clock2Time is what clocks are used to measure. Information about time tells the durations of events and when they occur and which events happen before which others, so time plays a very significant role in the universe’s structure, including the structure of our personal lives. But the attempt to carefully describe time’s properties has led to many unresolved issues, both philosophical and scientific.

Consider this issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing philosophical theories. Presentism implies that necessarily only present objects and present events are real, and we conscious beings can recognize this in the special vividness of our present experiences compared to our relatively dim memories of past experiences and dim expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality even though our current ideas of them have not. However, the growing-past theory implies the past and present are both real, but the future is not, because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our future death is not. The third theory, eternalism, is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective, such as depending upon whose present we are talking about.

In no particular order, here is a list of other issues about time that are discussed in this article:

•Whether there was a moment without an earlier one.
•Whether time exists when nothing is changing.
•What kinds of time travel are possible.
•Whether time has an arrow.
•How time is represented in the mind.
•Whether time itself passes or flows.
•How to distinguish an accurate clock from an inaccurate one.
•Whether what happens in the present is the same for everyone.
•Which features of our ordinary sense of the word time are, or should be, captured by the concept of time in physics.
•Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth-values now.
•Whether tensed facts or tenseless facts are ontologically fundamental.
•The proper formalism or logic for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning.
•Whether an instant can have a zero duration and also a very next instant.
•What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time.
•Whether time is objective or subjective.
•Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.
•Whether time is an illusion or merely a mathematical construct.
•Which specific aspects of time are conventional.
•How to settle the disputes between proponents of McTaggart’s A-theory and B-theory of time.

This article does not explore how time is treated within different cultures and languages, nor how persons can more efficiently manage their time, nor what entities are timeless.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Physical Time, Psychological Time, and Biological Time
  3. What is Time?
  4. Why There Is Time Instead of No Time
  5. The Scientific Image of Time
  6. Time and Change (Relationism vs. Substantivalism)
    1. History of the Debate from Aristotle to Kant
    2. History of the Debate after Kant
  7. Is There a Beginning or End to Time?
    1. The Beginning
    2. The End
    3. Historical Answers
  8. Emergence of Time
  9. Convention
  10. Arguments That Time Is Not Real
  11. Time Travel
    1. To the Future
    2. To the Past
  12. McTaggart’s A-Theory and B-Theory
  13. The Passage or Flow of Time
  14. The Past, Present, and Future
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. The Present
    3. Persistence, Four-Dimensionalism, and Temporal Parts
    4. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences
    5. Essentially-Tensed Facts
  15. The Arrow of Time
  16. Temporal Logic
  17. Time, Mind, and Experience
  18. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions about Time
    2. What Else Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  19. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Philosophers of time want to build a robust and defensible philosophical theory of time, one that resolves all the issues on the list of philosophical issues mentioned in the opening summary, or at least they want to provide a mutually consistent set of proposed answers to them that is supported by the majority of experts on the issues.

In doing this, one philosophical goal is to properly analyze the complicated relationship between the commonsense image of time and the scientific image of time. This is the relationship between beliefs about time held by ordinary speakers of our language and beliefs about time as understood through the lens of contemporary science, particularly physics. Our fundamental theories of physics are the general theory of relativity and quantum field theory. They are precise and quantitative.

When describing time, the commonsense image is expressed with non-technical terms such as now, flow, and past and not with technical scientific terms such as continuum, reference frame, and quantum entanglement. The scientific image uses underlying mechanisms such as atoms, fields, and other structures that are not observable to us without scientific instruments. The Greek philosopher Anaxagoras showed foresight when he said, “Phenomena are a sight of the unseen.” What he might say today is that, “There is so much more to the world than we were evolved to see” (Frank Wilczek).

The manifest image or folk image is the understanding of the world as it appears to us using common sense untutored by advances in contemporary science. It does not qualify as a theory in the technical sense of that term but is more an assortment of tacit beliefs. The concept is vague, and there is no good reason to believe that there is a single shared folk concept. Maybe different cultures have different concepts of time. Despite the variability here, a reasonable way to make the concept a little more precise is to say it contains all the following beliefs about time [some of which are declared to be false according to the scientific image]: (1) The universe has existed for longer than five minutes. (2) We all experience time via experiencing change. (3) The future must be different from the past.  (4) Time exists in all places. (5) You can change the direction you are going in space but not in time. (6) Every event has a duration, and, like length of an object and distance between places, duration is never negative.  (7) Every event occurs at some time or other. (8) The past is fixed, but the future is open. (9) A nearby present event cannot directly influence a distant present event. (10) Time has an intrinsic arrow. (11) Time has nothing to do with space. (12) Given any two events, they have some objective order such as one happening before the other, or else their being simultaneous. (13) Time passes; it flows like a river, and we directly experience this flow. (14) There is a present that is objective, that every living person shares, and that divides everyone’s past from their future. (15) Time is independent of the presence or absence of physical objects and what they are doing.

Only items 1 through 8 of the 15 have clearly survived the impact of modern science. Item 9 fails because of quantum entanglement. Item 12 fails because of the relativity of simultaneity in the theory of relativity. Item 15 fails because of relativistic time dilation; you could become twice as old as your twin brother if your brother goes on a high-speed adventure. Also, the scientific image has taken some of the everyday terms of the manifest image and given them more precise definitions.

The scientific image and the manifest image are not images of different worlds. They are images of the same reality. Both images have evolved over the years. The evolution has often been abrupt; think of the abrupt impact of the Copernican Revolution and the Darwinian Revolution. Regarding time, the most significant impact on its scientific image was the acceptance of the theory of relativity. Unlike with the theory of relativity, almost all the implications about time from quantum field theory are still in dispute. However, time is never quantized in quantum theory. See (Callender 2017) for a detailed description and discussion of the controversies between the manifest image and the scientific image.

A popular methodology used by some metaphysicians is to start with a feature of the manifest image and then change it only if there are good reasons to do so. Unfortunately, there is no consensus among philosophers of time about what counts as a good reason, although there is much more consensus among physicists. Does conflict with relativity theory count as a good reason? Yes, say physicists, but Husserl’s classic 1936 work on phenomenology, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, criticized the scientific image because of its acceptance of so many of the implications of relativity theory, and in this spirit A. N. Prior said that the theory of relativity is for this reason not about real time.

Ever since the downfall of the Logical Positivists‘ program of requiring all meaningful, non-tautological statements to be reducible to commonsense statements about what is given in our sense experiences (via seeing, hearing, feeling, and so forth), few philosophers of science would advocate any reduction or direct translation of statements expressed in the manifest image to statements expressed in the scientific image, or vice versa, but the proper relationship between the two is an open question.

With the rise of the importance of scientific realism in both metaphysics and the philosophy of science in the latter part of the twentieth century, many philosophers would summarize the relationship between the two images by saying our direct experience of reality is real but overrated. They suggest that defenders of the manifest image have been creative, but ultimately they have wasted their time in trying to revise and improve the manifest image to lesson its conflict with the scientific image. Regarding these attempts in support of the manifest image, the philosopher of physics Craig Callender made this sharp criticism:

These models of time are typically sophisticated products and shouldn’t be confused with manifest time. Instead they are models that adorn the time of physics with all manner of fancy temporal dress: primitive flows, tensed presents, transient presents, ersatz presents, Meinongian times, existent presents, priority presents, thick and skipping presents, moving spotlights, becoming, and at least half a dozen different types of branching! What unites this otherwise motley class is that each model has features that allegedly vindicate core aspects of manifest time. However, these tricked out times have not met with much success (Callender 2017, p. 29).

In some very loose and coarse-grained sense, manifest time might be called an illusion without any harm done. However, for many of its aspects, it’s a bit like calling our impression of a shape an illusion, and that seems wrong (Callender 2017, p. 310).

Some issues listed in the opening summary are intimately related to others, so it is reasonable to expect a resolution of one to have deep implications for another. For example, there is an important subset of related philosophical issues about time that cause many philosophers of time to divide into two broad camps, the A-camp and the B-camp, because the camps are on the opposite sides of so many controversial issues about time.

The next two paragraphs summarize the claims of the two camps. Later parts of this article provide more introduction to the philosophical controversy between the A and B camps, and they explain the technical terms that are about to be used. Briefly, the two camps can be distinguished by saying the members of the A-camp believe McTaggart’s A-theory is the fundamental way to understand time; and they accept a majority of the following claims: past events are always changing as they move farther into the past; this change is the only genuine, fundamental kind of change; the present or “now” is objectively real; so is time’s passage or flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory because the present is somehow metaphysically privileged compared to the future; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tensed facts are ontologically fundamental, not untensed facts; the ontologically fundamental objects are 3-dimensional, not 4-dimensional; and at least some A-predicates are not semantically reducible to B-predicates without significant loss of meaning. The word “fundamental” in these discussions is used either in the sense of “not derivable” or “not emergent.” It does not mean “most important.”

Members of the B-camp reject all or at least most of the claims of the A-camp. They believe McTaggart’s B-theory is the fundamental way to understand time; and they accept a majority of the following claims: events never undergo genuine change; the present or now is not objectively real and neither is time’s flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; untensed facts are more fundamental than tensed facts; the fundamental objects are 4-dimensional, not 3-dimensional; and A-predicates are reducible to B-predicates, or at least the truth conditions of sentences using A-predicates can be adequately explained in terms of the truth conditions of sentences using only B-predicates. Many B-theorists claim that they do not deny the reality of the human experiences that A-theorists appeal to, but rather they believe those experiences can be best explained from the perspective of the B-theory.

To what extent is time understood? This is a difficult question, not simply because the word understood is notoriously vague. There have been a great many advances in understanding time over the last two thousand years, especially over the last 125 years, as this article explains, so we can definitively say time is better understood than it was—clear evidence that philosophy makes progress. Nevertheless, in order to say time is understood, there remain too many other questions whose answers are not agreed upon by the experts. Can we at least say only the relatively less important questions are left unanswered? No, not even that. So, this is the state of understanding time at the end of the first quarter of the twenty-first century. It is certainly less than a reader might wish to have. Still, it is remarkable how much we do know about time that we once did not; and it is remarkable that we can be so clear about what it is that we do not know; and there is no good argument for why this still sought-after knowledge is beyond the reach of the human mind.

2. Physical Time, Biological Time, and Psychological Time

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time is indicated by regular, periodic biological processes, and by signs of aging. The ticks of a human being’s biological clock are produced by heartbeats, the rhythm of breathing, cycles of sleeping and waking, and periodic menstruation, although there is no conscious counting of the cycles as in an ordinary clock. Biological time is not another kind of time, but rather is best understood as the body’s recording of physical time, in the sense that biological time is physical time measured with a biological process.

Psychological time is private time; it is also called subjective time and phenomenological time. Our psychological time can change its rate, compared to physical time, depending on whether we are bored or instead intensively involved. Although the point has been disputed in the philosophical literature, and it still is, the position advocated by most philosophers is that psychological time is best understood not as a kind of time but rather as awareness of physical time. Psychological time is what people usually are thinking of when they ask whether time is just a construct of the mind. But not always, such as when a philosopher asks whether the spacetime of Einstein’s theory of relativity is only a projection of our brain’s neural processes.

There is no experimental evidence that the character of physical time is affected in any way by the presence or absence of mental awareness, or by the presence or absence of any biological phenomenon. For that reason, physical time is often called objective time and scientific time. The scientific image of time is the product of science’s attempt to understand physical time.

When a physicist defines speed to be distance traveled divided by the duration of the travel (or, more accurately, the rate of change of position with respect to time), the term time in that definition refers to physical time. Physical time is more helpful than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world; but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences, as is biological time for understanding biological phenomena.

Psychological time and biological time are explored in more detail in Section 17.

3. What is Time?

It may not be what it seems. Clocks can tell you what time it is, but they cannot tell you what time is.  “Time is succession,” Henri Bergson declared, but that remark is frustratingly vague.

There is disagreement among philosophers of time as to what metaphysical structure is essential to time. Two historically important, competing recommendations, among others, are that time is a one-dimensional structure of ordered instants satisfying McTaggart’s A-series, or the same structure but satisfying his B-series. Think of an instant as a snapshot of the universe at a time.  More will be said about these two series later in this article.

Maybe we can decide what time  is by considering what our world would be like if it did not contain time. Where do we proceed from here, though? We cannot turn off time and look at the result. Our imagining the world without time is not likely to be a reliable guide.

Information about time tells the durations of events, and when they occur, and which events happen before which others, so any definition of time or theory of time should allow for this. According to relativity theory and quantum mechanics, time provides a linear ordering of events, namely the points of spacetime, by the asymmetric relation of before-and-after-or-else-simultaneous-with, but there seems to be more to time than this. Time seems to be necessary for grounding causation, persistence, and change.

Here are some considerations. Can time be specified more precisely? Is it helpful to distinguish what time is from what it does? Should we be aiming to say time is what meets certain necessary and sufficient criteria, or should we aim for a more detailed and sophisticated philosophical theory about time, or should we say time is whatever plays this or that functional role such as accounting for our temporal phenomenology? Baron and Miller have argued that, if a demon plays the functional role of providing us with our temporal phenomenology, then we would not agree that time is a demon, so more constraints need to be placed on any functionalist account of time.

Many physicists have said time is whatever satisfies the requirements on the time variable in the fundamental equations of physics. In reaction to this last claim, its opponents among philosophers of physics usually complain of scientism. Other researchers say time is what best satisfies our many intuitions about time in our manifest image, or it is whatever functions to ground our temporal phenomenology. Their opponents usually complain here of overemphasis on subjective features of time and of insensitivity to scientific advances.

Sometimes, when we ask what time is, we are asking for the meaning of the noun “time.” It is the most frequently used noun in the English language. A first step in that direction might be to clarify the difference between its meaning and its reference.  The term time has several meanings. It can mean the duration between events, as when we say the trip from home to the supermarket took too much time because of all the traffic. It can mean, instead, the temporal location of an event, as when we say he arrived at the time they specified. It also can mean the temporal structure of the universe, as when we speak of investigating time rather than space. This article uses the word in all these senses.

Ordinary Language philosophers have carefully studied talk about time. This is what Ludwig Wittgenstein called the language game of discourse about time. Wittgenstein said in 1953, “For a large class of cases—though not for all—in which we employ the word ‘meaning’ it can be defined this way: the meaning of a word is its use in the language.” Perhaps an examination of all the uses of the word time would lead us to the meaning of the word. Someone, following the lead of Wittgenstein, might also say we would then be able to dissolve rather than answer most of our philosophical questions about time. That methodology of dissolving a problem was promoted by Wittgenstein in response to many other philosophical questions.

However, most philosophers of time in the twenty-first century are not interested in dissolving the problems about time nor in precisely defining the word time. They are interested in what time’s important characteristics are and in resolving philosophical disputes about time that do not seem to turn on what the word means. When Isaac Newton discovered that both the fall of an apple and the circular orbit of the Moon were caused by gravity, this was not primarily a discovery about the meaning of the word gravity, but rather about what gravity is. Do we not want some advances like this for time?

To emphasize this idea, notice that a metaphysician who asks, “What is a ghost?” already knows the meaning in ordinary language of the word ghost, and does not usually want a precise definition of ghost but rather wants to know what ghosts are and where to find them and how to find them; and they want a more-detailed theory of ghosts. This theory ideally would provide the following things: a consistent characterization of the most important features of ghosts, a claim regarding whether they do or do not exist and how they might be reliably detected if they do exist, what principles or laws describe their behavior, how they typically act, and what they are composed of. This article takes a similar approach to the question, “What is time?” The goal is to discover the best concept of time to use in understanding the world and to develop a philosophical theory of time that addresses what science has discovered about time plus what should be said about the many philosophical issues that practicing scientists usually do not concern themselves with.

There is much to learn about time from scientific theories, from certain special ones, the so-called fundamental ones. The exploration in sections ahead adopts a realist perspective on these scientific theories. That is, it interprets them usually to mean what they say, even in their highly theoretical aspects, while appreciating that there are such things as mathematical artifacts. The perspective does not take a fictionalist perspective on scientific theories, nor treat them as merely useful instruments, nor treat them operationally. It assumes that, in building a scientific theory, the goal is to achieve truth even though most theories achieve this goal only approximately; but what makes them approximately true is not their corresponding to some mysterious entity called approximate truth. Many of these assumptions have occasionally been challenged in the philosophical literature, and if one of the challenges is correct, then some of what is said below will require reinterpretation or rephrasing.

Everyone agrees that time has something to do with change and that clocks are designed to measure time. This article’s supplement of “Frequently Asked Questions” discusses what a clock is, and what it is for a clock to be accurate as opposed to precise, and why we trust some clocks more than others. Saying physical time is what clocks measure, which is how this article began, is a remark about clocks and not a definition of time. But is not as trivial as it might seem since it is a deep truth about our physical universe that it is capable of having clocks. We are lucky to live in a universe with so many different kinds of regular, periodic processes that tick in only one direction and never tick backwards and that humans can use for measuring time. However, some philosophers of physics claim that there is nothing more to time than whatever numbers are displayed on our clocks. The vast majority of philosophers of physics disagree with that claim. They say time is more than those numbers; it is what we intend to measure with those numbers. In the anti-realist spirit of those who do say there is nothing more to time than whatever numbers are displayed by our clocks, the distinguished philosopher of science Henri Poincaré said in 1912, “The properties of time are…merely those of our clocks just as the properties of space are merely those of the measuring instruments.”

What then is time really? This is still an open question. Let’s consider how this question has been answered in different ways throughout the centuries. Here we are interested in very short answers that give what the proponent considers to be the key idea about what time is.

Aristotle proposed what has come to be called the relational theory of time when he remarked, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). He clarified his remark by saying, “time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time…” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a leaf can fall faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12) of things, but he never said space is the measure of anything.

René Descartes, known for doubting many things, never doubted the existence of time. He answered the question, “What is time?” by claiming that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation (“Third Meditation” in Meditations on First Philosophy, published in 1641). Descartes’ worry is analogous to that of Buddhist logicians who say, “Something must explain how the separate elements of the process of becoming are holding together to produce the illusion of a stable material world.” The Buddhist answer was causality. Descartes would have answered that it is God’s actions.

In the late 17th century, Gottfried Leibniz, who is also a relationist as was Aristotle, said time is a series of moments, and each moment is a set of co-existing events in a network of relations of earlier-than and simultaneous-with. Isaac Newton, a contemporary of Leibniz, argued instead that time is independent of events. He claimed time is absolute in the sense that “true…time, in and of itself and of its own nature, without reference to anything external, flows uniformly…” (1687). This difference about time is also reflected in their disagreement about space. Newton thought of space as a thing, while Leibniz disagreed and said it is not a thing but only a relationship among the other things.

Both Newton and Leibniz presumed that time is the same for all of us in the sense that how long an event lasts is the same for everyone, no matter what they are doing. This presumption would eventually be challenged by Albert Einstein in the early 20th century.

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant made some very influential remarks that suggested he believed time and space themselves are forms that the mind projects upon the things-in-themselves that are external to the mind. In the twenty-first century, this is believed to be a misinterpretation of Kant’s intentions, even though he did say things that would lead to this false interpretation. What he actually believed was that our representations of space and time and not space and time themselves have this character. So, Kant’s remarks that time is “the form of inner sense” and that time “is an a priori condition of all appearance whatsoever” are probably best understood as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only have the ability to experience individual things and events within time. The “we” here is human beings; Kant left open the possibility that the minds of non-humans perceive differently than we humans do. Also, he left open the possibility that the world-in-itself, that is, the world as it is independently of being perceived, may or may not be temporal. The much more popular theory of mind in the 21st century implies conscious beings have unmediated access to the world; we can experience the external world and not merely internal representations of that world.

Ever since Newton’s theory of mechanics in the 17th century, time has been taken to be a theoretical entity, a theory-laden entity, in the sense that we can tell much about time’s key features by looking at the role it plays in our confirmed, fundamental theories. One of those is the theory of relativity that was created in the early 20th century. According to relativity theory, time is not fundamental, but is a necessary feature of spacetime, which itself is fundamental. Spacetime is all the actual events in the past, present, and future. In 1908, Hermann Minkowski argued that the proper way to understand relativity theory is to say time is really a non-spatial dimension of spacetime, and time has no existence independent of space. Einstein agreed. The most philosophically interesting feature of the relationship between time and space, according to relativity theory, is that which part of spacetime is space and which part is time are relative to a chosen frame of reference.

In the early 20th century, the philosophers Alfred North Whitehead and Martin Heidegger said time is essentially the form of becoming. This is an idea that excited a great many philosophers, but not many scientists, because the remark seems to give ontological priority to the manifest image of time over the scientific image.

In the 21st century, Stephen Wolfram speculated that perhaps any physical process is a natural computation, time is the inexorable progress of computation, and this progress is what other scientists have been calling “evolving according to the laws of nature.” Wolfram has said Einstein’s unification of space and time into spacetime was a mistake. One of Wolfram’s many critics, the philosopher of physics Tim Maudlin, reacted by remarking, “the physics determines the computational structure, not the other way around.”

Whatever time is, one should consider whether time has causal powers. The musician Hector Berlioz said, “Time is a great teacher, but unfortunately it kills all its pupils.” Everyone knows not to take this joke literally because, when you are asleep and then your alarm clock rings at 7:00, it is not the time itself that wakes you. Nevertheless, there are more serious reasons to believe that time has causal powers. Drawing a conclusion from relativity theory, Princeton physicist John Wheeler said, “Spacetime tells matter how to move and matter tells spacetime how to curve.” There is a scientific consensus on this point that the general theory of relativity implies space and time are dynamic actors, not a passive stage where events occur.

Relativity theory implies time is continuous and fundamental. But a large and growing number of experts in 21st century foundations of physics believe time is not continuous and not fundamental. Soon after the general acceptance of the theory of relativity in the early 20th century, most experts started believing time is a continuum with the same structure as a mathematical line. In the late 1920s, the new theory of quantum mechanics also presupposed this. If time is a continuum, then duration is a continuous magnitude and for any duration there is a shorter duration. Along with this it was believed that space and spacetime are also continua. However, in 1916 Albert Einstein had written privately that, even though he assumed space is a continuum in his theory of relativity, in the end it would turn out that space is discrete. Presumably he believed the same for time, but there is no more information in the historical record. Two giants of early twentieth century quantum mechanics, Werner Heisenberg and Niels Bohr, also did not personally believe in a temporal and spatial continuum; but they did not promote the idea because they could not reconcile their models of it with quantum mechanics. So, for the rest of the twentieth century it was accepted by nearly all experts that spacetime is a continuum, and textbooks promoted it to subsequent generations. Yet by the first quarter of the 21st century, many experts began to suspect that both space and time are not continuous at the fundamental level.

There is also rising suspicion that time is not fundamental and that time is real but only emerges as the scale increases in analogy to how the reality of temperature emerges at higher scales without there being temperature at the smallest scales. These physicists claim that for shorter and shorter durations below the Planck time scale of 10-44 seconds, the notions of time and spacetime are less applicable to reality. That is why they say that, “the whole idea of time is just an approximation.” Human beings need to use the concept of time as the scale increases, but Laplace’s Demon does not. The Demon has no limits on its computational capabilities and needs no simple models or coarse graining or approximations.

Later sections of this article, including the supplement “What Else Science Requires of Time,” introduce other speculations about how to answer the question, “What is time?”

4. Why There Is Time Instead of No Time

The fundamental theories of physical science that have ontological implications—namely the general theory of relativity and quantum field theory—imply that time exists. They imply it exists at least relative to a selected reference frame. However, those two theories have nothing to say about why time exists. More can be said, though.

Among physicists and philosophers of physics, there is no agreed-upon answer to why our universe contains time instead of no time, why it contains dynamical physical laws describing change over time, whether today’s physical laws will hold tomorrow, why the universe contains the fundamental laws that it does contain, or why there is a universe instead of no universe, although there have been interesting speculations on all these issues. For instance, perhaps there is something rather than nothing because throughout all time there has always been something and there is no good reason to believe it should or could transition to nothing or could have transitioned into being from nothing. The cosmologist Lawrence Krauss remarked that “Quantum mechanics blurs the distinction between something and nothing” because the vacuum according to quantum mechanics always contains fields and particles even at the lowest possible energy level.

There is little support for the claim that any of these unsolved problems are intractable, something too difficult for the human mind, in analogy to how even the most clever fish will never learn the chemistry of water.

Here is one not-too-serious linguistic explanation for why time exists; without time there would be no verbs. An interesting theological explanation for why time exists is that God wanted the world to be that way. Here is an anthropic explanation. If time were not to exist, we would not now be asking why it does. Here is an intriguing non-theological and non-anthropic explanation. When steam cools, eventually it suddenly reaches a tipping point and undergoes a phase transition into liquid water. Many cosmologists suspect that the universe should contain laws implying that, as the universe cools, a phase transition occurs during which four-dimensional space emerges from infinite-dimensional space; then, after more cooling, another phase transition occurs during which one of the four dimensions of primeval space collapses to become a time dimension. The previous sentence is a bit misleading because of its grammar which might suggest that something was happening before time began, but that is a problem with the English language, not with the suggestion about the origin of time.

There is a multiverse answer to our question, “Why does time exist?” The reason why our universe exists with time instead of no time is that nearly every kind of universe exists throughout the inflationary  multiverse; there are universes with time and universes without time. Like all universes in the multiverse, our particular universe with time came into existence by means of a random selection process without a conscious selector, a process in which every physically possible universe is overwhelmingly likely to arise as an actual universe, in analogy to how continual re-shuffling a deck of cards makes it overwhelmingly likely that any specific ordering of the cards will eventually appear. Opponents complain that this multiverse explanation is shallow. To again use the metaphor of a card game, they wish to know why their poker opponent had four aces in that last hand, and they are not satisfied with the shallow explanation that four aces are inevitable with enough deals or that it is just a random result. Nevertheless, perhaps there is no better explanation.

5. The Scientific Image of Time

Time has been studied for 2,500 years, but only in the early twentieth-century did time become one of the principal topics in professional journals of physics, and soon after in the journals of philosophy of science. The primary reason for this was the creation of the theory of relativity.

Any scientific theory can have its own implications about the nature of time, and time has been treated differently in different scientific theories over the centuries. When this article speaks of the scientific image of time or what science requires of time it means time of the latest, accepted theories that are fundamental in physics and so do not depend upon other theories. For example, Einstein’s theory of relativity is fundamental, but Newton’s theory of mechanics is not, nor is Newton’s theory of gravitation or Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism. Newton’s concept of time is useful only for applications where the speed is slow, where there are no extreme changes of gravitational forces, and where durations are very large compared to the Planck time because, under these conditions, Newton’s theory agrees with Einstein’s. For example, Newton’s two theories are all that were needed to specify the trajectory of the first spaceship that landed safely on the Moon.

When scientists use the concept of time in their theories, they adopt positions that metaphysicians call metaphysical. They suppose there is a mind-independent universe in which we all live and to which their fundamental theories apply. Physical scientists tend to be what metaphysicians call empiricists. They also usually are physicalists, and they would agree with the spirit of W.V.O. Quine’s remark that, “Nothing happens in the world … without some redistribution of microphysical states.” This physicalist position can be re-expressed as the thesis that all the facts about any subject matter such as geophysics or farming are fixed by the totality of microphysical facts about the universe. Philosophers sometimes express this claim by saying all facts supervene on microphysical facts. Philosophers and some scientists are especially interested in whether the human mind might be a special counterexample to this physicalist claim. So far, however, no scientific experiments or observations have shown clearly that the answer to the metaphysical question, “Does mind supervene upon matter?” is negative. Nor do scientific observations ever seem to need us to control for what the observer is thinking.

In the manifest image, the universe is fundamentally made of objects rather than events. In the scientific image, the universe is fundamentally made of events rather than objects. Physicists use the term “event” in two ways, and usually only the context suggests which sense is intended. In sense 1, something happens at a place for a certain amount of time. In sense 2, an event is simply a point location in space and time. Sense 2 is what Albert Einstein had in mind when he said the world of events forms a four-dimensional continuum in which time and space are not completely separate entities. In either of these two senses, it is assumed in fundamental scientific theories that longer events are composed of shorter events which in turn are composed of instantaneous events. The presumption of there being instantaneous events is controversial. That presupposition upset Alfred North Whitehead who said: “There is no nature apart from transition, and there is no transition apart from temporal duration. This is why an instant of time, conceived as a primary simple fact, is nonsense” (Whitehead 1938, p. 207).

Frames of reference are perspectives on the space or the spacetime we are interested in. A coordinate system is what the analyst places on a reference frame to help specify locations quantitatively. A coordinate system placed on a  reference frame of spacetime normally assigns numbers as names of temporal point-locations (called point-times) and spatial locations (point-places). The best numbers to assign are real numbers (a.k.a. decimals), in order to allow for the applicability of calculus.  A duration of only a billionth of a second still contains a great many point-times, a nondenumerable infinity of them. Relativity theory implies there are an infinite number of legitimate, different reference frames and coordinate systems. No one of them is distinguished or absolute in Isaac Newton’s sense of specifying what time it “really” is, and where you “really” are, independently of all other objects and events. Coordinate systems are not objective features of the world. They vary in human choices made about the location of their origins, their scales, the orientation of their coordinate axes, and whether the coordinate system specifies locations by things other than axes, such as the angle between two axes. In relativity theory, reference frames are often called “observers,” but there is no requirement that conscious beings be involved.

The fundamental theories of physics having ontological implications are the general theory of relativity and quantum field theory—that includes the standard model of particle physics but not the big bang theory and not statistical physics. The two are often called collectively the Core Theory. The Core Theory is discussed in more detail in a companion article. For scientists, it provides our civilization’s best idea of what is fundamentally real.

The theory of relativity is well understood philosophically, but quantum theory is not, although the mathematical implications of these theories are well understood by mathematicians and physicists. These theories are not merely informed guesses. Each is a confirmed set of precise, teleology-free laws. The theories have survived a great many tests and observations, so the scientific community trusts their implications in cases in which they do not conflict with each other, and the theories have many implications about the nature of time. One is that time is like space in some ways but not others.

Here is the scientific image of time presented as a numbered list of its most significant implications about time, with emphasis upon relativity theory and not quantum theory. The reason to avoid quantum theory is that there is considerable agreement among the experts that quantum theory has deep implications about the nature of time, but there is little agreement on what those implications are. For example, scientists do not agree on whether quantum theory implies that time splits or branches into parallel universes, each having its own time. The impact of quantum theory on our understanding of time is discussed in this Supplement.

(1) When you look at a distant object, you see it as it was some time ago, not as it is.

Because seeing requires light and because the speed of light is not infinite and because it takes time for the brain to process information that it receives from the eyes, the information you obtain by looking at an object is information about how it was, not how it is. The more distant the object, the more outdated is the information.

(2) The duration of the past is at least 13.8 billion years.

The big bang theory is well confirmed (though not as well as relativity theory), and it requires the past of the observable universe to extend back at least 13.8 billion years ago to when an explosion of space occurred, the so-called “big bang.” This number is found primarily from imagining the current expansion of the observable universe to be reversed in time, and noting that the galaxies were very close together about 13.8 billion years ago. It is assumed that gravity if the only significant phenomenon affecting this calculation. Because it is unknown whether anything happened before the big bang, it is better to think of the big bang, not as the beginning of time, but as the beginning of what we understand about our distant past. A large majority of cosmologists believe the big bang’s expansion is an expansion  of space but not of spacetime and thus not of time. By the way, when cosmologists speak of space expanding, this remark is about increasing distances among galaxies. The distance from New York City to London does not expand.

(3) Time is one-dimensional, like a line.

The scientist Joseph Priestly in 1765 first suggest time is like a one-dimensional line. The idea quickly caught on, and now time is represented as one-dimensional in all the fundamental theories of physics. Two-dimensional time has been studied by mathematical physicists, but no theories implying that time has more than one dimension in our actual universe have acquired a significant number of supporters. Such theories are difficult to make consistent with what else we know, and there is no motivation for doing so. Because of this one-dimensionality, time is represented in a coordinate system with a time line rather than a time area, and its geometry is simpler than that of space.

(4) Time connects all events.

Given any two events that ever have existed or ever will, one event happens before the other or else they happen simultaneously. No exceptions.

(5) Time travel is possible.

You can travel to the future—to meet your great, great grandchildren. Your travelling to someone else’s future has been experimentally well-confirmed many times. Travelling to your own future, though, does not make sense because you are always in your own present. There is no consensus among scientists regarding whether you might someday be able to travel into your own past, but the majority are doubtful.

(6) Time is relative.

According to relativity theory, the amount of time an event lasts (the event’s duration) is relative to someone’s choice of a reference frame or coordinate system or vantage point. How long you slept last night is very different depending on whether it is measured by a clock next to you or by a clock in a spaceship circling the solar system at close to the speed of light. If no reference frame has been pre-selected, then it is a violation of relativity theory to say one of those two durations is correct and the other is incorrect.  Newton would have said both durations cannot be correct, but regarding this feature of Newton’s classical physics, Einstein and Infeld said, “In classical physics it was always assumed that clocks in motion and at rest have the same rhythm…[but] if the relativity theory is valid, then we must sacrifice this assumption. It is difficult to get rid of deep-rooted prejudices, but there is no other way.”

Because duration is relative, the conclusion is drawn that:

(7) Time is not an objectively real feature of the universe.

According to relativity theory, space-time is objectively real and fundamental, but the main reason for believing time is not objectively real is that it is not independent of space. A second reason is that you can change the duration of anything that happened in the past just by changing your reference frame (coordinate system). Scientists assume that what is objectively real must not be dependent upon someone’s choice of reference frame. To some philosophers this implication casts doubt upon either the theory of relativity itself or the importance that scientists ascribe to frame-independence.

(8) Simultaneity is relative. Two observers who move relative to each other cannot agree on which events occur simultaneously. 

According to relativity theory, if the two observers move toward or away from each other or experience different gravitational forces, then many pairs of events will be simultaneous for one observer and not simultaneous for the other observer. Relativity theory implies there is no uniquely correct answer to the question, for some distant place, “What is happening now at that place?” The answer depends on what observer is answering the question, namely what reference frame is being assumed. Nevertheless, at least in cosmology there is an obvious, standard reference frame that every cosmologist chooses, the frame in which the galaxies have the least mutual motion. For ordinary discussions about events on Earth, a reference frame is customarily used in which the Earth is not moving. And since we all move at slow speeds relative to each other and don’t experience very different gravitational forces and don’t consider very distant phenomena, we can agree for practical purposes on Earth about what is simultaneous with what.

(9) Within a single reference frame, coordinate time “fixes” (i) when each event occurs, (ii) what any event’s duration is, (iii) what other events occur simultaneously with it, and (iv) the time-order of any two events.

Coordinate time is time measured along the time dimension in a chosen coordinate system.

(10) Speeding clocks run slower. 

According to relativity theory, a speeding clock always runs slower compared to a stationary clock. The speeding clock’s ticking is said to be “stretched” or “dilated” compared to that of the stationary clock. (An assumption here is that correct clocks are always protected from physical damage.) Click to view a picture of time dilation. The picture represents the ticking of two clocks that are initially synchronized after which they move rapidly away from each other, then rapidly back toward each other. This dilation works for all physical processes, not just clocks. So, if you wish to age slower, then walk faster.

(11) Time slows when the gravitational force increases. 

This somewhat misleading remark (because time has no rate of flow) is meant to imply that initially synchronized clocks will get out of synch if they are affected differently by gravity. The greater the gravitational force, the slower the ticking. This holds for all processes, not just the ticking of clocks. You will live longer on the first floor than on the ten floor of your apartment building; on the first floor the gravitational force on you is greater. This is a second kind of time dilation called gravitational time dilation. The clock in a satellite orbiting Earth disagrees with the standard clock back on Earth by slowing down due to its speed while speeding up due to its being less affected by Earth’s gravity. These two time dilation effects cancel out when the satellite is about 2,000 miles above Earth.

(12) There is no such thing as right now when you are far away.

The only reason that there is such a thing as THE correct time for a distant event is that we accept the convention of trusting reports from just one clock, our standard clock or master clock. By convention, our standard clock reports what time it is at the Greenwich Observatory in London, England. But relativity theory allows other conventions which allows a single distant event to occur at range of times.

(13) You have enough time left in your life to visit the far side of the galaxy and return.

One philosophically interesting implication of time dilation in relativity theory is that in your lifetime, without using cryogenics, you have enough time to visit the far side of our Milky Way galaxy 100,000 light years away from Earth and then return to report on your adventure to your descendants many generations from now. As your spaceship approaches the speed of light, you can cross the galaxy in hardly any time at all, even though someone using the coordinate time of the standard Earth-based clock must judge that it took you over 100,000 years to cross the galaxy one-way. Both time judgments would be correct. The faster you move the more time you have to visit new places because the distance of travel shrinks, too. You cannot reach the cosmic speed limit of traveling at light speed, but the closer you get to that speed the closer you get to experiencing no time at all (as measured by stationary clocks).

(14) Time can warp or curve.

When time warps, clocks do not bend in space as if in a Salvador Dali painting. Instead, they undergo gravitational time dilation. According to general relativity, gravity is the curvature of four-dimensional spacetime even though there is no fifth dimension for it to curve into. This 4D curvature of spacetime is observed by detecting time dilation and space contraction. Choosing to say “three-dimensional space curves” expands the ordinary meaning of the word “curve,” and saying “spacetime curves” expands it even more because the word “curve” normally indicates a change of spatial direction, as when the hiking path curves to the right or the shape of an apple is curved and not flat.

Special relativity allows curvature only in its ordinary sense, and it does not allow curvature of either time or space or spacetime. According to general relativity though, they all can curve. Gauss, Lobachevsky and Bolyai first suggested (independently of each other) that physical space could curve, and Einstein first suggested that spacetime could curve. Einstein’s general theory of relativity implies space-time can warp, stretch, and ripple like a chunk of jelly or a soft piece of rubber. Does time curve? Yes, but it is more common for physicists to say time warps or stretches.

(15) All the fundamental laws are invariant under time-translation.

This means the fundamental laws of nature do not depend on what time it is, and they do not change as time goes by. Your health might change as time goes by, but the basic laws underlying your health that held last year are the same as those that hold today. This translation symmetry property of time is called its homogeneity. It expresses the equivalence of all instants. This feature of time can be expressed using the language of coordinate systems by saying that replacing the time variable t everywhere in a fundamental law by t + 4 does not change what processes are allowed by the law. The choice of “4” was an arbitrary choice of a real number. Requiring the laws of physics to be time-translation symmetric was proposed by Isaac Newton. Physicists do not know a priori that laws must have this symmetry, but the assumption fits all the known evidence so far.

One reason the principle of time-translation symmetry is not analytically true is that a remarkable theorem by Emmy Noether in 1915 established that time-translation symmetry implies the principle of conservation of energy, but that principle is considered to be empirical and not analytic.

(16) The fundamental physical laws are invariant under time-reversal.

This point about time-reversal symmetry can be expressed informally by saying that if you make a documentary film and show it in reverse, what you see may look very surprising or even impossible, but actually nothing shown violates a fundamental physical law. It may violate the second law of thermodynamics, but that law is not fundamental. It is derivable.

If the fundamental laws are time-reversal symmetric, this raises the interesting question of why all physical processes are seen by us to go in only one direction in time spontaneously, as if time has an arrow. The arrow is shown in processes being observed to go in only one way. Eggs break but are never seen to un-break unless a human intervenes to put the pieces back together. Bullets explode but never un-explode. Heat flows spontaneously from hot to cold, never the other way. This issue is examined in the later section on the arrow of time.

For more about special relativity, see Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations.

6. Time and Change (Relationism vs. Substantivalism)

Does physical time necessarily depend on change existing, or vice versa? Philosophers have been sharply divided on these issues, and any careful treatment of them requires clarifying the relevant terms being used. Even the apparent truism that change involves time is false if the terms are used improperly.

Let’s focus on whether time necessarily involves change. If it does, then what sort of change is required? For example, would time exist in a universe that does change but does not change in enough of a regular manner to have a clock? Those who answer “yes,” are quick to point out that there is a difference between not being able to measure some entity and that entity not existing. Those who answer “no,” have sometimes said that if an entity cannot be measured then the very concept of it is meaningless—although not that it must be meaningless, as a Logical Positivist would declare, but only that it is as a matter of fact meaningless. The latter position is defended by Max Tegmark in (Tegmark 2017).

Classical relationists claim that time necessarily involves change, and classical substantivalists say it does not. Substantivalism (also called substantialism) implies that both space and time exist always and everywhere regardless of what else exists or changes. They say space and time provide a large, invisible, inert container within which matter exists and moves independently of the container. The container provides an absolute rest frame, and motion relative to that frame is real motion, not merely relative motion. Relationism (also called relationalism) implies space and time are not like this. It implies there is no container, so, if you take away matter’s motions, you take away time, and if you also take way the matter itself, you take away space.

Substantivalism is the thesis that space and time exist always and everywhere independently of physical material and its events.

Relationism is the thesis that space is only a set of relationships among existing physical material, and time is a set of relationships among the events of that physical material.

Relationism is inconsistent with substantivalism. Substantivalism implies there can be empty time, time without the existence of physical events. Relationism does not allow empty time. It is committed to the claim that time requires material change. That is, necessarily, if time exists, then change exists.

Everyone agrees that clocks do not function without change and that time cannot be measured without there being changes, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. Can we solve this issue by testing? Could we, for instance, turn off all changes and then look to see whether time still exists? No, the issue has to be approached indirectly.

Relationists and substantivalists agree that, perhaps as a matter of fact, change is pervasive and so is time. What is contentious is whether time exists even if, perhaps contrary to fact, nothing is changing. This question of whether time requires change is not the question of whether change requires time, nor is it the question of whether time is fundamental.

To make progress, more clarity is needed regarding the word change. The meaning of the word is philosophically controversial. It is used here in the sense of ordinary change—an object changing its ordinary properties over time. For example, a leaf changes its location if it falls from a branch and lands on the ground. This ordinary change of location is very different from the following three extraordinary kinds of change. (1) The leaf changes by being no longer admired by Donald. (2) The leaf changes by moving farther into the past. (3) The leaf changes across space from being green at its base to brown at its tip, all at one time. So, a reader needs always to be alert about whether the word change means ordinary change or one of the extraordinary kinds of change.

There is a fourth kind of change that also is extraordinary. Consider what the word properties means when we say an object changes its properties over time. When referring to ordinary change of properties, the word properties is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if and only if, during the time that it exists, it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. With this definition, we can conclude that the world’s chlorophyll underwent a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We naturally would react to drawing this conclusion by saying that this change in chlorophyll is very odd, not an ordinary change in the chlorophyll, surely nothing that would be helpful to the science of biology.

Classical substantival theories are also called absolute theories. The term absolute here implies existing without dependence on anything except perhaps God. The relationist, on the other hand, believes time’s existence depends upon material events.

Many centuries ago, the manifest image of time was relationist, but due to the influence of Isaac Newton upon the teaching of science in subsequent centuries and then this impact upon the average person who is not a scientist, the manifest image has become substantivalist.

a. History of the Debate from Aristotle to Kant

Mario Bunge encapsulated the history of relationism vs. substantivalism this way:

The idea that time is the pace of events [namely, is relational] was adumbrated by Plato [51], discussed by Aristotle [1], sung by Lucretius [43], worked out by Augustine [2] and reinvented by Leibniz [41], Mach [45], and a few others. Unfortunately none of these relationists proposed a theory (= hypothetico-deductive system) of time. Consequently the idea that time is “a measure of motion” (Aristotle) and “an order of successions” (Leibniz) remained nearly as half-baked and metaphorical as its rival, the absolutist view that time “of itself, and from its own nature, flows equably without relation to anything external” (Newton).

Let’s unpack some of the more important points in this history.

Aristotle had said, “neither does time exist without change” (Physics, Book IV, chapter 11, page 218b). This claim about time is often called Aristotle’s Principle. In this sense he was Leibniz’s predecessor,  although Leibniz’s relationism contains not only Aristotle’s negative element that there is no changeless time but also a positive element that describes what time is. In opposition to Aristotle on this topic, Democritus spoke of there being an existing space within which matter’s atoms move, implying space is substance-like rather than relational. So, the ancient Greek atomists were a predecessor to Newton on this topic.

The battle lines between substantivalism and relationism were drawn more clearly in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for relationism and Newton argued against it. Leibniz claimed that space is a network of objects. It is nothing but the “order of co-existing things,” so without objects there is no space. “I hold space to be something merely relative, as time is; …I hold it to be an order of coexistences, as time is an order of successions.” Leibniz would say time is abstracted from changes of things, namely events, with the paradigm kind of change being motion. Expressed more technically, we can say Leibniz’s relational world is one in which spatial relationships are ontologically prior to space itself, and relationships among changes (or events) are ontologically prior to time itself. This position of Leibniz’s can be summarized as his saying time is a relational order of successions of event. This is the positive element in Leibniz’s relationism. The typical succession-relationships Leibniz is talking about here are that this event happens two minutes before that event, and these two other events are simultaneous. If asked what a specific time is, a modern Leibnizian would be apt to say a time is a set of simultaneous events.

Opposing Leibniz, Isaac Barrow and his student Isaac Newton returned to a Democritus-like view of space as existing independently of material things; and they similarly accepted a substantival theory of time, with time existing independently of all motions and other events. Newton’s actual equations of motion and his law of gravity are consistent with both relationism and substantivalism, although this point was not clear at the time to either Leibniz or Newton.

In 1670 in his Lectiones Geometricae, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected any necessary linkage between time and change. He said, “Whether things run or stand still, whether we sleep or wake, time flows in its even tenor.” Barrow also said time existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Newton agreed. In Newton’s unpublished manuscript De gravitatione, written while he was composing Principia, he said, “we cannot think that space does not exist just as we cannot think there is no duration” (Newton 1962, p. 26). This suggests that he believed time exists necessarily, and this idea may have influenced Kant’s position that time is an a priori condition of all appearance whatsoever.

Newton believed time is not a primary substance, but is like a primary substance in not being dependent on anything except God. For Newton, God chose some instant of pre-existing time at which to create the physical world. From these initial conditions, including the forces acting on the material objects, the timeless scientific laws took over and guided the material objects, with God intervening only occasionally to perform miracles. If it were not for God’s intervention, the future would be a logical consequence of the present.

Leibniz objected. He was suspicious of Newton’s substantival time because it is undetectable, which, he supposed, made the concept incoherent. Leibniz argued that time should be understood not as an entity existing independently of actual, detectable events. He complained that Newton had under-emphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of events, the “successive order of things,” such as one event happening two seconds after another or four weeks before another. This is why time needs events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time.

It is clear that Leibniz and Newton had very different answers to the question, “Given some event, what does it mean to say it occurs at a specific time?” Newton would says events occur at some absolute time that is independent of what other events do nor do not occur, but Leibniz would say we can properly speak only about the event occurring before or after or simultaneous with some other events, and that is what it means to occur at a specific time. Leibniz and Newton had a similar disagreement about space. Newton believed objects had absolute locations that need no reference to other objects’ locations, but Leibniz believed objects can be located only via spatial relations between other material objects—by an object being located above or below or three feet from another object.

One of Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s theory is that it violates Leibniz’s Law of the Identity of Indiscernibles: If two things or situations cannot be discerned by their different properties, then they are really identical; they are just one and not two. Newton’s absolute theory violates this law, Leibniz said, because it implies that if God had shifted the entire world some distance east and its history some minutes earlier, yet changed no properties of the objects nor relationships among the objects, then this would have been a different world—what metaphysicians call an ontologically distinct state of affairs. Leibniz claimed there would be no difference because there would be no discernible difference in the two, so there would be just one world here, not two, and so Newton’s theory of absolute space and time is faulty. This argument is called “Leibniz’s shift argument.”

Regarding the shift argument, Newton suggested that, although Leibniz’s a priori Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles is correct, God is able to discern differences in absolute time or space that mere mortals cannot.

Leibniz offered another criticism. Newton’s theory violates Leibniz’s a priori Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is a sufficient reason why any aspect of the universe is the way it is and not some other way. Leibniz complained that, since everything happens for a reason, if God shifted the world in time or space but made no other changes, then He surely would have no reason to do so.

Newton responded that Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason but is incorrect to suppose there is a sufficient reason knowable to humans. God might have had His own reason for creating the universe at a given absolute place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reason.

Newton later admitted to friends that his two-part theological response to Leibniz was weak. Historians of philosophy generally agree that if Newton had said no more, he would have lost the debate.

Newton, through correspondence from his friend Clarke to Leibniz, did criticize Leibniz by saying, “the order of things succeeding each other in time is not time itself, for they may succeed each other faster or slower in the same order of succession but not in the same time.” Leibniz probably should have paid more attention to just what this remark might imply. However, Newton soon found another clever and clearer argument, one that had a much greater impact at the time. He suggested a thought experiment in which a bucket’s handle is tied to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, grasp the bucket, and, without spilling any water, rotate it many times until the rope is twisted. Do not let go of the bucket. When everything quiets down, the water surface is flat and there is no relative motion between the bucket and its water. That is situation 1. Now let go of the bucket, and let it spin until there is once again no relative motion between the bucket and its water. At this time, the bucket is spinning, and there is a concave curvature of the water surface. That is situation 2.

How can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the water’s surface in the two situations? It cannot, said Newton. Here is his argument. If we ignore our hands, the rope, the tree, and the rest of the universe, says Newton, each situation is simply a bucket with still water; the situations appear to differ only in the shape of their water surface. A relationist such as Leibniz cannot account for the change in shape. Newton said that even though Leibniz’s theory could not be used to explain the difference in shape, his own theory could. He said that when the bucket is not spinning, there is no motion relative to space itself, that is, to absolute space; but, when it is spinning, there is motion relative to space itself, and so space itself must be exerting a force on the water to make the concave shape. This force pushing away from the center of the bucket is called centrifugal force, and its presence is a way to detect absolute space.

Because Leibniz and his supporters had no counter to this thought experiment, for over two centuries Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers, with the notable exceptions of Locke in England and d’Alembert in France.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. Consider two nearly identical gloves except that one is right-handed and the other is left-handed. In a world containing only a right-hand glove, said Kant, Leibniz’s theory could not account for its handedness because all the internal relationships among parts of the glove would be the same as in a world containing only a left-hand glove. However, intuitively we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a space itself, then the absolute or substantival theory of space is better than the relational theory. This indirectly suggests that the absolute theory of time is better, too.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though Christiaan Huygens (in the 17th century) and George Berkeley (in the 18th century) had argued in favor of Leibniz. See (Huggett 1999) and (Arthur 2014) for a clear, detailed discussion of the opposing positions of Leibniz and Newton on this issue.

b. History of the Debate after Kant

Leibniz’s criticisms of Newton’s substantivalism are clear enough, but the positive element of Leibniz’s relationism is vague. It lacked specifics by assuming uncritically that his method for abstracting duration from change is unique, but this uniqueness assumption is not defended. That is, what exactly is it about the relationship of objects and their events that produces time and not something else? Nor did Leibniz address the issue of how to define the duration between two arbitrarily chosen events. In the twentieth century, Einstein argued successfully that the duration is not unique, but is relative. Appreciating Einstein’s argument has affected the debates about substantivalism and relationism.

Newton and subsequent substantivalists hoped to find a new substance for defining absolute motion without having to appeal to the existence and location of ordinary material objects. In the late 19th century, the substantivalists discovered a candidate for absolute space. It was James Clerk Maxwell’s luminiferous aether, the medium that waves when there is a light wave. Maxwell had discovered that light is an electromagnetic wave. Since all then-known waves required a medium to wave, all physicists and philosophers of science at the time believed Maxwell when he said the aether was needed as a medium for the propagation of electromagnetic waves and also when he said that it definitely did exist even if it had never been directly detected. Yet this was Maxwell’s intuition speaking; his own equations did not require a medium for the propagation.

In the nineteenth century, physicists assumed the Earth was rushing through the aether, thereby creating a continual aether wind. Late in the century, the physicist A. A. Michelson and his chemist colleague Edward Morley set out to experimentally detect the wind, and thus the aether. Their interferometer experiment was very sensitive, but somehow it failed to detect an aether even though the experiment was at the time the most sensitive experiment in the history of physics. Some physicists, including Michelson himself, believed the problem was that he needed a better experimental apparatus. Other physicists believed that the aether was somehow corrupting the apparatus. Most others, however, believed the physicist A. J. Fresnel who said the Earth is dragging the aether with it, so the Earth’s nearby aether is moving in concert with the Earth itself. If so, this would make the aether undetectable by the Michelson-Morley experimental apparatus, as long as the apparatus was used on Earth and not in outer space. No significant physicist said there was no aether to be detected.

However, these ad hoc rescues of the aether hypothesis did not last long. In 1893, the physicist-philosopher Ernst Mach, who had such a powerful influence on Albert Einstein, offered an original argument that attacked Newton’s bucket argument, promoted relationism, and did not assume the existence of absolute space (the aether) or absolute time. Absolute time, said Mach, “is an idle metaphysical conception.” Mach claimed Newton’s error was in not considering the presence or absence of stars or, more specifically, not considering the combined gravitational influence of all the matter in the universe beyond the bucket. That is what was curving the water surface in the bucket when the water was spinning.

To explore Mach’s argument, consider a female  ballet dancer who pirouettes in otherwise empty space. Would her arms have to splay out from her body in this thought experiment? And if we were to spin Newton’s bucket of water in otherwise empty space, would the presence of absolute space eventually cause the surface of the water to become concave? Leibniz would answer “no.” Newton would answer “yes.” Mach would say the questions makes no sense because the very notion of spin must be spin relative to some object, such as the surrounding stars. Mach would add that, if the distant stars were retained, then there would be spin relative to them, and he would change his answers to “yes.” Newton believed the presence or absence of the distant stars is irrelevant to the situations with a spinning ballet dancer and a spinning bucket of water. Unfortunately, Mach did not provide any detailed specification of how the distant stars exerted their influence on Newton’s bucket or a ballet dancer, and he had no suggestion for an experiment to test his answer; and nearly all physicists and philosophers of physics were not convinced by Mach’s reasoning. So, the prevailing orthodoxy was that Newton’s substantivalism is correct.

It is surprising that so little was said at the time about the asymmetry in the two bucket scenarios. In the second one, the water is rotating along with the bucket, and that implies change of velocity and thus acceleration, an acceleration that does not occur in the first scenario, and that might be the key to explaining the puzzle without relying upon the distant stars or upon an underlying spatial substance.

A young physicist named Albert Einstein was very intrigued by Mach’s remarks. He at first thought Mach was correct, and even wrote him a letter saying so, but he eventually rejected Mach’s position and took an original, relationist position on the issue.

In 1905, he proposed his special theory of relativity that does not require the existence of either Newton’s absolute space or Maxwell’s aether. Ten years later he added a description of gravity and produced his general theory of relativity, which had the same implication. The theory was immediately understood by the leading physicists, and, when experimentally confirmed, it caused the physics and philosophy communities to abandon classical substantivalism. The tide quickly turned against what Newton had said in his Principia, namely that “Time exists in and of itself and flows equably without reference to anything external.” Influenced by relativity theory, the philosopher Bertrand Russell became an articulate promoter of relationism in the early twentieth century.

Waxing philosophical in The New York Times newspaper in 1919, Einstein declared his general relativity theory to be a victory for relationism:

Till now it was believed that time and space existed by themselves, even if there was nothing—no Sun, no Earth, no stars—while now we know that time and space are not the vessel for the Universe, but could not exist at all if there were no contents, namely, no Sun, no Earth, and other celestial bodies.

Those remarks show Einstein believed in relationism at this time. However, in his Nobel Prize acceptance speech three years later in 1922, Einstein backtracked on this and took a more substantivalist position by saying time and space could continue to exist without the Sun, Earth, and other celestial bodies. He claimed that, although relativity theory does rule out Maxwell’s aether and Newton’s absolute space, it does not rule out some other underlying substance that is pervasive. All that is required is that, if such a substance exists, then it must obey the principles of the theory of relativity. Soon he was saying this substance is space-time itselfa field whose intrinsic curvature is what we call gravitational force. With this position, he is a non-Newtonian, non-Maxwellian substantivalist. Rejecting classical substantivalism, Einstein said that spacetime, “does not claim an existence of its own, but only as a structural quality of the [gravitational] field.”

This pro-substantivalism position has been subsequently strengthened by the 1998 experimental discovery of dark energy which eventually was interpreted as indicating that space itself has inertia and is expanding faster and faster. Because spacetime itself can curve and can have ripples (from gravitational waves) and can expand in volume, the pro-substantivalist position became the most popular position in the 21st century. Nevertheless, there are interesting challenges, and the issue is open.

In the 21st century it is widely accepted that spacetime can curve, expand (when the universe’s volume increases), and ripple (when gravitational waves pass by). Those are properties one commonly associates with an underlying medium.

Quantum field theory provides another reason to accept substantivalism. This theory is the result of applying quantum mechanics to fields. The assumption of Leibniz and Newton that fundamentally there are particles in space and time buffeted about by forces was rejected with the rise of quantum field theory in the late twentieth century. It became clear that fields are better candidates than particles for the fundamental entities of the universe. Physicists influenced by logical positivism, once worried that perhaps Einstein’s gravitation field, and all other fields, are merely computational devices without independent reality. However, ever since the demise of logical positivism and the development and confirmation of quantum electrodynamics in the late twentieth century, fields have been considered to be real by both physicists and philosophers. What used to be called “fundamental particles” still exist, but only as emergent entities from fundamental fields. Because quantum theory implies a field does not go away even if the field’s values reach a minimum everywhere, the gravitational field is considered to be substance-like, but it is a substance that changes with the distribution of matter-energy throughout the universe, so it is very unlike Newton’s absolute space or Maxwell’s aether. The philosophers John Earman and John Norton have called this position (of promoting the substance-like character of the gravitational field) manifold substantivalism. In response, the philosopher of physics Tim Maudlin said: “The question is: Why should any serious substantivalist settle on manifold substantivalism? What would recommend that view? Prima facie it seems like a peculiar position to hold” because the manifold has no spatiotemporal structure. (Maudlin 1988, p. 87).

Since the late twentieth century, philosophers have continued to create new arguments for and against substantivalism, so the issue is still open. Nevertheless, many other scientists and philosophers have suggested that the rise of quantum field theory has so changed the concepts in the Newton-Leibniz debate that the old issue cannot be settled either way.

For additional discussion of substantivalism and relationism, see (Dainton 2010, chapter 21).

7. Is There a Beginning or End to Time?

This section surveys some of the principal, well-informed speculations about the beginning and end of time. The emphasis should be on “speculations” because there are hundreds of competing ideas about the beginning and end of the universe and of time, and none of the ideas are necessary to explain any actual observations. Also, almost all of them are flexible enough that they could be made to accommodate any new data that needed an explanation. For all we know, we may never know the answer to these questions, despite being better informed on the issue than were our predecessors. One cautionary note is that researchers sometimes speak of time existing before the beginning of the universe, so perhaps what they mean by the word “universe” is not as comprehensive as what others mean. Also, researchers sometimes speak of the creation of a universe from the physicists’ quantum vacuum and call this creation ex nihilo, but a quantum vacuum is not nothing, so the label can be misleading.

a. The Beginning

Many persons have argued that the way to show there must have been a first event is to show that time has a finite past.  But this is a mistake. The universe can have a finite past but no first event. This point is illustrated with the positive real numbers. All positive real numbers before five (that is, less than five and greater than zero) have predecessors, but there is no first number in this series. For any positive real number in the series, there is a smaller one without there being a smallest one.

Many theologians are confident that there was a beginning to time, but there is no agreement among cosmologists that there ever was a beginning.

Relativity theory and quantum theory both allow time to be infinite in the future and the past. Thus any restrictions on time’s extent must come from other sources. Regarding the beginning of time, some cosmologists believe the universe began with a big bang 13.8 billion years ago. This is the t = 0 of cosmic time used by professional cosmologists. The main controversy is whether t = 0 is really the beginning. Your not being able to imagine there not being a time before the big bang does not imply there is such an earlier time, although this style of argument might have been acceptable to the ancient Greek philosophers. The mathematical physicist Stephen Hawking once famously quipped that asking for what happened before the big bang is like asking what is north of the north pole. He later retracted that remark and said it is an open question whether there was a time before the big bang, but he slightly favored a yes answer.

There are a great many detailed physical theories that speculate about our origins. One is that the Big Bang was the beginning. Another is that the universe had an infinite past in which nothing of interest happened, then abruptly the Big Bang began.

Even if there were a time before the big bang began, the question would remain as to whether the extent of this prior time is finite or infinite, and there is no consensus on that question either.

The big bounce theory of cosmology says the small, expanding volume of the universe 13.8 billion years ago was the effect of a prior multi-billion-year compression that, when the universe became small enough, stopped its compression and began a rapid expansion that we have been calling the big bang. Perhaps there have been repetitions of compression followed by expansion, and perhaps these cycles have been occurring forever and will continue occurring forever. This is the theory of a cyclic universe.

The Hawking-Hartle No Boundary Proposal suggests that the universe had no time, then suddenly one dimension of space converted to a dimension of time.

Cosmologist J. Richard Gott speculated that time began in an unusual process in which the universe came from itself by a process of backward causation as allowed by the theory of general relativity. At the beginning of the universe there was a closed time-like loop that lasted for 10-44 seconds during which the universe caused its own existence. Past time is not eternal according to this theory. The loop was a beginning of time without a first event. See (Gott 2002) for an informal presentation of the idea.

b. The End

The cosmologists’ favorite scenario for the universe’s destiny implies that all stars burn out, all black holes eventually evaporate, all mass is gone, and the remaining particles of radiation get ever farther from each other, with no end to the dilution and cooling while the ripples of space-time become weaker. This scenario, called the heat death, the big chill, and the big freeze, depends upon assuming the total energy of the universe is not zero, which is a controversial assumption.

Here is a summary of some serious, competing suggestions by twenty-first-century cosmologists about our universe’s future. The list begins with the most popular one:

  • Heat DeathBig Chill (Expansion of space at an ever-increasing rate.) A potentially infinite future.
  • Big Crunch (The universe is expanding; eventually the expansion stops somehow; and the universe begins contracting to a final compressed state as if the big bang is running in reverse.) A finite future.
  • Big Bounce. (Eternal pattern of cycles of expansion, then compression, then expansion, then compression, and so forth. One version implies there are repeated returns to a microscopic volume with each being followed by a new big bang). An infinite future.
  • Cycles without Crunches (While the universe expands, the observable part of the universe can oscillate between expansions and contractions with a big bounce separating a contraction from the next expansion.) An infinite future.
  • Big Rip (Dark energy runs wild. The expansion rate of dark energy is not a Cosmological Constant but instead increases exponentially toward infinity. As this happens, every complex system that interacts gravitationally is eventually pushed apart—first groups of galaxies, then galaxies, later the planets, then all the molecules, and within about 188,000,000 years even the fabric of space itself.) A finite future.
  • Big Snap (The fabric of space suddenly reveals a lethal granular nature when stretched too much, and its “snaps” like when an overly stretched rubber band breaks.) A finite future.
  • Death Bubble (Due to some high energy event such as the creation of a tiny black hole with a size never created before, our metastable Higgs field suddenly changes its value from the current false vacuum value to the more stable true vacuum value. The energy of the vacuum decay that this collapse creates appears as a 3D bubble with no inside that expands at nearly the speed of light while destroying everything in its path that has structure. Not expected to occur until 10100 years from now but possibly could occur tomorrow.) A finite future.
  • Mirror Universe. (Before  the big bang, time runs in reverse. Both the big bang’s before-region and after-region emerge from a tiny situation at cosmic time t = 0 in which the apexes of their two light cones meet. The two regions are almost mirror images of each other.) There are versions with a finite future and finite past and with an infinite future and infinite past.

These theories have been described in detail with mathematical physics, but they are just stories in the sense that none are tied to any experimental results. The Big Crunch was the most popular theory among cosmologists until the 1960s. In this theory, the universe would continue its present expansion for about three billion more years until the inward pull due to the mutual gravitation among all the universe’s matter-energy overcame the expansion, thereby causing a subsequent seven billion years of contraction until everything becomes compressed together into a black hole.

See (Mack 2020) and (Hossenfelder 2022, chapter two) for a presentation by two cosmologists of the many competing theories about the beginning and the end of time and of the universe.

c. Historical Answers

There has been much speculation over the centuries about the extent of the past and the future, although almost all remarks have contained serious ambiguities. For example, regarding the end of time, is this meant in the sense of (a) the end of humanity, or (b) the end of life, or (c) the end of the universe that was created by God, but not counting God, or (d) the end of all natural and supernatural change? Intimately related to these questions are two others: (1) Is it being assumed that time exists without change, and (2) what is meant by the term change? With these cautions in mind, here is a brief summary of speculations throughout the centuries about whether time has a beginning or an end.

Regarding the beginning of time, the Greek atomist Lucretius in about 50 B.C.E. said in his poem De Rerum Natura:

For surely the atoms did not hold council, assigning order to each, flexing their keen minds with questions of place and motion and who goes where.

But shuffled and jumbled in many ways, in the course of endless time they are buffeted, driven along chancing upon all motions, combinations.

At last they fall into such an arrangement as would create this universe.

The implication is that time has always existed, but that an organized universe began a finite time ago with a random fluctuation.

Plato and Aristotle, both of whom were opponents of the atomists, agreed with them that the past is infinite or eternal. Aristotle offered two reasons. Time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time. In addition, time had no beginning because everything in the world has a prior, efficient cause. In the fifth century, Augustine disagreed with Aristotle and said time itself came into existence by an act of God a finite time ago, but God, himself, does not exist in time. This is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the big bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

Agreeing with Augustine against Aristotle, Martin Luther estimated the universe to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E. Then Johannes Kepler estimated that it began in 4,004 B.C.E. In the early seventeenth century, the Calvinist James Ussher calculated from the Bible that the world began in 4,004 B.C.E. on Friday, October 28.

Advances in geology eventually refuted the low estimates that the universe was created in about 4,000 B.C.E.

In about 1700, Isaac Newton claimed future time is infinite and that, although God created the material world some finite time ago, there was an infinite period of past time before that, as Lucretius had also claimed.

Twenty-first century astronomers say the universe is at least as old as the big bang which began  about 13.8 billion years ago.

For more discussion of the issue of the extent of time, so the companion section Infinite Time.

8. Emergence of Time

To ask whether time emerges is to ask where it comes from, not how it changes over time. Is physical time emergent, or is it instead a fundamental feature of nature? That is, is it basic, elementary, not derivative, or does it emerge at a higher level of description from more basic timeless features? Does spacetime emerge as well? Experts are not sure of the answers, although a slight majority favor spacetime not being emergent, and nearly all members of this majority favor the position that time emerges from spacetime. The most favored candidate for what spacetime emerges from is the quantum wave function, and in particular from quantum entanglement. Entanglement is a matter of degree.

The word emerge has been used in different ways in the literature of philosophy. Some persons define emergence as the whole being greater than the sum of its parts. There are better, less vague definitions. The word “emerge” in this article is intended to indicate the appearance of an objective or mind-independent feature of nature, not a psychological feature or a feature of our knowledge. When we ask whether time emerges, the notion of being emergent does not imply being inexplicable, and it does not imply that there is a process occurring over time in which something appears that was not there before the process began such as an oak tree emerging from an acorn. Still, being emergent is less strong than being reducible. The philosopher Daniel Dennett helpfully recommends treating an emergent entity as a pattern that has an explanatory and predictive role in the theory positing the entity, but it is a pattern at a higher level. Emergence is about the level (a.k.a. scale or amount of detail) of the description of phenomena. Information is lost as one moves to higher levels, but the move to a higher level can reveal real patterns and promote understanding of nature that would never be noticed by focusing only on the fundamental level.

To say that something is emergent is to say that it’s part of an approximate description of reality that is valid at a certain (usually macroscopic) level, and is to be contrasted with “fundamental” things, which are part of an exact description at the microscopic level….Fundamental versus emergent is one distinction, and real versus not-real is a completely separate one (Carroll 2019, p. 235).

Believing time will be coarse-grained or emergent in a future, successful theory of quantum gravity, theoretical astrophysicist Sean Carroll says, “Time is just an approximation….” Carlo Rovelli agrees:

Space-time is…an approximation. In the elementary grammar of the world, there is neither space nor time—only processes that transform physical quantities from one to another…. At the most fundamental level that we currently know of,…there is little that resembles time as we experience it. There is no special variable “time,” there is no difference between past and future, there is no spacetime (Rovelli 2018 195).

Let’s pause here and say a bit more about emergence. Heat emerges from molecular motion even though no molecule is hot. What makes heat emergent in the sense that time might be emergent is that there can be no change in the heat without a corresponding change in the underlying molecular motion. For another example, we properly and usefully speak of hunger causing a person to visit the supermarket without bothering to consider how the terms cash out in terms  of constituent particles. In that sense, a person is just an approximation. The point of saying a new concept emerges at a higher level is not simply to imply that lower level information is lost in using higher level concepts. Instead the point of using a higher level concept is to make use of higher level patterns that are useful in creating explanations and that could not be easily appreciated by using only lower level concepts. The point is to find especially useful patterns at the higher level to improve describing, explaining, and understanding nature. The point is not to reduce sentences about persons to sentences about particles.

Any claim that time emerges should say whether this emergence is weak or strong (in the sense defined by the philosopher Mark Bedau). Weak emergence is about new features supervening upon more basic features but not existing at that more basic level. (A supervenes on B if changes in A require there to be changes in B. For example, temperature supervenes on molecular motion because the temperature of an object cannot change without there being changes in the object’s molecular motions, but at the basic level, no molecule has a temperature.) As a practical matter, it is rare that a higher level concept is in practice explicitly derived from a lower level concept even if it can be in principle. Strong emergence denies the supervenience and emphasizes the independence of the emergent concept from a lower level. Physicists favor weak emergence over strong emergence for their topics of interest, but the notion of strong emergence is perhaps more applicable when we say the behavior of a nation emerges from the behavior of its citizens.

An important philosophical issue is to decide which level is the fundamental one. Being fundamental is relative to the speaker’s purpose. Biologists and physicists have different purposes. To a biologist, the hunger causing you to visit the supermarket emerges from the fundamental level of cellular activity. But to a physicist, the level of cellular activity is not fundamental but rather emerges from the more fundamental level of elementary particle activity which in turn emerges from fluctuations in elementary quantum fields.

Does time emerge from spacetime? Special relativity definitely implies it does. But there is no longer a consensus on the issue. Some physicists speculate that early in the big bang period there were an infinite number of dimensions of space. As the universe expanded and cooled, these eventually collapsed into four dimensions of space and none of time. Then this collapsed so that one of the space dimensions disappeared as the time dimension emerged, leaving our current four-dimensional spacetime. (This description seems to imply that there was time before time began, but that is a problem with the English language and not with what is intended by the description.) Other physicists speculate, instead, that time is fundamental, but spacetime is what emerges. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed that viewpoint. While speaking about string theory, which is his favored theory for reconciling the inconsistency between quantum theory and the general theory of relativity, he said.

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

By doomed, Gross means not-fundamental and only emergent. Perhaps half of all physicists working in the field of quantum gravity in the first quarter of the 21st century suspect that resolving the inconsistency between quantum theory and gravitational theory will require forcing both spacetime and time to emerge from some more basic timeless substrate at or below the scale of the Planck length of about 10-35 meters and the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds. The physicist Stephen Wolfram believes the atoms of time have a duration of only 10-100 seconds. This is the time the universe needs to update itself to the next state.

According to Wolfram, time is the progression of the universe’s computations. All physical change is a computation, he believes.  He envisions the fundamental entities in the universe to be represented as a finite collection of atoms of space (nodes) that have connections (directed arrows) to others and to collections of others; the mathematical structure here is called a spatial hypergraph. The totality of space atoms is perhaps 10400, and time is the progressive rewriting of the hypergraph about every 10-100 seconds. The rewriting occurs by applying the same rule throughout the hypergraph. The rule says that, wherever within the hypergraph there is this particular simple pattern of nodes and their connections, update that pattern to this other pattern by following rule R. So there is quite a bit a parallel processing going on throughout the universe as it rewrites itself everywhere every 10100 seconds. Unfortunately, Wolfram does not yet know rule R, but he is confident there is such a rule to be found, and it will be simple, and it will lead to a universe that approximately has three-plus-one-dimensional spacetime that approximately obeys general relativity and quantum theory and appears to be continuous when not viewed too finely. So, time, space, matter, fields, and all of science’s laws emerge from patterns in the underlying hypergraph. In Wolfram’s theory, space and time are very different from each other, unlike in relativity theory.

The physicist Carlo Rovelli, a proponent of loop quantum gravity rather than string theory, has a suggestion for what the fundamental level is from which time emerges. It is a configuration of loops. He speculated: “At the fundamental level, the world is a collection of events not ordered in time” (Rovelli 2018a, p. 155). Rovelli is re-imagining the relationship between time and change. Nevertheless, at the macroscopic level, he would say time does exist even though it is not a fundamental feature of reality. In string theory, the strings that compose all elementary particles exist within a background of spacetime. But within loop quantum gravity this is not the case. Instead, spacetime emerges from a configuration of loops, analogous to the way a vest of chainmail emerges from a properly connected set of tiny circular chain links.

Eliminativism is the theory in ontology that says emergent entities are unreal. If time is emergent, it is not real. Similarly, if pain is emergent, it is not real—and so no person has really felt a pain. The theory is also called strong emergentism. The opposite and more popular position in ontology is anti-eliminativism or weak emergence. It implies that emergent entities are real despite being emergent. The English physicist Julian Barbour is an eliminativist and strong emergentist about time. He said the “universe is static. Nothing happens; there is being but no becoming. The flow of time and motion are illusions” (Barbour 2009, p. 1). He argued that, although there does exist objectively an infinity of individual, instantaneous moments, nevertheless there is no objective happens-before ordering of them, no objective time order. There is just a vast, jumbled heap of moments. Each moment is an instantaneous configuration (relative to one reference frame) of all the objects in space. Like a photograph, a moment or configuration contains information about change, but it, itself, does not change. If the universe is as Barbour describes, then space (the relative spatial relationships within a configuration) is ontologically fundamental and a continuum, but time is neither. Time is unreal, and at best emerges as some general measure of the differences among the existing spatial configurations. For more on Barbour’s position, see (Smolin 2013, pp. 84-88).

Sean Carroll has a different, original idea about time. He is not an eliminativist, but is a weak emergentist who claims in (Carroll 2019) that time and everything else in the universe emerges from the universe’s wave function in a “gravitized quantum theory.” The only fundamental entity in the universe is the wave function. Everything else that is real emerges from the wave function that obeys Schrödinger’s equation. This position gives a physical interpretation of the wave function. Carroll says neither time, space, nor even spacetime is fundamental. These features emerge from the quantum wave function. So, spacetime is merely an approximation to reality.

Stephen Wolfram suggested time emerges from the progressive rewriting of the universe’s hypergraph.

Another suggestion is that whether time is emergent may not have a unique answer. Perhaps time is relative to a characterization of nature. That is, perhaps there are alternative, but empirically adequate theoretical characterizations of nature, yet time is fundamental in one characterization but emergent in another. This idea is influenced by Quine’s ontological relativity.

For more description of the different, detailed speculations on whether time is among the fundamental constituents of reality, see (Merali 2013) and (Rovelli 2018b).

9. Convention

Time has both conventional and non-conventional features. The clearest way to specify the conventional elements in a theory would be by axiomatizing it, but there is no such precise theory of time.

The duration of the second is a conventional feature involving time. Our society could have chosen it to be longer or shorter. It is a convention that there are sixty-seconds in a minute rather than sixty-six, and that no week fails to contain a Tuesday. It is a convention that we choose time coordinates so that time goes forward as the coordinate numbers get larger rather than smaller.

Here is a non-conventional feature. In a single reference frame, if event 1 happens before event 2, and event 2 happens before event 3, then event 1 also happens before event 3. No exceptions. This transitivity of the happens-before relation in any single reference frame is a general feature of time, not a convention. However, it is a contingent feature, not an essential feature. It is believed because no one has ever seen evidence that transitivity is violated, and there are no reputable theories implying that there should be such evidence.

The issue here is conventional vs. factual, not conventional vs. foolish or impractical. Although the term convention is somewhat vague, conventions are up to us to freely adopt and are not objective features of the external world that we are forced to accept if we seek the truth. Conventions are inventions or artificial features as opposed to being natural or mandatory or factual. It is a convention that the English word green means green, but it is not a convention  that the color of normal, healthy leaves is green. Conventions need not be arbitrary; they can be useful or have other pragmatic virtues. Nevertheless, if a feature is conventional, then there must in some sense be reasonable alternative conventions that could have been adopted. Also, conventions can be explicit or implicit. For one last caution, conventions can become recognized as having been facts. The assumption that matter is composed of atoms was a useful convention in late nineteenth century physics; but, after Einstein’s explanation of Brownian motion in terms of atoms, the convention was generally recognized by physicists as having been a fact all along.

Time in physics is measured with real numbers (decimal numbers) rather than imaginary numbers (such as the square root of negative one). Does this reveal a deep feature of time? No, it is simply a convention.

It is a useful convention that, in order to keep future midnights from occurring during the daylight, clocks are re-set by one hour as one moves across a time-zone on the Earth’s surface—and that is also why leap days and leap seconds are used. The minor adjustments with leap seconds are required because the Earth’s rotations and revolutions are not exactly regular. For political and social reasons, time zones do not always have longitudes for boundaries. For similar reasons, some geographical regions use daylight savings time instead of standard time.

Consider the ordinary way a clock is used to measure how long a nearby event lasts. We adopt the following metric, or method: Take the time at which the event ends, say 5:00, and subtract the time at which it starts, say the previous 3:00. The metric procedure says to take the absolute value of the difference between the two numbers and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock could and should be used? That is, is there an objective metric, or is time metrically amorphous? Philosophers of physics do not agree on this. Perhaps the duration between instants x and y could be:


instead of the ordinary:

|y – x|.

A virtue of both metrics is that duration cannot be negative. The trouble with the log metric is that, for any three point events x, y, and z, if t(x) < t(y) < t(z), then it is normal to demand that the duration from x to y plus the duration from y to z be equal to the duration from x to z. However, the log metric does not have this property. The philosophical issue is whether it must have this property for any reason other than convenience.

Our civilization designs a clock to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time elapses. Is that a convention? Yes. In fact, when Westerners talk about past centuries, they agree to use both A.D. and B.C.E. A clock measuring B.C.E. periods would count toward lower numbers. The clock on today’s wall always counts up, but that is merely because it is agreed we are in the A.D. era, so there is no need for a clock to count in B.C.E. time. The choice of the origin of the time coordinate is conventional, too. It might be a Muhammad event or a Jesus event or a Temple event or the big bang event.

It is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is even capable of having a standard clock that measures both electromagnetic events and gravitational events and that electromagnetic time stays in synchrony with gravitational time.

It is a fact and not a convention that our universe contains a wide variety of phenomena that are sufficiently regular in their ticking to serve as clocks. They are sufficiently regular because they tick in adequate synchrony with the standard clock. The word adequate here means successful for the purposes we have for using a clock.

Physicists regularly assume they may use the concept of a point of continuous time. They might say some event happened the square root of three seconds after another event. Physicists usually uncritically accept a point of time as being real-valued, but philosophers of physics disagree with each other about whether this is merely a useful convention. Is time’s being a continuum in, say quantum mechanics, a fact or just a convention that should be eliminated in a better treatment of time? Experts disagree, although most favor the latter position.

Our society’s standard clock tells everyone what time it really is. Can our standard clock be inaccurate? “Yes,” say the objectivists about the standard clock. “No,” say the conventionalists who claim the standard clock is accurate only by convention; if it acts strangely, then all other clocks must act equally strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock. For an example of strangeness, suppose our standard clock used the periodic rotations of the Earth relative to the background stars. In that case, if a comet struck Earth and affected the rotational speed of the Earth (as judged by, say, a pendulum clock), then we would be forced to say the rotation speed of the Earth did not really change but rather the other periodic clock-like phenomena such as swinging pendulums and quartz crystal oscillations all changed in unison because of the comet strike. The comet “broke” those clocks. That would be a strange conclusion to draw, and in fact, for just this reason, 21st century physicists have rejected any standard clock that is based on Earth rotations and have chosen a newer standard clock that is based on atomic phenomena. Atomic phenomena are unaffected by comet strikes.

A good choice of a standard clock makes the application of physics much simpler. A closely related philosophical question about the choice of the standard clock is whether, when we change our standard clock, we are merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense we can be making a choice that is closer to being correct. For more on this point, see this article’s Frequently Asked Questions.

The special theory of relativity is widely believed to imply that the notion of now or the present is conventional in the following sense. Here is a two-dimensional Minkowski diagram of space and time displaying this feature:

pic of absolute elsewhere

The light cone of your future is the region above the gray area; the past line cone is the region below the gray area. The diagonal straight lines are the worldlines of light rays reaching and leaving you here now. The gray areas of this block universe represent all the events (in sense 1 of the term “event”) that could be classified either way, as your future events or as your past events; and this classification depends upon someone’s choice of what line within the gray area will be the line of your present. Events within the gray areas represent all the events that could neither cause, nor be caused by, your being here now. The more technical ways of saying this is that the gray area is all events that are space-like separated from your hear and now or that are in your hear-and-now’s absolute elsewhere or that constitute your extended present. Two events are time-like separated from each other if they could possibly have affected each other. If a pair of events is time-like separated, then they cannot also be space-like separated. Light cones are not frame relative; they are absolute and objective. Also, this structure of space-time holds not just for you; every point-event, has its own unique pair of light cones.

The gray region of space-like events is called the extended present because, if you were defining an x-axis of this diagram in order to represent your present events, then you would have a great latitude of choice. You could place the line that is to be the frame’s spatial axis anywhere in the gray area; but, in order to avoid ambiguity, once it is chosen it stays there for all uses of the coordinate system; it cannot change its angle. For example, suppose two point-events represented as a and b in the diagram both occur in the Andromeda Galaxy. That galaxy is 2,000,000 light-years away from you, assuming you are now on Earth. Even though event b were to occur a million years after a, you (or whomever is in charge of setting up the axes of the coordinate system you are using) are free to choose either event as happening now in that galaxy, and you also are free to choose any intermediate event there. But you are not free to choose an event in a white area because that would violate relativity theory’s requirements about causality. One implication of this argument is that relativity theory implies there is no fact of the matter as to what is happening at present in the Andromeda Galaxy. What is happening when there is frame-relative.

The above discussion about time-order is often expressed more succinctly by physicists by saying the time-order of space-like events is conventional and not absolute. For more on this issue, see the discussion of the relativity of simultaneity.

Well, perhaps this point should be made more cautiously by saying that special relativity implies the relativity of simultaneity for non-local events. Some philosophers believe there is a fact of the matter, a unique present, even if special relativity does not recognize the fact.

How do we know the speed of light is the same in all directions? Is this a fact, or is it a convention? This is a controversial issue in the philosophy of physics. Einstein claimed it was a convention, but the philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967, and D. Malament in 1977, gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions.

Additional conventional and non-conventional features of time are discussed in the supplement What Else Science Requires of Time.

10. Arguments That Time Is Not Real

We can see a clock, but we cannot see time, so how do we know whether time is real—that it exists? Someone might think that time is real because it is what clocks are designed to measure, and because there certainly are clocks. The trouble with this reasoning is that it is analogous to saying that unicorns are real because unicorn hunters intend to find unicorns, and because there certainly are unicorn hunters.

Early twentieth-century philosophers of science argued that spacetime is real because it is a necessary ingredient in Einstein’s general theory of relativity, which is well-confirmed experimentally. The theory is needed to correctly describe observations. But if, as most physicists say, to be real is to be frame-independent, then time is not real. This insight into the nature of time was first promoted by Hermann Minkowski soon after his student Albert Einstein created the special theory of relativity. Because energy, distance, and mass are also different in different references frames, they, too, are not real. The requirement that to be real is to be frame-independent is not a logical truth, nor a result of observation; it is a plausible metaphysical assumption that so far has the support of almost all physicists and most philosophers of physics.

Let’s consider some other arguments against the reality of time that have appeared in the philosophical literature. The logical positivist Rudolf Carnap said, “The external questions of the reality of physical space and physical time are pseudo-questions” (“Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology,” 1950). He meant these two questions are meaningless because there is no way to empirically verify their answers one way or the other. Subsequent philosophers have generally disagreed with Carnap and have taken these metaphysical questions seriously.

Here are other reasons for the unreality of time. Time is unreal because (i) it is emergent, or (ii) it is subjective, or (iii) it is merely conventional (only a mathematical construct), or (iv) it is defined inconsistently, or (v) its scientific image deviates too much from its commonsense image. The five are explored below, in order.

i. Because Time is Emergent

Time emerges from spacetime in relativity theory, as Minkowski first showed. This implies time is not fundamental; but a small minority of philosophers of time go further and say it also implies time is not real. Similarly, Arthur Eddington and Peter van Inwagen have argued that tables and chairs are not real because they emerge from arrangements of elementary particles, and it is only these particles and their arrangements that are real. The analogous position in the philosophy of mind is called eliminative materialism. It implies that because the physical facts fix all the facts and because future science will show that common mental states such as beliefs and hopes have no essential role in a successful explanation of mental and physical phenomena, there are no such entities as beliefs and hopes. You really do not believe anything nor hope for anything.

Suppose time does emerge from spacetime, or events, or the quantum gravitational field, or something else. Does this imply time is not real? Most scientists and philosophers of time will answer “no” for the following reasons. Scientists once were surprised to learn that heat emerges from the motion of molecules and that a molecule itself has no heat. Would it not have been a mistake to conclude from this that heat is unreal and nothing is warm? And when it became clear that baseballs are basically a collection of atoms, and so baseballs can be said to emerge from arrangements of atoms, would it not have been a mistake to say this implies baseballs no longer exist? Yes, because baseballs are real patterns of fundamental objects and events. Also, the concept of time has proven itself to be extremely useful from the small scales of quarks to the large scale of the cosmos, so most experts argue that time is real at least at all those scales. There is some speculation in the physics community that as one investigates nature at smaller and smaller scales below the Planck scale, the concept of time will become less applicable to reality, but few draw the conclusion from this that time is not real at any scale. The compatibility of time’s not existing somewhere below, say, the Planck scale to its existing above that scale is somewhat analogous to free will’s not existing at the scale of the activity of human cells to its existing at the macroscopic scale of human activity.

ii. Because Time is Subjective

Psychological time is clearly subjective, but the focus now is on physical time. Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective? Well, first what does subjective mean? This is a notoriously controversial term in philosophy. Here it means that a phenomenon is subjective if it is a mind-dependent phenomenon, something that depends upon being represented by a mind. A secondary quality such as being red is a subjective quality, but being capable of reflecting the light of a certain wavelength is not subjective. The same point can be made by asking whether time comes just from us or instead is wholly out there in the external world independent of us. Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? If so, time is not objective, and so is not objectively real.

Aristotle envisioned time to be a counting of motions (Physics, IV.ch11.219b2), but he also asked the question of whether the existence of time requires the existence of mind. He does not answer his own question because he says it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements to be numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, clearly adopted a subjectivist position regarding time, and said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality.

Several variants of idealism have implied that time is not real. Kant’s idealism implies objective time,  the time of things-in-themselves, if there even are such things, is unknowable, and so is in that sense unreal. The post-Kantian German idealists (Fichte, Schelling, Hegel) argued that the problem isn’t that time is unknowable but that all reality is based wholly upon minds, so objective time is unreal. It cannot be a feature of, or part of, reality.

Here are some comments against the above arguments and for the reality of objective time. Notice that a clock can tick in synchrony with other clocks even when no one is paying attention to the clocks. Second, notice how useful the concept of time is in making such good sense of our evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events. Consider succession. This is the order of events in time. If judgments of time order were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the temporal ordering of so many pairs of events: birth before death, the acorn sprouts before oak tree appears, houses are built before they are painted. W. V. O. Quine might add that the character of the objective world with all its patterns is a theoretical entity in a grand inference to the best explanation of the data of our experiences, and the result of this inference tells us that the world is an entity containing an objective time, a time that gets detected by us mentally as psychological time and gets detected by our clocks as physical time.

iii. Because Time is Merely Conventional or Only a Mathematical Construct

One might argue that time is not real because the concept of time is just a mathematical artifact in our fundamental theories of mathematical physics. It is merely playing an auxiliary mathematical role. Similarly, the infinite curvature of space at the center of a black hole is generally considered to be merely an artifact of the mathematics used by the general theory of relativity but not to exist in reality.

Or one might argue as follows. Philosophers generally agree that humans invented the concept of time, but some philosophers argue that time itself is invented. It was created as a useful convention, like when we decided to use certain coin-shaped metal objects as money. Money is culturally real but not objectively real because it would disappear if human culture were to disappear, even if the coin-shaped objects were not to disappear. Money and gold both exist, but money’s existence depends upon social relations and conventions that gold’s existence does not depend upon. Is time’s existence more like money than gold in that regard?

Although it would be inconvenient to do so, our society could eliminate money and return to barter transactions. Analogously, Callender asks us to consider the question, “Who Needs Time Anyway?”

Time is a way to describe the pace of motion or change, such as the speed of a light wave, how fast a heart beats, or how frequently a planet spins…but these processes could be related directly to one another without making reference to time. Earth: 108,000 beats per rotation. Light: 240,000 kilometers per beat. Thus, some physicists argue that time is a common currency, making the world easier to describe but having no independent existence (Callender 2010, p. 63).

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we have invented for our convenience. He said possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, so he recommended the convention of adopting whatever concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Nevertheless, he said, time is otherwise wholly conventional, not objective.

There are two primary reasons to believe time is not merely conventional: First, there are so many one-way processes in nature. For example, mixing cold milk into hot, black coffee produces lukewarm, brown coffee, but agitations of lukewarm, brown coffee have never turned it back into hot black coffee with cool milk. The process goes only one way in time.

Second, our universe has so many periodic processes whose periods are constant multiples of each other over time. That is, their periods keep the same constant ratio to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis relative to the “fixed” stars is a constant multiple of the frequency of swings of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half-life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a vibrating quartz crystal, which in turn is a constant multiple of the frequency of a light beam emitted from a specific kind of atomic process used in an atomic clock. The relationships do not change as time goes by—at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it. The existence of these sorts of constant time relationships—which cannot be changed by convention—makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is some convention-free, natural kind of entity that we are referring to with the time-variable in those physical laws—despite the fact that time is very abstract and not something we can see, taste, or touch.

iv. Because Time is Defined Inconsistently

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Parmenides, Zeno, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart said time is not real.

Plato’s classical interpretation of Zeno’s paradoxes is that they demonstrate the unreality of any motion or any other change. Assuming the existence of time requires the existence of change, then Zeno’s paradoxes also overturn Greek common sense that time exists.

The early 20th-century English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart believed he had a convincing argument for why a single event can acquire the properties of being a future event, a present event, and also a past event, and that since these are contrary properties, our concept of time is inconsistent. It follows for McTaggart that time is not real.

The early 20th-century absolute-idealist philosopher F.H. Bradley claimed, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance…. The problem of change defies solution.”

Regarding the inconsistencies in our concept of time that Zeno, McTaggart, Bradley, and others claim to have revealed, most philosophers of time say that there is no inconsistency, and that the complaints can be handled by clarification or by revising the relevant concepts. For example, Zeno’s paradoxes were solved by requiring time to be a linear continuum like a segment of the real number line. This solution was very fruitful and not ad hoc.  It would be unfair to call it a change of subject.

v. Because Scientific Time is Too Unlike Ordinary Time

If you believe that for time to exist it needs to have certain features of the commonsense image of time, but you believe that science implies time does not have those features, you might be tempted to conclude that science has really discovered that time does not exist. In the mid 20th century the logician Kurt Gödel argued for the unreality of time as described by contemporary physical science because the equations of the general theory of relativity allow for physically possible universes in which all events precede themselves. People can, “travel into any region of the past, present, and future and back again” (Gödel, 1959, pp. 560-1). It should not even be possible for time to be circular or symmetric like this, Gödel believed, so, he concluded that, if we suppose time is the time described by relativity theory, then time is not real.

Regarding the claim that our commonsense understanding of time by science is not treated fairly by the science of time, there is no consensus about which particular features of commonsense time cannot be rejected, although not all can be or else we would be changing the subject and not talking about time. But science has not required us to reject our belief that some events happen in time before other events, nor has science required us to reject our belief that some events last for a while. Gödel’s complaint about relativity theory’s allowing for circular time has been treated by the majority of physicists and philosophers of time by saying he should accept that time might possibly be circular even though as a contingent matter it is not circular in our universe, and he needs to revise his intuitions about what is essential to the concept.

vi. Conclusion

The word time refers to a real, existing entity because it is so helpful for explaining, understanding, and predicting so many phenomena above the Planck scale, plus there do not exist alternative, better ways of doing this. It is still an open question among physicists and philosophers as to the applicability of the concept below the Planck scale, the so-called ultramicroscopic scale. The presumption in the remainder of this article is that the concept of time is objective rather than subjective, that it is not primarily conventional or a mathematical artifact [except that any particular splitting of spacetime into a time part and a space part is conventional], that any inconsistency in time’s description or definition is merely apparent (or is not essential and can be eliminated), and that time is real even if it were discovered that it is emergent from the ultramicroscopic scale.

11. Time Travel

Would you like to travel to the future and read about the history of your great-grandchildren? You can do it. Nothing in principle is stopping you except some financial difficulties and a better-engineered spaceship that can survive occasional collisions with rocks and dust in space. Would you like to travel, instead, to the past? You may have regrets and wish to make some changes. Unfortunately, travel to your own past is not as easy as travel to someone else’s future. It is much easier to visit your descendants than your ancestors.

The term time travel has now become a technical term. For starters, it means travel in physical time, not psychological time. You do not time travel if you merely dream of living in the past, although neuroscientists commonly do call this “mental time travel.” You do not time travel for five minutes simply by being alive for five minutes. You do not time travel by crossing a time zone, nor do you travel in time by having your body frozen, then thawed later, even if this does extend your lifetime.

Time travel to the future presupposes the metaphysical theory of eternalism because, if you travel to the future, there must be a future that you travel to. Presentism and the growing-past theory deny the existence of this future.

In 1976, the Princeton University metaphysician David Lewis offered this technical definition of time travel:

In any case of physical time travel, the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

The implication from this definition is that time travel occurs when correct clocks get out of synchronization. If you are the traveler, your personal time (technically called your proper time) is shown on the clock that travels with you. A person not taking the journey is said to be measuring external time. This external time could be their proper time, or it could be the proper time of our civilization’s standard clock.

Lewis’s definition is widely accepted, although it has been criticized occasionally in the philosophical literature. The definition has no implications about whether, if you travel forward in external time to the year 2376 or backward to 1776, you can suddenly pop into existence then as opposed to having traveled continuously during the intervening years. Continuity is required by scientific theory, but discontinuous travel is more popular in fictional books and films.

a. To the Future

Time travel to the future occurs very frequently, and it has been observed and carefully measured by scientists. Time travel to the past is much more controversial, and experts disagree with each other about whether it is even physically possible. Relativity theory implies there are two different kinds of time travel to the future: (1) two clocks becoming out of synchrony due to their moving relative to each other, and (2) two clocks becoming out of synchrony due to their encountering different gravitational forces.

When you travel to the future, you eventually arrive at some future event having taken less time on your clock than the non-travelers do on their clocks. To them, you zipped through time; to you, they were sluggish. It is all relative. You might travel to the future in the sense that you participate in an event ten years in their future, having taken only two years according to your own clock. That would be an eight-year leap forward in time. You can be continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage to that event. However, the astronomers on Earth would notice that you turned the pages in your monthly calendar very slowly. The rate of ticking of your clock would differ from that of their clock during the flight. Reversing your velocity and traveling back to the place you began the trip will not undo this effect.

If you do travel to the future, that is, their future,  then you never get biologically younger; you simply age more slowly than those who do not travel with you. So, it is not possible to travel into the future and learn about your own death.

Any motion produces time travel to the future, relative to the clocks of those who do not move. That is why you can legitimately advertise any bicycle as being a time machine. The faster you go the sooner you get to the part of the future you desire but the more easily the dust and other particles in space will slice through your body during the trip.

The second kind of future time travel is due, not to a speed difference between two clocks, but to a difference in the strength of the gravitational field on two clocks. This is called gravitational time dilation, and it is most noticeable near a source of extreme gravitation such as a black hole. If you were to leave Earth and orbit near a black hole, your friends back on Earth might view you continuously through their telescopes and, if so, would see you live in slow motion. When you returned, your clock would show that less time had expired on your clock than on their clock that remained on Earth. Similarly, in a tall building the lower-floor clocks tick more slowly than upper-floor clocks because the lower floor is in a stronger gravitational field, all other things being equal. There is no theoretical limit to how slow a clock can tick when it undergoes time dilation, but it would never tick in reverse.

Travelers to the future can participate in that future, not just view it. They can influence the future and affect it.

One philosophical controversy is whether travelers to the future also can change the future. According to David Lewis (Lewis 1976, 150), this is impossible. If it changed, then it was not really the future after all. He argued that no action changes the future, regardless of whether time travel is involved.

Suppose you were to encounter a man today who says that yesterday he lived next door to Isaac Newton in England in the year 1700, but now he has traveled to the future and met you. According to the theory of relativity, it is physically possible that he did this. Yet it is an extraordinary claim since you undoubtedly believe that sufficiently fast spaceships or access to extraordinarily high gravitational fields were not available to anyone in 1700. And it is unlikely that history books failed to mention this if it did occur. Epistemology tells us that extraordinary claims require extraordinarily good evidence, so the burden of proof is on the strange man to produce that evidence, such as a good reason how the secret of building spaceships was discovered but kept from the public in 1700 and from later historians. You also would like to be shown that his body today contains traces of the kind of atmosphere that existed back in 1700; that atmosphere is slightly different chemically from ours today. If he cannot or will not produce the evidence, then it is much more likely that he is deluded or is simply lying. Giving him a lie detector test will not be very helpful; you want to know what is true, not merely what he believes to be true.

b. To the Past

Philosophers ask, “What do we mean by travel to the past?” You do not travel to the past when you remember your youth nor when you imagine living in an earlier century. A telescope is a window into our past. If we use it to look out into space to some region R a million light-years away, we are seeing R as it was a million years ago. However, this is looking at the past, not being in the past.

Travel in time was seriously discussed in Western philosophy only after 1949 when the logician Kurt Gödel published a solution to the equations of the general theory of relativity that allows travel to the past. He discovered that relativity theory implies some very exotic distributions of matter and energy will curve spacetime enough to form loops along which, as you continue to travel forward in your own proper time, you arrive back to past events. There is no requirement that anything moves faster than the speed of light. Einstein praised the paper, but said he hoped some new physical law would be discovered that would block Gödel’s solution to the relativity equations.

So, the general theory of relativity seems to imply that travel to your past is physically possible, although a minority of experts on relativity theory do not agree that it is possible. If it is possible, then either past travel exists now or else it might be created anew by manipulation of matter and energy to create the required curvature of spacetime. There are no known examples of past time travel, and it seems to be extremely difficult to create the required, bizarre curvature.

So, when two people come up to you, and one says, “I’m from your past,” and the second says, “I’m from your future,” you know that the second person is more apt to be lying. This is because time travel to one’s own past is so much more difficult than to someone’s future. Philosophers of physics are not in agreement about how much more difficult. Some, such as Tim Maudlin, say it is so difficult that it is not physically possible, but others say it is only technologically difficult. There is agreement, though, that time travel to the past has not yet been observed.

Science must obey logic, which implies that in a single world there is consistent story of what has happened and will happen, despite the fact that novels about time travel frequently describe traveling back to remake the past and thereby to produce a new version of reality that is inconsistent with the earlier version.

At present, we are existing in the past of future people (assuming humanity does have a future), but we are not time-traveling into their past. What optimists about past time travel hope is that it is possible to travel into our own past here on Earth. This is impossible according to Newton’s physics and impossible according to Einstein’s special theory of relativity, but it may be possible according to Einstein’s general theory of relativity, although experts are not in agreement on this point despite much study of the issue. The equations are simply too complicated, even for experts. The experts also are sure that the present equations will need revision to remove the current inconsistency between the theories of relativity and quantum mechanics. Many of these experts (for example, Frank Wilczek) suggest that travel to the past is not allowed in any physically possible universe, and the closest one can come to time travel to the past is to travel to a new branch of the universe’s quantum wave function, which implies, for some experts, travelling to a parallel universe. All the experts agree that, even if the equations do allow some possible universes to contain travel to one’s own past in our universe via the creation of a time machine, they do now allow travel to a time before the creation of the first time machine.

Shortly after Einstein published his general theory of relativity, the physicist Hermann Weyl predicted that the theory allows time travel to the past. However, his claim was not studied carefully until Kurt Gödel’s work on relativity in 1949. Gödel claimed his work demonstrated time travel must exist in a certain universe having a non-zero total angular momentum. Gödel was able to convince Einstein of this, but experts on relativity are not in agreement on whether Einstein should have been convinced. Opponents of Gödel say he discovered a mathematical curiosity, not a physical possibility. Still others say that, even if relativity does allow travel to the past, the theory should be revised to prevent this. Other opponents of the possibility of time travel to the past hope that an ad hoc restriction is not needed and instead that relativity theory will be understood more clearly so it can be seen that it does rule out past time travel. Still other opponents of time travel to the past hope an as yet unknown physical law will be discovered that rules out travel to the past. However, defenders of time travel say we should bite the bullet, accept that relativity allows time travel in some kinds of universes that have special curvatures, and trust the implications of relativity, but just assume that so far we probably do not live in a universe with the kind of curvature that is required.

Here is a pessimistic remark about time travel from J.J.C. Smart in The Journal of Philosophy in 1963:

Suppose it is agreed that I did not exist a hundred years ago. It is a contradiction to suppose that I can make a machine that will take me to a hundred years ago. Quite clearly no time machine can make it be that I both did and did not exist a hundred years ago.

Smart’s critics accuse him of the fallacy of begging the question. They wonder why he should demand that it be agreed that “I did not exist a hundred years ago.”

If general relativity does allow a universe that contains time travel to the past, this universe must contain a very special distribution of matter-energy. For an illustration of the simplest universe allowing backward time travel (in a one-dimensional space) and not being obviously inconsistent with general relativity, imagine a Minkowski two-dimensional spacetime diagram written on a square sheet of paper, with the one space dimension represented as going left and right on the page. Each point on the page represents a possible two-dimensional event. The time dimension points up and down the page, at right angles to the space dimension. The origin is at the center of the page. Now curve (bend) the page into a horizontal cylinder, parallel to the space axis so that the future meets the past. In the universe illustrated by that graph, any stationary object that persists long enough arrives into its past and becomes its earlier self. Its worldline is (topologically equivalent to) a circle; more technically, it is a closed time-like curve that is a circle. A closed curve has no end points. This cylindrical universe allows an event to occur both earlier and later than itself, so its time is not asymmetric. The curvature of this universe is what mathematicians call extrinsic curvature. There is no intrinsic curvature, however. Informally expressed, extrinsic curvature is curvature detectable only from a higher dimension, but intrinsic curvature can be detected by a being who lives within the space, say by noticing a failure of the Pythagorean Theorem somewhere. When the flat, square sheet is rolled into a tube, the intrinsic geometry does not change; only the extrinsic geometry changes.

Regardless of how space is curved and what sort of time travel occurs, if any past time travel does occur, the traveler apparently is never able to erase facts or otherwise change the past. That is the point of saying, “whatever happened, happened.” But that metaphysical position has been challenged. It assumes there is only one past and that whatever was the case will always have been the case. These assumptions, though widely accepted, occasionally have been challenged in the philosophical literature. They were challenged in the 11th century by Peter Damian who said God could change the past.

Assuming Damian is mistaken, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, some philosophers argue that for reasons of logical consistency, if you go back in time and try to kill your grandfather by shooting him before he conceived a child, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You will fail because you have failed. But nothing prevents your trying to kill him. There is no free will problem.

The impossibility of killing your grandfather seems to raise a problem about free will. If you are free to shoot and kill people before you step into a time machine, then presumably you are free to shoot and kill people after you step out. So, is there a paradox because you both can and cannot shoot and kill your grandfather?

Assuming you cannot shoot and kill your grandfather because you did not, many philosophers argue that in this situation you do not really have freedom in the libertarian sense of that term. To resolve this puzzle, the metaphysician David Lewis said you can in one sense kill your grandfather but cannot in another sense. You can, relative to a set of facts that does not include the fact that your grandfather survived to have children. You cannot, relative to a set of facts that does include this fact. However, Lewis said there is no sense in which you both can and cannot. So, the meaning of the word can is sensitive to context. The metaphysician Donald C. Williams disagreed, and argued that we always need to make our can-statement relative to all the available facts. Lewis is saying you can and can’t, but in different senses, and you can but won’t. Williams is saying simply that you can’t, so you won’t.

If you step into a time machine that projects you into the past, then you can expect to step out into a new place because time travel normally involves motion. There is an ongoing philosophical dispute about whether, in a real closed time-like curve, a person would travel to exactly an earlier event or, instead, only to a nearby event. One suggested reason for restricting the time-like curve to only nearby events is that, if one went back to the same event, one would bump into oneself, and this would happen over and over again, and there would be too many copies of oneself existing in the same place.

If it is logically inconsistent to build a new time machine to travel back to a time before the first time machine was invented, then there is no hope of creating the first time machine in order to visit the time of the dinosaurs.

In 1988 in an influential physics journal, Kip Thorne and colleagues described the first example of how to build a time machine in a world that has never had one: “[I]f the laws of physics permit traversable wormholes, then they probably also permit such a wormhole to be transformed into a “time machine….” (Morris 1988, p. 1446).

A wormhole is a second route between two places; perhaps it is a shortcut tunnel to a faraway place. Just as two clocks get out of synchrony if one moves relative to the other, a clock near a rapidly moving mouth of a wormhole could get out of synch with a clock at the other, stationary mouth. In principle a person could plunge into one hole and come out at an earlier time. Wormholes were first conceived by Einstein and Rosen, and later were named wormholes by John Wheeler.

Experts opposed to traversable wormholes have less of a problem with there being wormholes than with them being traversable. Although Thorne himself believes that traversable wormholes probably do not exist naturally, he also believes they might in principle be created by a more advanced civilization. However, Thorne also believes the short tunnel or “throat” between the two mouths of the wormhole probably would quickly collapse before anything of macroscopic size could use the wormhole to travel back in time. There has been speculation by physicists that an advanced civilization could manipulate negative gravitational energy with its positive pressure to keep the hole from collapsing long enough to create the universe’s first non-microscopic time machine.

It is a very interesting philosophical project to decide whether wormhole time travel, or any other time travel to the past, produces paradoxes of identity. For example, can a person travel back and be born again?

To solve the paradoxes of personal identity due to time travel’s inconsistency with commonly held assumptions about personal identity, many philosophers recommend rejecting the endurance theory which implies a person exists wholly at a single instant, for any instant of their life. They recommend accepting the perdurance theory in which a person exists as a four-dimensional entity extending in time from birth to death. The person is their spacetime “worm.” If the person were envisioned to be a point particle whose worm is a one-dimensional curve, then worms of this sort can live partly in wormholes and become closed time-like curves in spacetime.

Let us elaborate on this radical scenario. A closed time-like curve has implications for causality. The curve would be a causal loop. Causal loops lead to backward causation in which an effect can occur before its cause. Causal loops occur when there is a continuous sequence of events e1, e2, e3, …. in which each member is a cause of its numerical successor and, in addition, for some integer n, en causes e1. The philosopher Milič Čapek has cautioned that with a causal loop, “we would be clearly on the brink of magic.” Other philosophers of time are more willing to accept the possibility of causal loops, strange though they would be. These loops would be a fountain of youth. When you go around the loop, you travel back to a time when you were younger, or perhaps even to your birth. Accepting this possibility, Arthur C. Clarke is noted for saying, “Any sufficiently advanced technology is indistinguishable from magic.”

Most time travel stories in literature involve contradictions, either logical contradictions or inconsistency with accepted laws of physics. The most famous one that appears not to is Robert Heinlein’s story “All You Zombies.” It shows how someone could be both their father and mother, provided relativity theory does allow backward time travel.

For a detailed review of the philosophical literature on backward time travel and the resulting paradoxes of causality and of personal identity, see (Wasserman, 2018, ch. 5) and (Fisher, 2015).

Inspired by an idea from John Wheeler, Richard Feynman suggested that a way to interpret the theory of quantum electrodynamics about interactions dominated by electromagnetic and weak forces is that an antimatter particle is really a matter particle traveling backward in time. For example, the positively charged positron moving forward in time is really a negatively charged electron moving backward in time.

Feynman U.S. postage stamp
US Postal Museum

This phenomenon is pictured in the two diagrams on the left of the above postage stamp, where the positron e+ is moving downward or backward in time. Feynman diagrams picture a short sequence of elementary interactions among particles. Feynman speculated that the reason why every electron has exactly the same properties as any other, unlike identical brooms manufactured in a broom factory, is that there is only one electron in the universe and it exists simultaneously at a great many places, thanks to backward time travel.

All empirical searches attempting to observe a particle moving backward in time have failed. So, the majority of physicists in the 21st century see no need to accept backward time travel despite Feynman’s successful representations of quantum electrodynamics. See (Muller 2016a, p. 246, 296-7) and (Arntzenius & Greaves 2009) for critical comment on this. Nevertheless, some well-respected physicists such as Neil Turok do accept Feynman-style backward time travel. The philosopher Huw Price added that the Feynman “zigzag is not there in standard QM, so if we put it in, we are accepting that QM is incomplete. (The zigzag needs hidden variables, in other words)” in order to determine when to zig and when to zag. At the heart of this dispute about whether to believe antimatter is regular matter traveling backward in time, physicists are very cautious because they realize that the more extraordinary the claim, the more extraordinarily good the evidence should be in support of the claim.

Here are a variety of very brief philosophical arguments against travel to the past:

  1. If travel to the past were possible, you could go back in time and kill your grandfather before he met your grandmother, but then you would not be born and so could not go back in time and kill your grandfather. That is a logical contradiction. So, travel to the past is impossible.
  2. Like the future, the past is also not real, so time travel to the past or the future is not real either.
  3. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has ever encountered any time travelers.
  4. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is metaphysically impossible.
  5. If you were to go back to the past, then you would have been fated to go back because you already did, and this rules out your freedom to go back or not. Yet you do have this freedom, so travel to the past is impossible.
  6. If past time travel were possible, then you could die before you were born, which is biologically impossible.
  7. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  8. If travel to the past were possible, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always fail in their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since investigators have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there probably cannot be time travel.
  9. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. You in the 22nd century buy a copy of Darwin’s book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. You enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? You got the knowledge from Darwin, but Darwin got the knowledge from you. This is free information. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel is not really possible.
  10. Travel to the past allows you to return to have intercourse with one of your parents, causing your birth. You would have the same fingerprints as one of your parents, which is biologically impossible.
  11. If past time travel is possible, then it should be possible for a rocket ship to carry a time machine capable of launching a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past which might eventually reunite with the mother ship. The mother ship is programmed to launch the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the return or impending arrival of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the mother ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, not metaphysically possible, not physically possible, not technologically possible, not biologically possible, and not probable.

Counters to all of these arguments have been suggested by advocates of time travel. One response to the Grandfather Paradox of item 1 says you would kill your grandfather but then be in an alternative universe to the actual one where you did not kill him. This response is not liked by most proponents of time travel; they say traveling to an alternative universe is not what they mean by time travel.

Item 2 is the argument from presentism.

One response to item 3, the Enrico Fermi Paradox, is that perhaps we have seen no time travelers because we live in a boring era of little interest to time travelers. A better response is that perhaps the first time machine has never been built, and it is known that a time machine cannot be used to go back to a time before the first time machine exists (or closed time-like curve exists).

Item 9, the paradox of free information, has gotten considerable attention in the philosophical literature. In 1976, David Lewis said this:

But where did the information come from in the first place? Why did the whole affair happen? There is simply no answer. The parts of the loop are explicable, the whole of it is not. Strange! But not impossible, and not too different from inexplicabilities we are already inured to. Almost everyone agrees that God, or the Big Bang, or the entire infinite past of the Universe, or the decay of a tritium atom, is uncaused and inexplicable. Then if these are possible, why not also the inexplicable causal loops that arise in time travel?

Einstein and Rosen suggested that the laws of general relativity might allow traversable, macroscopic wormholes. A wormhole is a tunnel connecting two distant regions of space, and a traversable wormhole allows travel from one hole to the other. The tunnel would be a shortcut between two distant galaxies, and it is analogous to a path taken by a worm who has eaten its way to the opposite side of an apple’s surface without taking the longer path using only the apple’s surface. That is why John Wheeler coined the name “wormhole.” Think of a wormhole as two spheres connected by a tunnel.

The hole is highly curved spacetime, and from the outside it looks like a sphere in 3D-space. It is not quite a black hole, so it has no event horizon. There is no consensus among theoretical physicists whether general relativity permits the existence of a wormhole. Assuming it does, and assuming one of the spheres could be controlled and forced to move very fast back and forth, then with two connected spheres situated in separate galaxies, a particle or person could enter one at some time, then exit the other at an earlier time, having traveled, say, just a few meters through the tunnel. Because of this implication for time, some physicists argue that if these traversable wormholes are allowed by general relativity, then the theory needs to be revised to disallow them.

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.” For some arguments in the philosophy literature against the possibility of a person travelling back to a time at which the person previously existed, see (Horwich 1975), (Grey 1999), and (Sider 2001).

12. McTaggart’s A-Theory and B-Theory

In 1908, the English philosopher J.M.E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time. The two ways are different, but the two orderings are the same. Here is how he re-states his kernel idea:

For the sake of brevity, I shall give the name of the A series to that series of positions which runs from the far past through the near past to the present, and then from the present through the near future to the far future, or conversely. The series of positions which runs from earlier to later, or conversely, I shall call the B series. (McTaggart 1927, 10)

When McTaggart uses the word series, he means what mathematicians call a sequence, but the literature in philosophy often follows McTaggart on this point. Below is a graphic representation of McTaggart’s ordering, in which point event c happens later than point events a and b:


McTaggart is making several assumptions here. First, he does not believe time is real, so his remark that the A-series and B-series mark out positions in time is only on the assumption that time is real, despite what he, himself, believes. Another assumption is that longer-lasting events are composed of their point events. Also, there are a great many other events that are located within the series at event a‘s location, namely all the other events that are simultaneous with event a.

Using the standard time diagram with time increasing to the right along a horizontal line, event a in McTaggart’s B-series (see picture above) is ordered to the left of event b because a happens before b. But when ordering the same two events into McTaggart’s A-series, event a is ordered to the left of b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b, or, equivalently, has more pastness than b. The A-series locates each event relative to the present; the B-series is created with no attention paid to the present, but only to what occurs before what.

Suppose that event c occurs in our present and after events a and b. Although the philosophical literature is not in agreement, it is usually said that the information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series itself, but is used to create the A-series. That information of c‘s being in the present tells us to place c to the right of b because all present events are without pastness; they are not in the past. Someone constructing the B-series places event c to the right of b for a different reason, just that c happens after b.

McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical, but he also believed the A-properties (such as being past and being two weeks past) are essential to our concept of time. So, for this reason, he believed our current concept of time is paradoxical and incoherent. This reasoning is called McTaggart’s Paradox.

McTaggart is not an especially clear writer, so his remarks can be interpreted in different ways, and the reader needs to work hard to make sense of them. Consider McTaggart’s Paradox. Regarding one specific event, say the event when:

Socrates speaks to Plato for the first time.

This speaking to Plato is in the past, at least it is in our past, though not in the past of Egyptian King Tut during his lifetime, so the speaking is past in our present. Nevertheless, back in our past, there is a time when the event is present. From this, McTaggart concludes both that the event is past and that the event is present, from which he declares that the A-series is contradictory and so paradoxical. If that reasoning is correct (and it has been challenged by many), and if the A-series is essential to time, then time itself must be unreal. This piece of reasoning is commonly called “McTaggart’s Paradox.”

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of:

  • A-series and B-series
  • A-theorist and B-theorist
  • A-facts and B-facts
  • A-terms and B-terms
  • A-properties and B-properties
  • A-predicates and B-predicates
  • A-propositions and B-propositions
  • A-sentences and B-sentences
  • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples of using this terminology. Unlike the A-series terms, the B-series terms are relational terms because a B-term refers to a property that relates a pair of events. Some of these properties are: is earlier than, happens twenty-three minutes after, and is simultaneous with. An A-theory term, on the other hand, refers to a single event, not a pair of events. Some of these properties are: in the near future, happened twenty-three minutes ago, and is present. The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties.

The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago will not be a fact for long. B-theorists do not like facts going in and out of existence, but this is acceptable to A-theorists. Similarly, if we turn from fact-talk to statement-talk, the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago, if true, will soon become false. B-facts are eternal. For example, the statement “The snowfall occurred an hour before this act of utterance” will, if true, be true at all times, provided the indexical phrase the snowfall does not change its reference.

The A-theory usually implies A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist, at least a B-theorist who believes in the existence of facts, appeals instead to B-facts. According to a classical B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says, “It began snowing an hour ago,” what really makes it true is not that the snowing has an hour of pastness (so the fact is tensed) but that the event of uttering the sentence occurs an hour after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that occurs an hour after is a B-term that is supposed to be logically tenseless and to be analogous to the mathematical term numerically less than even though when expressed in English it must use the present tense of the verb to occur.

When you like an event, say yesterday’s snowfall, then change your mind and dislike the event, what sort of change of the event is that? Well, this change in attitude is not a change that is intrinsic to the event itself. It is extrinsic.  When your attitude changes, the snowfall itself undergoes no intrinsic change, only a change in its relationship to you. (A-theorists and B-theorists do not disagree about this.) This illustrates what is meant by intrinsic when A-theorists promote the intrinsic properties of an event, such as the snowfall having the intrinsic property of being in the past. B-theorists analyze the snowfall event differently, saying that more fundamentally the event is not in the past but is in the past relative to us. “Being in the past,” they say, is not intrinsic but rather is relational.

Members of the A-camp and B-camp recognize that ordinary speakers are not careful in their use of A and B terminology; but, when the terminology is used carefully, each believes their camp’s terminology can best explain ordinary speech involving time and also the terminology of the other camp.

Many A-theorists promote becoming. The term means a change in the A-series position of an event, such as a change in its degree of pastness. The B-theorist philosopher Adolf Grünbaum believes becoming is mind-dependent, and he points to the following initial quotation from J. J. C. Smart in opposition to the A-theory:

“If past, present, and future were real properties of events [i.e., properties possessed by physical events independently of being perceived], then it would require [non-trivial] explanation that an event which becomes present [i.e., qualifies as occurring now] in 1965 becomes present [now] at that date and not at some other (and this would have to be an explanation over and above the explanation of why an event of this sort occurred in 1965)” (says Smart). It would, of course, be a complete trivialization of the thesis of the mind-independence of becoming to reply that by definition an event occurring at a certain clock time t has the unanalyzable attribute of nowness at time t (Grünbaum 1971, p. 218).

Grünbaum is implying that it is appropriate to ask regarding the event of her house falling down in 1965, “Why now instead of some other date?” He believes that it would be an appropriate explanation to appeal to mind-independent soil conditions and weather patterns, but that it would be trivial and inadequate to say instead that the event occurs now because by definition it had at that time the unanalyzable attribute of nowness. And, more generally, says Grünbaum, temporal becoming has no appropriate place within physical theory.

Beginning with Bertrand Russell in 1903, many B-theorists have argued that there are no irreducible one-place A-qualities (such as the monadic property of being past) because the qualities can all be reduced to, and adequately explained in terms of, two-place B-relations. The A-theorist disagrees. For example, the claim that it is after midnight might be explained, says the B-theorist, by saying midnight occurs before the time of this assertion. Before is a two-place relationship, a binary relation. The A-theorist claims this is a faulty explanation.

Is the A-theory or is the B-theory the correct theory of reality? This is a philosophically controversial issue. To clarify the issue, let us re-state the two theories. The A-theory has two especially central theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory:

(1) Time is fundamentally constituted by an A-series in which any event’s being in the past (or in the present or in the future or twenty-three seconds in the past) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself.

(2) Events change.

In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes…. But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is usually called second-order change or McTaggartian change. For McTaggart, second-order change is the only genuine change, whereas a B-theorist such as Russell says this is not genuine change. Genuine change is intrinsic change, he would say. Just as there is no intrinsic change in a house due to your walking farther away from it, so there is no intrinsic change in an event as it supposedly “moves” farther into the past.

In response to Russell, McTaggart said:

No, Russell, no. What you identify as “change” isn’t change at all. The “B-series world” you think is the real world is…a world without becoming, a world in which nothing happens.

A world with becoming is a world in which events change and time flows. “It is difficult to see how we could construct the A series given only the B series, whereas given the former we can readily construct the latter,” says G.J. Whitrow in defense of the A theory.

The B-theory conflicts with two central theses of the A-theory. According to the B-theory,

(1′) Time is fundamentally constituted by a B-series, and the temporal properties of being in the past (or in the present or in the future) are fundamentally relational, not monadic.

(2′) Events do not change.

To re-examine this dispute, because there is much misunderstanding about what is being disputed, let us ask again what B-theorists mean by calling temporal properties relational. They mean that an event’s property of occurring twenty-three minutes in the past, say, is a relation between the event and us, the subject, the speaker. When analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Scottish Queen Anne’s death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past. It is not in Aristotle’s past or King Tut’s. So, the labels, “past,” “present,” and “future” are all about us and are not intrinsic properties of events. That is  why there is no objective distinction among past, present and future, say the proponents of the B-theory. For similar reasons the B-theorist says the property of being two days in the past is not an authentic property because it is a second-order property.” The property of being two days in our past, however, is a genuine property, says the B-theorist.

Their point about A-properties being relational when properly analyzed is also made this way. The A-theory terminology about space uses the terms here, there, far, and near. These terms are essentially about the speaker, says the B-theorist. “Here” for you is not “here” for me. World War II is past for you but not for Aristotle.

The B-theorist also argues that the A-theory violates the theory of relativity because that theory implies an event can be present for one person but not for another person who is moving relative to the first person. So, being present is relative and not an intrinsic quality of the event. Being present is relative to a reference frame. And for this reason, there are as many different B-series as there are legitimate reference frames. The typical proponent of the A-series cannot accept this.

A-theorists are aware of these criticisms, and there are many counterarguments. Some influential A-theorists are A. N. Prior, E. J. Lowe, and Quentin Smith. Some influential B-theorists are Bertrand Russell, W. V. O. Quine, D. H. Mellor, and Nathan Oaklander. The A-theory is closely related to the commonsense image of time, and the B-theory is more closely related to the scientific image. Proponents of each theory shoulder a certain burden—explaining not just why the opponent’s theory is incorrect but also why it seems to be correct to the opponent.

The philosophical literature on the controversy between the A and B theories is vast. During a famous confrontation in 1922 with the philosopher and A-theorist Henri Bergson, Einstein defended his own B-theory of time and said “the time of the philosophers” is an illusion. This is an overstatement by Einstein. He meant to attack only the time of the A-theorists.

Martin Heidegger said he wrote Being and Time in 1927 as a response to the conflict between the A-theory and the B-theory.

Other than the thesis that the present is metaphysically privileged, the other principal thesis of the A-theory that distinguishes it from the B-theory is that time flows. Let us turn to this feature of the A-theory.

13. The Passage or Flow of Time

Many philosophers claim that time passes or flows. This characteristic of time has also been called a flux, a transiency of the present, a moving now, and becoming. “All is flux,” said Heraclitus. The philosopher G.J. Whitrow claimed “the passage of time…is the very essence of the concept.” Advocates of this controversial philosophical position often point out that the present keeps vanishing. And they might offer a simile and say present events seem to flow into the past, like a boat that drifts past us on the riverbank and then recedes farther and farther downstream from us. In the converse sense, the simile is that we ourselves flow into the future and leave past events ever farther behind us. Philosophers disagree with each other about how to explain the ground of these ideas. Philosopher X will say time passes or flows, but not in the sense used by philosopher Y, while philosopher Z will disagree with both of them.

There are various entangled issues regarding flow. (i) Is the flow an objective feature of physical events that exists independently of our awareness of them? (ii) What is actually flowing? (iii) What does it mean for time to flow? (iv) Are there different kinds of flow? (v) If time flows, do we experience the flow directly or indirectly? (vi) What is its rate of flow, and can the rate change? (vii) If time does not flow, then why do so many people believe it does?

There are two primary philosophical positions about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) The flow is not objectively real; it is merely subjective. This B-theory is called the static theory, mostly by its opponents because of the negative connotation of the word “static.” The A-theory is called the dynamic theory because it implies time is constantly in flux. The A-theory implies that this fact of passage obtains independently of us; it is not subjective. The letters A and B are intended to suggest an alliance with McTaggart’s A-theory and B-theory. One A-theorist describes the situation this way:

The sensation we are (perhaps wrongly) tempted to describe as the sensation of temporal motion is veridical: it somehow puts us in touch with an aspect of reality that is unrepresented in Russell’s theory of time [the original B-theory]. (van Inwagen 2015, 81)

Some B-theorists complain that the concept of passage is incoherent, or it does not apply to the real world because this would require too many revisions to the scientific worldview of time. Other B-theorists say time flows but only subjectively and that B-theory concepts can explain why we believe in the flow. One explanation that is proposed is that the flow is due to our internal comparison of our predictions of what will happen with our memories of what recently happened, and this comparison needs to be continually updated.

One B-theorist charge is that the notion of flow is the product of a faulty metaphor.  They say time exists, things change, and so we say time passes, but time itself does not change. It does not change by flowing or passing or elapsing or undergoing any motion. The present does not objectively flow because the present is not an objective feature of the world. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience. It is not that the sentences, “The present keeps vanishing” and “Time flows” are false; they are just not objective truths.

Here is another prong of a common B-theory attack on the notion of flow. The death of Queen Anne is an event that an A-theorist says is continually changing from past to farther into the past, but this change is no more of an objectively real change intrinsic to her death than saying her death changed from being approved of by Mr. Smith to being disapproved of by him. This extrinsic change in approval is not intrinsic to her death and so does not count as an objectively real change in her death.

One point J.J.C. Smart offered against the A-theory of flow was to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly, he claimed. One second divided by one second is the number one, a unit-less number, and so not an allowable rate. And what would it be like for the rate to be two seconds per second? asks Huw Price who adds that, “We might just as well say that the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter flows at pi seconds per second!” (Price 1996, p. 13).

Other philosophers of time, such as John Norton and Tim Maudlin argue that the rate of one second per second is acceptable, despite these criticisms. Paul Churchland countered that the rate is meaningful but trivial, for what other rate could it be?

There surely is some objective feature of our brains that causes us to believe there is a flow of time which we are experiencing. B-theorists say perhaps the belief is due not to time’s actually flowing but rather to the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences.

A-theorists who believe in flow have produced many dynamic theories that are closer to common sense on this topic. Here are six.

(1) The passage or flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past. Events change in their degree of futureness and degree of pastness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart’s second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change that occurs when, say, a falling leaf changes its altitude over time.

(2) A second type of dynamic theory implies time’s flow is the coming into existence of new facts, the actualization of new states of affairs. Reality grows by the addition of more facts. There need be no commitment to events changing intrinsically.

(3) A third dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate to becoming determinate in the present. Because time’s flow is believed to be due to events becoming determinate, these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as becoming.

(4) A fourth dynamic theory says, “The progression of time can be understood by assuming that the Hubble expansion takes place in four dimensions rather than in three. The flow of time consists of the continuous creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space…. Unlike the picture drawn in the classic Minkowski spacetime diagram, the future does not yet exist; we are not moving into the future, but the future is being constantly created.” (Muller 2016b).

(5) A fifth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth-values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false because it is sunny today. That is an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth-value changes are at the root of the flow.

In response to this linguistic turn of theory (5), critics of the dynamic theory suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth-value because the reference of the word now is unspecified. If the sentence cannot have a truth-value, it cannot change its truth-value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth-value, namely the associated complete sentence or eternal sentence, the sentence with its temporal indexical replaced by some date expression that refers to a specific time, and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Typical indexicals are the words: then, now, I, this, here, them. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2020, and the speaker is in San Francisco, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately associated with the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2020, in San Francisco, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, so-called complete sentences have truth-values, and these truth-values do not change with time, so they do not underlie any flow of time, according to the critic of the fifth dynamic theory.

(6) A sixth dynamic theory adds to the block-universe a traveling present. The present is somehow metaphysically privileged, and there is a moving property of being now that spotlights a new slice of the present events of the block at every new, present moment. A slice is a set of events all of which are simultaneous in the block. So, a slice of events can temporarily possess a monadic property of being now, and then lose it as a newer slice becomes spotlighted. This theory is called the moving spotlight theory. It follows that there are illuminated moments and unilluminated moments that are, respectively, real and unreal. Here is how Hermann Weyl described the spotlight theory as subjective rather than objective:

The objective world simply is, it does not happen. Only to the gaze of my consciousness crawling along the lifeline of my body, does a section of the world come to life as a fleeting image in space which continuously changes in time.

Huw Price offers a short overview of various arguments against the passage of time in (Price 1996 pages 12-16). These arguments are responded to by Tim Maudlin in (Maudlin 2002).

14. The Past, Present, and Future

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, this is asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on this ontological question of the reality of the past, present, and future. There are three leading theories, and there is controversy over the exact wording of each, and whether the true theory is metaphysically necessary or just contingently true. The three do not differ in their observational consequences as do competing scientific theories.

(1) According to the ontological theory called presentism, only present objects exist. Stated another way: if something is real, then it exists now. The past and the future are not real, so either the past tense sentence, “Dinosaurs existed” is false, or else it is true but its truth is grounded only in some present facts. A similar analysis is required for statements in the future tense. Perhaps they can be analyzed in terms of present anticipations. With that accomplished, then all the events can be linearly ordered as if the past ones occur before the present ones and the present ones occur before the future ones, when actually they do not because all real events occur in the present. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, Thomas Hobbes, Arthur Schopenhauer, A.N. Prior, and Lee Smolin are presentists. In the 17th century, Hobbes wrote, “The present only has a being in nature; things past have a being in the memory only, but things to come have no being at all, the future being but a fiction of the mind….” In 1969, Prior said of the present and the real:

They are one and the same concept, and the present simply is the real considered in relation to two particular species of unreality, namely the past and the future.

(2) Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presentists that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C.D. Broad, George Ellis, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended the growing-past theory. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see Hilary Putnam (1967, p. 244) for commentary on this issue. The growing-past theory is also called by other names: the growing-present theory, now-and-then-ism, the becoming theory, and possibilism. Members of McTaggart’s A-camp are divided on whether to accept presentism or, instead, the growing-past theory, but they agree on rejecting eternalism.

(3) Advocates of eternalism say there are no objective ontological differences among the past, present, and future, just as there is no objective ontological difference between here and there. The differences among past, present, and future are subjective, depending upon whose experience is being implicitly referred to—yours or, say, Hitler’s or Aristotle’s. An eternalist will say Adolf Hitler’s rise to power in Germany is not simply in the past, as the first two theories imply; instead, it is in the past for you, but in the future for Aristotle, and it is equally real for both of you. The past, the present, and the future exist conjointly but not simultaneously. The eternalist is committed to saying all events in spacetime are equally real; the events of the present are not ontologically privileged. The eternalist often describes the theory with a large block of all events that in classical physics can be represented with a Minkowski diagram. All moments of the block are equally real, but only at different times. The entire block of events exists, but not wholly at one time. But the block as a representation of events might exist all at once on a piece of paper in your office.  For the eternalist or block theorist, there are epistemological limitations but no ontological differences among the past, present, and future. Fr example, we can know much more about past events than future ones.

Eternalism is often called a static theory. The label “static” was once supposed to be derogatory and to indicate that the theory could not successfully deal with change, but these days the term has lost much of its negative connotations just as the initially derogatory term “big bang” in cosmology has lost its negative connotations.

Eternalism is the only one of the three metaphysical theories that permits time travel, so it is understandable that time travel was not seriously discussed in philosophy until the twentieth century when presentism began to be challenged. Bertrand Russell, J.J.C. Smart, W.V.O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and David Lewis have endorsed eternalism. Eternalism is less frequently called the tapestry theory of time. It is very difficult to speak correctly about eternalism using natural language because all natural languages are infused with presumptions about presentism. Correct descriptions of personal identity are difficult for eternalists for this reason.

Here is how one philosopher of physics briefly defends eternalism:

I believe that the past is real: there are facts about what happened in the past that are independent of the present state of the world and independent of my knowledge or beliefs about the past. I similarly believe that there is (i.e., will be) a single unique future. I know what it would be to believe that the past is unreal (i.e., nothing ever happened, everything was just created ex nihilo) and to believe that the future is unreal (i.e., all will end, I will not exist tomorrow, I have no future). I do not believe these things, and would act very differently if I did. Insofar as belief in the reality of the past and the future constitutes a belief in a ‘block universe’, I believe in a block universe. But I also believe that time passes, and see no contradiction or tension between these views (Maudlin 2002, pp. 259-260).

A and B theorists agree that it is correct to say, “The past does not exist” and to say, “Future events do not exist” if the verbs are being used in their tensed form, but argue that there should be no implications here for ontology because this is merely an interesting feature of how some languages such as English use tensed verbs. Languages need not use tenses at all, and, according to the B-theorists, a B-analysis of tense-talk can be provided when languages do use tenses.

Hermann Minkowski is the father of the block universe concept. The block theory employing this concept implies reality is correctly representable as a four-dimensional block of point-events in spacetime in some reference frame. Minkowski treated the block as a manifold of point-events upon which was placed a four-dimensional rectangular coordinate system. In the block, any two non-simultaneous events are ordered by the happens-before-or-is-simultaneous-with relation.

For a graphic presentation of the block, see a four-dimensional Minkowski diagram in a supplement to this article. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, then the block is infinite in those directions in time. If space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along the spatial dimensions. If it were learned that space is nine-dimensional rather than three-dimensional, then block theorists would promote a ten-dimensional block rather than a four-dimensional block.

To get a sense of why the block is philosophically controversial, note that in his book The Future, the Oxford philosopher John Lucas said,

The block universe gives a deeply inadequate view of time. It fails to account for the passage of time, the pre-eminence of the present, the directedness of time, and the difference between the future and the past.

G. J. Whitrow complains that “the theory of the block universe…implies that past (and future) events co-exist with those that are present.” This is a contradiction, he believes. Whitrow’s point can be made metaphorically this way: The mistake of the B-theorist is to envision the future as unfolding, as if it has been waiting in the wings for its cue to appear on the present stage—which is absurd.

Motion in the real world is, of course, dynamic, but its historical record, such as its record or worldline within the block, is static. That is, any motion’s mathematical representation is static in the sense of being timeless. The block theory has been accused by A-theorists of spatializing time and geometricizing time, which arguably it does. The philosophical debate is whether this is a mistake. Some B-theorists complain that, by very act of labeling the static view as being static is implying mistakenly that there is a time dimension in which the block is not changing but should. The block describes change but does not itself change, say B-theorists. The A-theorist’s complaint, according to the B-theorist, is like complaining that a printed musical score is faulty because it is static, while real music is vibrant. The complaint is implying a video file does not represent anything happening because the file just sits there statically.

For the eternalist and block-theorist, the block that is created using one reference frame is no more distinguished than the block that is created using another frame allowed by the laws of science. Any chosen reference will have its own definite past, present, and future. The majority of physicists accept this block theory, which could be called the mild block theory. Metaphysicians also argue over whether reality itself is a static block, rather than just being representable as a static block. These metaphysicians are promoting a strong block theory. Some theorists complain that this strong block theory is confusing the representation with what is represented. See (Smolin 2013, pp. 25-36) for an elaboration of the point.

Some proponents of the growing-past theory have adopted a growing-block theory. They say the block is ever-growing, and the present is the leading edge between reality and the unreal future. Some philosophers express that point by saying the present is the edge of all becoming. The advocates of the growing-block usually agree with the eternalists that what makes the sentence, “Dinosaurs once existed,” be true is that there is a past region of the block in which dinosaurs do exist.

All three ontologies (namely, presentism, the growing-past, and eternalism) imply that, at the present moment, we only ever experience a part of the present and that we do not have direct access to the past or the future. They all agree that nothing exists now that is not present, and all three need to explain how and why there is an important difference between never existing (such as Santa Claus) and not existing now (such as Abraham Lincoln). Members of all three camps will understand an ordinary speaker who says, “There will be a storm tomorrow so it’s good that we fixed the roof last week,” but they will provide different treatments of this remark at a metaphysical level.

Most eternalists accept the B-theory of time. Presentists and advocates of the growing-past tend to accept the A-theory of time. Let us take a closer look at presentism.

One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated in 1865? Speaking technically, we are asking what are the truthmakers of the true sentences and the falsemakers of the false sentences. Many presentists say past-tensed truths lack truthmakers in the past but are nevertheless true because their truthmakers are in the present. They say what makes a tensed proposition true are only features of the present way that things are, perhaps traces of the past in pages of present books and in our memories. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist and the growing-past theorist believe this is to say something true of a real Abraham Lincoln who is not present. The block theorist and the growing-block theorist might add that Lincoln is real but far away from us along the time dimension just as the Moon is real but far away from us along a spatial dimension. “Why not treat these distant realities in the same manner?” they argue.

A related issue for the presentist is how to account for causation, for how April showers bring May flowers. Presentists believe in processes, but can they account for the process of a cause producing an effect without both the cause and the effect being real at different times?

Presentism and the growing-past theory need to account for the Theory of Relativity’s treatment of the present, or else criticize the theory. Relativity implies there is no common global present, but only different presents for each of us. Relativity theory allows event a to be simultaneous with event b in one reference frame, while allowing b to be simultaneous with event c in some other reference frame, even though a and c are not simultaneous in either frame. Nevertheless, if a is real, then is c not also real? But neither presentism nor the growing-past theory can allow c to be real. This argument against presentism and the growing-past theory presupposes the transitivity of co-existence.

Despite this criticism, (Stein 1991) says presentism can be retained by rejecting transitivity and saying what is present and thus real is different depending on your spacetime location. The implication is that, for event a, the only events that are real are those with a zero spacetime interval from a. Many of Stein’s opponents, including his fellow presentists, do not like this implication.

Eternalists very often adopt the block-universe theory. This implies our universe is the set of all the point-events with their actual properties. The block is representable with a Minkowski diagram in the regions where spacetime does not curve and where nature obeys the laws of special relativity.

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past theory usually will unite in opposition to eternalism for these five reasons: (i) The present is so much more vivid than the future. (ii) Eternalism misses the special open and changeable character of the future. In the classical block-universe theory promoted by most eternalists, there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already; but that denies our ability to affect the future, and it is known that we do have this ability. (iii) A present event moves in the sense that it is no longer present a moment later, having lost its property of presentness, but eternalism disallows this movement. (iv) Future events do not exist and so do not stand in relationships of before and after, but eternalism accepts these relationships. (v) Future-tensed statements that are contingent, such as “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” do not have existing truthmakers and so are neither true nor false, yet most eternalists mistakenly believe all these statements do have truth values now.

Defenders of eternalism and the block-universe offer a variety of responses to these criticisms. For instance, regarding (i), they are likely to say the vividness of here does not imply the unreality of there, so why should the vividness of now imply the unreality of then? Regarding (ii) and the openness of the future, the block theory allows a closed future and the absence of libertarian free will, but it does not require this. Eventually, there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block that has not happened yet.

“Do we all not fear impending doom?” an eternalist might ask. But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the future doom is known not to exist, as these two kinds of theorists evidently believe? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future danger and past danger be so mysterious, says the eternalist. In 1981, J.J.C. Smart, a proponent of the block-universe, asked us to:

conceive of a soldier in the twenty-first century…cold, miserable and suffering from dysentery, and being told that some twentieth-century philosophers and non-philosophers had held that the future was unreal. He might have some choice things to say.

All observation is of the past. If you look at the North Star, you see it as it was, not as it is, because it takes so many years for the light to reach your eyes, about 434 years. The North Star might have burned out several years ago. If so, then you are seeing something that does not exist, according to the presentist. That is puzzling. Eternalism with the block theory provides a way out of the puzzle: you are seeing an existing time-slice of the 4D block that is the North Star.

Determinism for a system is the thesis that specifying the state of the system fixes how the system evolves forward in time. So, the present determines the future. By “determines” we mean determines by rules or laws. Determinism implies that nothing that occurs is purely random. Here is a commonly offered defense of the block-universe theory against the charge that it demands determinism:

The block universe is not necessarily a deterministic one. …Strictly speaking, to say that the occurrence of a relatively later event is determined vis à vis a set of relatively earlier events, is only to say that there is a functional connection or physical law linking the properties of the later event to those of the earlier events. …Now in the block universe we may have partial or even total indeterminacy—there may be no functional connection between earlier and later events (McCall 1966, p. 271).

One defense of the block theory against Bergson’s charge that it inappropriately spatializes time is to point out that when we graph the color of eggs sold against the dollar amount of the sales, no one complains that we are inappropriately spatializing egg color. The issues of spatialization and determinism reflect a great philosophical divide between those who say the geometrical features of spacetime provide an explanation of physical phenomena or instead only a representation or codification of those phenomena.

Challenging the claim that the block universe theory must improperly spatialize time, but appreciating the point made by Bergson that users of the block universe can make the mistake of spatializing time, the pragmatist and physicist Lee Smolin says,

By succumbing to the temptation to conflate the representation with the reality and [to] identify the graph of the records of the motion with the motion itself, these scientists have taken a big step toward the expulsion of time from our conception of nature.

The confusion worsens when we represent time as an axis on a graph…This can be called spatializing time.

And the mathematical conjunction of the representations of space and time, with each having its own axis, can be called spacetime. The pragmatist will insist that this spacetime is not the real world. It’s entirely a human invention, just another representation…. If we confuse spacetime with reality, we are committing a fallacy, which can be called the fallacy of the spatialization of time. It is a consequence of forgetting the distinction between recording motion in time and time itself.

Once you commit this fallacy, you’re free to fantasize about the universe being timeless, and even being nothing but mathematics. But, the pragmatist says, timelessness and mathematics are properties of representations of records of motion—and only that.

For a survey of defenses for presentism and the growing-past theories, see (Putnam 1967), (Saunders 2002), (Markosian 2003), (Savitt 2008), and (Miller 2013, pp. 354-356).

b. The Present

The present is what we are referring to when we use the word “now.” The temporal word now changes its reference every instant but not its meaning. Obviously there is a present, many people say, because it is so different from the past. The majority position among physicists is that the present is not an objective feature of reality. It is a mind-dependent feature of events, depending on a human convention about which clock and reference frame to use. (Everyone in the dispute agrees that it can make an important difference to your life whether it is presently noon or presently midnight.)

The A-theorists favor the claim that the present is objectively real; the B-theorists say it is subjective because everyone and everything has its own personal time so there can be no fact of the matter as to which of their presents is the real present. They say the problem is especially evident with what is happening now over there as opposed to now right here. Relativity theory implies what is happening now is relative to a chosen reference frame. It is always different for two people moving toward or away from each other.

Let us consider some arguments in favor of the objectivity of the present, the reality of now. One is that the now is so much more vivid to everyone than all other times. Past and future events are dim by comparison. Proponents of an objective present say that if scientific laws do not recognize this vividness and the objectivity of the present, then there is a defect within science. Einstein considered this argument and rejected it. Tim Maudlin accepts it, and he hopes to find a way to revise relativity theory so it allows a universal present for each instant.

One counter to Einstein is that there is so much agreement among people about what is happening now and what is not. Is that not a sign that the now is objective, not subjective? This agreement is reflected within our natural languages where we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

What have B-theorists said in response? Well, regarding vividness, we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with the experience of past presents and future presents. Yet that is what needs to be done for a fair comparison. Instead, when we speak of the “vividness” of our present experience of, say, a leaf falling in front of us, all we can do is compare our present experience of the leaf with our dim memories of leaves falling, and with even dimmer expectations of leaves yet to fall. So, the comparison is unfair; the vividness of future events should be assessed, says the critic, by measuring those future events when they happen and not merely by measuring present expectations of those events before they happen.

In another attempt to undermine the vividness argument, the B-theorist points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now, in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time. But they do not really happen at the same time. We play a little trick on ourselves. The acoustic engineer assures us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light. Proponents of the manifest image of time do not take travel time into account and mistakenly suppose there is a common global present and suppose that what is happening at present is everything that could in principle show up in a still photograph taken with light that arrives with infinite speed.

When you speak on the phone with someone two hundred miles away, the conversation is normal because the two of you seem to share a common now. But that normalcy is only apparent because the phone signal travels the two hundred miles so quickly. During a phone conversation with someone much farther away, say on the Moon, you would notice a strange 1.3 second time lag because the Moon is 1.3 light seconds away from Earth. Suppose you were to look at your correct clock on Earth and notice it is midnight. What time would it be on the Moon, according to your clock? This is not a good question. A more sensible question is, “What events on the Moon are simultaneous with midnight on Earth, according to my clock?” You cannot look and see immediately. You will have to wait 1.3 seconds at least because it takes any signal that long to reach you from the Moon. If an asteroid were to strike the Moon, and you were to see the explosion through your Earth telescope at 1.3 seconds after midnight, then you could compute later that the asteroid must have struck the Moon at midnight. If you want to know what is presently happening on the other side of Milky Way, you will have a much longer wait. So, the moral is that the collection of events comprising your present is something you have to compute; you cannot directly perceive those events at once.

To continue advancing a pro-B-theory argument against an objective present, notice the difference in time between your clock which is stationary on Earth and the time of a pilot using a clock in a spaceship that is flying by you at high speed. Assume the spaceship flies very close to you and that the two clocks are synchronized and are working perfectly and they now show the time is midnight at the flyby. According to the special theory of relativity, the collection of events across the universe that you eventually compute and say occurs now at midnight, necessarily must be very different from the collection of events that the spaceship traveler computes and says occurs at midnight. You and the person on the spaceship probably will not notice much of a difference for an event at the end of your street or even for an event on another continent, but you will begin to notice the difference for an event on the Moon and even more so for an event somewhere across the Milky Way or, worse yet, for an event in the Andromeda galaxy.

When two people disagree about what events are present events because the two are in motion relative to each other, the direction of the motion makes a significant difference. If the spaceship is flying toward Andromeda and away from you, then the spaceship’s now (what it judges to be a present event) would include events on Andromeda that occurred thousands of years before you were born. If the spaceship is flying away from Andromeda, the spaceship’s now would include events on Andromeda that occur thousands of years in your future. Also, the difference in nows is more extreme the faster the spaceship’s speed as it flies by you. The implication, says the B theorist, is that there are a great many different nows and nobody’s now is the only correct one.

To make a similar point in the language of mathematical physics, something appropriately called a now would be an equivalence class of instances that occur at the same time. But because Einstein showed that time is relative to refence frame, there are different nows for different reference frames, so the notion of now is not frame-independent and thus is not objective, contra the philosophical position of the A-theorist.

When the B-theorist says there is no fact of the matter about whether a distant explosion has happened, the A-theorist will usually disagree and say, regardless of your limitations on what knowledge you have, the explosion has occurred now or it hasn’t occurred now. But to the B-theorist to say this is to merely insist on the manifest image of time despite the implications of relativity theory.

But is there not a privileged reference frame in astronomy? Yes, it is the frame in which cosmic time is measured. This is the unique frame used when astronomers say the big bang began 13.8 billion years ago, or that the universe turned transparent 380,000 years after that. The frame is described in more detail in the companion article’s analysis of the big bang. This reference frame has an origin where the average motion of all the universe’s galaxies is stationary. Clocks fixed in this frame are sitting still while the universe expands around them; and at the frame’s origin, the universe is approximately isotropic at the cosmic scale, so the universe looks like it has the same average temperature in all directions. The origin is traveling about 350 km/s toward the constellation of Pisces and away from Leo. This is a privileged reference frame for astronomical convenience, and it is unique in the universe, but there is little reason to suppose this frame is what is sought by the A-theorist who believes in an objective present, nor by Isaac Newton who believed in absolute rest, nor by Maxwell who believed in his nineteenth century aether.

Opponents of an objective present frequently point out that none of the fundamental laws of physics pick out a present moment. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the temporal coordinate of the present moment, then they go on to calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that some value of the time variable t is the present time is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The basic laws themselves treat all times equally. If science’s laws do not need the present, then it is not real, say the B theorists. The counterargument is that it is the mistake of scientism to suppose that if something is not in our current theories, then it must not be real. France is real, but it is not mentioned in any scientific law.

In any discussion about whether the now is objective, one needs to remember that the term objective has different senses. There is objective in the sense of not being relative to the reference frame, and there is objective in the sense of not being mind-dependent, and there is objective in the sense of not being anthropocentric. Proponents of the B-theory say the now is not objective in any of these senses.

There is considerable debate in the philosophical literature about whether the present moments are so special that the laws should somehow recognize them. It is pointed out that even Einstein said, “There is something essential about the Now which is just outside the realm of science.” In 1925, the influential philosopher of science Hans Reichenbach criticized the block theory’s treatment of the present:

In the condition of the world, a cross-section called the present is distinguished; the ‘now’ has objective significance. Even when no human being is alive any longer, there is a ‘now’….

This claim has met stiff resistance. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later (Russell 1915, p. 212).

Rudolf Carnap added that a belief in the present is a matter for psychology, not physics.

The B-camp says belief in a global now is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now, when actually we are not factoring in the finite speed of light and sound. Proponents of the non-objectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases the present and now as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered by the speaker, and so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. A-theorists do not accept these criticisms.

There are interesting issues about the now in the philosophy of religion. For one example, Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and to know this, says Kretzmann, God must always be changing because God’s knowledge keeps changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God’s being omniscient and God’s being immutable.

Disagreement about the now is an ongoing feature of debate in the philosophy of time, and there are many subtle moves made by advocates on each side of the issue. (Baron 2018) provides a broad overview of the debate about whether relativistic physics disallows an objective present. For an extended defense of the claim that the now is not subjective and that there is temporal becoming, see (Arthur 2019).

c. Persistence, Four-Dimensionalism, and Temporal Parts

Eternalism differs from four-dimensionalism. Eternalism is the thesis that the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas four-dimensionalism says the ontologically basic objects are four-dimensional events and ordinary objects referred to in everyday discourse are three-dimensional slices of 4-d spacetime. However, most four-dimensionalists do accept eternalism. Most all eternalists and four-dimensionalists accept McTaggart’s B-theory of time.

Four-dimensionalism does not imply that time is a spatial dimension. When a four-dimensionalist represents time relative to a reference frame in a four-dimensional diagram, say, a Minkowski diagram, time is a special one of the four-dimensions of this mathematical space, not an arbitrary one. Using this representation technique does not imply that a four-dimensionalist is committed to the claim that real, physical space itself is four-dimensional, but only that spacetime is.

Four-dimensionalists take a stand on the philosophical issue of endurance vs. perdurance. Some objects last longer than others, so we say they persist longer. But there is no philosophical consensus about how to understand persistence. Objects are traditionally said to persist by enduring over some time interval. At any time during the interval the whole of the object exists. Not so for perduring objects. Perduring objects are said, instead, to persist by perduring. They do not exist wholly at a single instant but rather exist over a stretch of time. These objects do not pass through time; they do not endure; instead, they extend through time. A football game does not wholly exist at one instant; it extends over an interval of time. The issue is whether we can or should say the same for electrons and people. Technically expressed, the controversial issue is whether or not persisting things are (or are best treated as) divisible into temporal parts.

The perduring object persists by being the sum or fusion of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages). Instantaneous temporal parts are called temporal slices and time slices. For example, a forty-year-old man might be treated as being a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his three temporal stages that we call his childhood, his middle age, and his future old age. But his right arm is also a temporal part that has perdured for forty years.

Although the concept of temporal parts is more likely to be used by a four-dimensionalist, here is a definition of the concept from Judith Jarvis Thomson in terms of three-dimensional objects:

Let object O exist at least from time t0 to time t3. A temporal part P of O is an object that begins to exist at some time t1, where t1 ≥ t0, and goes out of existence at some time t2 ≤ t3, and takes up some portion of the space that O takes up for all the time that P exists.

Four-dimensionalists, by contrast, think of physical objects as regions of spacetime and as having temporal parts that extend along all four dimensions of the object. A more detailed presentation of these temporal parts should say whether four-dimensional objects have their spatiotemporal parts essentially.

David Lewis offers the following, fairly well-accepted definitions of perdurance and endurance:

Something perdures iff it persists by having different temporal parts, or stages, at different times, though no one part of it is wholly present at more than one time; whereas it endures iff it persists by being wholly present at more than one time.

The termiff stands for “if and only if.” Given a sequence of temporal parts, how do we know whether they compose a single perduring object? One answer, given by Hans Reichenbach, Ted Sider, and others, is that they compose a single object if the sequence falls under a causal law so that temporal parts of the perduring object cause other temporal parts of the object. Philosophers of time with a distaste for the concept of causality, oppose this answer.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easier time solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus Paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus of ancient Greece, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken because people often step into the same river twice. Who is really making the mistake?

The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken, says Lewis. We do not step into two different rivers, do we? They are the same river. Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being a collection of water we stepped in the first time and a collection of water we stepped in the second time; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different intrinsic properties. So, the advocate of endurance has trouble escaping the Heraclitus Paradox. So does the mereological essentialist.

A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus Paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-dimensional river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4D game.

For more examination of the issue with detailed arguments for and against perdurance and endurance, see (Wasserman, 2018), (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7), and especially the article “Persistence in Time” in this encyclopedia.

d. Truth-Values of Tensed Sentences

The above disputes about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory have taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a related question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes,” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past.

The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur. For example, suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that the next day the admiral does order a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. The eternalist says that, if this is so, then the sentence token about the sea battle was true yesterday at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, eternalists say, and the predicate is true is a timeless predicate, not one that merely means is true now. The sentence spoken now has a truth-maker within the block at a future time, even though the event has not yet happened and so the speaker has no access to that truthmaker. These B-theory philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is simply true or false, even if we do not know which.

Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart’s A-camp, agree with Aristotle’s suggestion that the sentence about the future sea battle is not true (or false) until the battle occurs (or does not). Predictions fall into the truth-value gap. This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth-values when uttered is called the doctrine of the open future and also the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to have been holding the position in chapter 9 of his On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

One principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that, if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth-values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth-values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to many compatibilists, but not all, your choices do affect the world as the libertarians believe they must; but, if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you were not free to do otherwise if your intentions had been different back then, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see the discussion of it in Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument, presumably:

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without both premises in this argument having truth-values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth-values of the component sentences—that a valid argument cannot possibly have true premises and a false conclusion. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false. So, logic does not apply. Surely, then, the Aristotelian position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as now and tomorrow because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal or complete sentences whose truth-values are not relative to the situation and time of utterance because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by expressions for specific times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as timeless and tenseless], and having fixed truth-values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine. For a criticism of Quine’s treatment of indexicals, see (Slater 2012, p. 72).

Philosophers are divided on all these issues.

e. Essentially-Tensed Facts

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but only half the world’s languages use tenses. English has tenses, but the Chinese, Burmese, and Malay languages do not. The English language distinguishes “Her death has happened” from “Her death will happen.” However, English also expresses time in other ways: with the adverbial phrases now and twenty-three days ago, with the adjective phrases new and ancient, and with the prepositions until and since.

Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in time. There are two principal answers: tenses are objective, and tenses are subjective. The two answers have given rise to two competing camps of philosophers of time.

The first answer is that tenses represent objective features of reality that are not captured by the B-theory, nor by eternalism, nor by the block-universe approach. This philosophical theory is said to “take tense seriously” and is called the tensed theory of time. The theory claims that, when we learn the truth-values of certain tensed sentences, we obtain knowledge which tenseless sentences do not and cannot provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time. Tenses are almost the same as what is represented by positions in McTaggart‘s A-series, so the theory that takes tense seriously is commonly called the A-theory of tense, and its advocates are called tensers.

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that they are merely subjective. Tensed terms have an indexical feature which is specific to the subject doing the speaking, but this feature has no ontological significance. Saying the event happened rather than is happening indicates that the subject or speaker said this after the event happened rather than before or during the event. Tenses are about speakers, not about some other important ontological characteristic of time in the world. This theory is the B-theory of tense, and its advocates are called detensers. The detenser W.V.O. Quine expressed the position this way:

Our ordinary language shows a tiresome bias in its treatment of time. Relations of date are exalted grammatically…. This bias is of itself an inelegance, or breach of theoretical simplicity. Moreover, the form that it takes—that of requiring that every verb form show a tense—is peculiarly productive of needless complications, since it demands lipservice to time even when time is farthest from our thoughts. Hence in fashioning canonical notations it is usual to drop tense distinctions (Word and Object §36).

The philosophical disagreement about tenses is not so much about tenses in the grammatical sense, but rather about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark.

The controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true, to be their truthmakers.

The B-theorist says tensed facts are not needed to account for why tensed sentences get the truth values they do.

Consider the tensed sentence, “Queen Anne of Great Britain died.” The A-theorist says the truthmaker is simply the tensed fact that the death has pastness. The B-theorist gives a more complicated answer by saying the truthmaker is the fact that the time of Queen Anne’s death is-less-than the time of uttering the above sentence. Notice that the B-answer does not use any words in the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense (and more importantly, any appeal to tensed facts) is an extraneous and eliminable feature of our language at the fundamental level, as are all other uses of the terminology of the A-series (except in trivial instances such as “The A-series is constructed using A-facts”).

This B-theory analysis is challenged by the tenser’s A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but the A-theorist points out that a proposition can be true even if never uttered, never read, and never inscribed.

There are other challenges to the B-theory. Roderick Chisholm and A.N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present-tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to give a B-style analysis of it, such as, “There is a time t such that t = midnight,” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical phrase needs its own analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress. John Perry famously explored this argument in his 1979 article, “The Problem of the Essential Indexical.”

Prior, in (Prior 1959), supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” The B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness, he says, because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of “Thank goodness that is over,” since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event is in the past, that is, we are thankful for the pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice in which we are saying, “Thank goodness that is over.” Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So, Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is unsuccessful.

D.H. Mellor and J.J.C. Smart, both proponents of the B-theory, agree that tensed talk is important, and can be true, and even be essential for understanding how we think and speak; but Mellor and Smart claim that tensed talk is not essential for describing extra-linguistic reality and that the extra-linguistic reality does not contain tensed facts corresponding to true, tensed talk. These two philosophers, and many other philosophers who “do not take tense seriously,” advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed, declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior and other A-theorists are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be adequately translated into tenseless ones.

The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true. The sentence “Snow is white” is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term ‘snow’ satisfies the predicate ‘is white’. Regarding if-then sentences, the conditions under which the sentence “If it is snowing, then it is cold” are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically. Alfred Tarski has provided these analyses in his semantic theory of truth.

Mellor and Smart agree that truth conditions can adequately express the meaning of tensed sentences or all that is important about the meaning when it comes to describing objective reality. This is a philosophically controversial point, but Mellor and Smart accept it, and argue that therefore there is really no need for tensed facts and tensed properties. The untranslatability of some tensed sentences merely shows a fault with ordinary language‘s ability to characterize objective, tenseless reality. If the B-theory, in accounting for the truth conditions of an A-sentence, fails to account for the full meaning of the A-sentence, then this is because of a fault with the A-sentence, not the B-theory.

Let us make the same point in other words. According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, “It is now midnight,” then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without some loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained fully with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of “It is now midnight” are that my utterance occurs (in the tenseless sense of occurs) at very nearly the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it is true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in this explanation of the truth conditions.

Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory will say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over” after exiting the dentist’s chair. I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this; and even though it was true even last month that the one time occurred before the other, I am happy to learn this. Of course, I would be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless, that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Being thankful for the pastness of the painful event provides a simpler explanation, actually a simplistic explanation, but not a better explanation.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences; they can be used to explain why one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that the truth conditions of tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist.

To summarize, tensed facts were presumed by the A-theory to be needed to be the truthmakers for the truth of tensed talk; but proponents of the new B-theory claim their analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The B-theory concludes that we should “not take tense seriously” in the sense of requiring tensed facts to account for the truth and falsity of sentences involving tenses because tensed facts are not actually needed.

Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. They will insist there are irreducible A-properties and that what I am glad about when a painful event is over is that the event is earlier than now, that is, has pastness. Quentin Smith says, more generally, that the “new tenseless theory of time is faced with insurmountable problems, and that it ought to be abandoned in favor of the tensed theory.”

The advocate of the A-theory E.J. Lowe opposed the B-theory because it conflicts so much with the commonsense image of time:

I consider it to be a distinct merit of the tensed view of time that it delivers this verdict, for it surely coincides with the verdict of common sense (Lowe, 1998, p. 104).

Lowe argued that no genuine event can satisfy a tenseless predicate, and no truth can be made true by B-theory truth conditions because all statements of truth conditions are tensed.

So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

15. The Arrow of Time

If you are shown an ordinary movie and also shown the same movie running in reverse, you have no trouble telling which is which because it is so easy for you to detect the one in which time’s arrow is pointing improperly. Two clues that there is a problem with the arrow could be that an omelet turned into unbroken eggs and everyone shown in the movie is walking backwards. Philosophers of physics want to know the origin and nature of this arrow. There is considerable disagreement about what it is, what counts as an illustration of it, how to explain it, and even how to define the term.

The main two camps disagree about whether (1) there is an intrinsic arrow of time itself that is perhaps due to its flow or to more events becoming real, or (2) there is only an extrinsic arrow due to so many of nature’s processes spontaneously going in only one direction. Those in the intrinsic camp often accuse those in the other camp of scientism; those in the extrinsic camp often accuse those in the other camp of subjectivism and an over-emphasis on the phenomenology of temporal awareness.

Arthur Eddington first used the term “time’s arrow” in 1927. The presence of the arrow implies, among other things, that tomorrow will be different from today in many ways: people grow older rather than younger; metal naturally rusts but does not un-rust; eggs break but never un-break. Hopefully, all this can be explained and not simply assumed. To do this, there must be some assumption somewhere that is time-asymmetric, that prefers one direction in time to the other. In the search for that assumption, some recommendations are to: (a) find a significant fundamental law of physics that requires one-way behavior in time, or (b) assume a special feature at the origin of time that directs time to start out going in only one direction and keep going that way, or (c) assume arrow-ness or directedness is an intrinsic but otherwise inexplicable feature of time itself.

There is no hope the time-asymmetry will show up in current fundamental laws. Although the universe is filled with one-way processes, these are all macroprocesses, not micro-physical ones. At the most fundamental, micro-physical level, nearly all the laws of physics reveal no requirement that any process must go one way in time rather than the reverse. The exceptions involve rarely occurring weak interactions that all experts agree have nothing to do with time’s arrow.

Many experts in the extrinsic camp suggest that the presence of time’s arrow is basically a statistical issue involving increased disorder and randomization (the technical term is “increased entropy”) plus a special low-entropy configuration of nature early in the cosmic big bang, with the target of the arrow being thermodynamic equilibrium in the very distant future when the universe’s average temperature approaches absolute zero. These experts point to the second law of thermodynamics as the statistical law that gives a quantitative description of entropy increase. Experts in the intrinsic camp disagree with this kind of explanation of the arrow. They say the one-way character of time is not fundamentally a statistical issue involving processes but rather is intimately tied to the passage of time itself, to its intrinsic and uninterrupted flow or passage.

There is a wide variety of special kinds of processes with their own mini-arrows. The human mind can know the past more easily than the future (the knowledge arrow). Heat flows from hot to cold (the thermodynamic arrow). The cosmos expands and does not shrink (the cosmological arrow). Light rays expand away from a light bulb rather than converge into it (the electromagnetic arrow). These mini-arrows are deep and interesting asymmetries of nature, and philosophers and physicists would like to know how the mini-arrows are related to each other.

Some philosophers have even asked whether there could be distant regions of space and time where time’s arrow points in reverse compared to our arrow. If so, would adults there naturally walk backwards on the way to their infancy while they remember the future?

For more discussion, see the article “The Arrow of Time”.

16. Temporal Logic

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time and temporal information by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements imply which others. For example, in McTaggart’s B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Alice’s arrival at the train station happens before Bob’s. Therefore, Bob’s arrival at the station does not happen before Alice’s.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, where the individual constant ‘a‘ denotes Alice’s arrival at the train station, and ‘b‘ denotes Bob’s arrival at the train station. Let the two-place or two-argument relation ‘Bxy‘ be interpreted as x happens before y—the key relation of McTaggart’s B-series. The direct translation of the above informal argument produces one premise with one conclusion:


The symbol ‘~’ is the negation operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol ‘¬’ and others prefer to use ‘–’. Unfortunately, our simple formal argument is invalid. To make the argument become valid, we can add some semantic principles about the happens-before relation, namely, the premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we can add this additional premise to the argument:

∀x∀y[Bxy ~Byx]

The symbol ‘∀x‘ is the universal quantifier on the variable ‘x‘. Some logicians prefer to use ‘(x)‘ for the universal quantifier. The symbol ‘‘ is the conditional operator or if-then operator; some logicians prefer to use the symbol ‘‘ instead.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. For example, suppose Alice arrives at the train station before Bob, and suppose Bob arrives there before Carol. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Alice arrives before Carol? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:


To make this argument be valid we can add the premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(Bxy & Byz) Bxz]

The symbol ‘&’ represents the conjunction operation. Some logicians prefer to use either the symbol ‘·‘ or ‘∧’ for conjunction. The transitivity of B is a principle we may want to add to our temporal logic.

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Here are some of the many suggestions:

  • ∀x∀y{Bxy → [t(x) < t(y)]}. If x happens before y, then the time coordinate of x is less than the time coordinate of y. ‘t‘ is a one-argument function symbol.
  • ∀x~Bxx. An event cannot happen before itself.
  • ∀x∀y{[t(x) ≠ t(y)] → [Bxy v Byx]}. Any two non-simultaneous events are connected by the B relation. That is, there are no temporally unrelated pairs of events. (In 1781 in his Critique of Pure Reason, Kant says this is an a priori necessary requirement about time.)
  • ∀x∃yBxy. Time is infinite in the future.
  • ∀x∀y(Bxy → ∃z(Bxz & Bzy)). B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any pair of non-simultaneous point events. This prevents quantized time.

To incorporate the ideas of the theory of relativity, we might want to make the happens-before relation be three-valued instead of two-valued by having it relate two events plus a reference frame.

When we formalized these principles of reasoning about the happens-before relation by translating them into predicate logic, we said we were creating temporal logic. However, strictly speaking, a temporal logic is just a theory of temporal sentences expressed in a formal logic. Calling it a logic, as is commonly done, is a bit of an exaggeration; it is analogous to calling the formalization of Peano’s axioms of arithmetic the development of number logic. Our axioms about B are not axioms of predicate logic, but only of a theory that uses predicate logic and that presumes the logic is interpreted on a domain of instantaneous events, and that presumes B is not open to re-interpretation as are the other predicate letters of predicate logic, but is always to be interpreted as happens-before.

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments formalized in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic or predicate logic. A. N. Prior was the pioneer in the late 1950s. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. Prior created this new logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as now, happens before, twenty-three minutes afterward, at all times, and sometimes. He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to the resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V.O. Quine, who recommended avoiding the use of this sort of proposition. He recommended that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false.

Prior’s main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as it is possible that and it is necessary that. He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic by re-interpreting its propositional operators. Or we can say he added four new propositional operators. Here they are with examples of their intended interpretations using an arbitrary present-tensed proposition p.

Pp “It has at some time been the case that p
Fp “It will at some time be the case that p
Hp “It has always been the case that p
Gp “It will always be the case that p

Pp‘ might be interpreted also as at some past time it was the case that, or it once was the case that, or it once was that, all these being equivalent English phrases for the purposes of applying tense logic to English. None of the tense operators are truth-functional.

One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, if p represents the present-tensed proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp represents “It has at some time been the case that Custer dies in Montana” which is equivalent in English to simply “Custer died in Montana.” So, we properly call ‘P‘ the past-tense operator. It represents a phrase that attaches to a sentence and produces another that is in the past tense.

Metaphysicians who are presentists are especially interested in this tense logic because, if presentists can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then this logic, with an appropriate semantics, may show how to eliminate any ontological commitment to the past (and future) while preserving the truth of past tense propositions that appear in biology books such as “There were dinosaurs” and “There was a time when the Earth did not exist.”

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom:

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq).

The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then:

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)


Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the following equivalence. For all propositions p and q,

(Pp & Pq) ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom, when interpreted in tense logic, captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator It has always been the case that, then a new axiom might be:

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not necessary that not-p.

A tense logic will need additional axioms in order to express q has been true for the past two weeks. Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic. It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or does not come to an end or that time is like a straight line instead of a circle; the reason usually given is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth or falsehood of a tensed proposition could be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, the proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true-at-a-time t if and only if p is true-at-a-time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

Prior himself did not take a stand on which formal logic and formal semantics are correct for dealing with temporal expressions.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, for example, “The event of Queen Anne’s dying has the property of being in the past”; but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, “It has at some time in the past been the case that Queen Anne is dying,” and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. Instead of translating the x is resting predicate as Px, where P is a one-argument predicate, it could be translated into temporal predicate logic as the two-argument predicate Rxt, and this would be interpreted as saying x is resting at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate R by adding a place for a temporal argument. The time variable t is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms to more carefully specify what can be assumed about the nature of time.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say n, to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let the individual constant s denote Socrates, and let Rst be interpreted as “Socrates is resting at t.” The false sentence that Socrates has always been resting would be expressed in this first-order temporal logic as:

∀t(Ltn → Rst)

Here L is the two-argument predicate for numerically less than that mathematicians usually write as <. And we see the usefulness of having the symbol n.

If tense logic is developed using a Kripke semantics of possible worlds, then it is common to alter the accessibility relation between any two possible worlds by relativizing it to a time. The point is to show that some old possibilities are no longer possible. For example, a world in which Hillary Clinton becomes the first female U.S. president in 2016 was possible relative to the actual world of 2015, but not relative to the actual world of 2017. There are other complexities. Within a single world, if we are talking about a domain of people containing, say, Socrates, then we want the domain to vary with time since we want Socrates to exist at some times but not at others. Another complexity is that in any world, what event is simultaneous with what other event should be relativized to a reference frame, as is required by Einstein’s theory of relativity.

Some temporal logics have a semantics that allows sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth-values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having just one of the three truth-values True, or False, or Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, “There will be a sea battle tomorrow,” are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

For an introduction to temporal logics and their formal semantics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

17. Time, Mind, and Experience

The principal philosophical issue about time and mind is to specify how time is represented in the mind; and the principal scientific issue in cognitive neuroscience is to uncover the neurological basis of our sense of time.

Our experience reveals time to us in many ways: (1) We notice some objects changing over time and some other objects persisting unchanged. (2) We detect  some events succeeding one another. (3) We notice that some similar events have different durations. (4) We seem to automatically classify events as present, past, or future, and we treat those events differently depending upon how they are classified. For example, we worry more about future pain than past pain.

Neuroscientists and cognitive scientists know that these ways of experiencing time exist, but not why they exist. Humans do not need to consciously learn these skills any more than they need to learn how to be conscious. It’s just something that grows or is acquired naturally. It’s something that appears due to a human being’s innate biological nature coupled with the prerequisites of a normal human environment—such as an adequate air supply, warmth, food, and water. A tulip could be given the same prerequisites, but it would never develop anything like our time consciousness. But neuroscientists do not yet understand the details of how our pre-set genetic program produces time consciousness, although there is agreement that the genes themselves are not conscious in any way.

A minority of philosophers, the panpsychists, would disagree with these neurophysiologists and say genes have proto-mental properties and proto-consciousness and even proto-consciousness of time. Critics remark sarcastically that our genes must also have the proto-ability to pay our taxes on time. The philosopher Colin McGinn, who is not a panpsychist, has some sympathies with the panpsychist position. He says genes:

contain information which is such that if we were to know it we would know the solution to the mind-body problem. In a certain sense, then, the genes are the greatest of philosophers, the repositories of valuable pieces of philosophical information. (McGinn 1999, p. 227)

No time cell nor master clock has been discovered so far in the human body, despite much searching, so many neuroscientists have come to believe there are no such things to be found. Instead, the neurological basis of our time sense probably has to do with coordinated changes in a network of neurons (and glia cells, especially astrocytes) that somehow encodes time information. Our brain cells, the neurons, are firing all at once, but they are organized somehow to produce a single conscious story in perceived, linear time. Although the details are not well understood by neuroscientists, there is continual progress. One obstacle is complexity. The human central nervous system is the most complicated known structure in the universe.

Cognitive neuroscientists want to know the neural mechanisms that account for our awareness of change, for our ability to anticipate the future, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place remembered events into the correct time order (temporal succession), for our construction of a specious present, for our understanding of tenses, for our ability to notice and often accurately estimate durations, and for our ability to keep track of durations across many different time scales, such as milliseconds for some events and years for others.

It surely is the case that our body is capable of detecting very different durations even if we are not conscious of doing so. When we notice that the sound came from our left, not right, we do this by unconsciously detecting the very slight extra time it takes the sound to reach our right ear, which is only an extra 0.0005 seconds after reaching our left ear. The unconscious way we detect this difference in time must be very different from the way we detect differences in years. Also, our neurological and psychological “clocks” very probably do not work by our counting ticks and tocks as do the clocks we build in order to measure physical time.

We are consciously aware of time passing by noticing changes either outside or inside our body. For example, we notice a leaf fall from a tree as it acquires a new location. If we close our eyes, we still can encounter time just by imagining a leaf falling. But scientists and philosophers want more details. How is this conscious encounter with time accomplished, and how does it differ from our unconscious awareness of time?

With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. Some say our consciousness is a device that stores information about the past in order to predict the future. Although some researchers believe consciousness is a hard problem to understand, some others have said, “Consciousness seems easy to me: it’s merely the thoughts we can remember.” We remember old perceptions, and we make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions. Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time. John Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing. Surely memory is key. Memories need to be organized into the proper temporal order in analogy to how a deck of cards, each with a different integer on the cards, can be sorted into numerical order. There is a neurological basis to the mental process of time-stamping memories so they are not just a jumble when recalled or retrieved into consciousness. Dogs successfully time-stamp their memories when they remember where they hid their bone and also when they plan for the short-term future by standing at the door to encourage their owner to open it. The human’s ability to organize memories far surpasses any other conscious being. We can decide to do next week what we planned last month because of what happened last year. This is a key part of what makes homo sapiens be sapien.

As emphasized, a major neurological problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. How do brains take the input from all its sense organs and produce true beliefs about the world’s temporal relationships? Philosophers and cognitive scientists continue to investigate this, but so far there is no consensus on either how we experience temporal phenomena or how we are conscious that we do. However, there is a growing consensus that consciousness itself is an emergent property of a central nervous system, and that dualism between mental properties and physical properties is not a fruitful supposition. The vast majority of neuroscientists are physicalists who treat brains as if they are just wet machines, and they believe consciousness does not transcend scientific understanding.

Neuroscientists agree that the brain takes a pro-active role in building a mental scenario of the external 3+1-dimensional world. As one piece of suggestive evidence, notice that if you look at yourself in the mirror and glance at your left eyeball, then glance at your right eyeball, and then glance back to the left, you can never see your own eyes move. Your brain always constructs a continuous story of non-moving eyes. However, a video camera taking pictures of your face easily records your eyeballs’ movements, proving that your brain has taken an active role in “doctoring” the scenario.

Researchers believe that at all times our mind is testing hypotheses regarding what is taking place beyond our brain. The brain continually receives visual, auditory, tactile, and other sensory signals arriving at different times from an event, then must produce a hypothesis about what the signals might mean. Do those signals mean there probably is a tiger rushing at us? The brain also continuously revises hypotheses and produces new ones in an attempt to have a coherent story about what is out there, what is happening before what, and what is causing what. Being good at unconsciously producing, testing, and revising these hypotheses has survival value.

Psychological time’s rate of passage is a fascinating phenomenon to study. The most obvious feature is that psychological time often gets out of sync with physical time. At the end of our viewing an engrossing television program, we often think, “Where did the time go? It sped by.” When we are hungry in the afternoon and have to wait until the end of the workday before we can have dinner, we think, “Why is everything taking so long?” When we are feeling pain and we look at a clock, the clock seems to be ticking slower than normal.

An interesting feature of the rate of passage of psychological time reveals itself when we compare the experiences of younger people to older people. When we are younger, we lay down richer memories because everything is new. When we are older, the memories we lay down are much less rich because we have “seen it all before.” That is why older people report that a decade goes by so much more quickly than it did when they were younger.

Do things seem to move more slowly when we are terrified? “Yes,” most people would say. “No,” says neuroscientist David Eagleman, “it’s a retrospective trick of memory.” The terrifying event does seem to you to move more slowly when you think about it later, but not at the time it is occurring. Because memories of the terrifying event are “laid down so much more densely,” Eagleman says, it seems to you, upon your remembering, that your terrifying event lasted longer than it really did.

The human being inherited most or perhaps all of its biological clocks from its ancestor species. Although the cerebral cortex is usually considered to be the base for our conscious experience, it is surprising that rats can distinguish a five-second interval from a forty-second interval even with their cerebral cortex removed. So, a rat’s means of sensing time is probably distributed throughout many places in its brain. Perhaps the human being’s time sense is similarly distributed. However, surely the fact that we know that we know about time is specific to our cerebral cortex. A rat does not know that it knows. It has competence without comprehension. A cerebral cortex apparently is required for this comprehension. Very probably no other primate has an appreciation of time that is as sophisticated as that had by any normal human being.

Entomologists still do not know how the biological clock of a cicada enables these insects to hatch after 13 years living underground, and not after 12 years or 14 years. Progress on this issue might provide helpful clues for understanding the human being’s biological clock.

We humans are very good at detecting the duration of silences. We need this ability to tell the difference between the spoken sentence, “He gave her cat-food,” and “He gave her cat food.” The hyphen is the linguistic tool for indicating that the duration between the spoken words “cat” and “food” is shorter than usual. This is a favorite example of the neuroscientist Dean Buonomano.

Philosophers and cognitive neuroscientists want to know whether we have direct experience only of an instantaneous present event or instead we have direct experience only of the specious present, a present event that lasts a short stretch of physical time. Informally, the issue is said to be whether the present is thin or thick. Plato, Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed in a thin present. Shadworth Hodgson, Mary Calkins and William James believed in a thick present. The latter position is now the more favored one by experts in the fields of neuroscience and philosophy of mind.

If it is thick, then how thick? Does the present last longer than the blink of an eye? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, a good estimate of its duration is approximately eighty milliseconds for human beings, although neuroscientists do not yet know why it is not two milliseconds or two seconds.

Another issue is about overlapping specious presents. We do seem to have a unified stream of consciousness, but how do our individual specious presents overlap to produce this unity?

When you open your eyes, can you see what is happening now? In 1630, René Descartes would have said yes, but nearly all philosophers in the twenty-first century say no. You see the North Star as it was over 300 years ago, not as it is now. Also, light arriving at your eye from an external object contains information about its color, motion, and form. The three kinds of signals arrive simultaneously, but it takes your brain different times to process that information. Color information is processed more quickly than motion information, which in turn is processed more quickly than form information. Only after the light has taken its time to arrive at your eye, and then you have processed all the information, can you construct a correct story that perhaps says, “A white golf ball is flying toward my head.”

So, we all live in the past—in the sense that our belief about what is happening occurs later than when it really happened according to a clock. Our brain takes about eighty milliseconds to reconstruct a story of what is happening based on the information coming in from our different sense organs. Because of its long neck, a giraffe’s specious present might last considerably longer. However, it cannot take too much longer than this or else the story is so outdated that the organism risks becoming a predator’s lunch. Therefore, evolution has probably fine-tuned each kind of organism’s number of milliseconds of its specious present.

In the early days of television broadcasting, engineers worried about the problem of keeping audio and video signals synchronized. Then they accidentally discovered that they had about a tenth-of-a-second of “wiggle room.” As long as the signals arrive within this period, viewers’ brains automatically re-synchronize the signals; outside that tenth-of-a-second period, it suddenly looks like a badly dubbed movie. (Eagleman, 2009)

Watch a bouncing basketball. The light from the bounce arrives into our eyes before the sound arrives into our ears; then the brain builds a story in which the sight and sound of the bounce happen simultaneously. This sort of subjective synchronizing of visual and audio works for the bouncing ball so long as the ball is less than 100 feet away. Any farther and we begin to notice that the sound arrives later.

Some Eastern philosophies promote living in the present and dimming one’s awareness of the past and the future. Unfortunately, people who “live in the moment” have a more dangerous and shorter life. The cognitive scientist Lera Boroditsky says a crack addict is the best example of a person who lives in the moment.

Philosophers of time and psychologists who study time are interested in both how a person’s temporal experiences are affected by deficiencies in their imagination and their memory and how different interventions into a healthy person’s brain might affect that person’s temporal experience.

Some of neuroscientist David Eagleman’s experiments have shown clearly that under certain circumstances a person can be deceived into believing event A occurred before event B, when in fact the two occurred in the reverse order according to clock time. For more on these topics, see (Eagleman, 2011).

The time dilation effect in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. With repeated events lasting the same amount of clock time, presenting a brighter object will make that event seem to last longer. This is likewise true for louder sounds.

Suppose you live otherwise normally within a mine and are temporarily closed off from communicating with the world above. For a long while, simply with memory, you can keep track of how long you have been inside the mine, but eventually you will lose track of the correct clock time. What determines how long the long while is, and how is it affected by the subject matter? And why are some persons better estimators than others?

Do we directly experience the present? This is controversial, and it is not the same question as whether at present we are having an experience. Those who answer “yes” tend to accept McTaggart’s A-theory of time. But notice how different such direct experience would have to be from our other direct experiences. We directly experience green color but can directly experience other colors; we directly experience high-pitched notes but can directly experience other notes. Can we say we directly experience the present time but can directly experience other times? Definitely not. So, the direct experience of the present either is non-existent, or it is a strange sort of direct experience. Nevertheless, we probably do have some mental symbol for nowness in our mind that correlates with our having the concept of the present, but it does not follow from this that we directly experience the present any more than our having a concept of love implies that we directly experience love. For an argument that we do not experience the present, see chapter 9 of (Callender 2017).

If all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, but would any of these star events be in the future? This is a philosophically controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and add “Whose future?”

The issue of whether time itself is subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon such as a secondary quality, is explored elsewhere in this article.

According to René Descartes’ dualistic philosophy of mind, the mind is not in space, but it is in time. The current article accepts the more popular philosophy of mind that rejects dualism and claims that our mind is in both space and time due to the functioning of our brain. It takes no position, though, on the controversial issue of whether the process of conscious human understanding is a computation.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high-quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a ledge into a net; and trying different forms of meditation. These avenues definitely affect the ease with which pulses of neurotransmitters can be sent from one neuron to a neighboring neuron and thus affect our psychological time, but so far, none of these avenues has led to success productivity-wise.

For our final issue about time and mind, do we humans have an a priori awareness of time that can be used to give mathematics a firm foundation? In the early twentieth century, the mathematician and philosopher L.E.J. Brouwer believed so. Many mathematicians and philosophers at that time were suspicious that mathematics was not as certain as they hoped for, and they worried that contradictions might be uncovered within mathematics. Their suspicions were increased by the discovery of Russell’s Paradox and by the introduction into set theory of the controversial non-constructive axiom of choice. In response, Brouwer attempted to place mathematics on what he believed to be a firmer epistemological foundation by arguing that mathematical concepts are admissible only if they can be constructed from an ideal mathematician’s vivid, a priori awareness of time, what in Kantian terminology is called an intuition of inner time. Time, said Kant in his Critique of Pure Reason in 1781, is a structuring principle of all possible experience. As such time is not objective; it is not a feature of things-in-themselves, but rather is a feature of the phenomenal world.

Brouwer supported Kant’s claim that arithmetic is the pure form of temporal intuition. Brouwer tried to show how to construct higher-level mathematical concepts (for example, the mathematical line) from lower-level temporal intuitions; but unfortunately, he had to accept the consequence that his program required both rejecting Aristotle’s law of excluded middle in logic and rejecting some important theorems in mathematics such as the theorem that every real number has a decimal expansion and the theorem that there is an actual infinity as opposed to a potential infinity of points between any two points on the mathematical line. Unwilling to accept those inconsistencies with classical mathematics, most other mathematicians and philosophers instead rejected Brouwer’s idea of an intimate connection between mathematics and time.

For interesting video presentations about psychological time, see (Carroll 2012) and (Eagleman 2011). For the role of time in phenomenology, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” According to the phenomenologist Edmund Husserl, “One cannot discover the least thing about objective time through phenomenological analysis” (Husserl, 1991, p. 6).

Consider the mind of an extraterrestrial. Could an extraterrestrial arrive here on Earth with no concept of time? Probably not. How about arriving with a very different concept of time from ours? Perhaps, but how different? Stephen Hawking’s colleague James Hartle tried to answer this question by speculating that we and the extraterrestrial will at least, “share concepts of past, present and future, and the idea of a flow of time.”

18. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

b. What Else Science Requires of Time

c. Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)

19. References and Further Reading

  • Arntzenius Frank and H. Greaves. 2009. “Time Reversal in Classical Electromagnetism,” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science vol. 60 (3), pp. 557-584.
    • Challenges Feynman’s claim that anti-particles are nothing but particles propagating backwards in time.
  • Arthur, Richard T. 2014. Leibniz. Polity Press. Cambridge, U.K.
    • Comprehensive monograph on all things Leibniz, with a detailed examination of his views on time.
  • Arthur, Richard T.  W. 2019. The Reality of Time Flow: Local Becoming in Physics, Springer.
    • Challenges the claim that the now is subjective in modern physics.
  • Azzouni, Jody. 2015. “Nominalism, the Nonexistence of Mathematical Objects,” in Mathematics, Substance and Surmise, edited by E. Davis and P.J. Davis, pp. 133-145.
    • Argues that mathematical objects referred to by mathematical physics do not exist despite Quine’s argument that they do exist. Azzouni also claims that a corporation does not exist.
  • Barbour, Julian. 1999. The End of Time, Weidenfeld and Nicolson, London, and Oxford University Press, New York.
    • A popular presentation of Barbour’s theory which implies that if we could see the universe as it is, we should see that it is static. It is static, he says, because his way of quantizing general relativity, namely quantum geometrodynamics with its Wheeler-DeWitt equation, implies a time-independent quantum state for the universe as a whole. Time is emergent and not fundamental. He then offers an exotic explanation of how time emerges and why time seems to us to exist.
  • Barbour, Julian. 2009. The Nature of Time, arXiv:0903.3489.
    • An application of the Barbour’s ideas of strong emergentism to classical physics.
  • Baron, Sam. 2018. “Time, Physics, and Philosophy: It’s All Relative,” Philosophy Compass, Volume 13, Issue 1, January.
    • Reviews the conflict between the special theory of relativity and the dynamic theories of time.
  • Baron, S. and K. Miller. 2015. “Our Concept of Time” in Philosophy and Psychology of Time edited by B. Mölder, V. Arstila, P. Ohrstrom. Springer. Pp 29-52.
    • Explores the issue of whether time is a functionalist concept.
  • Bunge, Mario. 1968. “Physical Time: The Objective and Relational Theory.” Philosophy of Science. Vol. 35, No. 4. Pages 355-388.
    • Examines the dispute between relationism and substantivalism, sometimes acerbically.
  • Butterfield, Jeremy. 1984.“ Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present; and argues against a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. 2001. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. 2002. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers,  pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. 2010,. Is Time an Illusion?”, Scientific American, June,  pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion.
  • Callender, Craig. 2017. What Makes Time Special? Oxford University Press.
    • A comprehensive monograph on the relationship between the manifest image of time and its scientific image. The book makes a case for how, if information gathering and utilizing systems like us are immersed in an environment with the physical laws that do hold, then we will create the manifest image of time that we do. Not written at an introductory level.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1966. Philosophical Foundations of Physics: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Science. Basic Books, Inc. New York.
    • Chapter 8 “Time” is devoted to the issue of how to distinguish an accurate clock from an inaccurate one.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. 2010. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2010. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York.
    • Part Three “Entropy and Time’s Arrow” provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time’s arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of what happens in an interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of time goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2011. “Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time,” Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening “now.”
  • Carroll, Sean. 2012. Mysteries of Modern Physics: Time. The Teaching Company, The Great Courses: Chantilly, Virginia.
    • A series of popular lectures about time by a renowned physicist with an interest in philosophical issues. Emphasizes the arrow of time.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2016. The Big Picture. Dutton/Penguin Random House. New York.
    • A physicist surveys the cosmos’ past and future, including the evolution of life.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2022. The Biggest Ideas in the Universe: Space, Time, and Motion. Dutton/Penguin Random House.
    • A sophisticated survey of what modern physics implies about space, time, and motion, especially relativity theory and especially not quantum theory, with some emphasis on the philosophical issues. Introduces the relevant equations, but is aimed at a general audience and not physicists.
  • Carroll, Sean. 2019. Something Deeply Hidden: Quantum Worlds and the Emergence of Spacetime, Dutton/Penguin Random House.
    • Pages 287-289 explain how time emerges in a quantum universe governed by the Wheeler-DeWitt equation, a timeless version of the Schrödinger equation. The chapter “Breathing in Empty Space” explains why the limits of time (whether it is infinite or finite) depend on the total amount of energy in the universe. His podcast Mindscape in August 13, 2018 “Why Is There Something Rather than Nothing?” discusses this topic in its final twenty minutes. His answer is that this may not be a sensible question to ask.
  • Crowther, Karen. 2019. “When Do We Stop Digging? Conditions on a Fundamental Theory of Physics,” in What is ‘Fundamental’?, edited by Anthony Aguirre, Brendan Foster, and Zeeya Merali, Springer International Publishing.
    • An exploration of what physicists do mean and should mean when they say a particular theory of physics is final or fundamental rather than more fundamental. She warns, “a theory formally being predictive to all high-energy scales, and thus apparently being the lowest brick in the tower [of theories] (or, at least, one of the bricks at the lowest level of the tower), is no guarantee that it is in fact a fundamental theory. …Yet, it is one constraint on a fundamental theory.” When we arrive at a fundamental theory, “the question shifts from ‘What if there’s something beyond?’ to ‘Why should we think there is something beyond?” That is, the burden of justification is transferred.”
  • Damasio, Antonio R. 2006. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s claim to have discovered in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice. This claim has radical implications for the philosophical issue of free will.
  • Dainton, Barry. 2010. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca.
    • An easy-to-read, but technically correct, book. This is probably the best single book to read for someone desiring to understand in more depth the issues presented in this encyclopedia article.
  • Davies, Paul. 1995. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster.
    • An easy-to-read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity and other scientific advances on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. 2002. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood. 1994. “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of acquiring information for free by traveling in time.
  • Deutsch, David. 2013. “The Philosophy of Constructor Theory,” Synthese, Volume 190, Issue 18.
    • Challenges Laplace’s Paradigm that physics should be done by predicting what will happen from initial conditions and laws of motion. http://dx.doi.org/10.1007/s11229-013-0279-z.
  • Dowden, Bradley. 2009. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers many of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article. Easy reading for newcomers to the philosophy of time.
  • Dummett, Michael. 2000. Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy,  Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Eagleman David. 2009. “Brain Time.” In What’s Next? Dispatches on the Future of Science. Max Brockman, Ed., Penguin Random House.
    • A neuroscientist discusses the plasticity of time perception or temporal distortion.
  • Eagleman David. 2011. “David Eagleman on CHOICE,” Oct. 4, https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=MkANniH8XZE.
    • Commentary on research on subjective time.
  • Einstein, Albert. 1982. “Autobiographical Notes.” In P. A. Schilpp, ed. Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, vol. 1. LaSalle, Il. Open Court Publishing Company.
    • Describes his early confusion between the structure of the real number line and the structure of time itself.
  • Earman, John. 1972. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Fisher, A. R. J. 2015. “David Lewis, Donald C. Williams, and the History of Metaphysics in the Twentieth Century.” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, volume 1, issue 1, Spring.
    • Discusses the disagreements between Lewis and Williams, who both are four-dimensionalists, about the nature of time travel.
  • Gödel, Kurt. 1959.  “A Remark about the Relationship between Relativity Theory and Idealistic Philosophy,” in P. A. Schilpp, ed., Albert Einstein: Philosopher-Scientist, Harper & Row, New York.
    • Discussion of solutions to Einstein’s equations that allow closed causal chains, that is, traveling to your past.
  • Gott, J. Richard. 2002. Time Travel in Einstein’s Universe: The Physical Possibilities of Travel Through Time.
    • Presents an original theory of the origin of the universe involving backward causation and time travel.
  • Grant, Andrew. 2015. “Time’s Arrow,” Science News, July 25, pp. 15-18.
    • Popular description of why our early universe was so orderly even though nature should always have preferred the disorderly.
  • Greene, Brian. 2011. The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Universe, Vintage Books, New York.
    • Describes nine versions of the Multiverse Theory, including the Ultimate multiverse theory described by the philosopher Robert Nozick.
  • Grey, W. 1999. “Troubles with Time Travel,” Philosophy 74: pp. 55-70.
    • Examines arguments against time travel.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. 1950-51. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua. Difficult reading.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. 1971. “The Meaning of Time,” in Basic Issues in the Philosophy of Time, Eugene Freeman and Wilfrid Sellars, eds. LaSalle, pp. 195-228.
    • An analysis of the meaning of the term time in both the manifest image and scientific image, and a defense of the B-theory of time. Difficult reading.
  • Guth, Alan. 2014. “Infinite Phase Space and the Two-Headed Arrow of Time,” FQXi conference  in Vieques, Puerto Rico. https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=AmamlnbDX9I. 2014.
    • Guth argues that an arrow of time could evolve naturally even though it had no special initial conditions on entropy, provided the universe has an infinite available phase space that the universe could spread out into. If so, its maximum possible entropy is infinite, and any other state in which the universe begins will have relatively low entropy.
  • Haack, Susan. 1974. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 14d of the present article) for truth-value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. 1992. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603.
    • Nature conspires somehow to block backward time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. 1996. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He called this special space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. 1975. “On Some Alleged Paradoxes of Time Travel,” Journal of Philosophy, 72: pp.432-44.
    • Examines some of the famous arguments against past time travel.
  • Horwich, Paul. 1987. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action. Horwich argues that time itself has no arrow.
  • Hossenfelder, Sabine.  2022. Existential Physics: A Scientist’s Guide to Life’s Biggest Questions, Viking/Penguin Random House LLC.
    • A theoretical physicist who specializes in the foundations of physics examines the debate between Leibniz and Newton on relational vs. absolute (substantival) time. Her Chapter Two on theories about the beginning and end of the universe is especially deep, revealing, and easy to understand.
  • Huggett, Nick. 1999. Space from Zeno to Einstein, MIT Press.
    • Clear discussion of the debate between Leibniz and Newton on relational vs. absolute (substantival) time.
  • Husserl, Edmund. 1991. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time. Translated by J. B. Brough. Originally published 1893-1917. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • The father of phenomenology discusses internal time consciousness.
  • Katzenstein, Larry. 2006. ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Kirk, G.S. and Raven, J.E. 1957. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York: Cambridge University Press,
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, 2002. “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. 2012. A Universe from Nothing. Atria Paperback, New York.
    • Discusses on p. 170 why we live in a universe with time rather than with no time. The issue is pursued further in the afterward to the paperback edition that is not included within the hardback edition. Krauss’ position on why there is something rather than nothing was challenged by the philosopher David Albert in his March 23, 2012 review of Krauss’ hardback book in The New York Times newspaper.
  • Kretzmann, Norman. 1966. “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July, pp. 409-421.
    • Raises the question: If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. 2006. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, pp. 21-23.
    • A short analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his or own clock plus the other twin’s clock.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, 1993. The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin. 2003. Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow.
  • Lewis, David K. 1986. “The Paradoxes of Time Travel.” American Philosophical Quarterly, 13:145-52.
    • A classic argument against changing the past. Lewis assumes the B-theory of time.
  • Lockwood, Michael. 2005. The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveler,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Lowe, E. J. 1998. The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity and Time, Oxford University Press.
    • This Australian metaphysician defends the A-theory’s tensed view of time in chapter 4, based on an ontology of substances rather than events.
  • Mack, Katie. 2020. The End of Everything (Astrophysically Speaking). Scribner, New York.
    • Exploration of alternative ways the universe might end.
  • Markosian, Ned. 2003. “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press.
  • Maudlin, Tim. 1988. “The Essence of Space-Time.” Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, Volume Two: Symposia and Invited Papers (1988), pp. 82-91.
    • Maudlin discusses the hole argument, manifold substantivalism and metrical essentialism.
  • Maudlin, Tim. 2002. “Remarks on the Passing of Time,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, Vol. 102 (2002), pp. 259-274 Published by: Oxford University Press. https://www.jstor.org/stable/4545373. 2002.
    • Defends eternalism, the block universe, and the passage of time.
  • Maudlin, Tim. 2007. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and he argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • Maudlin, Tim. 2012. Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time, Princeton University Press.
    • An advanced introduction to the conceptual foundations of spacetime theory.
  • McCall, Storrs. 1966. “II. Temporal Flux,” American Philosophical Quarterly, October.
    • An analysis of the block universe, the flow of time, and the difference between past and future.
  • McGinn, Colin. 1999. The Mysterious Flame: Conscious Minds in a Material World. Basic Books.
    • Claims that the mind-body problem always will be a mystery for your mind but not for your genes.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. 1927. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument for the inconsistency that a single event has only one of the properties of being past, present, or future, but that any event also has all three of these properties is called “McTaggart’s Paradox.” The chapter is renamed “The Unreality of Time,” and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (Le Poidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. 1998. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Merali, Zeeya. 2013. Theoretical Physics: The Origins of Space and Time,” Nature, 28 August , vol. 500, pp. 516-519.
    • Describes six theories that compete for providing an explanation of the basic substratum from which space and time emerge.
  • Miller, Kristie. 2013. “Presentism, Eternalism, and the Growing Block,” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., pp. 345-364.
    • Compares the pros and cons of competing ontologies of time.
  • Morris, Michael S., Kip S. Thorne and Ulvi Yurtsever. 1988. “Wormholes, Time Machines, and the Weak Energy Condition,” Physical Review Letters, vol. 61, no. 13, 26 September.
    • The first description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Moskowitz, Clara. 2021. “In Every Bit of Nothing There is Something,” Scientific American, February.
    • Describes how the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle requires there to be continual creation and annihilation of virtual particles. This process is likely to be the cause of dark energy and the accelerating expansion of space.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. 2013. “The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century,” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Muller, Richard A. 2016a. NOW: The Physics of Time. W. W. Norton & Company, New York.
    • An informal presentation of the nature of time by an experimental physicist at the University of California, Berkeley. Chapter 15 argues that the correlation between the arrow of time and the increase of entropy is not a causal connection. Chapter 16 discusses the competing arrows of time. Muller favors space expansion as the cause of time’s arrow, with entropy not being involved. And he recommends a big bang theory in which both space and time expand, not simply space. Because space and time are so intimately linked, he says, the expansion of space is propelling time forward, and this explains the “flow” of time. However, “the new nows [are] created at the end of time, rather than uniformly throughout time.” (p. 8)
  • Muller, Richard. 2016b. “Now and the Flow of Time,” arXiv, https://arxiv.org/pdf/1606.07975.pdf.
    • Argues that the flow of time consists of the continual creation of new moments, new nows, that accompany the creation of new space.”
  • Nadis, Steve. 2013. “Starting Point,” Discover, September, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite (there was a first bubble) but its future must be infinite (always more bubbles).
  • Norton, John. 2010. “Time Really Passes,” Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April.
    • Argues that, “We don’t find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion.”
  • Novikov, Igor. 1998. The River of Time, Cambridge University Press.
    • Chapter 14 gives a very clear and elementary description of how to build a time machine using a wormhole.
  • Oaklander, L. Nathan. 2008. The Ontology of Time. Routledge.
    • An authoritative collection of articles on all the major issues. Written for an audience of professional researchers.
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P. F. V. Hasle. 1995. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Penrose, Roger. 2004. The Road to Reality: A Complete Guide to the Laws of the Universe. Alfred A. Knopf.
    • A mathematical physicist discusses cosmology, general relativity, and the second law of thermodynamics, but not at an introductory level.
  • Perry, John. 1979. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical,” Noûs, 13 (1), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot all be explicated by, reduced to, or eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. 2007. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that time in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses, in the sense of verb conjugations, but of course, it expresses all sorts of concepts about time in other ways.
  • Plato. Parmenides. 1961. Trans. by F. Macdonald Cornford in The Collected Dialogues of Plato, ed. E. Hamilton and H. Cairns. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Plato discusses time.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. 1988. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Price, Huw. 1996. Time’s Arrow & Archimedes’ Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time. Oxford University Press.
    • Price believes the future can affect the past, the notion of direction of the flow cannot be established as an objective notion, and philosophers of physics need to adopt an Archimedean point of view outside of time in order to discuss time in an unbiased manner.
  • Prior, A.N. 1959. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 .
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our feeling of relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A.N. 1967.Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press.
    • Pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, that permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A.N. 1969. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind, 78, no. 311, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A.N. 1970. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1967. “Time and Physical Geometry,” The Journal of Philosophy, 64, pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist. Putnam believes that the manifest image of time is refuted by relativity theory.
  • Quine, W.V.O. 1981. Theories and Things. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Quine argues for physicalism in metaphysics and naturalism in epistemology.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. 2017. Reality is Not What It Seems: The Journey to Quantum Gravity. Riverhead Books, New York.
    • An informal presentation of time in the theory of loop quantum gravity. Loop theory focuses on gravity; string theory is a theory of gravity plus all the forces and matter.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. 2018. The Order of Time. Riverhead Books, New York.
    • An informal discussion of the nature of time by a theoretical physicist. The book was originally published in Italian in 2017. Page 70 contains the graph of the absolute elsewhere that was the model for the one in this article.
  • Rovelli, Carlo. 2018. “Episode 2: Carlo Rovelli on Quantum Mechanics, Spacetime, and Reality” in Sean Carroll’s Mindscape Podcast at www.youtube.com/watch?v=3ZoeZ4Ozhb8. July 10.
    • Rovelli and Carroll discuss loop quantum gravity vs. string theory, and whether time is fundamental or emergent.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1915. “On the Experience of Time,” Monist, 25, pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1929. Our Knowledge of the External World. W. W. Norton and Co., New York, pp. 123-128.
    • Russell develops his formal theory of time that presupposes the relational theory of time.
  • Saunders, Simon. 2002. “How Relativity Contradicts Presentism,” in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. 1995. Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Savitt, Steven F. “Being and Becoming in Modern Physics.” In E. N. Zala (ed.). The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • In surveying being and becoming, it suggests how the presentist and grow-past ontologies might respond to criticisms that appeal to relativity theory.
  • Sciama, Dennis. 1986. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, pp. 6-21.
    • A clear account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. 1969. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66, pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the existence of changeless periods in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. 2000. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sider, Ted. 2001. Four-Dimensionalism: An Ontology of Persistence. Oxford University Press, New York.
    • Defends the ontological primacy of four-dimensional events over three-dimensional objects. He freely adopts causation as a means of explaining how a sequence of temporal parts composes a single perduring object. This feature of the causal theory of time originated with Hans Reichenbach.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space. 1976. Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivalism fails.
  • Slater, Hartley. 2012. “Logic is Not Mathematical,” Polish Journal of Philosophy, Spring, pp. 69-86.
    • Discusses, among other things, why modern symbolic logic fails to give a proper treatment of indexicality.
  • Smith, Quentin. 1994. “Problems with the New Tenseless Theories of Time,” pp. 38-56 in Oaklander, L. Nathan and Smith, Quentin (eds.), The New Theory of Time, New Haven: Yale University Press.
    • Challenges the new B-theory of time promoted by Mellor and Smith.
  • Smolin, Lee. 2013. Time Reborn. Houghton, Mifflin, Harcourt Publishing Company, New York.
    • An extended argument by a leading theoretical physicist for why time is real. Smolin is a presentist. He believes the general theory of relativity is mistaken about the relativity of simultaneity; he believes every black hole is the seed of a new universe; and he believes nothing exists outside of time.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 1988. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. 2011. “The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the Heart of Modern Cosmology Deeply Flawed?” Scientific American, April, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the big bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of big bangs and big crunches but with no inflation. The inflation theory of quantum cosmology implies the primeval creation of a very large universe in a very short time.
  • Tallant, Jonathan. 2013. “Time,” Analysis, Vol. 73, pp. 369-379.
    • Examines these issues: How do presentists ground true propositions about the past? How does time pass? How do we experience time’s passing?
  • Tegmark, Max. 2017. “Max Tegmark and the Nature of Time,” Closer to Truth, https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=rXJBbreLspA, July 10.
    • Speculates on the multiverse and why branching time is needed for a theory of quantum gravity.
  • Unruh, William. 1999. “Is Time Quantized? In Other Words, Is There a Fundamental Unit of Time That Could Not Be Divided into a Briefer Unit?” Scientific American, October 21. https://www.scientificamerican.com/article/is-time-quantized-in-othe/
    • Discusses whether time has the same structure as a mathematical continuum.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. 1985. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. 2015. Metaphysics, Fourth Edition. Westview Press.
    • An introduction to metaphysics by a distinguished proponent of the A-theory of time.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. 2006. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our big bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Wallace, David. 2021. Philosophy of Physics: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford University Press.
    • An excellent introduction to the philosophical issues within physics and how different philosophers approach them.
  • Wasserman, Ryan. 2018. Paradoxes of Time Travel, Oxford University Press.
    • A detailed review of much of the philosophical literature about time travel. The book contains many simple, helpful diagrams.
  • Whitehead, A. N. 1938. Modes of Thought. Cambridge University Press.
    • Here Whitehead describes his “process philosophy” that emphasizes the philosophy of becoming rather than of being, for instance, traveling the road rather than the road traveled.
  • Whitrow, G. J. 1980. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.