clock2Time is what a clock is used to measure. Information about time tells the durations of events, and when they occur, and which events happen before which others. So, time plays a very significant role in the universe’s organization. Nevertheless, despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, there are many unresolved issues.

Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing philosophical theories. Presentism implies that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our dim memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not, because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. Adolf Hitler’s rise to power in Germany is not simply in the past; it is past for you, but future for Aristotle. This third theory is called eternalism.

Here is a list of other issues about time, in no particular order:

•Whether there was a moment without an earlier one.
•Whether time exists when nothing is changing.
•What kinds of time travel are possible?
•Why time has an arrow.
•Whether time is an individual thing or instead only a relationship among things?
•How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow.
•Given an event, should everyone agree on whether it is present?
•Which features of our ordinary sense of the word “time” should be captured by the concept of time in physics?
•Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth-values now.
•When time will end.
•Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically fundamental.
•What is the proper formalism or logic for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning?
•Whether there are points of time or only intervals.
•What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time?
•Whether time is objective or, instead, subjective.
•How else time is related to mind.
•Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.
•Whether time is unreal either by being an illusion or by being wholly conventional.
•If time is not wholly conventional, then which specific aspects of time are conventional?
•How to settle the disputes between advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory of time and his B-theory of time.
•What is timeless?

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Time and Mind
  3. What Is Time?
  4. Why Is There Time Instead of No Time?
  5. Time and Change (Relationism vs. Substantivalism)
    1. History of the Debate up to Kant
    2. History of the Debate after Kant
  6. What Science Requires of Time
  7. Is There a Beginning or End to Time?
  8. Emergence
  9. Convention
  10. Arguments that Time Is Not Real
  11. Time Travel
    1. To the Future
    2. To the Past
  12. McTaggart’s A-Theory and B-Theory
  13. The Flow of Time
  14. The Past, Present, and Future
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. The Present
    3. Persistence, Four-Dimensionalism, and Temporal Parts
    4. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences
    5. Essentially-Tensed Facts
  15. The Arrow of Time
  16. Temporal Logic
  17. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Else Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  18. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The history of metaphysics can be seen as the history of arguing over the issue of what is timeless. The major candidates are timeless truths, timeless laws of nature, and timeless realms such as those of Platonic ideals, God, numbers, and spatial geometry. All these candidates are controversial. The present article briefly discusses a few of these candidates. Of course, if time were not to exist, then everything that does exist would be timeless.

A philosophical theory is more than a philosophical position. It is a philosophical position for which there are significant theses or laws or sub-positions for which support can be given. Philosophers of time want to build a robust philosophical theory of time, one that resolves a large number of the issues on the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary. Some issues are intimately related to others, so it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because the camps are on the opposite sides of so many controversial issues.

The next two paragraphs summarize the two camps. The technical terms used in the summaries are explained in more detail later in the article. Briefly, the two camps can be distinguished by saying the members of the A-camp believe McTaggart’s A-theory is the fundamental way to view time; and they accept a majority of the following claims: past events are always changing as they move farther into the past; this change is the only genuine, fundamental kind of change; the present or “now” is objectively real; so is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental, not untensed facts; the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional; and at least some A-predicates are not semantically reducible to B-predicates without loss of meaning.

Members of the B-camp reject most of the claims of the A-camp. They believe McTaggart’s B-theory is the fundamental way to view time; and they accept a majority of the following claims: events never undergo genuine change; the present or now is not objectively real and neither is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; the fundamental objects are four-dimensional, not three-dimensional; and A-predicates are reducible to B-predicates or at least the truth conditions of sentences using A-predicates can be adequately explained in terms of the truth conditions of sentences using B-predicates.

This article provides an introduction to the philosophical controversy between the A and B camps, as well as an introduction to many other issues about time.

Philosophers hope to properly analyze the very complicated relationship between the  common sense image of time and the scientific image of time. This is the relationship between beliefs about time held by ordinary speakers of our language and beliefs about time as understood through the lens of contemporary science, particularly physics.

The common sense image of time is what philosophers call the manifest image of time. It contains these beliefs about time: (1) The world was not created five minutes ago. (2) Time exists always and everywhere. (3) All events have durations. (4) Time is linear, like a straight line. (5) No event fails to occur at some time or other. (6) There are no gaps in time in which nothing occurs. (7) Time is continuous rather than a series of discrete moments. (8) The past is fixed, but the future is not. (9) Given any two events, they have some objective order such as one happening before the other, or their being simultaneous. (10) Time flows like a river, and we directly experience the flow. (11) There is a present that is objective, that everyone shares, and that divides everyone’s past from their future. (12) Time’s features are independent of the presence or absence of physical objects.

The first seven items on this list are common to both images. Scientific experts do not agree on the eighth. The rest are not features of the scientific image because most scientists say those features conflict with science.

A popular methodology used by metaphysicians is to start with the common sense image and then change it only if there are solid observations or good reasons that suggest changing it. There is much disagreement among philosophers of time about what counts as a good reason.

Does conflict with the theory of relativity count as a good reason? Husserl’s classic 1936 work on phenomenology, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, criticized the scientific image, and in this spirit A. N. Prior said that the theory of relativity is for this reason not about real time. Many other philosophers of time disagree with Husserl and Prior.

Ever since the downfall of the Logical Positivists’ program of reducing the meaningfulness of all non-tautological statements to common sense statements about what is given in our sense experiences (via seeing, hearing, feeling, and so forth), few would advocate any reduction of statements expressed in the scientific image to statements expressed in the common sense image, but the proper relationship between the two is still an open question.

Craig Callender, in speaking about the relationship of the two images, said:

In some very loose and coarse-grained sense, manifest time might be called an illusion without any harm done. However, for many of its aspects, it’s a bit like calling our impression of a shape an illusion, and that seems wrong (Callender 2017, p. 310).

Not only has the science changed over the centuries and thus has the scientific image, but the manifest image has changed as well, in large part due to the influence of science on our common sense. To give one example, it once was common sense to believe the world is flat, but, due to advances in science that have become so pervasively accepted by the average person, it is now common sense to believe the world is not flat.

To what extent is time understood? This is a difficult question, not simply because the word understood is notoriously vague, nor because of the unresolved disputes between the A-camp and B-camp of the philosophers of time. There have been a great many advances is understanding time over the last two thousand years, as this article explains, so we can definitively say time is better understood than it was. Nevertheless, there remain too many other unanswered questions and questions whose answers are not agreed upon by the experts. Can we at least say only the relatively less important questions are left unanswered? No, not even that.

An additional difficulty here is that it is very clear that the character of time is described to a great extent by the fundamental equations of relativity theory and quantum theory. Are those equations understood? Well, what does it mean to understand an equation? The Nobel Prize winner Paul Dirac gave what has become a generally agreed-upon answer to this question. He said, “I feel I understand an equation when I can anticipate the behavior of its solutions without actually solving it.”

A half-century later, the quantum physicist Richard Feynman famously remarked, “I think I can safely say that nobody understands quantum mechanics.” He seems to have meant that the solutions to its equations were continually surprising him.

So, this is the state of understanding time in the twenty-first century. It is certainly less than a reader might wish to have.

2. Time and Mind

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure.

Biological time in indicated by the regular biological processes inside us, and by signs of our aging.  For humans, there are regular heartbeats, breathing, cycles of sleeping and waking, and menstruation. Biological time is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as a body’s clock.

Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called “subjective time” and “phenomenological time;” and it is best understood also not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time, as a mental clock. Our psychological time can change its rate of flow (compared to a clock) depending on whether we are bored or instead intensively involved. Psychological time is the kind of time people usually are thinking of when they ask whether time is just a construct of the mind. This is the kind of time people usually are thinking of when they ask whether time is just a construct of the mind.

There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of mental awareness, or by the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is often called “objective time.” The scientific image of time is the product of science’s attempt to understand this time.

When a physicist defines “speed” to be distance traveled divided by the duration or, more accurately, the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science; but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena.

We feel time passing by noticing changes. The main reason why we believe time exists is that we notice change, for example, a leaf falling from a tree and acquiring a new location. Change indicates the presence of time. If we close our eyes, we still can encounter time just by imagining a leaf falling.

With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.

Psychological time’s rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. At the end of viewing an engrossing television program, we often think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” When we are hungry in the afternoon and have to wait until the end of the workday before we can go to dinner, we think, “Why is everything taking so long?” When we are feeling pain and we look at a clock, the clock seems to be ticking slower than normal.

An interesting feature of the rate of passage of psychological time reveals itself when we compare the experiences of younger people to older people. When we are younger, we lay down richer memories because everything is new. When we are older, the memories we lay down are much less rich because we have “seen it all before.” That is why older people report that a decade goes by so much more quickly than it did when they were younger.

Do things seem to move more slowly when we are terrified? “Yes,” most people would say. “No,” says neuroscientist David Eagleman, “it’s a retrospective trick of memory.” The terrifying event does seem to you to move more slowly when you think about it later, but not at the time it is occurring. Because memories of the terrifying event are “laid down so much more densely,” Eagleman says, it seems to you, upon your remembering, that your terrifying event lasted longer than it really did. For one of these events, the duration measured in psychological time is stretched compared to the event measured in physical time.

A major problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. How do brains take the input from all its sense organs and produce true beliefs about the world’s temporal relationships? Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate this, but so far there is no consensus on either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do.

Although the cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats can distinguish a five-second interval and a forty-second interval even with their cerebral cortex removed. So, a rat’s means of sensing time is probably distributed throughout many places in its brain. Perhaps the human being’s time sense is similarly distributed. However, surely the fact that we know that we know about time is specific to our cerebral cortex. A rat does not know that it knows. It has competence without comprehension. A cerebral cortex apparently is required for this comprehension.

Very probably no other primate has an appreciation of time that is as sophisticated as that had by any normal human being.

Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we experience directly and which we experience indirectly or only know by inference. Because of the travel time of any signal that reaches us, we have no direct experience of presently occurring distant events. There has been some disagreement in the literature about whether we humans directly or indirectly experience time.

There is a related issue: whether we have direct experience only of an instantaneous present event, as Plato, Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead (as William James popularized) we have direct experience only of the “specious present,” a present event that lasts a short stretch of physical time. Informally, the issue is said to be whether the present is “thin” or “thick.”

If it is thick, then how thick? Does the present (that is, can present events) last longer than the blink of an eye? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, a good estimate of its duration is approximately eighty milliseconds for human beings, although neuroscientists do not yet know why it is not two milliseconds or two seconds. We do seem to have a unified stream of consciousness, but how do our individual specious presents overlap to produce this, or do they not overlap?

Neuroscientists now agree that the brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. As one piece of suggestive evidence, notice that if you look at yourself in the mirror and glance at your left eyeball, then at your right eyeball, and then back to the left, you can never see your own eyes move. Your brain always constructs a continuous story of non-moving eyes. However, a video camera taking pictures of your face easily records your eyeballs’ movements, proving that your brain has taken an active role in “doctoring” the scenario.

When you open your eyes, can you see what is happening now? In 1630, René Descartes would have said yes, but most philosophers today say no. You see the North Star as it was 323 years ago, not as it is now. Also, light arriving at your eye from an external object contains information about its color, motion, and form. The signals arrive simultaneously, but it takes your brain different times to process that information. Color information is processed more quickly than motion information, which in turn is processed more quickly than form information. Only after the light has taken its time to arrive at your eye, and then you have processed all the information, do you construct a story that says, “A white ball is flying toward me.”

So, we all live in the past—in the sense that our belief about what is happening occurs later than when it really happened according to a clock. Our brain takes about eighty milliseconds to reconstruct a story of what is happening based on the information coming in from our different sense organs. Because of its long neck, a giraffe’s specious present might last considerably longer. However, it cannot take too much longer than this or else the story is so outdated that the organism risks becoming a predator’s lunch. Therefore, evolution has probably fine-tuned each kind of organism’s number of milliseconds of its specious present.

In the early days of television broadcasting, engineers worried about the problem of keeping audio and video signals synchronized. Then they accidentally discovered that they had about a tenth-of-a-second of “wiggle room.” As long as the signals arrive within this period, viewers’ brains automatically re-synchronize the signals; outside that tenth-of-a-second period, it suddenly looks like a badly dubbed movie. (Eagleman, 2009)

Watch a bouncing basketball. The light from the bounce arrives into our eyes before the sound arrives into our ears; then the brain builds a story in which the sight and sound of the bounce happen simultaneously. This sort of subjective synchronizing of visual and audio works for the bouncing ball so long as the ball is less than 100 feet away. Any farther and we begin to notice that the sound arrives later.

Philosophers of time and psychologists who study time are interested in both how a person’s temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and how different interventions into a healthy person’s brain might affect that person’s temporal experience.

Some of neuroscientist David Eagleman’s experiments have shown clearly that under certain circumstances a person can be deceived into believing event A occurred before event B, when in fact the two occurred in the reverse order according to clock time. For more on these topics, see (Eagleman, 2011).

The “time dilation effect” in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. With repeated events lasting the same amount of clock time, presenting a brighter object will make that event seem to last longer. This is likewise true for louder sounds.

Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our ability to anticipate the future, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the correct time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate durations (persistence). Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine for a while and are temporarily closed off from communicating with the world above. For a long while, simply with memory, you can keep track of how long you’ve been inside the mine until eventually, you lose track of the correct clock time. What determines how long the “long while” is?

Do we directly experience the present? This is controversial, and it is not the same question as whether at present we are having an experience. Those who answer “yes” tend to accept McTaggart’s A-theory of time. But notice how different such direct experience would have to be from our other direct experiences. We directly experience green color but can directly experience other colors; we directly experience high-pitched notes but can directly experience other notes. Can we say we directly experience the present time but can directly experience other times? Definitely not. So, the direct experience of the present either is non-existent, or it is a strange sort of direct experience. Nevertheless, we probably do have some mental symbol for nowness in our mind that correlates with our having the concept of the present, but it does not follow from this that we directly experience the present any more than our having a concept of love implies that we directly experience love. For an argument that we do not experience the present, see chapter 9 of (Callender 2017).

If all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a philosophically controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and add “Whose future?”

The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon such as a secondary quality, is explored elsewhere in this article.

According to René Descartes’ dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in both space and time due to the functioning of our brain. It takes no position, though, on the controversial issue of whether the process of conscious human understanding is a computation.

For our final issue about time and mind, do we humans have an a priori awareness of time that can be used to give mathematics a firm foundation? In the early twentieth century, the mathematician and philosopher L.E.J. Brouwer believed so. Many mathematicians and philosophers at that time were suspicious that mathematics was not as certain as they hoped for, and they worried that contradictions might be uncovered within mathematics. Their suspicions were raised by the discovery of Russell’s Paradox and the introduction into set theory of the controversial non-constructive axiom of choice. In response, Brouwer attempted to place mathematics on what he believed to be a firmer epistemological foundation by arguing that mathematical concepts are admissible only if they can be constructed from an ideal mathematician’s vivid, a priori awareness of time, what in Kantian terminology would be called an intuition of inner time. Brouwer supported Kant’s claim in the early 1800s that arithmetic is the pure form of temporal intuition. Brouwer tried to show how to construct higher-level mathematical concepts (for example, the mathematical line) from lower-level temporal intuitions; but unfortunately, he had to accept the consequence that his program required both rejecting Aristotle’s law of excluded middle in logic and rejecting some important theorems in mathematics such as the theorem that every real number has a decimal expansion and the theorem that there is an actual infinity as opposed to a potential infinity of points between any two points on the mathematical line. Accepting the notion of actual infinity is the key idea in the modern, standard solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes. Unwilling to accept those inconsistencies with classical mathematics, most other mathematicians and philosophers instead rejected Brouwer’s idea of an intimate connection between mathematics and time.

A later section of this article discusses time travel and raises the issue of whether thinking about past events is a kind of time travel to the past.

For interesting video presentations about psychological time, see (Carroll 2012) and (Eagleman 2011). For the role of time in phenomenology, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” According to the phenomenologist Edmund Husserl, “One cannot discover the least thing about objective time through phenomenological analysis” (Husserl, 1991, p. 6).

The remainder of this article is devoted primarily to physical time.

3. What Is Time?

Would it help, in answering our question, “What is physical  time?” to have a precise definition of the term? Shouldn’t that definition be found before launching into an answer to what time really is? The first step would be to clarify the difference between meaning and reference. The word “now” does not change its meaning every instant, but it does change its reference every instant.

The term time has several meanings. It can mean the duration between events, as when we say the trip from home to work took too much time because of all the traffic. It can mean, instead, the temporal location of an event, as when we say he arrived at the time they specified. It also can mean the temporal structure of the universe, as when we speak of investigating time rather than space. This article uses the word in all these senses.

Ordinary-language philosophers have carefully studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953, “For a large class of cases—though not for all—in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined this way: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.” Perhaps an examination of all the uses of the word “time” would lead us to the meaning of “time.” A Wittgensteinian might also say we would then be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions about time. That methodology of dissolving a problem was promoted by Wittgenstein in response to many philosophical questions.

However, most philosophers of time are not interested in precisely defining the word “time” but rather are interested in what time’s important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. When Newton discovered that the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the Moon were both caused by gravity, this was not a discovery about the meaning of the word “gravity,” but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want some advance like this for time?

To emphasize this point, notice that a metaphysician who asks, “What is a ghost?” does not usually want a definition of “ghost” but rather a theory of ghosts. This theory is perhaps a consistent description of the most important features of ghosts, and knowledge of whether they do or do not exist and how they might be reliably detected if they do exist, what principles or laws, if any, describe their behavior, how they typically act, and what they are composed of. This article takes a similar approach to the question, “What is time?”

In short, the full nature of physical time can be revealed only by developing a philosophical theory of time that addresses what science has discovered about time plus what should be said about the many philosophical issues that scientists usually do not concern themselves with.

Let’s begin by listing seven of the most significant features of time. They are numbered below. The exploration ahead presupposes a realist perspective on the scientific theories to be discussed. That is, it interprets them to mean what they say, and it does not take a fictionalist perspective on them, nor treat them as merely useful instruments, nor treat them operationally. This presupposition is itself philosophically controversial.

(1) Time is not an objective feature of reality. This is because spacetime can be divided up into its time part and its space part in many different ways by choosing different reference frames. This argument implicitly assumes that what is objective must not be relative to the reference frame we choose to use in describing reality. This assumption is widely accepted throughout all the physical sciences, although to some philosophers the result that time is not an objective feature of reality casts doubt upon either the theory of relativity itself or the importance of frame-independence.

Spacetime is an objective feature of reality. For any two point-events, the spacetime interval between them is real, and frame independent. It can be agreed upon by all observers. This is the lesson of the special theory of relativity. Nevertheless, most philosophers of science claim that time is otherwise objective once the reference frame has been chosen, and it is real, like energy, rather than imaginary, like Santa Claus.

(2) Physical time is what clocks are measuring. This comment is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having a clock, especially a standard clock. Clocks have regular behavior. We are lucky we live in a universe with so many different processes that can be used for clocks.

The claim that time is what clocks are measuring is not without its opponents. Some philosophers of physics claim that there is nothing more to time than whatever numbers are displayed on our standard clock. The vast majority of philosophers of physics disagree. They say time is more than those numbers; it is what we intend to measure with those numbers. And since a clock really is just a process of things changing, time really is just a general feature of the way things change with respect to each other—in a reference frame.

(3) Physical time is what the time variable t is denoting in the best theories of fundamental science. The time parameter in these theories is what scientists examine in order to understand what time is. The two most fundamental theories are the theory of relativity and quantum theory. An important feature of both theories is that, all other things being equal, their laws stay the same over time. Physicists do not agree on whether this feature should be accepted as a requirement on what time is, or if it is merely a feature that happens to have held during the last few billion years.

(4) Within a single reference frame, time “fixes” (i) when each event occurs, (ii) what any event’s duration is, (iii) what other events occur simultaneously with it, and (iv) whether, for any pair of non-simultaneous events, which one happens first.

(5) Time is not multi-dimensional.

(6) Time normally has an arrow or direction that points toward the future.

(7) Relativity theory implies that, for a given reference frame, time is continuous in the sense of being locally a linear continuum of zero-duration instants.

continuous vs discrete

This implies time is smooth without gaps.

The above list of seven important features of time is not exhaustive, nor uncontroversial.

Let us turn now to responses to the question, “What is time?” that have been offered throughout the centuries by some important European philosophers. Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12) of things. He never said space is the measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time….” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In the early 21st century, Julian Barbour developed Aristotle’s idea by finding an equation in classical mechanics that defined duration to be a measure of all motions:

I regard the definition of duration by [my equation] (3) as exceptionally important… time is…measured…by the sum of all motions (Barbour 2009, p. 6).

René Descartes answered the question, “What is time?” by claiming that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation (“Third Meditation” in Meditations on First Philosophy).

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves; they are, to use his terminology, forms of human sensible intuition. Time is not a property of things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is “the form of inner sense” and “is an a priori condition of all appearance whatsoever” is probably best understood as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only have the ability to experience individual things and events in time.

Kant claimed to know a priori that space obeys the principles of Euclidean geometry. After the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century, and with the implication from Albert Einstein’s general theory of relativity that the geometry of our space is non-Euclidean, the Kantian claim that synthetic truths about time are knowable a priori lost many advocates. In the twenty-first century, some synthetic a priori knowledge is still accepted by certain groups of philosophers. However, considerably more philosophers say we have a priori beliefs (“I shouldn’t swallow it if it tastes bad”) but not a priori knowledge.

In the early 20th century, the philosophers Alfred North Whitehead and Martin Heidegger said time is essentially the form of becoming, an idea that excited a great many philosophers, but not scientists.

Whatever time is, it is interesting to consider whether time has causal powers. The musician Hector Berlioz said, “Time is a great teacher, but unfortunately it kills all its pupils.” Everyone knows not to take this joke literally because, when you are asleep and then your alarm clock rings at 7:00, it is not the time itself that wakes you. Nevertheless, there are more serious reasons to believe that time has causal powers. In the early twentieth century, the general theory of relativity was developed, confirmed, and discovered to imply that time is intimately linked to space and matter. Time is a distinguished dimension of a more basic entity called spacetime. According to the Princeton University physicist John Wheeler, “Spacetime tells matter how to move.” If what Wheeler says is true, does this imply that time is part of what causes the motion of all matter?

This ends our introduction to some of the most significant features of time that should be incorporated into a full theory of time. But more needs to be said about these features, and there are more features and controversial issues to be discussed in the sections ahead.

4. Why Is there Time Instead of No Time?

There is no agreed-upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, why it contains physical laws instead of no physical laws, and why it exists instead of does not exist, nor even whether our universal laws are in fact universal in the sense of being eternal, although there have been interesting speculations on all these issues.

One suggestion for why the universe exists is that it is a result of the underlying laws of the universe which had to bring the universe into existence. Princeton University physicist Alan Guth said, “The laws of physics can exist even if the universe doesn’t….”

The issue of why the universe and its laws exist is most frequently raised by philosophers who assume that there needs to be something outside of the universe and outside of time in order to bring the universe and its time into existence, and this something is presumably a supernatural being. This is a philosophically and scientifically controversial assumption.

A suggestion from proponents of the Multiverse Theory of cosmology is that the reason why our universe exists with time instead of no time is that every kind of universe exists; there are universes with time and universes without time. Our own, single universe is one among many universes, and it came into existence by means of a random selection process, by a process in which any possible universe inevitably arises as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards inevitably produces any specific ordering of the cards. Opponents of this kind of explanation claim it is a shallow explanation. To again use the metaphor of a card game, they want to know why their poker opponent was dealt four aces in that last deal, and aren’t satisfied with the explanation that four aces are inevitable with enough deals or that it is just a random result. Nevertheless, perhaps there is no better explanation.

A very different suggestion for why our universe’s time came into existence is that it is due to a phase transition during which one of the four dimensions of primeval space collapsed to become a time dimension.

5. Time and Change (Relationism vs. Substantivalism)

Does the existence of physical time necessarily depend on the existence of change? Relationists say yes; substantivalists say no. Classical substantivalism (also called absolutism) implies space and time exist always and everywhere regardless of what else exists, and they provide an invisible, inert container within which matter exists and moves independently of the container. Relationism (also called relationalism) implies space and time are not like this. If you take away the matter and its motion, you also take away space and time, too.

Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.

Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist always and everywhere independently of physical material and its events.

Relationism is inconsistent with substantivalism. Substantivalism implies there can be “empty time,” time without the existence of physical events. Relationism does not allow empty time. It says time requires change. That is,

Necessarily, if time exists, then change exists.

Physical time is measured only by observing changes in some property such as the change in location of the hands of a clock. Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. Can we solve this issue by testing? Could we, for instance, turn off all changes and then look to see whether time still exists? No, the issue has to be approached more indirectly.

Relationists and substantivalists can agree that perhaps as a matter of fact change is pervasive and time exists always and everywhere. Their disagreement is whether time exists if, perhaps contrary to fact, nothing is changing. To appreciate this disagreement, more clarity is needed regarding the word change. The meaning of the word is philosophically controversial. It is used here in the sense of ordinary change—an object changing its ordinary, intrinsic properties over time, such as an object changing its location. A leaf undergoes this change when it falls off a branch and lands on the ground. This ordinary change is very different from the following three kinds of change. (1) If a house changes its properties over space, by being red on its roof and white on the walls at the same time, then this is not ordinary change. (2) When the death of Queen Anne “changes” by moving farther into the past, this, too, is not ordinary change. (3) If Loschmidt changes his relationship with Boltzmann because Boltzmann changes his mind from liking Loschmidt to disliking him, this is not intrinsic change in Loschmidt, so it is not ordinary change in Loschmidt. It is ordinary change only in Boltzmann. However, if Boltzmann were to communicate his dislike to Loschmidt, then Loschmidt might or might not react by changing his beliefs about Boltzmann, but if Loschmidt does change his beliefs, then this change would be ordinary, intrinsic change in Loschmidt’s brain and thus in Loschmidt. So, in philosophical literature a reader needs always to be alert about whether the word change means ordinary change or one of these three unusual kinds of change.

There is a fourth kind of change that is not ordinary. What does the word properties mean when we speak of an object changing its properties over time? The word property is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if, during the time that it exists, it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is odd, not an ordinary change or “real change” in the chlorophyll.

Classical substantival theories are also called absolute theories. Unfortunately, the term absolute also is used in other ways in philosophy. One sense of to be absolute is to be immutable, or changeless. Another sense is to be independent of reference frame. Einstein’s theory implies that time is not absolute in the sense of being independent of reference frame, but it is not so clear that his theory rules out time’s being absolute in the sense of being substance-like.

Centuries ago, the common sense image of time was relationist, but due to the influence of Newton on the teaching of science in subsequent centuries and then this influencing the average person who is not a scientist, the common sense image has become substantivalist.

a. History of the Debate up to Kant

The first advocate of a relational theory was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, Book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). Aristotle’s position is a predecessor of Leibniz’s relationism. The ancient Greek atomists such as Democritus spoke of there being an existing space within which matter’s atoms move, implying space is substance-like rather than relational, but the atomists were not as influential as Aristotle on this topic.

The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were drawn more clearly in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for relationism and Newton argued against it. Leibniz claimed that space is nothing but the “order of co-existing things,” so without objects there is no space. “I hold space to be something merely relative, as time is; that I hold it to be an order of coexistences, as time is an order of successions.” Leibniz would say time is abstracted from changes of things, namely events, with the paradigm change being motion. Expressed more technically, we can say Leibniz’s relational world is one in which spatial relationships are ontologically prior to space itself, and relationships among changes (or events) are ontologically prior to time itself.

Opposing Leibniz, Newton returned to a Democritus-like view of space as existing independently of material things; and he similarly accepted a substantival theory of time, with time being independent of all motions and other changes or events. Newton’s actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.

In 1670 in his Lectiones Geometricae, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected any necessary linkage between time and change. He said, “Whether things run or stand still, whether we sleep or wake, time flows in its even tenor.” Barrow also said time existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. In his unpublished manuscript De gravitatione, written while he was composing Principia, he said, “we cannot think that space does not exist just as we cannot think there is no duration” (Newton 1962, p. 26). This suggests that he believed time exists necessarily.

Newton believed time is not a primary substance, but is like a primary substance in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant of pre-existing time at which to create the physical world. From these initial conditions, including the forces acting on the material objects the timeless scientific laws took over and guided the material objects, with God intervening only occasionally to perform miracles. If it were not for God’s intervention, one might properly think of the future as a logical consequence of the present.

Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton’s absolute time because it is undetectable. Leibniz argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events, the “successive order of things.” This is why time needs events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. So, he advocated relationism and rejected Newton’s substantivalism.

One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory of absolute space and absolute time is that it violates a law of metaphysics that is now called Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really identical; they are just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that if God had shifted the entire world some distance east and its history some minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world. Leibniz asked what is different about the new, shifted world. There is nothing to distinguish one point from another in absolute space, nor one instant of absolute time from another, so there would be no discernible difference in Newton’s two worlds, the one before and the one after the shift. Leibniz claimed there is just one world here, not two, and so Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty. His point about time could have been expressed by saying Newton’s two universes differ in their absolute times but not in their relative times, yet only relative times are discernible.

Regarding Leibniz’s complaint using the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, Newton suggested the principle is correct but God is able to discern differences in absolute time or space that mere mortals cannot.

Leibniz offered another criticism. Newton’s theory violates Leibniz’s Law of Sufficient Reason: that there is a reason why any aspect of the universe is one way but might have been another. Leibniz complained that, if God shifted the world in time or space but made no other changes, then He would have no reason to do so.

Newton responded that Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason, yet Newton pointed out that the Principle does not require there to be sufficient reasons for humans; God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given absolute place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons.

Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response to Leibniz was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree that if Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate.

However, Newton found a much better argument. If you spin around and feel dizzy, then you are detecting absolute space. He didn’t put it in exactly those terms, though. He suggests a thought experiment in which we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Don’t let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, the bucket is spinning, and there is a concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.

How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water’s surface in the two situations? It cannot, said Newton. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of the water surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the difference in shape. Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory could not be used to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and space itself must be exerting a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force pushing away from the center of the bucket is called “centrifugal force,” and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.

Because Leibniz had no counter to this thought experiment, for over two centuries Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. Consider two nearly identical gloves except that one is right-handed and the other is left-handed. In a world containing only a right-hand glove, said Kant, Leibniz’s theory could not account for its handedness because all the internal relationships would be the same as in a world containing only a left-hand glove. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This indirectly suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though Christiaan Huygens (in the 17th century) and George Berkeley (in the 18th century) had argued in favor of Leibniz. See (Arthur 2014) for a comprehensive discussion of the views of Leibniz and Newton.

b. History of the Debate after Kant

In 1969, the philosopher Sydney Shoemaker presented a thought experiment attempting to establish that time’s existing without change is at least conceivable, despite Aristotle’s declaration that it is not.

With the following scenario, we all can conceive “empty time,” says Shoemaker. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. Region 3’s change ceases everywhere every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their “frozen” year. Suppose people in region 3 become convinced by these reports that the universe periodically freezes in their region every three years for just one year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year for a year, and the inhabitants can be convinced that their region behaves this way. Every sixty years—that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years—all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. At the beginning of year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, and they are justified in believing time has marched on for the previous year with no change anywhere in the universe. This year would be a year of empty time. Yes, there is no person available to observe the freezing in year sixty, but we all believe in things that we don’t directly observe, don’t we? Because this is a merely possible world, there need be no explanation of how the freezing and thawing is implemented, and it is conceivable that the freezing occurs after sixty years even if there is no person available to measure the freezing.

Many philosophers accept this argument about conceivability but would say the issue remains as to whether time would exist without change.

In the 19th century, a vast majority of physicists believed in time without change. They not only believed in absolute space and time, but also had a favorite candidate for a large substance that is stationary in absolute space, the ether. They believed the ether was needed for an adequate explanation of what waves when there is a light wave. In 1865, James Clerk Maxwell proposed his theory of light. The theory was quickly and universally accepted. So, they believed Maxwell when he said the ether was needed as a medium for the propagation of light and that it did exist even if it had never been directly detected.

The experimental physicist A. A. Michelson set out to detect the ether. Although his clever interferometer experiment failed to detect the ether, he believed he should have detected it if it existed. So, he concluded that “the hypothesis of a stationary ether is thus shown to be incorrect” (American Journal of Science,  p. 128, 1881). Most physicists disagreed with Michelson’s conclusion because they believed A. J. Fresnel who had said the Earth might drag the ether with it. If so, this would make the ether undetectable by Michelson’s experimental apparatus, as long as the apparatus was used on Earth and not in outer space.

However, this rescue of the ether hypothesis, and substantivalism along with it, did not last long. In 1905, Einstein proposed his special theory of relativity that implied there should be no ether. When his theory was experimentally confirmed, beliefs in the ether, substantival space, and substantival time were largely abandoned.

Einstein and the philosopher Hans Reichenbach declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for relationism. Quoted in The New York Times newspaper on December 3, 1919, Einstein said:

Till now it was believed that time and space existed by themselves, even if there was nothing—no Sun, no Earth, no stars—while now we know that time and space are not the vessel for the Universe, but could not exist at all if there were no contents, namely, no Sun, no Earth, and other celestial bodies.

According to Einstein’s and Reichenbach’s interpretation of relativity theory, Leibniz’s notion of shifting the whole universe a specific distance or shifting it in time simply was not a coherent notion. Most other experts agreed.

The relationist response by Ernst Mach to Newton’s bucket argument was to note Newton’s error in not considering the distant environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that a body’s inertial mass comes from its interaction with all the other bodies in the universe and not with its interaction with space itself. So, assuming inertia causes the rotating bucket’s water to take its concave shape, if Newton’s bucket were to hang still with no rotation while the background stars spun around the bucket, then the water would creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface. If that is correct, then Newton’s substantival space is not needed to explain the concave shape. Presumably, substantival time is not needed either. By Ockham’s Razor, if substantival space and time are not needed for successful explanations of the bucket situation or of any other situation, then substantival space and time should be rejected.

Despite this promotion of relationism by Mach, substantivalism continued to be defended.

Even Einstein himself changed his mind about substantivalism. In his Nobel Prize acceptance speech on December 10, 1922, he said relativity theory does rule out Maxwell’s ether, but it does not rule out some other underlying substance that is pervasive in space; all that is required is that if such a substance exists, then it must obey the principles of relativity.

Maybe that substance is really just space-time itself. Appealing only to the theory of relativity and not quantum theory, a principal argument in the 21st century for substantivalism goes like this. Relativity theory is true. It requires spacetime to exist, but if so, then it always can be carved up into its time part and space part, regardless of whether anything is happening. So, time does not require change. If change does happen to exist, well, that is a contingent matter, not a necessary one. However, time’s existence is necessary because spacetime’s existence is. Time exists regardless of whether it is “empty.”

Another argument against relationism appeals to the notion of a field. A candidate substance for the substantivalist is a space-filling field. Ever since the development of quantum electrodynamics in the late twentieth century, the field has been considered to be real and not merely a helpful computation device. What physicists call empty space is not empty in the sense imaged by Newton and the Greek atomists because the field is creating new particles continually and spontaneously, such as pairs of quarks and antiquarks. Because of this creation from nothing, which is required by Heisenberg’s Uncertainty Principle in quantum theory, there is no region of space where there could be empty time in the relationist sense. All regions are always changing. so, relationism is incorrect.

Another common suggestion is that spacetime is identical to the gravitational field. Because a field does not go away even if the field’s values reach a minimum everywhere, the field might be considered to be a substance of some sort.

Here is a related defense of substantivalism. Relativity theory implies there is a four-dimensional continuous manifold of point-events having a field, or perhaps various fields. One proposed definition of “spacetime” is that it is this manifold itself. This philosophical theory is often called “manifold substantivalism.” The manifold is the container that contains all the kinds of matter, and it is what continues to exist even after the matter is removed—removed in the sense that all the values of the matter field(s) reach a minimum. In this vein, another kind of substantivalism says that spacetime is not just the manifold but rather is a combination of the manifold plus a single, essential metrical structure. This metric field causes gravity and gives spacetime whatever rigidity it has.

Yet another metaphysical position is that the debate between substantivalism and relationism no longer makes sense given the new concepts of the general theory of relativity and quantum theory because the very distinction between spacetime itself and an event within spacetime has broken down, as has the distinction between space itself and matter within space.

For a short discussion of the relationship between spacetime and its fields, see What Is a Field? in this article. For additional discussion of these issues, see (Dainton 2010, chapter 21).

6. What Science Requires of Time

In the early twentieth century, the appearance of relativity theory, quantum theory, and the big bang theory transformed the investigation of time from a primarily speculative and metaphysical investigation into one that occupied scientists in their professional journals.

The scientific community trusts the implications of these theories, and they have many implications about time. For one example, the big bang theory places demands on the amount of past time there must be. The past needs to have a duration of at least 13.8 billion years because that is about how long ago the big bang event began. (There is no implication, of course, that during this time the Earth made 13.8 billion revolutions around the Sun.)

Unfortunately, the fundamental theories of physics disagree with each other about some key features of time. Relativity theory implies there is no smallest duration, but quantum theory implies there is a smallest possible duration of about 10-43 seconds. Relativity theory implies clocks run more slowly as they approach a massive body, but quantum theory does not imply this. Theoretical physicists are still searching for a theory of quantum gravity that can unite the best parts of these two theories to overcome their inconsistency.

Einstein’s theories of special relativity and general relativity have had the biggest impact on our understanding of time. Perhaps most significantly, they imply that two synchronized clocks will disagree on their readings once they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Because of this latter influence, a clock in a car parked near your apartment building runs slower than the stationary clock in an upper floor apartment because the upper floor feels a less gravitational force from the Earth. “Clocks at the top of Mount Everest pull ahead of those at sea level by about 30 microseconds a year” (Gibbs 2002). Effects on time by speed and gravitation are called “time dilation effects.” They affect all clocks, even biological ones.

If I am walking along the road and you drive by me toward the traffic signal ahead, then we can agree on the time at which the traffic signal changed color [the difference is practically insignificant], but in deciding which events on a planet in the Andromeda Galaxy are simultaneous with the traffic signal’s color change, we will correctly choose two very different classes of Andromeda events because the two will differ from each other by several weeks. This is yet another example of how relativistic effects usually do not arise in our everyday experience but only in extreme situations involving extremely high speeds, extremely large masses, or, in this example, extremely long distances.

Relativity theory demands a cosmic speed limit: light speed. This implies no object can increase its speed enough to catch up with a particle of light that had a head start. So, if it takes 100,000 years for light to cross the Milky Way Galaxy, could some human being ever cross it in less time? Yes, surprisingly. By exploiting the principles of time dilation and length contraction in the theory of relativity, the time limits on human exploration of the universe can be removed, at least in principle. Assuming you can travel safely at any high speed under light speed, then as your spaceship’s average speed approaches light speed, the trip’s distance contracts toward an infinitesimal length, and the trip time approaches an infinitesimal duration as measured by your personal clock. So, you do have time to cross the Milky Way Galaxy, even though such a trip takes light itself 100,000 years as measured by a clock fixed to Earth rather than to you. “If a photon had a clock, it wouldn’t tick,” said Sean Carroll.

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski had an original idea in metaphysics regarding space and time. He was the first person to claim that spacetime is more fundamental than either time or space alone. As he put it, rather dramatically, “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” The metaphysical assumption behind Minkowski’s remark is that what is “independently real” and not merely a mathematical artifact does not vary from one reference frame to another. What does not vary is what we now call “spacetime.” It seems to follow that the division of events into the disjoint regions of the past ones, the present ones, and the future ones is also not “independently real.” One philosophical implication that Minkowski and Einstein accepted is that it’s an error to say, “Only my present is real.” A more disturbing metaphysical implication seems to be that the future already exists but just has not yet been experienced.

The above claims about spacetime are challenged by, among others, the pragmatist and physicist Lee Smolin. He says,

By succumbing to the temptation to conflate the representation with the reality and identify the graph of the records of the motion with the motion itself, these scientists have taken a big step toward the expulsion of time from our conception of nature.

The confusion worsens when we represent time as an axis on a graph…This can be called spatializing time.

And the mathematical conjunction of the representations of space and time, with each having its own axis, can be called spacetime. The pragmatist will insist that this spacetime is not the real world. It’s entirely a human invention, just another representation…. If we confuse spacetime with reality, we are committing a fallacy, which can be called the fallacy of the spatialization of time. It is a consequence of forgetting the distinction between recording motion in time and time itself.

Once you commit this fallacy, you’re free to fantasize about the universe being timeless, and even being nothing but mathematics. But, the pragmatist says, timelessness and mathematics are properties of representations of records of motion–and only that.

According to special relativity, there is no curvature to time, space or spacetime. According to general relativity they all curve, and the curvature is not relative to the chosen reference frame, so it is real or objective. The curvature of time can be detected by noticing that synchronized clocks become unsynchronized. Spacetime is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature. This change is propagated at the speed of light, not instantaneously.

All the most fundamental physical laws have symmetry under time-translation. If a theory has this time-translation symmetry, then its laws do not change as time goes by. It follows that the law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law of gravitation that held one thousand centuries ago.

All those fundamental physical laws also have symmetry under time-reversal (or at least charge-parity-time reversal, that is, CPT reversal). More informally, the point can be expressed by saying time-reversal symmetry implies that, if you make a film of any process allowed by the laws of science, such as unbroken eggs being turned into an omelet, and then show the film backward, what is now shown is also a process allowed by the laws. Note, though, that it may be allowed but never observed, ever.

Science places special requirements on the micro-structure of time. For instance, to express laws using calculus, the physicists need to speak of one instantaneous event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds after another. In ordinary discourse outside of science, we would never need this kind of detail. This need requires time to be a linear continuum. Any linear continuum has the same structure as the real numbers in their natural order. It follows from this that physical theories treat time as being somewhat like a single spatial dimension. Time has this structure in all well-accepted fundamental theories, even quantum theory. Quantum theory does not quantize time.

Science requires time to be one-dimensional. Time’s one-dimensional structure might be like an unbounded straight line, or like a finite segment of that line, or like a ray, or even a circle. Two-dimensional time has been studied by mathematical physicists, but no theories implying time has more than one dimension have acquired a significant number of supporters among the experts.

For more discussion of these points, see also What Else Science Requires of Time and the article Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations.

7. Is There a Beginning or End to Time?

Many theologians are confident that there was a beginning to time, and they have used this idea to present an argument of the following sort:

Whatever begins to exist, has a cause.
The Universe begins to exist.
Therefore, the Universe had a cause.

This version of the infamous cosmological argument is assumed to be an important step in justifying belief in the existence of God. Critics complain about both its premises. Regarding the first premise, many critics say simply that the concept of cause does not properly apply here, and other critics comment that the universe might have come from nothing or come into existence randomly.

Regarding the second premise, there is no consensus among experts that there ever was a beginning to the universe. Perhaps there was no first time just as there is no first or smallest positive real number (because for any candidate first number there is always another that is half the size). Professional cosmologists, especially the advocates of the Big Bounce cosmology, say the past and future are infinite. However, their assertions are tentative.

The most likely scenario for the universe’s destiny is that the remaining particles will get ever farther from each other, with no end to the dilution. This scenario depends upon a guess about the total energy of the universe. Energy can be positive or negative. Mutually gravitating objects have gravitational potential energy that is negative. Their kinetic energy of motion is positive. Stephen Hawking, James Hartle, and other cosmologists say the difficulty of knowing whether the past and future are infinite turns on our ignorance of whether the universe’s positive energy is exactly canceled out by its negative energy (so the kinetic energy of expansion is canceled by the mutual gravitational attraction), and whether the universe’s positive charge is exactly canceled out by negative charge. If the total is exactly zero, then time is infinite. There is no evidence that the totals are non-zero, so the best guess is that time is infinite, but the experts’ confidence in this is not strong.

Regarding the beginning of time instead of the end, the cosmologists’ most favored theory of past time requires an explosion of all space when the universe had a very small volume. This caused all material in the space to expand, too. Theories that imply this phenomenon are called big bang theories, the classical version of which says time began from a singularity a finite time ago. The best estimate for that initial time of t = 0 is 13.8 billion years ago. The controversy is whether there was any time before that. The mathematical physicist Stephen Hawking once famously quipped that asking for what happened before the big bang is like asking what is north of the north pole. He later retracted that remark and said it is an open question whether there was a time before the big bang, but he slightly favored a yes answer. Even if yes were to be established as the correct answer, the question would remain as to whether this prior time was finite or infinite.

The Big Bounce Theory is a major competitor of the classical Big Bang Theory. The Big Bounce Theory says there was no singularity at t = 0. Instead, the small, expanding volume of the universe before 13.8 billion years ago was caused by a preceding, multi-billion-year compression that, when the universe became small enough, stopped its compression and began a very rapid expansion that was our big bang event. Perhaps there has been a cycle of bounces, a repetition of compression followed by expansion, and perhaps the cycles will continue forever and have been occurring forever. Much depends on whether the universe’s total negative energy exactly balances its positive energy. See the companion article What Else Science Requires of Time for more details about this dispute.

Let us turn now from contemporary cosmology to the history of speculation on this issue in the philosophical literature. There has been much speculation over the centuries about the extent of the past and the future, although almost all remarks have contained serious ambiguities. For example, regarding the end of time, is this (a) the end of humanity, or (b) the end of life, or (c) the end of the universe that was created by God, but not counting God, or (d) the end of all natural and supernatural change? Intimately related to these questions are two others: Is it being assumed that time exists without change, and just what is meant by the term “change”? With these cautions in mind, here is a brief summary of speculations throughout the centuries about whether time has a beginning or an end.

Regarding the beginning of time, the Greek atomist Lucretius in about 50 B.C.E. said in his poem De Rerum Natura:

For surely the atoms did not hold council, assigning order to each, flexing their keen minds with questions of place and motion and who goes where.

But shuffled and jumbled in many ways, in the course of endless time they are buffeted, driven along chancing upon all motions, combinations.

At last they fall into such an arrangement as would create this universe.

The implication is that time has always existed, but that an organized universe began a finite time ago with a random fluctuation.

Plato and Aristotle, both of whom were opponents of the atomists, agreed with them that the past is infinite (eternal). Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because everything in the world has a prior, efficient cause. In the fifth century, Augustine disagreed with Aristotle and said time itself came into existence by an act of God a finite time ago.

Martin Luther estimated the universe to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated that it began in 4,004 B.C.E. In the early seventeenth century, the Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began in 4,004 B.C.E. on Friday, October 28.

In about 1700, Isaac Newton claimed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that.

Advances in geology eventually refuted the low estimates that the universe was created in about 4,000 B.C.E., or even that the Earth alone was created then.

A much better estimate for a lower limit on the age of the universe as a whole comes not from geology but from the big bang theory which implies our universe is at least 13.8 billion years old.

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular remark, “God caused the big bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the big bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

What do current cosmologists say about whether future time ends? It definitely ends for any object that falls into a black hole. Similarly, if the current expansion of our universe stops, then reverses, and eventually collapses to a point, then our future time stops, too. Cosmologists consider this to be an unlikely scenario because it violates quantum theory and it is likely to violate the principles of any future theory of quantum gravity.

Here is a summary of some serious, competing suggestions by twenty-first-century cosmologists about our universe’s future, beginning with the most popular one:

  • Big Chill (eternal expansion of space at an ever-expanding rate, assuming dark energy never disappears).
  • Big Crunch (eventually the expansion due to dark energy stops somehow, and the universe begins contracting to a very compressed state much like when the Big Bang began.)
  • Big Bounce (eternal pattern of Big Bang, then Big Crunch, then Big Bang, then Big Crunch, and so forth).
  • Big Rip (every complex system of elementary particles is ripped apart—first galaxies, later the planets, then all the molecules, and so forth—as the expansion rate of new dark energy rapidly approaches infinity in a finite time, leaving a sea of elementary particles for an infinite time).
  • Big Snap (the fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much).
  • Death Bubbles (some regions of space decay and turn into lethal bubbles that expand at the speed of light, destroying everything else).

8. Emergence

Is physical time a basic feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features? Experts are not sure of the answer.

The word “emerge” has been used in different ways in philosophy, but here it is used in the sense of “weak emergence.” Being emergent does not imply being inexplicable, and it does not imply there is a process occurring over time. As Carroll explains it (Carroll 2019, p. 235):

Emergence in this sense does not refer to events unfolding over time, as when a baby bird emerges from its egg. It’s a way of describing the world that isn’t completely comprehensive, but divides up reality into more manageable chunks…. To say that something is emergent is to say that it’s part of an approximate description of reality that is valid at a certain (usually macroscopic) level, and is to be contrasted with “fundamental” things, which are part of an exact description at the microscopic level….Fundamental versus emergent is one distinction, and real versus not-real is a completely separate one.

Heat emerges from molecular motion, but no molecule is hot. Heat is not an autonomous property, though, because there can be no change in the heat without a corresponding change in the underlying molecular motion. Emergence (that is, weak emergence) is about useful, new features being supervenient upon more basic features but not existing at that more basic level. For another example, causation is not part of the most fundamental physics. Causation emerges as a very useful characteristic of the universe at the higher, coarser level, where we properly and usefully speak of an atom’s radioactive decay causing the release of a neutron, or hunger causing a person to visit the supermarket.

Which level is fundamental? The answer is relative to the user’s purpose. Biologists and physicists have different purposes. To a biologist, the hunger causing you to visit the supermarket emerges from the fundamental level of cellular activity. But to a physicist, the level of cellular activity is not fundamental but emerges from the more fundamental level of molecular motions.

Does time emerge from spacetime? Some physicists speculate that once there were four dimensions of space and none of time, but that eventually one of the space dimensions disappeared as the time dimension emerged. Other physicists speculate, instead, that time is fundamental, but spacetime is what emerges. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint. While speaking about string theory, which is his favored theory for reconciling the conflicts between quantum theory and the general theory of relativity, he said.

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

Many physicists working in the field of quantum gravity suspect that resolving the contradiction between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing both spacetime and time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate at or below the level of the Planck length (about 10-35 meters) and the Planck time (about 10-43 seconds). However, there is no experimental evidence yet to back up this suspicion, nor any agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is. Whatever the substrate is, the relation of this substrate to the spacetime itself cannot be analogous to the relation of a brick to a brick wall because the brick’s having a definite size would violate special relativity’s requirement that any “brick” of time has a size that must change depending upon which reference frame is chosen. Thus the emphasis on “covariant” entities, namely entities that are reference-frame independent.

The physicist Carlo Rovelli, an advocate of loop quantum gravity rather than string theory, said: “At the fundamental level, the world is a collection of events not ordered in time” (Rovelli 2018, p. 155). Nevertheless, at the macroscopic level, he would say time does exist. Eliminativism is the theory in ontology that emergent entities are unreal. If time is emergent, it is not real. If pain is emergent, it is not real. The theory is also called strong emergentism. The opposite and more popular position in ontology, anti-eliminativism or weak emergence, is that emergent entities are real despite being emergent. The English physicist Julian Barbour is an eliminativist. In (Barbour 2009, p. 1), he said the “universe is static. Nothing happens; there is being but no becoming. The flow of time and motion are illusions.” In (Barbour 1999, p. 37), he argued that, although there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, nevertheless there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments. Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one observer’s reference frame) of all the objects in space. Like a photograph, a moment or configuration contains information about change, but it, itself, does not change. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental, but time is not, and neither is spacetime. In this way, time is removed from the foundations of physics and emerges as some general measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations. For more on Barbour’s position, see (Smolin 2013, pp. 84-88).

The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic, nor for whether the concept of time is basic to concept formation. For more description of the different, detailed speculations on what the ultimate constituents of spacetime are, see (Merali, 2013).

9. Convention

Time has both conventional and non-conventional aspects. If event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3. No exceptions. This transitivity in a reference frame is a general feature of time, not a convention. Why are increases of time coordinates toward the future rather than toward the past? Is it just a convention that follows from the definitions of “future” and “positive,” or does it have an objective basis? It is just a convention. Time in physics is measured with real numbers (decimal numbers) rather than imaginary numbers. Does this reveal a deep feature of time? No, it is simply a convention.

The duration of the temporal unit called a “second” is clearly conventional. This is because our society could have chosen to make the second be longer or shorter than it now is. It is a convention that there are sixty-seconds in a minute rather than sixty-six, that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of twenty-three, and that no week fails to contain a Tuesday.

The issue here is conventional vs. factual. Although the term “convention” is somewhat vague, conventions are up to us to freely adopt and are not objective features of the external world that we are forced to accept if we seek the truth. Conventions are inventions or artificial features as opposed to being natural or mandatory or factual. It is a fact that the color of normal, healthy leaves is green; this is not conventional or a matter of the custom of language usage. What is conventional here is that “green” means green. Conventions need not be arbitrary; they can be useful or have other pragmatic virtues. Nevertheless, if a feature is conventional, then there must in some sense be reasonable alternative conventions that could have been adopted. Also, conventions can be explicit or implicit. For one last caution, conventions can become recognized as having been facts. The assumption that matter is composed of atoms was a useful convention in late 19th century physics; but, after Einstein’s explanation of Brownian motion in terms of atoms, the convention was generally recognized as having been a fact all along.

It is a useful convention that, in order to keep future noons from occurring during the night, clocks are re-set by one hour as one moves across a time-zone on the Earth’s surface, and that leap days and leap seconds are used. The minor adjustments with leap seconds are required because the Earth’s rotations and revolutions are not exactly regular. For political and social reasons, time zones do not always have longitudes for boundaries. For similar reasons, some geographical regions use daylight savings time instead of standard time.

Consider the ordinary way a clock is used to measure how long an event lasts. We adopt the following metric, or method: Take the time at which the event ends, and subtract the time at which it starts. For example, to find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, take the absolute value of the difference between the two numbers and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock could and should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time “metrically amorphous”? Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be:


instead of the ordinary:

|y – x|.

The trouble with this log metric is that, for any three events x, y, and z, if t(x) < t(y) < t(z), then it is normal to demand that the duration from x to y plus the duration from y to z be equal to the duration from x to z. However, the log metric does not have this property.

Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? Yes. In fact, when Westerners talk about past centuries, they agree to use both A.D. and B.C.E. A clock measuring B.C.E. periods would count toward lower numbers along the timeline. The laws of physics involving time t are unchanged regardless of whether the t is measured in B.C.E. years or A.D. years. The clock on today’s wall always counts up, but that is merely because it is agreed we are in the A.D. era, so there is no need for a clock to count in B.C.E. time. The choice of the origin of the time coordinate is conventional, too. It might be a Muhammad event or a Jesus event or a Temple event or the big bang event.

It is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is even capable of having a standard clock that measures both electromagnetic events and gravitational events and that “electromagnetic time” stays in synchrony with “gravitational time.”

It is a fact and not a convention that our universe contains a wide variety of phenomena that are sufficiently regular in their ticking to serve as clocks. They are sufficiently regular because they tick in adequate synchrony with the standard clock. The word “adequate” here means successful for the purposes we have for using a clock, for example for measuring lifetimes of mountain ranges or, by using a very different kind of clock, for measuring the very brief duration of a photon interacting with another photon.

Relativity theory and quantum theory imply time is continuous. So, physicists regularly use the concept of a point of continuous time. They might say some event happened the square root of three seconds after another event. Physicists usually uncritically accept a point of time as being real, but philosophers of physics disagree with each other about whether the points of time are real or, instead, merely a useful convention. Is time’s being a continuum a fact or just a convention that should be eliminated in a better treatment of time? Experts disagree.

Our society’s standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate only by convention; if it acts strangely, then all other clocks must act equally strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. For an example of strangeness, suppose our standard clock used the periodic rotations of the Earth relative to the background stars. In that case, if a comet struck Earth and affected the rotational speed of the Earth (as judged by, say, a pendulum clock), then we would be forced to say the rotation speed of the Earth did not really change but rather the other periodic clock-like phenomena such as swinging pendulums and quartz crystal oscillations all changed in unison because of the comet strike. The comet “broke” those clocks. That would be a strange conclusion to draw, and in fact, for just this reason, physicists have rejected any standard clock that is based on Earth rotations and chosen a newer standard clock that is based on atomic phenomena that are unaffected by comet strikes. A closely related philosophical question about the choice of the standard clock is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we can be making a choice that is closer to being correct. For more on this point, see this article’s Supplement.

The present is conventional in the following sense. The special theory of relativity implies that simultaneity is conventional. Here is a Minkowski diagram displaying this feature:

pic of absolute elsewhere

Your present and past light cones are defined by the diagonal lines which are the worldlines of light rays. Your forward light cone contains all events in your future. Your backward light cone contains all events in your past. The gray areas represent all the events of the block universe outside of your forward and backward light cones that could neither cause, nor be caused by, your being here now. The more technical way of saying this is that the gray area is all events that are spacelike for you. This structure of space-time holds not just for you but also for everyone else—in the sense that points that are outside of the two light cones of a point are neither in that point’s future nor in its past.

The gray region is what Carlo Rovelli calls the extended present because, if you were defining an x-axis of this diagram in order to represent your present events, you would have a great latitude of choice; assuming your space obeys Euclidean geometry, you may choose any straight line that goes through your present event and stays within the gray region. Suppose point events a and b occur in the Andromeda Galaxy, which is 2,000,000 light-years away from you. Even though event b were to occur two million years after a, you are free to choose either event as happening now in that galaxy, or you are free to choose any intermediate event there. There is no fact of the matter as to what is happening at present in the Andromeda Galaxy.

Well, perhaps this point should be made more cautiously by saying that Special Relativity implies there is no fact of the matter. Some philosophers believe there is a fact of the matter, a unique present, even if Special Relativity does not recognize the fact.

The conventionality of simultaneity is not the same thing as the relativity of simultaneity. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken about the conventionality of simultaneity. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For additional discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

It would be very helpful in doing physics if there were a convention to adopt that allows for a single reference frame in which any two events are forced either to be simultaneous or to be such that one of them happens before the other, as is always the case in Special Relativity. For some spacetimes obeying the laws of general relativity, it is not always possible to do this. But with a spacetime having well-behaved curvature, it is possible to find a global reference frame, although it will be unusual. This special coordinate system needs to be very curvilinear as opposed to rectilinear and to be “patched” (in analogy to a quilt made of patches of cloth). In that reference system, curved spacetime is exhaustively partitioned into non-intersecting but “bumpy” (or curvy) three-dimensional sheets of simultaneous events, where each sheet is locally perpendicular to time-like geodesics. (Geodesics in spacetime are the free-fall worldlines.) The bumps are due to curvature associated with the presence of matter and energy. Using one of these very special coordinate systems, all the events in each, single sheet throughout the universe happen simultaneously. This sort of unusual reference system is usually adopted by cosmologists when they treat very distant events in space or time.

Among the possible patchwork of frames one might adopt, some are much more useful choices than others. In particular, it is a useful convention to fix the spatial origin at a place where the light (which has now turned to heat) generated by the big bang arrives at Earth with about the same intensity and temperature from all directions. As (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9) describes it:

In fact, it isn’t quite true that the cosmic background heat radiation is completely uniform across the sky. It is very slightly hotter (i.e., more intense) in the direction of the constellation of Leo than at right angles to it…. Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 percent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.

Similar hypothetical clocks could be located everywhere in the universe, in each case in a reference frame where the cosmic background heat radiation looks uniform. Notice I say “hypothetical”; we can imagine the clocks out there, and legions of sentient beings dutifully inspecting them. This set of imaginary observers will agree on a common time scale and a common set of dates for major events in the universe, even though they are moving relative to each other as a result of the general expansion of the universe…. So, cosmic time as measured by this special set of observers constitutes a type of universal time….

Time is both cosmic and not cosmic. Time is not cosmic (that is, universal) because which pairs of events throughout the cosmos are simultaneous is different in different frames. Time is cosmic in another sense, though, the sense in which there exists a special set of reference frames that could produce universal agreement for stationary observers in those frames regarding the dates of major events of cosmic history. It is a convention that cosmologists agree to use the cosmic time of these special reference frames, but it is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is so organized that there is such a useful cosmic time available to be adopted by the cosmologists. Not all physically possible spacetimes obeying the laws of general relativity can have such a cosmic time.

10. Arguments that Time Is Not Real

Often in philosophical disputes, when persons argue that time is not real, they appeal to reasons other than the fact that time depends upon a person’s choice of the reference frame applied to spacetime. Let’s consider those appeals.

We can see a clock. It is real, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real—that it exists? Someone might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.

The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, “The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions” (“Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology,” 1950). He meant these two questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answers one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken these metaphysical questions seriously.

Some philosophers and physicists claim there are other reasons to believe time itself is not real. These reasons are that time is unreal because (i) it is emergent, or (ii) it is subjective, or (iii) it is merely conventional, or (iv) it is defined by an inconsistent concept, or (v) its scientific image deviates too much from its common sense image. All these reasons are explored below, in order.

i. Because Time is Emergent

Some philosophers of time argue that an emergent time is therefore not a real time. Similarly, some metaphysicians such as Arthur Eddington and Peter van Inwagen have argued that tables and chairs are not real because they emerge from arrangements of elementary particles, and it is only these particles and their arrangements that are real. The analogous position in the philosophy of mind is called “eliminative materialism.” It implies that because the physical facts fix all the facts and because future science will show that common mental states such as beliefs and hopes have no essential role in a successful explanation of mental and physical phenomena, there are no such entities as beliefs and hopes. The physicist Lee Smolin would object to this reasoning in favor of time being unreal and say time is not emergent from any deeper level of reality because it is real at the most fundamental level.

Suppose Smolin is incorrect and time does emerge from events, or spacetime, or the quantum gravitational field, or Barbour’s moments, or something else. Does this imply time is not real? Most scientists and philosophers of time will answer “no” for the following reasons. Scientists once were surprised to learn that heat emerges from the motion of molecules and that a molecule itself has no heat. Would it not have been a mistake to conclude from this that heat is unreal? And when it became clear that baseballs are basically a collection of atoms, and so baseballs can be said to emerge from atoms, would it not have been a mistake to say baseballs no longer exist? The concept of time is already known to be so extremely useful at the larger scales, the scales of quarks and molecules and mountains and galaxies, that it must be said to be real at least at these scales. The compatibility of time not existing below the Planck scale to its existing above that scale is somewhat analogous to the compatibility of free will not existing at the scale of molecular activity to its existing at the scale of human behavior.

An additional argument sometimes offered in support of this affirmation of emergent time draws attention to the question of how there could be observational support for a theory that time does not exist since presumably, observations occur in time, and causal reasoning requires that causes occur before their effects. Perhaps observations and causality could be explained with a timeless theory, but it is not at all clear how this could be accomplished.

ii. Because Time is Subjective

Psychological time is clearly subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective? Well, first what does “subjective” mean? This is a notoriously controversial term in philosophy. Here it means that a phenomenon is subjective if it is a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind. A secondary quality such as “being red” is a subjective quality; being capable of reflecting the light of a certain wavelength is not subjective. The point can be made by asking whether time comes just from us or instead is wholly out there in the external world independent of us. Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? If so, time is not objective, and so is not objectively real.

Aristotle envisioned time to be a counting of motions (Physics, IV.ch11.219b2), but he also asked the question of whether the existence of time requires the existence of mind. He does not answer his own question because he says it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjectivist position regarding time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality.

Notice that a clock will tick in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice the ability of the concept of time to help make such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events: birth before death, acorns sprout before oak trees appear, houses are built before they are painted. W. V. O. Quine might add the point that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time.

iii. Because Time is Merely Conventional

One might argue that time is not real because the concept of time is just a mathematical artifact in our fundamental theories of mathematical physics. It is merely playing an auxiliary mathematical role. Similarly, the infinite curvature of space at the center of a black hole is generally considered to be merely an artifact of the mathematics used by the general theory of relativity but not to exist in reality.

Or one might argue as follows. Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear. Money and gold both exist, but money’s existence depends upon social relations and conventions that gold’s existence does not depend upon. Is time’s existence more like money than gold in that regard?

Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway?”

Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence (Callender 2010, p. 63).

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we have invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, he said, time is otherwise wholly conventional, not objective.

One should be cautious about claiming something is merely a mathematical artifact that plays a merely auxiliary mathematical role in our theories of mathematical physics. When the concept of an atom was first proposed several centuries ago, atoms could properly be said to be merely a mathematical artifact and so not to be real. But when Einstein won a Nobel Prize for showing in 1905 that atoms are indispensable for explaining Brownian motion, a phenomenon which was until then unexplained, the scientists generally united in agreement that atoms are real.

There are two primary reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: First, there are so many one-way processes in nature. For example, mixing cold milk into hot, black coffee produces lukewarm, brown coffee, but agitations of lukewarm, brown coffee have never turned it back into hot black coffee with cool milk. The amalgamation of this process along with all the other one-way processes is time’s arrow, and no human choice affects its existence. Time’s arrow is a key feature of time itself.

Second, our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. That is, their periods keep the same constant ratio to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis, relative to the “fixed” stars, is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal. The relationships do not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of constant relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws.

iv. Because Time is Inconsistent

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real.

Plato’s classical interpretation of Zeno’s paradoxes is that they demonstrate the unreality of any motion or any other change. Assuming the existence of time requires the existence of change, then Zeno’s paradoxes also overturn Greek common sense that time exists.

The early 20th-century English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event can acquire the intrinsic properties of being a future event, a present event, and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is inconsistent. It follows for McTaggart that time is not real.

The early 20th-century absolute-idealist philosopher F.H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.”

Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time will say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaints can be handled by clarification or by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno’s paradoxes were solved by requiring time to be a linear continuum like a segment of the real number line. This solution did change Zeno’s concept, but the change was very fruitful and not ad hoc.

v. Because Scientific Time is Too Unlike Ordinary Time

If you believe that for time to exist it needs to have certain features of the common sense image of time, but you believe that science implies time does not have those features, you may be tempted to conclude that science has really discovered that time does not exist. The logician Kurt Gödel believed so. In the mid 20th century, he argued for the unreality of time as described by contemporary physical science because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. People can, “travel into any region of the past, present, and future and back again” (Gödel, 1959, pp. 560-1). It should not even be possible for time to be circular or symmetric like this, Gödel believed, so, he concluded that, if we suppose time is the time described by relativity theory, then time is not real.

Regarding the claim that our common sense understanding of time by science is not treated fairly by the science of time, there is no agreement about which particular features of common sense time cannot be rejected, although not all can be or else we would be changing the subject and not talking about time. But science has not required us to reject our belief that some events happen in time before other events, and our belief that some events last for a while. Gödel’s complaint about relativity theory’s allowing for circular time has been treated by the majority of physicists and philosophers of time by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular even though as a contingent matter it is not circular in our universe, and he needs to revise his intuitions about what is essential to the concept.

vi. Conclusion

The word “time” refers to a real or existing entity because the reference helps to explain, understand, and predict phenomena, plus there do not exist alternative, better ways of doing this.

It is still an open question among physicists and philosophers as to whether time exists below the Planck scale. However, for simplicity of presentation, the attitude taken in the remainder of this article is that time does exist at scales above the Planck scale, that the concept is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional or a mathematical artifact, that any inconsistency in time’s description is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real regardless of whether it is emergent.

11. Time Travel

You are much more likely today to meet a time traveler from the past than from the future. Would you yourself like to travel to the future and read about the history of your great-grandchildren? You can do it. Nothing in principle is stopping you except some financial difficulties and a better-engineered spaceship that can survive occasional collisions with objects in space. Would you like to travel, instead, to the past? You may have regrets and would like to set things straight.

Travel in time has been discussed in Hindu, Chinese and Japanese literature since ancient times, but its serious examination in physics and philosophy began only after 1949 when the logician Kurt Gödel published a solution to the equations of the general theory of relativity that allows travel to the past. The term “time travel” has now become a technical term. It means physical time travel, not psychological time travel. You are not a time traveler if you merely dream of living in the past, nor do you time travel for five minutes simply by being alive for five minutes. And you do not travel in time by crossing a time zone, or by having your body frozen.

In 1976, the Princeton University metaphysician David Lewis offered this technical definition of time travel:

In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

Time travel occurs when correct clocks get out of synchronization. If you are the traveler, your personal time is shown on your small personal clock that travels with you (and that is not frozen if your body is ever frozen). The person not taking the journey is said to be using “external time.” This usually is the time shown on the standard clock in the coordinate system in which the standard clock is stationary. Informally, and perhaps misleadingly, we say time “flows” differently for the time traveler than for the rest of us.

If you enter a room, then exit fifteen seconds later according to your personal clock, is the room a time machine that sends you fifteen seconds into the future? No, as can be seen by applying Lewis’s definition to the fact that your clock and a nearby clock that remained outside the room do not disagree on the time.

Lewis’s definition is widely accepted but has been criticized occasionally in the philosophical literature. The definition has no implications about whether, if you travel forward in external time to the year 2376 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then as opposed to have traveled continuously during the intervening years.

Here is a diagram of a traveler’s sudden appearance back in external time showing her death before her birth.


External time is represented in the diagram with equally-spaced times t1, t2, t3, t4, t5 and with t1 < t2 < t3 < t4 < t5. The traveler’s personal time begins when she is born at T1, with T1 = t4. Then she steps into a time machine at T2. The machine abruptly transports her back to the way the world was at t1, but her personal time is still T2, and T1 < T2. Later she dies at T3, in a situation where the external time is t2. Thus, according to external time, she dies before she is born. No such thing happened in personal time because T1 < T2 < T3.

Suppose at t1, you met this time traveler. Her personal clock would disagree with yours and would show t5. The diagram illustrates why, if you were to meet someone whose watch runs ahead of yours, this could be a sign that you’ve just met a time traveler from the future.

If Lewis’ definition of time travel is acceptable, any requirement that rules out discontinuous jumps by the traveler to the future or past in external time and demands spatiotemporal continuity of time travel will have to be supported by an additional argument. The argument that the general theory of relativity requires this continuity is such an argument.

a. To the Future

Time travel to the future does occur very frequently, and it has been observed and measured by scientists. Travel to the past is much more controversial. Relativity theory implies there are two kinds of future time travel: (1) two clocks getting out of synchrony due to their moving relative to each other, and (2) two clocks getting out of synchrony due to their encountering different gravitational forces.

When you travel to the future, you eventually arrive at some future event having taken less time on your clock than the non-travelers do on their clocks. To them, you zipped through time; to you, they were sluggish. It’s all relative. You might travel to the future in the sense that you participate in an event ten years in their future, having taken only two years according to your own clock. That would be an eight-year leap forward in time, judged by their clock. You can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage. However, the Earth observers would notice that you turned the pages in your monthly calendar very slowly. The rate of ticking of your clock differs from that of their clock during the flight, but when the two clocks are reunited and not moving relative to each other, they will tick at the same rate while showing an eight-year difference in times. Reversing your velocity and traveling back to the place you began the trip will not undo this effect.

If you do travel to the future, you never get biologically younger; you simply age more slowly than those who do not travel with you.

Any motion produces time travel to the future, relative to the clocks of those who do not move. That is why you can legitimately advertise any bicycle as being a time machine.

The second kind of future time travel is due, not to a speed difference between two clocks, but to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field on two clocks. This is called gravitational time dilation, and it is most noticeable near a source of extreme gravitation such as a black hole. If you were to leave Earth and orbit near a black hole, your friends back on Earth might view you continuously through their telescopes and, if so, would see you live in slow motion. When you returned, your clock would show that less time had expired on your clock than on their clock. Similarly, ground floor clocks tick more slowly than penthouse clocks because the ground floor is in a higher gravitational field.

Travelers to the future can participate in that future, not just view it. They can influence the future and affect it. Notice, though, that the travel has to be done in the right manner. The faster you go the sooner you get to the part of the future you desire but the more easily the dust and other particles in space will slice through your spaceship’s shielding.

One philosophical controversy is whether travelers to the future also can change the future. This is impossible, according to David Lewis (Lewis 1976, 150). If it changed, then it was not really the future after all. No action changes the future, regardless of whether time travel is involved.

Suppose you were to encounter a man today who says that yesterday he lived next door to Isaac Newton in England in the year 1700, but now he has traveled to the future and met you. It is physically possible that he did this according to the theory of general relativity. Yet it is an extraordinary claim since you undoubtedly believe that fast spaceships or access to high gravitational fields were not available to anyone in 1700. Epistemology tells us that extraordinary claims require extraordinarily good evidence, so the burden of proof is on the strange man to produce that evidence, such as a good reason why the secret of building spaceships was kept from the public. You’d also like to be shown that his body today contains traces of the kind of atmosphere that existed back in 1700; that atmosphere is slightly different from ours today. If he cannot or won’t produce the evidence, then it is much more likely that he is deluded. Giving him a lie detector test won’t be very helpful; you want to know the truth, not merely what he believes to be true.

If you are going to accept relativity’s implication that travel to the future does occur, then you need an adequate response to the claim that no one can travel to the future because only the present exists and so there is no future to travel to. This issue is discussed below in Section 14a.

b. To the Past

No scientist has yet been able to make anything travel to the past. But perhaps a scientist will someday. Let’s try to be clearer about what past time travel is, and how it might be produced. Time travel into the past does not change the direction of time, and it is not traveling through previous events in reverse. Nor do you travel to the past when you remember your youth.

A telescope is a window into the past. If we use it to look out into space to some region R a million light-years away, we are seeing R as it was a million years ago. However, this is looking, not being, because the light waves reaching our eyes through the telescope are not a million years old.

At present, you are existing in the past of future people, but not time-traveling into their past. What we might like to do instead, is to travel into our own past here on Earth. This is impossible according to Newton’s physics and impossible according to Einstein’s special theory of relativity, but not impossible according to Einstein’s general theory of relativity.

General relativity allows backward time travel. This was first predicted by the physicist Hermann Weyl shortly after Einstein published his theory, but it was not studied carefully until Gödel’s work in 1949. Some researchers find the possibility to be distasteful. They suggest that, if the theory of relativity does allow backward time travel, the theory should be revised to prevent this. Other opponents of the possibility of time travel to the past hope that an as yet unknown physical law will be discovered that rules it out. Others respond very differently and say we should bite the bullet and accept these surprising consequences of relativity theory.

Here is a pessimistic remark about time travel from J.J.C. Smart in The Journal of Philosophy in 1963:

Suppose it is agreed that I did not exist a hundred years ago. It is a contradiction to suppose that I can make a machine that will take me to a hundred years ago. Quite clearly no time machine can make it be that I both did and did not exist a hundred years ago.

Smart’s critics accuse him of the fallacy of begging the question. They wonder why he should demand that it be agreed that “I did not exist a hundred years ago.”

General relativity implies the possibility of time travel, but this is contingent upon the distribution of matter-energy in the universe, namely whether there is the proper sort of curvature of spacetime. For an illustration, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with the one space dimension going left and right on the page. Each point on the page represents a possible two-dimensional event. The time dimension points up and down the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now curve (bend) the page into a horizontal cylinder, parallel to the space axis so that the future meets the past. In the universe illustrated by this graph, any stationary object that persists long enough arrives into its past and become its earlier self. Its timeline or worldline is (topologically equivalent to) a circle; more technically, it is a closed time-like curve. A closed curve has no end points. This cylindrical universe allows an event to occur both earlier and later than itself. By the way, this curvature is what mathematicians call extrinsic curvature. There is no intrinsic curvature. Informally expressed, extrinsic curvature is something detectable only from a higher dimension, but intrinsic curvature can be detected by a being who lives within the space.

Regardless of how space is curved and what sort of time travel occurs, if any past time travel does occur, the traveler apparently is never able to erase facts or change the past. That’s the point of saying, “whatever happened, happened.” But that metaphysaical position has been challenged. It assumes there is only one past and that whatever was the case will always have been the case. These assumptions, though widely accepted, occasionally have been challenged. They were challenged in the 11th century by Peter Damian who said God could change the past.

Assuming Damian is mistaken, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather by shooting him before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed. But that seems to raise a problem about free will. If you are free to shoot and kill people before you step into a time machine, then presumably you are free to shoot and kill people after you step out. So, is there a paradox because you both can and cannot shoot and kill your grandfather?

Assuming you cannot shoot your grandfather because you didn’t, philosophers argue about whether this restraint on your actions toward your grandfather shows that in this situation you do not really have freedom in the libertarian sense of that term. To resolve this puzzle, the metaphysician David Lewis said you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. But, said Lewis, there is no sense in which you both can and cannot. So, the meaning of the word “can” is sensitive to context. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagreed, and argued that we always need to make our “can” statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, but in different senses, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t.

If you step into a time machine that projects you into the past, some philosophers argue, then you cannot stay in one place because, if you do, you will keep bumping into yourself. This problem is often called the “double-occupancy problem.” The implication is that time machines require motion, or they do not exist. Opponents of this scenario complain that there  is only one collision, not multiple collisions; a person caught in a time-like curve does not go around the curve multiple times.

It would be logically inconsistent to use a time machine to travel back to a time before the first time machine was invented, so there is no hope of creating the first time machine in order to visit the time of the dinosaurs. But if a time machine has always existed, or isn’t needed for time travel, such as in Gödel’s rotating universe, then a person could follow along a time-like worldline in that universe to visit any event in their past. Your travel is always within your own forward light cone, but the warp in spacetime continually “tilts” the cone, so you can eventually arrive back to events that occurred before you started your travel. In 1949, Kurt Gödel discovered these universes, which are models of Einstein’s equations of general relativity. Einstein was upset upon hearing that his own equations had such solutions, but he became convinced by Gödel’s arguments. There are also solutions to the equations of relativity that allow closed time-like worldlines in some regions of spacetime but not in other regions.

In 1988 in an influential physics journal, Kip Thorne and colleagues described a new way to build a time machine:

…if the laws of physics permit traversable wormholes, then they probably also permit such a wormhole to be transformed into a “time machine” with which causality might be violatable” (Morris, 1988, p. 1446).

A wormhole is a second route between two places. They are “shortcuts” in space from one place to another analogous to a path a worm might take as it chews into an apple and out again somewhere else. Just as two clocks get out of synchrony if one moves relative to the other, a clock near the rapidly moving mouth of a wormhole could get out of synch with a clock at the other, stationary mouth. Although Thorne believed that traversable wormholes probably do not exist naturally, he also believed they could in principle be created by an advanced civilization, but they probably would collapse their “throats” before anything could use the wormhole to travel back in time.

It is a very interesting philosophical project to decide whether wormhole time travel produces paradoxes of identity. Is it physically possible for a person who time travels through a wormhole to visit their earlier self? To solve the paradoxes of personal identity due to time travel’s inconsistency with commonly held assumptions about personal identity, many philosophers recommend rejecting the endurance theory which implies a person exists wholly at a single instant, for all the instants of their life. They recommend accepting the perdurance theory in which a person exists as a four-dimensional entity extending in time from birth to death. The person is their spacetime “worm.”

The concept of personal identity comes under even greater stress if, instead of merely visiting our earlier self, we become our earlier self, in which case our personal time is a loop, a closed timelike curve in spacetime. The most interesting loops are “causal loops.” Causal loops lead to backward causation in which an effect can occur before its cause. Causal loops occur when there is a continuous sequence of events e1, e2, e3, … in which each member is a cause of its numerical successor and in which, for some integer n, en causes e1. The philosopher Milič Čapek has cautioned that with a causal loop “we would be clearly on the brink of magic.” Other philosophers of time are more willing to accept the possibility of causal loops, strange though they would be. These loops would be a “fountain of youth” that allowed you to become biologically younger. When you go around the loop, you go just once, not multiple times.

What is meant by “cause” in the phrase “causal loop”? There is vast philosophical literature on disagreements about this keyword in the philosophical lexicon, but, as a first approximation, think of a cause as a necessary part of a sufficient condition.

Most time travel stories in literature involve contradictions. The most famous one that does not is Robert Heinlein’s story “All You Zombies.” It shows how a person could be both of their parents.

For a clear and detailed review of the philosophical literature on backward time travel and the resulting paradoxes of causality and of personal identity, see (Wasserman, 2018, ch. 5) and (Fisher, 2015).

Feynman U.S. postage stamp
US Postal Museum

Feynman diagrams picture a short sequence of elementary interactions among particles. Inspired by an idea from John Wheeler, Richard Feynman suggested that a way to interpret the theory of quantum electrodynamics about interactions dominated by electromagnetic or weak forces is that an antimatter particle is really a matter particle traveling backward in time. For example, the positively charged positron moving forward in time is really a negatively charged electron moving backward in time. This phenomenon is pictured in the two diagrams on the left of the above postage stamp, where the positron e+ is moving downward or backward in time.

The majority of physicists in the early 21st century see no need to accept backward time travel due to Feynman’s successful representations of quantum electrodynamics. See (Muller 2016a, p. 246, 296-7) for comment on this. Nevertheless, some well-respected physicists such as Neil Turok do accept Feynman-style backward time travel. Huw Price adds that the Feynman “zigzag is not there in standard QM, so if we put it in, we are accepting that QM is incomplete. (The zigzag needs hidden variables, in other words)” which determine when to zig and zag. At the heart of this dispute about whether to believe antimatter is regular matter traveling backward in time, physicists are very cautious because they realize that the more extraordinary the claim, the more extraordinarily good the evidence should be before accepting the claim.

Here are a variety of brief philosophical arguments against travel to the past:

  1. If travel to the past were possible, you could go back in time and kill your grandfather, but then you wouldn’t be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That’s a logical contradiction. So, travel to the past is impossible.
  2. Like the future, the past is also not real, so time travel to the past or the future is not real either.
  3. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has ever encountered any time travelers.
  4. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
  5. If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out your freedom to go back or not. Yet you do have this freedom, so travel to the past is impossible.
  6. If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is biologically impossible.
  7. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  8. If travel to the past were possible, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always fail in their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
  9. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. You in the 22nd century buy a copy of Darwin’s book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. You enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn’t really possible.
  10. Travel to the past allows you to return to have intercourse with one of your parents, causing your birth. You would have the same fingerprints as one of your parents, which is biologically impossible.
  11. If past time travel is possible, then it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which might eventually reunite with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the return or impending arrival of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, not metaphysically possible, not physically possible, not technologically possible, not biologically possible, and not probable.

Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. One response to the Grandfather Paradox of item 1 says you would kill your grandfather but then be in an alternative universe to the actual one where you did not kill him. This response is not liked by most advocates; they believe traveling to an alternative universe is not what they mean by “time travel.”

A response to the Enrico Fermi Paradox, item 3, is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to time travelers.

Argument 9, the paradox of free information, has gotten considerable attention in the philosophical literature. In 1976, David Lewis said this:

But where did the information come from in the first place? Why did the whole affair happen? There is simply no answer. The parts of the loop are explicable, the whole of it is not. Strange! But not impossible, and not too different from inexplicabilities we are already inured to. Almost everyone agrees that God, or the Big Bang, or the entire infinite past of the Universe, or the decay of a tritium atom, is uncaused and inexplicable. Then if these are possible, why not also the inexplicable causal loops that arise in time travel?

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

12. McTaggart’s A-Theory and B-Theory

In 1908, the English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The two ways are different, but the two orderings are the same.

For the sake of brevity, I shall give the name of the A series to that series of positions which runs from the far past through the near past to the present, and then from the present through the near future to the far future, or conversely. The series of positions which runs from earlier to later, or conversely, I shall call the B series (McTaggart 1968, §306).

Below is a graphic representation of McTaggart’s ordering, in which point event c happens later than point events a and b:


McTaggart is making several assumptions here. First, he does not believe time is real, so his remark that the A-series and B-series mark out positions in time is only on the assumption that time is real, despite what he, himself, believes. Another assumption is that longer-lasting events are composed of their point events. Also, there are a great many other events that are located within the series at event a‘s location, namely all the other events that are simultaneous with event a.

Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart’s B-series above is ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart’s A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or, equivalently, has more pastness than b. The A-series locates each event relative to the present; the B-series is created with no attention paid to the present, but only to what occurs before what.

Let’s suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. Although the philosophical literature is not in agreement, it is usually said that the information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself, but is used to create the A-series. That information of c‘s being in the present tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events are without pastness; they are not in the past. Someone constructing the B-series places event c to the right of b for a different reason, just that c happens after b.

McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical, but he also believed the A-properties (such as being past and being two weeks past) are essential to our concept of time. So, for this reason, he believed our current concept of time is paradoxical and incoherent. This reasoning is called McTaggart’s Paradox.

McTaggart is not an especially clear writer, so his remarks can be interpreted in different ways, and the reader needs to work hard to make sense of them. Consider McTaggart’s Paradox regarding one specific event, say the event when:

Socrates speaks to Plato for the first time.

This speaking to Plato is in the past, at least it is in our past, though not in the past of Egyptian King Tut during his lifetime, so the speaking is past in our present. Nevertheless, back in the past, there is a time when the event is present. From this, McTaggart concludes both that the event is past and that the event is present, from which he declares that the A-series is contradictory and so paradoxical. If that reasoning is correct (and it has been challenged by many), and if the A-series is essential to time, then time itself must be unreal.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of:

  • A-series and B-series
  • A-theorist and B-theorist
  • A-facts and B-facts
  • A-terms and B-terms
  • A-properties and B-properties
  • A-predicates and B-predicates
  • A-propositions and B-propositions
  • A-sentences and B-sentences
  • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples of using this terminology. Unlike the A-series terms, the B-series terms are relational terms because a B-term refers to a property that relates a pair of events. Some of these properties are: “is earlier than,” “happens twenty-three minutes after,” and “is simultaneous with.” An A-theory term, on the other hand, refers to a single event, not a pair of events. Some of these properties are: “in the near future,” “happened twenty-three minutes ago,” and “is present.” The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties.

The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon will not be a fact. B-theorists do not like facts going in and out of existence, but this is acceptable to A-theorists. Similarly, if we turn from fact-talk to statement-talk, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. B-facts are eternal. For example, the statement “The snowfall occurred an hour before this act of utterance” will, if true, be true at all times, provided the indexical phrase “the snowfall” is replaced by one indicating the time and place of the snowfall.

The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, “It began snowing an hour ago,” what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness (so the fact is “tensed”) but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that “occurs an hour after” is a B-term that is supposed to be logically tenseless and analogous to the mathematical term “numerically less than” even though when expressed in English it must use the present tense of the verb “occur.”

When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfall, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. When your attitude changes, the snowfall itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. (A-theorists and B-theorists do not disagree about this.) This is what is meant by “intrinsic” when A-theorists promote the intrinsic properties of an event, such as the snowfall having the intrinsic property of being in the past. B-theorists analyze the snowfall event differently, saying that more fundamentally the event is not in the past but is in the past relative to us. Being in the past, they say, is not intrinsic but rather is relational.

Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each camp member believes their camp’s terminology can best explain ordinary speech involving time and also the terminology of the other camp.

Usually, the A-theorist promotes “becoming” or “absolute becoming.” The term “becoming” means a change in the A-series position of an event, such as a change in its degree of pastness.

Beginning with Bertrand Russell in 1903, many B-theorists have argued that there are no irreducible one-place A-qualities (such as the monadic property of being past) because the qualities can all be reduced to, and adequately explained in terms of, two-place B-relations. The A-theorist disagrees. For example, the claim that it is after midnight might be explained, says the B-theorist, by saying midnight occurs before the time of this assertion. “Before” is a two-place relationship, a binary relation. The A-theorist claims this is a faulty explanation.

Is the A-theory or is the B-theory the correct theory of reality? This is a philosophically controversial issue. To clarify the issue, let’s re-state the two theories. The A-theory has two especially central theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory:

(1) Time is fundamentally constituted by an A-series in which any event’s being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself.

(2) Events change.

In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes… But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is usually called second-order change or McTaggartian change. For McTaggart, second-order change is the only genuine change, whereas a B-theorist such as Russell says this is not genuine change because genuine change is this: the ordinary change of color that occurs over time when a leaf turns from green to brown due to lack of water, or the ordinary change of location that occurs over time when a bullet leaves the gun barrel and strikes the target. In response, McTaggart said:

No, Russell, no. What you identify as “change” isn’t change at all. The “B-series world” you think is the real world is…a world without becoming, a world in which nothing happens.

The B-theory conflicts with two central theses of the A-theory. According to the B-theory,

(1′) Time is fundamentally constituted by a B-series, and the temporal properties of being in the past (or in the present or in the future) are fundamentally relational, not monadic.

(2′) Events do not change.

To re-examine this dispute, because there is much misunderstanding about what is being disputed, let’s ask again what B-theorists mean by calling temporal properties “relational.” They mean that an event’s property of occurring twenty-three minutes in the past, say, is a relation between the event and us, the subject, the speaker. When analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Scottish Queen Anne’s death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past. It is not in Aristotle’s past or King Tut’s. So, the labels, “past,” “present,” and “future” are all about us and are not intrinsic properties of events. There is no objective distinction among past, present and future, say the proponents of the B-theory. For similar reasons the B-theorist says the property of being two days in the past is not an authentic property because it is a second-order property.” The property of being two days in our past, however, is a genuine property, says the B-theorist.

Their point about A-properties being relational when properly analyzed is also made this way. The A-theory terminology about space uses the terms “here,” “there,” “far,” and “near.” These terms are essentially about the speaker.

Is a map drawn incorrectly because it leaves out an arrow pointing to ‘here’ and another arrow pointing to ‘there’? If not, then the B-theory’s spacetime diagram is also not an incorrect treatment of time even if our common sense image of time does require the event of Queen Anne’s death to change by receding farther into the past.

The B-theorist also argues that the A-theory violates the theory of relativity because an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is relative and not an intrinsic quality of the event. Being present is relative to a reference frame. And for this reason, there are as many different B-series as there are legitimate reference frames. The typical proponent of the A-series cannot accept this.

A-theorists are aware of these criticisms, and there are many counterarguments. Some influential A-theorists are A.N. Prior, E.J. Lowe, and Quentin Smith. Some influential B-theorists are Bertrand Russell, W.V.O. Quine, and D.H. Mellor. The A-theory is closely related to the common sense image of time, and the B-theory is more closely related to the scientific image. Proponents of each theory shoulder a certain burden—explaining not just why the opponent’s theory is incorrect but also why it seems to be correct to the opponent.

The philosophical literature on the controversy between the A and B theories is vast. During a famous confrontation with the philosopher Henri Bergson in 1922, Einstein defended his own scientific treatment of time and said the “time of the philosophers” is an illusion. This is an overstatement by Einstein. He meant to attack only the A-theorist philosophers.

Martin Heidegger said he wrote Being and Time in 1927 as a response to the conflict between the A-theory and the B-theory, the conflict between the time of Bergson and the time of Einstein.

13. The Flow of Time

Time seems to flow or pass, many people say. They might explain the remark by pointing out that the present keeps vanishing. Or they might offer a simile and say present events seem to flow into the past, like a boat that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther from us. In the converse sense, we flow into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us. The Spanish philosopher George Santayana said, “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” Philosophers disagree with each other on how to explain the ground of these ideas. Philosopher X will say time flows, but not in the sense of flow used by philosopher Y, while philosopher Z will disagree with both of them.

There are various entangled issues regarding flow. (i) What does it mean for time to flow? (ii) Does time really flow? (iii) If so, do we experience the flow directly? (iv) If time does not flow, why do so many people believe it does?

There are two primary philosophical attitudes about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) The flow is not objectively real; it is merely subjective. The B-theory is called the static theory, mostly by its opponents. The A-theory is called the dynamic theory because it implies time is constantly in flux. The letters “A” and “B” suggest an alliance with McTaggart’s A-theory and B-theory. One A-theorist describes the situation this way:

The sensation we are (perhaps wrongly) tempted to describe as the sensation of temporal motion is veridical:  it somehow puts us in touch with an aspect of reality that is unrepresented in Russell’s theory of time [the original B-theory] (van Inwagen 2015, 81).

The B-theory implies that this temporal motion or flow is not veridical; it is the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of that charge often proceeds like this. Time exists, things change, and so we say time “elapses,” but time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing or passing or undergoing any motion. The present does not objectively flow because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience.

Here is another prong of the B-theory attack on the notion of flow. The death of Queen Anne is an event that an A-theorist says is continually changing from past to farther into the past, but this change is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death.

One point J. J. C. Smart offered against the A-theory of flow was to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, he claimed. One second divided by one second is the number one, a unit-less number, and so not an allowable rate. And what would it be like for the rate to be two seconds per second? Other philosophers of time say the rate of one second per second is acceptable, despite these criticisms.

To understand the concept of flow or passage used by the A-theory, it can be helpful to appreciate that it is not any of the following four concepts.

(1) According to the theory of relativity, two clocks run at different rates if one is moving relative to the other. Physicists sometimes speak of this situation as one in which time flows differently for the two clocks. However, this is not the sense of flow being promoted by dynamic theories of time from McTaggart’s A-camp.

(2) Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term “flow.” This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. Continuous-time is flowing time. Again, this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers have in mind when debating the objectivity of time’s flow.

(3) Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing when all they mean is that time exists.

(4) Some researchers do speak of time flowing in yet another sense—that time has an arrow, a direction. Arthur Eddington often equated time’s flow and time’s arrow. For most all other advocates of time’s flow, this is not the sense of “flow” that they have in mind. One additional issue here though is whether flow entails the arrow of time or causes the arrow or is identical to the arrow or is independent of the arrow.

There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the proponents of the static theories, that causes us to believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. These B-theorists say perhaps the belief is due not to time’s actually flowing but rather to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences.

Dynamic theories are closer to common sense. However, there are many kinds of dynamic theory. Here are six. (1) The flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past. Events change in their degree of futureness and degree of pastness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart’s second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change that occurs when a falling leaf changes its altitude over time.

(2) A second type of dynamic theory says time’s flow is the coming into existence of new facts, the actualization of new states of affairs. Reality grows by the addition of more facts. There need be no commitment to events changing intrinsically, as McTaggart believed.

(3) A third dynamic theory says that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate to becoming determinate in the present. Because time’s flow is believed to be due to events becoming determinate, these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as “temporal becoming.”

(4) A fourth dynamic theory says, “The progression of time can be understood by assuming that the Hubble expansion takes place in 4 dimensions rather than in 3. The flow of time consists of the continuous creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space… Unlike the picture drawn in the classic Minkowski spacetime diagram, the future does not yet exist; we are not moving into the future, but the future is being constantly created.” (Muller 2016b).

(5) A fifth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth-values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false because it is sunny today. That is an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth-value changes are at the root of the flow.

In response to this linguistic turn, critics suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth-value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If the sentence cannot have a truth-value, it cannot change its truth-value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth-value, namely the associated “complete sentence” or “eternal sentence,” the sentence with its temporal indexical replaced by some date expression that refers to a specific time, and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Typical indexicals are the words: then, now, I, this, here, them. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2000, and the speaker is in San Francisco, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately associated with the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2000, in San Francisco, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, so-called “complete sentences” have truth-values, and these truth-values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time, according to the critic of the fifth dynamic theory.

(6) A sixth dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a traveling present or moving property of being now that spotlights a new present slice of the block at every new moment. A slice is a set of events all of which are simultaneous in the block. So, events can temporarily possess a monadic property of being now, and then lose it as a newer slice becomes spotlighted. This theory in which objective becoming is analyzed in terms of the moving spotlight is called the moving spotlight theory. This dynamic theory was attacked by J.M.E. McTaggart and promoted by C.D. Broad in the early 20th century.

14. The Past, Present, and Future

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, this is asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on this ontological question of the reality of the past, present, and future. There are three leading theories, and there is controversy over the exact wording of each, and whether the true theory is metaphysically necessary or just contingently true. The three do not differ in their observational consequences as do competing scientific theories.

(1) According to the ontological theory called presentism, only present objects exist. Stated another way: if something is real, then it exists now. The past and the future are not real, so either the past tense sentence, “Dinosaurs existed” is false, or else it is true but its truth is grounded only in some present facts. A similar analysis is required for statements in the future tense. Perhaps they can be analyzed in terms of present anticipations. With that accomplished, then all the events can be linearly ordered as if the past ones occur before the present ones and the present ones occur before the future ones, when actually they do not because all real events occur in the present. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, A.N. Prior, and Lee Smolin are presentists. In 1969, Prior said of the present and the real:

They are one and the same concept, and the present simply is the real considered in relation to two particular species of unreality, namely the past and the future.

(2) Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C.D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended the growing-past theory. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see Hilary Putnam (1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue. The growing-past theory is also called by other names: “now-and-then-ism, the “becoming theory,” and “possibilism.” Members of McTaggart’s A-camp are divided on whether to accept presentism or, instead, the growing-past theory, but they agree on rejecting eternalism.

(3) Advocates of eternalism say there are no objective ontological differences among the past, present, and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The differences among past, present, and future are subjective, depending upon whose experience is being implicitly referred to—yours or, say, Julius Caesar’s. Eternalism conflicts with the common sense image. Bertrand Russell, J.J.C. Smart, W.V.O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and David Lewis have endorsed eternalism. Eternalism is less frequently called the tapestry theory of time.

Almost all eternalists adopt the block-universe theory. The block theory implies reality is representable as a four-dimensional block of events in spacetime in some reference frame; in the block, any two non-simultaneous events are ordered by the happens-before relation. The future part of the block is a region of actual events, not possible events. It is clear how to transform events-at-times in the three-dimensional universe onto events-at-temporal-locations in the block universe.

For a graphic presentation of the block, see a four-dimensional Minkowski diagram where the curvature of spacetime due to the presence of matter-energy is not represented. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along those dimensions. Our knowledge about future events in the block is minimal, but the future part of the block is ontologically real despite these epistemological limitations.

If it were learned that space is nine-dimensional rather than three-dimensional, then block theorists would promote a ten-dimensional block rather than a four-dimensional block.

The block is philosophically controversial. In his book The Future, the Oxford philosopher John Lucas said, “The block universe gives a deeply inadequate view of time. It fails to account for the passage of time, the pre-eminence of the present, the directedness of time, and the difference between the future and the past.”

Motion in the real world is, of course, dynamic, but its historical record, such as its record within the block, is static. That is, any motion’s mathematical representation is static in the sense of being timeless. The block theory has been accused by A-theorists of spatializing time and geometricizing time, which arguably it does. The philosophical debate is whether this is a mistake. Some B-theorists complain that, by labeling the static view “static,” one is implying mistakenly that there is a time dimension in which the block is not changing but should. The block describes change but doesn’t itself change, say B-theorists. The A-theorist’s complaint, says the B-theorist, is like complaining that a musical score is faulty because it is static, while real music is vibrant.

For the eternalist and block-theorist, the block that is created using one reference frame is no more distinguished than the block that is created using another frame. Any chosen reference will have its own definite past, present, and future. The majority of physicists accept this block theory, which could be called the mild block theory. Metaphysicians also argue over whether reality itself is a static block, rather than just being representable as a static block. These metaphysicians are promoting a strong block theory. Some B-theorists complain that this strong block theory is confusing the representation with what is represented. It is helpful to keep this distinction in mind as the discussion continues. See (Smolin 2013, pp. 25-36) for an elaboration of the point.

Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say the block is ever-growing, and the present is the leading edge between reality and the unreal future. Some philosophers express that point by saying the present is the edge of all “becoming.” The advocates of the growing-block usually agree with the eternalists that what makes the sentence, “Dinosaurs once existed,” be true is that there is a past region of the block in which dinosaurs do exist.

All three ontologies [namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism] imply that, at the present moment, we only ever experience a part of the present and that we do not have direct access to the past or the future. They all agree that nothing exists now that is not present, and all three need to explain how and why there is an important difference between never existing (such as Santa Claus) and not existing now (such as Abraham Lincoln). Members of all three camps will understand an ordinary speaker who says, “There will be a storm tomorrow so it’s good that we fixed the roof last week,” but they will provide different treatments of this remark at a metaphysical level.

Most eternalists accept the B-theory of time. Presentists and advocates of the growing-past tend to accept the A-theory of time. Let’s take a closer look at presentism.

One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated in 1865? In technical-ease, we are asking what are the “truthmakers” of the true sentences and the “falsemakers” of the false sentences. Many presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers in the past but are nevertheless true because their truthmakers are in the present. They say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way that things are, perhaps traces of the past in pages of present books and in our memories. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist and the growing-past theorist believe this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist and the growing-block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real but far away from us along a spatial dimension. “Why not treat these distant realities in the same manner?” they will claim.

A related issue for the presentist is how to account for causation, for how April showers bring May flowers. Presentists believe in processes, but can they account for the process of a cause producing an effect without both the cause and the effect being real at different times?

Presentism and the growing-past theory need to account for the Theory of Relativity‘s treatment of the present, or else criticize the theory. Relativity implies there is no common global present, but only different presents for each of us. Relativity theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in one reference frame, while allowing b to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame, even though a and c are not simultaneous in either frame. Nevertheless, if a is real, then shouldn’t c be real? But neither presentism nor the growing-past theory can allow c to be real. This argument against presentism and the growing-past theory presupposes the transitivity of co-existence.

Despite this criticism, (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. The implication is that, for event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero spacetime interval from a; yet many of Stein’s opponents, including his fellow presentists, do not like this implication.

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past usually will unite in opposition to eternalism for these five reasons: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are expectations of future experiences. (ii) Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists (as opposed to non-classical versions that say the block splits into multiple blocks for each quantum possibility at each instant), there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; that is determinism. We know this determinsm is incorrect because it denies libertarian free will. (iii) A present event “moves” in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness, but eternalism disallows this movement. (iv) Future events do not exist and so do not stand in relationships of before and after, but eternalism accepts these relationships. (v) Future-tensed statements that are contingent, such as “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” do not have existing truthmakers and so are neither true nor false, yet most eternalists mistakenly believe all these statements do have truth values now.

Defenders of eternalism and the block-universe offer some responses to these criticisms. For instance, regarding (i), they are likely to say the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there, so why should the vividness of now imply the unreality of then and dthe unreality of the future? Regarding (ii) and the openness of the future, the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually, there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don’t we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious, says the eternalist. In 1981, J. J. C. Smart, a proponent of the block-universe, asked us to:

conceive of a soldier in the twenty-first century…cold, miserable and suffering from dysentery, and being told that some twentieth-century philosophers and non-philosophers had held that the future was unreal. He might have some choice things to say.

Here is a commonly offered defense of the block-universe theory against the charge that it demands determinism:

The block universe is not necessarily a deterministic one. …Strictly speaking, to say that the occurrence of a relatively later event is determined vis à vis a set of relatively earlier events, is only to say that there is a functional connection or physical law linking the properties of the later event to those of the earlier events. …Now in the block universe we may have partial or even total indeterminacy—there may be no functional connection between earlier and later events (McCall 1966, p. 271).

One defense of the block theory against Bergson’s charge that it inappropriately spatializes time is to point out that when we graph the color of eggs sold against the dollar amount of the sales, no one complains that we are inappropriately spatializing egg color.

If you look at the North Star, you see it as it was, not as it is, because it takes so many years for the light to reach your eyes. The North Star might have burned out several years ago. If so, then you are seeing something that does not exist, according to the presentist. That is puzzling. Eternalism provides a way out of the puzzle: you are seeing an existing time-slice of the 4D block that is the North Star.

A survey of defenses for presentism and the growing-past theories, see (Putnam 1967), (Saunders 2002), (Markosian 2003), (Savitt 2008), and (Miller 2013, pp. 354-356).

b. The Present

There is considerable controversy among philosophers of time about what is meant by the present, and whether it is objectively real. If it were objectively real, it should be agreed upon by everyone, at least in principle. The A-theorists favor the claim that the present is objectively real; the B-theorists oppose it. For simplicity, the discussion below ignores the debate about whether there is an objective specious present.

Let’s consider some arguments in favor of the objectivity of the present, the reality of now. The now is so much more vivid to everyone. Past and future events are dim by comparison. Proponents of an objective present say that if scientific laws do not recognize this vividness, then there is a defect within science.

There is so much agreement among people about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn’t that a sign that the now is objective, not subjective? This agreement is reflected within our natural languages where we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

What have B-theorists said in response? Well, regarding vividness, we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with the experience of past presents and future presents. Instead, when we speak of the “vividness” of our present experience of, say, a leaf falling in front of us, we are really comparing our present experience of the leaf with our dim memories of leaves falling, and with dim expectations of leaves yet to fall.  So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed, says the critic, by measuring those future events when they happen and not merely by measuring present expectations of those events.

In another attempt to undermine the vividness argument, the B-theorist points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now, in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer assures us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

When you speak on the phone with someone two hundred miles away, the conversation is normal because the two of you seem to share a common now. But that normalcy is only apparent because the phone signal travels the two hundred miles so quickly. During a phone conversation with someone much farther away, say on the Moon, you would notice a strange 1.3 second time lag because the Moon is 1.3 light seconds away from Earth. Suppose you were to look at your correct clock on Earth and notice it is midnight. What time would it be on the Moon, according to your clock? This is not a good question. A more sensible question is, “What events on the Moon are simultaneous with midnight on Earth, according to my clock?” You cannot look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes any signal that long to reach you from the Moon. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the explosion through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid must have struck the Moon at midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you will have a much longer wait. So, the moral is that the collection of events comprising your present is something you have to compute; you cannot directly perceive those events at once.

To continue advancing an argument against an objective present, which is the position of most B theorists, notice the difference in time between your clock which is stationary on Earth and the time of an observer using a clock in a  spaceship that is flying by you at a significant fraction of the speed of light. Assume the spaceship flies very close to you and that the two clocks are synchronized and are working perfectly and they now show the time is midnight at the flyby. According to the special theory of relativity, the collection of events across the universe that you eventually compute and say occurs now at midnight, necessarily must be different from the collection of events that the spaceship traveler computes and says occurs at midnight. You and the person on the spaceship probably will not notice much of a difference for an event at the end of your street or even on another continent, but you will begin to notice the difference for an event on the Moon and even more so for an event somewhere across the Milky Way or, worse yet, for an event in the Andromeda galaxy.  Also, the difference in nows is more extreme the faster the spaceship’s speed as it flies by you. The implication, says the B theorist, is that there are a great many different nows and nobody’s now is the only correct one. This point about the conventionality of the now or the conventionality of simultaneity was illustrated in Section 9 for events in the Andromeda Galaxy.

But isn’t there a privileged reference frame in astronomy? Yes, it is the frame in which cosmic time is measured. This is the frame used when astronomers say the big bang began 13.8 billion years ago, or that the universe turned transparent 380,000 years after that. The frame is described in this article’s analysis of the big bang. This reference frame has an origin where the average motion of all the universe’s galaxies is stationary. Clocks fixed in this frame are sitting still while the universe expands around them; and at the frame’s origin, the universe is approximately isotropic at the cosmic scale, so the universe looks like it has the same average temperature in all directions. The origin is traveling about 350 km/s toward the constellation of Pisces and away from Leo. This is a privileged reference frame for astronomical convenience, but there is little reason to suppose this frame is what is sought by the A-theorist who believes in an objective present.

Opponents of an objective present frequently point out that none of the fundamental laws of physics pick out a present moment. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that some value of the time variable t is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally. If science’s laws do not need the present, then it is not real, say the B theorists. The counterargument is that it is the mistake of scientism to suppose that if something is not in our current theories, then it must not be real. France is real, but it is not mentioned in any scientific law.

In any discussion about whether the now is objective, we need to remember that the term “objective” has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame, and there is objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent, and there is objective in the sense of not being anthropocentric. Proponents of the B-theory say the now is not objective in any of these senses.

There is considerable debate in the philosophical literature about whether the above treatment of the present in physics reveals an error in physics because, say the A-theorists, the present moments are so special that the laws should somehow recognize them. They point out that even Einstein said, “There is something essential about the Now which is just outside the realm of science.” In 1925, the distinguished philosopher of science Hans Reichenbach criticized the block theory’s treatment of the present:

In the condition of the world, a cross-section called the present is distinguished; the ‘now’ has objective significance. Even when no human being is alive any longer, there is a ‘now’….

This claim has met stiff resistance. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later (Russell 1915, p. 212).

Rudolf Carnap added that a belief in the present is a matter for psychology, not physics.

The B-camp says belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now, when actually we are not factoring in the finite speed of light and sound. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases “the present” and “now” as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered by the speaker, and so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. A-theorists do not accept these criticisms.

There are interesting issues about the now in the philosophy of religion. For one example, Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this, says Kretzmann, God must always be changing because God’s knowledge keeps changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God’s being omniscient and God’s being immutable.

Disagreement about the now is an ongoing feature of debate in the philosophy of time, and there are many subtle moves made by advocates on each side of the issue.

c. Persistence, Four-Dimensionalism, and Temporal Parts

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional events. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism. Both eternalists and four-dimensionalists accept McTaggart’s B-theory.

Four-dimensionalism does not imply that time is identical to a dimension of space; space and time are very different, though they do have some similarities. However, when a four-dimensionalist represents time in a four-dimensional diagram, say, a Minkowski diagram, time is one of the four-dimensions of this mathematical space. Doing this does not imply that a four-dimensional is committed to the claim that real, physical space itself is four-dimensional.

Four-dimensionalists take a stand on the philosophical issue of endurance vs. perdurance. Some objects last longer than others, so we say they persist longer. But there is a philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects are traditionally said to persist by enduring over some time interval. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said, instead, to persist by perduring. These objects do not pass through time; they do not endure; they extend through time.

The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages).  Instantaneous temporal parts are called temporal slices and time slices. For example, a forty-year-old man is a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his three temporal stages that we call his childhood, his middle age, and his future old age.

Here are fairly well-accepted definitions of endurance and perdurance from David Lewis in 1986:

Something perdures iff it persists by having different temporal parts, or stages, at different times, though no one part of it is wholly present at more than one time; whereas it endures iff it persists by being wholly present at more than one time.

The term “iff” stands for “if and only if.” Given a sequence of temporal parts, how do we know whether they compose a single perduring object? One answer, given by Hans Reichenbach, Ted Sider, and others, is that they compose a single object if the sequence falls under a causal law so that temporal parts of the perduring object cause other temporal parts of the object. Philosophers of time with a distaste for the concept of causality, oppose this answer.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easier time solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus Paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken because people often step into the same river twice. Who is really making the mistake?

The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken, says Lewis. We do not step into two different rivers, do we? They are the same river. Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. So, the advocate of endurance has trouble escaping the Heraclitus Paradox. So does the mereological essentialist.

A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus Paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-dimensional river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-D game.

There is nothing special about water flow. The problem of temporary intrinsics occurs when trying to explain how Socrates can both sit and stand. If Socrates exists wholly at each time, then how can he be both standing and not standing?

For more examination of the issue with detailed arguments for and against perdurance and endurance, see (Wasserman, 2018), (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7), and especially the article “Persistence” in this encyclopedia.

d. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences

The above disputes about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory have taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a related question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.

The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that the next day the admiral does order a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. The eternalist says that, if this is so, then the sentence token about the sea battle was true yesterday at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, eternalists say, and the predicate “is true” is a timeless predicate, not one that merely means “is true now.” The sentence spoken now has a truth-maker within the block at a future time, even though the event has not yet happened and so the speaker has no access to that truthmaker. These B-theory philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is simply true or false, even if we do not know which.

Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart’s A-camp, agree with Aristotle’s suggestion that the sentence about the future sea battle is not true (or false) until the battle occurs (or doesn’t).  Predictions fall into the “truth-value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth-values when uttered is called the “doctrine of the open future” and also the “Aristotelian position” because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to have been holding the position in chapter 9 of his On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth-values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth-values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world as the libertarians believe they must; but, if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you were not free to do otherwise if your intentions had been different back then, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see the discussion of it in Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument, presumably:

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without both premises in this argument having truth-values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth-values of the component sentences—that a valid argument cannot possibly have true premises and a false conclusion. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false. So, logic doesn’t apply. Surely, then, the Aristotelian position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as “now” and “tomorrow” because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal or complete sentences whose truth-values are not relative to the situation and time of utterance because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by expressions for specific times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth-values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine. For a criticism of Quine’s treatment of indexicals, see (Slater 2012, p. 72).

Philosophers are still divided on all these issues.

e. Essentially-Tensed Facts

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. English has tenses, but the Chinese, Burmese, and Malay languages do not. The English language distinguishes “Her death has happened” from “Her death will happen.” However, English also expresses time in other ways: with the adverbial phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” with the adjective phrases “new” and “ancient,” and with the prepositions “until” and “since.”

Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: tenses are objective, and tenses are subjective. The two answers have given rise to two competing camps of philosophers of time.

The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by the B-theory, nor by eternalism, nor by the block-universe approach. This philosophical theory is said to “take tense seriously” and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that, when we learn the truth-values of certain tensed sentences, we obtain knowledge which tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time. Tenses are almost the same as what is represented by positions in McTaggart‘s A-series, so the theory that takes tense seriously  is commonly called the A-theory of tense, and its advocates are called tensers.”

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Our saying the event “happened” rather than “is happening” indicates that we said this after the event happened rather than before or during the event. Tenses are about us speakers. This theory is the B-theory of tense, and its advocates are called detensers.  The detenser W. V. O. Quine expressed the position this way:

Our ordinary language shows a tiresome bias in its treatment of time. Relations of date are exalted grammatically…. This bias is of itself an inelegance, or breach of theoretical simplicity. Moreover, the form that it takes—that of requiring that every verb form show a tense—is peculiarly productive of needless complications, since it demands lipservice to time even when time is farthest from our thoughts. Hence in fashioning canonical notations it is usual to drop tense distinctions (Word and Object §36).

The philosophical disagreement about tenses is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark.

The controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their “truthmakers.”

The B-theorist says tensed facts are not needed to account for why tensed sentences get the truth values they do.

Consider the tensed sentence, “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the “tensed” fact that the death has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the above sentence. Notice that the B-answer does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, any appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language at the fundamental level, as are all other uses of the terminology of the A-series (except in trivial instances such as “The A-series is constructed using A-facts”).

This B-theory analysis is challenged by the tenser’s A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but the A-theorist points out that a proposition can be true even if never uttered, never read, and never inscribed.

There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present-tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis of it, such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight,” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress. John Perry famously explored this argument in his article, “The Problem of the Essential Indexical.”

Prior, in (Prior 1959), supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” The B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness, he says, because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of “Thank goodness that is over,” since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event is in the past, that is, we are thankful for the pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice in which we are saying, “Thank goodness that is over.” Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So, Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is unsuccessful.

D. H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart, both proponents of the B-theory, agree that tensed talk is important, and can be true, and even be essential for understanding how we think and speak; but Mellor and Smart claim that tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality and that the extra-linguistic reality does not contain tense facts corresponding to true, tensed talk. These two philosophers, and many other philosophers who “do not take tense seriously,” advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed, declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior and other A-theorists are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones.

The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence “Snow is white” is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term ‘snow’ satisfies the predicate ‘is white’. Regarding if-then sentences, the conditions under which the  sentence “If it’s snowing, then it’s cold” are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically. Alfred Tarski has provided these analyses in his semantic theory of truth.

Mellor and Smart agree that truth conditions can adequately express the meaning of tensed sentences or all that is important about the meaning when it comes to describing objective reality. This is a philosophically controversial point, but Mellor and Smart accept it, and argue that therefore there is really no need for tensed facts and tensed properties. The untranslatability of some tensed sentences merely shows a fault with ordinary language‘s ability to characterize objective, tenseless reality. If the B-theory, in accounting for the truth conditions of an A-sentence, fails to account for the full meaning of the A-sentence, then this is because of a fault with the A-sentence, not the B-theory.

Let’s make the same point in other words. According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, “It is now midnight,” then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without some loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of “It is now midnight” are that my utterance occurs (in the tenseless sense of “occurs”) at very nearly the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it’s true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in this explanation of the truth conditions.

Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist’s chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this; and even though it was true even last month that the one time occurred before the other, I am happy to learn this. Of course, I’d be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Being thankful for the pastness of the painful event provides a simpler explanation, actually a simplistic explanation, but not a better explanation.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.

To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but proponents of the new B-theory claim their analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should “not take tense seriously” in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not actually needed.

Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. They will insist there are irreducible A-properties and that what I am glad about when a painful event is over is that the event is earlier than now, that is, has pastness. Quentin Smith says, more generally, that the “new tenseless theory of time is faced with insurmountable problems, and that it ought to be abandoned in favor of the tensed theory.”

The advocate of the A-theory E.J. Lowe opposed the B-theory because it conflicts so much with the common sense image of time:

I consider it to be a distinct merit of the tensed view of time that it delivers this verdict, for it surely coincides with the verdict of common sense (Lowe, 1998, p. 104).

Lowe argued that no genuine event can satisfy a tenseless predicate, and no truth can be made true by B-theory truth conditions because all statements of truth conditions are tensed.

The philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

15. The Arrow of Time

The arrow of time is what the Roman poet Ovid was referring to when he said, “Time itself glides on with constant motion, ever as a flowing river.” One goal of philosophers of time is to describe and explain the arrow without using metaphors. Does time itself have the arrow directly, or does it have the arrow only indirectly because there are small arrows within some physical processes? Whatever the arrow is, it does not perform any “pushing” or “prodding.” The arrow is not a cause, although there are interesting philosophical speculations that the direction of time might be intimately linked with the direction from cause to effect.

Many physicists claim the arrow is due to the fact that so many of the universe’s complex processes display a one-way character called irreversibility. These processes are the small arrows. One of them is the process of people always evolving over time toward their death rather than from death back to life. A second small arrow is perfume escaping the open bottle and filling the room with fragrance; the process of the perfume molecules leaving the room and converging back into the bottle never occurs. A third is that heat goes from hot objects into adjacent cold ones, never in reverse by leaving the hot objects hotter and the cold objects colder. The amalgamation of all these irreversible processes is the arrow of time.

With considerable effort, a person might capture all the perfume molecules in the room and send them back in reverse until they all collect in the perfume bottle at the same time, but such a reversal would never happen spontaneously, that is, without this extra effort. To be an irreversible process, the process needs to have the feature that the reversal, even if it is physically possible, is extremely unlikely to happen spontaneously.

According to this one suggestion from physicists of what the phrase the arrow of time means, the main difficulty is to explain the difference between irreversible processes which do exhibit an arrow and reversible processes which do not, and to explain why the irreversible processes occur so much more frequently.

This profusion of irreversible processes is odd because the fundamental laws of nature permit nearly every process to go reverse, and the exceptions seem to be irrelevant to the arrow. Since an appeal to a law is always needed for a good scientific explanation, does this reversible feature of the fundamental laws imply that the arrow of time is describable but not ultimately explainable? The most favored answer to this notorious question is that so many irreversible processes exist because of statistical reasons having to do with entropy and because very special cosmological conditions obtained at the time of the big bang 13.8 billion years ago.

There are other interesting issues about the arrow. Which of the small arrows of time cannot be explained by entropy increase? Could there be distant regions of space and time where the arrow runs in reverse compared to our arrow? If so, would adults in that region naturally walk backwards on the way to their childhood while they remember the future?

16. Temporal Logic

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time and temporal information by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements imply which others. For example, in McTaggart’s B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time and temporal information.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Adam’s arrival at the train station happens before Bryan’s. Therefore, Bryan’s arrival at the station does not happen before Adam’s.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant ‘a’ denotes Adam’s arrival at the train station, and ‘b’ denotes Bryan’s arrival at the train station. Let the two-place or two-argument relation Bxy be interpreted as “x happens before y.” The direct translation of the above informal argument produces:


The symbol ‘~’ is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol ‘¬’ for negation. Unfortunately, this simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we can add some semantic principles about the happens-before relation, namely, the premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we can add this additional premise to the argument:

∀x∀y[Bxy ~Byx]

The symbol ‘∀’ is the universal quantifier on x. Some logicians prefer to use ‘(x)’ for the universal quantifier. The symbol ‘→’ is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol ‘⊃’ instead.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Adam arrives at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrives there before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrives before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:


To make this argument be valid we can add the premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) Bxz]

The symbol ‘&’ represents the conjunction operation. Some logicians prefer to use either the symbol ‘·‘ or ‘∧’ for conjunction. The transitivity of B is a principle we may want to add to our temporal logic.

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions:

  • ∀x∀y{Bxy → [t(x) < t(y)]}. If x happens before y, then the time coordinate of x is less than the time coordinate of y. ‘t’ is a one-argument function symbol.
  • ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself.
  • ∀x∀y{[t(x) ≠ t(y)] → [Bxy v Byx]}. Any two non-simultaneous events are connected by the B relation. That is, there are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. (In his Critique of Pure Reason, Kant says this is an apriori necessary requirement.)
  • ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future.
  • ∀x∀y(Bxy → ∃z(Bxz & Bzy)). B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any pair of non-simultaneous point events. This prevents quantized time.

To incorporate the ideas of the theory of relativity, we might want to make the happens-before relation be three-valued instead of two-valued by having it relate two events plus a reference frame.

When we formalized these principles of reasoning about the happens-before relation by translating them into predicate logic, we said we were creating temporal logic. However, strictly speaking, a temporal logic is just a theory of temporal sentences expressed in a formal logic. Calling it a logic, as is commonly done, is a bit of an exaggeration; it is analogous to calling the formalization of Peano’s axioms of arithmetic the development of number logic. Our axioms about B are not axioms of predicate logic, but only of a theory that uses predicate logic and that presumes the logic is interpreted on a domain of instantaneous events, and that presumes B is not open to re-interpretation as are the other predicate letters of predicate logic, but is always to be interpreted as “happens-before.”

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments formalized in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. A. N. Prior was the pioneer in the late 1950s. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. Prior created this new logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterward,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to the resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W. V. O. Quine, who prefer to avoid the use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false.

Prior’s main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic by re-interpreting its propositional operators. Or we can say he added four new propositional operators. Here they are with examples of their intended interpretations using an arbitrary present-tensed proposition p.

Pp “It has at some time been the case that p”
Fp “It will at some time be the case that p”
Hp “It has always been the case that p”
Gp “It will always be the case that p”

‘Pp’ might be interpreted also as “at some past time it was the case that,” or “it once was the case that,” or “it once was that,” all these being equivalent English phrases for the purposes of applying tense logic to English. None of the tense operators are truth-functional.

One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, if p represents the present-tensed proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp represents “It has at some time been the case that Custer dies in Montana” which is equivalent in English to simply “Custer died in Montana.” So, we call ‘P’ the past-tense operator. ‘P’ represents a phrase that attaches to a sentence in order to produce another.

Metaphysicians who are presentists are especially interested in this tense logic because, if Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then this logic, with an appropriate semantics, may show how to eliminate any ontological commitment to the past (and future) while preserving the truth of past tense propositions that appear in biology books such as “There were dinosaurs” and “There was a time when the Earth did not exist.”

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom:

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq).

The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then:

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)


Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the following equivalence. For all propositions p and q,

(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom, when interpreted in tense logic, captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be:

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not necessary that not-p.

A tense logic will need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic. It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time,
for example that it comes to an end or doesn’t come to an end or that time is like a line instead of a circle; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth or falsehood of a tensed proposition could be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, the proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true-at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

Prior himself did not take a stand on which formal logic and formal semantics are correct for dealing with temporal expressions.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, for example, “The event of Queen Anne’s dying has the property of being in the past”; but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, “It has at some time in the past been the case that Queen Anne is dying,” and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. Instead of translating the “x is resting” predicate as Px, where P is a one-argument predicate, it could be translated into temporal predicate logic as the two-argument predicate Rxt, and this would be interpreted as saying x is resting at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate R by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable ‘t’ is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms to more carefully specify what can be assumed about the nature of time.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say ‘n’, to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let the individual constant ‘s’ denote Socrates, and let Rst be interpreted as “Socrates is resting at t.” The false sentence that Socrates has always been resting would be expressed in this first-order temporal logic as:

∀t(Ltn → Rst)

Here ‘L’ is the two-argument predicate for numerically less than that mathematicians usually write as ‘<‘. And we see the usefulness of having the symbol ‘n’.

If tense logic is developed using a Kripke semantics of possible worlds, then it is common to alter the accessibility relation between any two possible worlds by relativizing it to a time. The point is to show that some old possibilities are no longer possible. For example, a world in which Hillary Clinton becomes the first female U.S. president in 2016 was possible relative to the actual world of 2015, but not relative to the actual world of 2017. There are other complexities. Within a single world, if we are talking about a domain of people containing, say, Socrates, then we want the domain to vary with time since we want Socrates to exist at some times but not at others. Another complexity is that in any world, what event is simultaneous with what other event should be relativized to a reference frame.

Some temporal logics have a semantics that allows sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth-values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having just one of the three truth-values True, or False, or Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

For an introduction to temporal logics and their formal semantics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

17. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:

  1. What Are Instants, Moments, and Durations?
  2. What Is an Event?
  3. What Is a Reference Frame?
  4. What Is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What Is Spacetime?
  6. What Is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What Are Time’s Metric and Spacetime’s Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time Is Part of Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How Is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What Is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What Is Time Dilation?
  16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox (the Twin Paradox)?
  19. What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What Is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?
  24. What Is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What Is a Field?

b. What Else Science Requires of Time

What Else Science Requires of Time

c. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate systems, and Lorentz Transformations

Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)

18. References and Further Reading

  • Arthur, Richard T. (2014). Leibniz. Polity Press. Cambridge, U.K.
    • Comprehensive monograph on all things Leibniz, with a detailed examination of his views on time.
  • Barbour, Julian. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York, 1999.
    • A popular presentation of Barbour’s theory which implies that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. Time is emergent and not fundamental. He then offers an exotic explanation of how time emerges and why time seems to us to exist.
  • Barbour, Julian. The Nature of Time, arXiv:0903.3489, 2009.
    • An application of the above ideas of strong emergentism to classical physics.
  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. “Is Time an Illusion?”, Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
  • Callender, Craig. What Makes Time Special? Oxford University Press, 2017.
    • The entire book makes a case for how, if information gathering and utilizing systems like us are immersed in an environment with the physical laws that do hold, then we will create the manifest image of time that we do. Not written at an introductory level.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three “Entropy and Time’s Arrow” provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time’s arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of what happens in an interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of time goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. “Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time,” Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening “now.”
  • Carroll, Sean. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia 2012.
    • A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues. Emphasizes the arrow of time.
  • Carroll, Sean. The Big Picture. Dutton/Penguin Random House. New York. 2016.
    • A physicist surveys the cosmos’ past and future, including the evolution of life.
  • Carroll, Sean. Something Deeply Hidden: Quantum Worlds and the Emergence of Spacetime, Dutton/Penguin Random House. 2018.
    • Pages 287-289 explain how time emerges in a quantum universe governed by the Wheeler-DeWitt equation. The chapter “Breathing in Empty Space” explains why the limits of time (whether it is infinite or finite) depend on the total amount of energy in the universe.
  • Crowther, Karen. “When do We Stop Digging? Conditions on a Fundamental Theory of Physics,” in What is ‘Fundamental’?, edited by Anthony Aguirre, Brendan Foster, and Zeeya Merali, Springer International Publishing, 2019.
    • An exploration of what physicists do mean and should mean when they say a particular theory of physics is final or fundamental rather than more fundamental. She warns, “a theory formally being predictive to all high-energy scales, and thus apparently being the lowest brick in the tower [of theories] (or, at least, one of the bricks at the lowest level of the tower), is no guarantee that it is in fact a fundamental theory. …Yet, it is one constraint on a fundamental theory.” When we arrive at a fundamental theory, “the question shifts from ‘What if there’s something beyond?’ to ‘Why should we think there is something beyond?” That is, the burden of justification is transferred.”
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s claim to have discovered in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice. This claim has radical implications for the philosophical issue of free will.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy-to-read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity and other scientific advances on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers many of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Eagleman David. “Brain Time,” What’s Next? Dispatches on the Future of Science. Max Brockman, Ed., Penguin Random House. 2009.
    • A neuroscientist discusses the plasticity of time perception or temporal distortion.
  • Eagleman David. “David Eagleman on CHOICE,” Oct. 4, 2011. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=MkANniH8XZE.
    • Commentary on research on subjective time.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Fisher, A. R. J. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring 2015.
    • Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
  • Gibbs, W. Wayt. “Ultimate Clocks,” Scientific American 2002.
    • Pushing the art of building more accurate clocks.
  • Gödel, Kurt. “A Remark about the Relationship between Relativity Theory and Idealistic Philosophy,” in P. A. Schilpp, ed., Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, Harper & Row, New York. 1959.
    • Discussion of solutions to Einstein’s equations that allow closed causal chains, that is, traveling to your past.
  • Grant, Andrew. “Time’s Arrow,” Science News, July 25, 2015, pp. 15-18.
    • Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
  • Greene, Brian. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York. 2011.
    • Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Guth, Alan. “Infinite Phase Space and the Two-Headed Arrow of Time,” FQXi conference 2014 in Vieques, Puerto Rico. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=AmamlnbDX9I. 2014.
    • Guth argues that an arrow of time could evolve naturally even though it had no special initial conditions on entropy, provided the universe has an infinite available phase space that the universe could spread out into. If so, it’s maximum possible entropy is infinite, and any other state in which the universe begins will have relatively low entropy.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 14d of the present article) for truth-value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this special space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action. Horwich argues that time itself has no arrow.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousnss of Internal Time. Translated by J. B. Brough. Originally published 1893-1917. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
    • The father of phenomenology discusses internal time consciousness.
  • Ijjas, Anna and Paul J. Steinhardt and Abraham Loeb, “Pop Goes the Universe,” Scientific American, pp. 32-39, February 2017.
    • Challenges the theories of the multiverse, inflation, and the classical Big Bang Theory, and promotes the Big Bounce Theory as equally plausible to the Big Bang Theory.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Kirk, G.S. & Raven, J.E. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1957.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York, 2012.
    • Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss’ position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss’ hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
  • Lewis, David K. “The Paradoxes of Time Travel.” American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52, 1986.
    • A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Lowe, E. J., The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity and Time, Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • This Australian metaphysician defends the A-theory’s tensed view of time in chapter 4, based on an ontology of substances rather than events.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • Maudlin, Tim. Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time, Princeton University Press, 2012.
    • An advanced introduction to the conceptual foundations of spacetime theory.
  • McCall, Storrs. “II. Temporal Flux,” American Philosophical Quarterly, October 1966.
    • An analysis of the block universe, the flow of time, and the difference between past and future.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument for the inconsistency that a single event has only one of the properties of being past, present, or future, but that any event also has all three of these properties is called “McTaggart’s Paradox.” The chapter is renamed “The Unreality of Time,” and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (Le Poidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Merali, Zeeya. “Theoretical Physics: The Origins of Space and Time,” Nature, 28 August 2013, vol. 500, pp. 516-519.
    • Describes each of the six leading theories that compete for providing an explanation of the basic substratum from which space and time emerge.
  • Miller, Kristie. “Presentism, Eternalism, and the Growing Block,” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., pp. 345-364, 2013.
    • Compares the pros and cons of competing ontologies of time.
  • Morris, Michael S., Kip S. Thorne and Ulvi Yurtsever, “Wormholes, Time Machines, and the Weak Energy Condition,” Physical Review Letters, vol. 61, no. 13, 26 September 1988.
    • The first description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. “The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century,” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Muller, Richard A. NOW: The Physics of Time. W. W. Norton & Company, New York, 2016a.
    • An informal presentation of the nature of time by an experimental physicist at the University of California, Berkeley. Chapter 15 argues that the correlation between the arrow of time and the increase of entropy is not a causal connection. Chapter 16 discusses the competing arrows of time. Muller favors space expansion as the cause of time’s arrow, with entropy not being involved. And he recommends a big bang theory in which both space and time expand, not simply space. Because space and time are so intimately linked, he says, the expansion of space is propelling time forward, and this explains the “flow” of time. However, “the new nows [are] created at the end of time, rather than uniformly throughout time.” (p. 8)
  • Muller, Richard. “Now and the Flow of Time,” arXiv, https://arxiv.org/pdf/1606.07975.pdf, 2016b.
    • Argues that the flow of time consists of the continuous creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space.”
  • Nadis, Steve. “Starting Point,” Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
  • Norton, John. “Time Really Passes,” Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that “We don’t find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion.”
  • Novikov, Igor. The River of Time, Cambridge University Press. 1998.
    • Chapter 14 gives a very clear and elementary description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Perry, John. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical,” Noûs, 13 (1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot all be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that time in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses, in the sense of verb conjugations, but of course, it expresses all sorts of concepts about time in other ways.
  • Plato. Parmenides, trans. F. Macdonald Cornford in The Collected Dialogues of Plato, ed. E. Hamilton and H. Cairns. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. 1961.
    • Plato discusses time.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • Pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, that permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. “Time and Physical Geometry,” The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist. Putnam believes that the manifest image of time is refuted by relativity theory.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York, 2017.
    • An informal presentation of time in the theory of loop quantum gravity. Loop theory focuses on gravity; string theory is a theory of gravity plus all the forces and matter.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. The Order of Time. Riverhead Books, New York, 2018.
    • An informal discussion of the nature of time by an Italian theoretical physicist. The book was originally published in Italian in 2017. Page 70 contains the graph of the absolute elsewhere that was the model for the one in this article.
  • Russell, Bertrand. “On the Experience of Time,” Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, 1929, pp. 123-128.
    • Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
  • Saunders, Simon. “How Relativity Contradicts Presentism,” in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Savitt, Steven F. “Being and Becoming in Modern Physics.” In E. N. Zala (ed.). The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • In surveying being and becoming, it suggests how the presentist and grow-past ontologies might respond to criticisms that appeal to relativity theory.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sider, Ted. Four-Dimensionalism: An Ontology of Persistence. Oxford University Press, New York, 2001.
    • Defends the ontological primacy of four-dimensional events over three-dimensional objects. He freely adopts causation as a means of explaining how a sequence of temporal parts composes a single perduring object. This feature of the causal theory of time originated with Hans Reichenbach.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivalism fails.
  • Slater, Hartley. “Logic is Not Mathematical,” Polish Journal of Philosophy, Spring 2012, pp. 69-86.
    • Discusses, among other things, why modern symbolic logic fails to give a proper treatment of indexicality.
  • Smith, Quentin. “Problems with the New Tenseless Theories of Time,” pp. 38-56 in Oaklander, L. Nathan and Smith, Quentin (eds.), The New Theory of Time, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1994.
    • Challenges the new B-theory of time promoted by Mellor and Smith.
  • Smolin, Lee. Time Reborn. Houghton, Mifflin, Harcourt Publishing Company, New York, 2013.
    • An extented argument by a leading theoretical physicist for why time is real. Smolin is a presentist. He believes the general theory of relativity is mistaken about the relativity of simultaneity; he believes every black hole is the seed of a new universe; and he believes nothing exists outside of time.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. “The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?” Scientific American, April 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. Metaphysics, Fourth Edition. Westview Press, 2015.
    • An introduction to metaphysics by a distinguished advocate of the A-theory of time.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Wasserman, Ryan. Paradoxes of Time Travel, Oxford University Press, 2018.
    • A detailed review of much of the philosophical literature about time travel. The book contains many simple, helpful diagrams.
  • Whitrow, G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.