The Metaphysics of Nothing

This article is about nothing. It is not the case that there is no thing that the article is about; nevertheless, the article does indeed explore the absence of referents as well as referring to absence. Nothing is said to have many extraordinary properties, but in predicating anything of nothingness we risk contradicting ourselves. In trying to avoid such misleading descriptions, nothingness could be theorised as ineffable, though that theorisation itself is an attempt to disparage it. Maybe nothingness is dialetheic, or maybe there are no things that are dialetheic, since contradictions are infamous for leading to absurdity. Contradictions and nothingness can explode very quickly into infinity, giving us everything out of nothing. So, perhaps nothing is something after all.

This article considers different metaphysical and logical understandings of nothingness via an analysis of the presence/absence distinction, by considering nothing first as the presence of absence, second as the absence of presence, third as both a presence and an absence, and fourth as neither a presence nor an absence. In short, it analyses nothingness as a noun, a quantifier, a verb, and a place, and it postulates nothingness as a presence, an absence, both, and neither.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction—Nothing and No-thing
  2. Nothing as Presence of Absence
  3. No-thing as Absence of Presence
    1. Eliminating Negation
    2. Eliminating True Negative Existentials
    3. Eliminating Referring Terms
    4. Eliminating Existentially Loaded Quantification
  4. Beyond the Binary—Both Presence and Absence
    1. Dialectical Becoming
    2. Dialetheic Nothing
  5. Beyond the Binary—Neither Presence nor Absence
    1. The Nothing Noths
    2. Absolute Nothing
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction—Nothing and No-thing

Consider the opening sentence:

“This article is about nothing.”

This has two readings:

(i) This article is about no-thing (in that there is no thing that this article is about).

(ii) This article is about Nothing (in that there is something that this article is about).

The first reading (i) is a quantificational reading about the (lack of) quantity of things that this article is about. ‘Quantificational’ comes from ‘quantifier’, where a quantifier is a quantity term that ranges over entities of a certain kind. In (i), the quantity is none, and the entities that there are none of are things. This reading is referred to throughout the article as ‘no-thing’ (hyphenated, rather than the ambiguous ‘nothing’) to highlight this absence of things. The second reading (ii) is a noun phrase about the identity of the thing that this article is about. This reading is referred to throughout the article as ‘Nothing’ (capitalised, again avoiding the ambiguous ‘nothing’) to highlight the presence of a thing. In going from (i) to (ii), we have made a noun out of a quantity (a process we can call ‘nounification’). We have given a name to the absence, Nothing, giving it a presence. Sometimes this presence is referred to as ‘nothingness’, but that locution is avoided here since usually the ‘-ness’ suffix in other contexts indicates a quality or way of being, rather than a being itself (compare the redness of a thing to red as a thing, for example), and as such ‘nothingness’ is reserved for describing the nothing-y state of the presence Nothing and the absence no-thing.

It is important not to conflate these readings, and they cannot be reduced to one or the other. To demonstrate their distinctness, consider that (i) and (ii) have different truth values, as (ii) is true whilst (i) is false: it is not the case that this article is not about anything (that is, that for any x whatsoever there is no x that this article is about). As such, the article would be very short indeed (or even empty), bereft of a topic and perhaps bereft of meaning. I intend to do better than that. My intentional states are directed towards Nothing, hence the truth of (ii): there is indeed a topic of this article, and that topic—the subject, or even object of it—is Nothing.

There has been much debate over whether it is legitimate to nounify the quantificational reading of no-thing. Those who are sceptical would say that the ambiguous ‘nothing’ is really not ambiguous at all and should only be understood as a (lack of) quantity, rather than a thing itself. They might further argue that it is just a slip of language that confuses us into taking Nothing to be a thing, and that some of the so-called paradoxes of nothingness arise from illegitimate nounification that otherwise dissolve into mere linguistic confusions. The dialogues between characters in Lewis Carroll’s Alice in Wonderland and Through the Looking Glass are often cited as exemplars of such slippage and confusions. For instance [with my own commentary in square brackets]:

“‘I see nobody [that is, no-body as a quantifier] on the road’, said Alice.

‘I only wish I had such eyes’, the King remarked in a fretful tone.

‘To be able to see Nobody! [that is, Nobody as a noun] And at that distance too! Why, it’s as much as I can do to see real people [that is, somebodyness, rather than nobodyness, as states], by this light!’” (1871 p234)

Here, the term under consideration is ‘nobody’, and the same treatment applies to this as ‘nothing’ (in that we can disambiguate ‘nobody’ into the quantificational no-body and nounified Nobody). Alice intended to convey that there were no-bodies (an absence of presence) in quantitative terms. But the King then nounifies the quantifier, moving to a presence of absence, and applauds Alice on her apparent capacity to see Nobody.

Making this shift from things to bodies is helpful because bodies are less abstract than things (presumably you are reading this article using your body, your family members have bodies, animals have bodies, and so you have an intuitive understanding of what a body is). Once we have determined what is going on with no-body and every-body, we can apply it to no-thing and every-thing. So, consider now ‘everybody’. When understood as a quantifier, every-body is taken to mean all the bodies in the relevant domain of quantification (where a domain of quantification can be understood as the selection of entities that our quantifier terms range over). Do all those bodies, together, create the referent of Everybody as a noun? In other words, does Everybody as a noun refer to all the bodies within the quantitative every-body? One of the mistakes made by the likes of the King is to treat the referent of the noun as itself an instance of the type of entity the quantifier term is quantifying over. This is clear with respect to bodies, as Everybody is not the right sort of entity to be a body itself. All those bodies, together, is not itself a body (unless your understanding of what a body is can accommodate for such a conglomerate monster). Likewise, Nobody, when understood alongside its quantifier reading of no-body as a lack of bodies, is not itself a body (as, by definition, it has no bodies). So, the King, who is able to see only ‘real people’, makes a category mistake in taking Nobody to be, presumably, ‘unreal people’. Nobody, like Everybody, are quite simply not the right category of entity to instantiate or exemplify people-hood, bodyness, or be a body themselves.

The lesson we have learnt from considering ‘nobody’ is that nounifying the quantifier (no-body) does not create an entity (Nobody) of the kind that is being quantified over (bodies). So, returning to the more general terms ‘nothing’ and ‘everything’, are they the right kind of entities to be things themselves? Do Nothing and Everything, as nouns, refer to things, the same category of thing that their quantifier readings of no-thing and every-thing quantify over? The level of generality we are working with when talking of things makes it more difficult to diagnose what is going on in these cases (by comparison with Nobody and Everybody, for example).

To help, we can apply the lessons learnt from Alfred Tarski (1944) in so far as when talking of these entities as things we are doing so within a higher order or level of language—a metalanguage—in order to avoid paradox. We can see how this works with the Liar Paradox. Consider the following sentence, call it ‘S’: ‘This sentence is false’. Now consider that S is true and name the following sentence ‘S*’: ‘S is true’. If S (and thereby also S*) is true, then S says of itself that it is false (given that S literally states ‘This sentence is false’, which if true, would say it is false). On the other hand, if S (and thereby also S*) is false, then S turns out to be true (again, given that S literally states ‘This sentence is false’, which if it is false, would be saying something true). Tarski’s trick is to say that S and S* are in different levels of language. By distinguishing the level of language that S is talking in when it says it ‘… is false’, from the level of language that S* is talking in when it says that S ‘is true’, we end up avoiding the contradiction of having S be true and false at the same time within the same level. S is in the first level or order of language—the object language—and when we talk about S we ascend to a higher level or order of language—the metalanguage. As such, the truth and falsity appealed to in S are of the object language, and the truth and falsity appealed to in S* are of the metalanguage.

Applying Tarski’s trick to Nothing, perhaps Nothing cannot be considered a thing at the same level as the things it is not, just as Everything cannot be considered a thing at the same level as all the things it encapsulates. As quantifier terms, no-thing and every-thing quantify over things in the first level or order of the object language. As nouns, Nothing and Everything can only be considered things themselves in the higher level or order of the metalanguage, which speaks about the object language. The ‘things’ (or lack of) quantified over by every-thing and no-thing are of the object language, whereas the type of ‘thing’ that Everything and Nothing are are of the metalanguage. This avoids Nothing being a thing of the same type that there are no-things of.

Finally, then, with such terminology and distinctions in hand, we are now in a position to understand the difference between the presence of an absence (Nothing, noun), and the absence of a presence (no-thing, quantifier). Lumped into these two theoretical categories are the related positions of referring to a non-existing thing and the failure to refer to any thing at all (which whilst there are important variations, there are illuminating similarities that justify their shared treatment). Each of these approaches in turn are explored before describing other ways in which one can derive (and attempt to avoid deriving) the existence of some-thing from no-thing.

2. Nothing as Presence of Absence

When we sing that childhood song, ‘There’s a hole in my bucket, dear Liza’, the lyrics can be interpreted as straightforwardly meaning that there really is, there really exists, a hole in the bucket, and it is to that hole that the lyrics refer. Extrapolating existence in this sort of way from our language is a Quinean (inspired by the work of W. V. O. Quine) criterion for deriving ontological commitments, and specifically Quine argued that we should take to exist what our best scientific theories refer to. Much of our language is about things, and according to the principle of intentionality, so are our thoughts, in that they are directed towards or refer to things. (Of course, not all language and thought point to things: for example, in the lyrics above, the words ‘a’ and ‘in’ do not pick out entities in the way that ‘bucket’ and ‘Liza’ do. The question is whether ‘hole’ and ‘nothing’ function more like nonreferential ‘a’ and ‘in’ or referential ‘bucket’ and ‘Liza’.)

In our perceptual experiences and in our languages and theories we can find many examples of seeming references to nothingness, including to holes, gaps, lacks, losses, absences, silences, voids, vacancies, emptiness, and space. If we take such experiences, thoughts, and language at face value, then nothingness, in its various forms, is a genuine feature of reality. Jean-Paul Sartre is in this camp, and, in Being and Nothingness, he argues that absences can be the objects of judgements. Famously, Sartre described the situation in which he arrived late for his appointment with Pierre at a café, and ‘sees’ the absence of Pierre (because Pierre is who he is expecting to see, and the absence of Pierre frustrates that expectation and creates a presence of that absence—Sartre does not also ‘see’ the absence of me, because he was not expecting to see me). Relatedly, and perhaps more infamously, Alexius Meinong takes non-existent things to have some form of Being, such that they are to be included in our ontology, though Meinongians—those inspired by Meinong—disagree on what things specifically should be taken as non-existent.

So, what things should we take to exist? Consider the Eleatic principle which states that only causes are real. Using this principle, Leucippus noted that voids have causal power, and generalises that nonbeings are causally efficacious, such that they are as equally real as atoms and beings in general. When we sing, on the part of Henry, his complaints to dear Liza that the water is leaking from his bucket, then, the hole is blamed as being the cause of this leakage, and from this we might deduce the hole’s existence (the presence of an absence with causal powers). Similarly, we might interpret Taoists as believing that a wide variety of absences can be causes (for example, by doing no-thing—or as little as possible to minimise disruption to the natural way of the Tao—which is considered the best course of ‘(in)action’), and as such are part of our reality. As James Legge has translated from the Tao Te Ching: “Vacancy, stillness, placidity, tastelessness, quietude, silence, and non-action, this is the level of heaven and earth, and the perfection of the Tao and its characteristics” (1891 p13).

Roy Sorensen (2022) has gone to great lengths to describe the ontological status of various nothings, and his book on ‘Nothing’ (aptly named Nothing) opens with the following interesting case about when the Mona Lisa was stolen from the Louvre in Paris. Apparently, at the time, more Parisians visited the Louvre to ‘see’ the absence than they did the presence of the Mona Lisa, and the ‘wall of shame’ where the Mona Lisa once hung was kept vacant for weeks to accommodate demand. The Parisians regarded this presence of the absence of the Mona Lisa as something that could be photographed, and they aimed to get a good view of this presence of absence for such a photo, otherwise complaining that they could not ‘see’ if their view was obstructed. Applying the Eleatic principle, the principle of intentionality, a criterion for ontological commitment, or other such metaphysical tests to this scenario (as with Sartre’s scenario) may provide a theoretical basis for interpreting the ‘object’ of the Parisians’ hype (and the missing Pierre) as a presence of absence (of presence)—a thing, specifically, a Nothing.

Interpreting Nothing as a presence of absence requires us to understand Nothing as a noun that picks out such a presence of absence. If there is no such presence of this nothingness, and instead such a state is simply describing where something is not, then it is to be understood as an absence of presence via a quantificational reading of there being no-thing that there is. It can be argued that the burden of proof is on the latter position, which denies Nothing as a noun, to argue that there is only absence of a presence rather than a presence of absence. Therefore, in what follows, we pay close attention to this sceptical view to determine whether we can get away with nothingness as an absence, where there is no-thing, rather than there being a presence of Nothing as our language and experience seem to suggest.

3. No-thing as Absence of Presence

Returning to Liza and that leaking bucket, instead of there being a hole in the bucket, we could reinterpret the situation as the bucket having a certain perforated shape. Rather than there being a presence of a hole (where the hole is an absence), we could say that there is an absence of bucket (where the bucket is a presence) at the site of the leaking water. Such a strategy can be used not only to avoid the existence of holes as things themselves, but also to reinterpret other negative states in positive ways. For example, Aristotle, like Leucippus, argues from the Eleatic principle in saying that omissions can be causes, but to avoid the existence of omissions themselves this seeming causation-by-absence must be redescribed within the framework of Being. As such, negative nothings are just placeholders for positive somethings.

We can see a parallel move happen with Augustine who treats Nothing as a linguistic confusion—where others took there to be negative things (presences of an absence), Augustine redescribed those negative things as mere lacks of positive things (absences of a presence). For example, Mani thought ‘evil’ names a substance, but Augustine says ‘evil’ names an absence of goodness just as ‘cold’ names the absence of heat. Saying that evil exists is as misleading as saying cold exists, as absences are mere privations, and privations of presences specifically. Adeodatus and his father argue similarly, where Adeodatus says ‘nihil’ refers to what is not, and in response his father says that to refer to what is not is to simply fail to refer (see Sorensen 2022 p175). This interpretation of language is speculated to have been imported from Arab grammarians and been influenced by Indian languages where negative statements such as ‘Ostriches do not fly’ are understood as metacognitive remarks that warn us not to believe in ostrich flight rather than a description of the non-flight of ostriches (again see Sorensen 2022 p176 and p181).

Bertrand Russell attempted to generalise this interpretation of negative statements by reducing all negative truths to positive truths (1985). For example, he tried to paraphrase ‘the cat is not on the mat’ as ‘there is a state of affairs incompatible with the cat being on the mat’. But of course, this paraphrase still makes use of negation with respect to ‘incompatible’ which simply means ‘not compatible’, and even when he tried to model ‘not p’ as an expression of ‘disbelief that p’, this too requires negation in the form of believing that something is not the case (or not believing that something is the case). This ineliminatibility of the negation and the negative facts we find it in meant that Russell eventually abandoned this project and (in a famous lecture at Harvard) conceded that irreducibly negative facts exist. Dorothy Wrinch (1918) jests at the self-refuting nature of such positions that try to eliminate the negative, by saying that it is “a little unwise to base a theory on such a disputable point as the non-existence of negative facts”. So can we eliminate Nothing in favour of no-thing? Can we try, like Russell’s attempt, to avoid the presence of negative absences like Nothing, and instead only appeal to the absence of positive presences like no-thing? Can we escape commitment to the new thing created by nounifying no-thing into Nothing, can no-thing do all the work that Nothing does? Consider various strategies.

a. Eliminating Negation

Despite Russell’s attempt, it seems we cannot eliminate negative facts from our natural language. But from the point of view of formal languages, like that of logic, negation is in fact dispensable. Take, for example, the pioneering work of Christine Ladd-Franklin. In 1883, her dissertation put forward an entire logical system based on exclusion, where she coined the NAND operator which reads ‘not … and not …’, or ‘neither … nor …’.  This closely resembles the work of Henry Sheffer, who later, in 1913, demonstrated that all of the logical connectives can be defined in terms of the dual of disjunction, which he named NOR (short for NOT OR, ‘neither … nor …’), or the dual of conjunction, which was (confusingly) named NAND (short for NOT AND, ‘either not … or not …’) and has come to be known as the Sheffer stroke. This Sheffer stroke, as well as the earlier Ladd-Franklin’s NAND operator, do away with the need for a symbolic representation of negation. Another example of such a method is in Alonzo Church’s formal language whereby the propositional constant f was stipulated to always be false (1956, §10), and f can then be used to define negation in terms of it as such: ~ A =df  A → f. If we can do away with formal negation, then perhaps this mirrors the possibility of doing away with informal negation, including Nothing.

An issue with using this general method of escaping negative reality regards what is known as ‘true negative existentials’ (for example, ‘Pegasus does not exist’). Using Sheffer’s NAND, this is ‘Pegasus exists NAND Pegasus exists’ which is read ‘either it is not the case that Pegasus exists or it is not the case that Pegasus exists’, which we would want to be true. But since Pegasus does not exist, the NAND sentence will not be true, as each side of the NAND (that is, ‘Pegasus exists’) is false. As we shall see, this is a persistent problem which has motivated many alternatives to the classical logic setup.

Another issue concerns whether the concept of negation has really been translated away in these cases, or whether negation has just become embedded within the formal language elsewhere under the guise of some sort of falsehood, ever present in the interpretation. This questioning of the priority of the concept of negation was put forward by Martin Heidegger, when he asks: “Is there Nothing only because there is ‘not’, i.e. negation? Or is it the other way round? Is there negation and ‘not’ only because there is Nothing?” (1929 p12) Heidegger’s answer is that “‘Nothing’ is prior to ‘not’ and negation” (ibid.), and so whilst ‘not’ and negation may be conceptually eliminable because they are not primitive, ‘Nothing’ cannot be so. Try as we might to rid ourselves of Nothing, we will fail, even if we succeed in ridding our formal language of ‘not’ and negation. We shall now turn to more of these eliminative methods.

b. Eliminating True Negative Existentials

The riddle, or paradox, of non-being describes the problem of true negative existentials, where propositions like ‘Pegasus does not exist’ are true but seem to bring with them some commitment to an entity ‘Pegasus’. As we learn from Plato’s Parmenides, “Non-being is… being something that is not, – if it’s going not to be” (1996 p81). It is thus self-defeating to say that something, like Pegasus, does not exist, and so it is impossible to speak of what there is not (but even this very argument negates itself). What do we do in such a predicament?

In the seminal paper ‘On What There Is’ (1948), Quine described this riddle of non-being as ‘Plato’s Beard’—overgrown, full of non-entities beyond necessity, to be shaved off with Ockham’s Razor. The problem arises because we bring a thing into existence in order to deny its existence. It is as if we are pointing towards something, and accusing what we are pointing at of not being there to be pointed at. This is reflected in the classical logic that Quine endorsed, where both ‘there is’ and ‘there exists’ are expressed by means of the ‘existential quantifier’ (∃), which is, consequently, interpreted as having ontological import. As a result, such formal systems render the statement ‘There is something that does not exist’ false, nonsensical, inexpressible, or contradictory. How can we get around this issue, in order to rescue the truth of negative existentials like ‘Pegasus does not exist’ without formalising it as ‘Pegasus—an existent thing—does not exist’?

This issue closely resembles the paradox of understanding Nothing—in referring to nothingness as if it were something. As Thales argues, thinking about nothing makes it something, so there can only truly be nothing if there is no one to contemplate it (see Frank Close 2009 p5). The very act of contemplation, or the very act of referring, brings something into existence, and turns no-thing into some-thing, which is self-defeating for the purposes of acknowledging an absence or denying existence. In his entry on ‘Nothingness’ in The Oxford Companion to the Mind, Oliver Sacks summarises the difficulty in the following way: “How can one describe nothingness, not-being, nonentity, when there is, literally, nothing to describe?” (1987 p564)

c. Eliminating Referring Terms

Bertrand Russell (1905) provides a way to ‘describe nothingness’ by removing the referent from definite descriptions. Russell analyses true negative existentials such as ‘The present King of France does not exist’ as ‘It is not the case that there is exactly one present King of France and all present Kings of France exist’. By transforming definite descriptions into quantitative terms, we do not end up referring to an entity in order to deny its existence—rather, the lack of an entity that meets the description ensures the truth of the negative existential. Quine (1948) takes this method a step further by rendering all names as disguised descriptions, and thereby analyses ‘Pegasus does not exist’ as more accurately reading ‘The thing that pegasizes does not exist’. Such paraphrasing away of referring devices removes the problem of pointing to an entity when asserting its nonexistence, thereby eliminating the problem of true negative existentials.

However, such methods are not without criticism, with some claiming their resolutions are worse than the problems they were initially trying to resolve. As Karel Lambert argues, they come with their own problems and place “undue weight both on Russell’s controversial theory of descriptions as the correct analysis of definite descriptions and on the validity of Quine’s elimination of grammatically proper names” (1967 p137). Lambert proposes, instead of ridding language of singular terms via these questionable means, one could rid singular terms of their ontological import. She creates a system of ‘free logic’ whereby singular terms like names need not refer in order to be meaningful, and propositions containing such empty terms can indeed be true. Therefore, ‘Pegasus does not exist’ may be meaningful and true even whilst ‘Pegasus’ does not refer, without contradiction or fancy footwork via paraphrasing into definite descriptions and quantificational statements.

Lambert (1963) also insists that such a move to free logic is required in order to prevent getting something from nothing in classical logic, when we derive an existential claim from a corresponding universal claim where the predicate in use is not true of anything in the domain. This happens when we infer according to the rule of ‘Universal Instantiation’ whereby what is true of all things is true of some (or particular) things, for example:

∀x(Fx → Gx)

∃x(Fx & Gx)

If no thing in the domain is F, then theoretically hypothesizing that all Fs are Gs leads to inferring that some Fs are Gs, thereby deriving an x that is F and G from the domain where there was no thing in the domain that was F to start with. Rather than the ad hoc limitation of the validity of such inferences to domains that include (at least) things that are F (or are more generally simply not empty), Lambert instead proposes her system of free logic where there need not be a thing in the domain for statements to be true.

But what about Nothing? Is ‘Nothing’ a referring term? For Rudolf Carnap, asking such a question is “based on the mistake of employing the word ‘nothing’ as a noun, because in ordinary language it is customary to use it in this form in order to construct negative existential statements… [E]ven if it were admissible to use ‘nothing’ as a name or description of an entity, still the existence of this entity would be denied by its very definition” (1959 p70). Many have argued against the first part of Carnap’s argument, to show that there are occurrences of ‘Nothing’ as a noun which cannot be understood in quantificational terms or as the null object without at least some loss of meaning (see, for example, Casati and Fujikawa 2019). Nevertheless, many have agreed with the second part of Carnap’s argument that even as a noun ‘Nothing’ would fail to refer to an existent thing (see, for example, Oliver and Smiley 2013). But if Nothing does not refer to an existent thing, what then is this encyclopaedia article about?

As Maria Reicher (2022) states, “One of the difficulties of this solution, however, is to give an account of what makes such sentences true, i.e., of what their truthmakers are (given the principle that, for every true sentence, there is something in the world that makes it true, i.e., something that is the sentence’s truthmaker).” The truthmaker of my opening sentence ‘This article is about nothing’ might then be that Nothing is what this article is about, even when Nothing is the name for the nounified no-thing. The problematic situation we seem to find ourselves in is this: Without an entity that the statement is about, the statement lacks a truthmaker; but with an entity that the statement is about, the statement becomes self-refuting in denying that very entity’s existence. But there is another option. ‘Nothing’ may not refer to an existent thing, yet this need not entail the lack of a referent altogether, because instead perhaps ‘Nothing’ refers to a non-existent thing, as we shall now explore.

d. Eliminating Existentially Loaded Quantification

Meinong’s ‘Theory of Objects’ (1904) explains how we can speak meaningfully and truthfully about entities that do not exist. Meinongians believe that we can refer to non-existent things, and talk of them truthfully, due to quantifying over them and having them as members in our domains of quantification. When we speak of non-existent things, then, our talk refers to entities in the domain that are non-existent things. So it is not that our language can be true without referring at all (as in free logic), but rather that our language can be true without referring to an existent thing (where instead what is referred to is a non-existent thing, which acts as a truthmaker). This approach grants that flying horses do not exist, but this does not imply that there are no flying horses. According to the Meinongian, there are flying horses, and they (presumably) belong to the class of non-existent things, where Pegasus is one of them. This class of non-existent things might also include the present King of France, Santa Claus, the largest prime number, the square circle, and every/any-thing you could possibly imagine if taken to not exist—maybe even Nothing.

So, for the Meinongian, naïvely put, there are existents and non-existents. Both are types of ‘thing’, and the over-arching name for these things are that they have ‘being’. All existent things have being, but not all being things have existence. And perhaps in such an account, Nothing could have ‘being’ regardless of its non/existence. Since Meinongians quantify over both existent and non-existent things, their quantification over domains containing both such things must be ontologically neutral (namely, by not having existential import), and they can differentiate between the two types of things by employing a predicate for existence which existent things instantiate and non-existent things do not. The neutral universal and particular quantifiers (Λ and Σ) can then be defined using the classical universal and existential quantifiers (∀ and ∃) with the existence predicate (E!) as such:

∀x =df Λx(E!x)

∃x =df Σx(E!x)

‘All existent things are F’ can be written as such:

∀x(Fx) =df Λx(E!x → Fx)

And ‘Some existent things are F’ can be written as such:

∃x(Fx) =df Σx(E!x & Fx)

Using these neutral quantifiers, we can then say, without contradiction, that some things do not exist, as such:


Despite these definitions, it would be erroneous to describe Meinongianism as “the way of the two quantifiers” (Peter van Inwagen 2003 p138). This is because the ontologically loaded quantifier ∃ can be considered as being restricted to existents, and so is different to Σ only by a matter of degree with respect to what is in the domain, that is, its range. Such a restriction of the domain can be understood as part and parcel of restricting what it is to count as a ‘thing’, where, for Quine, every-(and only)-thing(s) exists.

One need not be a Meinongian to treat the quantifiers as ontologically neutral, however. For example, Czeslaw Lejewski argues that the existentially non-committal ‘particular quantifier’ is “a nearer approximation to ordinary usage” and claims to “not see a contradiction in saying that something does not exist” (1954 p114). Another way to free the quantifiers of their ontological import is to demarcate ontological commitment from quantificational commitment, as in the work of Jody Azzouni (2004). Even the very basic idea of quantificational commitment leading to a commitment to an object in the domain of quantification can be challenged, by taking the quantifiers to be substitutional rather than objectual. In a substitutional interpretation, a quantificational claim is true not because there is an object in the domain that it is true of, but because there is a term in the language that it is true of (for an early pioneer of substitutional quantification, see Ruth Barcan-Marcus 1962).

In contrast to these alternative systems, for Quine (1948), “to be is to be the value of a bound variable”, which simply means to be quantified over by a quantifier, which further simplified means to be in the domain of quantification. An ontology, then, can be read straight from the domain, which contains (only) the existent things, which happens to be all the ‘things’ that there are. As we have seen, this is problematic with respect to understanding nonexistence. But that is not all. Ladd-Franklin (1912 p653), for example, argues that domains are just ‘fields of thought’, and thus the domain of discourse may vary, and it cannot simply be assumed to contain all of (and only) the things that exist in our reality. Even when the field of thought is physics, or whatever our best science may be, the domain of quantification still leaves us none the wiser with respect to what there is in reality. As Mary Hesse argues, “it is precisely what this domain of values is that is often a matter of dispute within physics” (1962 p243). Indeed, she continues, the very act of axiomatizing a theory in order to answer the question ‘what are the values of its variables?’ implies the adoption of a certain interpretation, which in turn is equivalent to the decisions involved in answering the question ‘what are entities?’ Therefore, one cannot informatively answer ‘what is there?’ with ‘the values of the bound variables’. Extrapolating from the domain is thus no guide to reality: it can give us some-thing from no-thing, regardless of whether every-thing includes more than every (existent) thing. And we cannot infer the existence of Nothing from ‘Nothing’.

4. Beyond the Binary—Both Presence and Absence

As we shall now see, the supposed choice between the binary options of understanding ‘nothing’ as Nothing (a noun, presence of absence) or no-thing (a quantifier, absence of presence) can itself be challenged. To get to that point, firstly, we introduce the dialectical process of Becoming which Nothing participates in, and then we introduce dialetheic understandings of the contradictory nature of Nothing.

a. Dialectical Becoming

In G. W. F. Hegel’s dialectics, a particular pattern is followed when it comes to conceptual analysis. To start, a positive concept is introduced as the ‘thesis’. Then, that positive concept is negated to create the ‘antithesis’ which opposes the thesis. The magic happens when the positive concept and the negative concept are unified to create a third concept, the ‘synthesis’ of the thesis and antithesis. When Hegel applied this dialectic of thesis-antithesis-synthesis to the topic we are considering in this article, the resulting pattern is Being-Nothing-Becoming. To start, he took Being as the positive thesis, which he stated is ‘meant’ to be the concept of presence. Negating this thesis of Being, we get what he stated is ‘meant’ to be the concept of absence, namely, Nothing, as the antithesis.

It is important to note that for Hegel the difference between Being and Nothing is only “something merely meant” (1991 remark to §87) in that we do mean to be highlighting different things when we use the term ‘Nothing’ rather than ‘Being’ or vice versa, but in content they are actually the same. What is the content of Being and Nothing, then, that would equate them in this extensional manner? Well, as purely abstract concepts, Being and Nothing are said to have no further determination, in that Being asserts bare presence, and Nothing asserts bare absence. Given that both are bare, and thus undetermined, they have the same (lack of) properties or content. (Compare the situation with the morning star and evening star—these terms were employed to mean different things, but actually they both refer to Venus.)

There is a presence to Nothing in its asserting absence, and there is an absence to Being in its empty presence. As Julie Maybee (2020) has described, “Being’s lack of determination thus leads it to sublate itself and pass into the concept of Nothing”, and this movement goes both ways. In speculating the bidirectional relationship between Being and Nothing, we enter the dialectic moment of synthesis that unifies and combines them into a state of Becoming. To Become is to go from Being to Nothing or from Nothing to Being, as we do when we consider their equally undefined content. But despite their extensional similarity (in what content they pick out), intensionally (their intended definitional meaning) Being and Nothing are different. Any contradiction that may arise from their synthesis can thus be avoided by reference to this difference. But what if such contradictions provide a more accurate understanding of nothingness, to better reflect its paradoxical nature? This is the idea we will now take up.

b. Dialetheic Nothing

Heidegger pointed out that in speaking of Nothing we make it into something and thereby contradict ourselves. Much like in that dialectical moment of synthesis, we posit Nothing as a being—as a thing—even though by our quantificational understanding that is precisely what it is not (see Krell 1977 p98f). Where can we go from here? Does this mean it is impossible to speak of Nothing without instantaneous self-defeat, by turning Nothing into not-no-thing, namely, some-thing? To this, Graham Priest adds, “One cannot, therefore, say anything of nothing. To say anything, whether that it is something or other, or just that it is, or even to refer to it at all, is to treat it as an object, which it is not” (2002 p241, emphasis in original).

Of course, Priest did say something about Nothing, as did Heidegger, and as does this article. It therefore is not impossible to talk of it. Perhaps the lesson to learn is that any talk of it will be false because the very act of doing so turns it into what it is not. This would be a kind of error-theory of Nothing, that whatever theorising is done will be in error, by virtue of postulating an object to be theorised where there is no object. But this will not do once we consider statements that motivate such a theory, like ‘Nothing is not an object’, which the error-theorist would want to be true in order for all (other) statements about Nothing to be false. Can we not even say that we cannot say anything about Nothing, then? Nor say that?

These problems reflect issues of ineffability. To be ineffable is to not be able to be effed, where to be effed is to be described in some way. Start with the idea that Nothing is ineffable, because in trying to describe it (a no-thing) we end up turning it into some-thing (a thing) that it is not. But, to say that Nothing is ineffable is a self-refuting statement, since ‘Nothing is ineffable’ is to say something about Nothing, namely, that it is ineffable. Furthermore, if it is true that Nothing is ineffable, then it is not true that no-thing is ineffable, because Nothing is. So, to repeat, can the (in)effability of nothingness be effed? And what about effing that?

Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus is also an example of trying to eff the ineffable, via a self-conscious process of ‘showing’ rather than ‘saying’ what cannot be said, or else rendering it all meaningless. Wittgenstein’s work explores (among other things) the limits of our language in relation to the limits of our world, and the messy paths that philosophical reflection on our language can take us down. Applying this to Nothing, it might be that the contradictions that arise from attempts to express nothingness reflect contradictions in its very nature. And maybe when we get caught up in linguistic knots trying to understand Nothing it is because Nothing is knotty (which pleasingly rhymes with not-y). Perhaps then we need not try to find a way out of contradictions that stem from analysing nothingness if those contradictions are true. So, is it true that Nothing is both an object and not an object? Is it true that Nothing is both a thing and no-thing? Whilst this would not be Wittgenstein’s remedy, according to Priest, ‘yes’, we ought to bite this bullet and accept the paradoxical nature of Nothing at face value. To treat such a contradiction as true, one must endorse a dialetheic metaphysics, with a paraconsistent logic to match, where Nothing is a dialetheia.

5. Beyond the Binary—Neither Presence nor Absence

a. The Nothing Noths

As we have seen, when contemplating nothingness, we can quickly go from no-thing to Nothing, which is no longer a ‘nothing’ due to being some-thing. When we turn towards nothingness, it turns away from us by turning itself into something else. This makes nothingness rather active, or rather re-active, in a self-destructive sort of way. As Heidegger put it, “the nothing itself noths or nihilates” (1929 p90).

Carnap was vehemently against such metaphysical musings, claiming that they were meaningless (1959 p65-67). Indeed, Heidegger and the Vienna Circle (of which Carnap was a leading and central figure) were in opposition in many ways, not least with respect to Heidegger’s antisemitism and affiliation with the Nazis in contrast with the Vienna Circle’s large proportion of Jewish and socialist members (see David Edmonds 2020 for the relationship between the political and philosophical disputes).

Somewhat mediating on the logical side of things, Oliver and Smiley (2013) consider ‘the nothing noths’ as “merely a case of verbing a noun” and argue: “If ‘critiques’ is what a critique does, and ‘references’ is what a reference does, ‘nichtet’ is what das Nichts does. The upshot of all this is that ‘das Nichts nichtet’ [‘the nothing noths’] translates as ‘zilch is zilch’ or, in symbols, ‘O=O’. Far from being a metaphysical pseudo-statement, it is a straightforward logical truth” (p611). If verbing a noun is legitimate, what about nouning a quantifier? If ‘Criticisms’ is the name for all criticisms, and ‘References’ is the name for all references, then is not ‘Everything’ the name for every-thing, and likewise ‘Nothing’ the name for no-thing? Such an understanding would make the path to such entities quite trivial, a triviality that ‘straightforward logical truths’ share. But if we have learnt anything about Nothing so far, it is surely that it is a long way (at least 8,000 words away) from being trivial.

Heidegger avoids charges of triviality by clarifying that Nothing is “‘higher’ than or beyond all ‘positivity’ and ‘negativity’” (see Krummel 2017 p256 which cites Beiträge). This resonates with Eastern understandings of true nothingness as irreducible to and outside of binary oppositions, which is prominent in the views of Nishida Kitarō from the Kyoto School. What are they good for? ‘Absolute nothing’ (and more).

b. Absolute Nothing

When Edwin Starr sang that war was good for absolutely nothing (1970), the message being conveyed was that there was no-thing for which war was good. This was emphasised and made salient by the ‘absolutely’. When we are analysing nothingness, we might likewise want to emphasise that what we are analysing is absolutely nothing. But what would that emphasis do? In what way does our conception of nothingness change when we make its absoluteness salient?

For the Kyoto School, this ‘absolute’ means cutting off oppositional understandings, in a bid to go beyond relativity. The way we comprehend reality is very much bound up in such oppositions: life/death, yes/no, true/false, black/white, man/woman, good/bad, acid/alkaline, high/low, left/right, on/off, 0/1, even/odd, this/that, us/them, in/out, hot/cold… and challenging such binaries is an important part of engaging in critical analysis to better grasp the complexities of reality. But these binaries may very well include opposites we have been relying upon in our understanding of nothingness, namely, presence/absence, thing/no-thing, no-thing/Nothing, binary/nonbinary, relative/absolute, and so forth. It seems whatever concept or term or object we hold (like Hegel’s ‘thesis’), we can negate it (like Hegel’s ‘antithesis’), making a set of opposites. What then can be beyond such oppositional dialect? Nothing. (Or is it no-thing?)

Zen Buddhism explains that true nothingness is absolute, not relative—beyond the realm of things. Our earlier attempts at elucidating Nothing and no-thing were very much conceptually related to things, and so to get a truer, more absolute nothingness, we must go beyond no-thing/thing and no-thing/Nothing. Only once detached from all contrasts do we have absolute nothingness.

Nishida says absolute negation (zettai hitei 絶対否定) is beyond the affirmative/negative itself, and so is a rejection of what it colloquially represents: true negation is thereby a negation of negation. This is not the double-negation of classical logic (whereby something being not not true is for that something to be true) and it is not the mealy-mouthed multiple-negation of conversation (whereby not disliking someone does not entail liking them but rather just finding them incredibly annoying, for example). Instead, this negation of negation leaves the realm of relativity behind, it goes beyond (or negates) that which can be negated to enter the absolute realm. No-thing can be absolute without being absolved of any defining opposition that would render it merely relative. And so Nothing can only be absolute when it goes beyond the binaries that attempt to define it in the world of being. This does not place the absolute nothingness in the realm of nonbeing; rather, absolute nothingness transcends the being/nonbeing distinction.

Without anything to define absolute nothingness in relation to, it is quite literally undefined. As such, Nothing cannot be made into a subject or object that could be judged, and so is completely undetermined. It would not make sense, then, to interpret ‘absolute nothing’ as a thing, because that would bring it into the purview of predication. Instead, Nishida (2000 467, 482) speaks of it as a place: “the place of absolute nothing” (zettai mu no basho) or “the place of true nothing” (shin no mu no basho). Within this place is every determination of all beings, and as such is infinitely determined. But this is in contradiction with its status as being completely undetermined, beyond the realm of relative definition. Is absolute nothingness really beyond the realm of relative definition if it is defined in contrast to relativity, namely, as absolute? It seems that we have stumbled upon contradictions and binaries again. (Ask yourself: Can we avoid them? Ought we avoid them?) Like the dialetheic understanding of Nothing, this absolute nothingness is effed as ineffable in terms of what it is and is not. And like the nothing-that-noths, this absolute nothingness is active, but rather than nihilating anything that comes in its path, it creates every-thing.

6. Conclusion

This article has analysed nothingness as a noun, a quantifier, a verb, and a place. It has postulated nothingness as a presence, an absence, both, and neither. Through an exploration of metaphysical and logical theories that crossed the analytic/continental and East/West divides, it started with nothing, got something, and ended up with everything. What other topic could be quite as encompassing? Without further ado, and after much ado about nothing, let us conclude the same way that Priest does in his article ‘Everything and Nothing’ (which hopefully you, the reader, will now be able to disambiguate):

“Everything is interesting; but perhaps nothing is more interesting than nothing” (Gabriel and Priest 2022 p38).

7. References and Further Reading

  • Jody Azzouni (2004) Deflating Existential Consequence: A Case for Nominalism, Oxford University Press.
  • Ruth Barcan-Marcus (1962) ‘Interpreting Quantification’, Inquiry, V: 252–259.
  • Filippo Casati and Naoya Fujikawa (2019) ‘Nothingness, Meinongianism and Inconsistent Mereology’, Synthese, 196.9: 3739–3772.
  • Rudolf Carnap (1959) ‘The Elimination Of Metaphysics Through Logical Analysis of Language’, A. Pap (trans.) in A. J. Ayer (ed.) Logical Positivism, New York: Free Press, 60–81.
  • Lewis Carroll (1871) Through the Looking-Glass and What Alice Found There, in M. Gardner (ed.) The Annotated Alice: The Definitive Edition, Harmondsworth: Penguin, 2000.
  • Alonzo Church (1956) Introduction to Mathematical Logic, Princeton University Press.
  • Frank Close (2009) Nothing: A very short introduction, Oxford University Press.
  • David Edmonds (2020) The Murder of Professor Schlick: The Rise and Fall of the Vienna Circle, Princeton University Press.
  • Suki Finn (2018) ‘The Hole Truth’, Aeon.
  • Suki Finn (2021) ‘Nothing’, Philosophy Bites.
  • Suki Finn (2023) ‘Nothing To Speak Of’, Think, 22.63: 39–45.
  • Markus Gabriel and Graham Priest (2022) Everything and Nothing, Polity Press.
  • W. F. Hegel (1991) The Encyclopedia Logic: Part 1 of the Encyclopaedia of Philosophical Sciences, F. Geraets, W. A. Suchting, and H. S. Harris (trans.), Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Martin Heidegger (1929) ‘What is Metaphysics?’, in (1949) Existence and Being, Henry Regenry Co.
  • Mary Hesse (1962) ‘On What There Is in Physics’, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 13.51: 234–244.
  • Peter van Inwagen (2003) ‘Existence, Ontological Commitment, and Fictional Entities’, in Michael
  • Loux and Dean Zimmerman (eds.) The Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 131–157.
  • F. Krell (ed.) (1977) Martin Heidegger: Basic Writings, New York: Harper & Row.
  • John W. M. Krummel (2017) ‘On (the) nothing: Heidegger and Nishida’, Continental Philosophy Review, 51.2: 239–268.
  • Christine Ladd-Franklin (1883) ‘The Algebra of Logic’, in Charles S. Pierce (ed.) Studies in Logic, Boston: Little, Brown & Co.
  • Christine Ladd-Franklin (1912) ‘Implication and Existence in Logic’, The Philosophical Review, 21.6: 641–665.
  • Karel Lambert (1963) ‘Existential Import Revisited’, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 4.4: 288–292.
  • Karel Lambert (1967) ‘Free Logic and the Concept of Existence’, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 8.1-2: 133–144.
  • James Legge (1891) The Writings of Chuang Tzu, Oxford University Press.
  • Czeslaw Lejewski (1954) ‘Logic and Existence’, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 5: 104–19.
  • Julie E. Maybee (2020) ‘Hegel’s Dialectics’, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Edward N. Zalta (ed.), <>.
  • Alexius Meinong (1904) ‘Über Gegenstandstheorie’, in Alexius Meinong (ed.) Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie und Psychologie, Leipzig: J. A. Barth.
  • Kitarō Nishida (2000) Nishida Kitarō zenshū [Collected works of Nishida Kitarō], Tokyo: Iwanami.
  • Alex Oliver and Timothy Smiley (2013) ‘Zilch’, Analysis, 73.4: 601–613.
  • Plato (1996) Parmenides, A. K. Whitaker (trans.) Newburyport, MA: Focus Philosophical Library.
  • Graham Priest (2002) Beyond the Limits of Thought, Oxford University Press.
  • W.V.O. Quine (1948) ‘On What There Is’, The Review of Metaphysics, 2.5: 21–38.
  • Maria Reicher (2022) ‘Non-existent Objects’, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Edward N. Zalta and Uri Nodelman (eds.), URL = <>.
  • Bertrand Russell (1905) ‘On Denoting’, Mind, 14: 479–493.
  • Bertrand Russell (1985) The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, La Salle, II: Open Court.
  • Oliver Sacks (1987) ‘Nothingness’, in Richard L. Gregory (ed.) The Oxford Companion to the Mind, Oxford University Press.
  • Jean-Paul Sartre (1956) Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology, Hazel E. Barnes (trans.), New York: Philosophical Library.
  • Henry Sheffer (1913) ‘A Set of Five Independent Postulates for Boolean Algebras, with Applications to Logical Constants’, Transactions of the American Mathematical Society, 14: 481–488.
  • Roy Sorensen (2022) Nothing: A Philosophical History, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Edwin Starr (1970) War, Motown: Gordy Records.
  • Alfred Tarski (1944) ‘The Semantic Conception of Truth’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 4.3: 341–376.
  • Ludwig Wittgenstein (1961) Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, D. F. Pears and B. F. McGuinness (trans.), New York: Humanities Press.
  • Dorothy Wrinch (1918) ‘Recent Work In Mathematical Logic’, The Monist, 28.4: 620–623.


Author Information

Suki Finn
Royal Holloway University of London
United Kingdom