably without reference to anything external.”

Waxing philosophical in The New York Times newspaper on December 3, 1919, Einstein declared his general relativity theory to be a victory for relationism:

Till now it was believed that time and space existed by themselves, even if there was nothing—no Sun, no Earth, no stars—while now we know that time and space are not the vessel for the Universe, but could not exist at all if there were no contents, namely, no Sun, no Earth, and other celestial bodies.

Those remarks make Einstein sound like pro-relation remarks, but those of a non-Leibnizian and non-Machian relationist. However, in his Nobel Prize acceptance speech on December 10, 1922, Einstein backtracked on this and said time and space could continue to exist without the Sun, Earth, and other celestial bodies. He claimed that, although relativity theory does rule out Maxwell’s aether and Newton’s absolute space, it does not rule out some other underlying substance that is pervasive. All that is required is that if such a substance exists, then it must obey the principles of relativity. Soon he was saying this substance is space-time itselfa field whose intrinsic curvature is what we call gravitational force. With this position he is a non-Newtonian, non-Maxwellian substantivalist. But Einstein also suggested that spacetime, “does not claim an existence of its own, but only as a structural quality of the [gravitational] field.” So, during pirouetting in empty space, your arms would splay out because there would be spin relative to spacetime. There are solutions to general relativity without mass at all in a closed universe but in which there is a difference between rotating and not rotating

In the 20th century, it had become clear that particles and forces are not fundamental; fields are. Physicists, and especially those philosophers who were influenced by logical positivism, once worried that perhaps Einstein’s gravitation field, and all other fields, are merely computational devices without independent reality. However, ever since the demise of logical positivism and the development and confirmation of quantum electrodynamics in the late twentieth century, fields have been considered to be real by both physicists and philosophers. Because quantum theory implies a field does not go away even if the field’s values reach a minimum everywhere, the gravitational field is considered to be substance-like, but it is a substance that usually changes with the distribution of matter-energy throughout the universe, so it is very unlike Newton’s absolute space or Maxwell’s aether. John Earman and John Norton have called this position (of promoting the substance-like character of the gravitational field) manifold substantivalism. In response, Tim Maudlin said: “The question is: Why should any serious substantivalist settle on manifold substantivalism? What would recommend that view? Prima facie it seems like a peculiar position to hold” because the manifold has no spatiotemporal structure. (Maudlin 1988, p. 87).

Opposing both relationism and substantivalism, some philosophers of physics say spacetime is not literally something that exists outside of the mathematics in the real world. Spacetime is merely a mathematical artifact, a useful device for organizing relations among events. This is a serious claim that spacetime itself is not a constituent of physical reality

Since the late twentieth century, philosophers have continued to create new arguments for and against substantivalism, but many other scientists and philosophers have suggested that the rise of quantum theory and quantum electrodynamics have so changed the concepts in the Newton-Leibniz debate—such as what it means for space to be empty and time to be empty and what counts as a material object—that the old issue cannot be settled either way.

There is a related question: If time does require change, what sort of change is required? For example, would time exist in a universe that does change but does not change in enough of a regular manner to have a clock? Those who answer “yes,” are quick to point out that there is a difference between not being able to measure some entity and that entity not existing. Those who answer “no,” say that if an entity cannot be measured then the very concept of it is meaningless—although not that it must be meaningless, as a Logical Positivist would declare, but only that it is as a matter of fact meaningless. The latter position is defended by Max Tegmark in (Tegmark 2017).

For additional discussion of substantivalism and relationism, see (Dainton 2010, chapter 21).

5. What Science Requires of Time

Time has been studied for 2,500 years, but only in the early twentieth-century did time become one of the principal topics in professional journals of physics, and soon after in the journals of philosophy of science.

Time has been treated differently in different scientific theories over the centuries, and its treatment continues to change. When this article speaks of the scientific image of time or what science requires of time it means time of the latest theories. Newton’s concept of time is fine for applications where speed is slow, where there are no significant changes of gravitational forces, and where durations are very large compared to the Planck time.

When scientists use the concept of time, they adopt positions that metaphysicians call metaphysical. They suppose there is a mind-independent universe in which we all live and to which their fundamental theories apply. Physical scientists tend to be physicalists, and they would agree with the spirit of W.V.O. Quine’s remark that, “Nothing happens in the world … without some redistribution of microphysical states” (Quine 1981, 98). This physicalist position can be re-expressed as the thesis that all the facts about any subject matter such as geophysics or farming are fixed by the totality of microphysical facts about the universe. Philosophers sometimes express this claim by saying all facts supervene on microphysical facts. Philosophers are especially interested in whether the human mind might be special and be a counterexample  to this physicalist claim. So far, however, no scientific experiments or observations have shown clearly that the answer to the metaphysical question, “Does mind emerge from matter?” is negative. Scientific observations in physical science never seem to need us to control for what the observer is thinking.

Scientific theories of nature are groups of laws of nature. All current laws of physics have one format: Given the way things are at some time, here is how they will evolve in time.  Notice the crucial role of time, but not of space. The laws do not say, given the way things are here now, then this is the way things are at a second place. Also, the laws do not mention how things got to be the way they are at that first time.

In the manifest image, the universe is more fundamentally made of objects rather than events. In the scientific image, the universe is more fundamentally made of events than objects. Physicists use the term “event” in two ways, and usually only the context suggests which sense is intended. There is sense 1 that has been used in this article until now: something happens at a place for a certain amount of time. In sense 2, an event is simply a point location in space and time, with no requirement that anything happen there then. In this sense, a coordinate system that spans space and time assigns numerical names to all events. In either of these two senses, it is assumed that longer events are composed of shorter events which in turn are composed of instantaneous events—another metaphysical presupposition. Sense 2 is what Albert Einstein had in mind when he said the world of events forms a four-dimensional continuum.

Mathematical physicists customarily apply a reference frame or coordinate system to spacetime in order to specify events quantitatively with temporal locations (that is, times) and spatial locations (places).  Relativity theory implies there are an infinite number of legitimate reference frames. No one of these frames is distinguished or absolute in Isaac Newton’s sense of specifying where something “really” is, independently of all other objects and events.

The fundamental theories of physics are relativity theory, quantum theory including the standard model of particle physics, and the big bang theory. The collection of these is called the Core Theory.

The word theory here is not meant in the sense of an informed guess. These theories have survived a great many tests, so the scientific community trusts their implications about time. Here is a numbered list of their most significant implications about time.

(1) When you look at distant objects, you see them as they were, not as they are.

Because the speed of light is not infinite and because it takes time for the brain to process information that it receives from the eyes, the information you obtain by looking at an object is information about how it was, not how it is. The more distant the object, the farther back in time is the object’s information that you receive. Click for a picture of this.

(2) The duration of the past is at least 13.8 billion years.

The big bang theory requires that the past extends back at least 13.8 billion years ago to when the big bang explosion occurred. This number is found primarily from imagining the current expansion of the universe to be reversed in time and noting when the galaxies became close together.

There is a privileged reference frame in astronomy. It is the frame in which cosmic time is measured. This is the unique frame used when cosmologists say that the big bang began 13.8 billion years ago or that the universe turned transparent 380,000 years after that. That frame is described in more detail in the companion article’s analysis of the big bang. The frame has an origin where the average motion of all the universe’s galaxies is stationary. If a clock were fixed at the spatial origin, then it would be motionless while the universe expands around it. At the origin the universe (at the cosmic scale) looks like it has nearly the same average temperature in all directions. This origin point, as judged from Earth, is traveling about 350 km/s toward the constellation of Pisces and away from Leo. This is a unique, privileged reference frame for astronomical convenience, but there is no reason to suppose it is otherwise privileged. It is not the frame sought by the A-theorist who believes in a unique present, nor by Isaac Newton who believed in absolute rest, nor by James Clerk Maxwell who believed in the aether.

Relativity theory has had the biggest impact upon our understanding of time. It implies:

(3) Time travel is possible.

Time travel to someone else’s future is much easier than to your own past. This feature is a consequence of the theory of relativity, and it is discussed in its own section.

(4) Duration is relative.

Sometimes it is helpful to think of spacetime as if it were the arena where events occur. Relativity theory implies this arena can be sliced up differently into a time part and a space part by choosing a different reference frame. This makes durations relative to which slice is chosen.

Here is an example of two ways to do the slicing, one in which you are standing still, and one in which you are moving at nearly the speed of light. Consider the event of your standing still in Berlin and slowly raising your right arm. Suppose a perfectly functioning, stationary clock there is used to measure that it took one second to raise your arm.  If the same event is measured by a perfectly functioning clock in a spaceship travelling past Berlin at nearly the speed of light, it might take a hundred years for you to raise your arm. Both durations can be correct—a shocking result to our manifest image of time.

Because duration is relative, the conclusion is drawn that:

(5) Time is not an objectively real feature of the universe.

According to the theory of relativity, the duration of an event is different in different reference frames. Scientists assume that what is objectively real must not be dependent upon someone’s choice of reference frame (coordinate system), so the implication is that time is not objectively real. To some philosophers this implication casts doubt upon either the theory of relativity itself or the importance of frame-independence.

Time is not objectively real, but spacetime is. That is, duration is not objectively real, nor is distance, but the spacetime interval is. According to relativity theory, for any two point-events, the spacetime interval between them is frame independent. This interval is the quantitative measure of the separation in spacetime between two events. The interval is the same no matter what reference frame is used in computing the value of the interval. The term spacetime interval is not synonymous with the term interval in the phrase time interval. For example, some spacetime intervals are imaginary numbers.

(6) Simultaneity is relative; that is, for many pairs of events, whether the two events occur simultaneously is a conventional feature of nature.

Changing reference frames for spacetime can make two distant, simultaneous events no longer be simultaneous. The relativity of simultaneity is discussed in more detail in section 9 on conventional  aspects of time, but the key idea is that, if one of the two events in a pair is in the other’s past light cone (its so-called absolute past), then no choice of reference frame will make it be simultaneous with the other event.

(7) Within a single reference frame, time “fixes” (i) when each event occurs, (ii) what any event’s duration is, (iii) what other events occur simultaneously with it, and (iv) which one happens first.

In that sense, time provides significant structure to the set of events. But one of the consequences is that there is no uniquely correct answer to the question, for some distant place, “What is happening now at that place?

(8) Time is one-dimensional.

Time is represented as one-dimensional in all the fundamental theories of physics. This is so even if space is nine or ten-dimensional according to string theory or space is two-dimensional according to the holographic principle. Remember though, that a circle also is one-dimensional. Two-dimensional time has been studied by mathematical physicists, but no theories implying that time has more than one dimension in our universe have acquired a significant number of supporters. Time would be multi-dimensional across the multiverse if our universe branched into many universes at each instant.

(9)  Time is smooth like a line.

Time is smooth, continuous, and free of gaps, like a mathematical line. This feature was first emphasized by the philosopher John Locke, but it is meant here in a more detailed, technical sense that was developed toward the end of the 19th century for calculus.

continuous vs discrete

According to relativity theory and quantum mechanics, time is not discrete or quantized or atomistic, with every event having a next event. Instead, the structure of point-times is a linear continuum with the same structure as the mathematical line or as the real numbers in their natural order. For any point of time, there is no next time because the times are packed together so tightly. Time’s being a continuum implies that there is a non-denumerably infinite number of point-times between any two non-simultaneous point-times. Some philosophers of science have objected that this number is too large, and we should use Aristotle’s notion of potential infinity and not the late 19th century notion of a completed infinity. Nevertheless, accepting the notion of an actual nondenumerable infinity is the key idea used to solve Zeno’s Paradoxes and to remove inconsistencies in calculus.

The fundamental laws of physics assume the universe is a collection of point events that form a four-dimensional continuum, and the laws tell us what happens after something else happens. These laws describe change but do not themselves change. At least that is what laws are in the first quarter of the 21st century, but one cannot know a priori that this is always how laws must be.

In contemporary theories of physics, time is assumed to have the same exotic structure as the mathematical line in that it consists of a continuum of temporal points. No experiment is so fine-grained that it could show times to be that close together, although there are possible experiments that would show the assumption to be false if it were false and if the graininess of time were to be large enough.

In the 21st century, one of the most important goals in physics is to discover/invent a theory of quantum gravity that unites the best parts of quantum theory and the theory of relativity. Einstein claimed in 1916 that his general theory of relativity needed to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A great many physicists of the 21st century believe a successful theory of quantum gravity will require quantizing time so that there are atoms of time.

If there is such a thing as an atom of time and thus such a thing as a next instant and a previous instant, then time cannot be like the real number line, because no real number has a next number. It is speculated that if time were discrete, the best estimate for the duration of an atom of time is 10-43 seconds, the so-called Planck time. No physicist can yet suggest a practical experiment that is sensitive to this tiny scale of phenomena. For more discussion, see (Tegmark 2017).

(10) Time can dilate.

As judged by a stationary clock, moving clocks tick slower and so their rate of ticking is “stretched” or “dilated” compared to that of the stationary clock. For example,  if you board a rocket ship and speed away from your twin who stays at home on earth, when the two of you re-unite you will be the younger twin. You will have moved into your twin’s future and your civilization’s future. The effect is trivial for speeds low compared to light speed. Click to view a picture of the ticking of the two clocks.  This effect of speed is called time dilation. It is always the other, moving person whose time slows down, not one’s own. One’s own time always marches on normally at one second per second, so to speak. It is common in popular literature to speak of time itself slowing down for someone else who speeds up relative to you. Time dilation occurs no matter whether the moving clock is speeding away from you or toward you or circling you or vibrating in place.

(11) Duration is relative.

A similar consequence of relativity theory is that two correct clocks with different velocities will disagree on the duration of an event such as how long your lunch lasted yesterday. Newton would have been shocked by this consequence of relativity theory because he said, “The duration…or perseverance of the existence of things remains the same, whether the motions are swift or slow, or none at all.” About this Newtonian conception, Einstein and Infeld said, “In classical physics it was always assumed that clocks in motion and at rest have the same rhythm…[but] if the relativity theory is valid, then we must sacrifice this assumption. It is difficult to get rid of deep-rooted prejudices, but there is no other way.”

(12) Clocks disagree if they are affected differently by gravity. 

There is a second kind of time dilation that is implied by general relativity. It depends on there being different gravitational forces in different places. Your sea level clock feels more gravitational force than clocks at higher altitudes, and your clock lags behind a clock at the top of Mount Everest by about 30 microseconds every year.  The longer you fly your spaceship near a black hole, the more your clock slows compared to Earth clocks, and the effect is not so trivial as it is with the Mount Everest clock.

(13) Our proper time is not standard time.

How much time that has occurred between two events is not a simple matter. All entities in the universe march to their own drummer, so to speak. Each has its own time, its so-called proper time. Every clock measures its own proper time, the time along its own path in spacetime. Think of any object’s proper time as its personal time, the time that would be shown on an ideal, small, massless, correct clock that always travels with the object and has no physical effect upon the object. The object itself need have no internal clock or regular process that can actually record its proper time. Your own proper time is not the time shown on your cell phone that travels with you; that phone is reporting the standard time of our civilization’s standard clock, namely the standard clock’s own proper time.

Everybody can agree on what time it is only because of the convention that we do not trust our own proper time, but trust only the proper time of our civilization’s standard atomic clock in Paris, the master clock. Coordinate time is time along the time axis of a chosen reference frame, and it is the proper time of an object fixed at the origin of the frame. People on Earth do not notice that they have different times from other people because the time dilation effect is so small for them.

One other philosophically interesting implication of time dilation is that in your lifetime you have enough proper time to visit the far side of our galaxy and then return to report on it to your ancestors a great number of generations from now. As your spaceship approaches the speed of light, you can cross the galaxy in hardly any proper time at all, according to your clock that travels with you, even though someone using the standard Earth-based clock must judge that it took you over 100,000 years to cross the galaxy one-way. Both time judgments would be correct. That is, it is correct to say, “You crossed the galaxy in almost no time at all and also in 100,000 years,” but your remark is ambiguous because two different clocks are doing the measuring.

(14) Spacetime curves.

According to general relativity, all forms of energy exert gravity, and gravity causes spacetime to curve. Alternatively, one can say gravitation is itself the curvature of spacetime. This curvature is observed by detecting time dilation and space contraction. Saying “space curves” does expand the meaning of the word “curve,” and saying “spacetime curves” expands it even more because the word “curve” normally indicates a change of spatial direction, as when the hiking path curves to the right or the shape of an apple is curved and not flat.

Special relativity uses the word “curve” in its ordinary sense. It allows physical objects to be curved and to move in curved paths in space, and it allows this curvature to change over time, but it does not allow curvature of space or spacetime. According to general relativity though, they both can curve. Gauss, Lobachevsky and Bolyai first suggested that physical space could curve, and Einstein first suggested that spacetime could curve.

Does time curve? It is not common to say time curves when spacetime curves, but it is common to say time is circular if someone’s worldline is a closed loop within spacetime, that is, if someone travels back in time to an event earlier in their life.

(15) All the laws of mathematical physics have symmetry under time-translation.

This means the laws do not change as time goes by. Your health might be very different as time goes by, but the laws about your health that hold at one time are the same as those that hold at any other time. This translation symmetry property of time is called its homogeneity. It expresses the equivalence of all instants. Instants are the so-called points of time. Another way of expressing time-translation symmetry is to say that replacing the time variable t everywhere in a law by t + 4 or instead t – 4 does not change what processes are allowed by the law. The choice of “4” was an arbitrary choice of a real number, positive or negative. Requiring the laws of physics to be time-translation symmetric was proposed by Isaac Newton. Physicists do not know a priori that laws must have this symmetry, but the assumption fits all the known evidence. The reason time-translation symmetry is not an analytic principle is that a remarkable theorem by Emmy Noether in 1915 establishes that time-translation symmetry implies the principle of conservation of energy, and the latter principle has withstood severe empirical tests that could have falsified it. But there is a problem at the ultramicroscopic scale where there have been no tests. Due to the creation of virtual particles, it follows from quantum field theory that the principle of conservation of energy is violated for extremely short durations on the order of the Planck time which is about 10-44 seconds.

(16) All the most fundamental physical laws have symmetry under time-reversal.

The exception is a law describing the decay of some rare particles. The point about time-reversal symmetry can be expressed by saying that if you make a film of any process allowed by the fundamental physical laws, such as the process of making an omelet, and then show the film in reverse, what is now shown is also a process allowed by the laws. Even though this reversed process is allowed, if  the process involves many particles, then the reversed process is extremely unlikely to occur spontaneously and is very difficult to force to occur.

(17) If negative energy does not balance positive energy, the past and future of the universe are infinite.

Physicists concur on this, assuming the law of conservation of energy holds for long time intervals. However, they do not agree on whether there is or is not an overall balance between positive and negative energy, although a majority tentatively favor imbalance. The law of conservation of energy in physics implies it is physically impossible to create energy out of no energy. Therefore, if the universe has a total non-zero energy, it has always had it and always will have it, so there can be no first instant or last instant. The energy of particles at rest (via E = mc2) is positive, as is their additional energy due to their motion. The topic is discussed in more detail in the next section and in a companion article.

(18) Entropy increase requires tomorrow to be different from today.

This is the thermodynamic arrow of time. It is an open question whether the arrow of time is a feature of time itself or only of processes within time, although a majority prefer the latter answer.

For more discussion of what science requires about time, see What Else Science Requires of Time and the article Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations.

7. Is There a Beginning or End to Time?

a. The Beginning

Many theologians are confident that there was a beginning to time, as shown in this argument for a First-Cause:

Whatever begins to exist, has a cause.
The Universe begins to exist.
Therefore, the Universe had a cause.

This version of the cosmological argument is assumed by some philosophers to be an important step in justifying belief in the existence of God, a First-Cause. Critics complain about second premise. There is no agreement among cosmologists that there ever was a beginning to the universe. That is, it is an open question whether the past is finite or infinite because this depends upon whether the universe has some non-zero total energy. If it has, then the past is infinite. One other idea is that, even if time has not always existed but now exists, perhaps there was no beginning time just as there is no beginning number in the series of positive real numbers.

If you look away from the Earth at a star that is, say, ten light years away, you see it as it was ten years ago, not as it is now. If you look at more distant stars or galaxies, you see them as they were even farther in their own past. (Technically, how they are now is outside of our light cone and in our absolute elsewhere. Two events in each other’s absolute elsewhere are causally unrelated and so are not directly detectable.) How then do we ever learn about our own past? We cannot see us from a distance. The cosmologists’ answer is to accept the cosmological principle. It says that as the scale increases, everywhere gets more alike. On the scale where the far-away galaxies in the visible universe are like points of dust floating in a room (about 100 million light years in distance from here), all galaxies and their arrangements and the stuff they are made of are about the same. And the laws of science that hold here also hold there. In addition, every point in our observable universe is the center of its own observable universe, and on a large scale (again about 100 million light years) all these observable universes are more or less alike, even though some places in their observable universe are not even in principle visible from our observable universe. This cosmological principle is crude, but so far there is no reason to believe it is false.

Regarding the beginning of time, many cosmologists believe the classical version of the big bang theory which implies time began about 13.8 billion years ago. This is the t = 0 of cosmic time used by professional cosmologists. The main controversy is whether t = 0 is really the beginning. Your imagining a time before the big bang does not imply there is such a time. The mathematical physicist Stephen Hawking once famously quipped that asking for what happened before the big bang is like asking what is north of the north pole. He later retracted that remark and said it is an open question whether there was a time before the big bang, but he slightly favored a yes answer. Even if yes were to be established as the correct answer, the question would remain as to whether the extent of this prior time is finite or infinite.

The classical big bang theory says there is overall expansion but no overall compression. The big bounce theory denies this. It was the most popular theory among cosmologists in the 1960s. The big bounce theory says the small, expanding volume of the universe 13.8 billion years ago was the effect of a prior multi-billion-year compression that, when the universe became small enough, stopped its compression and began a rapid expansion that we have been calling the big bang. Perhaps there have been repetitions of compression followed by expansion, and perhaps these cycles have been occurring forever and will continue occuring forever.

b. The End

The cosmologists’ favorite scenario for the universe’s destiny implies that all stars burn out, all black holes eventually evaporate and the remaining particles get ever farther from each other, with no end to the dilution and cooling. This scenario, called the big chill or the heat death depends upon assuming the total energy of the universe is not zero, which is a controversial assumption.

Here is a summary of some serious, competing suggestions by twenty-first-century cosmologists about our universe’s future, beginning with the most popular one:

  • Big Chill (Expansion of space at an ever-increasing rate—assuming universe’s total energy is non-zero, and dark energy never disappears, and all black holes eventually evaporate). An infinite future.
  • Big Crunch (Eventually the expansion that is due to dark energy stops somehow, and the universe begins contracting to a very compressed state much like when the Big Bang began. Slow baking of everything in a closed universe). A finite future.
  • Big Bounce (Eternal pattern of Big Bang, then Big Crunch, then Big Bang, then Big Crunch, and so forth). An infinite future.
  • Big Rip (The expansion rate of new dark energy is not a Cosmological Constant but instead is variable and its value increases rapidly toward infinity. As this happens, every complex system is eventually ripped apart—first groups of galaxies, then galaxies, later the planets, then all the molecules, followed by atoms and then quarks, and later the fabric of space itself). A finite future.
  • Big Snap (The fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much). A finite future.
  • Death Bubble (Due to some high energy event in our universe such as the creation of a tiny black hole with a size never created before, our meta-stable Higgs field suddenly changes its value from the current false vacuum value to the more stable true vacuum value. The vacuum decay that this hole creates then expands at the speed of light destroying the current laws of chemistry upon arrival.) A finite future.
  • Reversed Time (Total energy of the universe is zero. There is our era since the big bang and an era before the big bang but in reversed time compared to our era. The reversal point is a point of minimum entropy.) A finite future.

None of these cosmological theories lead to the end of planet Earth before the Sun expands and does the job.

c. Historical Answers

There has been much speculation over the centuries about the extent of the past and the future, although almost all remarks have contained serious ambiguities. For example, regarding the end of time, is this (a) the end of humanity, or (b) the end of life, or (c) the end of the universe that was created by God, but not counting God, or (d) the end of all natural and supernatural change? Intimately related to these questions are two others: (1) Is it being assumed that time exists without change, and (2) what is meant by the term change? With these cautions in mind, here is a brief summary of speculations throughout the centuries about whether time has a beginning or an end.

Regarding the beginning of time, the Greek atomist Lucretius in about 50 B.C.E. said in his poem De Rerum Natura:

For surely the atoms did not hold council, assigning order to each, flexing their keen minds with questions of place and motion and who goes where.

But shuffled and jumbled in many ways, in the course of endless time they are buffeted, driven along chancing upon all motions, combinations.

At last they fall into such an arrangement as would create this universe.

The implication is that time has always existed, but that an organized universe began a finite time ago with a random fluctuation.

Plato and Aristotle, both of whom were opponents of the atomists, agreed with them that the past is infinite or eternal. Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because everything in the world has a prior, efficient cause. In the fifth century, Augustine disagreed with Aristotle and said time itself came into existence by an act of God a finite time ago.

Agreeing with Augustine against Aristotle, Martin Luther estimated the universe to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated that it began in 4,004 B.C.E. In the early seventeenth century, the Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began in 4,004 B.C.E. on Friday, October 28.

Advances in geology eventually refuted the low estimates that the universe was created in about 4,000 B.C.E. For geologists, this date is low even for the date of the creation of the Earth.

A much better estimate for a lower limit on the age of the cosmos comes not from geology but from the big bang theory which implies our universe is at least 13.8 billion years old.

In about 1700, Isaac Newton claimed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that, as Lucretius had also claimed.

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular remark, “God caused the big bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the big bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

For more discussion of the issue of the extent of time, so the companion section Infinite Time.

8. Emergence

Is physical time a fundamental feature of nature—that is, is it basic, elementary, not derivative—or does it emerge at a higher level of description from more basic timeless features? As discussed above, experts are not sure of the answer for spacetime, although a slight majority favor spacetime not being emergent from an underlying non-spatiotemporal substrate, and nearly all members of this majority favor the position that time emerges from spacetime. Those who do favor spacetime being emergent say its dimensionality is emergent as well.

The word “emerge” here is intended to indicate an objective or mind-independent feature of nature, not a psychological feature or a feature of our knowledge. The word emerge has been used in different ways in the literature of philosophy. Regarding whether time emerges, the notion of being emergent does not imply being inexplicable, and it does not imply there is a process occurring over time in which something appears that was not there before the process began, as when an oak tree emerges from an acorn. Emergence is about the level (a.k.a. scale or order or detail) of the description of phenomena. Often information is lost as one moves to higher levels, but the move to a higher level can reveal real patterns and promote understanding of nature. As Sean Carroll explains it:

Emergence in this sense does not refer to events unfolding over time, as when a baby bird emerges from its egg. It’s a way of describing the world that isn’t completely comprehensive, but divides up reality into more manageable chunks…. To say that something is emergent is to say that it’s part of an approximate description of reality that is valid at a certain (usually macroscopic) level, and is to be contrasted with “fundamental” things, which are part of an exact description at the microscopic level….Fundamental versus emergent is one distinction, and real versus not-real is a completely separate one (Carroll 2019, p. 235).

Heat emerges from molecular motion even though no molecule is hot. What makes heat emergent in the sense that time might be emergent is that there can be no change in the heat without a corresponding change in the underlying molecular motion. For another example, we properly and usefully speak of hunger causing a person to visit the supermarket without bothering to consider how the terms cash out in terms  of constituent particles. The claim that causation is weakly emergent was forcefully promoted by Bertrand Russell who is noted for saying causation is “a relic of a bygone age, surviving, like the monarchy, only because it is erroneously supposed to do no harm.” He would say basic laws are best expressed with differential equations and not with the word cause. However, his claim about causation remains a matter of controversy in contemporary philosophical literature. Immanuel Kant had said that the assumption that everything has a cause is a precondition for any rational thought. Russell and Kant are talking about deterministic causes, not stochastic causes—those that do not fully determine their effects.

The point of saying a new concept emerges at a higher level is not simply to imply that lower level information is lost in using higher level concepts. Instead the point of using a higher level concept is to make use of higher level patterns that aren’t easily appreciated by using only lower level concepts. The point is to find especially useful patterns at the higher level to improve describing, explaining, and understanding nature.

Any claim that time emerges should say whether this emergence is weak or strong. Weak emergence is about new features supervening upon more basic features but not existing at that more basic level. (A supervenes on B if changes in A require there to be changes in B. For example, temperature supervenes on molecular motion because the temperature of an object cannot change without there being changes in the object’s molecular motion.) It is rare that a higher level concept is in practice explicitly derived from a lower level concept even if it can be in principle. Strong emergence denies the supervenience and emphasizes the independence of the emergent concept from a lower level. Physicists favor weak emergence over strong emergence.

Which level is fundamental? The answer is relative to the user’s purpose. Biologists and physicists have different purposes. To a biologist, the hunger causing you to visit the supermarket emerges from the fundamental level of cellular activity. But to a physicist, the level of cellular activity is not fundamental but rather emerges from the more fundamental level of elementary particle activity which in turn emerges from fluctuations in elementary quantum fields.

Does time emerge from spacetime? Special relativity definitely implies it does. But in speculations about a theory of quantum gravity, the issue is being re-examined. Some physicists speculate that once there were four dimensions of space and none of time, but that eventually one of the space dimensions disappeared as the time dimension emerged. Other physicists speculate, instead, that time is fundamental, but spacetime is what emerges. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint. While speaking about string theory, which is his favored theory for reconciling the inconsistency between quantum theory and the general theory of relativity, he said.

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

By doomed, Gross means not-fundamental. Perhaps half of all physicists working in the field of quantum gravity in the first quarter of the 21st century suspect that resolving the inconsistency between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing both spacetime and time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate at approximately the scale of the Planck length (about 10-35 meters) and the Planck time (about 10-43 seconds). String theorists suggest that spacetime emerges from a configuration of one-dimensional strings and higher-dimensional branes, but there is no experimental evidence yet to back up this suspicion, nor any agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is. Whatever the substrate is, the relation of this substrate to the spacetime itself cannot be analogous to the relation of a brick to a brick wall because the brick’s having a definite size would violate special relativity’s requirement that any “brick” of time has a size that must change depending upon which reference frame is chosen.

The physicist Carlo Rovelli, a proponent of loop quantum gravity rather than string theory, speculated: “At the fundamental level, the world is a collection of events not ordered in time” (Rovelli 2018a, p. 155). Rovelli is re-imagining the relationship between time and change. Nevertheless, at the macroscopic level, he would say time does exist even though it is not a fundamental feature of reality.

Eliminativism is the theory in ontology that says emergent entities are unreal. If time is emergent, it is not real. Similarly, if pain is emergent, it is not real—and so you have never really felt a pain. The theory is also called strong emergentism. The opposite and more popular position in ontology is anti-eliminativism or weak emergence. It implies that emergent entities are real despite being emergent. The English physicist Julian Barbour is an eliminativist and strong emergentist about time. He said the “universe is static. Nothing happens; there is being but no becoming. The flow of time and motion are illusions” (Barbour 2009, p. 1). He argued that, although there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, nevertheless there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments. Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one reference frame) of all the objects in space. Like a photograph, a moment or configuration contains information about change, but it, itself, does not change. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental, but time is not, and neither is spacetime. In this way, time is removed from the foundations of physics and emerges as some general measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations. For more on Barbour’s position, see (Smolin 2013, pp. 84-88).

Sean Carroll has a different, original idea about time. He is not an eliminativist, but is a weak emergentist who claims in (Carroll 2019) that time and everything else in the universe emerges from the universe’s wave function in a “gravitized quantum theory.” The only fundamental entity in the universe is the wave function. Everything else that is real emerges from the wave function that obeys Schrödinger’s equation. This position gives a physical interpretation of the wave function. Carroll says neither time, space, nor even spacetime is fundamental. These features emerge from the quantum wave function. So, spacetime is merely an approximation to reality.

Another suggestion is that whether time is emergent may not have a unique answer. Perhaps time is relative to a characterization of nature. That is, perhaps there are alternative, but empirically adequate theoretical characterizations of nature, yet time is fundamental in one characterization but emergent in another. This idea is influenced by Quine’s ontological relativity.

For more description of the different, detailed speculations on whether time is among the fundamental constituents of reality, see (Merali 2013) and (Rovelli 2018b).

9. Convention

Time has both conventional and non-conventional features.

For example, the duration of the second is conventional. Our society could have chosen it to be longer or shorter. It is a convention that there are sixty-seconds in a minute rather than sixty-six, that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of twenty-three, and that no week fails to contain a Tuesday.

Here is a non-conventional feature. In a single reference frame, if event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3. No exceptions. This transitivity of the happens-before relation in any reference frame is a general feature of time, not a convention. However, it is as contingent feature, not an essential feature. It is believed because no one has ever seen evidence that transitivity is violated, and there are no reputable theories implying that there should be such evidence.

The issue here is conventional vs. factual, not conventional vs. foolish or impractical. Although the term convention is somewhat vague, conventions are up to us to freely adopt and are not objective features of the external world that we are forced to accept if we seek the truth. Conventions are inventions or artificial features as opposed to being natural or mandatory or factual. It is a fact that the color of normal, healthy leaves is green; this is not conventional or a matter of the custom of language usage. What is conventional here is that the term green means green. Conventions need not be arbitrary; they can be useful or have other pragmatic virtues. Nevertheless, if a feature is conventional, then there must in some sense be reasonable alternative conventions that could have been adopted. Also, conventions can be explicit or implicit. For one last caution, conventions can become recognized as having been facts. The assumption that matter is composed of atoms was a useful convention in late 19th century physics; but, after Einstein’s explanation of Brownian motion in terms of atoms, the convention was generally recognized by physicists as having been a fact all along.

Time in physics is measured with real numbers (decimal numbers) rather than imaginary numbers (such as the square root of negative one). Does this reveal a deep feature of time? No, it is simply a convention.

It is a useful convention that, in order to keep future midnights from occurring during the daylight, clocks are re-set by one hour as one moves across a time-zone on the Earth’s surface—and that is also why leap days and leap seconds are used. The minor adjustments with leap seconds are required because the Earth’s rotations and revolutions are not exactly regular. For political and social reasons, time zones do not always have longitudes for boundaries. For similar reasons, some geographical regions use daylight savings time instead of standard time.

Consider the ordinary way a clock is used to measure how long a nearby event lasts. We adopt the following metric, or method: Take the time at which the event ends, and subtract the time at which it starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at the next 5:00, take the absolute value of the difference between the two numbers and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock could and should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time metrically amorphous? Philosophers of physics do not agree on this. Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be:


instead of the ordinary:

|y – x|.

A virtue of both metrics is that duration cannot be negative. The trouble with the log metric is that, for any three point events x, y, and z, if t(x) < t(y) < t(z), then it is normal to demand that the duration from x to y plus the duration from y to z be equal to the duration from x to z. However, the log metric does not have this property. The philosophical issue is whether it must have this property for any reason other than convenience.

Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? Yes. In fact, when Westerners talk about past centuries, they agree to use both A.D. and B.C.E. A clock measuring B.C.E. periods would count toward lower numbers. The laws of physics involving time t are unchanged regardless of whether the t is measured in B.C.E. years or A.D. years. The clock on today’s wall always counts up, but that is merely because it is agreed we are in the A.D. era, so there is no need for a clock to count in B.C.E. time. The choice of the origin of the time coordinate is conventional, too. It might be a Muhammad event or a Jesus event or a Temple event or the big bang event.

It is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is even capable of having a standard clock that measures both electromagnetic events and gravitational events and that electromagnetic time stays in synchrony with gravitational time.

It is a fact and not a convention that our universe contains a wide variety of phenomena that are sufficiently regular in their ticking to serve as clocks. They are sufficiently regular because they tick in adequate synchrony with the standard clock. The word adequate here means successful for the purposes we have for using a clock, for example for measuring lifetimes of mountain ranges or, by using a very different kind of clock, for measuring the very brief duration of a photon interacting with another photon.

Relativity theory and quantum theory imply time is continuous. So, physicists regularly use the concept of a point of continuous time. They might say some event happened the square root of three seconds after another event. Physicists usually uncritically accept a point of time as being real, but philosophers of physics disagree with each other about whether the points of time are real or merely a useful convention. Is time’s being a continuum in, say quantum mechanics, a fact or just a convention that should be eliminated in a better treatment of time? Experts disagree.

Our society’s standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? “Yes,” say the objectivists about the standard clock. “No,” say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate only by convention; if it acts strangely, then all other clocks must act equally strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. For an example of strangeness, suppose our standard clock used the periodic rotations of the Earth relative to the background stars. In that case, if a comet struck Earth and affected the rotational speed of the Earth (as judged by, say, a pendulum clock), then we would be forced to say the rotation speed of the Earth did not really change but rather the other periodic clock-like phenomena such as swinging pendulums and quartz crystal oscillations all changed in unison because of the comet strike. The comet “broke” those clocks. That would be a strange conclusion to draw, and in fact, for just this reason, 21st century physicists have rejected any standard clock that is based on Earth rotations and have chosen a newer standard clock that is based on atomic phenomena. Atomic phenomena are unaffected by comet strikes.

A good choice of a standard clock makes the application of physics much simpler. A closely related philosophical question about the choice of the standard clock is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we can be making a choice that is closer to being correct. For more on this point, see this article’s Supplement.

The special theory of relativity is widely believed to imply that the notion of now or the present is conventional in the following sense. Here is a two-dimensional Minkowski diagram of space and time displaying this feature:

pic of absolute elsewhere

The light cone of your future is the region above the gray area; the past line cone is the region below the gray area. The diagonal straight lines are the worldlines of light rays reaching and leaving you here now. The gray areas of this block universe represent all the events that could be classified either way, as future events or as past events, depending on someone’s choice of what line will be the line of your present. The gray areas represent all the events that could neither cause, nor be caused by, your being here now. The more technical way of saying this is that the gray area is all events that are spacelike for you. The diagram is objective in the sense that the light cones are not frame relative. This structure of space-time holds not just for you; there is a similar diagram for any other person or any other object. Every actual or possible point-event, has its own unique pair of light cones.

The gray region of spacelike events is called the extended present because, if you were defining an x-axis of this diagram in order to represent your present events, then you would have a great latitude of choice. Special relativity implies you may choose any straight line that goes through your present event and that stays within the gray region. Suppose two point-events represented as a and b in the diagram occur in the Andromeda Galaxy. That galaxy is 2,000,000 light-years away from you, assuming you are now on Earth. Even though event b were to occur two million years after a, you (or whomever is in charge of setting up the axes of the coordinate system you are using) are free to choose either event as happening now in that galaxy, and you also are free to choose any intermediate event there. But you are not free to choose an event in a white area because that would violate relativity theory’s requirements about causality. So, there is no fact of the matter as to what is happening at present in the Andromeda Galaxy. More generally, there is no fact of the matter as to what is happening at present, except in an infinitesimally-sized region that includes your here and now event. Very distant events are always used in examples because the effect is more easily represented than with events that are nearby to each other.

The above discussion about time-order is often expressed more succinctly by physicists by saying the time-order of space-like events is not absolute. Even more succinctly, they will say the discussion is about the relativity of simultaneity.

Well, perhaps this point should be made more cautiously by saying that special relativity implies the relativity of simultaneity for non-local events. Some philosophers believe there is a fact of the matter, a unique present, even if Special Relativity does not recognize the fact.

The conventionality of simultaneity is not the same thing as the relativity of simultaneity. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken about the conventionality of simultaneity. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For additional discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

Additional conventional and non-conventional features of time are discussed in the supplement What Else Science Requires of Time.

10. Arguments That Time Is Not Real

We can see a clock. It is real, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real—that it exists? Someone might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.

The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, “The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions” (“Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology,” 1950). He meant these two questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answers one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken these metaphysical questions seriously.

Some philosophers and physicists claim there are other reasons to believe time itself is not real. Here are five of those reasons. Time is unreal because (i) it is emergent, or (ii) it is subjective, or (iii) it is merely conventional or merely a mathematical construct, or (iv) it is defined inconsistently, or (v) its scientific image deviates too much from its common sense image. The five are explored below, in order.

i. Because Time is Emergent

Time emerges from spacetime in relativity theory, as Minkowski first showed. This implies time is not fundamental, but some philosophers of time go further and say it also implies time is not real. Similarly, Arthur Eddington and Peter van Inwagen have argued that tables and chairs are not real because they emerge from arrangements of elementary particles, and it is only these particles and their arrangements that are real. The analogous position in the philosophy of mind is called eliminative materialism. It implies that because the physical facts fix all the facts and because future science will show that common mental states such as beliefs and hopes have no essential role in a successful explanation of mental and physical phenomena, there are no such entities as beliefs and hopes. You really do not believe anything nor hope for anything.

The theoretical physicist Lee Smolin has said time is not emergent from any deeper level of reality because it is real at the most fundamental level.

Suppose Smolin is incorrect and time does emerge from spacetime, or events, or the quantum gravitational field, or Barbour’s moments, or something else. Does this imply time is not real? Most scientists and philosophers of time will answer “no” for the following reasons. Scientists once were surprised to learn that heat emerges from the motion of molecules and that a molecule itself has no heat. Would it not have been a mistake to conclude from this that heat is unreal and nothing is warm? And when it became clear that baseballs are basically a collection of atoms, and so baseballs can be said to emerge from atoms, would it not have been a mistake to say baseballs no longer exist? After all, baseballs are real patterns of fundamental objects and events. Also, the concept of time is already known to be so extremely useful at the larger scales of quarks and molecules and mountains and galaxies, so it is real at least at these scales. The compatibility of time’s not existing below the Planck scale to its existing above that scale is somewhat analogous to the compatibility of free will’s not existing at the scale of molecular activity to its existing at the scale of human behavior.

An additional philosophical argument sometimes offered in support of emergent time being real draws attention to the question of how there could be observational support for a theory that time does not exist since (i) observations occur in time, and (ii) causal reasoning requires that causes occur before their effects. Perhaps observations and causality could be explained with a timeless theory, but it is not at all clear how this could be accomplished.

ii. Because Time is Subjective

Psychological time is clearly subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective? Well, first what does subjective mean? This is a notoriously controversial term in philosophy. Here it means that a phenomenon is subjective if it is a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind. A secondary quality such as being red is a subjective quality; being capable of reflecting the light of a certain wavelength is not subjective. The point can be made by asking whether time comes just from us or instead is wholly out there in the external world independent of us. Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? If so, time is not objective, and so is not objectively real.

Aristotle envisioned time to be a counting of motions (Physics, IV.ch11.219b2), but he also asked the question of whether the existence of time requires the existence of mind. He does not answer his own question because he says it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjectivist position regarding time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality.

Notice that a clock can tick in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice how useful the concept of time is in making such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events: birth before death, acorns sprout before oak trees appear, houses are built before they are painted. W. V. O. Quine might add the point that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time.

iii. Because Time is Merely Conventional or Only a Mathematical Construct

One might argue that time is not real because the concept of time is just a mathematical artifact in our fundamental theories of mathematical physics. It is merely playing an auxiliary mathematical role. Similarly, the infinite curvature of space at the center of a black hole is generally considered to be merely an artifact of the mathematics used by the general theory of relativity but not to exist in reality.

Or one might argue as follows. Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some philosophers argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear. Money and gold both exist, but money’s existence depends upon social relations and conventions that gold’s existence does not depend upon. Is time’s existence more like money than gold in that regard?

Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway?”

Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence (Callender 2010, p. 63).

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we have invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, he said, time is otherwise wholly conventional, not objective.

One should be cautious about claiming something is a mathematical artifact that plays a merely auxiliary mathematical role in our theories of mathematical physics. When the concept of an atom was first proposed several centuries ago, atoms could properly be said to be merely a mathematical artifact and so not to be real. But when Einstein used the atomic hypothesis in order to explain Brownian motion, a phenomenon which was until then unexplained, physicists soon arrived at a consensus that atoms are real.

There are two primary reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: First, there are so many one-way processes in nature. For example, mixing cold milk into hot, black coffee produces lukewarm, brown coffee, but agitations of lukewarm, brown coffee—or any other manipulation of it—have never turned it back into hot black coffee with cool milk. The amalgamation of this one-way process along with all the other one-way processes is time’s arrow or at least an arrow of processes in time. No human choice affects its existence.

Second, our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. That is, their periods keep the same constant ratio to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the “fixed” stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal. The relationships do not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws.

iv. Because Time is Defined Inconsistently

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real.

Plato’s classical interpretation of Zeno’s paradoxes is that they demonstrate the unreality of any motion or any other change. Assuming the existence of time requires the existence of change, then Zeno’s paradoxes also overturn Greek common sense that time exists.

The early 20th-century English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event can acquire the properties of being a future event, a present event, and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is inconsistent. It follows for McTaggart that time is not real.

The early 20th-century absolute-idealist philosopher F.H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.”

Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time will say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaints can be handled by clarification or by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno’s paradoxes were solved by requiring time to be a linear continuum like a segment of the real number line. This solution did change Zeno’s concept, but the change was very fruitful and not ad hoc.

v. Because Scientific Time is Too Unlike Ordinary Time

If you believe that for time to exist it needs to have certain features of the common sense image of time, but you believe that science implies time does not have those features, you may be tempted to conclude that science has really discovered that time does not exist. The logician Kurt Gödel believed so. In the mid 20th century, he argued for the unreality of time as described by contemporary physical science because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. People can, “travel into any region of the past, present, and future and back again” (Gödel, 1959, pp. 560-1). It should not even be possible for time to be circular or symmetric like this, Gödel believed, so, he concluded that, if we suppose time is the time described by relativity theory, then time is not real.

Regarding the claim that our common sense understanding of time by science is not treated fairly by the science of time, there is no consensus about which particular features of common sense time cannot be rejected, although not all can be or else we would be changing the subject and not talking about time. But science has not required us to reject our belief that some events happen in time before other events, and our belief that some events last for a while. Gödel’s complaint about relativity theory’s allowing for circular time has been treated by the majority of physicists and philosophers of time by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular even though as a contingent matter it is not circular in our universe, and he needs to revise his intuitions about what is essential to the concept.

vi. Conclusion

The word time refers to a real, existing entity because the reference helps to explain, understand, and predict phenomena, plus there do not exist alternative, better ways of doing this. It is still an open question among physicists and philosophers as to whether time exists below the Planck scale, the so-called ultramicroscopic scale. However, for simplicity of presentation, the attitude taken in the remainder of this article is that time definitely does exist at scales above the Planck scale, that the concept is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional or a mathematical artifact [except that the splitting of spacetime into a time part and a space part is conventional], that any inconsistency in time’s description is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real regardless of whether it is emergent.

11. Time Travel

Would you like to travel to the future and read about the history of your great-grandchildren? You can do it. Nothing in principle is stopping you except some financial difficulties and a better-engineered spaceship that can survive occasional collisions with rocks in space. Would you like to travel, instead, to the past? You may have regrets and wish to make some changes.

Travel in time has been discussed in Hindu, Chinese and Japanese literature since ancient times, but its serious examination in physics and Western philosophy began only after 1949 when the logician Kurt Gödel published a solution to the equations of the general theory of relativity that allows travel to the past. The term time travel has now become a technical term. It means physical time travel, not psychological time travel. You do not time travel if you merely dream of living in the past, although many neuroscientists do call this “mental time travel.” Also, you do not time travel for five minutes simply by being alive for five minutes. And you do not time travel by crossing a time zone, or by having your body frozen, then thawed later.

Time travel to the future presupposes the metaphysical theory of eternalism because, if you travel to the future, there must exist a future you travel to, even if that future does not exist now. Presentism and the growing-past theory deny the existence of this future.

In 1976, the Princeton University metaphysician David Lewis offered this technical definition of time travel:

In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

The implication from this definition is that time travel occurs when correct clocks get out of synchronization. If you are the traveler, your personal time is shown on your small personal clock that travels with you (and that is not frozen if your body is ever frozen). A person not taking the journey is said to be measuring external time. This could be someone else’s proper time or it could be the time shown on the standard clock. Informally, it is common to make this point by saying time flows differently for the time traveler than for the rest of us. This remark may be common, but it can be misleading because in a sense time flows for the same for everyone under all conditions, namely at a second per second. It is clocks that work differently under different conditions.

Lewis’s definition is widely accepted, although it has been criticized occasionally in the philosophical literature. The definition has no implications about whether, if you travel forward in external time to the year 2376 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then as opposed to have traveled continuously during the intervening years. The kind of time travel requiring this continuity is more consistent with scientific theory, but the discontinuous travel is more popular in fiction and popular films.

Here is a diagram of a traveler’s sudden appearance back in external time showing her death before her birth.


External time, say our civilization’s standard time, is represented in the diagram with equally-spaced point-times t1, t2, t3, t4, t5 and with t1 < t2 < t3 < t4 < t5. Each might be twenty years after the previous one. The traveler’s personal time or proper time begins when she is born at T1, with T1 = t4. Later she steps into a time machine at T2. when the external time of her friends shows t5. The machine abruptly transports her back to the way the world was at t1, but her personal time is still T2. Yet T1 < T2, perhaps by twenty years. Later she dies at T3, in a situation where the external time is t2. Thus, according to external time, she dies before she is born. No such thing happened in personal time because T1 < T2 < T3. This scenario is a case of backward causation, in which events causally influence earlier events, but it is not a case of time reversal nor of personal time going forward while events are experienced in reverse order to how they occur for those in external time.

Suppose at t1, you met the above time traveler. Her personal clock would disagree with yours and would show t5. So, meeting someone whose clock runs ahead of yours could be a sign that you have just met a time traveler from the future. But before leaping to this conclusion, you would want first to rule out mundane explanations, such as that her clock is not working well.

If Lewis’ definition of time travel is acceptable, any requirement that rules out discontinuous jumps by the traveler to the future or past in external time and demands spatiotemporal continuity of time travel will have to be supported by an additional argument. The argument that the general theory of relativity requires this continuity is such an argument. Authors of films and books usually ignore this continuity requirement because it interferes with the story they would like to tell. That is why these films and books are rightfully categorized as being science fiction.

a. To the Future

Time travel to the future does occur very frequently, and it has been observed and measured by scientists. Time travel to the past is much more controversial, and experts disagree with each other about whether it is even physically possible. Relativity theory implies there are two different kinds of time travel to the future: (1) two clocks getting out of synchrony due to their moving relative to each other, and (2) two clocks getting out of synchrony due to their encountering different gravitational forces.

When you travel to the future, you eventually arrive at some future event having taken less time on your clock than the non-travelers do on their clocks. To them, you zipped through time; to you, they were sluggish. It is all relative. You might travel to the future in the sense that you participate in an event ten years in their future, having taken only two years according to your own clock. That would be an eight-year leap forward in time. You can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage to that event. However, the astronomers on Earth would notice that you turned the pages in your monthly calendar very slowly. The rate of ticking of your clock differs from that of their clock during the flight. Reversing your velocity and traveling back to the place you began the trip will not undo this effect.

If you do travel to the future, that is, their future,  then you never get biologically younger; you simply age more slowly than those who do not travel with you.

Any motion produces time travel to the future, relative to the clocks of those who do not move. That is why you can legitimately advertise any bicycle as being a time machine. The faster you go the sooner you get to the part of the future you desire but the more easily the dust and other particles in space will slice through your body during the trip.

The second kind of future time travel is due, not to a speed difference between two clocks, but to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field on two clocks. This is called gravitational time dilation, and it is most noticeable near a source of extreme gravitation such as a black hole. If you were to leave Earth and orbit near a black hole or a neutron star, your friends back on Earth might view you continuously through their telescopes and, if so, would see you live in slow motion. When you returned, your clock would show that less time had expired on your clock than on their clock that remained on Earth. Similarly, ground floor clocks tick more slowly than penthouse clocks because the ground floor is in a higher gravitational field. There is no theoretical limit to how slow a clock can tick when it undergoes time dilation, but it would never tick in reverse.

Travelers to the future can participate in that future, not just view it. They can influence the future and affect it.

One philosophical controversy is whether travelers to the future also can change the future. According to David Lewis (Lewis 1976, 150), this is impossible. If it changed, then it was not really the future after all. No action changes the future, regardless of whether time travel is involved, he argues.

Suppose you were to encounter a man today who says that yesterday he lived next door to Isaac Newton in England in the year 1700, but now he has traveled to the future and met you. According to the theory of relativity, it is physically possible that he did this. Yet it is an extraordinary claim since you undoubtedly believe that fast spaceships or access to high gravitational fields were not available to anyone in 1700. Epistemology tells us that extraordinary claims require extraordinarily good evidence, so the burden of proof is on the strange man to produce that evidence, such as a good reason how the secret of building spaceships was discovered but kept from the public in 1700. You also would like to be shown that his body today contains traces of the kind of atmosphere that existed back in 1700; that atmosphere is slightly different chemically from ours today. If he cannot or will not produce the evidence, then it is much more likely that he is deluded or lying. Giving him a lie detector test will not be very helpful; you want to know the truth, not merely what he believes to be true.

b. To the Past

You do not travel to the past when you remember your youth nor when you imagine living in an earlier century. Time travel to the past, has never been observed, but the general theory of relativity seems to imply that it is physically possible, although experts on relativity theory are not in agreement on this. If it is possible, it will be extremely difficult to create because it will require some bizarre curvature of spacetime. So, when two people come up to you, and one says, “I’m from your distant past,” and the second says, “I’m from your distant future,” you know that the second claim is less likely to be true than the first.

Time travel into the past, if it is possible according to general relativity, does not change the direction of time, nor permit re-experiencing events in the reverse order to how they first occurred. Science must obey logic, which implies that in a single world there is consistent story of what has happened and will happen, despite the fact that novels about time travel frequently describe traveling back to remake the past and thereby to produce a new version of reality.

A telescope is a window into our past. If we use it to look out into space to some region R a million light-years away, we are seeing R as it was a million years ago. However, this is looking at the past, not being in the past.

At present, we are existing in the past of future people, but we are not time-traveling into their past. What we might like to do instead is to travel into our own past here on Earth. This is impossible according to Newton’s physics and impossible according to Einstein’s special theory of relativity, but it may be possible according to Einstein’s general theory of relativity, although experts are not in agreement on this point, despite much study of the issue. The equations are simply too complicated, even for experts. These same experts believe that, even if the equations do allow possible universes to contain travel to one’s past, they do now allow travel to a time before the creation of the first time machine.

Shortly after Einstein published his general theory of relativity, the physicist Hermann Weyl predicted that the theory allows time travel, but his claim was not studied carefully until Kurt Gödel’s work on relativity in 1949. Gödel claimed his own work demonstrated time travel must exist in a certain universe having a non-zero total angular momentum. Gödel was able to convince Einstein of this, but experts on relativity are not in agreement on whether Einstein should have been convinced. Still others say that, even if relativity does allow travel to the past, the theory should be revised to prevent this. Other opponents of the possibility of time travel to the past hope that an ad hoc restriction is not needed and instead that relativity theory will be understood more clearly so it can be seen that it does rule out time travel. Still other opponents of time travel to the past hope an as yet unknown physical law will be discovered that rules out travel to the past. Nevertheless, defenders of time travel say we should bite the bullet, accept that relativity allows time travel in some kinds of universes that have special curvatures, and trust the implications of relativity, but assume we probably do not live in a universe with the kind of curvature that is required.

Here is a pessimistic remark about time travel from J.J.C. Smart in The Journal of Philosophy in 1963:

Suppose it is agreed that I did not exist a hundred years ago. It is a contradiction to suppose that I can make a machine that will take me to a hundred years ago. Quite clearly no time machine can make it be that I both did and did not exist a hundred years ago.

Smart’s critics accuse him of the fallacy of begging the question. They wonder why he should demand that it be agreed that “I did not exist a hundred years ago.”

If general relativity does allow a universe that contains time travel to the past, this universe must contain a very special distribution of matter-energy. For an illustration of the simplest universe allowing backward time travel and not being obviously inconsistent with general relativity, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with the one space dimension represented as going left and right on the page. Each point on the page represents a possible two-dimensional event. The time dimension points up and down the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now curve (bend) the page into a horizontal cylinder, parallel to the space axis so that the future meets the past. In the universe illustrated by that graph, any stationary object that persists long enough arrives into its past and becomes its earlier self. Its worldline is (topologically equivalent to) a circle; more technically, it is a closed time-like curve. A closed curve has no end points. This cylindrical universe allows an event to occur both earlier and later than itself, so its time is not asymmetric. The curvature of this universe is what mathematicians call extrinsic curvature. There is no intrinsic curvature. Informally expressed, extrinsic curvature is curvature detectable only from a higher dimension, but intrinsic curvature can be detected by a being who lives within the space, say by noticing a failure of the Pythagorean Theorem somewhere. When the flat, square sheet is rolled into a tube, the intrinsic geometry does not change; only the extrinsic geometry changes.

Regardless of how space is curved and what sort of time travel occurs, if any past time travel does occur, the traveler apparently is never able to erase facts or otherwise change the past. That is the point of saying, “whatever happened, happened.” But that metaphysical position has been challenged. It assumes there is only one past and that whatever was the case will always have been the case. These assumptions, though widely accepted, occasionally have been challenged in the philosophical literature. They were challenged in the 11th century by Peter Damian who said God could change the past.

Assuming Damian is mistaken, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather by shooting him before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed. But nothing prevents your trying to kill him. If you do attempt to kill him, you must fail.

But the impossibility of killing your grandfather seems to raise a problem about free will. If you are free to shoot and kill people before you step into a time machine, then presumably you are free to shoot and kill people after you step out. So, is there a paradox because you both can and cannot shoot and kill your grandfather?

Assuming you cannot shoot and kill your grandfather because you did not, philosophers argue about whether this restraint on your actions toward your grandfather shows that in this situation you do not really have freedom in the libertarian sense of that term. To resolve this puzzle, the metaphysician David Lewis said you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. However, Lewis said there is no sense in which you both can and cannot. So, the meaning of the word can is sensitive to context. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagreed, and argued that we always need to make our can-statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, but in different senses, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t.

If you step into a time machine that projects you into the past, then there you can expect to step out in a new place because time travel normally involves motion. There is an ongoing philosophical dispute about whether, in a real closed timelike curve, a person would travel locally forward in time but globally to exactly an earlier event or, instead, only to a nearby event. The reason for restricting the timelike cure to only nearby events is that, if some person or on-infinitesimal object went back to the same event, one would bump into oneself and there would be too many copies of oneself existing in the same place.

It would be logically inconsistent to build a new time machine to travel back to a time before the first time machine was invented, so there is no hope of creating the first time machine in order to visit the time of the dinosaurs.

In 1988 in an influential physics journal, Kip Thorne and colleagues described the first example of how to build a time machine in a world that has never had one: “[I]f the laws of physics permit traversable wormholes, then they probably also permit such a wormhole to be transformed into a “time machine….” (Morris 1988, p. 1446).

A wormhole is a second route between two places, perhaps it is a shortcut tunnel to a faraway place. Just as two clocks get out of synchrony if one moves relative to the other, a clock near a rapidly moving mouth of a wormhole could get out of synch with a clock at the other, stationary mouth. In principle a person could plunge into one hole and come out at an earlier time. Wormholes were first conceived by Einstein and Rosen, and later were named by Wheeler.

Notice that the above quotation begins with the word “if.” Experts opposed to traversable wormholes have less of a problem with there being wormholes than with them being traversable. Although Thorne himself believes that traversable wormholes probably do not exist naturally, he also believes they might in principle be created by a more advanced civilization, although Thorne also believes the short tunnel or “throat” between the two mouths of the wormhole probably would quickly collapse before anything of macroscopic size could use the wormhole to travel back in time. There has been speculation by physicists that an advanced civilization could manipulate negative gravitational energy to keep the hole from collapsing long enough to create the universe’s first non-microscopic time machine.

It is a very interesting philosophical project to decide whether wormhole time travel, or any other time travel to the past, produces paradoxes of identity. For example, can a person travel back and be born again?

To solve the paradoxes of personal identity due to time travel’s inconsistency with commonly held assumptions about personal identity, many philosophers recommend rejecting the endurance theory which implies a person exists wholly at a single instant, for all the instants of their life. They recommend accepting the perdurance theory in which a person exists as a four-dimensional entity extending in time from birth to death. The person is their spacetime “worm.” Worms can live in wormholes and become closed timelike curves in spacetime.

Let us elaborate on this radical scenario, which some experts believe is not even physically possible. A closed timelike curve has implications for causality. The curve would be a causal loop. Causal loops lead to backward causation in which an effect can occur before its cause. Causal loops occur when there is a continuous sequence of events e1, e2, e3, …. in which each member is a cause of its numerical successor and, in addition, for some integer n, en causes e1. The philosopher Milič Čapek has cautioned that with a causal loop, “we would be clearly on the brink of magic.” Other philosophers of time are more willing to accept the possibility of causal loops, strange though they would be. These loops would be a fountain of youth. When you go around the loop, you travel back to your birth.

Most time travel stories in literature involve contradictions, either logical contradictions or inconsistency with accepted laws of physics. The most famous one that appears not to is Robert Heinlein’s story “All You Zombies.” It shows how someone could be both their parents, provided relativity theory does allow backward time travel.

For a detailed review of the philosophical literature on backward time travel and the resulting paradoxes of causality and of personal identity, see (Wasserman, 2018, ch. 5) and (Fisher, 2015).

Feynman U.S. postage stamp
US Postal Museum

Feynman diagrams picture a short sequence of elementary interactions among particles. Inspired by an idea from John Wheeler, Richard Feynman suggested that a way to interpret the theory of quantum electrodynamics about interactions dominated by electromagnetic and weak forces is that an antimatter particle is really a matter particle traveling backward in time. For example, the positively charged positron moving forward in time is really a negatively charged electron moving backward in time. This phenomenon is pictured in the two diagrams on the left of the above postage stamp, where the positron e+ is moving downward or backward in time.

All empirical searches attempting to observe a particle moving backward in time have failed. So, the majority of physicists in the early 21st century see no need to accept backward time travel due to Feynman’s successful representations of quantum electrodynamics. See (Muller 2016a, p. 246, 296-7) for comment on this. Nevertheless, some well-respected physicists such as Neil Turok do accept Feynman-style backward time travel. The philosopher Huw Price adds that the Feynman “zigzag is not there in standard QM, so if we put it in, we are accepting that QM is incomplete. (The zigzag needs hidden variables, in other words),” in order to determine when to zig and when to zag. At the heart of this dispute about whether to believe antimatter is regular matter traveling backward in time, physicists are very cautious because they realize that the more extraordinary the claim, the more extraordinarily good the evidence should be before accepting the claim.

Here are a variety of very brief philosophical arguments against travel to the past:

  1. If travel to the past were possible, you could go back in time and kill your grandfather, but then you would not be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That is a logical contradiction. So, travel to the past is impossible.
  2. Like the future, the past is also not real, so time travel to the past or the future is not real either.
  3. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has ever encountered any time travelers.
  4. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
  5. If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out your freedom to go back or not. Yet you do have this freedom, so travel to the past is impossible.
  6. If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is biologically impossible.
  7. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  8. If travel to the past were possible, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always fail in their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since investigators have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
  9. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. You in the 22nd century buy a copy of Darwin’s book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. You enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? You got the knowledge from Darwin, but Darwin got the knowledge from you. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel is not really possible.
  10. Travel to the past allows you to return to have intercourse with one of your parents, causing your birth. You would have the same fingerprints as one of your parents, which is biologically impossible.
  11. If past time travel is possible, then it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which might eventually reunite with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the return or impending arrival of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, not metaphysically possible, not physically possible, not technologically possible, not biologically possible, and not probable.

Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. One response to the Grandfather Paradox of item 1 says you would kill your grandfather but then be in an alternative universe to the actual one where you did not kill him. This response is not liked by most proponents of time travel; they say traveling to an alternative universe is not what they mean by time travel.

Item 2 is the argument from presentism.

One response to the Enrico Fermi Paradox, item 3, is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to time travelers. A better response is that perhaps the first time machine has never been built, and it is known that a time machine cannot be used to go back to a time before the first time machine (or closed time-like curve) exists.

Argument 9, the paradox of free information, has gotten considerable attention in the philosophical literature. In 1976, David Lewis said this:

But where did the information come from in the first place? Why did the whole affair happen? There is simply no answer. The parts of the loop are explicable, the whole of it is not. Strange! But not impossible, and not too different from inexplicabilities we are already inured to. Almost everyone agrees that God, or the Big Bang, or the entire infinite past of the Universe, or the decay of a tritium atom, is uncaused and inexplicable. Then if these are possible, why not also the inexplicable causal loops that arise in time travel?

Einstein and Rosen suggested that the laws of general relativity might allow traversable, macroscopic wormholes. A wormhole is a tunnel connecting two distant regions of space, and a traversable wormhole allows travel from one hole to the other. The tunnel would be a shortcut between two distant galaxies, and it is analogous to a path taken by a worm who has eaten its way to the opposite side of an apple’s surface without taking the longer path using only the apple’s surface. That is why John Wheeler coined the name “wormhole.” Think of a wormhole as two spheres connected by a tunnel.

The hole is highly curved spacetime, and from the outside it looks like a sphere in 3D-space. It is not quite a black hole, so it has no event horizon. There is no consensus among theoretical physicists whether general relativity permits the existence of a wormhole. Assuming it does, and assuming one of the spheres could be controlled and forced to move very fast back and forth, then with two connected spheres situated in separate galaxies, a particle or person could enter one at some time, then exit the other at an earlier time, having traveled, say, just a few meters through the tunnel. Because of this implication for time, some physicists argue that if these traversable wormholes are allowed by general relativity, then the theory needs to be revised to disallow them.

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

12. McTaggart’s A-Theory and B-Theory

In 1908, the English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The two ways are different, but the two orderings are the same.

For the sake of brevity, I shall give the name of the A series to that series of positions which runs from the far past through the near past to the present, and then from the present through the near future to the far future, or conversely. The series of positions which runs from earlier to later, or conversely, I shall call the B series (McTaggart 1968, §306).

When McTaggart uses the word series, he means what mathematicians call a sequence, but the literature in philosophy often follows McTaggart on this point. Below is a graphic representation of McTaggart’s ordering, in which point event c happens later than point events a and b:


McTaggart is making several assumptions here. First, he does not believe time is real, so his remark that the A-series and B-series mark out positions in time is only on the assumption that time is real, despite what he, himself, believes. Another assumption is that longer-lasting events are composed of their point events. Also, there are a great many other events that are located within the series at event a‘s location, namely all the other events that are simultaneous with event a.

Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart’s B-series above is ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart’s A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or, equivalently, has more pastness than b. The A-series locates each event relative to the present; the B-series is created with no attention paid to the present, but only to what occurs before what.

Suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. Although the philosophical literature is not in agreement, it is usually said that the information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself, but is used to create the A-series. That information of c‘s being in the present tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events are without pastness; they are not in the past. Someone constructing the B-series places event c to the right of b for a different reason, just that c happens after b.

McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical, but he also believed the A-properties (such as being past and being two weeks past) are essential to our concept of time. So, for this reason, he believed our current concept of time is paradoxical and incoherent. This reasoning is called McTaggart’s Paradox.

McTaggart is not an especially clear writer, so his remarks can be interpreted in different ways, and the reader needs to work hard to make sense of them. Consider McTaggart’s Paradox regarding one specific event, say the event when:

Socrates speaks to Plato for the first time.

This speaking to Plato is in the past, at least it is in our past, though not in the past of Egyptian King Tut during his lifetime, so the speaking is past in our present. Nevertheless, back in the past, there is a time when the event is present. From this, McTaggart concludes both that the event is past and that the event is present, from which he declares that the A-series is contradictory and so paradoxical. If that reasoning is correct (and it has been challenged by many), and if the A-series is essential to time, then time itself must be unreal.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of:

  • A-series and B-series
  • A-theorist and B-theorist
  • A-facts and B-facts
  • A-terms and B-terms
  • A-properties and B-properties
  • A-predicates and B-predicates
  • A-propositions and B-propositions
  • A-sentences and B-sentences
  • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples of using this terminology. Unlike the A-series terms, the B-series terms are relational terms because a B-term refers to a property that relates a pair of events. Some of these properties are: is earlier than, happens twenty-three minutes after, and is simultaneous with. An A-theory term, on the other hand, refers to a single event, not a pair of events. Some of these properties are: in the near future, happened twenty-three minutes ago, and is present. The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties.

The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon will not be a fact. B-theorists do not like facts going in and out of existence, but this is acceptable to A-theorists. Similarly, if we turn from fact-talk to statement-talk, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. B-facts are eternal. For example, the statement “The snowfall occurred an hour before this act of utterance” will, if true, be true at all times, provided the indexical phrase the snowfall is replaced by one indicating the time and place of the snowfall.

The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, “It began snowing an hour ago,” what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness (so the fact is tensed) but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that occurs an hour after is a B-term that is supposed to be logically tenseless and analogous to the mathematical term numerically less than even though when expressed in English it must use the present tense of the verb occur.

When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfall, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. When your attitude changes, the snowfall itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. (A-theorists and B-theorists do not disagree about this.) This is what is meant by intrinsic when A-theorists promote the intrinsic properties of an event, such as the snowfall having the intrinsic property of being in the past. B-theorists analyze the snowfall event differently, saying that more fundamentally the event is not in the past but is in the past relative to us. Being in the past, they say, is not intrinsic but rather is relational.

Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each camp member believes their camp’s terminology can best explain ordinary speech involving time and also the terminology of the other camp.

Usually, the A-theorist promotes becoming. The term means a change in the A-series position of an event, such as a change in its degree of pastness.

Beginning with Bertrand Russell in 1903, many B-theorists have argued that there are no irreducible one-place A-qualities (such as the monadic property of being past) because the qualities can all be reduced to, and adequately explained in terms of, two-place B-relations. The A-theorist disagrees. For example, the claim that it is after midnight might be explained, says the B-theorist, by saying midnight occurs before the time of this assertion. Before is a two-place relationship, a binary relation. The A-theorist claims this is a faulty explanation.

Is the A-theory or is the B-theory the correct theory of reality? This is a philosophically controversial issue. To clarify the issue, let us re-state the two theories. The A-theory has two especially central theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory:

(1) Time is fundamentally constituted by an A-series in which any event’s being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself.

(2) Events change.

In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes…. But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is usually called second-order change or McTaggartian change. For McTaggart, second-order change is the only genuine change, whereas a B-theorist such as Russell says this is not genuine change. Genuine change is intrinsic change, he would say. Just as there is no intrinsic change in a house due to your walking farther away from it, so there is no intrinsic change in an event as it becomes farther away in time (from your present).

In response, McTaggart said:

No, Russell, no. What you identify as “change” isn’t change at all. The “B-series world” you think is the real world is…a world without becoming, a world in which nothing happens.

The B-theory conflicts with two central theses of the A-theory. According to the B-theory,

(1′) Time is fundamentally constituted by a B-series, and the temporal properties of being in the past (or in the present or in the future) are fundamentally relational, not monadic.

(2′) Events do not change.

To re-examine this dispute, because there is much misunderstanding about what is being disputed, let us ask again what B-theorists mean by calling temporal properties relational. They mean that an event’s property of occurring twenty-three minutes in the past, say, is a relation between the event and us, the subject, the speaker. When analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Scottish Queen Anne’s death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past. It is not in Aristotle’s past or King Tut’s. So, the labels, “past,” “present,” and “future” are all about us and are not intrinsic properties of events. There is no objective distinction among past, present and future, say the proponents of the B-theory. For similar reasons the B-theorist says the property of being two days in the past is not an authentic property because it is a second-order property.” The property of being two days in our past, however, is a genuine property, says the B-theorist.

Their point about A-properties being relational when properly analyzed is also made this way. The A-theory terminology about space uses the terms here, there, far, and near. These terms are essentially about the speaker.

Is a map drawn incorrectly because it leaves out an arrow pointing to ‘here’ and another arrow pointing to ‘there’? If not, then the B-theory’s spacetime diagram is also not an incorrect treatment of time even if our common sense image of time does require the event of Queen Anne’s death to change by receding farther into the past.

The B-theorist also argues that the A-theory violates the theory of relativity because an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is relative and not an intrinsic quality of the event. Being present is relative to a reference frame. And for this reason, there are as many different B-series as there are legitimate reference frames. The typical proponent of the A-series cannot accept this.

A-theorists are aware of these criticisms, and there are many counterarguments. Some influential A-theorists are A.N. Prior, E.J. Lowe, and Quentin Smith. Some influential B-theorists are Bertrand Russell, W.V.O. Quine, and D.H. Mellor. The A-theory is closely related to the common sense image of time, and the B-theory is more closely related to the scientific image. Proponents of each theory shoulder a certain burden—explaining not just why the opponent’s theory is incorrect but also why it seems to be correct to the opponent.

The philosophical literature on the controversy between the A and B theories is vast. During a famous confrontation with the philosopher Henri Bergson in 1922, Einstein defended his own scientific treatment of time and said “the time of the philosophers” is an illusion. This is an overstatement by Einstein. He meant to attack only the A-theorist philosophers.

Martin Heidegger said he wrote Being and Time in 1927 as a response to the conflict between the A-theory and the B-theory, the conflict between the time of Bergson and the time of Einstein.

13. The Passage or Flow of Time

Time seems to flow or pass, and there seems to be a moving now. Advocates of this controversial philosophical position often point out that the present keeps vanishing. And they might offer a simile and say present events seem to flow into the past, like a boat that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther downstream from us. In the converse sense, we ourselves flow into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us. This latter image is probably the vision that the Spanish philosopher George Santayana had in mind when he said, “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” Philosophers disagree with each other about how to explain the ground of these ideas. Philosopher X will say time passes or flows, but not in the sense used by philosopher Y, while philosopher Z will disagree with both of them.

There are various entangled issues regarding flow. (i) What is actually flowing? (ii) What does it mean for time to flow? Are there different senses? (iii) Does time really flow? (iv) If so, do we experience the flow directly? (v) What is its rate of flow? (vi) If time does not flow, why do so many people believe it does?

There are two primary philosophical theories or attitudes about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) The flow is not objectively real; it is merely subjective. This B-theory is called the static theory, mostly by its opponents because of the negative connotation of the word “static.” The A-theory is called the dynamic theory because it implies time is constantly in flux. The A-theory implies the fact of passage obtains independently of us. The letters A and B are intended to suggest an alliance with McTaggart’s A-theory and B-theory. One A-theorist describes the situation this way:

The sensation we are (perhaps wrongly) tempted to describe as the sensation of temporal motion is veridical: it somehow puts us in touch with an aspect of reality that is unrepresented in Russell’s theory of time [the original B-theory]. (van Inwagen 2015, 81)

The B-theory implies that this temporal motion or flow is not veridical; it is the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of that charge often proceeds like this. Time exists, things change, and so we say time passes or elapses, but time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing or passing or elapsing or undergoing any motion. The present does not objectively flow because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience.

Here is another prong of a common B-theory attack on the notion of flow. The death of Queen Anne is an event that an A-theorist says is continually changing from past to farther into the past, but this change is no more of an objectively real change intrinsic to her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death.

One point J.J.C. Smart offered against the A-theory of flow was to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, he claimed. One second divided by one second is the number one, a unit-less number, and so not an allowable rate. And what would it be like for the rate to be two seconds per second? Huw Price adds that, “We might just as well say that the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter flows at pi seconds per second!” (Price 1996, p. 13).

Other philosophers of time, such as John Norton and Tim Maudlin (Maudlin 2002, p. 262) argue that the rate of one second per second is acceptable, despite these criticisms.

To understand the concept of flow or passage used by the A-theory, it can be helpful to appreciate that it is not any of the following four concepts of flow:

(1) According to the theory of relativity, two synchronized clocks must lose their synchrony if the two are moving relative to each other. This loss is sometimes described as the time of the two clocks flowing differently.

(2) Change is continuous rather than discrete, and continuous time is flowing time, unlike discrete time.

(3) Time exists and things endure, and that is what it is for time to flow.

(4) Time has an arrow, it flows in a preferred direction, the future direction.

There surely is some objective feature of our brains that causes us to believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. B-theorists say perhaps the belief is due not to time’s actually flowing but rather to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences.

A-theorists who believe in flow have produced many dynamic theories that are closer to common sense on this topic. Here are six. (1) The passage or flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past. Events change in their degree of futureness and degree of pastness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart’s second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change that occurs when, say, a falling leaf changes its altitude over time.

(2) A second type of dynamic theory implies time’s flow is the coming into existence of new facts, the actualization of new states of affairs. Reality grows by the addition of more facts. There need be no commitment to events changing intrinsically, as McTaggart believed.

(3) A third dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate to becoming determinate in the present. Because time’s flow is believed to be due to events becoming determinate, these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as becoming.

(4) A fourth dynamic theory says, “The progression of time can be understood by assuming that the Hubble expansion takes place in 4 dimensions rather than in 3. The flow of time consists of the continuous creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space…. Unlike the picture drawn in the classic Minkowski spacetime diagram, the future does not yet exist; we are not moving into the future, but the future is being constantly created.” (Muller 2016b).

(5) A fifth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth-values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false because it is sunny today. That is an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth-value changes are at the root of the flow.

In response to this linguistic turn, critics of the dynamic theory suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth-value because the reference of the word now is unspecified. If the sentence cannot have a truth-value, it cannot change its truth-value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth-value, namely the associated complete sentence or eternal sentence, the sentence with its temporal indexical replaced by some date expression that refers to a specific time, and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Typical indexicals are the words: then, now, I, this, here, them. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2020, and the speaker is in San Francisco, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately associated with the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2020, in San Francisco, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, so-called complete sentences have truth-values, and these truth-values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time, according to the critic of the fifth dynamic theory.

(6) A sixth dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a traveling present or moving property of being now that spotlights a new slice of the block at every new moment. A slice is a set of events all of which are simultaneous in the block. So, a slice of events can temporarily possess a monadic property of being now, and then lose it as a newer slice becomes spotlighted. This theory is called the moving spotlight theory, and it implies a moment can change. Here is how Hermann Weyl described the theory:

The objective world simply is, it does not happen. Only to the gaze of my consciousness crawling along the lifeline of my body, does a section of the world come to life as a fleeting image in space which continuously changes in time.

14. The Past, Present, and Future

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, this is asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on this ontological question of the reality of the past, present, and future. There are three leading theories, and there is controversy over the exact wording of each, and whether the true theory is metaphysically necessary or just contingently true. The three do not differ in their observational consequences as do competing scientific theories.

(1) According to the ontological theory called presentism, only present objects exist. Stated another way: if something is real, then it exists now. The past and the future are not real, so either the past tense sentence, “Dinosaurs existed” is false, or else it is true but its truth is grounded only in some present facts. A similar analysis is required for statements in the future tense. Perhaps they can be analyzed in terms of present anticipations. With that accomplished, then all the events can be linearly ordered as if the past ones occur before the present ones and the present ones occur before the future ones, when actually they do not because all real events occur in the present. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, A.N. Prior, and Lee Smolin are presentists. In 1969, Prior said of the present and the real:

They are one and the same concept, and the present simply is the real considered in relation to two particular species of unreality, namely the past and the future.

(2) Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C.D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended the growing-past theory. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see Hilary Putnam (1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue. The growing-past theory is also called by other names: now-and-then-ism, the becoming theory, and possibilism. Members of McTaggart’s A-camp are divided on whether to accept presentism or, instead, the growing-past theory, but they agree on rejecting eternalism.

(3) Advocates of eternalism say there are no objective ontological differences among the past, present, and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The differences among past, present, and future are subjective, depending upon whose experience is being implicitly referred to—yours or, say, Julius Caesar’s. An event in your past can be in Caesar’s future. There are epistemological differences among the past, present, and future; we can know much more about the past than the future.

Eternalism conflicts with the common sense image. It is the only one of the three metaphysical theories that permits time travel so it is understandable that time travel was not seriously discussed in philosophy until the twentieth century. Bertrand Russell, J.J.C. Smart, W.V.O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and David Lewis have endorsed eternalism. Eternalism is less frequently called the tapestry theory of time. It is very difficult to speak correctly about eternalism using natural language because all natural languages are infused with presumptions about presentism. Correct talk of personal identity is especially difficult for this reason.

Here is how one philosopher of physics briefly defends eternalism:

I believe that the past is real: there are facts about what happened in the past that are independent of the present state of the world and independent of my knowledge or beliefs about the past. I similarly believe that there is (i.e. will be) a single unique future. I know what it would be to believe that the past is unreal (i.e. nothing ever happened, everything was just created ex nihilo) and to believe that the future is unreal (i.e. all will end, I will not exist tomorrow, I have
no future). I do not believe these things, and would act very differently if I did. Insofar as belief in the reality of the past and the future constitutes a belief in a ‘block universe’, I believe in a block universe. But I also believe that time passes, and see no contradiction or tension between these views (Maudlin 2002, pp. 259-260).

B-theorists agree that it is correct to say, “The past does not exist” and to say, “Future events do not exist” if the verbs are being used in their tensed form, but argue that there are no implications here for ontology. There is merely an interesting feature of how some languages such as English use tensed verbs in their discourse about time. Languages need not use tenses at all, and a B-analysis of tense-talk can be provided when languages do use tenses.

The block theory implies reality is correctly representable as a four-dimensional block of events in spacetime in some reference frame. In the block, any two non-simultaneous events are ordered by the happens-before relation. The future part of the block is a region of actual events, not possible events, which is why we have no epistemological access to the future part.

For a graphic presentation of the block, see a four-dimensional Minkowski diagram. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along those dimensions. Our knowledge about future events in the block is minimal, but the future part of the block is ontologically real despite these epistemological limitations.

If it were learned that space is nine-dimensional rather than three-dimensional, then block theorists would promote a ten-dimensional block rather than a four-dimensional block.

The block is philosophically controversial. In his book The Future, the Oxford philosopher John Lucas said, “The block universe gives a deeply inadequate view of time. It fails to account for the passage of time, the pre-eminence of the present, the directedness of time, and the difference between the future and the past.”

Motion in the real world is, of course, dynamic, but its historical record, such as its record within the block, is static. That is, any motion’s mathematical representation is static in the sense of being timeless. The block theory has been accused by A-theorists of spatializing time and geometricizing time, which arguably it does. The philosophical debate is whether this is a mistake. Some B-theorists complain that, by labeling the static view static, one is implying mistakenly that there is a time dimension in which the block is not changing but should. The block describes change but does not itself change, say B-theorists. The A-theorist’s complaint, says the B-theorist, is like complaining that a printed musical score is faulty because it is static, while real music is vibrant.

For the eternalist and block-theorist, the block that is created using one reference frame is no more distinguished than the block that is created using another frame. Any chosen reference will have its own definite past, present, and future. The majority of physicists accept this block theory, which could be called the mild block theory. Metaphysicians also argue over whether reality itself is a static block, rather than just being representable as a static block. These metaphysicians are promoting a strong block theory. Some B-theorists complain that this strong block theory is confusing the representation with what is represented. It is helpful to keep this distinction in mind as the discussion continues. See (Smolin 2013, pp. 25-36) for an elaboration of the point.

Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say the block is ever-growing, and the present is the leading edge between reality and the unreal future. Some philosophers express that point by saying the present is the edge of all becoming. The advocates of the growing-block usually agree with the eternalists that what makes the sentence, “Dinosaurs once existed,” be true is that there is a past region of the block in which dinosaurs do exist.

All three ontologies [namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism] imply that, at the present moment, we only ever experience a part of the present and that we do not have direct access to the past or the future. They all agree that nothing exists now that is not present, and all three need to explain how and why there is an important difference between never existing (such as Santa Claus) and not existing now (such as Abraham Lincoln). Members of all three camps will understand an ordinary speaker who says, “There will be a storm tomorrow so it’s good that we fixed the roof last week,” but they will provide different treatments of this remark at a metaphysical level.

Most eternalists accept the B-theory of time. Presentists and advocates of the growing-past tend to accept the A-theory of time. Let us take a closer look at presentism.

One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated in 1865? Speaking technically, we are asking what are the truthmakers of the true sentences and the falsemakers of the false sentences. Many presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers in the past but are nevertheless true because their truthmakers are in the present. They say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way that things are, perhaps traces of the past in pages of present books and in our memories. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist and the growing-past theorist believe this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist and the growing-block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real but far away from us along a spatial dimension. “Why not treat these distant realities in the same manner?” they argue.

A related issue for the presentist is how to account for causation, for how April showers bring May flowers. Presentists believe in processes, but can they account for the process of a cause producing an effect without both the cause and the effect being real at different times?

Presentism and the growing-past theory need to account for the Theory of Relativity’s treatment of the present, or else criticize the theory. Relativity implies there is no common global present, but only different presents for each of us. Relativity theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in one reference frame, while allowing b to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame, even though a and c are not simultaneous in either frame. Nevertheless, if a is real, then is c not also real? But neither presentism nor the growing-past theory can allow c to be real. This argument against presentism and the growing-past theory presupposes the transitivity of co-existence.

Despite this criticism, (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. The implication is that, for event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero spacetime interval from a; yet many of Stein’s opponents, including his fellow presentists, do not like this implication.

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past theory usually will unite in opposition to eternalism for these five reasons: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special open and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists (as opposed to multiverse versions that say the block splits into multiple blocks for each quantum possibility at each instant), there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; but that denies our ability to affect the future, but it is known that we do have this ability. (iii) A present event moves in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness, but eternalism disallows this movement. (iv) Future events do not exist and so do not stand in relationships of before and after, but eternalism accepts these relationships. (v) Future-tensed statements that are contingent, such as “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” do not have existing truthmakers and so are neither true nor false, yet most eternalists mistakenly believe all these statements do have truth values now.

Defenders of eternalism and the block-universe offer a variety of responses to these criticisms. For instance, regarding (i), they are likely to say the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there, so why should the vividness of now imply the unreality of then? Regarding (ii) and the openness of the future, the block theory allows a closed future and the absence of libertarian free will, but it does not require this. Eventually, there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block that has not happened yet.

“Do we all not fear impending doom?” an eternalist might ask. But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the future doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious, says the eternalist. In 1981, J.J.C. Smart, a proponent of the block-universe, asked us to:

conceive of a soldier in the twenty-first century…cold, miserable and suffering from dysentery, and being told that some twentieth-century philosophers and non-philosophers had held that the future was unreal. He might have some choice things to say.

All observation is of the past. If you look at the North Star, you see it as it was, not as it is, because it takes so many years for the light to reach your eyes. The North Star might have burned out several years ago. If so, then you are seeing something that does not exist, according to the presentist. That is puzzling. Eternalism provides a way out of the puzzle: you are seeing an existing time-slice of the 4D block that is the North Star.

Determinism for a system is the thesis that specifying the state of the system fixes how the system evolves over time, either forward in time or backward in time. Determinism implies nothing that occurs is purely random. Here is a commonly offered defense of the block-universe theory against the charge that it demands determinism:

The block universe is not necessarily a deterministic one. …Strictly speaking, to say that the occurrence of a relatively later event is determined vis à vis a set of relatively earlier events, is only to say that there is a functional connection or physical law linking the properties of the later event to those of the earlier events. …Now in the block universe we may have partial or even total indeterminacy—there may be no functional connection between earlier and later events (McCall 1966, p. 271).

One defense of the block theory against Bergson’s charge that it inappropriately spatializes time is to point out that when we graph the color of eggs sold against the dollar amount of the sales, no one complains that we are inappropriately spatializing egg color. The issues of spatialization and determinism reflect a great philosophical divide between those who say the geometrical features of spacetime provide an explanation of physical phenomena or instead only a representation or codification of those phenomena.

Challenging the claim that the block universe theory must improperly spatialize time, but appreciating the point made by Bergson that users of the block universe can make the mistake of spatializing time, the pragmatist and physicist Lee Smolin says,

By succumbing to the temptation to conflate the representation with the reality and [to] identify the graph of the records of the motion with the motion itself, these scientists have taken a big step toward the expulsion of time from our conception of nature.

The confusion worsens when we represent time as an axis on a graph…This can be called spatializing time.

And the mathematical conjunction of the representations of space and time, with each having its own axis, can be called spacetime. The pragmatist will insist that this spacetime is not the real world. It’s entirely a human invention, just another representation…. If we confuse spacetime with reality, we are committing a fallacy, which can be called the fallacy of the spatialization of time. It is a consequence of forgetting the distinction between recording motion in time and time itself.

Once you commit this fallacy, you’re free to fantasize about the universe being timeless, and even being nothing but mathematics. But, the pragmatist says, timelessness and mathematics are properties of representations of records of motion—and only that.

For a survey of defenses for presentism and the growing-past theories, see (Putnam 1967), (Saunders 2002), (Markosian 2003), (Savitt 2008), and (Miller 2013, pp. 354-356).

b. The Present

There is considerable controversy among philosophers of time about what is meant by the present, and whether it is objectively real. If it were objective, it should be agreed upon by everyone, at least in principle. The A-theorists favor the claim that the present is objectively real; the B-theorists oppose it and say everything has its own personal time so there can be no fact of the matter as to which present is the real present. They say there is no problem with the notion of what is happening now here; the problem is with what is happening now there. Every event we detect is in our past

Let us consider some arguments in favor of the objectivity of the present, the reality of now. The now is so much more vivid to everyone than all other times. Past and future events are dim by comparison. Proponents of an objective present say that if scientific laws do not recognize this vividness, then there is a defect within science.

There is so much agreement among people about what is happening now and what is not. So, is that not a sign that the now is objective, not subjective? This agreement is reflected within our natural languages where we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

What have B-theorists said in response? Well, regarding vividness, we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with the experience of past presents and future presents. Yet that is what needs to be done for a fair comparison. Instead, when we speak of the “vividness” of our present experience of, say, a leaf falling in front of us, all we can do is compare our present experience of the leaf with our dim memories of leaves falling, and with even dimmer expectations of leaves yet to fall. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed, says the critic, by measuring those future events when they happen and not merely by measuring present expectations of those events.

In another attempt to undermine the vividness argument, the B-theorist points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now, in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer assures us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

When you speak on the phone with someone two hundred miles away, the conversation is normal because the two of you seem to share a common now. But that normalcy is only apparent because the phone signal travels the two hundred miles so quickly. During a phone conversation with someone much farther away, say on the Moon, you would notice a strange 1.3 second time lag because the Moon is 1.3 light seconds away from Earth. Suppose you were to look at your correct clock on Earth and notice it is midnight. What time would it be on the Moon, according to your clock? This is not a good question. A more sensible question is, “What events on the Moon are simultaneous with midnight on Earth, according to my clock?” You cannot look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes any signal that long to reach you from the Moon. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the explosion through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid must have struck the Moon at midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you will have a much longer wait. So, the moral is that the collection of events comprising your present is something you have to compute; you cannot directly perceive those events at once.

To continue advancing a pro-B-theory argument against an objective present, notice the difference in time between your clock which is stationary on Earth and the time of a pilot using a clock in a spaceship that is flying by you at high speed. Assume the spaceship flies very close to you and that the two clocks are synchronized and are working perfectly and they now show the time is midnight at the flyby. According to the special theory of relativity, the collection of events across the universe that you eventually compute and say occurs now at midnight, necessarily must be very different from the collection of events that the spaceship traveler computes and says occurs at midnight. You and the person on the spaceship probably will not notice much of a difference for an event at the end of your street or even for an event on another continent, but you will begin to notice the difference for an event on the Moon and even more so for an event somewhere across the Milky Way or, worse yet, for an event in the Andromeda galaxy. If the spaceship is flying toward Andromeda and away from you, then the spaceship’s now would include events on Andromeda and occurred thousands of years before you were born. If the spaceship is flying away from Andromeda, the spaceship’s now would include events on Andromeda that occur thousands of years in your future. Also, the difference in nows is more extreme the faster the spaceship’s speed as it flies by you. The implication, says the B theorist, is that there are a great many different nows and nobody’s now is the only correct one.

To make a similar point in the language of mathematical physics, something appropriately called a now would be an equivalence class of instances that occur at the same time. But because Einstein showed that time is relative to refence frame, there are different nows for different reference frames, so the notion of now is not frame-free and thus is not objective, contra the philosophical position of the A-theorist.

When the B-theorist says there is no fact of the matter about whether a distant explosion has happened, the A-theorist will usually disagree and say, regardless of your limitations on what knowledge you have, the explosion has occurred now or it hasn’t occurred now. But to the B-theorist to say this is to merely insist on the manifest image of time despite the implications of relativity theory.

But is there not a privileged reference frame in astronomy? Yes, it is the frame in which cosmic time is measured. This is the unique frame used when astronomers say the big bang began 13.8 billion years ago, or that the universe turned transparent 380,000 years after that. The frame is described in more detail in the companion article’s analysis of the big bang. This reference frame has an origin where the average motion of all the universe’s galaxies is stationary. Clocks fixed in this frame are sitting still while the universe expands around them; and at the frame’s origin, the universe is approximately isotropic at the cosmic scale, so the universe looks like it has the same average temperature in all directions. The origin is traveling about 350 km/s toward the constellation of Pisces and away from Leo. This is a privileged reference frame for astronomical convenience, and it is unique in the universe, but there is little reason to suppose this frame is what is sought by the A-theorist who believes in an objective present, nor by Isaac Newton who believed in absolute rest, nor by Maxwell who believed in his nineteenth century aether.

Opponents of an objective present frequently point out that none of the fundamental laws of physics pick out a present moment. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that some value of the time variable t is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally. If science’s laws do not need the present, then it is not real, say the B theorists. The counterargument is that it is the mistake of scientism to suppose that if something is not in our current theories, then it must not be real. France is real, but it is not mentioned in any scientific law.

In any discussion about whether the now is objective, one needs to remember that the term objective has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame, and there is objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent, and there is objective in the sense of not being anthropocentric. Proponents of the B-theory say the now is not objective in any of these senses.

There is considerable debate in the philosophical literature about whether the above treatment of the present in physics reveals an error in physics because, according to the A-theorists, the present moments are so special that the laws should somehow recognize them. They point out that even Einstein said, “There is something essential about the Now which is just outside the realm of science.” In 1925, the distinguished philosopher of science Hans Reichenbach criticized the block theory’s treatment of the present:

In the condition of the world, a cross-section called the present is distinguished; the ‘now’ has objective significance. Even when no human being is alive any longer, there is a ‘now’….

This claim has met stiff resistance. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later (Russell 1915, p. 212).

Rudolf Carnap added that a belief in the present is a matter for psychology, not physics.

The B-camp says belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now, when actually we are not factoring in the finite speed of light and sound. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases the present and now as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered by the speaker, and so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. A-theorists do not accept these criticisms.

There are interesting issues about the now in the philosophy of religion. For one example, Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this, says Kretzmann, God must always be changing because God’s knowledge keeps changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God’s being omniscient and God’s being immutable.

Disagreement about the now is an ongoing feature of debate in the philosophy of time, and there are many subtle moves made by advocates on each side of the issue. (Baron 2018) provides a broad overview of the debate about whether relativistic physics disallows an objective present.

c. Persistence, Four-Dimensionalism, and Temporal Parts

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional events. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism. Both eternalists and four-dimensionalists accept McTaggart’s B-theory.

Four-dimensionalism does not imply that time is identical to a dimension of space; space and time are very different, though they do have some similarities. However, when a four-dimensionalist represents time in a four-dimensional diagram, say, a Minkowski diagram, time is a special one of the four-dimensions of this mathematical space. Using this representation technique does not imply that a four-dimensionalist is committed to the claim that real, physical space itself is four-dimensional, but only that spacetime is.

Four-dimensionalists take a stand on the philosophical issue of endurance vs. perdurance. Some objects last longer than others, so we say they persist longer. But there is no philosophical consensus about how to understand persistence. Objects are traditionally said to persist by enduring over some time interval. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said, instead, to persist by perduring. These objects do not pass through time; they do not endure; instead, they extend through time.

The perduring object persists by being the sum or fusion of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages). Instantaneous temporal parts are called temporal slices and time slices. For example, a forty-year-old man is a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his three temporal stages that we call his childhood, his middle age, and his future old age. But his right arm is also a temporal part that has perdured for forty years.

Although the concept of temporal parts is more likely to be used by a four-dimensionalist, here is a definition of the concept from Judith Jarvis Thomson in terms of three-dimensional objects:

Let object O exist at least from time t0 to time t3. A temporal part P of O is an object that begins to exist at some time t1, where t1 ≥ t0, and goes out of existence at some time t2 ≤ t3, and takes up some portion of the space that O takes up for all the time that P exists.

Four-dimensionalists, by contrast, think of physical objects as regions of spacetime and as having temporal parts that extend along all four dimensions of the object. A more detailed presentation of these temporal parts should say whether four-dimensional objects have their spatiotemporal parts essentially.

David Lewis offers the following, fairly well-accepted definitions of perdurance and endurance:

Something perdures iff it persists by having different temporal parts, or stages, at different times, though no one part of it is wholly present at more than one time; whereas it endures iff it persists by being wholly present at more than one time.

The termiff stands for “if and only if.” Given a sequence of temporal parts, how do we know whether they compose a single perduring object? One answer, given by Hans Reichenbach, Ted Sider, and others, is that they compose a single object if the sequence falls under a causal law so that temporal parts of the perduring object cause other temporal parts of the object. Philosophers of time with a distaste for the concept of causality, oppose this answer.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easier time solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus Paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken because people often step into the same river twice. Who is really making the mistake?

The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken, says Lewis. We do not step into two different rivers, do we? They are the same river. Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. So, the advocate of endurance has trouble escaping the Heraclitus Paradox. So does the mereological essentialist.

A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus Paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-dimensional river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4D game.

For more examination of the issue with detailed arguments for and against perdurance and endurance, see (Wasserman, 2018), (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7), and especially the article “Persistence in Time” in this encyclopedia.

d. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences

The above disputes about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory have taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a related question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.

The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that the next day the admiral does order a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. The eternalist says that, if this is so, then the sentence token about the sea battle was true yesterday at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, eternalists say, and the predicate is true is a timeless predicate, not one that merely means is true now. The sentence spoken now has a truth-maker within the block at a future time, even though the event has not yet happened and so the speaker has no access to that truthmaker. These B-theory philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is simply true or false, even if we do not know which.

Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart’s A-camp, agree with Aristotle’s suggestion that the sentence about the future sea battle is not true (or false) until the battle occurs (or does not). Predictions fall into the truth-value gap. This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth-values when uttered is called the doctrine of the open future and also the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to have been holding the position in chapter 9 of his On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth-values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth-values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world as the libertarians believe they must; but, if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you were not free to do otherwise if your intentions had been different back then, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see the discussion of it in Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument, presumably:

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without both premises in this argument having truth-values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth-values of the component sentences—that a valid argument cannot possibly have true premises and a false conclusion. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false. So, logic does not apply. Surely, then, the Aristotelian position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as now and tomorrow because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal or complete sentences whose truth-values are not relative to the situation and time of utterance because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by expressions for specific times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth-values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine. For a criticism of Quine’s treatment of indexicals, see (Slater 2012, p. 72).

Philosophers are divided on all these issues.

e. Essentially-Tensed Facts

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. English has tenses, but the Chinese, Burmese, and Malay languages do not. The English language distinguishes “Her death has happened” from “Her death will happen.” However, English also expresses time in other ways: with the adverbial phrases now and twenty-three days ago, with the adjective phrases new and ancient, and with the prepositions until and since.

Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: tenses are objective, and tenses are subjective. The two answers have given rise to two competing camps of philosophers of time.

The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by the B-theory, nor by eternalism, nor by the block-universe approach. This philosophical theory is said to “take tense seriously” and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that, when we learn the truth-values of certain tensed sentences, we obtain knowledge which tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time. Tenses are almost the same as what is represented by positions in McTaggart‘s A-series, so the theory that takes tense seriously is commonly called the A-theory of tense, and its advocates are called tensers.

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Tensed terms have an indexical feature which is specific to the subject doing the speaking, but this feature has no ontological significance. Saying the event happened rather than is happening indicates that the subject or speaker said this after the event happened rather than before or during the event. Tenses are about speakers, not about some other important ontological characteristic of time in the world. This theory is the B-theory of tense, and its advocates are called detensers. The detenser W.V.O. Quine expressed the position this way:

Our ordinary language shows a tiresome bias in its treatment of time. Relations of date are exalted grammatically…. This bias is of itself an inelegance, or breach of theoretical simplicity. Moreover, the form that it takes—that of requiring that every verb form show a tense—is peculiarly productive of needless complications, since it demands lipservice to time even when time is farthest from our thoughts. Hence in fashioning canonical notations it is usual to drop tense distinctions (Word and Object §36).

The philosophical disagreement about tenses is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark.

The controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their truthmakers.

The B-theorist says tensed facts are not needed to account for why tensed sentences get the truth values they do.

Consider the tensed sentence, “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the tensed fact that the death has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the above sentence. Notice that the B-answer does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, any appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language at the fundamental level, as are all other uses of the terminology of the A-series (except in trivial instances such as “The A-series is constructed using A-facts”).

This B-theory analysis is challenged by the tenser’s A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but the A-theorist points out that a proposition can be true even if never uttered, never read, and never inscribed.

There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A.N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present-tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis of it, such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight,” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress. John Perry famously explored this argument in his article, “The Problem of the Essential Indexical.”

Prior, in (Prior 1959), supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” The B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness, he says, because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of “Thank goodness that is over,” since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event is in the past, that is, we are thankful for the pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice in which we are saying, “Thank goodness that is over.” Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So, Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is unsuccessful.

D.H. Mellor and J.J.C. Smart, both proponents of the B-theory, agree that tensed talk is important, and can be true, and even be essential for understanding how we think and speak; but Mellor and Smart claim that tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality and that the extra-linguistic reality does not contain tense facts corresponding to true, tensed talk. These two philosophers, and many other philosophers who “do not take tense seriously,” advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed, declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior and other A-theorists are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones.

The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence “Snow is white” is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term ‘snow’ satisfies the predicate ‘is white’. Regarding if-then sentences, the conditions under which the sentence “If it is snowing, then it is cold” are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically. Alfred Tarski has provided these analyses in his semantic theory of truth.

Mellor and Smart agree that truth conditions can adequately express the meaning of tensed sentences or all that is important about the meaning when it comes to describing objective reality. This is a philosophically controversial point, but Mellor and Smart accept it, and argue that therefore there is really no need for tensed facts and tensed properties. The untranslatability of some tensed sentences merely shows a fault with ordinary language‘s ability to characterize objective, tenseless reality. If the B-theory, in accounting for the truth conditions of an A-sentence, fails to account for the full meaning of the A-sentence, then this is because of a fault with the A-sentence, not the B-theory.

Let us make the same point in other words. According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, “It is now midnight,” then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without some loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of “It is now midnight” are that my utterance occurs (in the tenseless sense of occurs) at very nearly the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it is true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in this explanation of the truth conditions.

Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist’s chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this; and even though it was true even last month that the one time occurred before the other, I am happy to learn this. Of course, I would be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Being thankful for the pastness of the painful event provides a simpler explanation, actually a simplistic explanation, but not a better explanation.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.

To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but proponents of the new B-theory claim their analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should “not take tense seriously” in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not actually needed.

Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. They will insist there are irreducible A-properties and that what I am glad about when a painful event is over is that the event is earlier than now, that is, has pastness. Quentin Smith says, more generally, that the “new tenseless theory of time is faced with insurmountable problems, and that it ought to be abandoned in favor of the tensed theory.”

The advocate of the A-theory E.J. Lowe opposed the B-theory because it conflicts so much with the common sense image of time:

I consider it to be a distinct merit of the tensed view of time that it delivers this verdict, for it surely coincides with the verdict of common sense (Lowe, 1998, p. 104).

Lowe argued that no genuine event can satisfy a tenseless predicate, and no truth can be made true by B-theory truth conditions because all statements of truth conditions are tensed.

So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

15. The Arrow of Time

Time has an arrow, but space does not. Philosophers of physics want to know the origin and nature of this arrow such as whether it is fundamental in the universe or, instead, derivative or emergent. The arrow is what the Roman poet Ovid was referring to when he said, “Time itself glides on with constant motion, ever as a flowing river.” This arrow is Nature’s preferring that tomorrow be different from today. There is no turning back. And this feature is not a fickle thing that comes and goes each month.

Although the previous remarks are suggestive, they need philosophical clarification. The remark that time has an arrow or a direction is metaphorical. Normally it is paths and moving objects that are said to have a direction. The reason some philosophers give for why the metaphor is apt is that tomorrow is never the same as today; today always produces a new tomorrow. You will never observe today’s breakfast omelets turning back into unbroken eggs tomorrow, nor all the light rays tomorrow returning to today’s lit candle. Macroscopic processes like these are never observed to reverse spontaneously, so they are said to be irreversible. It may be physically possible for them to reverse, but this would require either (1) someone actively intervening and employing considerable energy resources or (2) if the reversal is to occur spontaneously, that is, without intervention, then it would not be expected to occur for trillions of years or more, and it would be less likely the more constituent particles that are involved.

Among physicists, the most popular proposal for analyzing the arrow implies that time’s arrow is not in time itself, which has no arrow. Instead, the arrow is the amalgamation of all the universe’s irreversible physical processes. According to this controversial proposal, the main difficulties are to explain why irreversible processes are irreversible, and to explain why the irreversible processes occur so much more frequently than the reversible ones.

This frequent occurrence of irreversible processes is puzzling because the fundamental laws describing them are reversible in the sense that they permit every significant irreversible process to go in reverse. An appeal to a law always is needed for a good scientific explanation, so does this reversible feature of the fundamental laws imply that the arrow of time is describable but not explainable?

One popular proposal is that there exists such a preponderance of irreversible processes because of statistical reasons having to do with entropy increases and the special uniformity of the big bang explosion. One controversial issue with this proposal is whether the assumption of this special uniformity is unacceptably ad hoc.

Philosophers also ask: (1) Is there a fundamental, objective distinction between time’s two directions? (2) Does time have an arrow in one sense but not in another? (3) Is the arrow a fundamental, irreducible, inexplicable fact, or can it be analyzed as being grounded in the nature of spacetime, or as emerging somehow from temporally irreversible, physical processes? (4) Does the arrow depend on contingent facts about how matter and energy are distributed?

There are other interesting issues. Is the arrow of entropy-increase fundamental in the sense that this thermodynamic arrow can be used successfully to account for all the other specific arrows of time—for example, these three: The arrow of life proceeding from birth to death rather than from death to birth, the arrow of the universe’s expanding and never shrinking, and the arrow of memory always being of the past and never the future? Could there be distant regions of space and time where the arrow runs in reverse compared to our arrow? If so, would adults there naturally walk backwards on the way to their infancy while they remember the future?

It is commonly said that time has an arrow if time is asymmetric. What does that mean? Here is the definition of an asymmetric relation:

A binary relation, say R, on a set S of objects is asymmetric if and only if, for arbitrary members of S, such as x and y, if xRy, then not also yRx.

Time is not a binary relation, so what does it mean for time to be asymmetric? Perhaps it means that the happens-before relation is asymmetric on the set of point events.

For more discussion of the arrow, see (Carroll 2010).

16. Temporal Logic

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time and temporal information by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements imply which others. For example, in McTaggart’s B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time and temporal information.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Alice’s arrival at the train station happens before Bob’s. Therefore, Bob’s arrival at the station does not happen before Alice’s.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant ‘a’ denotes Alice’s arrival at the train station, and ‘b’ denotes Bob’s arrival at the train station. Let the two-place or two-argument relation Bxy be interpreted as x happens before y. The direct translation of the above informal argument produces:


The symbol ‘~’ is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol ‘¬’ for negation. Unfortunately, this simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we can add some semantic principles about the happens-before relation, namely, the premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we can add this additional premise to the argument:

∀x∀y[Bxy ~Byx]

The symbol ‘∀’ is the universal quantifier on ‘x’. Some logicians prefer to use ‘(x)’ for the universal quantifier. The symbol ‘→’ is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol ‘⊃’ instead.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Alice arrives at the train station before Bob, and suppose Bob arrives there before Carol. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Alice arrives before Carol? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:


To make this argument be valid we can add the premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) Bxz]

The symbol ‘&’ represents the conjunction operation. Some logicians prefer to use either the symbol ‘·‘ or ‘∧’ for conjunction. The transitivity of B is a principle we may want to add to our temporal logic.

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions:

  • ∀x∀y{Bxy → [t(x) < t(y)]}. If x happens before y, then the time coordinate of x is less than the time coordinate of y. ‘t’ is a one-argument function symbol.
  • ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself.
  • ∀x∀y{[t(x) ≠ t(y)] → [Bxy v Byx]}. Any two non-simultaneous events are connected by the B relation. That is, there are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. (In his Critique of Pure Reason, Kant says this is an apriori necessary requirement.)
  • ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future.
  • ∀x∀y(Bxy → ∃z(Bxz & Bzy)). B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any pair of non-simultaneous point events. This prevents quantized time.

To incorporate the ideas of the theory of relativity, we might want to make the happens-before relation be three-valued instead of two-valued by having it relate two events plus a reference frame.

When we formalized these principles of reasoning about the happens-before relation by translating them into predicate logic, we said we were creating temporal logic. However, strictly speaking, a temporal logic is just a theory of temporal sentences expressed in a formal logic. Calling it a logic, as is commonly done, is a bit of an exaggeration; it is analogous to calling the formalization of Peano’s axioms of arithmetic the development of number logic. Our axioms about B are not axioms of predicate logic, but only of a theory that uses predicate logic and that presumes the logic is interpreted on a domain of instantaneous events, and that presumes B is not open to re-interpretation as are the other predicate letters of predicate logic, but is always to be interpreted as happens-before.

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments formalized in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. A. N. Prior was the pioneer in the late 1950s. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. Prior created this new logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as now, happens before, twenty-three minutes afterward, at all times, and sometimes. He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to the resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V.O. Quine, who prefer to avoid the use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false.

Prior’s main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as it is possible that and it is necessary that. He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic by re-interpreting its propositional operators. Or we can say he added four new propositional operators. Here they are with examples of their intended interpretations using an arbitrary present-tensed proposition p.

Pp “It has at some time been the case that p”
Fp “It will at some time be the case that p”
Hp “It has always been the case that p”
Gp “It will always be the case that p”

‘Pp’ might be interpreted also as at some past time it was the case that, or it once was the case that, or it once was that, all these being equivalent English phrases for the purposes of applying tense logic to English. None of the tense operators are truth-functional.

One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, if p represents the present-tensed proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp represents “It has at some time been the case that Custer dies in Montana” which is equivalent in English to simply “Custer died in Montana.” So, we call ‘P’ the past-tense operator. It represents a phrase that attaches to a sentence in order to produce another.

Metaphysicians who are presentists are especially interested in this tense logic because, if Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then this logic, with an appropriate semantics, may show how to eliminate any ontological commitment to the past (and future) while preserving the truth of past tense propositions that appear in biology books such as “There were dinosaurs” and “There was a time when the Earth did not exist.”

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom:

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq).

The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then:

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)


Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the following equivalence. For all propositions p and q,

(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom, when interpreted in tense logic, captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator It has always been the case that, then a new axiom might be:

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not necessary that not-p.

A tense logic will need additional axioms in order to express q has been true for the past two weeks. Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic. It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time,
for example that it comes to an end or does not come to an end or that time is like a line instead of a circle; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth or falsehood of a tensed proposition could be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, the proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true-at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

Prior himself did not take a stand on which formal logic and formal semantics are correct for dealing with temporal expressions.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, for example, “The event of Queen Anne’s dying has the property of being in the past”; but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, “It has at some time in the past been the case that Queen Anne is dying,” and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. Instead of translating the x is resting predicate as Px, where P is a one-argument predicate, it could be translated into temporal predicate logic as the two-argument predicate Rxt, and this would be interpreted as saying x is resting at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate R by adding a place for a temporal argument. The time variable t is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms to more carefully specify what can be assumed about the nature of time.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say n, to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let the individual constant s denote Socrates, and let Rst be interpreted as “Socrates is resting at t.” The false sentence that Socrates has always been resting would be expressed in this first-order temporal logic as:

∀t(Ltn → Rst)

Here L is the two-argument predicate for numerically less than that mathematicians usually write as <. And we see the usefulness of having the symbol n.

If tense logic is developed using a Kripke semantics of possible worlds, then it is common to alter the accessibility relation between any two possible worlds by relativizing it to a time. The point is to show that some old possibilities are no longer possible. For example, a world in which Hillary Clinton becomes the first female U.S. president in 2016 was possible relative to the actual world of 2015, but not relative to the actual world of 2017. There are other complexities. Within a single world, if we are talking about a domain of people containing, say, Socrates, then we want the domain to vary with time since we want Socrates to exist at some times but not at others. Another complexity is that in any world, what event is simultaneous with what other event should be relativized to a reference frame.

Some temporal logics have a semantics that allows sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth-values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having just one of the three truth-values True, or False, or Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

For an introduction to temporal logics and their formal semantics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

17. Time, Mind, and Experience

The principal philosophical issue about time and mind is to specify how time is represented in the mind; and the principal scientific issue in cognitive neuroscience is to uncover the neurological basis of our sense of time.

No time cell nor a master clock has been discovered so far in the human body, despite much searching, so many neuroscientists have come to believe there are no such things to be found. Instead, the neurological basis of our time sense probably has to do with coordinated changes in a network of neurons that somehow encodes time information.

These neuroscientists want to understand the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our ability to anticipate the future, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place remembered events into the correct time order (temporal succession), for our construction of a specious present, for our understanding of tenses, and for our ability to notice and often accurately estimate durations (persistence).

It surely is the case that our body is capable of detecting very different durations even if we are not conscious of doing so. When we notice that the sound came from our left, not right, we do this by unconsciously detecting the very slight extra time it takes the sound to reach our right ear, which is only an extra 0.0005 seconds after reaching our left ear. The way we detect this difference in time is very different from the way we detect differences in weeks. Also, our neurological and psychological “clocks” very probably do not work by our counting oscillations, the ticks and tocks, as do the clocks we build in order to measure physical time.

We are consciously aware of time passing by noticing changes either outside or inside our body. For example, we notice a leaf fall from a tree as it acquires a new location. If we close our eyes, we still can encounter time just by imagining a leaf falling. But scientists and philosophers want more details. How is this encounter with time accomplished?

With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. Some say our consciousness is a device that stores information about the past in order to predict the future. Although some researchers believe consciousness is a hard problem to understand, some others have said, “Consciousness seems easy to me: it’s merely the thoughts we can remember.” We remember old perceptions, and we make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing. Surely memory is key. Memories need to be organized into the proper temporal order in analogy to how a deck of cards, each with a different integer on the cards, can be sorted into numerical order. There is a neurological basis to the mental process of time-stamping memories so they are not just a jumble when recalled or retrieved into consciousness. Dogs successfully time-stamp their memories when they remember where they hid their bone and when they can plan for the short-term future by standing at the door to encourage their owner to open it. The human’s ability to organize memories far surpasses any other conscious being. We can decide to do next week what we planned last month because of what happened last year. This is a key part of what makes homo sapiens be sapien.

A major neurological problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. How do brains take the input from all its sense organs and produce true beliefs about the world’s temporal relationships? Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate this, but so far there is no consensus on either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do. However, there is a growing consensus that consciousness itself is an emergent property of a central nervous system, and that dualism between mental properties and physical properties is not a fruitful supposition.

Neuroscientists agree that the brain takes a pro-active role in building a mental scenario of the external 3+1-dimensional world. As one piece of suggestive evidence, notice that if you look at yourself in the mirror and glance at your left eyeball, then glance at your right eyeball, and then glance back to the left, you can never see your own eyes move. Your brain always constructs a continuous story of non-moving eyes. However, a video camera taking pictures of your face easily records your eyeballs’ movements, proving that your brain has taken an active role in “doctoring” the scenario.

Researchers believe that at all times our mind is testing hypotheses regarding what is taking place beyond our brain. The brain continually receives visual, auditory, tactile, and other sensory signals arriving at different times from an event, then must produce a hypothesis about what the signals might mean. Do those signals mean there probably is a tiger rushing at us? The brain also continuously revises hypotheses and produces new ones in an attempt to have a coherent story about what is out there, what is happening before what, and what is causing what. Being good at unconsciously producing, testing, and revising these hypotheses has survival value.

Psychological time’s rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. The most obvious feature is that psychological time often gets out of sync with physical time, clock time. At the end of viewing an engrossing television program, we often think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” When we are hungry in the afternoon and have to wait until the end of the workday before we can have dinner, we think, “Why is everything taking so long?” When we are feeling pain and we look at a clock, the clock seems to be ticking slower than normal.

An interesting feature of the rate of passage of psychological time reveals itself when we compare the experiences of younger people to older people. When we are younger, we lay down richer memories because everything is new. When we are older, the memories we lay down are much less rich because we have “seen it all before.” That is why older people report that a decade goes by so much more quickly than it did when they were younger.

Do things seem to move more slowly when we are terrified? “Yes,” most people would say. “No,” says neuroscientist David Eagleman, “it’s a retrospective trick of memory.” The terrifying event does seem to you to move more slowly when you think about it later, but not at the time it is occurring. Because memories of the terrifying event are “laid down so much more densely,” Eagleman says, it seems to you, upon your remembering, that your terrifying event lasted longer than it really did. For one of these events, the duration measured in psychological time is stretched compared to the event measured in physical time.

Although the cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats can distinguish a five-second interval and a forty-second interval even with their cerebral cortex removed. So, a rat’s means of sensing time is probably distributed throughout many places in its brain. Perhaps the human being’s time sense is similarly distributed. However, surely the fact that we know that we know about time is specific to our cerebral cortex. A rat does not know that it knows. It has competence without comprehension. A cerebral cortex apparently is required for this comprehension. Very probably no other primate has an appreciation of time that is as sophisticated as that had by any normal human being.

We humans are very good at detecting the duration of silences. We need this ability to tell the difference between the spoken sentence, “He gave her cat-food,” and “He gave her cat food.” The hyphen is the linguistic tool for indicating that the duration between the spoken words “cat” and “food” is shorter than usual. This is a favorite example of the neuroscientist Dean Buonomano.

Philosophers and cognitive neuroscientists want to know whether we have direct experience only of an instantaneous present event or instead we have direct experience only of the specious present, a present event that lasts a short stretch of physical time. Informally, the issue is said to be whether the present is thin or thick. Plato, Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed in a thin present. Shadworth Hodgson, Mary Calkins and William James believed in a thick present. The latter position is now the more favored one by experts in neuroscience and philosophy.

If it is thick, then how thick? Does the present last longer than the blink of an eye? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, a good estimate of its duration is approximately eighty milliseconds for human beings, although neuroscientists do not yet know why it is not two milliseconds or two seconds. We do seem to have a unified stream of consciousness, but how do our individual specious presents overlap to produce this?

When you open your eyes, can you see what is happening now? In 1630, René Descartes would have said yes, but most philosophers today say no. You see the North Star as it was over 300 years ago, not as it is now. Also, light arriving at your eye from an external object contains information about its color, motion, and form. The signals arrive simultaneously, but it takes your brain different times to process that information. Color information is processed more quickly than motion information, which in turn is processed more quickly than form information. Only after the light has taken its time to arrive at your eye, and then you have processed all the information, can you construct a correct story that perhaps says, “A white golf ball is flying toward me.”

So, we all live in the past—in the sense that our belief about what is happening occurs later than when it really happened according to a clock. Our brain takes about eighty milliseconds to reconstruct a story of what is happening based on the information coming in from our different sense organs. Because of its long neck, a giraffe’s specious present might last considerably longer. However, it cannot take too much longer than this or else the story is so outdated that the organism risks becoming a predator’s lunch. Therefore, evolution has probably fine-tuned each kind of organism’s number of milliseconds of its specious present.

In the early days of television broadcasting, engineers worried about the problem of keeping audio and video signals synchronized. Then they accidentally discovered that they had about a tenth-of-a-second of “wiggle room.” As long as the signals arrive within this period, viewers’ brains automatically re-synchronize the signals; outside that tenth-of-a-second period, it suddenly looks like a badly dubbed movie. (Eagleman, 2009)

Watch a bouncing basketball. The light from the bounce arrives into our eyes before the sound arrives into our ears; then the brain builds a story in which the sight and sound of the bounce happen simultaneously. This sort of subjective synchronizing of visual and audio works for the bouncing ball so long as the ball is less than 100 feet away. Any farther and we begin to notice that the sound arrives later.

Philosophers of time and psychologists who study time are interested in both how a person’s temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and how different interventions into a healthy person’s brain might affect that person’s temporal experience.

Some of neuroscientist David Eagleman’s experiments have shown clearly that under certain circumstances a person can be deceived into believing event A occurred before event B, when in fact the two occurred in the reverse order according to clock time. For more on these topics, see (Eagleman, 2011).

The time dilation effect in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. With repeated events lasting the same amount of clock time, presenting a brighter object will make that event seem to last longer. This is likewise true for louder sounds.

Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine and are temporarily closed off from communicating with the world above. For a long while, simply with memory, you can keep track of how long you have been inside the mine, but eventually you will lose track of the correct clock time. What determines how long the long while is, and how is it affected by the subject matter? And why are some persons better estimators than others?

Do we directly experience the present? This is controversial, and it is not the same question as whether at present we are having an experience. Those who answer “yes” tend to accept McTaggart’s A-theory of time. But notice how different such direct experience would have to be from our other direct experiences. We directly experience green color but can directly experience other colors; we directly experience high-pitched notes but can directly experience other notes. Can we say we directly experience the present time but can directly experience other times? Definitely not. So, the direct experience of the present either is non-existent, or it is a strange sort of direct experience. Nevertheless, we probably do have some mental symbol for nowness in our mind that correlates with our having the concept of the present, but it does not follow from this that we directly experience the present any more than our having a concept of love implies that we directly experience love. For an argument that we do not experience the present, see chapter 9 of (Callender 2017).

If all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a philosophically controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and add “Whose future?”

The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon such as a secondary quality, is explored elsewhere in this article.

According to René Descartes’ dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in both space and time due to the functioning of our brain. It takes no position, though, on the controversial issue of whether the process of conscious human understanding is a computation.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high-quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a ledge into a net; and trying different forms of meditation. These avenues definitely affect the ease with which pulses of neurotransmitters can be sent from one neuron to a neighboring neuron and thus affect our psychological time, but so far, none of these avenues has led to success productivity-wise.

For our final issue about time and mind, do we humans have an a priori awareness of time that can be used to give mathematics a firm foundation? In the early twentieth century, the mathematician and philosopher L.E.J. Brouwer believed so. Many mathematicians and philosophers at that time were suspicious that mathematics was not as certain as they hoped for, and they worried that contradictions might be uncovered within mathematics. Their suspicions were increased by the discovery of Russell’s Paradox and by the introduction into set theory of the controversial non-constructive axiom of choice. In response, Brouwer attempted to place mathematics on what he believed to be a firmer epistemological foundation by arguing that mathematical concepts are admissible only if they can be constructed from an ideal mathematician’s vivid, a priori awareness of time, what in Kantian terminology is called an intuition of inner time. Time, said Kant in his Critique of Pure Reason in 1781, is a structuring principle of all possible experience. As such time is not objective; it is not a feature of things-in-themselves, but rather is a feature of the phenomenal world.

Brouwer supported Kant’s claim that arithmetic is the pure form of temporal intuition. Brouwer tried to show how to construct higher-level mathematical concepts (for example, the mathematical line) from lower-level temporal intuitions; but unfortunately, he had to accept the consequence that his program required both rejecting Aristotle’s law of excluded middle in logic and rejecting some important theorems in mathematics such as the theorem that every real number has a decimal expansion and the theorem that there is an actual infinity as opposed to a potential infinity of points between any two points on the mathematical line. Unwilling to accept those inconsistencies with classical mathematics, most other mathematicians and philosophers instead rejected Brouwer’s idea of an intimate connection between mathematics and time.

For interesting video presentations about psychological time, see (Carroll 2012) and (Eagleman 2011). For the role of time in phenomenology, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” According to the phenomenologist Edmund Husserl, “One cannot discover the least thing about objective time through phenomenological analysis” (Husserl, 1991, p. 6).

Consider the mind of an extraterrestrial. Is it likely that our civilization and an extraterrestrial’s civilization have the same concept of physical time? Could an extraterrestrial arrive here on Earth with no concept of time? Probably not. How about arriving with a very different concept of time from ours? Perhaps, but how different? Stephen Hawking’s colleague James Hartle claimed we and the extraterrestrial will, “share concepts of past, present and future, and the idea of a flow of time.”

18. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

  1. What Are Instants, Moments, and Durations?
  2. What Is an Event?
  3. What Is a Reference Frame?
    1. Why Do Cartesian Coordinates Fail?
  4. What Is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What Is Spacetime?
  6. What Is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What Are Time’s Metric and Spacetime’s Interval?
  8. Proper Time or Coordinate Time?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How Is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What Is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What Is Time Dilation?
  16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox?
  19. What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What Is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?
  24. What Is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What Is a Field?

b. What Else Science Requires of Time

1. What are Theories of Physics?
2. Relativity Theory
3. Quantum Theory
a. The Standard Model
4. Big Bang
a. Cosmic Inflation
b. Eternal Inflation and the Multiverse
5. Infinite Time

c. Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)

19. References and Further Reading

  • Arthur, Richard T. (2014). Leibniz. Polity Press. Cambridge, U.K.
    • Comprehensive monograph on all things Leibniz, with a detailed examination of his views on time.
  • Barbour, Julian. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York, 1999.
    • A popular presentation of Barbour’s theory which implies that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. Time is emergent and not fundamental. He then offers an exotic explanation of how time emerges and why time seems to us to exist.
  • Barbour, Julian. The Nature of Time, arXiv:0903.3489, 2009.
    • An application of the above ideas of strong emergentism to classical physics.
  • Baron, Sam. “Time, Physics, and Philosophy: It’s All Relative,” Philosophy Compass, Volume 13, Issue 1, January 2018.
    • Reviews the conflict between the special theory of relativity and the dynamic theories of time.
  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. “Is Time an Illusion?”, Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
  • Callender, Craig. What Makes Time Special? Oxford University Press, 2017.
    • A comprehensive monograph on the relationship between the manifest image of time and its scientific image. The book makes a case for how, if information gathering and utilizing systems like us are immersed in an environment with the physical laws that do hold, then we will create the manifest image of time that we do. Not written at an introductory level.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. Philosophical Foundations of Physics: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Science. Basic Books, Inc. New York. 1966.
    • Chapter 8 “Time” is devoted to the issue of how to distinguish an accurate clock from an inaccurate one.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three “Entropy and Time’s Arrow” provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time’s arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of what happens in an interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of time goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. “Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time,” Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening “now.”
  • Carroll, Sean. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia 2012.
    • A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues. Emphasizes the arrow of time.
  • Carroll, Sean. The Big Picture. Dutton/Penguin Random House. New York. 2016.
    • A physicist surveys the cosmos’ past and future, including the evolution of life.
  • Carroll, Sean. Something Deeply Hidden: Quantum Worlds and the Emergence of Spacetime, Dutton/Penguin Random House. 2019.
    • Pages 287-289 explain how time emerges in a quantum universe governed by the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, a timeless version of the Schrödinger equation. The chapter “Breathing in Empty Space” explains why the limits of time (whether it is infinite or finite) depend on the total amount of energy in the universe. His podcast Mindscape in August 13, 2018 “Why Is There Something Rather than Nothing?” discusses this topic in its final twenty minutes. His answer is that this may not be a sensible question to ask.
  • Crowther, Karen. “When Do We Stop Digging? Conditions on a Fundamental Theory of Physics,” in What is ‘Fundamental’?, edited by Anthony Aguirre, Brendan Foster, and Zeeya Merali, Springer International Publishing, 2019.
    • An exploration of what physicists do mean and should mean when they say a particular theory of physics is final or fundamental rather than more fundamental. She warns, “a theory formally being predictive to all high-energy scales, and thus apparently being the lowest brick in the tower [of theories] (or, at least, one of the bricks at the lowest level of the tower), is no guarantee that it is in fact a fundamental theory. …Yet, it is one constraint on a fundamental theory.” When we arrive at a fundamental theory, “the question shifts from ‘What if there’s something beyond?’ to ‘Why should we think there is something beyond?” That is, the burden of justification is transferred.”
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s claim to have discovered in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice. This claim has radical implications for the philosophical issue of free will.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy-to-read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity and other scientific advances on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Deutsch, David, “The Philosophy of Constructor Theory,” Synthese, Volume 190, Issue 18, 2013.
    • Challenges Laplace’s Paradigm that physics should be done by predicting what will happen from initial conditions and laws of motion. http://dx.doi.org/10.1007/s11229-013-0279-z.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers many of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article. Easy reading for newcomers to the philosophy of time.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Eagleman David. “Brain Time.” In What’s Next? Dispatches on the Future of Science. Max Brockman, Ed., Penguin Random House. 2009.
    • A neuroscientist discusses the plasticity of time perception or temporal distortion.
  • Eagleman David. “David Eagleman on CHOICE,” Oct. 4, 2011. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=MkANniH8XZE.
    • Commentary on research on subjective time.
  • Einstein, Albert. “Autobiographical Notes.” In P. A. Schilpp, ed. Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, vol. 1. LaSalle, Il. Open Court Publishing Company, 1982.
    • Describes his early confusion between the structure of the real number line and the structure of time itself.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
    • Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
  • Gödel, Kurt. “A Remark about the Relationship between Relativity Theory and Idealistic Philosophy,” in P. A. Schilpp, ed., Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, Harper & Row, New York. 1959.
    • Discussion of solutions to Einstein’s equations that allow closed causal chains, that is, traveling to your past.
  • Grant, Andrew. “Time’s Arrow,” Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
    • Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
  • Greene, Brian. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York. 2011.
    • Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Guth, Alan. “Infinite Phase Space and the Two-Headed Arrow of Time,” FQXi conference 2014 in Vieques, Puerto Rico. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=AmamlnbDX9I. 2014.
    • Guth argues that an arrow of time could evolve naturally even though it had no special initial conditions on entropy, provided the universe has an infinite available phase space that the universe could spread out into. If so, its maximum possible entropy is infinite, and any other state in which the universe begins will have relatively low entropy.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 14d of the present article) for truth-value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this special space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action. Horwich argues that time itself has no arrow.
  • Huggett, Nick. Space from Zeno to Einstein, MIT Press, 1999.
    • Clear discussion of the debate between Leibniz and Newton on relational vs. absolute (substantival) time.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time. Translated by J. B. Brough. Originally published 1893-1917. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
    • The father of phenomenology discusses internal time consciousness.
  • Ijjas, Anna and Paul J. Steinhardt and Abraham Loeb, “Pop Goes the Universe,” Scientific American, pp. 32-39, February 2017.
    • Challenges the theories of the multiverse, inflation, and the classical Big Bang Theory, and promotes the Big Bounce Theory as equally plausible to the Big Bang Theory.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Kirk, G.S. & Raven, J.E. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1957.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York, 2012.
    • Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss’ position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss’ hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow.
  • Lewis, David K. “The Paradoxes of Time Travel.” American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52, 1986.
    • A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveler,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Lowe, E. J., The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity and Time, Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • This Australian metaphysician defends the A-theory’s tensed view of time in chapter 4, based on an ontology of substances rather than events.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. “The Essence of Space-Time.” Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1988, Vol. 1988, Volume Two: Symposia and Invited Papers (1988), pp. 82-91.
    • Maudlin discusses the hole argument, manifold substantivalism and metrical essentialism.
  • Maudlin, Tim. “Remarks on the Passing of Time,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 2002, New Series, Vol. 102 (2002), pp. 259-274 Published by: Oxford University Press. https://www.jstor.org/stable/4545373. 2002.
    • Defends eternalism, the block universe, and the passage of time.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • Maudlin, Tim. Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time, Princeton University Press, 2012.
    • An advanced introduction to the conceptual foundations of spacetime theory.
  • McCall, Storrs. “II. Temporal Flux,” American Philosophical Quarterly, October 1966.
    • An analysis of the block universe, the flow of time, and the difference between past and future.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument for the inconsistency that a single event has only one of the properties of being past, present, or future, but that any event also has all three of these properties is called “McTaggart’s Paradox.” The chapter is renamed “The Unreality of Time,” and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (Le Poidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Merali, Zeeya. “Theoretical Physics: The Origins of Space and Time,” Nature, 28 August 2013, vol. 500, pp. 516-519.
    • Describes six theories that compete for providing an explanation of the basic substratum from which space and time emerge.
  • Miller, Kristie. “Presentism, Eternalism, and the Growing Block,” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., pp. 345-364, 2013.
    • Compares the pros and cons of competing ontologies of time.
  • Morris, Michael S., Kip S. Thorne and Ulvi Yurtsever, “Wormholes, Time Machines, and the Weak Energy Condition,” Physical Review Letters, vol. 61, no. 13, 26 September 1988.
    • The first description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Moskowitz, Clara, “In Every Bit of Nothing There is Something,” Scientific American, February 2021.
    • Describes how the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle requires there to be continual creation and annihilation of virtual particles. This process is likely to be the cause of dark energy and the accelerating expansion of space.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. “The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century,” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Muller, Richard A. NOW: The Physics of Time. W. W. Norton & Company, New York, 2016a.
    • An informal presentation of the nature of time by an experimental physicist at the University of California, Berkeley. Chapter 15 argues that the correlation between the arrow of time and the increase of entropy is not a causal connection. Chapter 16 discusses the competing arrows of time. Muller favors space expansion as the cause of time’s arrow, with entropy not being involved. And he recommends a big bang theory in which both space and time expand, not simply space. Because space and time are so intimately linked, he says, the expansion of space is propelling time forward, and this explains the “flow” of time. However, “the new nows [are] created at the end of time, rather than uniformly throughout time.” (p. 8)
  • Muller, Richard. “Now and the Flow of Time,” arXiv, https://arxiv.org/pdf/1606.07975.pdf, 2016b.
    • Argues that the flow of time consists of the continual creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space.”
  • Nadis, Steve. “Starting Point,” Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
  • Norton, John. “Time Really Passes,” Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that, “We don’t find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion.”
  • Novikov, Igor. The River of Time, Cambridge University Press. 1998.
    • Chapter 14 gives a very clear and elementary description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Penrose, Roger. The Road to Reality: A Complete Guide to the Laws of the Universe. Alfred A. Knopf, 2004.
    • A mathematical physicist discusses cosmology, general relativity, and the second law of thermodynamics, but not at an introductory level.
  • Perry, John. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical,” Noûs, 13 (1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot all be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that time in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses, in the sense of verb conjugations, but of course, it expresses all sorts of concepts about time in other ways.
  • Plato. Parmenides, trans. F. Macdonald Cornford in The Collected Dialogues of Plato, ed. E. Hamilton and H. Cairns. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. 1961.
    • Plato discusses time.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Price, Huw. Time’s Arrow & Archimedes’ Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time. Oxford University Press. 1996.
    • Price believes the future can affect the past, the notion of direction of the flow cannot be established as an objective notion, and philosophers of physics need to adopt an Archimedean point of view outside of time in order to discuss time in an unbiased manner.
  • Prior, A.N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our feeling of relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A.N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • Pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, that permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A.N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A.N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. “Time and Physical Geometry,” The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist. Putnam believes that the manifest image of time is refuted by relativity theory.
  • Quine, W.V.O. Theories and Things. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
    • Quineargues for physicalism in metaphysics and naturalism in epistemology.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York, 2017.
    • An informal presentation of time in the theory of loop quantum gravity. Loop theory focuses on gravity; string theory is a theory of gravity plus all the forces and matter.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. The Order of Time. Riverhead Books, New York, 2018.
    • An informal discussion of the nature of time by a theoretical physicist. The book was originally published in Italian in 2017. Page 70 contains the graph of the absolute elsewhere that was the model for the one in this article.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. “Episode 2: Carlo Rovelli on Quantum Mechanics, Spacetime, and Reality” in Sean Carroll’s Mindscape Podcast at www.youtube.com/watch?v=3ZoeZ4Ozhb8. July 10, 2018.
    • Rovelli and Carroll discuss loop quantum gravity vs. string theory, and whether time is fundamental or emergent.
  • Russell, Bertrand. “On the Experience of Time,” Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
    • Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
  • Saunders, Simon. “How Relativity Contradicts Presentism,” in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Savitt, Steven F. “Being and Becoming in Modern Physics.” In E. N. Zala (ed.). The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • In surveying being and becoming, it suggests how the presentist and grow-past ontologies might respond to criticisms that appeal to relativity theory.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sider, Ted. Four-Dimensionalism: An Ontology of Persistence. Oxford University Press, New York, 2001.
    • Defends the ontological primacy of four-dimensional events over three-dimensional objects. He freely adopts causation as a means of explaining how a sequence of temporal parts composes a single perduring object. This feature of the causal theory of time originated with Hans Reichenbach.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivalism fails.
  • Slater, Hartley. “Logic is Not Mathematical,” Polish Journal of Philosophy, Spring 2012, pp. 69-86.
    • Discusses, among other things, why modern symbolic logic fails to give a proper treatment of indexicality.
  • Smith, Quentin. “Problems with the New Tenseless Theories of Time,” pp. 38-56 in Oaklander, L. Nathan and Smith, Quentin (eds.), The New Theory of Time, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1994.
    • Challenges the new B-theory of time promoted by Mellor and Smith.
  • Smolin, Lee. Time Reborn. Houghton, Mifflin, Harcourt Publishing Company, New York, 2013.
    • An extended argument by a leading theoretical physicist for why time is real. Smolin is a presentist. He believes the general theory of relativity is mistaken about the relativity of simultaneity; he believes every black hole is the seed of a new universe; and he believes nothing exists outside of time.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. “The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?” Scientific American, April 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Tegmark, Max. “Max Tegmark and the Nature of Time,” Closer to Truth, https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=rXJBbreLspA, July 10, 2017.
    • Speculates on the multiverse and branching time being needed for a theory of quantum gravity.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. Metaphysics, Fourth Edition. Westview Press, 2015.
    • An introduction to metaphysics by a distinguished proponent of the A-theory of time.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Wallace, David. Philosophy of Physics: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford University Press, 2021.
    • An excellent introduction to the philosophical issues within physics and how different philosophers approach them.
  • Wasserman, Ryan. Paradoxes of Time Travel, Oxford University Press, 2018.
    • A detailed review of much of the philosophical literature about time travel. The book contains many simple, helpful diagrams.
  • Whitrow, G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.