History of Utilitarianism

The term “utilitarianism” is most-commonly used to refer to an ethical theory or a family of related ethical theories.  It is taken to be a form of consequentialism, which is the view that the moral status of an action depends on the kinds of consequences the action produces. Stated this way, consequentialism is not committed to any view of what makes certain outcomes desirable. A consequentialist could claim (rather absurdly) that individuals have a moral obligation to cause as much suffering as possible. Similarly, a consequentialist could adopt an ethical egoist position, that individuals are morally required to promote their own interests. Utilitarians have their own position on these matters. They claim it is utility (such as happiness, or well-being), which makes an outcome desirable, they claim that an outcome with greater utility is morally preferable to one with less. Contrary to the ethical egoist, the utilitarian is committed to everyone’s interests being regarded as equally morally important.

These features are fairly uncontroversial among utilitarians, but other features are the subject of considerable dispute. How “utility” should be understood is contested. The favoured ways of understanding utilitarianism have varied significantly since Jeremy Bentham—seen as the “father of utilitarianism”—produced the first systematic treatise of the view. There have also been proponents of views that resemble utilitarianism throughout history, dating back to the ancient world.

This article begins by examining some of the ancient forerunners to utilitarianism, identifying relevant similarities to the position that eventually became known as utilitarianism. It then explores the development what has been called “classical utilitarianism”. Despite the name, “classical utilitarianism” emerged in the 18th and 19th centuries, and it is associated with Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. Once the main features of the view are explained, some common historical objections and responses are considered. Utilitarianism as the social movement particularly influential in the 19th century is then discussed, followed by a review of some of the modifications of utilitarianism in the 20th century. The article ends with a reflection on the influence of utilitarianism since then.

Table of Contents

  1. Precursors to Utilitarianism in the Ancient World
    1. Mozi
    2. Epicureanism
  2. The Development of Classical Utilitarianism
    1. Hutcheson
    2. Christian Utilitarianism
    3. French Utilitarianism
  3. Classical Utilitarianism
    1. Origin of the Term
    2. Bentham
    3. Features of Classical Utilitarianism
      1. Consequentialism
      2. Hedonism
      3. Aggregation
      4. Optimific (‘Maximising’)
      5. Impartiality
      6. Inclusivity
    4. Early Objections and Mill’s Utilitarianism
      1. Dickens’ Gradgrindian Criticism
      2. The ‘Swine’ Objection and ‘Higher Pleasures’
      3. Demandingness
      4. Decision Procedure
  4. The Utilitarian Movement
  5. Utilitarianism in the Twentieth 20th Century
    1. Hedonism and Welfarism
    2. Anscombe and ‘Consequentialism’
    3. Act versus Rule
    4. Satisficing and Scalar Views
  6. Utilitarianism in the Early 21st Century
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Precursors to Utilitarianism in the Ancient World

While utilitarianism became a refined philosophical theory (and the term “utilitarianism” was first used) in the 18th century, positions which bear strong similarities to utilitarianism have been deployed throughout history. For example, similarities to utilitarianism are sometimes drawn to the teachings of Aristotle, the Buddha and Jesus Christ. In this section, two views from the ancient world are considered. The first is of Mozi, who is sometimes described as the first utilitarian (though this is disputed). The second is Epicurus, whose hedonism was influential on the development of utilitarianism.

a. Mozi

Mozi (c.400s-300s B.C.E)—also known as Mo-Tzu, Mo Di and Mo Ti—led the Mohist school in Chinese philosophy, which, alongside the Confucian school, was one of the two major schools of thought during the Warring States period (403-221 B.C.E.). In this article, some salient similarities between his ethical outlook and utilitarianism will be observed. For a more detailed discussion of Mozi’s philosophy, including how appropriate it is to view him as a utilitarian, see the article devoted to his writings.

Utilitarians are explicit in the importance of impartiality, namely that the well-being of any one individual is no more important than the well-being of anyone else. This is also found in Mozi’s writings. The term jian’ai is often translated as “universal love”, but it is better understood as impartial care or concern. This notion is regarded as the cornerstone of Mohism. The Mohists saw excessive partiality as the central obstacle to good behaviour. The thief steals because they do not sufficiently care for the person they steal from, and rulers instigate wars because they care more for their own good than the people whose countries they invade. Thus, Mozi implored his followers to “replace partiality with impartiality”.

His emphasis on the importance of impartiality bears striking similarities to arguments later made by Bentham and Sidgwick. Mozi’s impartiality is like the utilitarian’s in that it implies inclusivity and equality. Every person’s interests are morally important, and they are equally important.

A second clear similarity between Mohists and utilitarians is the focus on consequences when considering the justifications for actions or practices. Unlike the Confucians, who saw rituals and custom as having moral significance, Mozi would reject this unless they could satisfy some useful purpose. If a custom serves no useful purpose, it should be disposed of. For example, it was customary at the time to spend large quantities of resources on funeral rites, but Mozi criticised this due to these conferring no practical benefit. This scrutiny of the status quo, and willingness to reform practices deemed unbeneficial is something found repeatedly in utilitarians in the 18th century and beyond (see section 4).

A particularly interesting suggestion made by Mozi is that the belief in ghosts and spirts should be encouraged. He claimed that historically, a belief in ghosts who would punish dishonesty or corrupt behaviour had motivated people to act well. Upon seeing scepticism about ghosts in his time, Mozi thought this meant people felt free to act poorly without punishment: “If the ability of ghosts and spirits to reward the worthy and punish the wicked could be firmly established as fact, it would surely bring order to the state and great benefit to the people” (The Mozi, chapter 31).

Mozi approves of the belief in the existence of ghosts, whether or not they actually exist, because of the useful consequences of this belief. This suggestion that utility may count in favour of believing falsehoods is reminiscent of a claim by Henry Sidgwick (1838-1900). Sidgwick was a utilitarian, but he acknowledged that the general public may be happier if they did not believe utilitarianism was true. If that was the case, Sidgwick suggests that the truth of utilitarianism should be kept secret, and some other moral system that makes people happier be taught to society generally. This controversial implication——that it might be morally appropriate to mislead the general public when it is useful——is radical, but it is a reasonable inference from this type of moral view, which Mozi embraced.

A significant difference between Mozi and the utilitarians of the 18th century is the theory of the good he endorsed. Mozi sought to promote a range of goods, specifically order, wealth and a large population. Classical utilitarians, however, regarded happiness or pleasure as the only good. This view was presented shortly after Mozi, in Ancient Greece.

b. Epicureanism

The Epicureans, led by Epicurus (341-271 B.C.E.), were (alongside the Stoics and the Skeptics) one of the three major Hellenistic schools of philosophy. The Epicureans were hedonistic, which means that they saw pleasure as the only thing that was valuable in itself, and pain (or suffering) as the only ultimately bad thing.

This commitment is shared by later utilitarians, and it can be seen in slogans like “the greatest happiness of the greatest number”, which was later used by Frances Hutcheson and popularised by Bentham (though he later disliked it as too imprecise).

Though the Epicureans saw pleasure as the only good, the way they understood pleasure was somewhat different to the way one might imagine pleasure today. They realised that the most intense pleasures, perhaps through eating large amounts of tasty food or having sex, are short-lived. Eating too much will lead to pain further down the line, and appetites for sex dwindle. Even if appetites do not fade, becoming accustomed to intense pleasures may lead to sadness (a mental pain) further down the line if one’s desires cannot be satisfied. Thus, Epicurus endorsed finding pleasure in simple activities that could be reliably maintained for long periods of time. Rather than elaborate feasts and orgies, Epicurus recommended seeking joy in discussion with friends, developing tastes that could easily be satisfied and becoming self-sufficient.

A particular difference between the Epicurean view of pleasure and the view of later hedonists is that Epicurus regards a state of painlessness—being without any physical pains or mental disturbances—as one of pleasure. In particular, Epicurus thought we should aim towards a state of ataraxia, a state of tranquillity or serenity. For this reason, the Epicurean view is similar to a version of utilitarianism sometimes known as negative utilitarianism, which claims that morality requires agents to minimise suffering, as opposed to the emphasis typical utilitarians play on promoting happiness.

Epicurus also differed from utilitarians in terms of the scope of his teachings. His guidance was fairly insular, amounting to something like egoistic hedonism—one that encouraged everyone to promote their own personal pleasure. Epicurus encouraged his followers to find comfort with friends, and make their families and communities happy. This is a stark difference from the attitude of radical reform exhibited by Jeremy Bentham and his followers, who intended to increase the levels of happiness all over the world, rather than merely in the secluded garden that they happened to inhabit.

Epicurean teaching continued long after Epicurus’ death, with Epicurean communities flourishing throughout Greece. However, with the rise of Christianity, the influence of Epicureanism waned. There are several reasons that may explain this. The metaphysical picture of the world painted by Epicureans was one lacking in divine providence, which was seen as impious. Furthermore, the Epicurean attitude towards pleasure was often distorted, and portrayed as degrading and animalistic. This criticism, albeit unfair, would go on to be a typical criticism of utilitarianism (see 3.d.ii). Due to these perceptions, Epicureanism was neglected in the Middle Ages.

By the 15th century, this trend had begun to reverse. The Italian Renaissance philosopher Lorenzo Valla (1407-1457) was influenced by Epicurus and the ancient Epicurean Lucretius (99-55 B.C.E.). Valla defended Epicurean ideas, particularly in his work, On Pleasure, and attempted to reconcile them with Christianity. Thomas More (1478-1535) continued the rehabilitation of hedonism. In Utopia (1516), More describes an idyllic society, where individuals are guided by the quest for pleasure. The Utopian citizens prioritised spiritual pleasures over animalistic ones, which may have made this view more amenable to More’s contemporaries. Later still, the French philosopher Pierre Gassendi (1592-1695) embraced significant portions of Epicurean thinking, including the commitment to ataraxia (tranquillity) as the highest pleasure. The Renaissance revival of Epicureanism paved the way for the development of utilitarianism.

2. The Development of Classical Utilitarianism

In the 17th and early 18th century, philosophical positions that are recognisably utilitarian gained prominence. None of the following labelled themselves as “utilitarians” (the word had not yet been introduced) and whether some should properly be described in this way is a matter of some dispute, but each contain significant utilitarian features and have an important place in the intellectual history.

a. Hutcheson

Francis Hutcheson (1694-1795) was a Scots-Irish philosopher sometimes seen as the first true utilitarian. Geoffrey Scarre (1996) suggests that Hutcheson deserves the title of “father of British utilitarianism” (though Bentham is more typically described in this kind of way). As with many attributions of this sort, this is heavily contested. Colin Heydt, for instance, suggests Hutcheson should not be classified as a utilitarian. Regardless, his contribution to the development of utilitarian thought is undisputed.

Hutcheson was a moral sense theorist. This means he thought that human beings have a special faculty for detecting the moral features of the world. The moral sense gives a person a feeling of pleasure when they observe pleasure in others. Further, the sense approves of actions which are benevolent. Benevolent actions are those that aim towards the general good.

One particular passage that had significant influence on utilitarians can be found in Hutcheson’s Inquiry Concerning the Original of Our Ideas of Virtue or Moral Good (1725):

In the same manner, the moral evil, or vice, is as the degree of misery, and number of sufferers; so that, that action is best, which procures the greatest happiness for the greatest numbers; and that, worst, which, in like manner, occasions, misery.

The phrase, “greatest happiness for the greatest number(s)” became one of the major slogans of utilitarianism. This seems to be the first appearance of the phrase in English (though it was used decades previously by Leibniz). Because of this position, it is easy to see how Hutcheson can be interpreted as a utilitarian.

One important distinction between Hutcheson and utilitarians, however, is that he views the motives of individuals as what is valuable, rather than the state of affairs the action brings about. Whereas utilitarians view happiness itself as good, Hutcheson thinks it is the motives identified by our moral sense (which aim at happiness), which are good.

Hutcheson anticipates something similar to Mill’s higher/lower pleasures distinction (see 3.d.ii). In his posthumously published A System of Moral Philosophy, he says there are “a great variety of pleasures of different and sometimes inconsistent kinds, some of them also higher and more durable than others” (1755). Hutcheson associates dignity and virtuous action with the higher pleasures, and claims that “the exercise of virtue, for some short period, provided it is not succeeded by something vicious, is of incomparably greater value than the most lasting sensual pleasures”. These “higher” pleasures include social and intellectual activities, and are held to trump “lower” pleasures, like food and sex. Hutcheson is aware, however, that pleasures are “generally blended”. Lower pleasures may be accompanied by socialising, moral qualities, or friendship.

This appreciation for the variety and combinations of pleasure adds a rich texture to Hutcheson’s account. However, these intricacies may indicate a further difference between his view and utilitarianism. For the utilitarian, for a certain type of activity to be more valuable than another, this must be explained in terms of pleasure. Hutcheson, however, seems to determine which pleasures are higher and lower based on prior views he harbours about which are noble. He supposes that people who possess “diviner faculties and fuller knowledge” will be able to judge which pleasures are better, and thus which it is better to engage in and promote in others.

Hutcheson is further distinct from utilitarians in that it is unclear whether he is actually trying to provide a theory of right action. He notes that our moral sense can discern which actions are best and worst, but he does not explicitly link this to an account of what it is our duty to do, or what it would be wrong for us not to do. This could be viewed simply as something Hutcheson omitted, but alternatively could be interpreted as a version of scalar utilitarianism (see section 5.d).

b. Christian Utilitarianism

Utilitarianism today is usually seen as a secular doctrine. From Bentham onwards, utilitarians typically attempted to describe their worldview without referring to any theistic commitments. In the 18th century, however, there was a distinct branch of early utilitarians who gave theistic justifications for their position. Participants in this strand are sometime referred to as “Anglican utilitarians”. Richard Cumberland (1631-1718) was an early example of this, and was later followed by John Gay (1699-1745), Soame Jenyns (1704-1787), Joseph Priestley (1733-1804), and William Paley (1743-1805). Paley’s Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy (1785) was the first to bring utilitarianism to a wider audience, and it remained the most discussed example of utilitarianism well into the 19th century.

Cumberland was a natural law theorist, which is to say that moral truths are determined by or can be derived from features of the world, including the nature of human beings. In Cumberland’s view, because human beings find pleasure good and pain bad, they can discern that God wills that they promote pleasure and diminish pain. In A Treatise of the Laws of Nature (1672), he writes: Having duly pondered on these matters to the best of our ability, our minds will be able to bring forth certain general precepts for deciding what sort of human actions may best promote the common good of all beings, and especially of rational beings, in which the proper happiness of each is contained. In such precepts, provided they be true and necessary, is the law of nature contained.

So, armed only with empirical facts about the world, like experiences of pleasure and pain, and our possessing the faculty of reason, Cumberland claimed that it was possible to ascertain that human beings have a God-given duty to promote the general happiness.

While secular versions of utilitarianism came to dominate the tradition, this type of argument for utilitarianism actually has some distinct advantages. Notably, this can provide simple answers to the question “Why be moral?”. Everyone may value their own happiness, so this provides everyone with a reason to act in ways that increase their own happiness. However, there are instances where promoting one’s own personal happiness seem to conflict with the common good. John Gay issued a challenge for secular versions of utilitarianism to explain why an agent in such a position has reason to sacrifice their own happiness to help others: “But how can the Good of Mankind be any Obligation to me, when perhaps in particular Cases, such as laying down my Life, or the like, it is contrary to my Happiness?” (Concerning the Fundamental Principle of Virtue or Morality, 1731).

For the Anglican utilitarian, this question is resolved easily. While it might appear that an individual’s happiness is best promoted by a selfish act contrary to the public good, this is only because rewards of the afterlife have not been taken into account. When someone recognises the infinite rewards for complying with God’s will (or infinite punishments for defying it), they will realise that acting in the interests of the common good (promoting the general happiness) is actually in their best interests. This kind of solution to the problem of moral motivation is not available for secular utilitarians.

Although theistically grounded versions of utilitarianism may stand on firmer ground when it comes to the problem of moral motivation, there are costs too. There are challenges to the existence of an all-powerful creator (see arguments for atheism). Even if those are avoided, the natural law reasoning championed by the Anglican utilitarians might not be persuasive. The inference from what kinds of things people enjoy to a specific divine purpose of human beings (for example, Priestley claims that we can discover that God “made us to be happy”) is one that might be scrutinised. Furthermore, the theistic utilitarian faces a version of the Euthyphro problem: is happiness good because God desires it, or does God desire happiness because it is good?

The Anglican utilitarians foresaw some of the problems that would become serious areas of discussion for later utilitarians. In Priestley, for instance, one can find a discussion of what would later be known as the “demandingness objection” (discussed in section 3.d.iii).

William Paley’s utilitarianism is of historical interest because he discussed several features of the view that have concerned utilitarians and their critics since. For example, he raised the question of whether certain types of action usually deemed to be evil, such as bribery or deceit, might be regarded as morally good if they lead to good consequences:

It may be useful to get possession of a place…or of a seat in parliament, by bribery or false swearing: as by means of them we may serve the public more effectually than in our private station. What then shall we say? Must we admit these actions to be right, which would be to justify assassination, plunder and perjury; or must we give up our principle, that the criterion of right is utility? (The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy, 1785: 854).

In his answer to this question, Paley suggests a form of what would later be known as rule-utilitarianism (discussed further in section 5.c). He suggests that two types of consequences of an action can be distinguished—the general consequences and the particular consequences. The particular consequence is what follows from a specific action, that is, bribing someone on a given occasion. The general consequence is what follows from acting on that rule, and it is the general consequence Paley views as more important. Paley suggests that, in considering whether bribery to gain a political position is right, one should think about the consequences if everyone accepted a rule where bribery was allowed. Once this is taken into account, Paley argues, it will become apparent that bribery is not useful.

Like Epicurus, Paley is somewhat dismissive of animalistic pleasures, but his explanation for this differs. He makes a distinction between pleasures, which are fleeting, and happiness, which he seems to regard as possessed over longer periods of time:

Happiness does not consist in the pleasures of sense, in whatever profusion or variety they be enjoyed. By the pleasures of sense, I mean, as well the animal gratifications of eating, drinking, and that by which the species is continued, as the more refined pleasures of music, painting, architecture, gardening, splendid shows, theatric exhibitions; and the pleasures, lastly, of active sports, as of hunting, shooting, fishing, etc. (Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy, 35)

He claims these bodily pleasures do not contribute to happiness because they are too fleeting and “by repetition, lose their relish”. Rather, Paley sees happiness as consisting in social activities, the exercise of our faculties, and good health. Paley might then be seen as suggesting that happiness is something one does, rather than something one experiences. He also emphasises the importance of “prudent constitution of the habits” (which bears similarities to Aristotelian ethics). This distinguishes Paley somewhat from the classical utilitarians, who regarded pleasure as a mental state, and happiness consisting in pleasure as well as an absence of pain.

William Paley is also somewhat distinctive due to his conservative values. Unlike Bentham and his followers, who were radical reformers, Paley found the status quo satisfactory. This difference arises for a few different reasons. One explanation for this is that he thought that happiness was relatively evenly distributed around society. He did not think, for instance, that the wealthy were significantly happier than the poor. He argued that this was the case because of his view of happiness—he thought the wealthy and the poor had fairly equal access to social activities, utilising their faculties, and good health.

In his discussions of what acts should be regarded as criminal and what the punishments should be, he does appeal to utility, but also regularly to scripture. As a consequence, Paley’s position on many social issues is one that would now be considered extremely regressive. For example, he favoured financial penalties for women guilty of adultery (but did not suggest the same for men) and argued that we should not pursue leisure activities (like playing cards or frequenting taverns) on the Sabbath. Like many of the later utilitarians, Paley did argue that slavery should be abolished, criticising it as an “odious institution”, but he was in favour of a “gradual” emancipation.

The Anglican utilitarians were extremely influential. Bentham was familiar with their work, citing Joseph Priestley in particular as a major inspiration. Many of the discussions that later became strongly associated with utilitarianism originated here (or were at least brought to a wider audience). An obvious difference between many of the Anglican utilitarians and the later (Benthamite) utilitarians is the conservativism of the former. (One notable exception is perhaps found in Priestley, who celebrated the French Revolution. This reaction was met with such animosity—his chapel was destroyed in a riot—that he emigrated to America.) The Anglican utilitarians were committed to the traditional role of the church and did not endorse anything like the kind of radical reform championed by Bentham and his followers.

c. French Utilitarianism

The development of utilitarianism is strongly associated with Britain. John Plamenatz described the doctrine as “essentially English”. However, a distinctly utilitarian movement also took place in 18th-century France. Of the French utilitarians, Claude Helvétius (1715-1751) and François-Jean de Chastellux (1734-1788) are of particular interest.

While the dominant form utilitarianism in Britain in the 18th century was the Anglican utilitarianism of John Gay (see 2.b), the French utilitarians argued from no divine commitments. Helvétius’ De L’Espirit (1758) was ordered to be burned due to its apparently sacrilegious content. That the French utilitarians were secular has some implications that make it historically noteworthy. As mentioned above (section 2.b), one advantage of the theistically-grounded utilitarianism is that it solves the problem of moral motivation—one should promote the well-being of others because God desires it, and, even if one is fundamentally self-interested, it is in one’s interests to please God (because one’s happiness in the afterlife depends on God’s will). Without the appeal to God, giving an account of why anyone should promote the general happiness, rather than their own, becomes a serious challenge.

Helvétius poses an answer to this challenge. He accepts that the general good is what we should promote, but also, influenced by the Hobbesian or Mandevillian view of human nature, holds that people are generally self-interested. So, people should promote the general good, but human nature will mean that they will promote their individual goods. Helvétius takes this to show that we need to design our laws and policies so that private interest aligns with the general good. If everyone’s actions will be directed towards their own good, as a matter of human nature, “it is only by incorporating personal and general interest, that they can be rendered virtuous.” For this reason, he claims that morality is a frivolous science, “unless blended with policy and legislation”. Colin Heydt identifies this as the key insight that Bentham takes from Helvétius.

Taking this commitment seriously, Helvétius considered what it took to make a human life happy, and what circumstances would be most likely to bring this about. He approached this with a scientific attitude, suggesting “that ethics ought to be treated like all the other sciences. Its methods are those of experimental physics”. But this raises the question of how policy and legislation be designed to make people happy.

Helvétius thought that to be happy, people needed to have their fundamental needs met. In addition to this, they needed to be occupied. Wealthy people may often find themselves bored, but the “man who is occupied is the happy man”. So, the legislator should seek to ensure that citizens’ fundamental needs are met, but also that they are not idle, because he viewed labour as an important component in the happy life. Helvétius treats the suggestion that labour is a negative feature of life with scorn, claiming:

“To regard the necessity of labour as the consequence of an original sin, and a punishment from God, is an absurdity. This necessity is, on the contrary, a favour from heaven” (A Treatise on Man: His Intellectual Faculties and Education, volume 2).

Furthermore, certain desires and dispositions are amenable to an individual’s happiness, so the legislator should encourage citizens to psychologically develop a certain way. For instance, people should be persuaded that they do not need excessive wealth to be happy, and that in fact, luxury does not enhance the happiness of the rich. Because of this, he proposed institutional restrictions on what powers, privileges, and property people could legally acquire. In addition, Helvétius suggested that education should serve to restrict citizens’ beliefs about what they should even want to require, that is, people could be taught (or indoctrinated?) not to want anything that would not be conducive the public good.

As poverty does negatively affect the happiness of the poor, Helvétius defended limited redistribution of wealth. Specifically, one suggestion he offered was to force families that have shrunk in size to relinquish some of their land to families which have grown. Exactly what is the best way to move from a state of misery (which he thought most people were in) to a state of happiness would vary from society to society. So specific suggestions may have limited application. Helvétius urged that this transformation should take place and might involve changing how people think.

In Chastellux’s work, the view that governments should act primarily to promote public happiness is explicit. In his De la Félicité publique (1774), he says: It is an indisputable point, (or at least, there is room to think it, in this philosophical age, an acknowledged truth) that the first object of all governments, should be to render the people happy.

Accepting this, Chastellux asked how this should be done. What is most noteworthy in Chastellux is that he pursued a historical methodology, examining what methods of governments had been most successful in creating a happy populace, so that the more successful efforts might be emulated and developed. From his observations, Chastellux claimed that no society so far had discovered the best way to ensure happiness of its citizens, but he does not find this disheartening. He notes that even if all governments had aimed at the happiness of their citizens, it would “be no matter of astonishment” that they had so far failed, because human civilisation is still in its infancy. He harbours optimism that the technological developments of the future could help improve the quality of life of the poorest in society.

While the historical methodology found in Chastellux may be questionable (Geoffrey Scarre describes it as “fanciful and impressionistic”), it showed a willingness to utilise empirical measures in determining what is most likely to promote the general happiness.

Of the French utilitarians, Helvétius had the greatest influence on later developments in Britain; he was regularly acknowledged by Jeremy Bentham, William Godwin, and John Stuart Mill. The conviction to create good legislation and policies forms the crucial desire of utilitarians in the political realm. In Helvétius, we can also see the optimism of the radical reformer utilitarians, holding to his hope that “wise laws would be able without doubt to bring about the miracle of a universal happiness”.

3. Classical Utilitarianism

While many thinkers were promoting recognisably utilitarian ideas long before him, it is Jeremy Bentham who is credited with providing the first systematic account of utilitarianism in his Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (1789).

a. Origin of the Term

The word “utilitarianism” is not used in Jeremy Bentham’s Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation (IPML). There he introduces the ‘principle of utility’, that “principle which approves or disapproves of every action whatsoever, according to the tendency it appears to have to augment or diminish the happiness of the party whose interest is in question; or, what is the same thing in other words to promote or to oppose that happiness”. Bentham borrows the term “utility” from David Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (1739-1740). There, Hume argues that for any character traits viewed as virtues, this can be explained by the propensity of those traits to cause happiness (‘utility’). Bentham later reported that upon reading this, he “felt as if scales had fallen from my eyes”.

The first recorded use of the word “utilitarianism” comes in a letter Bentham wrote in 1781. The term did not catch on immediately. In 1802, in another letter, Bentham was still resisting the label “Benthamite” and encouraging the use of “utilitarian” instead. While Bentham seems to have originated the term, this does not seem to have been common knowledge. John Stuart Mill, in Utilitarianism (1861) notes that he found the term in an 1821 John Galt novel. He was using it as early as 1822, when he formed a society called the ‘Utilitarian Society’, which was a group of young men, who met every two weeks for three and half years. After this, the term entered common parlance.

b. Bentham

As well as providing what became the common name of the view, Jeremy Bentham (1748-1832) is credited with making utilitarianism a systematic ethical view. His utilitarian inclinations were sparked when he read Joseph Priestley’s Essay on Government (1768), and he claims that the “greatest happiness of the greatest number” is the measure of right and wrong in his Fragment on Government (1776). It is in IMPL, however, where the ideas are presented most clearly and explicitly.

In IPML, Bentham defines utility as “that property in any object, whereby it tends to produce benefit, advantage, pleasure, good, or happiness”. In the opening of IPML, Bentham makes clear his view that utility (pleasure and pain) determines the rightness or wrongness of an action. He states:

Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne. They govern us in all we do, in all we say, in all we think: every effort we can make to throw off our subjection, will serve but to demonstrate and confirm it.

As well as emphasising hedonism as the standard of rightness (normative hedonism), Bentham seems here committed to a certain view about our motivation. He not only claims that the rightness or wrongness of an action is determined by pain/pleasure, but also that these notions determine what we will do. Specifically, following Hobbes, Bentham thought that everyone is, as a matter of fact, always motivated by their own happiness, a form of psychological egoism. If we accept the ought-implies-can principle, the idea that we can only be required to act in ways that it is actually possible for us to act, this is a difficult position to reconcile with the claim that we ought to promote the general happiness. If human beings are necessarily always motivated by their own self-interest, imploring them to promote the interests of others seems futile.

Bentham was aware of this sort of objection. One type of response he gives is to claim that we should ensure, where possible, that society is structured so that when individuals act in their own interests, this is conducive to the general happiness. This answer is reminiscent of the strategy deployed by Helvétius (section 2.c). When the incentive and punitive structures in society are structured in this way, self-interested actions benefit the wider community. Second, he suggests that individuals do benefit from living in a community where the general good is promoted. This amounts to a denial that any self-interested actions actually does clash with the general good. This strikes many as implausible, as any actions that would be good for the general good but bad for the individual acting, would disprove it. This move is rendered unnecessary if psychological egoism is abandoned, and given some of the arguments against the view, Bentham’s utilitarianism may be better off without that psychological claim.

One of the ideas Bentham is known for is the “hedonic calculus” or “felicific calculus” (though Bentham never himself used either of these terms). The crux of this is the thought that to determine the value of an action, one can use a kind of moral ledger. On one side of the ledger, the expected good effects of the action and how good they are can be added up. On the other side, the bad effects of the action can be added. The total value of the negative effects can then be subtracted from the value of the positive effects, giving the total value of the action (or policy). This idea was first introduced by Pierre Bayle (1647-1706), though Bentham adds considerable depth to the idea.

In considering how to value a quantity of pleasure (or pain), Bentham observed that we can evaluate it with regards to seven dimensions or elements. These are the pleasure’s:

(1) intensity

(2) duration (how long the pleasure lasts)

(3) certainty/uncertainty (the probability it will occur)

(4) propinquity or remoteness (how soon the pleasure will occur)

(5) fecundity (how likely it is to be followed by further pleasures)

(6) purity (how likely it is to be followed or accompanied by pains)

(7) extent (the number of persons it extends to)

Bentham included a poem in the second edition of IPML, so that people could remember these dimensions:

Intense, long, certain, speedy, fruitful, pure –
Such marks in pleasures and in pains endure.
Such pleasures seek if private be thy end:
If it be public, wide let them extend
Such pains avoid, whichever be thy view:
If pains must come, let them extend to few.

On Bentham’s view, these are all the features we must know of a certain pleasure. Importantly, even a frivolous game, if it turns out to have the same intensity, duration, and so forth, is just as good as intellectual pursuits. He says this explicitly about the game push-pin (a children’s game where players try to hit each other’s pins on a table): “Prejudice apart, the game of push-pin is of equal value with the arts and sciences of music and poetry”. Notably, this view set him apart from those who claimed a difference in kind between types of pleasures, like John Stuart Mill (see section 3.d.ii).

While Bentham does suggest that this kind of happiness arithmetic would be successful in determining what actions are best, he does not suggest that we consider every factor of every possible action in advance of every given action. This would obviously be excessively time consuming, and could result in a failure to act, which would often be bad in terms of utility. Rather, we should use our experience as a guide to what will likely promote utility best.

Though the term “greatest happiness for the greatest number” has become strongly associated with utilitarianism and is used by Bentham in earlier works, he later distanced himself from it, because in it “lurks a source of misconception”. One interpretation of the expression suggests we should ascertain the largest number of people benefited by an action (the greatest number), and benefit those as much as possible, no matter what the effects are on the other remainder. For instance, we could imagine a policy that enslaved 1% of the population for the benefit of the 99%, greatly benefiting that majority, but making the enslaved miserable. A policy like this, which ignores entirely the well-being of some, is certainly not what Bentham intended. He later speaks simply of the “greatest happiness principle”, the requirement to promote the greatest happiness across the whole community.

Bentham was an active reformer. He argued for radical political changes, including arguing for the right to vote for women, significant prison reforms, the abolition of slavery, the elimination of capital punishment, and in favour of sexual freedom. Each of these was argued for on grounds of utility. Bentham gained a number of intellectual followers. One of the most notorious of these was James Mill (1783-1836), who was one of the major figures in 19th century philosophy and economics. Mill’s reputation was international, attracting attention from Karl Marx (1818-1883), and is still seen as one of the most important figures in utilitarianism, but today he is overshadowed by his son, John Stuart. John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) met Bentham when he was two years old, and, under the influences of Bentham and his father, became one of utilitarianism’s fiercest champions. John Stuart Mill’s defence of utilitarianism is still the most widely read today (discussed in more depth in 3.d).

c. Features of Classical Utilitarianism

It is a matter of some dispute what features make a moral theory appropriate for the name utilitarianism. The core features mentioned here are those commonly associated with classical utilitarianism. It is not clear how many of those associated with utilitarianism, even in 19th century Britain, actually accepted classical utilitarianism, that is, who thought the correct moral theory possessed these six features. For instance, though John Stuart Mill is regarded as the man who did most to popularise the view, he rejected elements of this picture, as he explicitly rejected the requirement to maximise utility (see Jacobson 2008 for a discussion of how Mill deviates from this orthodox picture). Regardless of how many actually held it, the view consisting of these claims has become the archetype of utilitarianism. The more a moral view departs from these, the less likely it is to be deemed a version of utilitarianism.

i. Consequentialism

Views are classed as consequentialist if they place particular emphasis on the role of the outcome of actions, rather than features intrinsic to the actions (for example, whether it involves killing, deception, kindness, or sympathy) as forms of deontology do, or what the actions might reveal about the character of the agent performing them (as does virtue ethics).

Classical utilitarianism is uncontroversially consequentialist. Later variations, such as rule-utilitarianism (see section 5c), which regard consequences as having an important role, are less easily categorised. Versions of utilitarianism that do not assess actions solely in terms of the utility they produce are sometimes referred to as indirect forms of utilitarianism.

ii. Hedonism

Following the Epicureans, classical utilitarianism regards pleasure as the only thing that is valuable in itself. Pleasure is the “utility” in classical utilitarianism. On this view, actions are morally better if they result in more pleasure, and worse if they result in less.

Hedonists differ on how they understand pleasure. The Epicureans, for instance, regarded a state of tranquility (ataraxia) as a form of pleasure, and one that should be pursued because it is sustainable. Classical utilitarians typically regard pleasure as a mental state which the individual experiences as positive. Bentham evaluated pleasures across his seven elements, but importantly thought no pleasure was superior in kind to any other. For example, the pleasure from eating fast food is no less valuable than the pleasure one may attain from reading a great novel, though they may differ in terms of sustainability (one might become ill fairly quickly from eating fast food) or propinquity (pleasure from fast food may be quick, whereas it may take some time to come to appreciate a complex prose). This parity of pleasures was something John Stuart Mill disagreed with, leading to a notable difference in their views (see 3.d.ii).

Many contemporary utilitarians, recognising issues with hedonism, have instead adopted welfarism, the weaker claim that the only thing that is intrinsically valuable is well-being, that is, whatever it is that makes a life go well. Well-being could be given a hedonistic analysis, as in classical utilitarianism, but alternatively a preference-satisfaction view (which states that one’s well-being consists in having one’s preferences satisfied) or an objective-list view (which states that lives go well or badly depending on how well they satisfy a set list of criteria) could be adopted.

iii. Aggregation

The utilitarian thinks that everyone’s individual pleasure is good, but they also think it makes sense to evaluate how good an outcome is by adding together all the respective quantities of pleasure (and pain) of the individuals affected. Imagine that we can assign a numerical value to how happy every person is (say 10 is as happy as you could be, zero is neither happy or unhappy, and -10 is as unhappy as you could be). The aggregative claim holds that we can simply add the quantities together for an action to see which is the best.

One of the criticisms sometimes made of utilitarianism is that ignores the separateness of persons. When we decide actions based on aggregated sums of happiness, we no longer think about individuals as individuals. Instead, they are treated more like happiness containers. A related complaint is that determining the best outcome by adding together the happiness scores of every individual can obscure extremes that might be morally relevant. This has implications that many find counterintuitive, such as that this method may judge an outcome where one person undergoes horrific torture to be a good outcome, so long as enough other people are happy.

iv. Optimific (‘Maximising’)

Hedonists believe pleasure is the only good. Aggregation commits utilitarians to the idea that the pleasures and pains of different people can be added to compare the value of outcomes. One could accept these claims without thinking that a moral agent must always do the best. Classical utilitarianism does hold that one is required to perform the best action. In other words, classical utilitarianism is a maximising doctrine (“maximising” is another word introduced into English by Jeremy Bentham).

Maximising views are controversial. One reason for this is that they eliminate the possibility of supererogatory actions, that is, actions that are beyond the call of duty. For example, we might think donating most of your income to charity would be a wonderful and admirable thing to do, but not something that is usually required. The maximiser claims that you must do the best action, and this is the case even if doing so is really difficult, or really costly, for the person acting.

Some of the most persistent criticisms of utilitarianism concern how much it demands. In response, some of the 20th-century revisions of the view sought to abandon this element, for example, satisficing versions and scalar views (5.d).

v. Impartiality

Utilitarians embrace a form of egalitarianism. No individual’s well-being is more important than any other’s. Because of this, utilitarians believe that it is just as important to help distant strangers as it is to help people nearby, including one’s friends or family. As Mill puts it, utilitarianism requires an agent “to be as strictly impartial as a disinterested and benevolent spectator”.

In fact, sometimes impartiality may require a person to help a stranger instead of a loved one. William Godwin (1756-1836) highlighted this in a famous example. He described a scenario where a fire broke out, and a bystander was able to save either Archbishop Fénelon (a famous thinker and author of the time) or a chambermaid. Godwin argued that because of Fénelon’s contributions to humanity, a bystander would be morally required to save him. Moreover, Godwin claimed, one would be required to save Fénelon even if the chambermaid was one’s mother.

This requirement for strict impartiality strikes many as uncomfortable, or even alienating. When challenged, Godwin defended his position, but insisted that scenarios where this kind of sacrifice is required would be rare. In most instances, he thought, people do happen to be more able to bring happiness to themselves or their loved ones, because of greater knowledge or increased proximity. In this way, some partial treatment, like paying more attention to one’s friends or family, can be defended impartially.

vi. Inclusivity

The classical utilitarian accepts the hedonist commitment that happiness is what is valuable. It is a separate question whose happiness should count. Utilitarians answer this with the most inclusive answer possible—everyone’s. Any subject that is capable of pleasure or pain should be taken into consideration.

This has some radical implications. As well as human beings, many animals can also experience pleasure or pain. On this topic, one passage from Bentham is regularly deployed by defenders of animal rights:

It may come one day to be recognized, that the number of legs, the villosity of the skin, or the termination of the os sacrum, are reasons equally insufficient for abandoning a sensitive being to the same fate. What else is it that should trace the insuperable line? Is it the faculty of reason, or perhaps, the faculty for discourse? …the question is not, Can they reason? nor, Can they talk? but, Can they suffer? (IPML, chapter XVII)

Reasoning of this sort extends the domain of morally relevant beings further than many were comfortable with. Bentham was not alone among utilitarians in suggesting that non-human life should be taken into moral consideration. In his Utilitarianism, Mill noted that lives full of happiness and free from pain should be “secured to all mankind; and not to them only, but, so far as the nature of things admits, to the whole sentient creation.” This emphasis on the importance of the well-being of animal life, as well as human life, has persisted into contemporary utilitarian thought.

d. Early Objections and Mill’s Utilitarianism

In the 19th century, knowledge of utilitarianism spread throughout society. This resulted in many criticisms of the view. Some of these were legitimate challenges to the view, which persist in some form today. Others, however, were based upon mistaken impressions.

In 1861, frustrated by what he saw as misunderstandings of the view, John Stuart Mill published a series of articles in Fraser’s Magazine, introducing the theory and addressing some common misconceptions. This was later published as a book, Utilitarianism (1863). Mill was somewhat dismissive of the importance of this work. In letters, he described it as a “little treatise”, and barely mentioned it in his Autobiography (unlike all his other major works). Despite this, it is the most widely consulted defence of utilitarianism.

Here are some of the early criticisms of utilitarianism, and Mill’s responses.

i. Dickens’ Gradgrindian Criticism

In the 19th century, utilitarianism was perceived by some of its detractors as cold, calculating, and unfeeling. In his 1854 novel, Hard Times, Charles Dickens portrays a caricature of a utilitarian in the character of Thomas Gradgrind. Gradgrind, who is described explicitly as a utilitarian, is originally described as follows:

Thomas Gradgrind, sir. A man of realities. A man of facts and calculations. A man who proceeds upon the principle that two and two are four, and nothing over, and who is not to be talked into allowing for anything over. Thomas Gradgrind, sir—peremptorily Thomas—Thomas Gradgrind. With a rule and a pair of scales, and the multiplication table always in his pocket, sir, ready to weigh and measure any parcel of human nature, and tell you exactly what it comes to. It is a mere question of figures, a case of simple arithmetic. You might hope to get some other nonsensical belief into the head of George Gradgrind, or Augustus Gradgrind, or John Gradgrind, or Joseph Gradgrind (all supposititious, non-existent persons), but into the head of Thomas Gradgrind—no, sir!

The reputation of utilitarians for being joyless and overly fixated on precision was so established that John Stuart Mill addressed this misconception in Utilitarianism (1861). Mill complains that the opponents of utilitarianism have been mistaken that the view opposes pleasure, which he describes as an “ignorant blunder”. This view of the position may come, in part, from its name, and the focus on utility, or what is useful or functional—terms seldom associated with happiness.

Despite Mill’s frustrations with this criticism, the colloquial use of the word “utilitarian” continued to have similar connotation long after his death. In an episode of the sitcom Seinfeld, for example, Elaine notes that while the female body is aesthetically appealing, the “The male body is utilitarian — it’s for getting around. It’s like a Jeep” (1997). The implication is that utilitarian objects being functional rather than fun. This association may be unfortunate and unfair, as Mill argues, but it has been a persistent one.

This particular criticism may be unfortunate, but aspects of it—such as the focus on measurement and arithmetic—foreshadow some of the utilitarianism’s later criticisms, like John Rawls’ (1921-2002) suggestion that it cannot appreciate the separateness of persons, or Bernard Williams’ (1923-2003) complaint that the view insists that people regard themselves as merely nodes in a utility calculus.

ii. The ‘Swine’ Objection and ‘Higher Pleasures’

Another criticism that was regularly levelled against utilitarianism was that it is unfit for humans, because the focus on pleasure would not allow for the pursuits of uniquely human goods. This was a criticism also made (unfairly) of the Epicureans. It suggested that the hedonist would endorse a life consisting entirely in eating, sleeping, and having sex, which were devoid of more sophisticated activities like listening to music, playing card games, or enjoying poetry. The allegation suggests that the utilitarian proffers an ethics for swine, which is undignified for human beings. Consequently, the opponent suggests, the view must be rejected.

There are several ways a utilitarian could respond to this. They could make use of the Epicurean strategy, which is to suggest that the animalistic pleasures are just as good, but they are not sustainable. If you try to spend all your time eating delicious food, your appetite will run out, and you may make yourself sick. Pleasures of the mind, however, might be pursued for a longer time. If someone is able to take pleasure in listening to poetry or music, this might also be more readily satisfied. Indulging in pleasures of these sorts does not require scarce resources, and so could be less vulnerable to contingent environmental factors. A bad harvest may ruin one’s ability to enjoy a certain food, but it would not tarnish one’s ability to enjoy a piece of music or think about philosophy. This is the type of response that would satisfy Bentham. He thought that no type of pleasure was intrinsically better than another (that push-pin “is of equal value with the arts and sciences of music and poetry”).

Mill disagreed with Bentham on this matter, claiming instead that “some kinds of pleasure are more desirable and more valuable than others”. On his view, the pleasure gained from appreciating a sophisticated poem or an opera could be better than the pleasure from push-pin, even if both instances had the same duration, were equally intense, and had no additional relevant consequences.

This was a controversial aspect of Mill’s utilitarianism, and many found his justification for this unconvincing. He suggested that someone who had experienced two different kinds of pleasures would be able to discern which was the higher quality. Some people may not be able to appreciate some forms of pleasure, because of ignorance or a lack of intelligence, just as animals are not capable of enjoying a great novel. But, according to Mill, it is generally better to be the intelligent person than the fool, and better to be a human than a pig, even a happy one: “It is better to be a human being dissatisfied than a pig satisfied; better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a fool satisfied. And if the fool, or the pig, is of a different opinion, it is only because they only know their own side of the question” (Mill, Utilitarianism, chapter 2).

Mill’s suggestion, however, invites scrutiny. Many people do opt for “lower” pleasures, rather than “higher” ones, even when capable of enjoying both. One might also wonder whether some mixture of different kinds of pleasures might be preferable to restricting oneself to pleasures more closely associated with the intellect and reasoning (which Mill regards as superior), yet Mill does not consider this, or that different people may simply have different preferences regarding some of these kinds of pleasure, without that indicating any superiority or inferiority. Mill’s proposal raises many questions, so a utilitarian may find that the simpler, Benthamite ‘quantitative hedonism’ is preferable to Mill’s ‘qualitative hedonism’ (see here for further discussion of this distinction).

While this aspect of Mill’s utilitarianism is contentious, a similar type of argument is still utilised to justify the claim that animals have a different moral status (see also the discussion of animals and ethics).

iii. Demandingness

Because of the classical utilitarian commitment to maximisation, utilitarianism is sometimes accused of being excessively demanding. Everyone is required, according to the classical utilitarian, to bring about the most happiness. If an individual can best serve the general utility by living an austere, self-sacrificial life, this is what the utilitarian calculus demands. However, this strikes many as counterintuitive. According to common-sense moral thinking, people can use their time in myriad ways without having morally failed, but the maximiser states that one must always do the very best. Morality then threatens to encroach on every decision.

Mill was aware of this criticism. He identified two particular ways this might be a concern.

First, utilitarianism may be seen to require that moral agents are always thinking about duty, that this must be the motive in every action a person performs. Thinking about morality must be central in all a person’s decisions. This, he claims, is a mistake. Mill argues that the business of ethics is people’s conduct, not whether they act because of a conscious desire to bring about the greatest utility. He provides an example to illustrate this. If a bystander notices someone drowning, what matters is that they save them, whatever their reasons might be:

He who saves a fellow creature from drowning does what is morally right, whether his motive be duty, or the hope of being paid for his trouble: he who betrays the friend that trusts him, is guilty of a crime, even if his object be to serve another friend to whom he is under greater obligations. (Utilitarianism, chapter 2)

Here, Mill makes a distinction between the moral worth of the action and the moral worth of an agent. As far as the action is concerned, the drowning person being rescued is what matters. Whether the person doing the saving is an admirable person might depend on whether they did it for noble reasons (like preventing suffering) or selfish reasons (like the hope of some reward), but utilitarianism is primarily concerned with what actions one should do. In other places, Mill does talk extensively about what makes a virtuous person, and this is strongly connected to his utilitarian commitments.

Second, Mill was aware of the worry that utilitarianism might dominate one’s life. If every action one performs must maximise utility, will this not condemn one to be constantly acting for the sake of others, to the neglect of the things that make one’s own life meaningful? Mill was dismissive of this worry, claiming that “the occasions on which any person (except one in a thousand) has it in his power to do this on an extended scale, in other words, to be a public benefactor, are but exceptional”. Sometimes, one might find oneself in a situation where one could save a drowning stranger, but such scenarios are rare. Most of the time, Mill thought, one individual does not have the ability to affect the happiness of others to any great degree, so they can focus on improving their own situation, or the situations of their friends or families.

In the 19th century, this response may have been more satisfactory, but today it seems wildly implausible. Due to the existence of effective charities, and the ability to send resources around the world instantly, an affluent person can make enormous differences to the lives of people halfway around the world. This could be in terms of providing food to countries experiencing famine, inoculations against debilitating illnesses or simply money to alleviate extreme poverty. In his time, perhaps Mill could not have been confident that small sums of money could prevent considerable suffering, but today’s middle classes have no such excuse.

Because of technological developments, for many people in affluent countries, living maximising happiness may require living a very austere life, while giving most of their resources to the world’s poorest people. This appears implausible to many people, and this intuition forms the basis of one of the major objections to utilitarianism today. Some have responded to this by moving to rule, satisficing, or scalar forms of utilitarianism (see section 5).

iv. Decision Procedure

The utilitarian claims that the right action is that which maximises utility. When an agent acts, they should act in a way that maximises expected utility. But how do they determine this? One way is to consider every possible action one might do, and for each one, think about all the consequences one might expect (with appropriate weightings for how likely each consequence would be), come up with an expected happiness value for each action, and then pick the one with the highest score. However, this sounds like a very time-consuming process. This will often be impossible, as time is limited. Is this a problem for utilitarians? Does it make the view impractical?

Mill was aware of this concern, that “there is not time, previous to action, for calculating and weighing the effects of any line of conduct on the general happiness.” However, Mill thinks this objection obscures relevant information gained throughout human history. As people have acted in all sorts of ways, with varying results, any person today can draw upon humanity’s wealth of knowledge of causes and effects, as well as from their own experiences. This background knowledge provides reasons to think that some actions are likely to be more conducive to happiness than others. Often, Mill thinks, an agent will not need to perform any calculations of utility to determine which actions best promote happiness; it will just be obvious.

Mill ridicules the suggestion that individuals would be completely ignorant of what actions they must do if they were to adopt utilitarianism. There would, of course, be no need to contemplate on each occasion whether theft or murder promote utility—and even if there were, he suggests that this would still not be particularly puzzling. Acknowledging this criticism with some derision, Mill notes that “there is no difficulty in proving any ethical standard whatever to work ill, if we suppose universal idiocy to be conjoined with it”.

However, this kind of objection relates to an interesting question. Should a utilitarian endorse reasoning like a utilitarian? Mill suggests that it is preferable in many occasions to make use of rules that have been previously accepted. But how does one determine whether to use a rule and when to perform a utility calculation? Some of Mill’s remarks about how to use rules have prompted commentators to regard him as a rule-utilitarian (see section 5.c). Utilitarianism also seems to allow for the possibility that no one should believe that utilitarianism is true. If, for instance, it turns out that the world would be a happier place if everyone accepted a Kantian ethical theory, the utilitarian should, by their own lights, favour a world where everyone believes Kant. Henry Sidgwick (1838-1900) took this seriously, and he defended the idea that perhaps only an “enlightened few” should know the truth about morality, and keep it hidden from the masses.

Utilitarians can say that the truth of their view does not depend on what the correct decision procedure is. Whether performing a utility calculus or simply acting on common-sense morality leads to most happiness, they can still say that the right actions are those that lead to happiness being maximised, that is, that utilitarianism is the correct theory. However, given that utilitarians do tend to care about how people should act, and want to change behaviours, the question of how one should decide what to do is pertinent. Exactly what the relationship between utilitarianism and practical reasoning is, or should be, according to utilitarians, is a persisting question.

4. The Utilitarian Movement

Today, utilitarianism is regarded primarily as a moral theory which can be used to determine the obligations of an individual in a situation. This focus on individual morality gives an inaccurate impression of the Utilitarian movement (‘Utilitarianism’ with a capital ‘U’ will be used to indicate the movement, as distinct from the moral theory) in the 18th and 19th century. The Utilitarians were keenly focused on social change. This took the form of revising social policy with the aim of improving the general happiness. Bentham is explicit on the first page of Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation that the principle of utility applies not only to actions of private individuals, but also to “every measure of government”. Helvétius was similarly minded, emphasising the importance of laws that could make people happy, as well as ways to change people, so that they could be made happy more easily.

The Utilitarian project was an ambitious one. Every policy, every law, every custom was open to scrutiny. If it was deemed not conducive to general happiness, the Utilitarians suggested it should be disregarded or replaced. Because they were so willing to disregard customs—even those the general community placed high values on—the Utilitarians were a radical group. This section discusses some of the policies supported by Utilitarians.

A common plea from Utilitarians, deemed radical at the time, was for women’s suffrage. A notable example of this comes from Harriet Taylor (1807-1858). Taylor befriended and later married John Stuart Mill, and she is regarded as a prominent Utilitarian in her own right. She had a significant influence on Mill’s writing (exactly how much influence she had is a matter of dispute, though Mill said in his introduction to On Liberty, “Like all that” he had “written for many years, it belongs as much to her as to” him). In Taylor’s Enfranchisement of Women (1851), she argues that women should have equal political rights to men, including the right to vote and to serve in juries. In fact, Taylor’s arguments call for the equal access to all spheres of public life. In particular, she claimed women should be able to enter all professions, including running for political office.

In the same essay, Taylor condemned slavery. This was another point Utilitarians were largely united on. Bentham also criticised slavery on the grounds that it had negative effects on the general happiness, and when abolition was discussed in parliament, he actively opposed compensating slave-traders for their losses. John Stuart Mill was also vocal on the topic of slavery and the just treatment of former slaves. As a Member of Parliament, Mill chaired the Jamaica Committee, which aimed to prosecute Governor Eyre of Jamaica, who used excessive and deadly force in suppressing an uprising at Morant Bay in 1865. This pitted Mill against many prominent intellectuals, including his contemporary (and sometimes friend) Thomas Carlyle (1795-1881). Mill received assassination threats for his position, which was seen by many as overly sympathetic towards the Black Jamaicans.

Like his wife, John Stuart Mill also campaigned for the rights of women. He thought not only that society would benefit considerably from the liberation of women, but also that there would be an “unspeakable gain in private happiness to the liberated half of the species; the difference to them between a life of subjection to the will of others, and a life of rational freedom”. As well as making the case in his book The Subjection of Women (which drew heavily upon material from his wife’s previous work), Mill spoke passionately in favour of expanding suffrage in Parliament. This cause clearly moved Mill, who was reportedly arrested as a teenager for distributing information about contraception. Henry Sidgwick was also an active campaigner, particularly regarding education reform. He became one of the leading voices advocating for access to higher education for women and was one of the organisers of “Lectures for Ladies” at Cambridge, which, in 1871, led to the formation of Newnham College, an all-women’s college (at the time, women were not allowed to attend the university).

Jeremy Bentham, in the early 1800s, wrote essays defending sexual freedom. He was motivated by the harsh way that society treated homosexuals and thought there could be no utilitarian justification for this. While many members of the public may have been offended by these behaviours, they were not harmful, but the restrictions and punishments faced by the marginalised groups were.

Utilitarians were also vocal in defense of animal welfare. Bentham argued that the feature relevant for whether an entity has moral status is “is not, Can they reason? nor, Can they talk? but, Can they suffer?”. Mill, despite famously arguing that humans can appreciate “higher pleasures” than animals, is insistent that animal welfare is relevant. He thought it obvious that, for a utilitarian, any practice that led to more animal suffering than human pleasure was immoral, thus it seems likely he would have opposed factory farming practices.

Not all of the proposals endorsed by Utilitarians are looked on quite so favourably with a modern eye. While John Stuart Mill argued, from utilitarian principles, for a liberal democratic state, he suggested that those arguments did not apply to “barbarians” who were “unfit for representative government”. Infamously, Mill considered India unsuitable for democracy, and is seen by some as an apologist for the British Empire for defending this kind of view.

Another infamous proposal from the Utilitarians comes from Bentham in the domain of prison reform. Bentham suggested an innovative prison design known as the “panopticon” (1787). This was designed to be humane and efficient. A panopticon prison is circular with cells around the edges, and an inspector’s lodge in the middle, situated so that the guard can view each cell. From the inspection lodge each cell would be visible, but blinds to the inspector’s lodge would prevent the prisoners from seeing whether they were being watched, or even whether a guard was present, at any given time. The mere possibility that they were being watched at any time, Bentham thought, would suffice to ensure good behaviour. He also thought that this would prevent guards from mistreating prisoners, as that too would be widely visible. The panopticon was later popularised and criticised by Michel Foucault in Discipline and Punish. The panopticon is notorious for imposing psychological punishment on inmates. Never knowing whether one is being watched can be psychologically stressful. For better or worse, the panopticon anticipated many developments in surveillance present in early 21st-century society.

In each of these proposals, the Utilitarians insisted that policies, laws, or customs must be justified by their effects. If the effects were positive, they were good and could be maintained. If the effects were negative, they should be dispelled with. This attitude, and the radical political ambition, characterised Utilitarianism as a movement.

5. Utilitarianism in the Twentieth 20th Century

Despite its many detractors, utilitarianism in one form or another continued to hold sway as one of the major moral approaches throughout the 20th century. Philippa Foot (1920-2010) claimed in 1985 that it “tends to haunt” even those who reject the view. That being said, during the 20th century, new criticisms of the view emerged, and previous objections were explored in considerably more depth. This resulted in additional complications to the view, novel defences, and variations on the classical view.

In this section, some of the major 20th-century developments for utilitarianism are discussed. Some advances that may have been described under the heading of “utilitarianism” previously have been omitted, because they veer too far from the core view. For example, G. E. Moore’s “ideal utilitarianism”, despite the name, departs significantly from the central utilitarian commitments, so is not included here (in the early 21st century, this was typically regarded as a non-utilitarian form of consequentialism—see this discussion for further details).

a. Hedonism and Welfarism

The hedonism embraced by classical utilitarianism is controversial. Some of the reasons for this have already been discussed, such as the suggestion that pleasure is all that matters is crude or a doctrine “worthy of swine”. An additional complaint that this offers an impoverished theory of the good suggests that it ignores the values of achievement or authenticity. One example that exemplifies this is the thought experiment of the “experience machine” given by Robert Nozick (1938-2002):

Suppose there were an experience machine that would give you any experience you desired. Superduper neuropsychologists could stimulate your brain so that you would think and feel you were writing a great novel, or making a friend, or reading an interesting book. All the time you would be floating in a tank, with electrodes attached to your brain. Should you plug into this machine for life, pre-programming your life’s experiences? (Nozick, Anarchy, State & Utopia, 1974)

Nozick supposes that many people would be reluctant to plug into the machine. Given that the machine could guarantee more pleasurable experiences than life outside it could, this suggests that people value something other than simply the pleasurable sensations. If some of the things that one would miss out on inside the machine (like forming relationships or changing the world in various ways) are valuable, this suggests that hedonism—the claim that only pleasure matters—is false.

In the 20th century, as a result of rejecting the hedonistic component, several utilitarians modified their view, such that utility could be understood differently. One way to change this is to suggest that the classical view is right that it is important that a person’s life goes well (their well-being), and also that this is the only thing that matters morally, but that it gets something wrong about what makes a person’s life go well. Rather than just a matter of how much pleasure a life contains, we might think well-being is best understood in another way. If a view holds that the well-being of individuals—however this is best understood—is the only moral value, it is welfarist.

One account of well-being regards preferences as especially important, such that a person’s life is made better by their preferences being satisfied. This view, which when joined to utilitarianism is known as preference utilitarianism, is able to evade the problems caused by the experience machine, because some of our preferences are not just to experience certain sensations, but to do things and to have relationships. These preferences would remain unsatisfied in an artificial reality, so the preference utilitarian could regard a person’s life as going less well as a result (even if they do not know it).

However, preference utilitarianism has problems of its own. For instance, some preferences simply do not seem that important. John Rawls (1921-2002) imagines a case of an intellectually gifted person, whose only desire is to count blades of grass. According to preference-satisfaction theories of well-being, if such a person is able to spend all their time grass-counting, their life is as good as it can be. Yet many have the intuition that this life is lacking some important features, like participating in social relationships or enjoying cultural pursuits. If there is some value lacking in the life of the grass-counter, this implies something wrong with the preference-satisfaction account of well-being.

Another objection against preference utilitarianism concerns preferences a person no longer has. If someone has a preference for something to happen, then forgets about it, never to find out whether it occurs, does this actually make their life go better? To take this to an extreme, does a person’s life improve if one of their preferences is satisfied after they die? Utilitarians who are more hedonistically inclined find this implausible. Peter Singer, one of utilitarianism’s most famous defenders, previously endorsed preference utilitarianism, but has since abandoned this in favour of hedonistic utilitarianism.

b. Anscombe and ‘Consequentialism’

G.E.M. Anscombe (1919-2001) was an influential figure in 20th century philosophy. She was not a utilitarian but was responsible for significant changes in how utilitarianism was discussed. In ‘Modern Moral Philosophy’ (1958), Anscombe expressed extremely critical views about the state of moral philosophy. She thought the notion of morality as laws or rules that one must follow made little sense in a secular world; that without a divine law-maker (God), injunctions to or prohibitions against acting some way lacked authority. She was similarly critical of Kant, claiming that the idea that one could legislate for oneself was “absurd”. Among other things, her paper—and Anscombe’s general rejection of the major ethical theories of her day—sparked renewed interest in Aristotelian ethical thinking and the development of virtue ethics.

Anscombe also criticised utilitarianism as a “shallow philosophy” because it suggested that it was always able to give clear-cut answers. She claimed that in ethics borderline cases are ubiquitous. In these cases, there is not an obvious answer, and even if there is a correct answer, it might be something one should be conflicted about.

Anscombe’s criticisms of utilitarians since Sidgwick were particularly scathing. She claimed that they held a view of intention that meant everything that was foreseen was intended—a view she thought was “obviously incorrect”. Anscombe invented the term “consequentialism” as a name for the view she was critical of, distinguishing this from “old-fashioned Utilitarianism”. After Anscombe, “consequentialism” became a broader label than utilitarianism. As well as the classical view outlined above, “consequentialism” allowed for different conceptions of the good. For example, a view that thought that only consequences matter, but held that—as well as happiness or well-being—beauty is intrinsically valuable would be consequentialist, but not utilitarian (this is why G.E. Moore’s “ideal utilitarianism” has not been discussed in this article, as he makes claims of this sort). Today, the term “consequentialism” is used more often by philosophers than “utilitarianism”, though many of those identifying as consequentialists either embrace or sympathise with utilitarianism.

c. Act versus Rule

In the 20th century, a distinction that had been noted previously was scrutinised and given a name. This is the act/rule distinction. Versions of rule-utilitarianism had been given before the 20th century. The rule utilitarian claims that, rather than examining the consequences of any particular action to determine the ethical status of an action, one should consider whether it is compatible with a set of rules that would have good consequences if (roughly) most people accepted them.

The term “rule-utilitarian” was not in popular use until the second half of the 20th century, but the central claim—that the rules one is acting in accordance with determine the moral status of one’s actions—was much older. George Berkeley (1685-1753) is sometimes suggested to have offered the first formulation of rule-utilitarianism. He suggested that we should design rules that aim towards the well-being of humanity, that “The Rule is framed with respect to the Good of Mankind, but our Practice must be always shaped immediately by the Rule”.

Later in the 18th century, William Paley (1743-1804) also suggested something like rule-utilitarianism in response to the problem that his view would seemingly condone horrible behaviours, like lying one’s way to a powerful position, or murder, if the consequences were only good enough. Paley rejected this by claiming that the consequences of the rule should be considered. If one was willing to lie or cheat or steal in order to promote the good, Paley suggested this would licence others to lie, cheat, or steal in other situations. If others did, from this precedent, decide that lying, cheating, and stealing were permissible, this would have bad consequences, particularly when people did these actions for nefarious reasons. Thus, Paley reasoned, these behaviours should be prohibited. Later still, in his Utilitarianism, John Stuart Mill proposed what some have interpreted as a form of rule-utilitarianism, though this is controversial (a discussion on this dispute can be found here).

While principles that can properly be regarded as rule-utilitarian were proposed before, it was in the 20th century that these views received the name “rule-utilitarianism” and were given extensive scrutiny.

Before considering some of the serious objections to rule-utilitarianism, it is worth noting that the view has some apparent advantages over classical act-utilitarianism. Act-utilitarians have a difficulty in making sense of prohibitions resulting from rights. Jeremy Bentham famously described the idea that there might exist moral rights as “nonsense on stilts”, but this is a controversial position. It is often argued that we do have rights, and that these are unconditional and inalienable, such as the right to bodily autonomy. If one person has a right to bodily autonomy, this is understood as requiring that others do not use their body in certain ways, regardless of the consequences. However, basic act-utilitarianism cannot make sense of this. In a famous example, Judith Jarvis Thomson (1929-2020) imagines a surgeon who realises they could save the life of five patients by killing a healthy person who happens to be the right blood type. Assuming they could avoid special negative consequences from the surgeon killing an innocent healthy person (perhaps they can perform the killing so that it looks like an accident to prevent the public panicking about murderous surgeons), an act-utilitarian seems committed to the view that the surgeon should kill the one in order to save the five. The rule-utilitarian, however, has a neat response. They can suggest that a set of rules that gives people rights over their own bodies—rights that preclude surgeons killing them even if they have useful organs—leads to more happiness overall, perhaps because of the feeling of safety or self-respect that this might result in. So the rule-utilitarian can say such a killing was wrong, even if on this particular occasion it would have resulted in the best consequences.

Another potential advantage for rule-utilitarians is that they may have an easier time avoiding giving extremely demanding moral verdicts. For the act-utilitarian, one must always perform the action which has the best consequences, regardless of how burdensome this might be. Given the state of the world today, and how much people in affluent countries could improve the lives of those living in extreme poverty with small sums of money, act-utilitarianism seems to imply that affluent people in developed nations must donate the vast majority of their disposable income to those in extreme poverty. If buying a cup of coffee does not have expected consequences as good as donating the money to the Against Malaria Foundation to spend on mosquito nets, the act-utilitarian claims that buying the cup of coffee is morally wrong (because of the commitment to maximising). Rule-utilitarians can give a different answer. They consider what moral rule would be best for society. One of the reasons act-utilitarianism is so burdensome for a given individual is that the vast majority of people give nothing or very little. However, if every middle-class person in developed nations donated 10% of their income, this might be sufficient to eliminate extreme poverty. So perhaps that would be the rule a rule-utilitarian would endorse.

Despite some advantages, rule-utilitarianism does have many problems of its own. One issue pertains to the strength of the rules. Consider a rule prohibiting lying. This might seem like a good rule for a moral code. However, applying this rule in a case where a would-be murderer asks for the location of a would-be victim would seemingly have disastrous consequences (Kant is often ridiculed for his absolutist stance in this case). One response here would be to suggest that the rules could be more specific. Maybe “do not lie” is too broad, and instead the rule “do not lie, unless it saves a life” is better? But if all rules should be made more and more complicated when this leads to rules with better consequences, this defeats the purpose of the rules. As J. J. C. Smart (1920-2012) pointed out, the view then seems to collapse into a version of act-utilitarianism. In Smart’s words:

 I conclude that in every case if there is a rule R the keeping of which is in general optimific, but such that in a special sort of circumstances the optimific behaviour is to break R, then in these circumstances we should break R…. But if we do come to the conclusion that we should break the rule…what reason remains for keeping the rule?  (Smart, ‘Extreme and Restricted Utilitarianism’, 1956)

On the other hand, one might suggest that the rules stand, and that lying is wrong in this instance. However, this looks like an absurd position for a utilitarian to take, as they claim that what matters is promoting good consequences, yet they will be forced to endorse an action with disastrous consequences. If they suggest rule-following even when the consequences are terrible, this is difficult to reconcile with core consequentialist commitments, and looks like—in Smart’s terms—“superstitious rule worship”. Is it not incoherent to suggest that only the consequences matter, but also that sometimes one should not try to bring about the best consequences? The rule-utilitarian thus seems to face a dilemma. Of the two obvious responses available, one leads to a collapse into act-utilitarianism and the other leads to incoherence.

Richard Brandt (1910-1997) was the first to offer a rigorous defence of rule-utilitarianism. He offers one way of responding to the above criticism. He suggests that the rules should be of a fairly simple sort, like “do not lie”, “do not steal” and so on, but in extreme scenarios, these rules will be suspended. When a murderer arrives at the door asking for the location of one’s friends, this is an extreme example, so ordinary rules can be suspended so that disaster can be averted. A version of this strategy, where the correct set of rules includes an “avoid disaster” rule, is defended by contemporary rule-consequentialist Brad Hooker (Hooker’s own view is not strictly rule-utilitarian because his code includes an a priori caveat—he thinks there is some moral importance to prioritising the worst-off in society, over and above their benefits to well-being).

A second problem for rule-utilitarians concerns issues relating to partial compliance. If everyone always acted morally decently and followed the rules, this would mean that certain rules would not be required. For instance, there would be no rules needed for dealing with rule-breakers. But it is not realistic to think that everyone will always follow the rules. So, what degree of compliance should a rule-utilitarian cater for when devising their rules? Whatever answer is given to this is likely to look arbitrary. Some rule-utilitarians devise the rules not in terms of compliance, but acceptance or internalisation. Someone may have accepted the rules but, because of weakness of will or a misunderstanding, still break the rules. Formulating the view this way means that the resulting code will incorporate rules for rule-breakers.

A further dispute concerns whether rule-utilitarianism should really be classified as a form of utilitarianism at all. Because the rightness of an action is only connected to consequences indirectly (via whether or not the action accords to a rule and whether the rule relates to the consequences in the right way), it is sometimes argued that this should not count as a version of utilitarianism (or consequentialism) at all.

d. Satisficing and Scalar Views

A common objection to act-utilitarianism is that, by always requiring the best action, it demands too much. In ordinary life, people do not view each other as failing whenever they do something that does not maximise utility. One response to this is to reconstrue utilitarianism without the claim that an agent must always do the best. Two attempts at such a move will be considered here. One replaces the requirement to do the best with a requirement to do at least good enough. This is known as satisficing utilitarianism. A second adjustment removes obligation entirely. This is known as scalar utilitarianism.

Discussions of satisficing were introduced into moral philosophy by Michael Slote, who found maximising versions of utilitarianism unsatisfactory. Satisficing versions of utilitarianism hope to provide more intuitive verdicts. When someone does not give most of their money to an effective charity, which may be the best thing they could do, they might still do something good enough by giving some donation or helping the needy in other ways. According to the satisficing utilitarian, there is a standard which actions can be measured against. A big problem for satisficing views arises when they are challenged to say how this standard is arrived at—how do they figure out what makes an action good enough? Simple answers to the question have major issues. If, for instance, they suggest that everyone should bring about consequences at least 90% as good as they possibly can, this suggests someone can always permissibly do only 90% of the best. But in some cases, doing what brings about 90% of the best outcome looks really bad. For example, if 10 people are drowning, and an observer can decide how many to save without any cost to themselves, picking 9—and allowing one to die needlessly—would be a monstrous decision. Many sophisticated versions of satisficing utilitarianism have been proposed, but none so far has escaped some counterintuitive implications.

The problem of where to set the bar is not one faced by the scalar utilitarians, as they deny that there is a bar. The scalar utilitarian acknowledges that what makes actions better or worse is their effects on peoples’ well-being but shuns the application of “rightness” and “wrongness”. This approach avoids problems of being overly or insufficiently demanding, because it makes no demands. The scalar view avoids deontic categories, like permissible, impermissible, required, and forbidden. Why might such a view seem appealing? For one thing, the categories of right and wrong are typically seen as binary—the act-utilitarian says actions are either right or wrong, a black-and-white matter. If the moral quality of actions is extremely richly textured, this might look unsatisfactory. Furthermore, using the blunt categories of “right” and “wrong”, someone confident that they have acted rightly may become morally complacent. Unless you are doing the very best, there is room for improvement, scope for doing better, which can be obfuscated by viewing acts as merely permissible or impermissible. While some utilitarians have found this model attractive, abandoning “right” and “wrong” is a radical move, and perhaps unhelpful. It might seem very useful, for instance, for some actions to be regarded as forbidden. Similarly, an account of morality which sets the boundaries of permissible action may be much more useful for regulating behaviour than viewing it merely as matters of degrees.

6. Utilitarianism in the Early 21st Century

In moral theory, discussions of utilitarianism have been partly subsumed under discussions of consequentialism. As typically classified, utilitarianism is simply a form of consequentialism, so any problems that a theory faces in virtue of being consequentialist are also faced by utilitarian views. Some consequentialists will also explicitly reject the label of “utilitarianism” because of its commitment to a hedonistic or welfarist account of the good. Brad Hooker, for example, endorses a rule-consequentialism where not only the total quantity of happiness matters (as the utilitarian would suggest), but where the distribution of happiness is also non-instrumentally important. This allows him to claim that a world with slightly less overall happiness, but where the poorest are happier, is all-things-considered better than a world with more total happiness, but where the worst-off are miserable.

While many of the discussions concern consequentialism more broadly, many of the arguments involved in these discussions still resemble those from the 19th century. The major objections levelled against consequentialism in the early 21st century—for example, whether it demands too much, whether it can account for rights or justice, or whether it allows partial treatment in a satisfactory way—target its utilitarian aspects.

The influence of utilitarian thinking and the Utilitarian movement is still observable. One place where Utilitarian thinking is particularly conspicuous is in the Effective Altruism movement. Like the 19th century Utilitarians, Effective Altruists ask what interventions in the world will actually make a difference and promote the behaviours that are the best. Groups such as Giving What We Can urge individuals to pledge a portion of their income to effective charities. What makes a charity effective is determined by rigorous scientific research to ascertain which interventions have the best prospects for improving peoples’ lives. Like the classical utilitarians and their predecessors, they answer the question of “what is good?” by asking “what is useful?”. In this respect, the spirit of utilitarianism lives on.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ahern, Dennis M. (1976): ‘Is Mo Tzu a Utilitarian?’, Journal of Chinese Philosophy 3 (1976): 185-193.
    • A discussion about whether the utilitarian label is appropriate for Mozi.
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. (1958): ‘Modern Moral Philosophy’, Philosophy, 33(124), 1-19.
    • Influential paper where Anscombe criticises various forms of utilitarianism popular at the time she was writing, and also introduces the word “consequentialism”.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1776): A Fragment on Government, F. C. Montague (ed.) Oxford: Clarendon Press (1891).
    • One of the first places utilitarian thinking can be seen in Bentham’s writings.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1787): ‘Panopticon or The Inspection House’, in The Panopticon Writings. Ed. Miran Bozovic (London: Verso, 1995). p. 29-95
    • This is where Bentham proposes his innovative prison model, the “panopticon”. It also includes lengthy discussions of how prisoners should be treated, as well as proposals for hospitals, “mad-houses” and schools.
  • Bentham, Jeremy (1789): An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation., Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1907.
    • Seen as the first rigorous account of utilitarianism. It begins by describing the principle of utility, and it continues by considering applications of the principle in morality and legal policy.
  • Brandt, R. B. (1959): Ethical Theory, Englewood-Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall.
    • This book offers a clear formulation of rule-utilitarianism, and it is one of the earliest resources that refers to the view explicitly as “rule-utilitarianism”.
  • Chastellux, François-Jean de (1774): De la Félicité publique, (“Essay on Public Happiness”), London: Cadell; facsimile reprint New York: Augustus Kelley, 1969.
    • This book is where Chastellux investigates the history of human societies in terms of their successes (and failures) in securing happiness for their citizens.
  • Cumberland, Richard (1672): A Treatise of the Laws of Nature (De Legibus Naturae), selection printed in British Moralists 1650-1800 (1991), D.D. Raphael (ed.), Hackett.
    • Here Cumberland discusses the nature of things, and introduces his natural law view, which leads to some utilitarian-like conclusion.
  • Dabhoiwala, Faramerz (2014): ‘Of Sexual Irregularities by Jeremy Bentham—review’, The Guardian,  https://www.theguardian.com/books/2014/jun/26/sexual-irregularities-morality-jeremy-bentham-review.
    • Article about a recent book discussing Bentham’s position on sexual ethics.
  • De Lazari-Radek, Karazyna and Singer, Peter (2014): The Point of View of the Universe, Oxford University Press.
    • An exposition of Henry Sidgwick’s utilitarianism, considering his view in light of contemporary ethical discussions.
  • Dickens, Charles (1854): Hard Times, Bradbury & Evans.
    • Novel featuring Thomas Gradgrind—a caricature of a utilitarianist.
  • Foot, Philippa (1985): ‘Utilitarianism and the Virtues’, Mind, 94(374), 196-209.
    • Foot—an opponent of utilitarianism—notes how utilitarianism has been extremely persistent. She suggests that one reason for this is that utilitarianism’s opponents have been willing to grant that it makes sense to think of objectively better and worse “states of affairs”, and she scrutinises this assumption.
  • Gay, John (1731): Concerning the Fundamental Principle of Virtue or Morality, selection printed in British Moralists 1650-1800 (1991), D.D. Raphael (ed.), Hackett.
    • This includes Gay’s challenge to secular versions of utilitarianism, to explain moral motivation.
  • Helvétius, Claude (1777): A Treatise on Man, His Intellectual Faculties, and His Education, 2 vols., London: B. Law and G. Robinson.
    • Published after Helvétius’ death, this work includes lengthy discussions of how society may be altered to better promote happiness.
  • Heydt, Colin (2014): ‘Utilitarianism before Bentham’, in The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism, pp. 16-37). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCO9781139096737.002
    • This paper describes the intellectual development of utilitarianism, drawing attention to the non-utilitarian origins, as well as the distinct religious and secular variations of utilitarianism in Britain, and the French utilitarians.
  • Hooker, Brad (2000): Ideal Code, Real World: A Rule-consequentialist Theory of Morality. Oxford University Press.
    • This book offers a rigorous defence of rule-consequentialism. Hooker’s account is not rule-utilitarian (because he claims that some priority should be given to the worst-off in society), but he offers defences against all the major objections to rule-utilitarianism.
  • Hruschka, Joachim, 1991. “The Greatest Happiness Principle and Other Early German Anticipations of Utilitarian Theory,” Utilitas, 3: 165–77.
    • Hruschka dispels some myths about the origins of the term “greatest happiness for the greatest number”, and he explores the history of the idea in Germany prior to the development of utilitarianism in Britain.
  • Hutcheson, Francis (1725): Inquiry Concerning the Original of Our Ideas of Virtue or Moral Good, treatise II of An Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, selection printed in British Moralists 1650-1800 (1991), D.D. Raphael (ed.), Hackett.
    • This work provides a detailed account of Hutcheson’s moral and aesthetic theory.
  • Hutcheson, Francis (1755): A System of Moral Philosophy, three volumes, London.
    • Published after Hutcheson’s death, this book was written specifically for students. It further develops Hutcheson’s moral thinking, and it includes a discussion of different kinds of pleasures.
  • Jacobson, Daniel (2008): ‘Utilitarianism without Consequentialism: The Case of John Stuart Mill’, Philosophical Review, 117(2), 159-191.
    • This article makes a case for distinguishing the view of John Stuart Mill and his contemporaries from consequentialism, as the view is discussed today. This locates “Utilitarianism” within a certain socio-historical context and identifies ways in which it differs in its commitments than the “consequentialism”.
  • MacAskill, William (2015): Doing Good Better: Effective Altruism and How You Can Make a Difference, Random House.
    • An introduction to the Effective Altruism movement, which can be seen as an intellectual descendent of the Utilitarians.
  • Mill, John Stuart (1861): Utilitarianism, originally published in Fraser’s Magazine, now widely available, e.g., https://www.utilitarianism.net/books/utilitarianism-john-stuart-mill/1
    • This is an attempt from John Stuart Mill to demonstrate that utilitarianism is much more appealing than critics at the time implied. This is often seen today as the foundational text for utilitarianism, though Mill did not seem to regard it as highly as some of his other works, like On Liberty and Considerations on Representative Government.
  • Mill, John Stuart (1867): ‘House of Commons Speech’, Hansard. https://hansard.parliament.uk/Commons/1867-05-20/debates/c38e8bdb-704c-4952-9375-e33d7967a5a4/Clauses34ProgressMay17?highlight=%22conceding%20to%22#contribution-b39e743f-6b70-45e4-82c4-8ac642f8fd18
    • A lengthy speech given by Mill as an MP arguing for suffrage for women.
  • Mozi (2010): The Mozi: A Complete Translation, Ian Johnston (trans.), The Chinese University Press.
    • A translated version of Mozi’s work, accompanied by commentary.
  • Nozick, Robert (1974): Anarchy, State & Utopia, New York: Basic Books.
    • In this book, as well as his general account of the requirements of justice, Nozick introduces the example of the “experience machine”, which is often thought to demonstrate a problem for hedonism.
  • O’Keefe, Tim (2009): Epicureanism, Acumen Publishing.
    • O’Keefe discusses the teachings of Epicurus. As well as Epicurean ethics, this includes large discussions of Epicurean thoughts on metaphysics and epistemology.
  • Paley, William (1785): Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy, Boston: Richardson and Lord (1821).
    • Paley’s Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy was the most influential work of utilitarianism for much of the 19th It also includes an early defence of what would be later termed rule-utilitarianism.
  • Priestley, Joseph (1768): Essay on the First Principles of Government, London.
    • In this work, Priestley claims that the greatest happiness for the greatest number is the measure of right and wrong. Bentham says this influenced him significantly.
  • Railton, Peter (1984): ‘Alienation, Consequentialism and the Demands of Morality’, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 13(2), 134-171.
    • Elaborates a complaint relating to utilitarian decision procedure, and how this may lead to alienation. Railton offers a distinction between “objective” and “subjective” versions of consequentialism, endorsing the former.
  • Rawls, John (1971): A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • When developing his influential theory of justice, Rawls criticises the inability of classical utilitarianism to properly appreciate the individual nature of persons.
  • Rosen, Frederick (2003): Classical Utilitarianism from Hume to Mill, London: Routledge.
    • This book traces the influence of the idea that utility is the basis of morality and justice, starting from Hume. It includes many of the figures discussed in this article in significantly more depth. It also devotes two chapters to considering the notion of utility as found in the works of Adam Smith.
  • Scarre, Geoffrey (1996): Utilitarianism, London: Routledge.
    • This book provides a wonderful discussion of utilitarianism. The first few chapters of the book were extremely useful in the creation of this article.
  • Schultz, Bart and Varouxakis, Georgios (2005): Utilitarianism and Empire, Oxford: Lexington.
    • This book is a collection of essays that consider the relationship between Utilitarianism—particularly as a social movement—and the British Empire. It explores the criticisms that early Utilitarians, like Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, were racist, insufficiently critical of slavery, and served as apologists for the British Empire.
  • Slote, Michael (1984): ‘Satisficing Consequentialism’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 58, 139-163.
    • This article marks the introduction of satisficing views, which remove the feature of maximising from utilitarianism, instead claiming that it is (at least) sometimes permissible to perform actions which do not have the best consequences, but which are good enough.
  • Smart, J. J. C and Williams, Bernard (1973): Utilitarianism: For & Against, Cambridge University Press.
    • A pair of essays for and against utilitarianism. Williams’ part includes his objection that utilitarianism undermines the integrity of moral agents, which has been very influential.
  • Taylor, Harriet (1851): ‘Enfranchisement of Women’, available here: https://www.utilitarianism.net/books/enfranchisement-of-women-harriet-taylor-mill
    • Harriet Taylor’s essay arguing for the legal equality of women.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis (1976): ‘Killing, Letting Die and The Trolley Problem’, The Monist, 59(2), 204-217.
    • This paper uses the case of a surgeon who must decide whether to kill one healthy person to save five, which has been used since to show problems utilitarianism has with making sense of rights. It also introduces the term “trolley problem” for a type of case that has become commonplace in moral philosophy.


Author Information

Joe Slater
Email: Joe.Slater@glasgow.ac.uk
University of Glasgow
United Kingdom