Divine Command Theory

Philosophers both past and present have sought to defend theories of ethics that are grounded in a theistic framework. Roughly, Divine Command Theory is the view that morality is somehow dependent upon God, and that moral obligation consists in obedience to God’s commands. Divine Command Theory includes the claim that morality is ultimately based on the commands or character of God, and that the morally right action is the one that God commands or requires. The specific content of these divine commands varies according to the particular religion and the particular views of the individual divine command theorist, but all versions of the theory hold in common the claim that morality and moral obligations ultimately depend on God.

Divine Command Theory has been and continues to be highly controversial. It has been criticized by numerous philosophers, including Plato, Kai Nielsen, and J. L. Mackie. The theory also has many defenders, both classic and contemporary, such as Thomas Aquinas, Robert Adams, and Philip Quinn. The question of the possible connections between religion and ethics is of interest to moral philosophers as well as philosophers of religion, but it also leads us to consider the role of religion in society as well as the nature of moral deliberation. Given this, the arguments offered for and against Divine Command Theory have both theoretical and practical importance.

Table of Contents

  1. Modern Moral Philosophy
  2. Some Possible Advantages of Divine Command Theory
  3. A Persistent Problem: The Euthyphro Dilemma
  4. Responses to the Euthyphro Dilemma
    1. Bite the Bullet
    2. Human Nature
    3. Alston’s Advice
    4. Modified Divine Command Theory
  5. Speech Acts and Obligations to Act
  6. Ethics Without God
  7. Other Objections to Divine Command Theory
    1. The Omnipotence Objection
    2. The Omnibenevolence Objection
    3. The Autonomy Objection
    4. The Pluralism Objection
  8. Conclusion: Religion, Morality, and the Good Life
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Modern Moral Philosophy

In her influential paper, “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Elizabeth Anscombe (1958) argues that moral terms such as “should” and “ought” acquired a legalistic sense (that is, being bound by law) because of Christianity’s far-reaching historical influence and its legalistic conception of ethics. For example, use of the term “ought” seems to suggest a verdict on an action, and this in turn suggests a judge. On a law conception of ethics, conformity with the virtues requires obeying the divine law. A divine law requires the existence of God, as the divine lawgiver. Anscombe claims that since we have given up on God’s existence, we should also give up the use of moral terms that are derived from a theistic worldview. Since we have given up belief in God, we should also give up the moral understanding that rests on such belief, and engage in moral philosophy without using such terms. For Anscombe, this meant that we should abandon talk of morality as law, and instead focus on morality as virtue.

Alan Donagan (1977) argues against these conclusions. Donagan’s view is that Anscombe was mistaken on two counts. First, he rejects her claim that we can only treat morality as a system of law if we also presuppose the existence of a divine lawgiver. Second, Donagan contends that neither must we abandon law-based conceptions of morality for an Aristotelian virtue ethic. The reason for this, according to Donagan, is that a divine command must express God’s reason in order for it to be expressive of a divine law. Given this, if we assume that human reason is at least in principle adequate for directing our lives, then the substance of divine law that is relevant to human life can be appreciated with human reason, apart from any reference to a divine being. Moreover, according to Donagan, even if we conceive of morality as Aristotle did, namely, as a matter of virtue, it is quite natural to think that each virtue has as its counterpart some moral rule or precept. For example, ‘to act in manner x is to be just’ has as its counterpart ‘to act in manner x is morally right’. And if we can apprehend the relevant moral virtue via human reason, then we can also apprehend the relevant moral law by that same reason. Given the foregoing points raised by Anscombe and Donagan, a divine command theorist might opt for a conception of morality as virtue, as law, or both.

Before looking at some possible advantages of Divine Command Theory, it will be helpful to clarify further the content of the view. Edward Wierenga (1989) points out that there are many ways to conceive of the connection between God and morality. A strong version of Divine Command Theory includes the claim that moral statements (x is obligatory) are defined in terms of theological statements (x is commanded by God). At the other end of the spectrum is the view that the commands of God are coextensive with the demands of morality. God’s commands do not determine morality, but rather inform us about its content. Wierenga opts for a view that lies between these strong and weak versions of Divine Command Theory. In what follows, I will, following Wierenga, take Divine Command Theory to include the following claims: (i) God in some sense determines what is moral; (ii) moral obligations are derived from God’s commands, where these commands are understood as statements of the revealed divine will.

2. Some Possible Advantages of Divine Command Theory

In his Critique of Practical Reason, Immanuel Kant, who has traditionally not been seen as an advocate of Divine Command Theory (for an opposing view see Nuyen, 1998), claims that morality requires faith in God and an afterlife. According to Kant, we must believe that God exists because the requirements of morality are too much for us to bear. We must believe that there is a God who will help us satisfy the demands of the moral law. With such a belief, we have the hope that we will be able to live moral lives. Moreover, Kant argues that “there is not the slightest ground in the moral law for a necessary connection between the morality and proportionate happiness of a being who belongs to the world as one of its parts and is thus dependent on it” (p. 131). However, if there is a God and an afterlife where the righteous are rewarded with happiness and justice obtains, this problem goes away. That is, being moral does not guarantee happiness, so we must believe in a God who will reward the morally righteous with happiness. Kant does not employ the concept of moral faith as an argument for Divine Command Theory, but a contemporary advocate could argue along Kantian lines that these advantages do accrue to this view of morality.

Another possible advantage of Divine Command Theory is that it provides an objective metaphysical foundation for morality. For those committed to the existence of objective moral truths, such truths seem to fit well within a theistic framework. That is, if the origin of the universe is a personal moral being, then the existence of objective moral truths are at home, so to speak, in the universe. By contrast, if the origin of the universe is non-moral, then the existence of such truths becomes philosophically perplexing, because it is unclear how moral properties can come into existence via non-moral origins. Given the metaphysical insight that ex nihilo, nihilo fit, the resulting claim is that out of the non-moral, nothing moral comes. Objective moral properties stick out due to a lack of naturalness of fit in an entirely naturalistic universe. This perspective assumes that objective moral properties exist, which is of course highly controversial.

Not only does Divine Command Theory provide a metaphysical basis for morality, but according to many it also gives us a good answer to the question, why be moral? William Lane Craig argues that this is an advantage of a view of ethics that is grounded in God. On theism, we are held accountable for our actions by God. Those who do evil will be punished, and those who live morally upstanding lives will be vindicated and even rewarded. Good, in the end, triumphs over evil. Justice will win out. Moreover, on a theistic view of ethics, we have a reason to act in ways that run counter to our self-interest, because such actions of self-sacrifice have deep significance and merit within a theistic framework. On Divine Command Theory it is therefore rational to sacrifice my own well-being for the well-being of my children, my friends, and even complete strangers, because God approves of and even commands such acts of self-sacrifice.

An important objection to the foregoing points is that there is something inadequate about a punishment and reward orientation of moral motivation. That is, one might argue that if the motive for being moral on Divine Command Theory is to merely avoid punishment and perhaps gain eternal bliss, then this is less than ideal as an account of moral motivation, because it is a mark of moral immaturity. Should we not instead seek to live moral lives in community with others because we value them and desire their happiness? In response to this, advocates of Divine Command Theory may offer different accounts of moral motivation, agreeing that a moral motivation based solely on reward and punishment is inadequate. For example, perhaps the reason to be moral is that God designed human beings to be constituted in such a way that being moral is a necessary condition for human flourishing. Some might object that this is overly egoistic, but at any rate it seems less objectionable than the motivation to be moral provided by the mere desire to avoid punishment. Augustine (see Kent, 2001) develops a view along these lines. Augustine begins with the notion that ethics is the pursuit of the supreme good, which provides the happiness that all humans seek. He then claims that the way to obtain this happiness is to love the right objects, that is, those that are worthy of our love, in the right way. In order to do this, we must love God, and then we will be able to love our friends, physical objects, and everything else in the right way and in the right amount. On Augustine’s view, love of God helps us to orient our other loves in the proper way, proportional to their value. However, even if these points in defense of Divine Command Theory are thought to be satisfactory, there is another problem looming for the view that was famously discussed by Plato over two thousand years ago.

3. A Persistent Problem: The Euthyphro Dilemma

The dialogue between Socrates and Euthyphro is nearly omnipresent in philosophical discussions of the relationship between God and ethics. In this dialogue, written by Plato (1981), who was a student of Socrates, Euthyphro and Socrates encounter each other in the king’s court. Charges have been brought against Socrates by Miletus, who claims that Socrates is guilty of corrupting the youth of Athens by leading them away from belief in the proper gods. In the course of their conversation, Socrates is surprised to discover that Euthyphro is prosecuting his own father for the murder of a servant. Euthyphro’s family is upset with him because of this, and they believe that what he is doing—prosecuting his own father—is impious. Euthyphro maintains that his family fails to understand the divine attitude to his action. This then sets the stage for a discussion of the nature of piety between Socrates and Euthyphro. In this discussion, Socrates asks Euthyphro the now philosophically famous question that he and any divine command theorist must consider: “Is the pious loved by the gods because it is pious, or is it pious because it is loved by the gods?” (p. 14).

For our purposes, it will be useful to rephrase Socrates’ question. Socrates can be understood as asking “Does God command this particular action because it is morally right, or is it morally right because God commands it?” It is in answering this question that the divine command theorist encounters a difficulty. A defender of Divine Command Theory might respond that an action is morally right because God commands it. However, the implication of this response is that if God commanded that we inflict suffering on others for fun, then doing so would be morally right. We would be obligated to do so, because God commanded it. This is because, on Divine Command Theory, the reason that inflicting such suffering is wrong is that God commands us not to do it. However, if God commanded us to inflict such suffering, doing so would become the morally right thing to do. The problem for this response to Socrates’ question, then, is that God’s commands and therefore the foundations of morality become arbitrary, which then allows for morally reprehensible actions to become morally obligatory.

Most advocates of Divine Command Theory do not want to be stuck with the implication that cruelty could possibly be morally right, nor do they want to accept the implication that the foundations of morality are arbitrary. So, a divine command theorist might avoid this problem of arbitrariness by opting for a different answer to Socrates’ question, and say that for any particular action that God commands, He commands it because it is morally right. By taking this route, the divine command theorist avoids having to accept that inflicting suffering on others for fun could be a morally right action. More generally, she avoids the arbitrariness that plagues any Divine Command Theory which includes the claim that an action is right solely because God commands it. However, two new problems now arise. If God commands a particular action because it is morally right, then ethics no longer depends on God in the way that Divine Command Theorists maintain. God is no longer the author of ethics, but rather a mere recognizer of right and wrong. As such, God no longer serves as the foundation of ethics. Moreover, it now seems that God has become subject to an external moral law, and is no longer sovereign. John Arthur (2005) puts the point this way: “If God approves kindness because it is a virtue and hates the Nazis because they were evil, then it seems that God discovers morality rather than inventing it” (20, emphasis added). God is no longer sovereign over the entire universe, but rather is subject to a moral law external to himself. The notion that God is subject to an external moral law is also a problem for theists who hold that in the great chain of being, God is at the top. Here, there is a moral law external to and higher than God, and this is a consequence that many divine command theorists would want to reject. Hence, the advocate of a Divine Command Theory of ethics faces a dilemma: morality either rests on arbitrary foundations, or God is not the source of ethics and is subject to an external moral law, both of which allegedly compromise his supreme moral and metaphysical status.

4. Responses to the Euthyphro Dilemma

a. Bite the Bullet

One possible response to the Euthyphro Dilemma is to simply accept that if God does command cruelty, then inflicting it upon others would be morally obligatory. In Super 4 Libros Sententiarum, William of Ockham states that the actions which we call “theft” and “adultery” would be obligatory for us if God commanded us to do them. Most people find this to be an unacceptable view of moral obligation, on the grounds that any theory of ethics that leaves open the possibility that such actions are morally praiseworthy is fatally flawed. However, as Robert Adams (1987) points out, a full understanding of Ockham’s view here would emphasize that it is a mere logical possibility that God could command adultery or cruelty, and not a real possibility. That is, even if it is logically possible that God could command cruelty, it is not something that God will do, given his character in the actual world. Given this, Ockham himself was surely not prepared to inflict suffering on others if God commanded it. Even with this proviso, however, many reject this type of response to the Euthyphro Dilemma.

b. Human Nature

Another response to the Euthyphro Dilemma which is intended to avoid the problem of arbitrariness is discussed by Clark and Poortenga (2003), drawing upon the moral theory of Thomas Aquinas. If we conceive of the good life for human beings as consisting in activities and character qualities that fulfill us, then the good life will depend upon our nature, as human beings. Given human nature, some activities and character traits will fulfill us, and some will not. For example, neither drinking gasoline nor lying nor committing adultery will help us to function properly and so be fulfilled, as human beings. God created us with a certain nature. Once he has done this, he cannot arbitrarily decide what is good or bad for us, what will help or hinder us from functioning properly. God could have created us differently. That is, it is possible that he could have made us to thrive and be fulfilled by ingesting gasoline, lying, and committing adultery. But, according to Aquinas, he did no such thing. We must live lives marked by a love for God and other people, if we want to be fulfilled as human beings. The defender of this type of response to the Euthyphro Dilemma, to avoid the charge of arbitrariness, should explain why God created us with the nature that we possess, rather than some other nature. What grounded this decision? A satisfactory answer will include the claim that there is something valuable about human beings and the nature that we possess that grounded God’s decision, but it is incumbent upon the proponent of this response to defend this claim.

c. Alston’s Advice

In his “Some Suggestions for Divine Command Theorists”, William Alston (1990) offers some advice to advocates of Divine Command Theory, which Alston believes will make the view as philosophically strong as it can be. Alston formulates the Euthyphro dilemma as a question regarding which of the two following statements a divine command theorist should accept:

1. We ought to love one another because God commands us to do so.


2. God commands us to love one another because that is what we ought to do.

Alston’s argument is that if we interpret these statements correctly, a theist can in fact grasp both horns of this putative dilemma. One problem with opting for number 1 in the above dilemma is that it becomes difficult if not impossible to conceive of God as morally good, because if the standards of moral goodness are set by God’s commands, then the claim “God is morally good” is equivalent to “God obeys His own commands”. But this trivialization is not what we mean when we assert that God is morally good. Alston argues that a divine command theorist can avoid this problem by conceiving of God’s moral goodness as something distinct from conformity to moral obligations, and so as something distinct from conformity to divine commands. Alston summarizes his argument for this claim as follows:

…a necessary condition of the truth that ‘S ought to do A’ is at least the metaphysical possibility that S does not do A. On this view, moral obligations attach to all human beings, even those so saintly as to totally lack any tendency, in the ordinary sense of that term, to do other than what it is morally good to do. And no moral obligations attach to God, assuming, as we are here, that God is essentially perfectly good. Thus divine commands can be constitutive of moral obligations for those beings who have them without it being the case that God’s goodness consists in His obeying His own commands, or, indeed, consists in any relation whatsoever of God to His commands (p. 315).

Alston concludes that Divine Command Theory survives the first horn of the dilemma. However, in so doing, perhaps the theory is delivered a fatal blow by the dilemma’s second horn. If the divine command theorist holds that “God commands us to love our neighbor because it is morally good that we should do so,” then moral goodness is independent of God’s will and moral facts stand over God, so to speak, insofar as God is now subject to such facts. Hence, God is no longer absolutely sovereign. One response is to say that God is subject to moral principles in the same way that he is subject to logical principles, which nearly all agree does not compromise his sovereignty (See The Omnipotence Objection below). Alston prefers a different option, however, and argues that we can think of God himself as the supreme standard of goodness. God does not consult some independent Platonic realm where the objective principles of goodness exist, but rather God just acts according to his necessarily good character. But is not arbitrariness still present, insofar as it seems that it is arbitrary to take a particular individual as the standard of goodness, without reference to the individual’s conformity to general principles of goodness? In response, Alston points out that there must be a stopping point for any explanation. That is, sooner or later, when we are seeking an answer to the question “By virtue of what does good supervene on these characteristics?” we ultimately reach either a general principle or an individual paradigm. And Alston’s view is that it is no more arbitrary to invoke God as the supreme moral standard than it is to invoke some supreme moral principle. That is, the claim that good supervenes on God is no more arbitrary than the claim that it supervenes on some Platonic principle.

d. Modified Divine Command Theory

Robert Adams (1987) has offered a modified version of the Divine Command Theory, which a defender of the theory can appropriate in response to the Euthyphro Dilemma. Adams argues that a modified divine command theorist “wants to say…that an act is wrong if and only if it is contrary to God’s will or commands (assuming God loves us)” (121). Moreover, Adams claims that the following is a necessary truth: “Any action is ethically wrong if and only if it is contrary to the commands of a loving God” (132). On this modification of Divine Command Theory, actions, and perhaps intentions and individuals, possess the property of ethical wrongness, and this property is an objective property. That is, an action such as torturing someone for fun is ethically wrong, irrespective of whether anyone actually believes that it is wrong, and it is wrong because it is contrary to the commands of a loving God.

One could agree with this modification of Divine Command Theory, but disagree with the claim that it is a necessary truth that any action is ethically wrong if and only if it is contrary to the commands of a loving God. One might hold that this claim is a contingent truth, that is, that in the actual world, being contrary to the commands of a loving God is what constitutes ethical wrongness, but that there are other possible worlds in which ethical wrongness is not identified with being contrary to the commands of a loving God. It should be pointed out that for the theist who wants to argue from the existence of objective moral properties back to the existence of God, Adams’ stronger claim, namely, that an action is wrong if and only if it goes against the commands of a loving God, should be taken as a necessary truth, rather than a contingent one.

At any rate, whichever option a modified divine command theorist chooses, the modification at issue is aimed at avoiding both horns of the Euthyphro Dilemma. The first horn of the dilemma posed by Socrates to Euthyphro is that if an act is morally right because God commands it, then morality becomes arbitrary. Given this, we could be morally obligated to inflict cruelty upon others. The Modified Divine Command Theory avoids this problem, because morality is not based on the mere commands of God, but is rooted in the unchanging omnibenevolent nature of God. Hence, morality is not arbitrary nor would God command cruelty for its own sake, because God’s nature is fixed and unchanging, and to do so would violate it. It is not possible for a loving God to command cruelty for its own sake. The Modified Divine Command Theory is also thought to avoid the second horn of the Euthyphro Dilemma. God is the source of morality, because morality is grounded in the character of God. Moreover, God is not subject to a moral law that exists external to him. On the Modified Divine Command Theory, the moral law is a feature of God’s nature. Given that the moral law exists internal to God, in this sense, God is not subject to an external moral law, but rather is that moral law. God therefore retains his supreme moral and metaphysical status. Morality, for the modified divine command theorist, is ultimately grounded in the perfect nature of God.

5. Speech Acts and Obligations to Act

Philip Quinn (1978, 1998) offers the following two statements, which he takes to be equivalent:

  1. The moral law imposes the obligation that p.
  2. God commands that p.

For Quinn, then, an agent is obliged to p just in case God commands that p. God is the source of moral obligation. Quinn illustrates and expands on this claim by examining scriptural stories in which God commands some action that apparently violates a previous divine command. Consider God’s command to the Israelites to plunder the Egyptians reported in Exodus 11:2. This seems to go against God’s previous command, contained within the Ten Commandments, against theft. One response to this offered by Quinn is to claim that since theft involves taking what is not due one, and God commanded the Israelites to plunder the Egyptians, their plunder of the Egyptians does not count as theft. The divine command makes obligatory an action that would have been wrong apart from that command. Such moral power is not available to human beings, because only God has such moral authority by virtue of the divine nature.

Elsewhere, Quinn (1979) considers a different relationship between divine commands and moral obligations. Rather than equivalence, Quinn offers a causal theory in which our moral obligations are created by divine commands or acts of will: “…a sufficient causal condition that it is obligatory that p is that God commands that p, and a necessary causal condition that it is obligatory that p is that God commands that p” (312).

Quinn’s accounts lead us to the question of the relationship between speech acts and obligations to act, discussed by philosophers such as Rawls (1999) and Searle (1969). Consider the act of making a promise. If S promises R to do a, is this sufficient for S incurring an obligation to do a? On the account offered by Rawls, under certain conditions, the answer is yes. Just as rules govern games, there is a public system of rules that governs the institution of promising, such that when S promises R to do a, the rule is that S ought to do a, unless certain conditions obtain which excuse S from this obligation. If S is to make a genuine promise that is morally binding, S must be fully conscious, rational, aware of the meaning and use of the relevant words, and free from coercion. For Rawls, promising allows us to enter into stable cooperative agreements that are mutually advantageous. If the institution of promise making is just, then Rawls argues that the principle of fairness applies. For Rawls, the principle of fairness states that “a person is required to do his part as defined by the rules of an institution when two conditions are met: first, the institution is just (or fair)…and second, one has voluntarily accepted the benefits of the arrangement or taken advantage of the opportunities it offers to further one’s interests” (96). If these conditions are met, then S does incur an obligation to do a by virtue of S’s promise to R.

What implications does the above have for Divine Command Theory? Speech acts can entail obligations, as we have seen with respect to the institution of promise making. However, the case of divine commands is asymmetrical to the case of promising. That is, rather than incurring obligations by our own speech acts, Divine Command Theory tells us that we incur obligations by the communicative acts of another, namely, God. How might this work?

An advocate of Divine Command Theory might argue that some of Rawls points apply to the obligations created by the communicative acts of God. For example, our divine command theorist might claim that if God commands S to do a, S must do a if S meets Rawls’ demands of full consciousness, rationality, awareness of the meaning and use of the relevant words, and freedom from coercion. The rule of fairness applies and its demands are satisfied, according to our divine command theorist, because she holds that the institution of obedience to God’s commands is just and fair, given God’s nature, and because S has voluntarily accepted the benefits of this arrangement with God or taken advantage of the opportunities afforded by the arrangement to further her own interests. So, if S has consented to be a follower of a particular religion, and if the requirements of that religion are just and fair, and if S benefits from this arrangement, then S can incur obligations via divine commands. The upshot is not that the foregoing religious and metaphysical claims are true, but rather that by applying some of Rawls’ claims about promise making, we are able to recognize a possible connection between divine commands and the obligation to perform an action. In the next section, Kai Nielsen challenges the truth of these claims, as well as the overall plausibility of Divine Command Theory.

6. Ethics Without God

In his Ethics Without God, Kai Nielsen (1973) argues against the Divine Command Theory and espouses the view that morality cannot be dependent on the will of God. Nielsen advances an argument for the claim that religion and morality are logically independent. Nielsen admits that it may certainly be prudent to obey the commands of any powerful person, including God. However, it does not follow that such obedience is morally obligatory. For a command of God’s to be relevant to our moral obligations in any particular instance, God must be good. And while the religious believer does maintain that God is good, Nielsen wants to know the basis for such a belief. In response, a believer might claim that she knows God is good because the Bible teaches this, or because Jesus embodied and displayed God’s goodness, or that the world contains evidence in support of the claim that God is good. However, these responses show that the believer herself has some logically prior criterion of goodness based on something apart from the mere fact that God exists or that God created the universe. Otherwise, how does she know that her other beliefs about the Bible, Jesus, or the state of the world support her belief that God is good? Alternatively, the religious believer might simply assert that the statement “God is good” is analytic, that is, that it is a truth of language. The idea here is that we are logically prohibited from calling any entity “God” if that entity is not good in the relevant sense. In this way, the claim “God is good” is similar to the claim “Bachelors are unmarried males.” But now another problem arises for the religious believer, according to Nielsen. In order to properly refer to some entity as “God,” we must already have an understanding of what it is for something to be good. We must already possess a criterion for making judgments of moral goodness, apart from the will of God. Put another way, when we say that we know God is good we must use some independent moral criterion to ground this judgment. So, morality is not based on God because we need a criterion of goodness that is not derived from God’s nature. It follows that God and morality are independent.

Nielsen considers another possibility that remains open to the divine command theorist: she might concede that ethics does not necessarily depend on God, but maintain that God is required for the existence of an adequate morality, that is, one that satisfies our most persistent moral demands. If we take happiness to be the ultimate aim of all human activity, then the ultimate aim of all of our moral activity is also happiness. The divine command theorist can then claim that the mistake of Nielsen and other secular moralists is that they fail to see that only in God can we as human beings find ultimate and lasting happiness. God gives purpose to our lives, and we are fulfilled in loving God. Given this fact of human nature, the divine command theorist can argue that only by faith in God can we find purpose in life. Goodness may not be identical with the will of God, but loving God is the reason we exist. On this account, we need God to be fulfilled and truly happy. We are secure in the knowledge that the universe is not against us, ultimately, but rather that God will guide us, protect us, and care for us. This frees us from anxiety, and enables us to direct our lives towards genuine happiness by living according to the will of God in friendship with God. While from a secular perspective it may seem irrational to live according to an other-regarding ethic, from the viewpoint of the religious believer it is rational because it fulfills our human nature and makes us genuinely happy.

In response to this, Nielsen argues that we simply do not have evidence for the existence of God. Without such evidence, the religious believer’s claim that human nature is truly fulfilled in relationship to God is groundless (for more on the issues Nielsen raises, see Moreland and Nielsen, 1990). Moreover, people can, have, and do live purposeful lives apart from belief in God. Religious faith is not necessary for having a life of purpose. Nielsen adds the skeptical doubt that human beings do not have any ultimate function that we must fulfill to be truly happy. We were not made for anything. This realization need not lead us to nihilism, however. For Nielsen, the notion that in order to have a purpose for our lives there must be a God trades on a confusion. Nielsen argues that even if there is no purpose of life, there can still be a purpose in life. While there may not be a purpose for humans qua humans, we can still have purpose in another sense. That is, we can have purpose in life because we have goals, intentions, and motives. Life is purposeless in the larger sense, but in this more restricted sense it is not, and so things matter to us, even if God does not exist. Life has no Purpose, but our lives can still have purpose. A divine command theorist would likely challenge Nielsen’s view that purpose in the latter sense is sufficient for human flourishing.

7. Other Objections to Divine Command Theory

a. The Omnipotence Objection

An implication of the Modified Divine Command Theory is that God would not, and indeed cannot, command cruelty for its own sake. Some would argue that this implication is inconsistent with the belief that God is omnipotent. How could there be anything that an all-powerful being cannot do?

In his discussion of the omnipotence of God, Thomas Aquinas responds to this understanding of omnipotence, and argues that it is misguided. Aquinas argues that we must consider “the precise meaning of ‘all’ when we say that God can do all things” (First Part, Question 25, Article 3). For Aquinas, to say that God can do all things is to say that he can do all things that are possible, and not those that are impossible. For example, God cannot make a round corner, because this is absolutely impossible. Since “a round corner” is a contradiction in terms, it is better to say that making a round corner cannot be done, rather than God cannot make such a thing. This response, however, is insufficient for the issue at hand, namely, that on a Modified Divine Command Theory, God would not and cannot command cruelty for its own sake. There is no logical contradiction in terms here, as there is in the case of the round corner. Aquinas offers a further response to this sort of challenge to God’s omnipotence. His view is that “to sin is to fall short of a perfect action; which is repugnant to omnipotence” (Ibid). For Aquinas, there is something about the nature of sin (a category in which commanding cruelty for its own sake would fall) that is contrary to omnipotence. Hence, that God cannot do immoral actions is not a limit on his power, but rather it is entailed by his omnipotence. Aquinas’ view is that God cannot command cruelty because he is omnipotent.

b. The Omnibenevolence Objection

On Divine Command Theory, it problematically appears that God’s goodness consists in God doing whatever he wills to do. This problem has been given voice by Leibniz (1951), and has recently been discussed by Quinn (1978), Wierenga (1989), Alston (1989), and Wainright (2005). The problem is this: if what it means for an action to be morally required is that it be commanded by God, then God’s doing what he is obligated to do is equivalent to his doing what he commands himself to do. This, however, is incoherent. While it makes sense to conceive of God as forming an intention to do an action, or judging that it would be good to do an action, the notion that he commands himself to do an action is incoherent. Moreover, on Divine Command Theory, God could not be seen as possessing moral virtues, because a moral virtue would be a disposition to do an action that God commands. This is also incoherent.

In response, divine command theorists have argued that they can still make sense of God’s goodness, by pointing out that he possesses traits which are good as distinguished from being morally obligatory. For example, God may be disposed to love human beings, treat them with compassion, and deal with them fairly. These dispositions are good, even if they are not grounded in a disposition to obey God. And if we take these dispositions to be essential to God’s nature, that is, if they are possessed by God in every possible world in which God exists, then, as Wierenga (1989) points out, while it is still the case that whatever God does is good, “the range of ‘whatever God were to do’ includes no actions for which God would not be praiseworthy” (p. 222). Wainright (2005) explains further that while it is true that the moral obligatoriness of truth telling could not have been God’s reason for commanding it, the claim that God does not have moral reasons for commanding it does not follow. This is because the moral goodness of truth telling is a sufficient reason for God to command it. Once God does command it, truth telling is not only morally good, but it also becomes morally obligatory, on Divine Command Theory.

c. The Autonomy Objection

The idea that to be morally mature, one must freely decide which moral principles will govern one’s life serves as an objection to Divine Command Theory, because on the theory it is not our own wills that govern our moral lives, but the will of God. We are no longer self-legislating beings in the moral realm, but instead followers of a moral law imposed on us from the outside. In this sense, autonomy is incompatible with Divine Command Theory, insofar as on the theory we do not impose the moral law upon ourselves. However, Adams (1999) argues that Divine Command Theory and moral responsibility are compatible, because we are responsible for obeying or not obeying God’s commands, correctly understanding and applying them, and adopting a self-critical stance with respect to what God has commanded us to do. Given this, we are autonomous because we must rely on our own independent judgments about God’s goodness and what moral laws are in consistent with God’s commands. Additionally, it seems that a divine command theorist can still say that we impose the moral law on ourselves by our agreeing to subject ourselves to it once we come to understand it, even if it ultimately is grounded in God’s commands.

d. The Pluralism Objection

The last objection to note is that given the variety and number of religions in the world, how does the divine command theorist know which (putatively) divine commands to follow? The religions of the world often give conflicting accounts of the nature and content of the commands of God. Moreover, even if such a person believes that her religion is correct, there remains a plurality of understandings within religious traditions with respect to what God commands us to do. In response, some of the issues raised above regarding autonomy are relevant. A divine command theorist must decide for herself, based on the available evidence, which understanding of the divine to adopt and which understanding of divine commands within her particular tradition she finds to be the most compelling. This is similar to the activity and deliberation of a secular moralist who must also decide for herself, among a plurality of moral traditions and interpretations within those traditions, which moral principles to adopt and allow to govern her life. This takes us into another problem for divine command theory, namely, that it is only those who follow the correct religion, and the correct interpretation of that religion, that are moral, which seems highly problematic. However, Divine Command Theory is consistent with the belief that numerous religions contain moral truth, and that we can come to know our moral obligations apart from revelation, tradition, and religious practice. For example, a divine command theorist could grant that a philosophical naturalist may come to see that beneficence is intrinsically good through a rational insight into the necessary character of reality (see Austin, 2003). It is consistent with Divine Command Theory that we can come to see our obligations in this and many other ways, and not merely through a religious text, religious experience, or religious tradition.

8. Conclusion: Religion, Morality, and the Good Life

In his A Just Society (2004), Michael Boylan argues that we must engage in self-analysis for the purpose of both constructing and implementing a personal plan of life that is coherent, comprehensive, and good. In this activity, we must recognize that there are many types of values by which we live, including but not limited to religious, ethical, and aesthetic values. Of particular interest in this context is Boylan’s discussion of God’s command to Abraham to kill Isaac. Here we have a conflict between the religious and the ethical. Boylan notes that in the story, Abraham does not kill Isaac, but if he had his community must judge him to be a murderer. The reason for this is that Abraham’s community does not know whether the command to kill Isaac was a legitimate divine command, or some delusion of Abraham’s. So, this community must depend upon the ethical prohibition against murder when evaluating Abraham’s actions. Boylan’s position contrasts with Kierkegaard’s, who is generally interpreted as believing that Abraham’s action is justified by a suspension of the ethical, so that in this case the religious trumps the ethical. However, in such disputes, Boylan argues that when the commands of religion (or the values of aesthetics) clash with the demands of morality, in a just society morality should win the day.

Regardless of what one makes of this, when evaluating the philosophical merits and drawbacks of Divine Command Theory, one should take a broad perspective and consider the possible connections between the theory and other religious and moral issues, as well as the relevant aesthetic, epistemic, and metaphysical questions, in order to develop a personal plan of life that is coherent, comprehensive, and good.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert M. 1987. The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays in Philosophical Theology. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Adams, Robert M. 1999. Finite and Infinite Goods. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Alston, William. 1989. Divine Nature and Human Language: Essays in Philosophical Theology. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press.
  • Alston, William. 1990. “Some Suggestions for Divine Command Theorists.” In Christian Theism and the Problems of Philosophy. Edited by Michael Beaty. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press: 303-326.
  • Anscombe, G. E. M. 1958. “Modern Moral Philosophy.” Philosophy 33: 1-19.
  • Arthur, John. 2005. “Morality, Religion, and Conscience.” In Morality and Moral Controversies: Readings in Moral, Social, and Political Philosophy. Edited by John Arthur. Seventh edition. Upper Saddle River, N.J.: Pearson Prentice Hall: 15-23.
  • Audi, Robert and William Wainwright. 1986. Rationality, Religious Belief, and Moral Commitment. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press.
  • Austin, Michael W. 2003. “On the Alleged Irrationality of Ethical Intuitionism: Are Ethical Intuitions Epistemically Suspect?” Southwest Philosophy Review 19: 205-213.
  • Beaty, Michael, ed. 1990. Christian Theism and the Problems of Philosophy. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Beaty, Michael, Carlton Fisher, and Mark Nelson, eds. 1998. Christian Theism and Moral Philosophy. Macon, Geo.: Mercer University Press.
  • Boylan, Michael. 2004. A Just Society. Lanham, Md.: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Clark, Kelly James and Anne Poortenga. 2003. The Story of Ethics: Fulfilling Our Human Nature. Upper Saddle River, N.J.: Prentice Hall.
  • Copan, Paul. 2003. “Morality and Meaning Without God: Another Failed Attempt.” Philosophia Christi Series 2, 6: 295-304.
  • Donagan, Alan. 1977. The Theory of Morality. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Hare, John. 1997. The Moral Gap: Kantian Ethics, Human Limits, and God’s Assistance. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hare, John. 2000. “Naturalism and Morality.” In Naturalism: A Critical Analysis. Edited by William Lane Craig and J. P. Moreland. New York: Routledge: 189-212.
  • Kant, Immanuel. 1993. Critique of Practical Reason. Third Edition. Translated by Lewis White Beck. Upper Saddle River, N.J.: Prentice Hall.
  • Kent, Bonnie. “Augustine’s Ethics.” 2001. In The Cambridge Companion to Augustine. Edited by Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann. New York: Cambridge University Press: 205-233.
  • Kierkegaard, Søren. 1985. Fear and Trembling. Translated by Alastair Hannay. New York: Penguin.
  • Kretzmann, Norman. 1983. “Abraham, Isaac, and Euthyphro: God and the Basis of Morality.” In Hamarti, The Concept of Error in the Western Tradition: Essays in Honor of John M. Crossett. Edited by D.V. Stump, E. Stump, J.A. Arieti, and L. Gerson. New York: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm. 1951. Theodicy. London: Routledge, Kegan, and Paul.
  • Mackie, J. L. 1977. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. New York: Penguin Books.
  • Moreland, J. P. and Kai Nielsen. 1990. Does God Exist?: The Great Debate. Nashville: Thomas Nelson.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1987. “Duty and Divine Goodness.” American Philosophical Quarterly 21.
  • Morris, Thomas V. 1991. Our Idea of God: An Introduction to Philosophical Theology. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Morriston, Wes. 2001. “Must There Be a Standard of Moral Goodness Apart from God?” Philosophia Christi Series 2, 3: 127-138.
  • Murphy, Mark. “Divine Command, Divine Will, and Moral Obligation.” Faith and Philosophy 15 (1998): 3-27.
  • Nielsen, Kai. 1973. Ethics Without God. Buffalo, N.Y.: Prometheus Books.
  • Nuyen, R. T. 1998. “Is Kant a Divine Command Theorist?” History of Philosophy Quarterly 15: 441-453.
  • Plato. 1981. Five Dialogues: Euthyphro, Apology, Crito, Meno, Phaedo. Translated by G. M. A. Grube. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Quinn, Philip L. 1978. Divine Commands and Moral Requirements. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Quinn, Philip L. 1979. “Divine Command Ethics: A Causal Theory.” In Divine Command Morality: Historical and Contemporary Readings. Edited by Janine Idziak. New York: Edwin Mellen Press, 1979: 305-325.
  • Quinn, Philip. 1992. “The Primacy of God’s Will in Christian Ethics.” Philosophical Perspectives 6: 493-513.
  • Stump, Eleonore, and Norman Kretzmann. 1985. “Absolute Simplicity.” Faith and Philosophy 2: 353-382.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 2001. “Evil and the Nature of Faith.” In Seeking Understanding: The Stob Lectures 1986-1998. Grand Rapids, Mich.: Eerdmans: 530-550.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Saint. 1947. The Summa Theologica. Translated by the Fathers of the English Dominican Province.
  • Wainright, William J. 2005. Religion and Morality. Burlington, Verm.: Ashgate.
  • Wierenga, Edward. 1983. “A Defensible Divine Command Theory.” Nous 17, pp. 387-407.
  • Wierenga, Edward. 1989. The Nature of God: An Inquiry into Divine Attributes. Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press.
  • William of Ockham. Super 4 Libros Sententiarum II, 19.
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 2004. Divine Motivation Theory. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Author Information

Michael W. Austin
Email: mike.austin@eku.edu
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.

Bhedabheda Vedanta

Bhedābheda Vedānta is one of the several traditions of Vedānta philosophy in India. “Bhedābheda” is a Sanskrit word meaning “Difference and Non-Difference.” The characteristic position of all the different Bhedābheda Vedānta schools is that the individual self (jīvātman) is both different and not different from the ultimate reality known as Brahman. Bhedābheda reconciles the positions of two other major schools of Vedānta. The Advaita (Monist) Vedānta that claims the individual self is completely identical to Brahman, and the Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta that teaches complete difference between the individual self and Brahman. However, each thinker within the Bhedābheda Vedānta tradition has his own particular understanding of the precise meanings of the philosophical terms “difference” and “non-difference.” Bhedābheda Vedāntic ideas can traced to some of the very oldest Vedāntic texts, including quite possibly Bādarāyaṇa’sBrahma Sūtra (app. 4th c. CE). Bhedābheda ideas also had an enormous influence on the devotional (bhakti) schools of India’s medieval period. Among medieval Bhedābheda thinkers are Vallabha (1479-1531 CE), founder of the Puṣṭimārga devotional sect now centered in Nathdwara, Rajasthan, and Caitanya (1485-1533 CE) the founder of the Gaudīya Vaiṣṇava sect based in the northeastern Indian state of West Bengal.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Overview
    1. Bādarāyaṇa and Bhartṛprapañca
    2. Bhāskara
    3. Yādavaprakāśa and Nimbārka
    4. Vallabha
    5. Caitanya
    6. Vijñānabhikṣu
  2. Ontology
    1. Part and Whole
    2. Aupādhika and Svābhāvika Bhedābheda
  3. Causality
    1. Pariṇāmavāda (Theory of real transformation)
    2. Vivartavāda (Theory of unreal manifestation)
    3. Satkāryavāda (Theory of pre-existent effect)
  4. Theology and soteriology
    1. God in Bhedābhedavāda
    2. Knowledge combined with ritual acts leads to liberation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Overview

Bhedābheda is often presented as a school of Vedānta. Vedānta, in turn, is sometimes spoken about as a single philosophy, when in reality “Vedānta” has different uses. Its most inclusive use is as a label for a philosophy that purports to be expressed at length in the latter part of the Vedas, that is, the Upaniṣads. It is centrally concerned with the inquiry into the nature of an ultimate entity called “Brahman.” There are many different accounts of this synoptic philosophy, and the various accounts are often considered schools of philosophy themselves. Unlike the well-known schools of Advaita (Non-Dualist) Vedānta, Viśiṣṭādvaita (Non-Dualism of the Qualified) Vedānta, and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta, it makes more sense to refer to Bhedābheda Vedānta as a “tradition” or “family” of philosophies rather than as a single “school.” This is because, unlike the three aforementioned schools, Bhedābheda has no single founder who created an institutionalized network of monasteries dedicated to the study, development, and propagation of the founder’s teachings. The history of Bhedābheda in India stretches back at least until the 7th century CE and likely quite earlier, and continues into the present day. Although there are substantial philosophical disagreements among the many Bhedābheda thinkers, their philosophies also show certain characteristic similarities. After a short historical introduction to several major Bhedābhedavādins, I will discuss a few viewpoints that almost all Bhedābheda schools share. These include the understanding of the relation between individual self (jīvātman) and Brahman as one of part and whole; the doctrine that the phenomenal world is a real transformation of Brahman (Pariṇāmavāda); and the doctrine that liberation can only be attained by means of a combination of knowledge and ritual action (Jñānakarmasamuccayavāda), not by knowledge alone.

a. Bādarāyaṇa and Bhartṛprapañca

Numerous scholars have concluded that Bādarāyaṇa’s Brahma Sūtra (circa 4th c. CE), one of the foundational texts common to all Vedānta schools, was written from a Bhedābheda Vedāntic viewpoint (Dasgupta 1922: vol. 2, p. 42; Nakamura 1989: p. 500). While that claim is disputed by other schools, there is little doubt that Bhedābheda predates Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedānta. In his commentary on the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, Śaṅkara (8th c.) repeatedly criticizes interpretations by an earlier Vedāntin named Bhartṛprapañca, who characterized the relation between Brahman and individual souls as one of difference and non-difference. One of the central disagreements between the two is that Śaṅkara claims that Brahman’s entire creation is a mere appearance (vivarta), while Bhartṛprapañca maintains that it is real (Hiriyanna 1957: vol. 2, pp. 6-16).

b. Bhāskara

The first Bhedābhedavādin widely recognized as such by the later tradition is Bhāskara (8th-9th c.). He was either a younger contemporary of Śaṅkara or perhaps lived slightly after Śaṅkara. His only extant work is a commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. That work is expressly written in order to defend the earlier claims of Bhedābhedavādins against Śaṅkara’s interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra. Although he never mentions Śaṅkara by name, he makes it clear from the beginning that his primary intention in commenting on the Brahma Sūtra is to oppose some predecessor: “I am writing a commentary on thissūtra in order to obstruct those commentators who have concealed its ideas and replaced them with their own” (Bhāskara 1903: p. 1). Bhāskara is the earliest in a long line of Vedāntic authors concerned to refute Advaita (including Rāmānuja and Madhva, not to mention numerous Bhedābhedavādins). Many of the stock arguments used against the Advaita originated with Bhāskara, if indeed he did not borrow them from an even earlier source. He also seems to have been remembered by the collective Advaita tradition as a thorn in its side. So, for instance, in the 14th century hagiography of Śaṅkara, theŚaṅkaradigvijaya, Mādhava depicts one “Bhaṭṭa Bhāskara” as a haughty and famous Bhedābhedavādin whom Śaṅkara defeats in a lengthy debate.

c. Yādavaprakāśa and Nimbārka

While the Viśiṣṭādvaita philosopher Rāmānuja (11th-12th c.) is widely acknowledged as the most influential Vedāntin after Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja’s complicated relationship with Bhedābhedavāda is rarely discussed. Rāmānuja’s teacher Yādavaprakāśa was a Bhedābhedavādin. Yādavaprakāśa’s works have been lost, and therefore almost all of what we know of his ideas comes from Rāmānuja and one of Rāmānuja’s commentators, Sudarśanasῡri. However, it is possible from these numerous hints to draw a sketch of Yādavaprakāśa’s basic views. Rāmānuja depicts Yādavaprakāśa as an exponent of Svābhāvika Bhedābhedavāda, the view that Brahman is both different and not different than the world in its very nature, and that difference is not simply due to difference of artificial limiting conditions (see Oberhammer 1997: p. 10). Yādavaprakāśa shares this basic viewpoint with Nimbārka (13th c.?), and disagrees with the Aupādhika Bhedābhedavāda of Bhāskara, who maintains that the difference of the world and Brahman is due to limiting conditions. Another characteristic of Yādavaprakāśa’s thought is his repeated insistence that Brahman has the substance of pure existence (sanmātradravya). The relationship between Brahman and the world is not merely one of class and individual, but rather both are existent entities, standing in the relationship of cause and effect (see Oberhammer 1997: p. 14).

d. Vallabha

In the late medieval period, the doctrine of Bhedābheda became increasingly associated with devotional (bhakti) movements in North India. It is largely on the basis of their reputations as the founders of religious sects, and not as philosophers per se, that thinkers such as Vallabha (1479-1531) and Caitanya (1485-1533) became widely known. Among the former’s most influential works are a commentary on the Brahma Sūtraentitled the Anubhāṣya, and his commentary on the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, entitled theSubodhinī. Vallabha founded the Vaiṣṇava sect of the Puṣṭimārga (“path of nourishment”) now based in Nathdwara, Rajasthan. His philosophical system, called Śuddhādvaita (Pure Non-Dualism), takes its name from his view that there is no dualism whatsoever between a real Brahman and an unreal world. Since both are completely real, he denies that there can be any sort of ontological dualism of real and unreal between the two—therefore it is a “pure” non-dualism. Obviously, this refers to the Advaita school’s view that the phenomenal world is not real in an ultimate sense, and is a clever attempt to re-appropriate the valued label “Advaita” for his own school. Yet in this regard all Bhedābhedavādins might claim the name Śuddhādvaita, since they all assert the reality of the phenomenal world.

e. Caitanya

Caitanya was another medieval Vaiṣṇava philosopher/theologian, famous for a school of thought known as Acintya Bhedābhedavāda (Inconceivable Difference and Non-difference). Although Caitanya never wrote down his teachings, numerous followers authored works based on his philosophy, such as Jīva Gosvāmin, author of a well-known commentary on the Bhāgavata Purāṇa. This system’s notion of “inconceivability” (acintyatva) is a central concept used to reconcile apparently contradictory notions, such as the simultaneous oneness and multiplicity of Brahman, or the difference and non-difference of God and his powers. The tradition of Acintya-Bhedābheda, also commonly known as Gaudīya Vaiṣṇavism, thrives to this day in the Indian state of West Bengal. Perhaps the most famous offshoot of this devotional tradition is the International Society for Krishna Consciousness (ISKON), more popularly known in the West by the name the “Hari Krishnas.”

f. Vijñānabhikṣu

The last major Bhedābheda thinker in pre-modern India, Vijñānabhikṣu (16th c.), did not follow the path of bhakti. Vijñānabhikṣu sought to show the ultimate unity of the schools of Vedānta, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, and Nyāya, and is most well known today for commentaries on Sāṅkhya and Yoga texts. In his innovative sub-commentary on Patanjali’s Yoga Sūtra, Vijñānabhikṣu argues that yoga is the most effective means to liberation, although he never repudiates the Bhedābheda metaphysical framework of his earliest writings (Nicholson 2005). Vijñānabhikṣu was a theist who considered Viṣṇu the supreme God. In his commentary on the Sāṅkhya Sūtra, he argues that the Sāṅkhya school requires an omnipotent God in order to cause the union of its two fundamental principles, primordial nature (prakṛti) and pure consciousness (puruṣa). Vijñānabhikṣu grounds his reinterpretations of fundamental concepts in Sāṅkhya-Yoga in Bhedābheda metaphysics. In his earliest works, such as his Bhedābheda Vedāntic commentary on the Brahma Sūtras, he understands the concepts of difference and non-difference in terms of separation and non-separation (Ram 1995). Although for him the fundamental relation of the individual self and Brahman is one of non-separation, the Sāṅkhya-Yoga analysis of the individual selves as multiple and separate from one another is correct, as long as it is understood that this state of separation is temporary and adventitious. While Vijñānabhikṣu’s acceptance of Sāṅkhya-Yoga philosophical truths puts him at odds with some earlier Bhedābhedavādins, he continues in the tradition of Bhāskara in his trenchant criticism of the Advaita Vedāntins, whom he decries as “crypto-Buddhists” (pracchannabauddha) and “Vedāntins in name alone” (vedāntibruva).

2. Ontology

One of the most notable differences between Bhedābheda Vedānta and Advaita (Monistic) Vedānta is their views on the existence of the phenomenal world. While Advaita holds that the phenomenal world is ultimately unreal (mithyā) and that only Brahman truly exists, Bhedābheda thinkers insist that the phenomenal world is real, and not at all illusory. In this basic assertion they are in line with the majority of Indian philosophical schools, including the schools of Qualified Non-Dualist (Viśiṣṭādvaita) Vedānta, Dualist (Dvaita) Vedānta, Nyāya, Sāṅkhya, and Mīmāṃsā. Although Advaitins cite certain passages from the Upaniṣads as supporting the notion that the world is akin to a mirage or a magical trick, Bhedābhedavādins accuse Advaitins of borrowing this idea from the Mind-only (Cittamātra) school of Buddhism, and frequently employ the epithet of “crypto-Buddhist” (pracchannabauddha) to refer to Advaitins.

a. Part and Whole

Bhedābhedavādins understand the relation between Brahman and the individual souls to be a relation between a whole and its parts. They frequently employ stock examples to illustrate this relation. Some of the most common are a fire and its sparks, the sun and its rays, a father and his son, and the ocean and its waves. Each of these is an example of a part-whole relation, which is also a variety of difference and non-difference (Bhedābheda). So, to take one example, the sparks that come off of a fire are both the same as that fire and different from it. They are the same insofar as they came from the fire, and are constituted by the same substance as fire. But they are also distinguishable from the original fire, as occupying a separate point in space. Although these four examples each seem to illustrate a different relation (and it may seem to make no sense at all to understand a son as a “part” of his father), Bhedābhedavādins cite these familiar examples from the physical world in order to shed light on the true metaphysical relation between Brahman and the individual selves. While each might capture some aspect of that relation, inevitably they are mere approximations, requiring further commentary and philosophical analysis.

Advaita Vedāntins object to the characterization of the individual self as a part, and characterize Brahman as partless. All schools of Vedānta understand the Veda as the ultimate epistemic authority, and arguments from scripture play a large part in intra-Vedāntic disputes. Advaitins point out that both the Upaniṣads and the Brahma Sūtras say that Brahman is partless (niravayava, niṣkala). Furthermore, the assertion that Brahman has parts seems to defy logic. It is inconceivable that Brahman could be made up of parts, for things that are made up of parts are dependent on those parts, and impermanent. Advaitins offer their own stock examples to show that Brahman cannot be divided up, and that any such division is purely an artificial limitation on an indivisible entity. For example, Advaitins commonly liken Brahman to the element called “space” (ākāśa). According to traditional science in India, space is an element that is omnipresent in the world, just as all Vedāntins agree that Brahman is omnipresent. Although we can talk about space as being delimited (the space inside a room, the space inside a pot), such limitations of space are purely accidental, not essential to the element itself. It may appear to an observer that the space inside a pot and the space outside the pot are two different entities, but this is a misunderstanding of the fundamental nature of space.

The Bhedābhedavādins can themselves appeal to textual authority for the idea that the relation between Brahman and the individual self is a relation between a whole and its parts. In Brahma Sūtra 2.3.43, The individual self is referred to as a “part” (aṁśa), and Bhedābhedavādins cite this passage whenever they require a textual support for their views. However, Advaitins take this description of the relation as a figurative, and not literal description of the status of the individual self. Otherwise, this passage will conflict with Brahma Sūtra 2.1.26, which says that Brahman is “partless” (niravayava). For Advaita, the world appears as if to be made of parts. But when it is understood correctly, all of the many entities in the world are seen to be false, and only one entity, a single, partless Brahman remains. Bhedābhedavādins, in their assertion of the world’s phenomenal reality, insist that multiplicity is real. Brahman is simultaneously one and many, depending on the perspective from which it is viewed, just as the ocean can be described as one or many, depending on the perspective from which it is described. Bhedābhedavādins maintain that Brahman’s being made up of parts in no way diminishes the perfection of Brahman, just as the existence of waves in the ocean in no way diminishes the amount of water therein.

b. Aupādhika and Svābhāvika Bhedābheda

All Bhedābhedavādins maintain the reality of the phenomenal world and the multiplicity of individual selves. However, some Bhedābheda thinkers edge closer to the Advaita position by arguing that although multiplicity is real, it is in some way less real than the absolute unity of Brahman. The early Bhedābheda thinker Bhāskara (8th-9th c. CE) exemplifies this tendency to reduce the ontological status of the phenomenal world, while still maintaining its reality. Bhāskara’s philosophy is an example of Aupādhika Bhedābhedavāda (“Difference and Non-difference Based on Limiting Conditions”). According to Bhāskara, the one, absolute Brahman becomes finite and multiple by means of limiting conditions (upādhis). Just as a pure diamond appears to be red when it is placed next to a red flower, so too the absolute Brahman appears finite when it is transformed through limiting conditions. This transformation is a real one; the individual self really is finite, subject to ignorance, suffering, and bondage, so long as it is filtered through limiting conditions. Although the individual self is real as differentiated from Brahman, for Bhāskara difference is merely a temporary state. In its natural state, Brahman is one and not many. Although it undergoes limitations to become finite, the ultimate goal of the individual is to realize his or her absolute state. Liberation is precisely the removal of such limiting conditions.

At the other end of the spectrum from Bhāskara’s Aupadhika Bhedābhedavāda is Nimbārka’s philosophy of Svābhāvika Bhedābheda (Natural Difference and Non-Difference). For Nimbārka (13th c.), Brahman is different and non-different not because of artificial limiting conditions, but contains both non-difference and non-difference as its essential nature. Along with Yādavaprakāśa (11th c.), Nimbārka comes closest to upholding both difference and non-difference as equally real states of Brahman. The tendency among most Bhedābhedavādins, however, is to subordinate difference to non-difference. Although difference is a real state that Brahman undergoes as it transforms into multiple individual selves, Bhāskara in essence makes the state of non-difference “more real” than the state of difference. In this way, school of Bhedābheda Vedānta is often closer to the school of Advaita (Monist) Vedānta than it is to the school of Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta.

3. Causality

a. Pariṇāmavāda (Theory of real transformation)

Closely related to Bhedābheda Vedānta’s ontology is its theory of causality. Bhedābheda Vedāntins subscribe to the theory of Pariṇāmavāda, which states that the phenomenal world is a real transformation (pariṇāma) of the material cause of the world. They share this theory with the Sāṅkhya school of philosophy, as well as with most other schools of Vedānta. The major difference between the Vedāntic theory of Pariṇāmavāda and the Sāṅkhya’s Pariṇāmavāda is the understanding of what constitutes the material cause of the world. For Sāṅkhya, primordial nature (prakṛti) transforms itself into the phenomenal world. The principle of primordial nature is completely insentient, and the process of transformation that creates the world is a blind, automatic process. For Bhedābheda Vedāntins, Brahman is both the material and efficient cause of the universe. Brahman, unlike the Sāṅkhya’s prakṛti, is sentient. Yet both the sentient (individual souls) and insentient (physical things) have their origin in Brahman, according to Bhedābhedavādins. In spite of their apparent proximity to the Sāṅkhya school on the issue of causality, early Bhedābheda thinkers such as Bhāskara took pains to critique the Sāṅkhya notion ofprakṛti, accusing it of being both contrary to scripture and contrary to logic. A few later Bhedābheda thinkers took a softer line on Sāṅkhya. The most notable of these was Vijñānabhikṣu (16th c.), who argued for the ultimate unity of Sāṅkhya and Bhedābheda Vedānta doctrines.

b. Vivartavāda (Theory of unreal manifestation)

Once again, it is useful to contrast the doctrines of the Bhedābheda school with Advaita Vedānta. Advaita Vedānta maintains the doctrine of Vivartavāda, which states that the world is an unreal manifestation (vivarta) of Brahman. Advaita, like other schools of Vedānta, identifies Brahman as both material and efficient cause. But for the Advaitins, Brahman is the cause of an unreal effect. Although the world can be described as conventionally real (vyavahārasat), the Advaitins claim that all of Brahman’s effects must ultimately be acknowledged as unreal before the individual self can be liberated. Although the theory of Vivartavāda is traditionally accepted as a theory shared by the entire Advaita school, some recent historians have questioned this, noting passages in the work of Śaṅkara, the founder of the Advaita, that appear to be closer to the theory ofpariṇāma (Hacker 1953: pp. 24ff.; Rao 1996: pp. 265ff.). It is likely that the theory ofVivartavāda is a theory that emerged gradually out of the earlier Vedāntic theory ofPariṇāmavāda, rather than one that sprang fully formed out of the head of Śaṅkara. It also bears repeating that some Bhedābheda Vedāntins come perilously close to the Advaita view of the phenomenal world as only conventionally real, as they often emphasize that multiplicity is an unnatural, temporary state.

c. Satkāryavāda (Theory of pre-existent effect)

Proponents of both Vedāntic theories of causality, Pariṇāmavāda and Vivartavāda, justify each by citing a central passage at Chāndogya Upaniṣad 6.1.4-5. There, the sage Aruni describes the nature of causality to his son, Śvetaketu, using the example of the relation of clay to a pot:

It is like this, son. By means of just one lump of clay one would perceive everything made of clay—the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s clay.’It is like this, son. By means of just one copper trinket one would perceive everything made of copper—the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s copper.’ (Olivelle 1996: 148)

This passage uses the examples of an everyday material cause, clay or copper, to shed light on the nature of cause and effect. It expresses the doctrine of Satkaryavāda, which says that the effect preexists in its cause. All Vedāntins subscribe to this theory—the doctrines of real tranformation (pariṇāma) and unreal manifestation (Vivartavāda) can be understood as two different versions of the theory of Satkāryavāda. According toSatkāryavāda, the lump of clay does not go out of existence when it is transformed into a pot, a cup, a saucer, or the like, only to be replaced by something entirely new. Although the form of the clay has changed, its essence, its clay-ness, remains. The same logic applies to everything caused by Brahman. The entire world, in all of its many forms, nonetheless shares the same essence, as being Brahman. This view, something like an early Indian theory of the conservation of matter, suggests that nothing ever arrives in the universe completely new, but only as a transformation of some earlier material cause. Nothing can be created ex nihilo. In this belief, the Vedāntins are at odds with the Buddhist and Nyāya schools, who for separate reasons argue that the effect does not preexist in the cause.

Although Bhedābheda Vedāntins and Advaita Vedāntins have the theory of Satkāryavādain common, they part ways when asked to characterize the status of the effect. Is the effect a real transformation (pariṇāma) of the cause, or merely an unreal manifestation (vivarta)? The passage at Chāndogya Upaniṣad 6.1.4-5 has been interpreted in both ways. Advaitins emphasize the apparent nominalism expressed by Aruni in this passage: “the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s copper.’” This might suggest that the effect is unreal, and only the cause is truly real. But Bhedābhedavādins see this passage as simply another instantiation of the principle of difference and non-difference, just as it is illustrated by the examples of a fire and its sparks or the sun and its rays. From one perspective, focusing on substance, we can say that all of the various cups, saucers, and plates are one—they are all clay. Yet at the same time, they have been transformed by the pot-maker into different forms, multiple in number, occupying different points in space. From this perspective, the effects are real. Just as the many pots, plates, and saucers are simultaneously different and non-different from the original lump of clay, so too all of the individual selves are both different and non-different from Brahman, the original material cause.

4. Theology and soteriology

a. God in Bhedābhedavāda

In the medieval period, Bhedābheda Vedānta became closely associated with theism in general, and the movement of bhakti devotionalism in particular. There is a reason thatbhaktas such as Vallabha (1479-1531 CE) and Caitanya (1485-1533) built the foundations of their theological systems on centuries-old Bhedābheda concepts. Like the schools of Rāmānuja and Madhva, Bhedābhedavāda is a realist school. Whereas in the Advaita school even God has to be understood as ultimately unreal, since He too is merely Brahman limited by the artificial condition of lordliness, certain types of Bhedābheda philosophy can accommodate a God who is real in his qualified (saguṇa) form. Although on a certain level, an Advaitin can profess a belief in God, he or she knows that ultimately God is merely a crutch, a heuristic to enable human beings to go one step closer to that ultimate Brahman devoid of qualities (nirguṇa). Such a God is ultimately unsatisfying for those whose primary interest is devotion—in any system of Advaita, devotion must occupy a lower position than pure knowledge. On the other hand, many worshippers will also be unsatisfied with the Dvaita school’s uncompromising notion that they themselves are completely separate from God, and that ultimate unification with the Godhead is impossible. Both Bhedābhedavāda and Viśiṣṭādvaita offer the possibility to bridge these two alternatives, by offering the alternative of both a real God possessing qualities and the possibility of personal participation in that Godhead.

b. Knowledge combined with ritual acts leads to liberation

Besides insistence that the phenomenal world is a real transformation (pariṇāma) of Brahman, another view shared by Bhedābhedavādins is the necessity of ritual acts in combination with knowledge (Jñānakarmasamuccayavāda) in order to obtain liberation. Bhāskara devotes much of the beginning of his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra to a critique of Śaṅkara’s radical view that knowledge alone is sufficient for the attainment of Brahman, as long as one has fulfilled one’s ritual requirements at an earlier stage. Although today polemics between Vedāntins are usually depicted in solely philosophical or theological terms, this suggests that above all, Śaṅkara’s new teachings were seen by other Vedāntins in the 8th century as a serious threat to the ritual-social order. Bhāskara’s arguments in favor of Brahmanic ritualism are an important reminder of the continuities between early Vedānta and the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā (Prior Exegesis) school of ritual hermeneutics. The two schools are so close that Sanskrit authors in pre-modern India typically refer to Vedānta by the names “Brahma Mīmāṃsā” (Exegesis of Brahman) or “Uttara Mīmāṃsā” (Later Exegesis), emphasizing the central importance of Vedic interpretation for all Vedāntic thinkers.

The notion of bhakti finds a home in Bhedābhedavāda, since Bhedābheda takes activity in the world (karman) seriously, believing that activities in the world are real, and produce real effects. But it should not be thought that all Bhedābhedavādins were proponents ofbhakti. The early Bhedābheda of Bhāskara was not concerned at all with bhakti. Instead, Bhāskara uses Bhedābheda conceptual terminology as a conservative apologist, to defend the importance of Brahmanical ritual orthodoxy from Śaṅkara, a radical who rejected the ultimate efficacy of Vedic ritual. It is only with Nimbārka, a Bhedābheda thinker heavily influenced by the bhakti system of Rāmānuja, that we first fully see the union of bhaktiworship and Bhedābhedavāda. Even in medieval northern India, where bhakti was influential and widespread, not all Bhedābhedavādins were bhaktas. Vijñānabhikṣu, for example, was more interested in espousing a modified, Bhedābheda Vedāntic form of Patañjali’s Yoga than he was to proselytize for the path of devotion. Such flexibility of the Bhedābheda philosophical apparatus has allowed it to survive as a living tradition for over 1500 years in a number of very different historical contexts. Although in the modern period Bhedābheda Vedānta has been eclipsed in popularity by neo-Vedāntic interpretations of Advaita Vedānta philosophy, its lineage continues today among traditional scholars in Puṣṭimārga and Gaudīya Vaiṣṇava religious communities. And, for the first time in its long history, in the early 21st century Bhedābheda Vedānta is beginning to receive the attention it deserves among historians, philosophers, and theologians outside of India.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bhāskara (1903). Brahmasūtrabhāṣyam, ed. Pandit Vindhyeshvari Prasada Dvivedin. Benares: Chowkhamba Sanskrit Book Depot.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath (1922). A History of Indian Philosophy, vol III. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Hacker, Paul (1953). Vivarta: Studien zur Geschichte der illusionistischen Kosmologie und Erkenntnistheorie der Inder. Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Kapoor, O.B.L (1976). The Philosophy and Religion of Sri Caitanya. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal.
  • Marfatia, Mrdula I. (1967). The Philosophy of Vallabhācarya. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal.
  • Nakamura, Hajime (1989). A History of Early Vedānta Philosophy, part 1. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Nicholson, Andrew (2005). “Vijñānabhikṣu’s Yoga,” Journal of Vaishnava Studies vol.14, no. 1: pp. 43-53.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (1997). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule III:Yādavaprakāśa, der vergessene Lehrer Rāmānujas. Wien: Verlag der Osterreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, translator (1996). Upaniṣads. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ram, Kanshi (1995). Integral Non-Dualism: A Critical Exposition of Vijñānabhikṣu’s System of Philosophy. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Rao, Srinivasa (1996). “Two ‘Myths’ in Advaita,” Journal of Indian Philosophy vol. 24: pp. 265-279.
  • Smith, Frederick M. (2005). “The Hierarchy of Philosophical Systems According to Vallabhācārya,” Journal of Indian Philosophy vol. 33: pp. 421-453.
  • Srinivasachari, P.N. (1972). The Philosophy of Bhedābheda. Madras: Adyar Library.

Author Information

Andrew J. Nicholson
Stony Brook University
U. S. A.

Contextualism in Epistemology

In very general terms, epistemological contextualism maintains that whether one knows is somehow relative to context. Certain features of contexts—features such as the intentions and presuppositions of the members of a conversational context—shape the standards that one must meet in order for one’s beliefs to count as knowledge. This allows for the possibility that different contexts set different epistemic standards, and contextualists invariably maintain that the standards do in fact vary from context to context. In some contexts, the epistemic standards are unusually high, and it is difficult, if not impossible, for our beliefs to count as knowledge in such contexts. In most contexts, however, the epistemic standards are comparatively low, and our beliefs can and often do count as knowledge in these contexts. The primary arguments for epistemological contextualism claim that contextualism best explains our epistemic judgments—it explains why we judge in most contexts that we have knowledge and why we judge in some contexts that we don’t—and that contextualism provides the best solution to puzzles generated by skeptical arguments.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Subjunctive Conditionals Contextualism
  3. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Rejecting Closure
    1. Dretske’s Relevant Alternatives Theory of Knowledge
    2. Relevant Alternatives Contextualisms that Reject Closure
  4. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Accepting Closure
  5. Contextualism and Epistemic Rationality
  6. Other Forms of Epistemological Contextualism
    1. Explanatory Contextualism
    2. Evidential Contextualism
    3. Contextualism as a Theory of Knowledge
  7. Objections to Contextualism
  8. Alternatives to Contextualism
  9. Conclusion
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Epistemological contextualism has evolved primarily as a response to views that maintain that we have no knowledge of the world around us. Taking quite seriously the problems presented by skepticism, contextualists seek to resolve the apparent conflict between claims like the following:

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. But I don’t know that I have hands if I don’t know that I’m not a brain-in-a-vat (that is, a bodiless brain that is floating in a vat of nutrients and that is electrochemically stimulated in a way that generates perceptual experiences that are exactly similar to those that I am now having in what I take to be normal circumstances).
  3. I don’t know that I’m not a brain-in-a-vat (henceforth, a BIV).

These claims, when taken together, present a puzzle. (1), (2), and (3) are independently plausible yet mutually inconsistent. That (1) is plausible seems to require no explanation. (3) is plausible because it seems that in order to know that I’m not a BIV, I must rule out the possibility that I am a BIV. Yet the BIV and I have perceptual experiences that are exactly similar—it seems to the BIV, just as it seems to me, that he has hands, that he is sitting at his desk and in front of his computer, and so on. Accordingly, my perceptual experiences give me no reason to favor the belief that I am not a BIV over the belief that I am. Thus, since I have only my perceptual experiences to go on, I cannot rule out the possibility that I’m a BIV. Considerations like these contribute to (3)’s plausibility.

Moreover, it seems that I can’t know that I have hands—and, in general, that I can’t know that I have any body at all —if I can’t rule out the possibility that I’m a bodiless BIV. This, then, contributes to the plausibility of (2). It seems in addition that (2) always retains its plausibility, no matter how high or low we set the standards for knowledge. Keith DeRose (1999a) defends this claim by noting that it is always a comparative fact that my epistemic position with respect to the claim that I’m not a BIV is just as strong as my epistemic position with respect to the claim that I have hands. If this is correct, then (2) is true across contexts, no matter what the epistemic standards.

Yet in spite of the fact that they are independently plausible, (1), (2), and (3) are mutually inconsistent; they cannot all be true. It seems, therefore, that we must give up one of these claims. But which one should we give up, and why?

In trying to answer these questions, contextualists maintain that ‘know’ either is or functions very much like an indexical, that is, an expression whose semantic content (or meaning) depends on the context of its use. For example, the word ‘here’ is an indexical. I say, “Jaime is here,” and what I mean depends on where I am when I say it. If I’m in the conference room, then I mean, all other things being equal, that Jaime is in the conference room. ‘I’ is also an indexical—its meaning depends on the context of its use and, in particular, on who is using it. When Jaime says, “I am in the conference room,” then he means, all other things being equal, that Jaime is in the conference room. Yet when Julie uses ‘I’, she means something different; Julie’s ‘I’ means Julie.

If ‘know’ is an indexical, its semantic content (or meaning) will depend on the context in which it is used. Furthermore, since context will affect the semantic content of ‘know’, context will have an effect on the semantic content of complex lexical items in which ‘know’ appears, for example, on the semantic content of knowledge attributions like ‘Jaime knows that he’s in the conference room’. Contextualists have put the point this way:

the truth-conditions of knowledge ascribing and knowledge denying sentences (sentences of the form ‘S knows that P’ and ‘S doesn’t know that P’ and related variants of such sentences) vary in certain ways according to the contexts in which they are uttered. What so varies is the epistemic standards that S must meet (or, in the case of a denial of knowledge, fail to meet) in order for such a statement to be true. (DeRose 1999a, p. 187)

Given this, contextualists maintain that (1), (2), and (3) do not in fact conflict, even though it seems that they do. They suggest, first of all, that some contexts set very high epistemic standards, standards according to which knowledge requires a great deal. Contexts in which these high standards are in play are typically those in which we are considering and taking seriously certain skeptical hypotheses. For example, in order to know anything at all about the world around us, these high standards might require us to rule out the possibility that we are BIVs, or the possibility that we are now dreaming, or the possibility that we are now being deceived by an omnipotent but malevolent demon. Yet our perceptual experiences afford us no evidence that would allow us to rule out these skeptical possibilities, for if we were BIVs, for example, we would be having exactly the same perceptual experiences that we’re now having. Thus, we fail to meet these high epistemic standards with respect both to the belief that I have hands and to the belief that I’m not a BIV. (1) is therefore false in these high-standards contexts while (3) is true. According to contextualists, then, we should reject (1) in high-standards contexts. When we do so, we are no longer faced with a conflict, for the conflict presents itself only when we insist on the truth of each of the three mutually inconsistent claims. Moreover, in rejecting (1) in high-standards contexts, contextualism gives the skeptic his due, and takes seriously the compelling nature of skeptical arguments.

Nevertheless, contextualists maintain that in most contexts, the epistemic standards are comparatively low. Typically, these are ordinary contexts in which we are considering no skeptical hypotheses. In such contexts, we can have knowledge of the world around us without eliminating skeptical possibilities like the BIV possibility. In order to know that I have a hand, for example, I need eliminate only possibilities like those in which I have no hands, or in which I have paws or claws instead of hands. Moreover, the evidence provided by my perceptual experiences—the evidence that I obtain by looking at my hands, or by hearing the sounds made when I clap them together—does allow me to eliminate these possibilities. Thus, we can meet the epistemic standards that are in place in low-standards contexts. (1) is therefore true in these contexts while (3) is false. According to contextualists, then, we should reject (3) in low-standards contexts. And here again, in rejecting (3), we keep the conflict between (1), (2), and (3) from presenting itself. Moreover, in rejecting (3) in low-standards contexts, contextualism allows us to retain our ordinary knowledge—it allows us to know the things we ordinarily take ourselves to know.

Yet if we are never actually faced with a conflict between (1), (2), and (3), why does it seem as if we are? Contextualists respond in this way: Since we most often find ourselves in low-standards contexts, we tend to evaluate knowledge attributions according to the epistemic standards that are in place in those contexts. Thus, we tend to reckon (1) true. However, since (3) makes explicit reference to BIVs, our evaluation of that claim tends to lead us to entertain the BIV skeptical scenario. Doing this can raise the epistemic standards—it can push us into a context in which the epistemic standards are quite high—and so we tend to reckon (3) true. And so it seems that we are faced with a conflict between (1), (2), and (3). Yet it merely seems as if we are faced with such a conflict. For, as we have seen, when the epistemic standards are high, (1) is false while (3) is true. But when the standards are lower, (1) is true while (3) is false.

Contextualism also allows us to explain why it seems in certain contexts that we don’t know that we have hands (for example). We make these epistemic judgments at least partly because it’s true in such contexts that we don’t know that we have hands. And we judge in other contexts that we know that we have hands at least partly because such claims are true in those other contexts. Thus, contextualism not only helps us to see our way out of apparent conflicts like those between (1), (2), and (3), but it also helps us to explain why we make the epistemic judgments that we do.

The most prominent forms of epistemological contextualism are based either on Robert Nozick’s subjunctive conditionals account of knowledge or on the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge that is associated with Fred Dretske and Alvin Goldman. The primary difference between these two forms of contextualism is in how they characterize epistemic standards. As we will see, the former characterizes the standards in terms of subjunctive conditionals, while the latter characterizes them in terms of relevant alternatives. We will consider subjunctive conditionals contextualism in Section 2 and relevant alternatives contextualism in Sections 3 and 4. Some forms of contextualism, however, are based on neither of these theories. One such view is the version of contextualism that Stewart Cohen advocates most recently, and we will consider this view in Section 5. Let us turn now, though, to subjunctive conditionals contextualism.

2. Subjunctive Conditionals Contextualism

Keith DeRose provides an influential brand of epistemological contextualism. It is intended to solve the puzzles generated by groups of statements like the following:

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. But I don’t know that I have hands if I don’t know that I’m not a BIV.
  3. I don’t know that I’m not a BIV.

DeRose claims that in contexts in which the standards for knowledge are unusually high, we should reject (1) and that the skeptic can truthfully say in such contexts that I don’t know that I have hands. In other contexts, however, the epistemic standards are more relaxed and we can both reject (3) and correctly say that I do know that I have hands.

DeRose’s contextualist solution seeks to explain the plausibility of (3) by utilizing resources provided by Robert Nozick. Specifically, DeRose’s solution appeals to the Subjunctive Conditionals Account (SCA) of the plausibility of (3). According to SCA, “we have a very strong general, though not exceptionless, inclination to think that we don’t know that P when we think that our belief that P is a belief we would hold even if P were false” (DeRose 1999a, p. 193). DeRose calls the belief that P insensitive if it is one that we would hold even if P were false. SCA’s generalization thus becomes: We are inclined to think that S doesn’t know that P if we think that S’s belief that P is insensitive.

DeRose claims that even though this generalization does not represent our ordinary standard for knowledge, there are contexts in which the skeptic puts it into place as the standard (for example, by mentioning skeptical possibilities like the possibility that you are now a BIV). The standard in such contexts is the skeptical standard, according to which my beliefs must be sensitive if they are to count as knowledge. When this standard is in place, as it is in skeptical contexts, I fail to know that I’m not a BIV. For my belief that I’m not a BIV is not sensitive: I would believe that I wasn’t a BIV even if I were a BIV. Moreover, since (2) is true in all contexts, it follows that I don’t know in skeptical contexts that I have hands. In this way, DeRose’s contextualism explains the plausibility of (3) and gives the skeptic his due by arguing that there are contexts in which we should reject (1).

But DeRose wants to avoid the boldly skeptical conclusion that I never know that I have hands, and he does this by arguing that in ordinary contexts of knowledge attribution—contexts in which the skeptical standard is not in place and in which the epistemic standards are comparatively low—we can reject (3). In these contexts, the skeptical standard is not in place, and our beliefs need not be sensitive in order to count as knowledge. Thus, we can truthfully assert in ordinary contexts that I do know that I have hands. And, since (2) is true in all contexts, it follows that I know in ordinary contexts that I’m not a BIV. In this way, DeRose’s contextualism explains the plausibility of rejecting (3) and allows us to retain the knowledge that we ordinarily take ourselves to have.

According to DeRose, the relevant difference between these contexts is that the standards for knowledge are quite high in skeptical contexts but comparatively low in ordinary ones. But what accounts for this difference? DeRose recognizes that he must “explain how the standards for knowledge are raised [by the skeptic]” (DeRose 1999a, p. 206) if his solution is to be adequate. Essential to this explanation is DeRose’s Rule of Sensitivity:

When someone asserts that S knows (or does not know) that P, the standards for knowledge tend to be raised, if need be, to a level such that S’s belief that P must be sensitive if it is to count as knowledge. (DeRose 1999a, p. 206)

He then provides the following explanation of how the skeptic raises the standards.

In utilizing [puzzles like those generated by (1)-(3)] to attack our putative knowledge of O [where O is a proposition that we ordinarily take ourselves to know], the skeptic instinctively chooses her skeptical hypothesis, H, so that it will have these two features: (1) We will be in at least as strong a position to know that not-H as we’re in to know that O, but (2) Any belief we might have to the effect that not-H will be an insensitive belief…. Given feature (2), the skeptic’s assertion that we don’t know that not-H, by the Rule of Sensitivity, drives the standards for knowledge up to such a point as to make that assertion true. …And since we’re in no stronger an epistemic position with respect to O than we’re in with respect to not-H (feature (1)), then, at the high standards put in place by the skeptic’s assertion of [(3)], we also fail to know that O. (DeRose 1999a, pp. 206-7)

DeRose maintains, then, that the skeptic’s assertion is the mechanism she uses to raise the standards for knowledge. When the skeptic asserts that I don’t know that I’m not a BIV, the Rule of Sensitivity is invoked, and the standards for knowledge are raised to such a level that my beliefs must be sensitive if they are to count as knowledge. And since my belief that I’m not a BIV is not sensitive—that is, since I would believe that I wasn’t a BIV even if I were a BIV—I do not know in skeptical contexts that I’m not a BIV. Thus, given the truth of (2), I do not know in skeptical contexts that I have hands (or, for that matter, anything that I ordinarily take myself to know.)

Nevertheless, when no one mentions a skeptical hypothesis, the Rule of Sensitivity is not invoked, and the epistemic standards allow beliefs to count as knowledge even though they are not sensitive. This means that in ordinary contexts, we are still in a position to know the things we ordinarily take ourselves to know.

3. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Rejecting Closure

Perhaps the main motivation for epistemological contextualism is now the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge. There are two kinds of relevant alternatives contextualism. One kind rejects the closure principle, according to which knowledge is closed under known implication:

If S knows that p, and knows that p implies q, then S knows that q.

The closure principle is both plausible and explanatorily valuable. For one thing, it helps to explain how we come to know things via deduction. I know, for example, that tomorrow is Saturday. I know this because I know that today is Friday and that if today is Friday then tomorrow is Saturday. The closure principle helps to account for this knowledge, and the fact that I come to know things via deduction—and in accordance with the closure principle—renders that principle both plausible and desirable.

A second kind of relevant alternatives contextualism accepts the closure principle.

In Section 3.2, we will consider Mark Heller’s relevant alternatives contextualism, which represents accounts that reject the closure principle. Before examining Heller’s contextualism, however, we should consider the theory that motivates it.

a. Dretske’s Relevant Alternatives Theory of Knowledge

Fred Dretske proposes “to think of knowledge as an evidential state in which all relevant alternatives (to what is known) are eliminated” (Dretske 2000b, p. 52). This is the relevant alternatives theory of knowledge, or RA. But this leaves several questions unanswered.

First, what is an alternative to p? A proposition q is an alternative to p if and only if it cannot be true both that q and that p. Thus, the proposition that this animal is a Siberian grebe is an alternative to the proposition that it’s a Gadwall duck. For the animal cannot be both a Siberian grebe and a Gadwall duck.

Second, what is a relevant alternative to p? Dretske says that a relevant alternative is an alternative “that a person must be in a[n] evidential position to exclude (when he knows that P)” (Dretske 2000b, p. 57). But this doesn’t help very much at all. What is it about the alternatives that S must exclude that makes them such that she must exclude them? Unfortunately, there is no widely accepted response to this question. The vote seems to be split between two candidates. Some, including Dretske, say that an alternative q is relevant only if there is an objective possibility that q. But others say that q can be a relevant alternative simply because we regard q as a possibility.

Third, what does it mean to eliminate a relevant alternative? Here, too, there is disagreement. One view about elimination is the strongest view, according to which S can eliminate a relevant alternative q only if her evidence for believing not-q is strong enough to allow her to know that not-q. A proponent of RA might instead adopt the strong view, according to which S can eliminate q if her evidence for thinking that not-q is either strong enough to allow her to know that not-q or strong enough to allow her to have very good reason to believe that not-q. A proponent of RA might also adopt the weak view, according to which S can eliminate a relevant alternative q by meeting one of the following three conditions: (i) her evidence for not-q is strong enough to allow her to know that not-q, (ii) her evidence for not-q is strong enough to allow her to have very good reason to believe that not-q, or (iii) S’s belief that not-q is epistemically non-evidentially rational, where this is “a way in which it can be rational (or reasonable) [for S] to believe [that not-q] without possessing evidence for the belief” (Cohen 1988, p. 112). Some RA contextualists make it clear that they have something like the weak view in mind (see Cohen 1988 and Stine 1976), but most fail to make it clear which of the three views they adopt.

Dretske argues that I can know that p without eliminating the irrelevant alternatives to p. Still, he maintains that my knowing that p entails nothing whatsoever about whether I know that q, where q is an irrelevant alternative to p and might even be a necessary consequence of p. This amounts to a denial of the closure principle. Suppose that the alternative that this is a Siberian grebe is irrelevant to my knowing that it is a Gadwall duck. Notice too that the negation of the former proposition is a necessary consequence of the latter proposition—if this is a Gadwall duck, then it is not a Siberian grebe. Dretske claims that I can know that this is a Gadwall duck even though I don’t know that it’s not a Siberian grebe. Thus, Dretske holds that the closure principle is false.

This verdict is quite controversial, however, and there is disagreement over this matter even among proponents of RA. I see the lines of this disagreement as boundaries between different kinds of RA theories, and we can classify RA theories according to whether they accept or reject closure. We might choose to do this partly because RA contextualists, as well as RA theorists in general, tend to make it clear whether they accept closure, while they do not always make it clear where they stand on other issues (e.g., on the issue of relevance and on the issue of elimination). Primarily, though, we should distinguish between RA contextualists who accept closure and those who reject it because their views about closure crucially influence how they respond to skepticism. As we shall shortly see, those who reject closure deny one of the conflicting claims, namely, (2), the claim that I don’t know that I have hands if I don’t know that I’m not a BIV. So, according to RA contextualists who reject closure, there really is no conflict at all between claims (1) and (3). But according to those who accept closure, there is such a conflict. For, by the closure principle, in contexts in which I don’t know that certain skeptical alternatives do not obtain, I also fail to know certain things about the external world.

In Section 4, we will see how RA contextualists who accept closure respond to skepticism. In the following section, however, we will examine the response provided by RA contextualists who reject closure.

b. Relevant Alternatives Contextualisms that Reject Closure

Consider the puzzle that is generated by the following argument:

  1. I don’t know that I’m not a BIV in a treeless world (that is, a BIVT).
  2. If I know that there is a tree before me (call the italicized proposition T), and I know that T implies my not being a BIVT, then I know that I’m not a BIVT.
  3. So, I don’t know that T (given that I know that T implies my not being a BIVT).

In “Relevant Alternatives and Closure,” Mark Heller follows Dretske’s lead and argues that we can solve this skeptical puzzle by rejecting the closure principle, of which (5) is an instance.

To show why we should give up (5) (and hence the closure principle), Heller argues for a particular interpretation of RA. He claims that (5) is false if his interpretation of RA is true. He calls his interpretation Expanded Relevant Alternatives, or ERA.

(ERA) S knows that p only if S does not believe p in any of the closest not-p worlds or any more distant not-p worlds that are still close enough.

ERA accounts for our inclination to think, for example, that if I know that T, I will not believe that T in any of the closest worlds in which it’s not the case that T. In addition, ERA accounts for our inclination to think that something else is sometimes needed if I am to know that T. Imagine that “the actual world is cluttered with papier mâché tree facsimiles which S is unable to distinguish from real trees” (Heller 1999b, p. 200). In this case, we are inclined to say that S doesn’t know that T even if she doesn’t believe that T in any of the closest not-T worlds. Here, even though worlds that are cluttered with papier mâché tree facsimiles are not among the closest not-T worlds, they are close enough to the actual world to count as relevant. So Heller claims that in at least some cases, if S is to know that p, she must not believe that p in any of the close enough not-p worlds.

ERA provides the foundation for a relevant alternatives contextualism, for it allows us to see different contexts as setting different epistemic standards. Which not-p worlds count as epistemically relevant—that is, which not-p worlds count as being close enough to the actual world—will vary from context to context. And since ERA characterizes epistemic standards in terms of relevant alternatives (that is, in terms of relevant not-p worlds), it allows for the context-sensitivity of epistemic standards.

In light of this, Heller maintains, we may solve the skeptical puzzle by concluding that (5) is false. Note first of all that there are no contexts in which I know that I’m not a BIVT. Given ERA, if I am to know that I’m not a BIVT, I must not believe that I’m not a BIVT in any of the closest BIVT worlds. Thus, since I do believe that I’m not a BIVT in the closest BIVT worlds, I don’t know that I’m not a BIVT.

Nevertheless, there are contexts in which I do know that T. This is true because we use “different worlds as relevant alternatives when considering whether [I know that T] from those used when considering whether [I know that I’m not a BIVT]” (Heller 1999b, p. 197). According to ERA, I know in C that T because I don’t believe that T in any of the not-T worlds that are close enough to the actual world. (And we need consider only the close enough not-T worlds because those worlds include the closest not-T worlds.) So given that ERA is true, (5) is false: I can know that there is a tree before me (and hence evade the skeptic’s snare) even though I don’t know that I’m not a BIVT. We can therefore solve the skeptical puzzle by giving up the closure principle.

Any solution to the skeptical puzzle that denies the truth of (5) must explain why it seems to us that (5) is true. In providing this explanation, Heller argues that (5) seems true because some contexts conform to the demands of the closure principle. For example, there are contexts in which astonishingly distant not-T worlds—for example, worlds in which I am a BIVT—are close enough to the actual world to count as epistemically relevant. In those contexts, I know neither that T nor that I’m not a BIVT. For, in BIVT worlds, I believe both that T and that I’m not a BIVT. The fact that there are contexts such as these, contexts that conform to the demands of the closure principle, can make it seem that (5) is true.

4. Relevant Alternatives Contextualism and Accepting Closure

Some relevant alternatives contextualisms accept the closure principle. In this section, we will examine the contextualist theory espoused by Stewart Cohen in his influential article “How to be a Fallibilist.” Cohen’s theory is perhaps the most prominent relevant alternatives contextualism and should be counted among the most notable of all contextualisms.

Cohen’s contextualism, like others, is intended to solve certain skeptical puzzles. The puzzle with which Cohen is concerned is familiar—it consists of three independently plausible but mutually inconsistent propositions.

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. If I don’t know that I’m not a BIV, then I don’t know that I have hands.
  3. I don’t know that I’m not a BIV.

To solve this paradox, Cohen relies on a relevant alternatives contextualism, one that accepts the plausibility—and indeed the truth—of proposition (2), which follows from the closure principle (given that I know that my having hands implies my not being a BIV). Cohen claims that in skeptical contexts, contexts in which the BIV alternative is relevant, we should accept propositions (2) and (3) but deny proposition (1). However, in ordinary contexts, contexts in which the BIV alternative is not relevant, we should accept (1) and (2) but deny (3).

Let’s look at the details of Cohen’s account. For Cohen,

an alternative (to [some proposition] q) h is relevant (for [some person] S) = df S’s epistemic position with respect to h precludes S from knowing q. (Cohen 1988, p. 101)

Cohen also claims that there are criteria of relevance and that these criteria ought to reflect our intuitions about the conditions under which S knows that q. He says that our intuitions are influenced both by conditions that are internal and by conditions that are external to a person’s evidence. Accordingly, he offers two criteria of relevance. First, there is the external criterion.

An alternative (to p) h is relevant if the probability of h conditional on reason r and certain features of the circumstances is sufficiently high (where the level of probability that is sufficient is determined by context). (Cohen 1988, p. 102)

By this criterion, the fact that there are a number of cleverly painted mules in the zoo, whether or not I have any evidence for this fact, can be sufficient to make relevant the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule. Presumably, if there are a number of cleverly painted mules in the zoo, it is probable to some determinate degree d that this is a cleverly painted mule rather than, say, a zebra. And according to Cohen, the context determines, for example, that probabilities of degree d* and higher are sufficiently high to render an alternative relevant. Thus, according to the external criterion, if d is greater than or equal to d*, the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule will be relevant in this context.

Second, there is the internal criterion.

An alternative (to q) h is relevant if S lacks sufficient evidence (reason) to deny h, i.e., to believe not-h (Cohen 1988, p. 103),

where the amount of evidence that is sufficient is presumably determined by context. By this criterion, the amount of evidence that S has for her belief that this is not a cleverly painted mule can be sufficiently low to make relevant the alternative that it is a cleverly painted mule. We may again presume that S has a determinate amount of evidence a for her belief that this is not a cleverly painted mule. Here, the context determines, say, that amounts of evidence a* and lower are sufficiently low to render an alternative relevant. So if a is less than or equal to a*, the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule will be relevant in this context.

Both the internal criterion and the external criterion are sensitive to context. According to Cohen, then,

there will be no general specification of what constitutes sufficient evidence to deny an alternative in order for it not to be relevant, and as such, no general specification of what constitutes sufficient evidence to know q. Rather, this will depend on the context in which the attribution of knowledge occurs. (Cohen 1988, p. 103)

But how do the standards of relevance shift? Cohen recognizes that he must explain how this shift occurs if his contextualist solution to the skeptical paradox is to work. Because Cohen thinks of reasons as statistical in nature, he thinks that they advertise both the chance that we believe correctly on their basis and the chance that we believe erroneously on their basis. When the chances for error are highlighted, those chances become salient, and the standards for relevance shift. Thus, highlighting the chances for error allows certain alternatives to become relevant.

For example, suppose that I have reasons to believe that this is a zebra. It looks for all the world like a zebra; it is in an area of the zoo that is clearly marked “zebras”; I believe with good reason that zookeepers put only zebras in areas marked “zebras”; and so on. But perhaps someone underscores the fact that all of these reasons are compatible with this animal’s being a cleverly painted mule. Such mules look for all the world like zebras, and in a pinch even the most conscientious zookeeper might put such creatures in an area marked “zebras.” Underscoring these facts makes salient the chance that I believe erroneously on the basis of my reasons, and it makes relevant the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule.

This suggests that, for Cohen, the standards of relevance shift whenever someone underscores the statistical nature of our reasons, whenever someone points out that there is a chance that we believe erroneously on the basis of those reasons. So, in ordinary contexts, contexts in which no one underscores the chance that I believe erroneously, that chance will not be salient, and I can know on the basis of my reasons that this is a zebra. However, in skeptical contexts, contexts in which someone does underscore the chance that I believe erroneously, that chance will be salient. In these contexts, my attention will have been focused on the chance that I am wrong, and the alternative that this is a cleverly painted mule will be relevant. Since I cannot eliminate that alternative, I do not know that this is a zebra.

Cohen suggests that his relevant alternatives contextualism allows us to solve skeptical puzzles like those that focus on zebras and cleverly painted mules. This is because his version of the relevant alternatives theory is formulated in terms of evidence, and such puzzles involve beliefs for which we can have evidence. But Cohen suggests that radical skeptical paradoxes involve beliefs for which we can have no evidence—”radical skeptical hypotheses are immune to rejection on the basis of any evidence” (Cohen 1988, p. 111). As it is, then, Cohen’s relevant alternatives contextualism seems ill equipped to resolve radical skeptical paradoxes.

To overcome this difficulty, Cohen adjusts his version of the relevant alternatives theory so that it takes into account beliefs for which I can have no evidence. He claims that for some such beliefs it is epistemically rational for me to hold them even though I possess no evidence for them. He calls beliefs of this sort intrinsically rational beliefs. Among the intrinsically rational beliefs is my belief that I’m not a BIV. According to Cohen, it is rational for me to believe that I’m not a BIV even though I have no evidence for that belief.

Taking into account intrinsically rational beliefs, Cohen amends the internal criterion of relevance. First, he says that

it is reasonable for a subject S to believe a proposition q just in case S possesses sufficient evidence in support of q, or q is intrinsically rational. (Cohen 1988, p. 113)

He then provides the following amended version of the internal criterion, or ICa:

(ICa:) An alternative (to p) h is relevant if it is not sufficiently reasonable for S to deny h (to believe not-h), where, presumably, the degree of reasonableness that is sufficient is determined by context.

Cohen now notes that according to ICa: the alternative that I am a BIV is not ordinarily relevant. For my belief that I’m not a BIV is intrinsically rational. This means that the alternative that I am a BIV does not preclude me from knowing, on the basis of my reasons, that I have hands. Thus, I can know in ordinary contexts that I have hands (given both that my reasons are sufficient for my knowing that I have hands and that all relevant alternatives are eliminated). Furthermore, Cohen claims that since the standards are comparatively low in ordinary contexts, I can also know in those contexts that I’m not a BIV.

However, there are contexts in which the skeptic underscores the fact that I can have no evidence for my belief that I’m not a BIV. By doing this, the skeptic focuses my attention on the chance of error. According to Cohen, this makes relevant the alternative that I am a BIV, and I cannot eliminate that alternative. So, by the standards that apply in these skeptical contexts, I know neither that I’m not a BIV nor that I have hands. In this way, then, Cohen solves the radical skeptical puzzle while maintaining that closure holds.

5. Contextualism and Epistemic Rationality

Certain objections have led Cohen to abandon the relevant alternatives contextualism that he presents in “How to be a Fallibilist” and to revise his contextualist solution to radical skeptical paradoxes. He is most troubled by two objections. First, he is troubled by the idea that I can have evidence for my belief that I’m not a BIV. Second, he is troubled by the idea that his account commits him to the view that I can have a priori knowledge of some contingent facts, in particular, of the fact that I’m not a BIV. On the view that he presents in “How to be a Fallibilist,” I can know that I’m not a BIV solely on the basis of the intrinsic rationality of denying that I am a BIV. According to Cohen (see Cohen 1999, p. 69), this means that I can know a priori that I’m not a BIV and hence that I can have a priori knowledge of some contingent facts. These two objections have led Cohen away from his earlier relevant alternatives contextualism.

Even though Cohen now admits that I can have evidence for my belief that I’m not a BIV, he still thinks that there are beliefs for which I can never have evidence. He formulates a new radical skeptical paradox in terms of such beliefs. Cohen asks us to imagine a creature that is a BIV but will never have evidence that it is. Call such a creature a BIV*. Now, my belief that I’m not a BIV* is a belief for which I will never have evidence. We can formulate the following new paradox in terms of that belief.

  1. I know that I have hands.
  1. f I don’t know that I’m not a BIV*, then I don’t know that I have hands.
  2. I don’t know that I’m not a BIV*.

Since this paradox involves a skeptical hypothesis for which I can never have evidence, the idea that I can have evidence for my belief that I’m not a BIV* should not trouble Cohen’s solution to this new paradox.

But given that Cohen has abandoned the relevant alternatives framework, just what is his solution to the BIV* paradox? He notes first of all that my belief that I’m not a BIV* can be intrinsically rational, or what he now calls non-evidentially rational. Once again, S’s belief that p is non-evidentially rational if it is epistemically rational for S to believe that p even though S has no evidence for that belief. Furthermore, Cohen now suggests that

S knows that p if and only if her belief that p is epistemically rational to some degree d, where epistemic rationality has both an evidential and a non-evidential component, and where d is determined by context. (see Cohen 1999, pp. 63-69, 76-77)

Suppose, then, that I have a certain amount of evidence for my belief that I have hands, and that my belief that I have hands is therefore evidentially rational to degree de:. Suppose too that my belief that I’m not a BIV* is non-evidentially rational to some degree dne. Cohen claims that “the non-evidential rationality [of my belief that I’m not a BIV*] is a component of the overall rationality or justification for any empirical proposition” (Cohen 1999, p. 86, fn. 36). So we may suppose that my belief that I have hands is epistemically rational to degree d*, where d* equals de plus dne.

Cohen now says that the degree to which a belief must be epistemically rational if it is to count as knowledge is “determined by some complicated function of speaker intentions, listener expectations, presuppositions of the conversation, salience relations, etc.” (Cohen 1999, p. 61). He suggests that the listeners’ cooperation is an essential part of this function. He also claims that in ordinary contexts this complicated function specifies that a belief is sufficiently epistemically rational if it is epistemically rational to degree do. And d*—the degree to which my belief that I have hands is epistemically rational—is greater than do. This means that I can know in ordinary contexts that I have hands. “And since my having a hand entails my not being a brain-in-a-vat [and a fortiori a BIV*], in those same [ordinary] contexts, my belief that I am not a brain-in-a-vat is sufficiently rational for me to know I am not a brain-in-a-vat” (Cohen 1999, p. 77). This allows him to overcome the objection that I know a priori that I’m not a BIV, for “my knowledge that I am not a brain-in-a-vat is based, in part, on my empirical evidence (the evidence that I have a hand), and so is not a priori” (Cohen 1999, p. 76). In ordinary contexts, then, we accept propositions (1) and (7) of the new radical skeptical paradox, but deny proposition (8).

But in skeptical contexts the complicated function specifies that a belief is sufficiently epistemically rational only if it is epistemically rational to degree ds. And d* is less than Ds This means that in skeptical contexts “my belief that I have a hand is not sufficiently rational for me to know I have a hand. In those same [skeptical] contexts, I have no basis for knowing I am not a brain-in-a-vat” (Cohen 1999, p. 77). In skeptical contexts, we accept propositions (7) and (8) but deny proposition (1). In this way, then, Cohen solves the BIV* paradox while maintaining that closure holds.

6. Other Forms of Epistemological Contextualism

Besides those already discussed, a few other forms of epistemological contextualism warrant mention. We begin with the form that belongs to Steven Rieber, which is most similar to those already considered.

a. Explanatory Contextualism

In “Skepticism and Contrastive Explanation,” Steven Rieber provides a contextualist solution to the skeptical puzzle generated when (1), (2), and (3) are considered together. He first proposes the following analysis of knowledge:

S knows that P … iff: the fact that P explains why S believes that P. (Rieber 1998, p. 194)

He next claims that his analysis of knowledge “generates the sort of context-sensitivity needed to solve the skeptical puzzle” (Rieber 1998, p. 195). He says that “what counts as an explanation is highly context-dependent. In particular, as recent work on contrastive explanation has made clear, it can depend on an implied contrast” (Rieber 1998, p. 195). For example, only those who have syphilis contract paresis, but most of those who have syphilis never get paresis. Suppose that Smith has both syphilis and paresis. We might ask

(S) Does the fact that Smith has syphilis explain why he contracted paresis?

According to Rieber, the answer to this question can depend on what is being implicitly contrasted with Smith. If there is an implied contrast with Jones, who has neither syphilis nor paresis, then we understand (S) to be asking

(J) Does the fact that Smith has syphilis explain why he rather than Jones contracted paresis?

And the answer to (J) might well be yes. However, if there is an implied contrast with Brown, who has syphilis but did not contract paresis, then we understand (S) to be asking

(B) Does the fact that Smith has syphilis explain why he rather than Brown contracted paresis?

And the answer to (B) might well be no. So it seems that whether one thing explains another can depend on context. Thus, given Rieber’s explanatory analysis of knowledge, knowledge too will be context-sensitive.

Rieber’s analysis of knowledge seems to him to be well suited to solve the skeptical puzzle. He suggests that on his analysis of knowledge, to ask

(9) Do I know that I have hands?

is to ask

(9a) Does the fact that I have hands explain why I believe that I have hands?

Rieber claims that in ordinary contexts the answer to (9a) is clearly yes, and so I know in such contexts that I have hands. Presumably, I also know in those contexts that I’m not a BIV.

But a consideration of the BIV skeptical possibility can make salient a contrast with that possibility. When this contrast is salient, we understand (9) to be asking

(9b) Does the fact that I have hands rather than being a handless BIV explain why I believe that I have hands rather than that I am a handless BIV?

The answer to (9b) is no, for all of the evidence that I have for my belief that I have hands is compatible with my being a handless BIV. And whenever the answer to (9b) is no, so is the answer to (9). Thus, in skeptical contexts, contexts in which a contrast with the BIV possibility is salient, we should accept (3) but deny (1). The skeptic can truthfully say in such contexts that I know neither that I’m not a BIV nor that I have hands.

Rieber’s explanatory contextualism thus solves our skeptical puzzle. In ordinary contexts, we accept (1) and (2) but deny (3). I know in such contexts both that I have hands and that I’m not a BIV. However, when we consider certain skeptical possibilities, certain contrasts become salient. In these contexts, I know neither that I have hands nor that I’m not a BIV.

b. Evidential Contextualism

In “Contextualism and the Problem of the External World,” Ram Neta argues that the standards for knowledge are invariant, and therefore that we should not see the skeptic as being able to raise those standards. We ought instead to understand the skeptic to be restricting what can count as evidence. The skeptic does this, according to Neta, by exploiting the context-sensitivity of our attributions of evidence. When she brings up the BIV skeptical hypothesis, for example, the skeptic restricts what I can truthfully regard as my evidence to just those mental states that are available to me whether or not I am a BIV. That is, she prevents any of my current mental states from counting as evidence for my beliefs about the external world, thereby creating an unbridgeable (in this context, at least) epistemic gap between my evidence and my beliefs. In these contexts, my beliefs fail to meet the epistemic standard and therefore fail to count as knowledge. Still, in contexts in which I am considering no skeptical hypotheses, I can have plenty of evidence for my beliefs about the external world. In such contexts, my beliefs can meet the epistemic standards and can therefore count as knowledge. In this way, Neta’s version of contextualism, like the other versions we’ve considered, is meant to resolve familiar conflicts and to explain why we judge in most contexts that we have knowledge but why we judge in other contexts that we don’t.

c. Contextualism as a Theory of Knowledge

The last two forms of epistemological contextualism, those belonging to Michael Williams and to David Annis, have few similarities with the forms we’ve considered so far.

In his recent work, Williams argues for contextualism, which is, for him, the view that “independently of all [situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors], a proposition has no epistemic status whatsoever. There is no fact of the matter as to what kind of justification it either admits of or requires” (Williams 1996a, p. 119). His arguments for contextualism also count as arguments against epistemological realism, which is the view that even independently of contextual factors, there is a fact of the matter as to what kind of justification a belief requires. In particular, epistemological realism maintains the truth of the doctrine of epistemic priority (or DEP). According to DEP, our beliefs about the external world must be justified by sensory experience if they are to amount to knowledge. Williams argues that epistemological realism in general and DEP in particular are “contentious and possibly dispensable theoretical ideas about knowledge and justification” (Williams 1999b, p. 144). He also argues that skepticism depends essentially on these contentious ideas, and that, being theoretical, they are not forced on us by our ordinary ways of epistemic thinking. This suggests that skepticism is unnatural and thus that the burden of proof belongs to the skeptic. Yet since the skeptic cannot carry this burden, we have, according to Williams, no reason to take skepticism seriously.

Annis’ contextualism is meant to be an alternative both to foundationalism and to coherentism. Annis complains that both foundationalism and coherentism ignore the social nature of justification. According to his version of contextualism, then, S is justified in believing that p only if she can meet certain objections that express real doubts. These objections can include, but are not necessarily limited to, those according to which S is not in a position to know that p and those according to which p is false. We might object, for example, that since S is not reliable in situations like this, she is not in a position to know that the book on yonder shelf is brown. Thus, if S is to be justified in believing that the book is brown, she must be able to meet that objection. The justification of S’s belief that p also depends, according to Annis, on who offers certain objections and on the importance of S’s being right about p. It matters, for example, that it is S’s flight instructors, rather than her teasing friends, who object that she is unreliable when it comes to distinguishing the colors of fairly distant objects. A theory of justification that includes contextual parameters like these, Annis argues, fares better than either foundationalism or coherentism, both of which overlook the social nature of justification.

7. Objections to Contextualism

In this section, we will discuss two leading objections to epistemological contextualism. These are by no means the only criticisms that have been leveled against contextualism, but they introduce themes that have motivated additional objections as well as alternatives to contextualism. A discussion of these objections, then, should provide a center of operations for an exploration of objections to contextualism.

Palle Yourgrau (1983) argues that contextualism allows for dialogues such as the following since it claims that the standards for knowledge shift from context to context:

A: Is that a zebra?
B: Yes, it is a zebra.
A: But can you rule out its merely being a cleverly painted mule?
B: No, I can’t.
A: So you admit you didn’t know it was a zebra.
B: No, I did know then that it was a zebra. But after your question, I no longer knew.

This dialogue strikes Yourgrau as absurd, for it seems that nothing changes during the course of the conversation that would account for a change in B’s epistemic state: B is in just as good an epistemic position at the beginning of the conversation as she is at the end of the conversation, and so it seems that if B knows at the beginning, she should also know at the end. This suggests that, contrary to epistemological contextualism, we cannot affect shifts in the standards for knowledge simply by mentioning certain skeptical possibilities.

Contextualists (see DeRose 1992) have replied to this sort of objection by saying that once A introduces a skeptical possibility and thereby raises the standards for knowledge, B can no longer truly say, “I did know then that it was a zebra.” Once the standards for knowledge have been raised, the truth of any attribution of knowledge, including an attribution that is meant to apply only at some time in the past, must be judged according to those higher standards. Once the standards have been raised, B cannot both attribute knowledge to himself in the past and deny knowledge to himself in the present. He should now only deny himself knowledge; once the standards have been raised, neither B’s past self nor his present self knows that this is a zebra.

Stephen Schiffer has leveled a different sort of criticism at epistemological contextualism. Again, contextualism maintains that we attribute knowledge relative to standards that shift from context to context. This is to say, in effect, that when we say that B knows that this is a zebra, we mean that she knows relative to such-and-such an epistemic standard that this is a zebra. Putting this another way, contextualism maintains that our knowledge attributions are implicitly relative. Yet the contextualist’s response to Yourgrau’s objection suggests that B—or anyone else, for that matter—might fail to realize that our knowledge attributions are implicitly relative to an epistemic standard that shifts from context to context. Schiffer argues, however, that it is a general linguistic truth that speakers do realize that certain attributions are implicitly relative. For example, anyone who utters, “It’s raining,” in order to say that it’s raining in London knows full well that she’s asserting that it’s raining in London. Yet, according to Schiffer, when we utter, “B knows that it’s a zebra,” we typically do not take ourselves to be asserting that B knows relative to any standard. All this suggests, Schiffer argues, that the contextualist is wrong to think that our knowledge attributions are implicitly relative, and hence wrong to think that the standards for knowledge can shift from context to context.

8. Alternatives to Contextualism

Objections like these push people away from epistemological contextualism and toward theories that envisage epistemic standards that remain invariant from context to context. Two such theories present themselves as alternatives to contextualism. The first is skepticism, and the second is Mooreanism. Both skeptics and Mooreans maintain that the standards for knowledge do not shift. Yet while the skeptic claims that they are invariantly quite high, the Moorean claims that the standards are invariantly comparatively low.

The skeptic contends not only that there are no contexts in which we know that we’re not BIVs, but also that there are no contexts in which we know that we have hands (see, for example, Unger 1975 and Stone 2000). This response strikes some as implausible, however, since it does not accord with the thought that there are many contexts in which we can and do know things about the world around us.

The Moorean contends that there are never any insurmountable obstacles to our knowing both that we have hands and that we’re not BIVs.

Ernest Sosa’s Moorean response begins with the rejection of Nozick’s idea that knowledge requires sensitivity (see Section 2). He argues instead that knowledge requires safety, according to which S would believe that p only if it were the case that p (see Sosa 1999, p. 142). Moreover, both my belief that I have hands and my belief that I’m not a BIV are safe. Hence, both beliefs can always count as knowledge. Sosa says that

after all, not easily would one believe that [one was not radically deceived] without it being true … . In the actual world, and for quite a distance away from the actual world, up to quite remote possible worlds, our belief that we are not radically deceived matches the fact as to whether we are or are not radically deceived. (Sosa 1999, p. 147)

Yet if I can know across contexts that I’m not a BIV, why is it that it sometimes seems as if I don’t know that I’m not a BIV? Sosa maintains that since we can easily mistake safety for sensitivity, and since the belief that we’re not BIVs is not sensitive, it can sometimes seem to us that our belief that we’re not BIVs is not safe and thus that we don’t know that we’re not BIVs. Nevertheless, this is, according to Sosa, a mere appearance. For, since our belief is safe, we can know across contexts that we’re not BIVs and thus adopt a Moorean response to our skeptical puzzles.

Tim Black also provides a Moorean response to these puzzles. Employing Nozick’s sensitivity requirement for knowledge, Black argues in “A Moorean Response to Brain-in-a-Vat Scepticism” that the only worlds that are relevant to whether or not S knows that p are those in which S’s belief is produced by the method that actually produces it. This means that BIV worlds—possible worlds in which S is a BIV—are not relevant to whether S knows that she’s not a BIV. For BIV worlds are worlds in which her belief is produced by a method other than the one that actually produces it. Thus, since BIV worlds are not relevant to whether S know things about the external world, S can know both that she has hands and that she’s not a BIV. This, too, suggests a Moorean response to our skeptical puzzles.

9. Conclusion

We have now characterized epistemological contextualism in a way that allows several different theories to count as versions of that position. We have seen in particular that epistemological contextualists maintain that certain features of conversational contexts shape the standards that one must meet in order for one’s beliefs to count as knowledge. Understood in this way, a fairly wide range of views will count as versions of epistemological contextualism. Different versions will disagree over which features of conversational contexts can shape the epistemic standards, and over how the relevant contextual features help to shape those standards. Yet in spite of the differences between versions of epistemological contextualism, each seeks to achieve the valuable ends of explaining our epistemic judgments and solving the puzzles that are generated by skeptical arguments.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Annis, David. (1978) “A Contextual Theory of Epistemic Justification.” American Philosophical Quarterly 15: 213-219.
  • Austin, J. L. (1979) “Other Minds.” In Philosophical Papers, 3rd ed. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Black, Tim. (2002a) “A Moorean Response to Brain-in-a-Vat Scepticism.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 80: 148-163.
  • Black, Tim. (2002b) “Relevant Alternatives and the Shifting Standards for Knowledge.” Southwest Philosophy Review 18: 23-32.
  • Brueckner, Anthony. (1994) “The Shifting Content of Knowledge Attributions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 54: 123-126.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (1986) “Knowledge and Context.” Journal of Philosophy 83: 574-583.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (1987) “Knowledge, Context, and Social Standards.” Synthese 73: 3-26.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (1988) “How to be a Fallibilist.” Philosophical Perspectives 2, Epistemology: 91-123.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (1998a) “Contextualist Solutions to Epistemological Problems: Scepticism, Gettier, and the Lottery.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 76: 289-306.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (1998b) “Two Kinds of Skeptical Argument.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58: 143-159.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (1999) “Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons.” Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology: 57-89.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (2000a) “Contextualism and Skepticism.” Philosophical Issues 10, Skepticism: 94-107.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (2000b) “Replies [to Klein, Hawthorne, and Prades].” Philosophical Issues 10, Skepticism: 132-139.
  • Cohen, Stewart. (2001) “Contextualism Defended: Comments on Richard Feldman’s ‘Skeptical Problems, Contextualist Solutions’.” Philosophical Studies 103: 87-98.
  • DeRose, Keith. (1992) “Contextualism and Knowledge Attributions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52: 913-929.
  • DeRose, Keith. (1996a) “Knowledge, Assertion and Lotteries.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 568-580.
  • DeRose, Keith. (1996b) “Relevant Alternatives and the Content of Knowledge Attributions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56: 193-197.
  • DeRose, Keith. (1999a) “Solving the Skeptical Problem.” Reprinted in Keith DeRose and Ted A. Warfield, eds., Skepticism: A Contemporary Reader. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DeRose, Keith. (1999b) “Contextualism: An Explanation and Defense.” In John Greco and Ernest Sosa, eds., The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • DeRose, Keith. (1999c) “Introduction: Responding to Skepticism.” In Keith DeRose and Ted A. Warfield, eds., Skepticism: A Contemporary Reader. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DeRose, Keith. (2000a) “How Can We Know that We’re Not Brains In Vats?” Southern Journal of Philosophy 38 (Spindel Conference Supplement): 121-148.
  • DeRose, Keith. (2000b) “Now You Know It, Now You Don’t.” Proceedings of the Twentieth World Congress of Philosophy: Volume V, Epistemology: 91-106.
  • DeRose, Keith. (2002) “Assertion, Knowledge, and Context.” Philosophical Review 111 (2): 167-203.
  • DeRose, Keith. (2004)a “Single Scoreboard Semantics.” Philosophical Studies 119 (1-2): 1-21.
  • DeRose, Keith. (2004b) “Sosa, Safety, Sensitivity, and Skeptical Hypotheses.” In John Greco, ed., Sosa and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Dretske, Fred I. (1981) Knowledge and the Flow of Information. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Dretske, Fred I. (2000a) “Epistemic Operators.” In Perception, Knowledge and Belief: Selected Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dretske, Fred I. (2000b) “The Pragmatic Dimension of Knowledge.” In Perception, Knowledge and Belief: Selected Essays. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Feldman, Richard. (1999) “Contextualism and Skepticism.” Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology: 91-114.
  • Feldman, Richard. (2001) “Skeptical Problems, Contextualist Solutions.” Philosophical Studies 103: 61-85.
  • Fogelin, Robert J. (1999) “The Sceptic’s Burden.” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 7: 159-172.
  • Garfinkel, Alan. (1981) Forms of Explanation. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. (1976) “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 73: 771-791.
  • Hambourger, Robert. (1987) “Justified Assertion and the Relativity of Knowledge.” Philosophical Studies 51: 241-269.
  • Hawthorne, John. (2002) “Lewis, the Lottery and the Preface.” Analysis 62: 242-251.
  • Heller, Mark. (1989) “Relevant Alternatives.” Philosophical Studies 55: 23-40.
  • Heller, Mark. (1999a) “The Proper Role for Contextualism in an Anti-Luck Epistemology.” Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology: 115-129.
  • Heller, Mark. (1999b) “Relevant Alternatives and Closure.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 77: 196-208.
  • Hofweber, Thomas. (1999) “Contextualism and the Meaning-Intention Problem.” In Kepa Korta, Ernest Sosa, Xabier Arrazola, eds., Cognition, Agency and Rationality. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Jacobson, Stephen. (2001) “Contextualism and Global Doubts about the World.” Synthese 129: 381-404.
  • Johnsen, Bredo C. (2001) “Contextualist Swords, Skeptical Plowshares.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62: 385-406.
  • Klein, Peter. (2000) “Contextualism and the Real Nature of Academic Skepticism.” Philosophical Issues 10, Skepticism: 108-116.
  • Kornblith, Hilary. (2000) “The Contextualist Evasion of Epistemology.” Philosophical Issues 10, Skepticism: 24-32.
  • Lewis, David. (1979) “Scorekeeping in a Language Game.” Journal of Philosophical Logic 8: 339-359.
  • Lewis, David. (1986) “Causal Explanation.” In Philosophical Papers, Volume II. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David. (1996) “Elusive Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-567.
  • Lipton, Peter. (1990) “Contrastive Explanation.” In Dudley Knowles, ed., Explanation and its Limits. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lipton, Peter. (1991) Inference to the Best Explanation. London: Routledge.
  • Neta, Ram. (2002) “S knows that p.” Noûs 36: 663-681.
  • Neta, Ram. (2003) “Contextualism and the Problem of the External World.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 66: 1-31.
  • Neta, Ram. (2003) “Skepticism, Contextualism, and Semantic Self-Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67 (2): 396–411.
  • Nozick, Robert. (1981) Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Oakley, I.T. (2001) “A Skeptic’s Reply to Lewisian Contextualism.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31: 309-332.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. (2000) “Closure and Context.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 78: 275-280.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. (2001) “Contextualism, Scepticism, and the Problem of Epistemic Descent.” Dialectica 55: 327-349.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. (2002) “Recent Work on Radical Skepticism.” American Philosophical Quarterly 39: 215-257.
  • Rieber, Steven. (1998) “Skepticism and Contrastive Explanation.” Noûs 32: 189-204.
  • Rysiew, Patrick. (2001) “The Context-Sensitivity of Knowledge Attributions.” Noûs 35: 477-514.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. (2001) “Knowledge, Relevant Alternatives and Missed Clues.” Analysis 61: 202-208.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. (2004a) “From Contextualism to Contrastivism.” Philosophical Studies, 119 (1-2): 73-104.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. (2004b) “Skepticism, Contextualism, and Discrimination.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 69 (1): 138–155.
  • Schiffer, Stephen. (1996) “Contextualist Solutions to Scepticism.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 96: 317-333.
  • Shatz, David. (1981) “Reliability and Relevant Alternatives.” Philosophical Studies 39: 393-408.
  • Shuger, Scott. (1983) “Knowledge and its Consequences.” American Philosophical Quarterly 20: 217-225.
  • Sosa, Ernest. (1999) “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore.” Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology: 141-153.
  • Sosa, Ernest. (2000a) “Skepticism and Contextualism.” Philosophical Issues 10, Skepticism: 1-18.
  • Sosa, Ernest. (2000b) “Replies [to Tomberlin, Kornblith, and Lehrer].” Philosophical Issues 10, Skepticism: 38-41.
  • Sosa, Ernest. (2004) “Relevant Alternatives, Contextualism Included.” Philosophical Studies, 119 (1-2): 35-65.
  • Stanley, Jason. (2000) “Context and Logical Form.” Linguistics and Philosophy 23: 391-434.
  • Stanley, Jason. (2004) “On the Linguistic Basis for Contextualism.” Philosophical Studies, 119 (1-2): 119-146.
  • Stine, Gail. (1976) “Skepticism, Relevant Alternatives, and Deductive Closure.” Philosophical Studies 29: 249-261.
  • Stone, Jim. (2000) “Skepticism as a Theory of Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60: 527-545.
  • Stroud, Barry. (1984) The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Unger, Peter. (1975) Ignorance: A Case for Scepticism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Unger, Peter. (1984) Philosophical Relativity. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Unger, Peter. (1986) “The Cone Model of Knowledge.” Philosophical Topics 14: 125-178.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. (1987) “Tracking, Closure, and Inductive Knowledge.” In Steven Luper-Foy, ed., The Possibility of Knowledge: Nozick and His Critics. Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. (1990) “Are There Counterexamples to the Closure Principle?” In Glenn Ross and Michael D. Roth, eds., Doubting: Contemporary Perspectives on Skepticism. Dordrecht: Reidel Publishing Company.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. (1997) “Skepticism and Foundationalism: A Reply to Michael Williams.” Journal of Philosophical Research 22: 11-28.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. (1999) “The New Relevant Alternatives Theory.” Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology: 155-180.
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  • Williams, Michael. (2001) “Contextualism, Externalism and Epistemic Standards.” Philosophical Studies 103: 1-23.
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Author Information

Tim Black
Email: tim.black@csun.edu
California State University, Northridge
U. S. A.

Edward Caird (1835—1908)

cairdA Scottish philosopher of the latter half of the nineteenth century, Edward Caird was one of the key figures of the idealist movement that dominated British philosophy from 1870 until the mid 1920s. Best known for his studies of Kant and Hegel, he argued that “Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism.” Caird exercised a strong influence on the second generation of idealists, such as John Watson and Bernard Bosanquet. During his long and productive life, Caird was active in university and local politics and in educational and social reform. In his two series of Gifford lectures, he developed an important evolutionary account of religious conceptions ( the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity).

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critique of Kant and Hegel
  3. Philosophical Style
  4. Evolution and Religion
  5. Reference and Further Reading

1. Biography

Edward Caird was born in Greenock, Scotland, on March 23, 1835. A younger brother of the theologian John Caird (1820-1898), Edward began his studies at the University of Glasgow (which he briefly abandoned due to ill health), later moving to Balliol College, Oxford, from which he graduated in 1863. Following his graduation, he became Tutor at Merton College, Oxford (1864-1866), but soon left for the Professorship of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow (1866-1893). There, in addition to carrying out his academic duties, Caird was active in university and local politics, and was responsible for establishing the study of political sciences at the University. Following the death of Benjamin Jowett (1817-1893), Caird returned to Oxford, where he served as Master of Balliol College until 1907. He was a founding fellow of the British Academy (1902), a corresponding member of the French Academy, and held honorary doctorates from the Universities of St Andrews (1883), Oxford (1891), Cambridge (1898) and Wales (1902).

Like many of the British idealists, Caird had a strong interest in classical literature. In his two volumes of Essays on Literature and Philosophy (1892), he brought together critical essays on Goethe, Rousseau, Carlyle, Dante and Wordsworth, with a discussion (in Volume II) of Cartesianism (Descartes, Malbranche and Spinoza) and metaphysics.

Caird’s politics were generally liberal and progressive. He supported the education of women, opposed the Anglo-Boer War (1899-1902) and, like Green, was involved in the ‘university settlement’ programs–particularly in Glasgow and in London–where recent university graduates and professionals attempted to narrow the gap between social classes by living and working among and with the poor.

In 1907, Caird resigned his position as Master of Balliol, and died the following year on November 1. He is buried in St Sepulchre’s Cemetery, Oxford, alongside Jowett and Green.

2. Critique of Kant and Hegel

Along with T.H. Green (1836-1882), Caird was one of the first generation of British idealists, whose philosophical work was largely in reaction to the then-dominant empiricist and associationist views of Alexander Bain (1818-1903) and J.S. Mill. He had, however, an ability of literary expression which Green did not possess; he was also more inclined to discuss questions by the method of tracing the historical development of the ideas involved. But while Green died at the early age of 47, Caird enjoyed a relatively long and productive life. It is, in part, for this reason that he exercised such a strong influence—particularly on the relation of philosophy and religion—on later idealists such as John Watson (1847-1939) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923). Though often considered to be Hegelian, Caird was arguably more profoundly influenced by Kant, although he was far from an uncritical reader.

Caird’s first major work was A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant (1877), focusing on the Critique of Pure Reason and the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics. It was superseded in 1889 by The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant (two volumes) in which Caird wished to show the relation of the three Critiques and the continuity in the movement of Kant’s thought. In general, Caird was convinced that, though Kant had inaugurated a new era in philosophy with his attempt to integrate the a priori and the a posteriori, he failed to carry out this task fully. It was here that Caird’s idealism took over. In these volumes on Kant, Caird sought “to display in the very argument of the great metaphysician, who was supposed to have cut the world in two with a hatchet, an almost involuntary but continuous and inevitable regression towards objective organic unity.” Thus, he argued that “Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism.” (1877, p. 667)

A sympathetic exposition of Hegel’s philosophy is contained in his monograph on Hegel (1883) and, in 1885, his Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte (based on a collection of articles that had been previously published in the magazine, Contemporary Review) appeared. In these two works, Caird critically interprets these authors on lines of his own. Concerning Comte, for example, Caird writes that there cannot be a ‘religion of Humanity’ that is not, at the same time, a religion of God. In his treatment of Hegel, as of Kant, Caird’s purpose was to show that there is a center of unity to which the mind must come back out of all differences, however varied and alien in appearance. The analysis was preliminary to reconstruction.

3. Philosophical Style

Caird’s way of philosophizing differed from that of many of his contemporaries. It was consistently and even obtrusively constructive. According to Caird, “the true manner of honoring a thinker is to force oneself to understand him from his own point of view,” and only then “to submit his ideas to as objective an examination as possible.” Thus, he seized on the truths contained in the authors with whom he dealt, and was only incidentally concerned with their errors. One of the results of this, however, was that Caird’s own views are often to be found only indirectly–that is, in his exposition and commentary of the views of others.

4. Evolution and Religion

Like many other idealists, such as D.G. Ritchie (1853-1903), Caird was concerned to show the relation of evolutionary theory to the development of thought and culture. His first set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Religion (2 volumes, 1893), deals less than his other works with an exposition of the views of other philosophers. These lectures focussed on the possibility of a science of religion and the nature of religion from Greek times, but were especially centered on the development of the Christian faith through to the Reformation. Caird shows the spiritual sense of humanity as at first dominated by the object, but constrained by its own abstractions to swing around so as to fall under the sway of the subject.

In 1904 Caird’s second set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers,appeared. Here, he provides again an evolutionary account of religious conceptions (e.g., the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity) toward a ‘reflective religion’ or theology. The story of Greek philosophy, which Caird considered mainly (but not exclusively) in its relation to theology, was carried from Plato through Aristotle, the Stoics, and Philo, to Plotinus and–in the final lecture–to Christian theology and St. Augustine.

In general, Caird’s views on religion were importantly related to his understanding of ethics, and Caird borrows from Hegel (and Goethe) the ethical idea of self sacrifice, or “dying to live,” which was to have an important role in the work of Bosanquet. Caird consistently emphasized the importance of religion, and that a genuine metaphysics must be able to provide an account of it.

5. References and Further Reading

  • The Collected Works of Edward Caird, 12 Volumes, Ed. and Introd. Colin Tyler, Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 1999.
  • A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant, with an Historical Introduction. Glasgow: J. Maclehose, 1877.
  • The Problem of Philosophy at the Present Time: an Introductory Address Delivered to the Philosophical Society of the University of Edinburgh. Glasgow, James Maclehose & sons, 1881. (43 p.)
  • Hegel, Philadelphia: J. B. Lippincott and co.; Edinburgh: W. Blackwood and sons, 1883.
  • The Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte. Glasgow: J. Maclehose and sons, 1885. New York, Macmillan, 1885.
  • The Moral Aspect of the Economical Problem; Presidential Address to the Ethical Society. London, Swan Sonnenschein, Lowrey & Co., 1888. (18 p.)
  • The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, Glasgow: J. Maclehose & sons, 1889; New York: Macmillan, 1889. 2 v.
  • Essays on Literature and Philosophy, Glasgow, J. Maclehose and sons, 1892. 2 v. [v. 1. Dante in his relation to the theology and ethics of the Middle Ages. Goethe and philosophy. Rousseau. Wordsworth. The problem of philosophy at the present time. The genius of Carlyle; v. 2. Cartesianism. Metaphysic.]
  • The Evolution of Religion. 2 v., Glasgow: James Maclehose, 1893; New York: Macmillan, 1893. [Gifford lectures; 1890/1891-1891/1892]
  • Address on Plato’s Republic as the Earliest Educational Treatise, Delivered by Edward Caird at the Closing Ceremony of the Session 1893-94. Bangor: Jarvis & Foster, 1894 (22 p.)
  • The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers. 2 v., Glasgow: J. Maclehose and sons, 1904. [Gifford lectures, Glasgow; 1900/1901 and 1901-1902].
  • Idealism and the Theory of Knowledge. London: Henry Frowde, 1903 (14 p.)
  • Lay Sermons and Addresses : Delivered in the Hall of Balliol College, Oxford. Glasgow : J. Maclehose; New York: Macmillan, 1907.

The standard assessment of Caird’s work is:

  • The Life and Philosophy of Edward Caird by Sir Henry Jones and John Henry Muirhead. Glasgow: Maclehose, Jackson and co., 1921.

The IEP desires a newer and more detailed article on Caird.

Author Information

Revised by William Sweet
U. S. A.

Transcendental Arguments

Transcendental arguments are partly non-empirical, often anti-skeptical arguments focusing on necessary enabling conditions either of coherent experience or the possession or employment of some kind of knowledge or cognitive ability, where the opponent is not in a position to question the fact of this experience, knowledge, or cognitive ability, and where the revealed preconditions include what the opponent questions. Such arguments take as a premise some obvious fact about our mental life—such as some aspect of our knowledge, our experience, our beliefs, or our cognitive abilities—and add a claim that some other state of affairs is a necessary condition of the first one. Transcendental arguments most commonly have been deployed against a position denying the knowability of some extra-mental proposition, such as the existence of other minds or a material world. Thus these arguments characteristically center on a claim that, for some extra-mental proposition P, the indisputable truth of some general proposition Q about our mental life requires that P. Eighteenth Century Prussian philosopher Immanuel Kant is usually credited with introducing the systematic use of the transcendental argument. His use of it included arguments aimed at refuting epistemic skepticism, as well as arguments with the more fundamental purpose of showing the legitimacy of the application of certain concepts—in particular those of substance and cause—to experience. Later scholars have developed a variety of general objections to the transcendental argument strategy. In response, some recent and contemporary philosophers have offered updated strategies similar in form to transcendental arguments, but with less controversial premises and/or more modest goals.

Table of Contents

  1. Transcendental Reasoning and Skepticism
  2. The Modal Objection
  3. The Analytic/Criteriological Approach
  4. The Verificationism/Idealism Objection
  5. The Uniqueness-of-Conceptual-Framework Objection
  6. Modest Transcendental Arguments
  7. Objections to Modest Transcendental Arguments
  8. A More Modest Project for Kant
  9. Prospects for Strong Transcendental Arguments
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Transcendental Reasoning and Skepticism

“Transcendental” reasoning, for Kant, is reasoning pertaining to the necessary conditions of experience. Though he did coin the term “transcendental argument” in a different context, Kant actually did not use it to refer to transcendental arguments as they are understood today. He did sometimes use the term “transcendental deduction” for a range of arguments concerning the necessary conditions of coherent experience. Early uses of the term “transcendental argument” for arguments of this type have been noted in Charles Peirce and J. L. Austin. Often, the purpose of a transcendental argument is to answer a variety of epistemic skepticism by showing that the skeptical position itself (or its expression) implies or presupposes the possibility of the very knowledge in question. In this way, as Kant puts it in his Critique of Pure Reason, “the game played by idealism [is] turned against itself.” The skeptic is shown to presuppose the very facts he or she calls into question. (Kant also had a more modest use for transcendental arguments pertaining merely to establishing the applicability of certain fundamental concepts; see Section 8, below.)

Kant’s anti-skeptical arguments were inspired by a number of figures, but his primary concern was with what he saw as the empiricist skepticism of David Hume. In his Treatise of Human Nature, Hume argues that all ideas are derived from simple sense-impressions, simple impressions of reflection, and reflection on the mind’s operations. He goes on to argue that complex ideas of material objects are not fully grounded in the data of the senses, but are based in part on psychological propensities to pass from one idea to another. Our senses do not present us with the characteristics of mind-independence and perdurance; rather, our experience consists in sequences of impressions, some of which exhibit a resembling constancy with each other over time. To this picture, Hume argues, we must add an imaginative propensity to identify, and thus attribute continued existence to, impressions exhibiting constancy and coherency. Since the distinctness of these impressions conflicts with our propensity to identify them, we posit enduring and independent items that are responsible for various subjective impressions. One natural conclusion from this line of reasoning is that, whatever compulsion we might feel to acknowledge external, material things, neither reason nor the senses can be said to yield knowledge of such items.

Kant addresses skepticism about the material world most directly with his “Refutation of Idealism” in the second edition Critique of Pure Reason. There he argues that the possibility of recognizing the time-order of one’s own perceptions depends on the application of the concept of alteration to one’s own mental states. And in order for us to possess and apply the concept of alteration, it must be exhibited in the sensory experience of objective alteration. This experience cannot be based on patterns or regularities in experience (including its constancy and coherence), since the recognition of any such pattern depends on the organization of one’s experiences in time. The possibility of the organization of one’s own experiences in time (and even recognizing that one’s own states have a determinate time-order at all) requires relating changes in those experiences to objective alterations. Since we do make judgments about the time-order of our own experiences, we must have experienced objective alteration.

Kant’s answer to the skeptic thus takes roughly the following form:

(1) I make judgments about the temporal order of my own mental states.
(2) I could not make judgments about the temporal order of my own mental states without having experienced enduring substances independent of me undergoing alteration.
(3) Hence independent, enduring substances exist.

He thus establishes a claim to knowledge of the existence of enduring, independent objects by showing that the skeptic is committed to something (in this case, consciousness of one’s own perceptions as ordered in time) that is impossible without the existence of such objects. The skeptic thus is either committed to the existence of such things by virtue of accepting the obvious fact that we are conscious of our own perceptions as ordered in time, or presumes the existence of such things in the very attempt to raise doubt about it. This result would license the conclusion that we have knowledge of material objects, or at least that skepticism about the very existence of such items is incoherent.

Kant’s refutation of skepticism matches the template for a common understanding of the classical form of a transcendental argument:

(1) Some proposition Q about our mental life, the truth of which is immediately apparent or presumed by the skeptic’s position.
(2) The truth of some extra-mental proposition P, our knowledge of which is questioned by the skeptic, is a necessary condition of Q.
(3) Therefore P.

Transcendental arguments are further distinguished by the fact that the necessity they draw on is, characteristically, neither empirical nor analytic necessity. Rather, claims like those found in the second premise imply some claim to synthetic a priori knowledge—knowledge of substantive facts about the world derived by a priori metaphysical reasoning. If such claims were based on empirical observation, they would beg the question against most relevant forms of skepticism; if these claims were merely analytic, then it is unlikely any substantive conclusion could be derived from them.

Transcendental arguments can be characterized as demonstrations that the skeptic’s articulation of her own position is self-defeating in some way. These arguments imply that the skeptic cannot even coherently articulate a given position. Epicurus is reported to have argued that, without free choice, one assents to propositions only because one is determined to do so. Without free choice, then, it would be impossible to rationally assent to any proposition—that is, to assent to it because one has good reasons to think it is true, rather than because one must. The proposition that one has no free choice is thus self-stultifying, in that, if true, it cannot be warranted. This reasoning implies the following argument:

(1) I am able to rationally assent to the proposition that there is no free choice.
(2) I could not rationally assent to any proposition if there were no free choice.
(3) Hence, there is free choice.

Hilary Putnam (1981), drawing on his concept of content-externalism, holds that we cannot refer to brains and vats if we are brains in vats who have never actually experienced such things. If we have never had contact with external objects, our language is “Vat-English,” rather than English. Since reference, in his view, is partly determined by its context and causal history, it would be impossible for a permanent brain-in-a-vat to raise doubts about whether she is a brain in a vat. Given this theory of reference, the proposition that all persons are and have always been brains in vats is self-defeating, in that it is either false or not affirmable by anyone. Insofar as the skeptic supposes that the issue is a legitimate one to raise, she presupposes that the relevant concern is moot:

(1) I am able to raise the question as to whether all persons have always been brains in vats.
(2) I could not refer to brains in vats unless some person (that is, myself) were acquainted with such things.
(3) Hence, it is not the case that all persons have always been brains in vats.

Finally, it is an implication of Kant’s reasoning in the Refutation of Idealism that the proposition that no one has had any contact with material objects would be literally unthinkable without contact with material objects to give one a sense of an objective system of temporal relations (in turn enabling inner time-determination). If Kant is right, then such a proposition is performatively self-falsifying in the strongest sense: the possibility of the skeptic articulating her own position would prove its falsity.

2. The Modal Objection

One general objection commonly raised against transcendental arguments concerns the very type of necessity transcendental arguments rely upon. Transcendental arguments characteristically center on a claim to synthetic a priori knowledge. Take, for example, Kant’s claim that the experience of enduring objects undergoing alteration is a precondition of subjective time-consciousness. This claim is neither grounded in experience nor follows from the meanings of the terms involved. He does provide some (often rather obscure) reasoning to support this claim, but that support, again, typically involves claims to synthetic a priori knowledge. Such claims have been portrayed as ultimately relying on a mysterious faculty of philosophical intuition, of insight into the natures of things not grounded in observation or experiment, the legitimacy of which is at least as doubtful as sensory perception or empirical inference.

3. The Analytic/Criteriological Approach

Partly in response to concerns about the modality of Kantian transcendental arguments, and in response to allied concerns about claims to synthetic a priori knowledge, Peter Strawson, Jonathan Bennett, and others have promoted a strategy structurally similar to Kant’s, but which is intended to avoid such problematic claims. Their strategy is analytic, in that it concerns relationships between beliefs or concepts and the conceptual frameworks needed to give those beliefs or concepts their content.

In Individuals, Strawson (1959) offers a transcendental argument purporting to demonstrate the existence of other minds. He argues that, to employ the concept of one’s own mind in the self-ascription of mental states, one must be able to distinguish between one’s own mental states and the mental states of others. This requires the ability to predicate mental states of both oneself and others. But, he continues, in order to employ (or understand) any general concept one needs criteria for its application. In order to ascribe mental states to oneself, then, one must be in possession of logically adequate criteria (that is to say, behavioral criteria) for ascribing mental states to others.

Strawson’s (1966) approach in The Bounds of Sense to reconstructing Kant’s Refutation of Idealism argument works similarly. His reconstruction states that, to give content to the idea of one’s being in some particular conscious state at some particular time, one needs “the idea of a system of temporal relations which comprehends more than those experiences themselves.” One’s experiences thus must be taken as experiences of things independent of oneself with their own temporal order. The idea of temporal order, he argues, cannot be gleaned from one’s own case alone; the application of the concept of temporal ordering depends on the possession and application of a concept of objectivity. But does the requirement that one have and apply the concept of an objective order guarantee that there really exists such an order? Is it not sufficient that we think there is one? Similarly, is it not sufficient for the self-ascription of mental states that we think there are other minds? Strawson’s reply rests on his “principle of significance,” which states that “there can be no legitimate, or even meaningful, employment of ideas or concepts which does not relate them to empirical or experiential conditions of their application.” One’s assessment of the analytic/criteriological approach depends on one’s assessment of this verificationism-inspired principle.

4. The Verificationism/Idealism Objection

In a much-cited essay, Barry Stroud (1968) argues that, to any claim that the truth of some proposition is a necessary condition of some fact about our mental life, the skeptic can always reply that it would be enough for it merely to appear to be true, or for us merely to believe that it is true. Transcendental arguments, he claims, at best demonstrate how things must appear, or what we must believe, rather than how things must be. Anti-skeptical transcendental arguments of familiar sorts are thus left with a gap to fill. Stroud’s contention—which is now widely accepted—is that such arguments, when aimed at refuting epistemic skepticism, can only close that gap by adverting either to a sort of verificationism or to idealism. In the case of Strawson’s arguments above, even supposing that we must be in possession of some criteria for applying concepts of other minds and/or an objective world, this fact only has anti-skeptical consequences if we also accept that there is no meaningful concept-application without experiential criteria sufficient for knowing whether the concept is instantiated. As Stroud points out, such a principle is implausible. Further, if we accepted such a principle, other aspects of transcendental arguments would be superfluous. All we would have to show is that we meaningfully employ external-world concepts; it would be impossible for any form of skepticism to be meaningful or intelligible.

As Stroud goes on to point out, another way of closing the gap between it being necessary that things appear a certain way and things being that way, would be to embrace an idealism that reduces how things are to how things appear, or must appear, to us. Kant did not rely on any verificationist principle in making the case against skepticism, but according to many scholars his “transcendental idealism” made possible the jump from how things must be experienced by us to how things must be by reducing objects of experience to mere mental representations. But such idealism is unacceptable to most: embracing idealism to answer the epistemic skeptic results in a Pyrrhic victory at best.

Despite Stroud’s blanket assertion, it should be noted that the verification/idealism objection only applies on a case-by-case basis. Some arguments that take the form of transcendental arguments may have other deficiencies, but do not rely on either verificationism or idealism. A few scholars have observed that Descartes’s “Cogito, ergo sum” argument can be re-conceived as a transcendental argument:

(1) I think.
(2) In order to think “I think,” it is necessary to exist.
(3) Hence, I exist.

This argument meets the criteria for a transcendental argument: it takes a fact about one’s mental life as a premise, adds that some extra-mental fact is a necessary condition of the truth of that premise, and concludes that the extra-mental fact holds. This argument would turn on the claim that the statement, “I do not exist” (or better, the proposition that no one exists) is performatively self-defeating in the sense that the fact of its performance counts as conclusive evidence against its truth. That is what connects the mental fact (I am thinking about whether I exist) to the relevant extra-mental fact (I exist). Regardless of how this argument might fail in some other respect, it presupposes neither verificationism nor idealism in closing the gap between the internal and the external.

5. The Uniqueness-of-Conceptual-Framework Objection

Another important general objection to transcendental arguments concerns the hidden assumption requiring the uniqueness of the conceptual scheme that is held to be a precondition of experience in any given transcendental argument. Kant, for example, argues that experience is only possible if certain concepts are applied a priori in its organization, such as the concepts of substance and cause. Strawson similarly argues that experience is only possible via the application of the concept of an objective system of temporal relations. Stephan Körner (1974), however, famously characterized arguments resting on such claims as hopeless, because there is no way to establish the uniqueness of the relevant conceptual precondition. His concern is that other conceptual schemes and principles—perhaps unimaginable to us—might suffice as well. But if such schemes cannot be ruled out, then the validity of any such argument cannot be decisively established. All transcendental arguments make some claim about necessary enabling conditions. Given that the sense of necessity in question is not logical, how can the uniqueness of the enabling conditions ever be shown?

6. Modest Transcendental Arguments

In response to some of these concerns Stroud has proposed that we keep transcendental arguments, but moderate the goal we hope to achieve with them (Stroud 1994 and 1999). The goal of a “modest” transcendental argument is just to show the indispensability of some belief, concept, or conceptual framework. The conclusion such arguments hope to draw is not a refutation of some variety of epistemic skepticism via a demonstration of the alternative, but rather a demonstration of the unintelligibility of the skeptical position. The idea is that, by showing that it is impossible consistently to maintain a given position, one also shows that it is legitimate to ignore it. Arguments of this sort seek to show that beliefs about, say, an external world or other minds are indispensable to coherent experience or the use of language.

The modest strategy in replying to external-world skepticism would be to concede that one cannot prove transcendentally that there is an external world, but to show that one must believe in such a world, or presuppose such a world as part of one’s interpretive framework, as a precondition of coherent experience. This, Stroud argues, would be sufficient to entitle one to ignore external-world skepticism. We are entitled to hold a belief, according to this line of thought, if that belief can be shown to be incorrigible or invulnerable to correction.

One major advantage to modest transcendental arguments is that they are not subject to the verificationism/idealism objection. All that such arguments seek to show is that we must believe a certain way, not that the world must be a certain way. Thus there is no gap to be closed between showing that the world must appear a certain way and eliminating the possibility that the world really is not that way.

7. Objections to Modest Transcendental Arguments

Arguments relying on the relative necessity of some conceptual framework or set of beliefs, however, are subject to certain general objections. A version of Körner’s uniqueness objection still seems applicable. To provide some response to the epistemic skeptic, an indispensability argument would have to show that a given belief is indispensable as such, rather than just indispensable for us. And to do that is impossible; we can only argue for the uniqueness of a conceptual or doxastic framework on the basis of our own concepts and beliefs. As Stern (2000) puts it, if indispensability “is weaker than infallibility in so far as it leaves open the possibility that our belief that p is false, how can p be immune from doubt?; and if it is immune from doubt though possibly false, isn’t this a vice rather than a virtue?” If the “necessity” of some set of beliefs or conceptual framework just follows from our own inability to think outside that framework, then the discovery of this necessity is just a discovery about our own limitations, rather than a discovery about the world around us. Indispensability may indeed be all a modest transcendental argument needs to show that skepticism is inert (for us), but is this an interesting result if it stems just from our own incapacities?

This kind of concern is reflected in a challenge to the classical claim that radical skepticism about reason is self-defeating. How can we know that logical inference really is truth-preserving? How can we know that the principle of non-contradiction is true? It would seem that such a skeptical position is unanswerable, because any answer involves argument, which presupposes the validity of deductive inference. But, as Aristotle first suggested in his Metaphysics, when one makes a statement asserting the impossibility of rationally supporting any claim one makes, one presupposes the theoretical possibility of claims being rationally supported (c.f. Meynell 1984). The framework under which we suppose that it is possible to rationally support claims is, in other words, indispensable, and the belief that it is possible to do so is invulnerable. This argument is, effectively, a modest transcendental argument.

But why can’t the skeptic make the same point while limiting herself to asking for proof of the universal and necessary validity of deductive inference? The skeptic need not on this approach make some claim to the effect that statements may not be rationally supportable (a claim, in other words, that itself calls for support). An inherent inconsistency in the affirmation of some such claim need not, then, be a concern (see Fowler 1987). In asking for proof, of course, the skeptic in some way implies that there is at least some prima facie doubt with regard to the operation of reason in finding truth. So in that way the skeptic must be implying at least a prima facie possibility that reason is inadequate to that task.

A modest transcendental argument establishing the indispensability of a conceptual framework has the effect of reducing the skeptic either to inconsistency or to raising doubts in the abstract. Since the alternative is inconceivable, the skeptic cannot consistently commit to the possibility of the alternative. Yet it seems too quick to go directly from showing that some conceptual framework is necessary for us to deny any relevance to questions about the truth of the framework. It is not clear, then, that any modest transcendental argument really renders its target skepticism inert. Even if the skeptic is shown to be unable consistently to raise a certain possibility, that possibility is not thereby taken out of contention. However abstract (or even inexpressible) the doubt may be that remains, the modest transcendental argument falls short of establishing epistemic entitlement.

8. A More Modest Project for Kant

There is another kind of modest application of transcendental arguments that is not subject to the above concerns, owing to its pursuit of a different kind of result. Part of Kant’s project is not so much concerned with responding to the epistemic skeptic as with responding to an opponent who questions the very conceptual legitimacy of external-world concepts like substance and cause. Despite an emphasis in contemporary philosophy on epistemic skepticism, for Kant conceptual legitimacy appears to be the primary or fundamental application of transcendental reasoning. This project is the major concern of his “Transcendental Deduction of the Categories” in the Critique of Pure Reason. He employs a legal metaphor at the beginning of his defense of our use of such conceptsto distinguish between “what is lawful (quid juris) and that which concerns the fact (quid facti).” His avowed focus, then, is on the “lawfulness” of our application of external-world concepts. He is concerned, as a first goal at least, with the applicability (or “objective validity”) of these concepts quite independently of their instantiation. That this should be a primary goal for Kant makes a lot of sense in light of some of his major precursors. Though in other respects having very different views, Leibniz, Berkeley, and Hume each questioned the legitimacy of the application of concepts like substance and cause to experience. Leibniz denied not only the existence of material substance but its metaphysical possibility. Because matter is infinitely divisible, he argued, it cannot be a basic constituent of the universe. Only minds can be substances, so the concept of substance is not even appropriately applied to matter. Berkeley argued that all we can describe are our ideas, and there is no sense in saying that ideas resemble material objects or their qualities. Talk of material objects independent of the mind is incoherent. Finally, Hume argued that it is impossible to find a source for the concepts of substance and cause in perception sufficient to explain either the occurrence or even the content of such ideas.

Leibniz, Berkeley, and Hume all have in common, then, the position that external-world concepts like substance and cause are either incoherent or inapplicable to perceptual experience. In modern terms, they held that such application, if possible at all, is a category mistake. It is not difficult to see how at least part of Kant’s project in his transcendental deduction of these concepts is to refute this view, as distinguished from the project of proving that we veridically experience a world of causally-related substances. His strategy in doing so is notoriously hard to pin down, but the gist of it is that he claims that the concept of an objective world (which would include the concepts of substance and cause) is needed as an organizing principle—a rule or set of rules—for reproducing and synthesizing in judgment one’s various and otherwise inherently unconnected representations. For example, because all experience qua one’s subjective flow of perceptions is successive, the concept of cause is needed to distinguish between a succession of experiences representing the experience of an object (which could be experienced differently and yet be thought of as the same object) and a succession of experiences representing the experience of an event (the order of the stages of which determines the way it can be experienced). Because the thought of a causal relationship between event-stages is constitutive of the thought of an event, and because distinguishing between an accidental and externally-determined sequence of experiences is necessary to time-determination, the a priori possession of the concept of cause is a necessary condition of coherent experience.

The legitimacy of the concepts of substance and cause would also be a consequence of some of Kant’s more explicitly anti-skeptical arguments. A consequence of his reasoning in the “Refutation of Idealism,” for example, is that objective time-determination is implicated in subjective time-determination. The application of concepts relevant to determining an objective time-order (as the concepts of substance and cause are, he had explained earlier) is inseparable from subjective self-awareness. Since each of Kant’s precursors allow for an inner mental life, they cannot consistently deny the legitimacy of applying concepts like substance and cause to perceptual experience. This would not prove the existence of causally-related material substances, but it would accomplish quite a lot: it would demonstrate the inadequacy, in a certain respect, of Leibnizian metaphysics, Berkeleyan phenomenalism, and Humean empiricism.

9. Prospects for Strong Transcendental Arguments

Defenders of strong anti-skeptical transcendental arguments still exist. Kenneth Westphal (2003), for example, is more confident than most that some of Kant’s core transcendental arguments can be successful. He believes that the process by which Kant identifies our basic cognitive capacities and their enabling conditions (Westphal calls this “epistemic reflection”) has been confused with simple introspection, which is an empirical enterprise concerned with the contents of one’s consciousness. He argues that Kant does convincingly show that we legitimately apply certain concepts a priori as a necessary condition of coherent consciousness, and that there are, in fact, “perduring, perceptible, causally interacting physical objects.”

Despite Kant’s remaining defenders, however, few now believe that transcendental arguments can yield a direct refutation of epistemic skepticism. Most now agree that more modest goals are in order if such arguments are to remain relevant. Such modest variations on the transcendental argument form continue to appear in a variety of contexts.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Book Γ.
  • Austin, J.L. (1939). “Are There A Priori Concepts?”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 18.
  • Bardon, Adrian (forthcoming). “The Aristotelian Prescription: Skepticism, Retortion, and Transcendental Arguments,” International Philosophical Quarterly.
  • Bardon, Adrian (2004). “Kant’s Empiricism in His Refutation of Idealism,” Kantian Review 8.
  • Bardon, Adrian (2005). “Performative Transcendental Arguments,” Philosophia 33.
  • Bennett, Jonathan (1966). Kant’s Analytic (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Berkeley, George (1979). Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous, ed. by Robert Adams (Indianapolis: Hackett).
  • Brueckner, Anthony (1983). “Transcendental Arguments I.” Noûs 17, pp. 551-76.
  • Brueckner, Anthony (1984). “Transcendental Arguments II.” Noûs 18, pp. 197-225.
  • Cassam, Quassim (1999). Self and World (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Cassam, Quassim (1987). “Transcendental Arguments, Transcendental Synthesis, and Transcendental Idealism,” Philosophical Quarterly 37.
  • Davidson, Donald (1984). Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Fowler, Corbin (1987). “Scepticism Revisited,” Philosophy 62, pp. 385-88.
  • Genova, A.C. (1984). “Good Transcendental Arguments.” Kant-Studien 75, pp. 469-95.
  • Gram, Moltke (1975). “Why Must We Revisit Transcendental Arguments?” The Journal of Philosophy 72, pp. 624-6.
  • Guyer, Paul (1987). Kant and the Claims of Knowledge. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Hintikka, Jaakko (1962). “Cogito, Ergo Sum: Inference or Performance?”, The Philosophical Review 71.
  • Hume, David (1978). A Treatise of Human Nature, 2nd ed. (Oxford: The Clarendon Press).
  • Kant, Immanuel (1998). Critique of Pure Reason, ed. and trans. by Paul Guyer and Allen Wood (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Körner, Stephan (1974). Categorial Frameworks (Oxford: Basil Blackwell).
  • Leibniz, G.W. (1998). Monadology, in G.W. Leibniz: Philosophical Texts, trans. by Richard Franks and R.S. Woolhouse (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Lewis, C.I. (1946). An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation. (La Salle: Open Court).
  • Lewis, C.I. (1969) Values and Imperatives, ed. by J. Lange (Stanford: Stanford University Press).
  • Lipson, Morris (1987). “Objective Experience.” Noûs 21, pp. 319-43.
  • Lonergan, Bernard (1970). Insight (New York: Philosophical Library).
  • Meynell, Hugo (1984). “Scepticism Reconsidered,” Philosophy 59, pp. 431-42 .
  • Peirce, C.S. (1931 & 1958). Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, 8 vols., vols. i-iv ed. C. Hartshorne and P. Weiss (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1931-5), vols. vii-viii ed. A. Burks Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1958).
  • Putnam, Hilary (1981). Reason, Truth, and History (New York: Cambridge University Press).
  • Rosenberg, Jay F. (1975). “Transcendental Arguments Revisited.” The Journal of Philosophy 72, pp. 611-24.
  • Schaper, Eva (1972). “Arguing Transcendentally,” Kant-Studien 63, pp. 101-16.
  • Stern, Robert (2000). Transcendental Arguments and Skepticism (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Strawson, P.F. (1966). The Bounds of Sense (London: Methuen & Co.).
  • Strawson, P.F. (1959). Individuals (New York: Methuen & Co.).
  • Strawson, P.F. (1985). Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties (New York: Columbia University Press).
  • Stroud, Barry (1999). “The Goal of Transcendental Arguments,” in Robert Stern (ed.), Transcendental Arguments: Problems and Prospects (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Stroud, Barry (1994). “Kantian Argument, Conceptual Capacities, and Invulnerability,” in Paolo Parrini (ed.), Kant and Contemporary Epistemology ( Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers).
  • Stroud, Barry (1968). “Transcendental Arguments,” Journal of Philosophy 65 (1968).
  • Westphal, Kenneth (2003). “Epistemic Reflection and Transcendental Proof,” in Strawson and Kant, ed. by Hans-Johann Glock (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Author Information

Adrian Bardon
Email: bardona@wfu.edu
Wake Forest University
U. S. A.

Omniscience and Divine Foreknowledge

Omniscience is an attribute having to do with knowledge; it is the attribute of “having knowledge of everything.” Many philosophers consider omniscience to be an attribute possessed only by a divine being, such as the God of Western monotheism. However, the Eastern followers of Jainism allow omniscience to be an attribute of some human beings. But what exactly is it to be omniscient? The term’s root Latin words are “omni” (all) and “scientia” (knowledge), and these suggest a rough layman’s definition of omniscience as “knowledge of everything.” Yet even though this definition may be somewhat useful, there are a number of questions which the definition alone does not address. First, there is the general question of what exactly our human knowledge is and whether or not an understanding of human knowledge can be applied to God. For example, does God have beliefs? And what kind of evidence does God need for these beliefs to count as knowledge? There is also the question of what exactly this “everything” in the definition is supposed to mean. Does God know everything which is actual but not all that is possible? Does God know the future, and if so, how exactly? This last question is a perennial difficulty and will require a thorough investigation.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Components of God’s Knowledge
    1. A Preliminary Account of Knowledge
    2. Beliefs, Sentences, Propositions and God’s Knowledge
      1. Beliefs, Propositions, or Both?
      2. Beliefs: Occurrent or Dispositional?
      3. Does God have Beliefs?
        1. Non-propositional knowledge
        2. Propositional Knowledge without Beliefs
    3. Truth and God’s Knowledge
      1. Truth as Correspondence
      2. Truth as a Clear and Distinct Perception
    4. Cognitive Faculties and God’s Knowledge
      1. Inferential Faculties
      2. Non-inferential Faculties
        1. Perception
        2. Introspection
        3. Kinesthetic awareness
        4. Memory
        5. Testimony
        6. A priori intuition
  3. Analyses of the Scope & Power of God’s Knowledge
    1. Non-comparative Analyses of Omniscience
      1. Having knowledge of all propositions
      2. Having knowledge of all true propositions
      3. Having knowledge of all true propositions and having no false beliefs
    2. Comparative Analyses of Omniscience
      1. Having knowledge which is not actually surpassed
      2. Having knowledge which could not possibly be surpassed
      3. Having knowledge which could not possibly be matched by another
      4. Having the most actual, or unsurpassable, or unmatchable cognitive power
  4. Divine Foreknowledge
    1. Argument for the Incompatibility of Omniscience and (creaturely) Freedom (IOF)
    2. Perceptual Knowledge of the Future
    3. Deductive Knowledge of the Future
      1. Deterministic Knowledge (DK)
      2. Molinism (Middle Knowledge)
    4. Intuitional Knowledge of the Future
    5. Limited Knowledge of the Future: Open Theism
      1. No Knowledge of the Future
      2. Limited Deductive and Inductive Knowledge of the Future
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

There are a number of scriptures that remark on the vastness of God’s knowledge. For instance the Qur’an (alt. Koran) states “[W]hat the heavens and earth contain [is God’s], and all that lies between them and underneath the soil. You have no need to speak aloud; for He has knowledge of all that is secret, and all that is hidden. . . . God has knowledge of all things.” (Suras 20:5ff; 24:35). Psalm 139 expresses similar thoughts:

Even before there is a word on my tongue,
Behold, O LORD, You know it all. . . .
Such knowledge is too wonderful for me;
It is too high, I cannot attain to it.
Where can I go from Your Spirit?
Or where can I flee from Your presence?
If I ascend to heaven, You are there;
If I make my bed in Sheol, behold, You are there. (NASB, vs. 4, 6-8)

These and many other passages from the sacred scriptures of Judaism, Christianity, and Islam all hint at the awesome breadth and depth of God’s knowledge. God is said not only to know the daily activities of his creatures but to know even their thoughts. God as creator knows about the heavens, the earth, and the whole physical cosmos. This much at least is supported by scriptures. But the scriptures are for the most part not philosophical texts and do little to offer a rigorous analysis of omniscience, a task that largely has been left to the philosophers within the traditions. This entry will navigate through the landscape of arguments presented by those theistic philosophers who have tried to make further progress in comprehending this attribute of God.

The first few sections analyze the concept of knowledge itself with particular application to God. After getting clearer on the different components of God’s knowledge, a number of different analyses of the quality and scope of God’s knowledge are considered in an attempt to sort out some plausible definitions of omniscience. The final sections take up one of the most difficult aspects of understanding God’s knowledge, his knowledge of the future. Several models are presented with an eye toward seeing whether or not the models can be reconciled with human freedom, divine providence, and a robust account of God’s omniscience.

2. The Components of God’s Knowledge

a. A Preliminary Account of Knowledge

It will be helpful to begin an exploration into God’s knowledge with a very brief account of human knowledge. Typically, knowledge has been thought of as a certain kind of belief. For starters, it must be a true belief. It would be a mistake to claim to know that “2+2=5” because 2 and 2 equal 4, not 5. Similarly one could not know that humans lived on the moon during the Clinton administration, because none did.

But is a true belief the same thing as knowledge? No. Here is an example to motivate why this cannot be. Suppose that a friend of yours has a broken compass that is no longer polarized so that the needle can spin freely. Your friend likes this compass a lot and even though he realizes that it does not work, sometimes he uses it to give people directions. One day, a stranger comes to your friend and asks for directions, specifically where north is (it’s a very cloudy day and there is no moss around). Your friend graciously pulls out his compass and proceeds to spin the needle. It lands on north. And, as it turns out, the compass is right. Question: Does your friend know where north is? It seems not. Why? Because your friend has really bad evidence for believing this since it is far more likely that his compass is pointing in the wrong direction. Your friend has a true belief, but he does not have knowledge. Something else is needed, namely, good evidence. Although it is debatable that all beliefs which count as knowledge must be based on good evidence, all knowledge is usually thought as a true belief that is either based on sufficient evidence (or a proper ground) or is formed in the right sort of way.

This is a rough account of what human knowledge is often thought to be. But there are additional complications when trying to apply this account to God. In what follows, a more thorough discussion of each of the elements of knowledge (belief, truth, and the way beliefs are grounded) will be undertaken in order to get clearer on what God’s knowledge may be like.

b. Beliefs, Sentences, Propositions and God’s Knowledge

Some argue that, strictly speaking, at bottom it is not beliefs which are true; instead it is sentences or propositions. When we believe that “Snow is white” we believe that this sentence (or proposition) is true. Thus God’s knowledge is ultimately of sentences, propositions, or whatever the real truth-bearers turn out to be. (See also What Sorts of Things are True (or False).)

First, consider the possibility that the truth-bearers are sentences. Sentences are essential components of a language. Here it is useful to distinguish between sentence-types and sentence-tokens. A sentence-token is a concrete entity such as some ink on a paper, pixels on a screen, a sound uttered by someone’s voice, or some other physical object. The sentences being read on your computer screen are all sentence-tokens. Sentence-tokens are instances of sentence-types. A sentence-type is an abstract entity that is multi-exemplifiable, that is, it can have instances in more than one place at a time. The sentence-token on your screen “Tully is the author of this article” and the ink blot in English on my desk (which reads: “Tully is the author of this article”) are both instances of the same sentence-type.

One objection to the theory that sentence-tokens are truth-bearers is that if there had never been anyone uttering a sentence, there would be no truth. Yet this is very implausible for surely it was true that there were plants before there were humans and other language users. This is a strike against sentence-tokens as the ultimate bearers of truth.

The truth-bearers of God’s knowledge do not seem to be sentence-types either because of an objection that might be called “the problem of indexicals”. For suppose God at some time expresses this proposition audibly in English, “I am God,” and Jim Morrison also says “I am God.” Spoken by God, this is evidently true but for Morrison this is false. It would seem, then, that the sentence-type expressed by both of these propositions would then bear two contradictory truth-values, that of being true and false—an absurd consequence. Therefore sentence-tokens and sentence-types should both be rejected as ultimate constituents of God’s knowledge.

In order to solve these problems, many have turned to propositions as the objects of God’s beliefs. Propositions are non-linguistic, abstract objects. Both of the following sentences can be thought to express the same proposition: “The father is a father by paternity”; “Pater paternitate est pater.” The advantage of holding that propositions are truth-bearers is that the abstract character of propositions does not commit one to thinking that God must be essentially related to time nor speaks in an ineffable divine language. (He might, but the propositional account does not entail this.) Additionally if the truth-bearers are propositions, it can be thought that when God and Jim Morrison both say “I am God” they are expressing two different propositions and not just the same sentence-type.

i. Beliefs, Propositions, or Both?

Ordinarily, in contrast to beliefs, propositions are to be thought of as non-mental entities. If propositions are truth-bearers, then it was true that “There are dinosaurs” when there were dinosaurs and no humans or other smart creatures around to believe this. So propositions have an advantage over beliefs as truth-bearers, because if propositions do the truth-bearing then there can be true statements when there are no believers.

But since God has always existed and been aware of everything, it may be that God’s beliefs are good enough to do the trick and there is no need for propositions, just so long as God believes all the facts. So for the theist who believes that everything is dependent on God in some sense—and thus at least partially on God’s mind—it may be appropriate to adopt the view that the propositions which humans believe are just God’s beliefs. After all, the only significant difference between propositions and beliefs is that propositions are ordinarily thought of as non-psychological, mind-independent entities. Positing beliefs rather than “free-floating” propositions as the truth-bearers of God’s knowledge is a more natural way of deferring to God as the source of all knowledge. Perhaps a theist can say with Berkeley, “Esse est percipi”—to be is to be perceived, or more precisely, “Esse verum est Deo credi”—to be true is (just) to be believed by God. God is the source of his beliefs and God’s beliefs are the source of what is true; false beliefs arise from creatures mistakenly believing to be true what God believes is false.

Whether or not propositions are just God’s beliefs will not be fully settled in this entry. Since much of the literature on omniscience understands the concept as knowledge of true propositions, the remaining sections of the article will not suppose that the ultimate truth-bearers of God’s knowledge are beliefs or propositions and the two terms will be used interchangeably to refer to whatever the truth-bearers happen to be.

ii. Beliefs: Occurrent or Dispositional?

Another distinction is useful in getting clearer on the nature of God’s beliefs. This is the distinction between occurrent and dispositional beliefs. To have an occurrent belief that something is true is to be actively thinking that something is true. For instance, supposing that person P believes in God, P is only currently believing in God if P is actively thinking that this proposition is true, “God exists.”

But sometimes we are inclined to say things like this too, “Yes, I’ve believed that all my life. I’ve always believed God exists, even if I haven’t always been actively thinking this.” If this way of describing beliefs is right, what we are talking about cannot be an occurrent belief since we have not spent all of our life thinking about this or any other proposition. Rather, we have what is called a dispositional belief. If a person has a dispositional belief this means she would be disposed or inclined to have an occurrent belief in a proposition if she were to think about the proposition.

But how best to describe God’s beliefs? The downside of the dispositional account of God’s beliefs is that dispositional beliefs entail that God is not always aware of all that is true. A dispositional account of beliefs is suitable for making sense of limited human cognitive activity but would be deficient for a perfect thinker. If it is possible to make sense of a being who can be aware of all propositions simultaneously it is preferable to think of all of God’s beliefs as occurrent. Dispositional beliefs are adequate for finite humans, but the goal is always to be aware of everything that one believes. [For arguments in favor of dispositional beliefs see Hunt (1995)].

iii. Does God have Beliefs?

Not all describe God’s knowledge in the typical way of God having a very large set of justified, true beliefs. William Alston has argued that God’s knowledge should be characterized in a different way because, no matter how one understands God’s knowledge, it can be shown that God has no beliefs (287-307).

According to Alston, there are two plausible ways to characterize God’s knowledge without beliefs. The predominant view in contemporary philosophy of religion is that his knowledge is propositional in content. Alston thinks God’s knowledge may be thought of as propositional without God having beliefs. Call this the propositional view of God’s knowledge. An alternative view is that God does not grasp the truth of propositions; rather he is immediately and directly aware of the world without any propositional intermediaries that are about the world. This is the non-propositional view of God’s knowledge.

1) Non-propositional knowledge

Beginning with the latter position, Alston takes Aquinas to be one of its chief representatives. According to Aquinas, God is not dependent for his existence on anything, including his attributes. God is thought of as absolutely simple, not having any real parts distinct from God’s essence. God’s simplicity encompasses every attribute of God including his knowledge. To put it crudely, there is no difference between God, his knowledge, and the objects of God’s knowledge. So the object of God’s knowledge turns out to be God’s own essence. God’s essence contains within it the likeness of everything and God knows everything by knowing his own essence.

Alston admits that this way of knowing is very mysterious and we will never be able to adequately understand how it is that God knows everything. But he thinks we can liken God’s knowledge to our initial perceptual vision of a scene, where we have yet to extract from the scene separate facts. We have an awareness of things but the awareness is without a propositional structuring. In this initial perception, there is a unity present in which we have yet to separate subject from object, knower from things known. For humans, we do not have understanding until we begin to separate our knowledge from the things known and separate the scene into a distinct set of facts. Yet we lose and long for the underlying unity of the initial awareness. God, it may be thought, retains the unity and can have understanding without piecemeal, discursive thought present in human reasoning.

That is a rough description of what non-propositional knowledge is like, perhaps not fully illuminating, but not incoherent. If one accepts divine simplicity, one has a pretty strong argument against knowledge as propositional beliefs:

1. God is simple, including God’s knowledge.
2. Propositional thought structure is complex.
3. If God’s thought structure is propositional, this means that either God’s beliefs just are propositions or the content of his beliefs are of mind-independent propositions.
4. Either way, God’s knowledge cannot be composed of beliefs.

If one balks at the idea of divine simplicity, there is a second argument for why God’s knowledge is non-propositional. We humans are limited. We cannot understand any concrete thing without abstracting from it and formulating propositions about its abstract features. For example, we cannot fully understand Jimmy Carter but only various aspects of him, that he is a Democrat, that he is human, and so forth. But God is not limited. His knowledge is complete. God can understand everything about Jimmy Carter all at once without separating aspects of him from Jimmy Carter. He does this by knowing Jimmy Carter himself. So there is no reason for God to employ propositions if his knowledge is unlimited in the way just described. Since God does not have to employ propositions, he has no need of beliefs.

2) Propositional Knowledge without Beliefs

If a propositional account of God’s knowledge is to be preferred, Alston thinks that this too can be described without the employment of beliefs. He calls this view the “intuitive” conception of knowledge. Instead of having a belief that p is true—where p is a proposition that is true if it corresponds with some fact F—he thinks that God could be directly aware of the fact, F, with no belief about p at all. (Even though God is directly aware of facts, and not propositions, he still thinks that this can rightly be called a propositional way of knowing because the facts which would correspond to true propositions have the same isomorphic structure. For more on facts and correspondence, see Truth as Correspondence). Knowing something would then be a completely different kind of psychological state than believing something. One can have a belief without the belief being true. However if knowledge is a state of awareness of a fact, there is an intrinsic relationship between awareness of facts and truth that beliefs do not have. All of God’s knowledge would be infallible in a very strong sense.

Alston thinks that if we compare this kind of knowledge with human knowledge (true belief grounded in the right way) we can see that the former is better because “[t]here is no potentially distorting medium in the way, no possibly unreliable witnesses, no fallible signs or indications” (190). We humans have a lot of beliefs that we are not always immediately aware of and could be wrong about many of them. We would gladly trade this kind of knowledge for always being directly aware of the facts. Intuitive knowledge just seems like a superior kind of knowledge. Since God is perfect he should be thought of as having this superior kind of knowledge, a knowledge without beliefs. [For objections to this view see Hasker (1988)].

c. Truth and God’s Knowledge

A discussion of all of the different theories of truth is well beyond the scope of this entry. Instead only two theories will be discussed which present the most likely candidates for the kind of truth involved in God’s knowledge. Since the belief and justification components of knowledge provide more complications for a theory about God’s knowledge, this section will be relatively brief. For additional complications, see Truth.

i. Truth as Correspondence

The most widely held account of truth is that truth is a relationship, namely one of correspondence (See Correspondence Theory). A belief is true if the proposition held to be true corresponds with some fact. “2+2=4” is true if it is a fact that 2+2=4. “John McCain is now President of the United States” is true if right now it is a fact that he is the president and it is false if this fact does not now obtain. What is a fact? This is an area of current debate. Some think of facts as concrete entities like events which contain substances and their properties as constituents. But it is doubtful that a theist can maintain this understanding of facts since it is often thought that God could know propositions about God’s thoughts or about uncreated creatures. Yet there seems to be no concrete entity or entities which these kinds of propositions could correspond with to give them their truth value. Thus for many theists, facts have been understood like propositions as abstract entities—states of affairs that are either actually, possibly, or necessarily existing.

ii. Truth as a Clear and Distinct Perception

Above it was mentioned that William Alston proposes that God does not have beliefs. Instead, God has knowledge by either being directly aware of facts or by being directly aware of his own essence. If Alston is right, then the truth element involved in God’s knowledge is not truth as correspondence since there are no beliefs or propositions as constituents of God’s knowledge to correspond with facts.

Alston at one point appeals to Descartes’ formulation of knowledge as a clear and distinct perception to clarify his view that God can have knowledge by a kind of perception without beliefs. Although Alston does not do so explicitly himself, Descartes’ thoughts can also be used to illuminate what truth would be in the absence of beliefs. According to this understanding, perceptions or “awarenesses” are true if and only if they are clear and distinct. Moreover, we might just hink of truth as this quality of being clear and distinct. For humans, not all of our perceptions are clear and distinct, so some of our perceptions will not be true. But God’s perceptual faculties do not suffer from human limitations—all of his perceptions (of either his own essence or of mind independent facts) would be perfectly clear and distinct. Thus built into God’s perceptual faculties is that they yield qualitatively perfect perceptions and thus everything which is perceived must be true.

d. Cognitive Faculties and God’s Knowledge

The traditional account of knowledge is true belief plus something else. What this something else is has often been called justification (or sometimes “warrant”). From the time of the Ancient philosophers to the present, there has been an endless debate on the nature of this third component of knowledge. Some have even thought that justification, being an essentially normative (and perhaps moral) notion, should not be attributed to God who is the author or ground of normativity and does not need to justify his beliefs.

This debate about what justification is and whether God needs it will not be resolved here. Even if God does not have to have justified beliefs and does not need reasons for all of his items of knowledge, God still needs cognitive faculties to provide him experience or a proper ground for at least some things. Thus we can understand this third component of knowledge less controversially in terms of the kinds of cognitive faculties needed to yield a wide scope of knowledge. A cognitive faculty is simply a particular ability to know something. Perception is an example of a faculty of human cognition that allows us to know about the physical world. Memory is the faculty that allows us to know about the past. Below, each of the classical faculties which have been thought to provide humans with evidence for their beliefs will be discussed in relation to God’s knowledge.

i. Inferential Faculties

Most often when we ask for evidence for someone’s belief, it is propositional evidence that we are asking for. We are asking for propositional reasons to believe something. Many times, we will use our beliefs that certain propositions are true as evidence for some of our other beliefs. Using beliefs as evidence for other beliefs is using inferential evidence. Here is an example. In order for Jane to justifiably believe that Brutus killed Caesar, Jane may need to know that the history book that she is reading was written by a credible historian. To know that cigarettes cause cancer, Jane would perhaps need to know that studies have shown this to be true. When we are reasoning inferentially, we are employing arguments. Thus inferential evidence can come as a deductive, inductive, or abductive argument.

1) Deductive Reasoning

A deductive argument which provides knowledge is one in which the premises guarantee the truth of the conclusion such that if the premises were true it would be impossible for the conclusion to be false.

1.If John Sidoti is Sicilian, then John Sidoti is Italian.
2.John Sidoti is Sicilian.
3.Thus, John Sidoti is Italian.

Deductive reasoning is an excellent way to come to a conclusion because the premises necessitate the truth of the conclusion. Since deductive arguments provide an infallible guide to knowledge of the conclusions, if God reasons inferentially there is little reason to think that he does not reason deductively.

2) Inductive Reasoning

An inductive argument which yields knowledge is one in which the premises do not guarantee the truth of the conclusion but make it very likely that a conclusion is true.

1.98% of the students at the Ohio State University have high school diplomas.
2.Titus is a student at the Ohio State University.
3.Thus, Titus has a high school diploma.

The conclusion of this argument does not necessarily follow from the premises. Inductive reasoning is thus a fallible way of reasoning, and as such, most have not attributed this kind of reasoning to God. Since the truth of the premises does not guarantee that the conclusion is true, God could be wrong if he reasoned inductively—an unfortunate feature of a perfect being. But as will be seen below, there are some who think that God is omniscient yet could be mistaken about some things. For example, if the future is to some degree indeterminate, God could possibly be mistaken about its outcome. Still, God could make reasonable predictions about the future if he reasons inductively. Thus an inductive account of some of God’s knowledge may be attractive as a way of granting the most and qualitatively best knowledge possible given necessary limiting conditions which are thought to inhere in the world.

3) Abductive Reasoning

An abductive argument is an argument to the best explanation. Inferential knowledge of a proposition via an abductive argument would be such that the conclusion yields a true and epistemically plausible explanation for the facts provided in the premises.

1. There are things which came into existence.
2. Whatever comes into existence is caused to exist by something or other.
3. There cannot be an infinite series of past causes.
4. Therefore, there was a first uncaused cause.
5. Thus God exists (because the best explanation for this first cause is God).

Like inductive reasoning, abductive reasoning is thought to be fallible, again, a serious drawback in attributing it to a perfect being. One important difference between inferential and abductive reasoning that counts even more against the possibility of God reasoning abductively is that while inductive reasoning is forward looking, abductive reasoning is present or backward looking and may be unnecessary for God to have. There might be good reasons to think that God can only have fallible knowledge of the future, but there are few reasons why God could not have infallible knowledge of the present and past so long as (a) there has never been a time in which God has not existed and (b) God has perfect “vision” of all that is present to him or that he remembers. Presumably God would never need to make a best guess about why something is the way it is, since he has “seen” all that has been before and all that is now. So it is unlikely that God reasons abductively if he has the sorts of cognitive faculties like perception and memory which will be discussed below.
One final thing should be said about God’s reasoning in general. When humans reason by inference, they do so discursively with a temporal lag between seeing the premises as true and using the premises as bases for the conclusion. In other words, we reason piecemeal and working through our reasoning by way of an argument takes time. Most who think that God can reason inferentially do not think his reasoning is discursive like this. God can see the argument all at once and see immediately that certain premises lead to a conclusion. The premises are evidentially prior to the conclusion but he does not think of them temporally prior to believing the conclusion.

ii. Non-inferential Faculties

Not all evidence comes from inferential cognitive faculties. More often than not, we take direct experience as evidence for the truth of propositions and think that we have faculties which can provide us this more immediate kind of evidence. The perception of a watch on your neighbor’s hand is taken as evidence that “Your neighbor is wearing a watch” is true. The feeling of a sharp pain in my leg is evidence that “I am hurting” is true. The feeling of one’s legs being crossed under the desk is evidence for the belief that “My legs are crossed.” At a minimum, perceptual, introspective, and kinesthetic experience seem to count as evidence for some beliefs. In addition, memory, testimony, and a priori intuitions have been thought to yield immediate evidence as well.

1) Perception

Many theists speak of God as “seeing” the world, “hearing” their prayers, and “feeling” sad for sin. Less often is God spoken of as smelling or tasting something. But in general, it is thought that God can perceive the world.  (See The Epistemology of Perception.)  Since most theists think of God as non-bodily, God’s perception will only be analogously like human perception. God’s sight, for example, will not involve the reception of light into the eye and his sight will never yield misleading or “fuzzy” data. Accordingly having perfect perception would seem to involve removing all of the limits of human perception. For instance, God’s seeing would not be limited to seeing the surface of material objects but could penetrate through the solid objects to what is beyond. He would lack unclear, peripheral vision and instead would be able to focus on everything clearly all at once.

God’s relationship with time will also affect the scope of God’s perceptions. If God is atemporal, God’s perceptual faculty should be thought of as God’s ability to perceive all of time all at once. If God is temporal, his perception would best be thought of like human perception, as awareness of only what is present.

2) Introspection

The introspective faculty provides direct insight of one’s own internal thoughts, feelings, and emotions (See Introspection). That I am now in pain can be known just by experiencing pain. That I am now thinking is also known by introspection. Since God is traditionally thought to be personal—enjoying psychological faculties involving beliefs, feelings, thoughts, and so forth—there is little reason to think that some of God’s knowledge is not gained by something like human introspection.

3) Kinesthetic awareness

Kinesthetic awareness is an experience of one’s bodily movements and the location (and perhaps feeling) of one’s bodily parts. Whether or not kinesthetic awareness is a type of introspection or something different entirely is a matter of debate. But either way, it would seem that God would lack this type of evidence and its corresponding faculty since God is usually not thought to have a body. If God did have a body (say, as Jesus), then God could have kinesthetic awareness.

4) Memory

The faculty of memory provides immediate knowledge of the past. The question of whether or not God remembers things is essentially tied to questions about God’s relationship to time. If God is atemporal, then he would have no memory, since memory consists of being aware of a past experience. But if God is atemporal, then he would have no past experiences to recall. Thus God only has memory if God is a temporal being.

5) Testimony

Some think that humans have a testimony faculty which enables them to have knowledge of some propositions just by hearing certain kinds of testimony that something is true. It is not clear why God could not have testimony as evidence but there seems to be no reason to think that he does. This is because God would already have overwhelming evidence from his other faculties for whatever a creature testified to be true. Since there are no circumstances in which testimony would be needed by God in order for him to have knowledge, there is little reason to suppose that God ever has knowledge which is based on testimony.

6) A priori intuition

Finally, God is thought to have knowledge of all necessarily true propositions such as “2+2=4,” “God exists,” and “if x is a bachelor, then x is an unmarried male.” God does not reason by inference that these propositions are true nor does he experience that they are true. God just intuits they are true by an a priori intuition (See A Priori and A Posteriori).

There is wide debate about what a priori intuition is for humans so it is even more difficult to explain what it is for God. Some have thought that having a priori knowledge just amounts to understanding the meaning of the terms in a statement; if one were to understand the terms, then one would know that it is true. Others have suggested that it is a kind of grasping of abstract objects and their relations between them (for instance, grasping the numbers 2 and 4 and the relations of adding and equaling in the proposition 2+2=4). Whatever a priori intuition turns out to be for God, most think that God enjoys this cognitive faculty.

3. Analyses of the Scope & Power of God’s Knowledge

How great is God’s knowledge? How much does he know? In order to answer these questions it is not enough just to offer an analysis of the components of God’s knowledge; one must also specify the scope of his knowledge. There are a number of ways this might be done.

The first three attempts at an analysis of the scope of God’s knowledge listed below have been called non-comparative notions because they specify the range or amount of God’s knowledge without comparing God’s knowledge to the knowledge of any other being. The final four are comparative accounts of God’s knowledge. Proponents of these views recognize God’s knowledge as perhaps more limited than the non-comparative notions allow but still think that omniscience can be explained in terms of a comparison with other beings, even if God’s knowledge is significantly restricted. The last of the four also stands out as not only being a non-comparative account, but as the only analysis which does not state that it is necessary for an omniscient being to have knowledge. Rather it is sufficient to be omniscient if one has a significant degree of power to have knowledge.

a. Non-comparative Analyses of Omniscience

i. Having knowledge of all propositions

In spite of an initial feeling of piety that might accompany embracing this definition, it should be rejected. Why? Recall what knowledge is. It requires at a minimum holding what is true. But some propositions are false such as 2+2=5. Since it is false it cannot be known by anyone, especially God who most think could not even believe something that is false let alone know it.

ii. Having knowledge of all true propositions

According to this clause, God knows a lot—in fact he knows all that could possibly be known. This is a very strong version of omniscience and in all likelihood has been the one most widely held among theists. On this interpretation, God knows all the present truths and all truths of the past and future. God also knows the propositions that must be true or are merely possibly true. For instance, God knows that “necessarily, all humans are not triangles” and “possibly, the Steelers sign a linebacker named Tristan this year.” Furthermore, many who hold to this definition think that God knows all of the subjunctive propositions which are sometimes of events that are not actual but could have been as in the statement “if the U.S. had not entered World War II, Germany would have won.”

iii. Having knowledge of all true propositions and having no false beliefs

Many have proposed (iii) [i.e., Having knowledge of all true propositions and having no false beliefs] instead of (ii) [i.e., Having knowledge of all true propositions] in order to make clear that an omniscient being not only believes all true propositions but is not mistaken about any beliefs either. But as Edward Wierenga has pointed out, adding this clause in (iii) is at least redundant and possibly incoherent (39) for it seems to presuppose it is possible that for someone to know all true propositions and yet have a false belief. Suppose that God could. If God knew all true propositions, he would know that he believed some false proposition. But it may not be coherent to both know p and know that you believe not-p.

Yet even if this is coherent, says Wierenga, the additional clause about God not having false beliefs can be shown to be redundant. Presumably God has deductive cognitive faculties. Now if God both knows p and believes not-p, then God believes a contradiction, and anything whatsoever can be validly deduced from a contradiction. So if God did know p and believed not-p, God would deduce all propositions from this and believe everything. But this seems impossible. Thus there is no reason to add the additional clause “having no false beliefs” because knowing all true propositions seems to be incompatible with having false beliefs.

b. Comparative Analyses of Omniscience

i. Having knowledge which is not actually surpassed

Although holding this definition is consistent with believing that God knows all true propositions, it leaves open the possibility that God does not know everything. Those that prefer this analysis of omniscience think that there are some propositions that likely God does not know.

Recall the discussion above about indexicals (See Beliefs, Sentences, Propositions and God’s Knowledge). Some have argued that it is impossible for God to know the proposition expressed by Jones when Jones says “I am thinking.” The idea is that such propositions involving an indexical term like “I” are not identical with propositions involving proper names such as “Jones” in the sentence, “Jones is thinking.” God could know “Jones is thinking” but propositions with an indexical like “I” can only be grasped by whoever is expressing the proposition, in this case, Jones.

In response, some have argued that “I” refers to a haecciety, a mysterious entity that individuates Jones from other humans, but an entity nonetheless that God can know (Wierenga, 50-6). Jones and every other human have in common “humanity” but differ by having individual haeccities. In knowing “I am thinking” when thought by Jones, God knows the act of Jones’ thinking & Jones’ haecciety and thereby knows that this proposition is true. But there are questions about whether or not God could know haeccities of persons or objects other than God (Rosenkrantz, 220-4).

Another set of propositions that God may not know are propositions about causally undetermined, future events. Examples are random events at the quantum level or free creaturely actions. Whether or not God has knowledge of the future will be discussed below.

It should be reiterated that proponents of this limited view of omniscience still want to maintain that omniscience can be characterized quite sufficiently as a comparative notion. They are not denying that God is omniscient. They simply think that omniscience need not be thought of as necessarily having knowledge of every true proposition. True, it may seem strange that God learns things. Nevertheless, they insist, no one who exists knows as much as God. God still knows a lot more than anyone else.

ii. Having knowledge which could not possibly be surpassed

This definition is also compatible with the second non-comparative definition above (having knowledge of all true propositions) and proponents of this definition typically think that God does not know all true propositions. But this analysis is stronger than the previous comparative analysis (i) because it states that God knows everything that any being could possibly know. The problem with the previous analysis of omniscience is that it leaves open the possibility that there is a possible being whose knowledge could exceed God’s knowledge. But at least since the time of Anselm, God is thought of not only as the greatest actual being, but the greatest possible being. As such it should be the case that God has knowledge which no one could possibly surpass.

iii. Having knowledge which could not possibly be matched by another

Note that both (i) and (ii) state that no one can know as much as God but they allow for the possibility that there can be more than one omniscient being. But most theists are uncomfortable with this possibility and (iii) rules this out. In support of (iii) a theist could appeal to the doctrine of divine simplicity, the doctrine that God is perfectly simple (as mentioned above).

Since the Medieval era, a number of theologians have proposed that God is absolutely simple and that in reality, (on a very popular interpretation) all of God’s attributes are really identical with each other and God. This is a difficult doctrine to understand for it forces one to say that God’s omniscience is really identical to God’s omnipotence, God’s omnipotence is identical to God’s justice, and so forth. But if the doctrine is embraced, it seems to be incompatible with analyses (i) and (ii). For if God is the greatest possible being, and God is the greatest in virtue of having the great-making attributes of omniscience, omnibenevolence, and so forth, (which turn out to all be identical with each other and with God), then it is impossible that any other being have omniscience, for to be omniscient is to be identical with God. [For more arguments for a comparative analysis of omniscience see Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (2002)].

iv. Having the most actual, or unsurpassable, or unmatchable cognitive power

The final analysis of God’s omniscience is really a group of three related views which could be parsed in terms of God having the most actual power or possible power. But for brevity sake the three views have been lumped together leaving it to the reader to understand “most actual”, “unsurpassable”, and “unmatchable” along the lines discussed in the previous three analyses. What separates this kind of analysis from the former ones is that the idea of omniscience is understood strictly as a function of God’s omnipotence and not in terms of the scope or content of God’s knowledge. The concept of omniscience, it is thought, is only a concept about what God is able to do and not about what he knows. So this view is neutral on the scope of God’s actual knowledge—there may be some things that God does not or cannot know.

One virtue of this view for Christian theists is that it may provide resources for making sense of how Jesus was God even though he seemed to grow in knowledge and wisdom during his life on earth. If to be omniscient, it is sufficient to have a superior kind of cognitive power without thereby exercising that power, Jesus could be said to be divine even though he did not fully exercise his power to know many things. In becoming a man, Jesus relinquished the full exercise of his omnipotence and with it his vast knowledge, nevertheless retaining his power. This position of course leaves one with the curiosity that one can be a human and be omniscient, but perhaps this can be defended. Furthermore, there is a question about whether omniscience is an attribute of only God considered as a complete substance or an attribute of each person. [For more on this understanding of the scope of omniscience see Kvanvig (1986), (1989), and Taliafferro (1993)].

4. Divine Foreknowledge

Quite possibly the most contested area of God’s knowledge has been his knowledge of the future. On the one hand there is the problem of how God’s foreknowledge is possible without canceling the possibility of his creatures’ ability to act freely. If God knows that some event E will happen in the future, there is a sense in which E must happen. But if God knows the future exhaustively, then it seems as if the entire future is fixed and humans are not genuinely free (See Foreknowledge and Freewill). On the other hand, if creatures are free and act indeterminately then it may be that God cannot know what exactly his creatures will do and this lack of knowledge may limit his providential care for them. The theist is thus forced to try to retain a strong sense of (a) God’s knowledge of the future and (b) God’s providence, while at the same time not excluding the possibility of (c) free creaturely action.

There have been many ways of trying to hold on to all three and sometimes the attempts end up diminishing the extent of one at the expense of another. Some begin with a strong sense of God’s sovereignty and then try to explain God’s foreknowledge and creaturely freedom in ways which may end up limiting one or the other. Others begin with a strong sense of creaturely freedom and then explain God’s sovereignty or foreknowledge.

In order to sort out the different views, it will be helpful to offer an argument against the compatibility of God’s foreknowledge and human freedom. The argument will serve as a heuristic device for showing how competing views of God’s foreknowledge have developed at least in part as a way of solving this dilemma. After the argument is presented, four types of foreknowledge which are modeled after human cognitive faculties will be explained as responses to the argument. [For a good introduction to different views about God’s foreknowledge see Beilby and Eddy (2001)].

a. Argument for the Incompatibility of Omniscience and (creaturely) Freedom (IOF)

The following argument is about a fictional person, Ryan, who we are to imagine freely refrains from watching TV on his day off from work. A worry is that if God knows what he will do ahead of time, then Ryan is not really free to refrain from watching TV. Even though this is a fictional account, one can see that if this argument is right it would additionally apply to real people and could be generalized to show that either no one is ever free, or God is not omniscient since he does not have foreknowledge. [For other incompatibility arguments see Fischer (1989)].

  1. God essentially exists in time and is essentially omniscient.
  2. Now suppose someone, call him Ryan, gets a call from his boss on Thursday that he should not come to work, and Ryan stays home from work on Friday but freely refrains from watching TV on Friday even though he could have watched TV.
  3. Principle of Freedom: An act, A, is freely performed by a person S, only if S’s performing the action is not wholly determined by anyone or anything other than S and S could’ve done other than A.
  4. Suppose also that God knows on Thursday that Ryan does not watch TV on Friday.
  5. If Ryan were to have freely watched TV on Friday, then God would have had a false belief on Thursday.
  6. But if God would have had a false belief on Thursday, then God would not have been omniscient on Thursday.
  7. Thus if Ryan were to watch TV on Friday, then God would not have been omniscient on Thursday; in other words, God wouldn’t have existed, since being omniscient is an essential part of what it is to be God.
  8. Thus either Ryan is never free to do things like watch TV (or any other free action for that matter) or Ryan could have brought it about that God did not exist.

b. Perceptual Knowledge of the Future

One way to challenge the conclusion of the IOF argument is to reject the clause in the first premise that God is essentially in time. A number of philosophers have postulated that God is not in time but “sees” all of time from his eternal perspective. Boethius is a good representative of this contingent of philosophers and is one of the earliest philosophers to devote much thought to the question of how God knows the future. God is able to know the future because of the way that God exists, eternally. Boethius describes God’s eternal existence as follows:

“Eternity is a possession of life, a possession simultaneously entire and perfect, which has no end. . . That which grasps and possesses the entire fullness of a life that has no end at one and the same time (nothing that is to come being absent to it, nothing of what has passed having flowed away from it) is rightly held to be eternal.” (Consolation CV 6.4, 144).

God is not like humans who exist wholly at each finite moment in time and endure through time. A human possesses her life only in a small finite window which we call “now”—the past life is no longer possessed but gone, the future is not yet realized. Since our human life is lived in a finite “now”, it is never full and complete but is fragmented. God, however, is perfect and God’s life is not fragmented like the life of a temporally enduring human. He lives in the eternal “now.” His “now” stretches over our past, present, and future. Our finite present is representative of God’s eternal present, but our finite present is only a faint and imperfect model.

Thus by being eternal, the future is not off in the distance for God but is subsumed under his eternal presence. Since God wholly exists at all times in his eternal “now” he can know what happens at every time. Boethius says that God’s foreknowledge “looks at such things as are present to it just as they will eventually come to pass in time as future things.” (Consolation CV 6.21, 147). Boethius’ explanation for how God knows the future is a kind of perceptual model. Foreknowledge is a simple awareness of the future, not involving any complex deductive or inductive reasoning. If having knowledge of something before it happens is like looking far off in the distance, having knowledge in the “eternal now” is like perceiving something immediately before one’s eyes. God “sees” with the divine mind all of existence immediately in one eternal moment. [See Marenbon (2003)].


Obviously this perceptual model of God’s foreknowledge represented here by Boethius is not meant to be taken literally in the sense that God has eyes and really has a vision in the same sense that humans do. Still, there are other worries besides how to make sense of the way an immaterial being perceives. For one, there are problems about what kinds of propositions God could be justified in believing from his vantage point. It seems that from the perspective of the eternal “now”, God’s knowledge of temporal statements is limited to tenseless, time-indexed propositions—propositions that specify the time a certain event occurred such as “In 1994 Pink Floyd goes on tour” but do not change their truth value over time such as the proposition “Pink Floyd will tour next year.” This latter proposition is true in 1993, but false in 1995.

But God could not know this latter kind of tensed proposition. This is because these kinds of statements describe events relative to the time they are spoken, written, or in general, expressed by creatures. But for God, all time is “now” and it makes no sense to say that something will happen or did happen in relation to God’s temporal “now,” since his temporal “now” subsumes all times. All tensed propositions will be reduced to tenseless propositions. For example, when Jane thinks “Pink Floyd will go on tour next year” what God knows is that “In 1993, Jane thinks that Pink Floyd will go on tour in 1994” and “In 1994, Pink Floyd goes on tour.”

Defenders of Boethius argue that tense is a creaturely fiction; tensed statements only express psychological attitudes but nothing about time itself. As such, there is nothing that God fails to know since time is not really composed of a real past, present, and future. But this debate is yet to be settled.

There is another related problem having to do with the relationship between God’s eternal “now” and every other “now.” The problem can be seen by considering the transitivity of the relation “happening now.” Here is a definition of a transitive relation: x is a transitive relation, if and only if for any A, B, and C, if A stands in x to B, and B stands in x to C, then A stands in x to C. “Being to the left of” is a good example of a transitive relation. If A is to the left of B, and B is to the left of C, then A is to the left of C.

“Happening now” also seems to be transitive. If I am now typing while my wife is writing, and my wife is writing while my daughters are now playing, then I am now typing while my daughters are now playing. Here is the problem for Boethius’ position. For God, I am now typing while he is now seeing me type, and God is now seeing me type while he is seeing Rome burn. But this means that I am now typing while Rome is burning! This seems absurd. The Boethian defender is thus faced with the difficulty of explaining how God’s eternal “now” does not lead to this absurdity. An adequate explanation will need to provide an account of the kind of “now” which is special for God that both meets at least some of our intuitions of what “now” means while avoiding complications which arise from the transitivity of our “now” with God’s “now.”

Another substantial problem with the perceptual model has to do with making sense of God’s providence. If the perceptual view is right, it would seem that God is taking a very large risk in creating. This is because his creative activity must be in some sense prior to his knowledge of his creation—for he cannot be said to know the happenings in the world if it does not exist! In other words, God creates the whole world all at once—past, present, and future—then sees the world from his atemporal vantage point. But if God’s creative activity is logically prior to God’s knowledge of the world, it would seem that God’s creative activity is done in the blind. Thus God runs a risk of creating a world in which tremendous evil occurs.

In response to this objection, an argument might be developed against the notion of “risk” utilized in the objection. If it can be shown that risks imply temporal priority and not just logical priority in actions, then the Boethian understanding of God’s knowledge of the future can be preserved because, since God is outside of time, his creative activity is not temporally prior to his foreknowledge. If this cannot be shown, then the theists who want to maintain God’s future knowledge and God’s providence might move to either of the next two models which have a more straightforward way of preserving God’s providence.

A final problem for this view is with reconciling Boethius’ understanding of foreknowledge with the divine attribute of immutability—God’s changelessness. If God creates the world logically prior to his knowing about the world, then it appears that God learns about what he creates. But to learn of what he creates is for God to change. Hence if Boethius is right, it either means that God is not immutable or that Boethius’ view is internally incoherent.

At least two things could be said in response to this charge. First, typically since at least the time of Aristotle, a change has been thought of as the acquisition or loss of a property from one time to another. If I gain the property of “being 5 feet 11 inches tall” then I have lost some other property, say, “being 5 feet 10 inches tall” and thus have changed. But since God is atemporal, there is no time in which he gains or loses a property. His creation is logically prior to his knowledge, but not temporally prior. Of course, this response hinges crucially on the notion of logical priority—if some sense can be made of it and it can be separated from temporal priority then this objection seems to have been met. A second response is to concede that God has changed, but retort that this kind of change does not affect the doctrine of divine immutability. God does not change with regard to his moral character, but can change in other ways. This response would weaken the doctrine of immutability as it has traditionally been held. [For further objections see Marenbon (2003) and Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 2002].

c. Deductive Knowledge of the Future

i. Deterministic Knowledge (DK)

The DK model for the most part embraces the reasoning of the IOF argument but rejects the Principle of Freedom. Being free is compatible with being determined. Some DK advocates also reject the idea that God is temporal. Both the temporal and atemporal versions are discussed below.

The DK view has been attributed to a number of philosophers and theologians, most notably to the Christian Father, Saint Augustine, and the Protestant Reformer John Calvin. The basic idea is relatively simple. According to DK, God is completely in control of the unfolding of time including everything that happens in the future. This is because he predestines the future. Here, “predestines” means that God determines the outcome of the future. Since the future is determined by God, once God initiates his plan for the future, necessarily, his plan unfolds and there is no possibility of any divergence from the plan. Thus, once God knows his plan and initiates it, God can deduce any event which follows from it because he knows either self-evidently or a priori, (1) the plan prior to its unfolding, (2) that he wants it to unfold, and knows (3) that God gets exactly what he wants.

The DK view is consistent with both an atemporal understanding of God as well as a temporal one. On the atemporal view, God is outside of time and determines the world via one eternal act. Since God is outside of time there is no prior time when God formulates and initiates a plan. Nevertheless it is still right to say that there is a causal or logical priority in this instance and that God’s initiating a plan for the world is logically and causally prior to the unfolding of that plan. So God deduces, logically prior to his one eternal act, everything that will occur given his plan and his intent to create the future.

The temporal view is basically the same. God knows his plan, that he wants it, and that he will get it if he wants it. The only difference is that God has always known this in his infinite temporal existence. God is everlasting and his knowledge of the future is not only logically prior to the future but is temporally prior to the future as well. God deduces what will happen both logically and temporally prior to the future occurrences. For present purposes, the only significant difference between the temporal and atemporal DK model is that the atemporal position can, with the perceptual model, reject the first premise of the IOF argument about God’s essential relationship to time. [For Augustine’s view see Augustine (1979) and Wetzel (2001); for a defense of the DK model see Paul Helm’s chapter in Beilby and Eddy (2001)].


The DK model has a clear way of preserving God’s providence. Since God causes the future by bringing about his perfect plan, there are no surprises like there seem to be if God knows the future via perception. The model also has a clear way of explaining how God knows, namely by deduction—an infallible guide to a conclusion. So the most substantive objections to this model of knowledge are not epistemological, rather they are metaphysical. One fairly obvious worry is that this view relies on a very tenuous view of freedom, namely that freedom is compatible with determinism. But for many this sounds crazy. What could be any less free than being wholly determined?

Another problem is that it seems that God is the author of not only the good and redemptive acts in the world, but also pain, suffering, and in general, all the evil. Since God’s plan includes evil, human actions as a component, and God’s will is sufficient for bringing about his plan, it would seem that God is the ultimate cause of evil. Although this problem of evil is something that all theists must deal with, it is particularly difficult for the determinist. A defender of DK will either want to argue that this is the best world God could create, or that even if we cannot show that it is, there may be reasons of which we are unaware for why God permits so much evil. [For further objections see remarks against Paul Helm’s view in Beilby and Eddy (2001) and also see Craig (1999)].

ii. Molinism (Middle Knowledge)

Middle knowledge or as it is often called, Molinism, after the 16th century Jesuit theologian Luis de Molina, is also a deductive model (See Middle Knowledge). Like the previous two models, Molinism is not committed to the idea that God is essentially in time. However, Molinists want to maintain a strong view of human freedom and reject the idea that human freedom is compatible with determinism. Their response to the IOF argument is to show that it is invalid because God can know the future, whether in time or not, and humans can still be significantly free. (More will be said below to flesh out precisely how they would respond.)

Like most theories of God’s omniscience, Molinism says that God knows a number of things a priori or self-evidently, for example, necessary mathematical and logical truths, as well as truths about God’s nature, the nature of uncreated creatures, and so on. This is God’s natural knowledge. God also has free knowledge. This is knowledge of contingent truths, such as the truth that “God creates this world,” that “Adam eats the fruit,” and that “the Steelers win the Super Bowl in 2006.” God’s free knowledge is known by God subsequent to acts of God’s free will.

But the Molinist account of how some of this free knowledge is arrived at is different than the account given by some DK advocates who allow that the future is contingent. On the (non-fatalistic) DK model, all of God’s free knowledge of contingent truths is arrived at because of the contingency of God’s causal activity. It is contingently true (and not necessarily true) that Adam eats the fruit only because it is possible that God determine Adam not to eat the fruit. The Molinist rejects this deterministic way of thinking about God’s knowledge and instead posits that God arrives at free knowledge of creaturely actions by deducing it from (a) God’s free knowledge of his own actions and from (b) his middle knowledge of what creatures would do in certain situations that God could place them in. Thus a proper description of God’s knowledge of the future crucially hinges on an account of God’s middle knowledge.

Like natural knowledge, God’s middle knowledge is known prior to God’s free knowledge. But middle knowledge is like free knowledge in that the truths of middle knowledge are contingent and not necessary. Here is an example: “If Eve were in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit, then Eve would freely choose to eat the fruit after being placed in these circumstances.” (More generally, items of middle knowledge are subjunctive conditionals of the form “if x were in circumstance C, x would do A.”)

Using this example we can see how God uses it in order to deduce knowledge of the future:

1. Natural Knowledge: It is possible that Eve and a snake are created in a garden and possible that Eve will freely choose to eat the fruit.
2. Middle knowledge: If Eve were in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit, then Eve would freely choose to eat the fruit after being placed in these circumstances.
3. Free knowledge: God creates Eve in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat the fruit.
4. Free knowledge (of the future): Thus Eve will freely choose to eat the fruit.

The argument is stated in the logical order of God’s knowledge. First, God surveys all the necessary truths which reveals all the possible circumstances that he can create, in this case that it is possible that God create the garden with Eve and the snake in it. God then surveys his middle knowledge to see what Eve would freely do if placed in these circumstances. He then elicits an act of will to create this world or some set of circumstances in the world and thus knows the actual circumstances of the world. Since he knows the circumstances of the actual world and what will happen given those circumstances, he is able to deduce the future.

Middle knowledge (allegedly) gives God perfect providential control of the future. To see how, we must make a distinction between different kinds of conditional statements known by Middle Knowledge. All conditionals about what creatures would freely do are subjunctive conditionals and can be called “subjunctives of freedom.” Within subjunctives of freedom it is worth distinguishing between what might be called factuals and counterfactuals of freedom. A factual of freedom is a true conditional statement about a creature in which the antecedent (the first half of the conditional) and the consequent (the second half of the conditional) are both true. Factuals of freedom are what God uses to deduce knowledge of the future. A counterfactual of freedom is a conditional statement in which the antecedent is (contingently) false and describes a set of circumstances that is contrary to fact, for example, “If Eve were alive today, she would be the First Lady.” According to Molinism, God knows both factuals and counterfactuals of freedom. His knowledge is comprehensive. He knows what people will do when placed in actual circumstances and he knows what they would choose to do if they were placed in other circumstances that God and his creatures never bring about. Knowing both kinds of subjunctives of freedom enables God to see what his creatures would do in any kind of circumstances and allows God to survey all the possible worlds that he might create and choose one that he thinks is good enough to create.

Molinism has a number of attractive features if correct. First, it offers a clear way to describe God’s knowledge of the future as deductive. Second, it retains a robust theory of human freedom. But perhaps just as important, it does not sacrifice God’s providence at the expense of freedom. God is still free to create whatever sorts of worlds he deems feasible by surveying what any particular creature from any species would do if placed in certain situations by God. Thus when God creates, he is not at all surprised by anything about his creation or any actions which his creatures will do because he knows all the circumstances that he will create them in and by his middle knowledge knows exactly what they will do in those circumstances.

To return now to the IOF argument against the compatibility of God’s omniscience with human freedom, we can now give an account of the complex response the Molinist has at his disposal. (For a more in-depth response see Foreknowledge and Freewill).

Although Molinism tends to lend itself to the view that God is atemporal, there is nothing about the position which entails that it must take a position on God’s relationship with time as the perceptual model must. Thus the following response to the IOF argument is presented on behalf of Molinists who believe God is in time (since the atemporal Molinist could simply reject the first premise that God is essentially in time).

The strategy for the temporal-Molinist is to accept the premises of the argument, but object that once the argument is fully understood it will be found to be invalid. There is nothing in the argument that leads to the conclusion that either people are not free or that God cannot have knowledge of free actions. To see how this reply works, it will be useful to first present the problem from a DK model perspective only now cast in Molinist terms. According to the DK advocate, God knows the future exclusively just by knowing his free knowledge of God’s decision to determine the kind of world he wants. His knowledge of what he will do is logically prior to his creating and his knowledge entails what will unfold in the world. So God’s free knowledge does in some sense determine everything and limits human freedom.

But for the Molinist, God knows prior to any decision to create what his creatures would freely do in all circumstances by way of Middle Knowledge. His free knowledge of the future is posterior to his knowledge of what creatures would freely do. So God’s Middle Knowledge, which is only of what creatures would freely do, does not determine what they in fact do. Nor does God’s free knowledge determine what they would freely do since his free knowledge is posterior to God’s Middle Knowledge.

Returning now the IOF argument, prior to Ryan’s actions, God knows what Ryan would freely do if Ryan were placed in certain circumstances. But this knowledge in no way causes Ryan to do what he does, for it just says what Ryan would freely do, not what he must do. Ryan is the cause of his actions, and it is the fact that he does freely choose to refrain from watching TV that makes God’s belief true from all eternity that Ryan would freely refrain from watching TV if given the day off from work. [For a defense of Molinism see Craig (1999) and Flint (1989)].


There are two problematic questions for Middle Knowledge. One is, on what basis are these conditionals of freedom known? This is an epistemic question about how God is justified in his knowledge of subjunctives of freedom. Second, what are the truth-makers of these conditionals? This is a metaphysical question about the explanation for what makes these conditionals true.

Consider first the epistemic problems having to do with God’s evidence for knowing the future. According to Molinism God knows the future by deducing it in part from factuals of freedom which are contingently true. But factuals of freedom are not themselves deduced from anything, they are known directly by one of God’s Non-inferential Faculties. But by which one? As contingent truths they cannot be known a priori, since a priori knowledge is only of necessary truths. Moreover they are obviously not known by perception, memory, kinesthetic awareness, or testimony. This leaves introspection as the last option. Yet it is a complete mystery what God could know about himself that would yield evidence of what his creatures would freely do if placed in certain circumstances. So it looks as if the Molinist must posit some unknown faculty by which God knows factuals of freedom (as wells as counterfactuals of freedom). But then this account of God’s foreknowledge which started out as a deductive model—modeled after human knowledge—is at bottom wholly inscrutable. Why not, then, just say that God somehow knows the future instead of complicating things with a deductive account?

This kind of objection can be put in a slightly different way. How is it that God knows which of the true subjunctives of freedom are factuals rather than counterfactuals of freedom? Recall that a factual of freedom has a true antecedent and a counterfactual of freedom a false antecedent. But the truth or falsity of the antecedent cannot be known prior to God’s creative activity. For instance, God only knows that it is true that “Eve is in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit” after he creates her in these circumstances and knows that it is false that “A Martian is in the garden in the circumstances in which a serpent tempts her to eat fruit” after he decides not to create Martians. But then God cannot know which subjunctive of freedom (that has either the information about Eve or the Martian in the antecedent) should be used in an argument to deduce what will happen in the future prior to his creating.

It might be tempting for the temporal-Molinist to think that someone’s past actions or present character will provide sufficient evidence. But again, this will not help God prior to his decision to create his creatures. His creative act must first be known in order to know what kinds of characters his creatures end up having.

Turning now to the metaphysical side of the problem, there is the difficulty of explaining what it is that makes subjunctives of freedom true. It cannot be a fact about the creatures themselves, for God is supposed to have Middle Knowledge before there are any creatures. Perhaps, then, it is a fact about uninstantiated creaturely essences. God might know a lot about Eve and Martians even before he creates them because he knows the essence of these creatures just like he would know the essence of plants and other kinds of animals before he creates them. But it is strange to think that Eve’s essence could provide knowledge of what she will freely do in certain circumstances. If she is free and not determined to act by the circumstances in which she is created, there is some possible world in which she is placed in the same set of circumstances and freely does not eat the apple. But then there is nothing about her essence which necessitates what she will in fact do when placed in those circumstances—for Eve is essentially Eve in the circumstances in which she freely eats of the fruit and freely refrains from eating. But if not creaturely essences as the ground of the truth of subjunctives of freedom, what then?

It needs to be pointed out that none of the objections to middle knowledge show that God could not have deductive knowledge of the future. At best what the objections show is that Middle Knowledge bottoms out in a mystery. In order to offer a satisfying explanation of how God knows the future, a Molinist must provide an answer to these questions. [For objections to Molinism see Hasker (1989), (2000), and Beilby and Eddy (2001).]

d. Intuitional Knowledge of the Future

Of the three theories presented so far, the only one which has been a model of direct knowledge of the future has been the Boethian perceptual theory. The other two models describe God as having indirect knowledge of the future via deduction. The intuitive model is another account of how God might have knowledge of the future directly. But instead of God having this knowledge via perception God has the knowledge either innately or as a kind of immediate a priori grasp of the truth about the future.

The intuitive model is compatible with God being temporal or atemporal. If the atemporal model is preferred, the intuitionist can respond to the IOF argument in the same way that Boethius does by rejecting the first premise of the argument which says that God is in time. If the temporal model is preferred, the intuitionist can argue like the Molinist that the argument is invalid. The intuitive model of God’s foreknowledge offers no unique objection to the IOF argument.

Here is an account of God’s intuitive knowledge. Intuitive knowledge is knowledge which is in some sense internal to the knower. One can have intuitive knowledge of something without external evidence to justify it. Many have thought that mathematical knowledge is like this. Yes, a human might need external objects to become aware of certain propositions, but they do not need external evidence to be justified in believing the propositions. For instance, it may be true that children need to have symbols of numbers written on a chalk board, or have two blocks presented to them with two other blocks presented to them in order to at first become aware that 2+2 really does equal 4. But the chalk and the blocks are not evidence that 2+2=4; they are more like physical tools (like their own brain) that gets their mind to be aware of the proposition 2+2=4. But once they become aware of the proposition, they just see that it is true. They may even think, “Of course, I’ve always known that!” Some truths we just seem to know in this intuitive way.

If it is true that humans know some things intuitively, it would seem that God does too. Moreover it would seem that unlike humans, God would not even need physical objects like chalk and toy blocks to become aware that 2+2=4. God, it is assumed, could have innate knowledge of mathematical and logical truths without physical objects either helping him to become aware of propositions, making the propositions true, or justifying God’s belief in the propositions. But, the intuitionist argues, if God can know a number of propositions intuitively, why not think that God knows the future intuitively too?

One advantage of the intuitionist position is its flexibility. For instance, since the intuitionist position is silent with regard to God’s relationship to time the intuitionist is able to adopt whatever theory seems best on its own merits and can respond to IOF type arguments with many of the previously mentioned replies. Similarly, the intuitionist position itself makes no claims about the compatibility of God’s actions with human freedom leaving the intuitionist unconstrained in adopting a libertarian or compatibilist view of freedom. Finally, if the future is known exhaustively by intuition, then it would seem that God’s providential control would not be restricted. [For a brief defense of intuitive knowledge of the future see Craig (1999)].


As just mentioned, the advantage of the intuitionist position is its ability to be flexible and meet a wide range of objections. But this is taken by some as insight into its weakness. The reason why the intuitive account might seem invulnerable to objection is because it can hardly be considered a theory about how God knows at all. The perceptual view and the deductive models at least offer a model of understanding with which we are all quite familiar. This is why it seems that most defenders of God’s knowledge of the future begin with the previously mentioned models and only give them up after much resistance. The intuitionist model seems like a last ditch effort to retain an explanation of God’s foreknowledge if the other models fail. How does God know the future, if the other models fail? He just does, the intuitionist answers, in the same way that we know 2+2=4. But without anything further to add, it can hardly be thought to be an explanation for how God knows the future.

Another reason to think that the intuitionist model is an ad hoc explanation is because most of our intuitions which we count as knowledge are necessary truths, like 2+2=4. Thus intuitive knowledge is often characterized as a priori knowledge (See A priori intuition above). Often it is argued that such truths are either known by knowing the meaning of the terms or are known by grasping the abstract objects involved (in the example, numbers and their relations). But, unless one adopts a fatalist version of the DK model, truths about the future are thought to be wholly contingent. But a priori knowledge is not of contingent truths and thus cannot be how God directly intuits the future.

A second way of characterizing intuitive knowledge is as a kind of introspection. As was discussed above, William Alston recently has appealed to Aquinas’ view, which says that that God knows the future by knowing creaturely essences which are ultimately contained in God’s essence (See Does God have Beliefs? above). This is a very mysterious doctrine (For further elaboration of Aquinas’ view, see Stump).

A final reply is to treat God’s intuitions like intuitions of people who are clairvoyant or psychic. A few studies suggest that some humans have abilities to know extraordinary things by being presented with images of the future or some event taking place well beyond their vision. Such knowledge is of contingent truths. Still, the skeptic may balk at using such questionable instances of knowledge as an illustration analogous to God’s infallible grasp of the future.

e. Limited Knowledge of the Future: Open Theism

Like Molinists, Open Theists are strongly committed to the idea that humans have libertarian freedom. However Open Theists are skeptical that God has the kind of comprehensive knowledge that all of the previous views claim. If faced with the IOF argument given above, the Open Theist will give up the idea that God exhaustively knows the future or will argue that even if God knows the future, his certainty of the future is not strong enough to cause problems for human freedom. Open Theists think that God is in time and that there are at least some tensed and non-tensed statements that God does not know with absolute certainty.

At a minimum, Open Theism is the doctrine that the future has not yet been fully decided, it is “open” to what is not yet completely known by God or anyone else. There are a number of different ways that this “openness” can be explained and defended, some more radical than others. We will first turn to the more radical position and then the more moderate.

i. No Knowledge of the Future

An Open Theist could think that God has no knowledge at all of the future for several reasons. One is because there is no future to know anything about. On either a Presentist view of time (only the present exists) or an Expanding Universe view of time (the growing past is real as well as the present), the future is denied existence. Only what is present exists, or perhaps the past along with the present. But if the future does not exist, then there is nothing to make the following sorts of propositions true “In 2021, a Republican is President;” or “A Republican will be President in 2021.” There is no future to ground the truth of the propositions, so the propositions lack a truth-value.

In response it is fair to note that this position is somewhat radical because it forces one to deny a widely held principle called The Principle of Bivalence: For any proposition, it must be either true or false. The Open Theist of the sort being described can accept that there are propositions about the future but must deny that any are true because there is nothing to make them true. But this does not mean they are false either since there is no contradictory future state of affairs to render the propositions false. The propositions’ truth-values have yet to be decided, but in the present, they lack a truth-value. To fully meet this argument from the Open Theist, one must either defend the view that the future does exist in some sense or that there can be abstract future facts which make propositions about the future true, even if the future does not exist.

A second way to argue that God cannot know the future is to deny that there really are propositions or beliefs about the future. If there were no propositions/beliefs about the future then there could not be knowledge of the future. In order to make sense of what seem like perfectly good claims about the future that we ordinarily make, it can be argued that claims seemingly about the future are really only about the past or present. For example, a statement such as “Amy will go to the store this Tuesday” really just expresses the proposition “Right now, Amy’s dispositions are such that, if it were Tuesday, it would be likely that Amy would go to the store.” So on this view, all statements about God’s purported future knowledge are really just statements which express propositions about the present or the past.

This position is fairly radical and has a limited number of proponents (See Fischer, 23-24). The basic reason against it is that most think that they really are saying something about the future and not just the present. It is very hard to believe that most humans are this confused about what they are saying. Surely even if they are wrong that what they are expressing is true, they are saying something about what will happen and not just about they way things currently are.

Finally, a third line of argument that God cannot know the future at all accepts that there are true propositions about the future but denies that God is or could be justified in believing these propositions to the extent that this justification yields knowledge. For instance, a person could have a true belief that it will rain tomorrow but not know this because the inductive evidence for this belief is just too unreliable. Accordingly, there may not be enough current evidence for God to know with certainty what the future holds.

The trouble with this position is that it seems unlikely that God could not know at least some propositions about the future. It is likely that God could know with certainty some propositions about what he will do, for instance that “God will create plants on the third day,” and also some propositions which are entailed by the present state of affairs taken together with the laws of nature. If God knew all the laws of nature that he established involving gravity and saw at time t1 that a rock is falling, that the wind is blowing at such and such a speed, and so forth, God could know with certainty where the rock will be at some subsequent time t2.

ii. Limited Deductive and Inductive Knowledge of the Future

Some Open Theists think that God has some knowledge of the future but not exhaustive knowledge. God knows with absolute certainty some things that he will do—such as judge the righteous and the wicked—even if he may not know exactly who all those righteous and wicked people will turn out to be. God also knows some future events that are determined by past events taken together with binding laws of nature. He knows exactly where the sun will be in 2025 because he knows where the sun is in 2020 and knows what the laws of nature will determine the sun and every other planetary object to do. In general, God can know everything about the future which can be validly deduced from the present or past.

But as has been noted previously, there is a class of propositions which God cannot know with absolute certainty, perhaps some indeterminate events which take place on the quantum level and future free actions by God’s creatures. Those that think that God cannot know these future events at all, appeal to arguments raised above by the more radical Open Theists—only applying the arguments just to this class of propositions.

An even less radical kind of Open Theist will grant God exhaustive knowledge of the future—or something close to it—but will insist that God’s knowledge of free creaturely actions is never infallible. How then does God know what creatures will do in the future? He knows by induction rather than deduction (See Inferential Faculties above). God can know the characters of people by perceiving the way they are presently disposed to act. He also has memories of what particular creatures have done in past situations. Given all this knowledge, God can know with a high degree of epistemic probability what will happen in the future.

But God may end up having some false beliefs. Someone’s past actions and present character are good indicators of what creatures will do, but if they are genuinely free they could always act differently or do something uncharacteristic. Thus, if God reasons inductively, it is quite probable that he gets some things wrong. But even if he does not, his knowledge is still fallible because his evidence never guarantees its conclusion.

Above it was mentioned that this view “will grant God exhaustive knowledge of the future—or something close to it.” But it is highly probable that God could not have exhaustive inductive knowledge of the future because of the problem of dwindling probabilities. To see the problem, consider God’s knowledge that the Eiffel tower will be built. It is hard to see how God could have inductive knowledge of the Eiffel tower two hundred years prior to its being built. For instance, God would need to know which couples would be married in the future and which will have grandchildren that will be engineers, how Paris’s economy will shape up, whether Paris will be bombed to smithereens in two hundred years and so forth.

Each item in the previous list will need to be assigned some epistemic probability reflecting the likelihood of its truth. Suppose God sees that it is highly probable that Paris’ economy will have sufficient resources for the Eiffel tower, say, he is 90% sure of this. Allow also that God thinks it is highly probable that there will in fact be a good number of engineers in France in two hundred years; again, he is 90% sure. But notice that God will be less sure that both of these things take place. The probability that both will take place can be figured by multiplying the percentages of each which yields an 81% probability. But there are hundreds, perhaps thousands, of factors which need to be considered to determine if the Eiffel Tower will be built. And there are millions of free decisions which will be made. Once all of these probabilities are taken into consideration, the probability that the Eiffel Tower will be built must be extremely small. What this example shows is that if God does have inductive knowledge, it is probably only of a very limited number of things which are not very far into the future. [For a more extended defense of Open Theism see Hasker (2002), (2000), (1989), Hasker et al. (1994), and Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (2002)].


Some objections have already been mentioned against the arguments that God has no knowledge of the future. The objections to the more limited view will also be objections against the more radical position. Here, then, are a few more problems leveled against Open Theism as a whole.

First is the basic complaint that Open Theism has a new and unorthodox view of God’s knowledge. Of all the views presented, it is the one which thinks of God’s knowledge as most limited. This not only puts constraints on the scope of God’s foreknowledge but this will normally entail a revision of the traditional conception of omniscience as Having knowledge of all true propositions. (Thus Open Theists find Comparative Analyses of God’s Omniscience more conducive to their position).

Open Theists will argue that there are numerous scriptures which support their view—passages which suggest that God regrets creating people, that he changes his mind if people will repent, and that God interacts with his people, responding to them as he learns what they will do. Opponents protest that these readings are anthropomorphic. But the ambiguity of the passages suggests that the disagreement can only be settled by philosophical considerations.

Another problem is that since God learns, God changes. As was already mentioned above this entails that Open Theists must deny God’s immutability. Again, the Open Theist may reply that God’s immutability allows for some changes in God, just not changes involving his impeccable character and love for his creatures.

A third objection is that Open Theism diminishes God’s sovereignty and providence. The Open Theist thinks that it is an advantage of his view that God can relate to and respond to creatures. But the problem with this is if God does not know the future exhaustively, he cannot be of as much help to his creatures since he will be surprised about some things that happen. He can only react to terrible circumstances, but cannot prevent all of them.

Finally, a reoccurring objection is that, if anything, arguments presented by Open Theists just show that competing views have problems and that there is no fully satisfying way of explaining in human terms how God can know the future. But this does not show that God does not know the future. The Open Theist is thus mistaken in concluding that God does not know the future from her failure to understand how it can be known. [For further objections to Open Theism see Flint (1989) and Beilby and Eddy (2001).]

5. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. P. (1987). “Does God Have Beliefs,” Religious Studies, 22, 287-306; reprinted in Divine Nature and Human Language: Essays in Philosophical Theology, Cornell University Press, 1989.
  • Augustine (1976). On Grace and Free Will, in Basic Writings of Saint Augustine, vol. I, ed. W. J. Oates, Baker Book House.
  • Boethius (2001). Consolation of Philosophy, trans. Joel C. Relihan, Hackett Publishing.
  • Beilby, J. K. and P. R. Eddy, eds. (2001). Divine Foreknowledge: Four Views, InterVarsity Press.
  • Craig, W. L. (1999). The Only Wise God: The Compatibility of Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom, Wipf and Stock Publishers.
  • Craig, W. L. (1988). The Problem of Divine Foreknowledge and Future Contingents from Aristotle to Suarez, E. J. Brill.
  • Fischer, J. M. (1989). God, Foreknowledge, and Freedom, Stanford University Press.
  • Flint, T. (1989). Divine Providence: The Molinist Account, Cornell University Press.
  • Hasker, W. (2002). “The Antinomies of Divine Providence,” Philosophia Christi, 4: 361-376.
  • Hasker, W. (2000). “Anti-Molinism is Undefeated!” Faith and Philosophy, 17: 126-131.
  • Hasker, W. (1989). God, Time, and Knowledge, Cornell University Press.
  • Hasker, W. (1988). “Yes, God Has Beliefs!” Religious Studies, 24: 385-394.
  • Hasker, W., C. H. Pinnock, R. Rice, J. Sanders (1994). The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God, InterVarsity Press.
  • Hoffman, J. and G. S. Rosenkrantz (2002). The Divine Attributes, Blackwell Publishing.
  • Hunt, D. (1995). “Dispositional Omniscience,” Philosophical Studies, 80: 243-278. The Koran (1999). Trans. N. J. Dawood, Penguin.
  • Kvanvig, J. (1986). The Possibility of An All Knowing God, St. Martin’s.
  • Kvanvig, J. (1989). “Unknowable Truths and the Doctrine of Omniscience,” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, 57: 485-507.
  • Marenbon, J. (2003). Boethius, Oxford University Press.
  • McCann, H. J. (2001). “Divine Providence,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, http://plato.stanford.edu/entries/providence-divine/
  • de Molina, L. (1988). On Divine Foreknowledge: Part IV of the Concordia, tr. A. J. Freddoso, Cornell University Press.
  • Rosenkrantz, G. S. (1993). Haecceity: An Ontological Essay, Kluwer.
  • Stump, E. (2003). “Chapter 5: God’s Knowledge,” in Aquinas, Routledge.
  • Taliaferro, C. (1993). “Unknowable Truths and Omniscience: A Reply to Kvanvig,” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, 61: 553-566.
  • Wetzel, T. (2001). “Predestination, Pelagianism, and Foreknowledge,” in The Cambridge Companion to Augustine, N. Kretzmann and E. Stump eds., Cambridge University Press: 49-58.
  • Wierenga, E. (1989). The Nature of God: An Inquiry into Divine Attributes, Cornell University Press.

Author Information

Tully Borland
Email: tborland@purdue.edu
Purdue University
U. S. A.

George Santayana (1863—1952)

santayanGeorge Santayana was an influential 20th century American thinker whose philosophy connected a rich diversity of historical perspectives, culminating in a unique and unrivaled form of materialism, one recommending a bold reconciliation of spirit and nature. Santayana was also a poet, and he wrote a work of fiction, The Last Puritan, that was a Book of the Month Club selection in 1936, the same year he adorned the cover of Time magazine. Though he spent his formative intellectual life in America and ultimately is best categorized philosophically in that tradition, Santayana spent the better part of his life and publishing career in Europe. He spent his early childhood in his birth-country of Spain and throughout his expansive travels and residencies never relinquished his native citizenship. Displaying in both composition and criticism a prodigious literary imagination, Santayana’s writings appealed to a wide audience, and he remains to this day one of the most quoted of twentieth century thinkers. Probably the most well-known sentence of Santayana’s is also one of the least accurately quoted: “Those who cannot remember the past are condemned to repeat it” (The Life of Reason: Reason in Common Sense. Scribner’s, 1905: 284). Scholarly interest in Santayana today remains modest but diverse. Santayana was a thinker of rare stature whose work deserves the highest compliment of all: it can and may well still be read millennia from now.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Philosophy
    1. Ontology and Epiphenomenalism
    2. Realms and Terminology
    3. Realms Defined
  4. Naturalism in World Perspective
  5. Legacy
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. MIT Press Critical Editions
    2. Other Santayana Works
    3. Books About Santayana

1. Life

George Santayana was born on December 16, 1863 in Madrid, Spain. He lived his first eight years in Spain, his next forty years in Boston, and his last forty years in Europe. Accordingly, Santayana arranged his life in his autobiography, Persons and Places, in three parts: (1) “Background,” (2) “On Both Sides of the Atlantic,” and (3) “All on One Side.” The Background (1863-1886) encompassed his childhood in Ávila, Spain, through his undergraduate years at Harvard. The second period, during which Santayana traveled between the U.S. and Europe, covered his Harvard years (1886-1912), both as graduate student (Ph.D. 1889) and professor. The third period (1912-1952) was that of the retired professor writing and traveling in Europe, and eventually adopting Rome as his center of activity.

Santayana’s birth name was Jorge Agustín Nicolás Ruiz de Santayana. At the time of his birth Santayana’s father, Agustín Ruiz de Santayana, had only in the last few years met and married Josefina Borrás Sturgis, the recent widow of a Boston merchant named George Sturgis. While Agustín and Josefina united long enough to marry and produce young Jorge (the only child of their union), the two would ultimately part ways. Receiving financial support from her brother-in-law Robert (George Sturgis died leaving her little), Josefina decided to move herself and her surviving Sturgis children to Boston while for eight years young George and his father remained in Ávila. In 1872, father and son made the twelve-day sea voyage to Boston where Agustín briefly attempted to settle in with his wife and her Sturgis children, and, failing to do so, left young George with them to return to Spain in the spring of 1873. This early uprooting and estrangement from his father surely had a deep emotional impact on Santayana, and indeed in his autobiography he characterizes the move as a “moral disinheritance.”

Santayana had a rich early education, spending eight years at the Boston Latin School. He revealingly reflects on those early years (the fall of 1874 through 1882), in his autobiography: “…I know I was solitary and unhappy, out of humor with everything that surrounded me, and attached only to a persistent dream-life, fed on books of fiction, on architecture and on religion.” Besides Latin, students of the Boston Latin School studied Greek, Mathematics, History, French, English Composition, Literature, and Rhetoric. Through this exposure Santayana managed to develop a life-long appreciation for classical and medieval worlds and their cultural contributions, to a great extent preferring them to modern offerings. These appreciations would contribute a breadth of historical perspective to Santayana’s mature philosophical works that is unrivaled by his American contemporaries.

In his early education Santayana nurtured a love of poetry and even entertained seriously the possibility of becoming an architect. Entering Harvard upon graduation from the Latin School in 1882, Santayana respectively took his undergraduate and graduate degrees (B.A., ’86, Ph.D. ‘89), benefiting incalculably from the philosophical mentorship of his teachers, amongst whom were two of the most famous “golden age” Harvard philosophers: William James and Josiah Royce. Upon successful completion of his doctorate, Santayana, by now fully committed to the discipline, began teaching philosophy at Harvard in the fall of 1889. He would remain there until his departure at the zenith of academic success. In 1912 Santayana took advantage of a modest inheritance from the death of his mother to retire from Harvard, and left for Europe indefinitely.

As to his time in America, though he does offer the occasional fond or sympathetic reflection, Santayana largely hated academic life and commercialism and the dead Puritanism that he identified in his novel The Last Puritan. Probably referring obliquely to his own eventual feelings of exile in America, Santayana wrote: “It is natural for a man to like to live at home, and to live long elsewhere without a sense of exile is not good for his moral integrity” (Winds of Doctrine, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1913, pg. 6).

He left the U.S. to live an intellectually free life in Oxford, Paris, and, after 1925, Rome. Unsuccessful in his efforts to leave Rome before World War II, on October 14, 1941 he entered the Clinica della Piccola Compagna di Maria, or “Convent of the Blue Nuns,” a hospital-clinic where he lived until his death in September of 1952. He is buried in the only Spanish plot in Rome’s Campo Verano Cemetery.

2. Writings

Next to Ralph Waldo Emerson, Santayana is arguably one of the best writers in the Classical American tradition. Most philosophers tend to read Santayana as a literary figure (which he is) rather than a serious philosopher (which he is also), part of which has to do with the fact that his publications strike in both directions simultaneously: an oddity from the perspective of a public that tends to quarantine the two areas of interest.

His philosophical works reflect two distinct periods, the early “humanistic” period in which he composed The Sense of Beauty (1896), Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1900), and the five-volume The Life of Reason (1905-6); and the later “ontological” period which yielded Scepticism and Animal Faith (1923), and the four-volume ontology titled Realms of Being (between 1927 and 1940).

Santayana sometimes repudiated his earlier work, in part for its having the taint of academic life. He especially spoke down at times about the Life of Reason series for its association with the progressivism of the day, and it was later edited by Santayana and his late-life personal assistant and secretary, Daniel Cory, with the intent of removing some of its more humanistic overtones.

These authorial disparagements notwithstanding, The Life of Reason series holds up as one of the greatest philosophical works of the early half of the twentieth century. His peer and adversarial contemporary John Dewey praised the series in a review of 1907 as “the most adequate contribution America has yet made—always excepting Emerson—to moral philosophy” (John Dewey, in John Dewey: The Middle Works, Volume 4 [1907-1909], edited by Jo Ann Boydston, Southern Illinois University Press, 1977: 241). The series would have a lasting influence on naturalistic philosophy in the twentieth century.

In his budding writing career Santayana also published a volume of poetry (an 1894 collection titled Sonnets and Other Verses). Nevertheless his poetic muse would fade with the passing of years. Despite in his early years attracting a near-cult following of Harvard poets, and later maintaining the same mentorship through their Rome pilgrimages, letters, and solicitations of feedback, Santayana’s literary exertions would be restricted to fiction and philosophy.

Early in his career at Harvard, Santayana would feel the pressure to produce a work of philosophy. The Sense of Beauty (1896)—an exercise in aesthetic formalism—was culled from a series of lectures he gave between 1892 and 1893 as a newly appointed Harvard professor. The book contains the famous definition of beauty as “pleasure regarded as a quality of the thing.” To this day The Sense of Beauty is arguably the most widely read of Santayana’s philosophical corpus. This is most likely due to its restrictive scope in comparison to his other philosophical works, while there has been the tendency for Santayana’s more ambitious philosophy to be neglected. This neglect probably will subside with the ongoing MIT Press Critical Edition publications of The Works of Santayana, edited by William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr.

After The Sense of Beauty, Santayana published Interpretations of Poetry and Religion in 1900, a work which famously provoked William James—Santayana’s then-recent colleague—to characterize his philosophy as a “perfection of rottenness.” The book also provoked a key recognition from the other of Santayana’s early influential mentors, and also dissertation advisor, Josiah Royce. Santayana relates that Royce told him around the time of Interpretations that “the gist of [his] philosophy [is] the separation of essence from existence” (“Apologia Pro Mente Sua” in The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana, edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp, New York: Tudor Publishing, pg. 497). The ontological categories of “essence” and “matter” would become key components of Santayana’s mature philosophy. (See section 3c.)

Besides being a poet, philosopher, and novelist, Santayana was a hugely influential cultural critic. In a trenchant 1911 address before the Philosophical Union in California he coined the term “genteel tradition” and memorably provided the characterization of America as an “old wine in new bottles.” He wrote many similarly speculatively rich essays diagnosing the cultural character of the America of his time, some of which included penetrating philosophical criticisms of his contemporaries and former teachers, James and Royce. These diagnoses were early collected in the volume Character and Opinion in the United States (1920).

None of Santayana’s writings stray entirely from philosophical considerations, including his only fictional novel. Santayana authored a single best-selling work of fiction titled The Last Puritan, published in 1936. He spent several of his post-Harvard years composing the book, and many of the main characters reflect personalities close to the author. The main theme of the novel (co-titled: “Memoir in the Form of a Novel”) is of interest for its enhancing one’s understanding of Santayana’s view towards America. It chronicles the tragic, sacrificial life of Oliver Alden, the title-subject, a romantic and pious youth whose inner religious sensibilities conflict with the pulsating natural life around him. Alden is from one standpoint a sympathetic character, one with whom the author himself admitted affinities. But from another standpoint the protagonist represented the tragic contemporary American as Santayana understood him—partly in reaction to troubled young poets and artists Santayana knew from his Harvard days.

Santayana’s broader cultural criticism can be found in such works as Winds of Doctrine (1913) and the beautiful and unforced Soliloquies in England (1922), remarkably written amidst the uncertain, violent times of World War I. The latter is an exemplary instance—of which two others include Dialogues in Limbo (1926) and Platonism and the Spiritual Life (1927)—where one finds the post-Harvard Santayana following inspirations as they come, allowing both his literary imagination and penetrating philosophical eye to take equal share in the interpretive task.

These shorter works undoubtedly provided opportunities of creative release for Santayana as the ambitious project of conceiving a system of philosophy began to assert itself. In 1923 Scepticism and Animal Faith (hereafter SAF), the introductory text to his four-volume system of philosophy was published. SAF is one of the few Santayana works to have remained in print up to the present. The book introduces the terminology and critical background of his mature ontology, itself unfolded in four volumes over the period of thirteen years.

3. Philosophy

a. Ontology and Epiphenomenalism

Despite minor shifts in emphasis and Santayana’s own attitude towards his work, there is no radical break between the early humanistic Santayana, and the mature, ontological one. The same persistent distinction between ideals and natural grounds for those ideals—which he calls in his mature ontology “essence” and “matter”—holds throughout all of Santayana’s works; and the same abiding concern for reconciling moral with natural life remains intact.

As Royce had prophesied, an ontological distinction persisted throughout Santayana’s works: between “essence,” or the infinite realm of character embodiments that any existing thing must take on in order to be experienced by humans, and “existence,” or the groundless causal flux of nature that underlies any form whatsoever.

In the Life of Reason Santayana emphasizes the distinction between “perfections” or “ideals” and their “natural roots” which he sometimes calls a “natural ground” or “basis” for all action, thought and experience: “Every genuine ideal has a natural basis…Ideals are legitimate, and each initially envisages a genuine and innocent good; but they are not realizable together, nor even singly when they have no deep roots in the world.” Such ideals then are not Platonic forms, in that they have “roots” and bear the marks of their natural origins. Plato’s forms, on the contrary, are conceived as entirely foreign to natural origins.

But Santayana’s terminological shift from talking of ideals and natural grounds to talking of essence and matter perhaps did come at a certain cost. Throughout the evolution of his thinking Santayana holds to an increasing, and to many interpreters troubling, epiphenomenal view of consciousness. Briefly, epiphenomenalism is the view that mind is derivative, wholly caused, and has itself no causal power. Such strong epiphenomenalism comes out in the following passage from RB: “…the realm of matter cannot admit mind into its progressive structure and movement; each trope or rhythm must be complete before sensation can arise; so that this sensation is intrinsically a result and not a cause, a comment and not an agent…” If mind and sensation appear on the scene only as after-effects, one has to wonder how human experience can be considered fulfilling—how more specifically it can be anything but an ineffectual, spectator process.

There is however more than this to Santayana’s view of mind and accompanying story of human experience. To see this one needs a further understanding of the definitive concepts of his mature philosophy.

b. Realms and Terminology

The four realms of being Santayana identifies, in the order in which he published each RB volume, are essence, matter, truth, and spirit. The realms are said by Santayana to be “qualities of reality” (RB 183) (not themselves to be confused as parts of the cosmos), that are worth distinguishing to render human experience more fulfilling, intelligent, and edifying.

Santayana holds that the realms are irreducibly different and are for that reason worth distinguishing. The possibility that there are more realms is not something he dismisses; his only condition for an additional realm is that it be irreducibly distinct from the four he distinguishes.

As indicated, before introducing the realms individually Santayana set up their presentation through a penetrating and synthetic critical introduction, published in 1923 as Scepticism and Animal Faith. Understanding the project of SAF requires acquaintance with the meaning of key original concepts, amongst which are: “intuition,” “intent,” “psyche,” “animal faith,” and “skepticism.”

All belief, Santayana writes, is “a form of some faith in animal, material existence.” What Santayana calls “animal faith,” is the instinctive (if you will) and unavoidable tendency for human actions to betray a deep belief in the existence of matter. On Santayana’s account, one cannot act without believing in matter. According to Santayana, the denial in speech or dialectical skepticism of the existence of matter is a solipsistic, momentary pose. So philosophers like Descartes and Berkeley are transcendental posers, inflexibly denying in theory what they unhesitatingly affirm in practice. Worse yet, however: these Modern’s conflate functional orientations of the mind which Santayana respectively distinguishes as “intuition” and “intent.”

“Intuition” is for Santayana the contemplation or consciousness of an essence (more on these shortly) apart from belief in any particular existence. Santayana contrasts “intent” from intuition in order to capture the process of “taking” essences as existences. When we interact with, manipulate, engage, or otherwise encounter what we experience as physical objects, we are imbuing essences with intent—giving them a material existence they can never literally have. This process of intent is governed by the preferential makeup of what Santayana terms “psyche.”

The psyche is the material set of preferences that define individuality in organisms. The psyche is, very simply, the material manifestation of mind and as such it is imbued with, defined by, and stricken with belief. When one is believing, one is acting on behalf of one’s psyche. When one is intuiting essences without the addition of belief in their existence—be it a revery, daydream, or performative trance as in a locked moment of harmonious activity—one is communing spiritually with the realm of essence.

This raises the issue of skepticism: if we only ever have a symbolic grasp of material reality, and we can at any point imaginatively “escape” such symbolic play, what’s to keep us from relapsing into Cartesian (re)pose? The first ten chapters of SAF are an exercise in engaging Cartesianism, with the goal of pushing skepticism to its “ultimate” limits.

As a skeptic Descartes was half-hearted according to Santayana (as regards naturalism he also accused his contemporary John Dewey of this), in that he thought skepticism ceased with awareness of the self. For Santayana, nothing overcomes skepticism except pure intuition, the irony of which is the fact that pure intuition issues in the “discovery of essence,” which is itself a bankruptcy of knowledge (see “essence” below). So where Descartes had sought the most indubitable knowledge, and proceeded on the principle that such a thing could be achieved, Santayana tries to show in SAF that the principle of indubitable knowledge is itself a paradox; when knowledge is tested by way of a radical skepticism, and certainty is the ultimate goal, the paradox is that certainty is achieved only at the cost of knowledge itself. “Certainty,” for Santayana, is thus a transcendent vision of essence and as such has nothing to do with knowledge, much less with science.

So the goal of SAF is to bankrupt Cartesianism, and in doing so to suggest a new starting point for philosophy. That starting point is animal faith, the tacit acceptance of material reality as the source of understanding, knowledge, and common sense. Hence the title: “Skepticism AND Animal Faith”: we need skepticism to intellectually clear the way for, and at the same time to lead us back to, natural intelligence—to the realms themselves!

c. Realms Defined

Essence: The realm of essence should be understood to have a certain primacy since it is infinite and pertains to all of the forms or definite character embodiments that material objects and events may take on. Essence is what Santayana defines as the most radical sense in which anything is or has a character. Nothing—be it material objects, objects of thought, imaginings, flights of fancy, or objects of logical deduction—is experienced except through the mediation, or more accurately, “im-mediation” of essences. In his inimitable way, Santayana says of essences that they are “the only things people ever see and the last they notice.” Essences are said by Santayana to designate the realm of internal or intrinsic relations, and awareness of essences indicates a departure from what is called “knowledge,” which he defines as “faith mediated by symbols.” Awareness of essence is just that: awareness; it is direct and unmediated and as such entails no faith (belief in realities not given).

Matter: The catch however is that Santayana is a thoroughgoing materialist, in that he holds that no form can appear to human intuition without the previous establishment of material conditions for that form to arise. Matter is the primordial existential flux and is an unintelligible “surd.” This does not mean, however, that matter cannot be “known,” at least provisionally. Like Spinoza’s substance, existence or matter for Santayana has no purpose, but imposes external, natural limits to all activity. Those external limits define human life and mark off the boundaries between human understanding and the unfathomable depths of material existence. Santayana holds that humans know matter only at a remove, that is, (to repeat) symbolically. Matter is in fact referred to by Santayana as a “metaphor” only, producing one of the more provocative aspects of his philosophy: science is no less literary than poetry in representing matter in that it must express its truths at a remove, through the lens of human bias. In this sense Santayana’s materialism is, to use a contemporary term, “non-reductive.” Whatever scientists keep telling us of matter, while it is the hallmark of wisdom to defer everyday understanding to these experts (their findings do after all indicate a provisional advance upon previous understanding and serve contemporary sympathies very well), it is for Santayana only spiritual nearsightedness to deem such knowledge exhaustive of the cosmos.

Truth: As a fourth realm of being, truth wasn’t conceived by Santayana until after the first three (essence, matter and spirit) had been distinguished, and may therefore be justly supposed to have been introduced somewhat ad hoc. Whatever the reason, by 1913 (10 years before the publication of SAF) Santayana had conceived truth to round out his fourfold ontology. Truth is alleged by Santayana to be a subset of the infinite realm of essence. The realm of truth is the total inventory of essences instantiated by matter. The master metaphor for truth is given by Santayana in RB as: “Truth is the furrow which matter must plow upon the face of essence.” All events that take place entail concatenations of essences elected by matter for appearance in the course of human life, and their objective relations—factual arrangement, for example, that the terrorist attacks in America in 2001 took place on September 11th rather than the 12th—introduce the possibility of truth for human understanding.

Though there are similarities, Santayana’s view of truth differs in important respects from that of Classical pragmatists: truth for Santayana is fully objective and not necessarily presupposing of a cognizing agent; it is the necessary condition for the possibility of true opinions (Santayana appeals to the self-conscious act of lying as evidence of this fact); judgments are true if and only if they faithfully reproduce a portion of the descriptive properties of the process of the world coming, becoming, and going away into existence. These features of truth are guaranteed by the eternal status of the terms of its acknowledgement: essences.

Thus the pragmatist account of truth as what “works,” in the sense of what fits the current standard comprehensive description of the world is acceptable to Santayana so long as there is an understanding that the terms that make truth possible, namely, essences, are eternal, everlasting possibilities of experience that are not reducible to that experience. This is where Santayana especially departs from the pragmatist account of truth: it is not reducible to experience.

Spirit: Finally, Santayana distinguishes the realm of spirit, which is neither more nor less mysterious than one’s everyday understanding of consciousness. Santayana defines consciousness as the “total inner difference between being asleep and awake.” John Lachs has characterized Santayana’s spirit as that part of a life constituted by its series of intuitions. The native affinity of mind is, according to Santayana, to essence and not to fact. (This is an important outcome of his engagement with and overcoming of Cartesianism.) As such consciousness may play with appearances apart from the believing intent of the organic manifestation of mind (psyche); to the extent that it does so play, the spiritual life has been lived. Spirit is the ability of mind to turn natural events and experiences into appearances of themselves, and in so doing allow a healthy cosmic repose even as nature moves ceaselessly, beautifully, and sometimes destructively along.

In this way the core contribution of Santayana’s philosophy can be seen to culminate in a reconciliation of spirit and nature, two realities very much at odds in contemporary life. Santayana’s status as something of an “acquired taste” philosopher may plausibly be argued to be a function of his uncommon ability to uphold two sincere sympathies: on the one hand with Platonism and the spiritual life, and on the other with the life of reason which includes an openness to the advantages of three phases of moral life he called in that same-titled volume “pre-rational morality,” “rational ethics,” and “post-rational morality.”

4. Naturalism in World Perspective

As should not be surprising from what has been presented, Santayana consistently praises select philosophers and philosophies from history for what he considers their “naturalistic piety.” From the Ancient world, Santayana was deeply impressed with Lucretius, and also what he gleaned from Eastern Indian philosophy. Of the Modern philosophers, Santayana reserves his highest praise for Spinoza.

Backed by these historical allies, Santayana provides in a soliloquy a memorable (if partly irreverent) arrangement of world-philosophies:

…the progress of philosophy has not been of such a sort that the latest philosophers are the best: it is quite the other way…the later we come down in the history of philosophy the less important philosophy becomes, and the less true in fundamental matters.
Suppose I arrange the works of the essential philosophers—leaving out secondary and transitional systems—in a bookcase of four shelves; on the top shelf (out of reach since I can’t read the language) I will place the Indians; on the next the Greek naturalists; and to remedy the unfortunate paucity of their remains, I will add here those free inquirers of the renaissance, leading to Spinoza, who after two thousand years picked up the thread of scientific speculation; and besides, all modern science: so that this shelf will run over into a whole library of what is not ordinarily called philosophy. On the third shelf I will put Platonism, including Aristotle, the Fathers, the Scholastics, and all honestly Christian theology; and on the last, modern or subjective philosophy in its entirety. I will leave lying on the table, as of doubtful destination, the works of my contemporaries. There is much life in some of them. I like their water-colour sketches of self-consciousness, their rebellious egotisms, their fervid reforms of phraseology, their peep-holes through which some very small part of things may be seen very clearly: they have lively wits, but they seem to me like children playing blind-man’s-buff; they are keenly excited at not knowing where they are. (“The Progress of Philosophy,” in Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1922: 208-210)

Santayana recommends placing on the bottom, “inferior” shelves all the philosophy that is published, reprinted, and discussed in universities across the Western world today. This recommendation motivated one critic to characterize Santayana as a “defiant eclectic” (Charles Hartshorne, “Santayana’s Defiant Eclecticism” in The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. LXI. No. 1, 1964: 35-44), suggesting that his thinking amounts to a high-minded circumvention of the real problems of philosophy through the sublimation of a few eccentric doctrines. This point is still an issue among Santayana scholars. What is clear is that Santayana combined an indisputably rich reading of the history of philosophy with an unparalleled synoptic critical vision.

5. Legacy

Santayana’s philosophy has had a modest, unsettled legacy, one which nevertheless surprises in its continuing ability to attract sensibilities from across academic disciplines. While his thinking never has, and likely never will be, given to indoctrination or discipleship, it is clear that Santayana never conceived of these as important and justifiably suspected that such things were bad rather than good indications that a philosophy is worthy of the world it struggles to understand.

Still, a glowing campfire of devotion to Santayana’s work persists, first through the institutional support of the MIT Press and the staff of the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis (IUPUI); and second from the scholarly contributions made to the only Santayana journal, Overheard in Seville: Bulletin of the Santayana Society. The Bulletin is published annually and is edited by Angus Kerr-Lawson. The Santayana Society meets annually in December at the Eastern gathering of the American Philosophical Association and has recently been added to the proceedings of the annual meetings of the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy. MIT Press is in the process of publishing a critical edition of The Works of George Santayana, several of which are currently released.

The future of Santayana studies, whatever their course, will depend upon genuine interest in a non-reductive philosophical naturalism that expresses deep respect to religious sensibilities and leads the charge for the return to a conception of philosophy as a way of life rather than as a critical profession with little relevance to inner experience.

6. References and Further Reading

a. MIT Press Critical Editions

All works by George Santayana are undergoing republication as critical editions through MIT Press, under the editorship of William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr., and the editorial work of those affiliated with the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis.

  • Persons and Places (1987).
  • The Sense of Beauty (1988).
  • Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1990).
  • The Last Puritan (1994).
  • The Letters of George Santayana: Books I-VIII (2001-2008).

b. Other Santayana Works

  • Animal Faith and Spiritual Life. Edited by John Lachs. New York: Appleton-Century- Crofts, 1967.
  • The Birth of Reason and Other Essays. Daniel Cory, editor. New York and London: Columbia University Press, 1968.
  • Character and Opinion in the United States. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1921.
  • Dialogues in Limbo. The University of Michigan Press, 1948.
  • Dominations and Powers: Reflections on Liberty, Society, and Government. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1951.
  • Egotism in German Philosophy. Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1940.
  • Essays in Literary Criticism. Edited by Irving Singer. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1956.
  • The Genteel Tradition: Nine Essays by George Santayana. Lincoln and London: The University of Nebraska Press, 1967.
  • The Idea of Christ in the Gospels. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1946.
  • Life of Reason or The Phases of Human Progress, One Volume Edition. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1955.
  • Obiter Scripta. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1936.
  • The Philosophy of Santayana. Edited by Irwin Edman. The Modern Library, 1936.
  • Poems. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1923.
  • The Realms of Being. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1942.
  • Santayana on America: Essays, Notes, and Letters on American Life, Literature, and Philosophy. Edited by Richard Colton Lyon. New York: Harcourt, Brace & World, Inc., 1968.
  • Scepticism and Animal Faith. New York: Dover Publications, 1923, 1955.
  • Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1922.
  • Some Turns of Thought in Modern Philosophy. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1933.
  • Winds of Doctrine: Studies in Contemporary Opinion. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1913.

c. Books About Santayana

  • Ames, Van Meter. Proust and Santayana: The Aesthetic Way of Life. New York: Willett, Clark & Company, 1937.
  • Arnett, Willard E. Santayana and the Sense of Beauty. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1957.
  • Butler, Richard. The Life and World of George Santayana. Chicago: A Gateway Edition, 1960.
  • Coleman, Martin; Santayana Edition (IUPUI).  The Essential Santayana: Selected Writings.  Compiled with an introduction by Martin Coleman and the Santayana Edition at IUPUI.  Indiana University Press, 2009.
  • Cory, Daniel. The Letters of George Santayana. New York, Charles Scribner’s Sons: 1955.
  • Cory, Daniel. Santayana: The Later Years; A Portrait With Letters. New York: George Braziller, 1963.
  • Flamm, Matthew Caleb and Krzysztof Piotr Skowronski. Under Any Sky: Contemporary Readings of George Santayana. Newcastle: Cambridge Scholars Publishing, 2007.
  • Howgate, George W. George Santayana. New York: A.S. Barnes and Co., Inc., 1961.
  • Lachs, John. On Santayana. Wadsworth, 2000.
  • Lachs, John with Michael Hodges. Thinking in the Ruins: Wittgenstein and Santayana on Contingency. Vanderbilt University Press, 2000.
  • Levinson, Henry Samuel. Santayana, Pragmatism, and the Spiritual Life. Chapel Hill and London: The University of North Carolina Press: 1992.
  • Lamont, Corliss, editor. Dialogue on George Santayana. New York: Horizon Press, 1959.
  • Munson, Thomas N. The Essential Wisdom of George Santayana. New York: Columbia University Press, 1962.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur, editor. The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana. New York: Tudor Publishing Company, 1951.
  • Singer, Irving. George Santayana, Literary Philosopher. Yale University Press, 2000.
  • Sprigge, Timothy. Santayana. London and New York: Routledge, 1995.
  • Woodward, Anthony. Living in the Eternal: A Study of George Santayana. Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1988.

Author Information

Matthew Caleb Flamm
Email: mflamm@rockford.edu
Rockford College
U. S. A.

Huineng (Hui-neng) (638—713)

HuinengHuineng (Hui-neng) a seminal figure in Buddhist history. He is the famous “Sixth Patriarch” of the Chan or meditation tradition, which is better known in Japanese as “Zen”). The focus of an immense body of lore that grew over the centuries, Huineng’s life mirrors the fortunes of Chan itself – a provincial Chinese version of Buddhism that rose to become a major religious and cultural force throughout East Asia. Tradition holds that Huineng was an uncouth “barbarian” youth who, because of his innate intuitive insight, surpassed his more cultured fellow monks to earn the official “dharma seal” certifying the authoritative transmission of Buddhist enlightenment, and thereby earning a lasting place in history. He is intimately associated with the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, one of the most influential texts in all of Chinese Buddhism. Alleged to be a sermon from the lips of Huineng himself, this text provides a gripping first person account of the Master’s life. Its cryptic, yet insightful, discussion of Chan practice lays out the central concerns of Chan cultivation. Huineng’s discussion of the themes of inherent enlightenment, sudden awakening, and the non-dual nature of wisdom (Sanskrit: prajna) and meditation (Sanskrit: dhyana) resounds through later generations of Chan teachers, and continues to pose difficult philosophical challenges to this day.

Table of Contents

  1. Chan Buddhism in Context
  2. Biography
  3. Historical Issues and Mythic Elements
  4. Central Teachings
    1. Major Themes
      1. Original/Inherent Enlightenment (ben jue)
      2. Non-duality
      3. No-thought (wu nian)
      4. Sudden Awakening (dun wu)
      5. The Centrality of Practice
    2. Teaching Style
  5. Influences
  6. Critical Issues
    1. The Role of Reason and Rationality
    2. Sudden vs. Gradual?
    3. The Role of Text (wen) in Life
    4. The Relation of Action (praxis) and Knowledge (theoria)
    5. The Centrality of Ritual (Li)
  7. Impact on Later Buddhist and Chinese Philosophical Traditions
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Chan Buddhism in Context

It is impossible to disentangle Huineng from the story of early Chan. Indeed, it is in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra that Huineng lays out the classic story of Chan’s origins. According to this account, Chan began with the historical Buddha, Sakyamuni, and his famous “Flower Sermon.” One day the Buddha took his seat before his assembled monks and, instead of speaking, remained silent while holding a single flower aloft in his hand. Of those assembled, only one disciple Mahakashyapa (Sanskrit: “Great Kashyapa”), understood the meaning of the Buddha’s actions. The Buddha publicly recognized Mahakashyapa’s realization and he, in turn, passed the wordless teaching along to his disciples. Eventually the transmission passed to a certain Bodhidharma (c. 470-553 CE), the infamous “First Patriarch,” who, it is said, brought Chan to southern China, crossing the Yangzi (Yangtze) River on a reed. Recent scholarship has established that a mysterious figure named Bodhidharma was indeed in southern China in the fifth century proclaiming teachings based on the Lankavatara Sutra as well as a simplified but powerful form of dhyana. After his death his disciples carried on his teachings, but most of them never founded lasting lineages. Eventually these teachings were transmitted to Hongren (600-674), the Fifth Patriarch, who taught at Dongshan. Hongren had a number of disciples who spread out through China, establishing their own schools where they taught their own versions of Chan. Some died out but a few flourished, going on to record their histories to establish their particular pedigrees.

Often dubbed “the meditation school,” Chan derives its name from the Chinese term channa, an attempted transliteration of the Sanskrit term dhyana (meditation, concentration). In Japan, it is known as Zen; in Korea, as Son; and in Vietnam, as Thien. In India, dhyana encompassed a wide variety of techniques for training the mind to attain the deep insight into reality necessary for awakening. When Buddhism began making inroads into China in the first and second centuries CE, missionaries brought these techniques with them. Dhyana study proved popular in some circles – in part because of its resemblance to Daoist meditation practices – but it was just one practice alongside of others, such as sutra study, devotional rituals and the performance of charitable works. Only later did Chan become a self-conscious movement with a firm institutional base.

By the sixth century, certain monasteries in the mountainous areas of central and southwestern China became known as places reserved for intense meditation training. The masters at these centers taught methods so powerful that it was rumored that those willing to persevere could awaken in this very life. As time went on several of these meditation masters gained loyal followings and tales of them spread as their disciples established their own monasteries. It was out of this context that Chan as a distinct school (zong, “lineage”) and the legend of its most famous master arose. Modern scholars now agree that many of the stories surrounding Huineng are “mythical” reconstructions and elaborations by later generations of Chan writers. Nonetheless, this mythology tells us a lot about how Chan came to conceive itself as a distinct tradition, at once radically innovative and deeply conservative. This Chan self-conception finds its best articulation in a poem attributed to Bodhidharma, according to which Chan is “a separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and phrases, directly transmitted from mind to mind.” Such transmission can only occur within the relationship between Master and student; hence, the Master, and the connection to him, is of paramount importance in all Chan schools.

2. Biography

As with many legendary figures, it is difficult to sort fact from fiction when it comes to Huineng. We have many sources of information on him but most were written long after his lifetime. Most scholars of Buddhism now consider the story of Huineng’s life and his role in establishing Chan as a direct line going back to Sakyamuni (the historical Buddha, ca. 6th to 5th centuries BCE) to be little more than pious fiction. While there may be a kernel of historical truth to them, all of the accounts of Huineng’s life (particularly as recorded in the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch) show evidence of later expansion and elaboration. In fact, scholars cannot even agree on the location of Dafan, the temple in which Huineng allegedly recited the Platform Sutra.

The earliest mention of Huineng comes from an inscription for a memorial pagoda in Faxing monastery dated 676. The pagoda was said to commemorate Huineng’s meeting with master Yinzong (627-713), a devotee of the Nirvana Sutra and a renowned master of monastic discipline (vinaya), and the ceremony in which Huineng underwent monastic tonsure, that is, shaving of part of the head. Unfortunately, the actual inscription has not been preserved and so many historians deem it unreliable. The only other record dating back to Huineng’s lifetime just lists him as a student of the Chan master Hongren (Hong-jen).

Later records, of which there are many, probably bear little resemblance to real historical events, and actually contradict each other on certain details. Later traditions concerning Huineng vary tremendously. He seems to go into hiding for several years only to reappear in Nanhai at a monastery presided over by Yinzong. One day after the Master had finished a lecture, Huineng overheard two monks arguing over whether the temple flag or the wind was moving. Huineng abruptly injected himself into this discussion, declaring that in fact it was mind that was moving. Hearing of this, Yinzong sent for Huineng and, bowing to him, asked to be taught the dharma of Hongren. It was Yinzong who oversaw the giving of the tonsure to Huineng, the incident memorialized in the inscription mentioned above. Eventually most accounts of Huineng’s life have him retiring to the Baolin temple. Some traditions speak of Huineng being summoned to the imperial capital by the emperor Zhongzong or possibly the empress Wu Zhao (ca. 625-706). In any case, Huineng declined, preferring to spend his days in the mountains and forests preaching the dharma. He did, however, give the imperial envoy a dharma talk that jolted the messenger into an intense sudden realization. Returning to the capital the envoy reported his experience to the emperor who issued an edict praising Huineng and bestowing special gifts upon him.

Our major source for information on Huineng is the autobiographical portion (sections 2-11) of the Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch, an immensely complicated text that has undergone numerous revisions over the centuries. Purporting to be a series of sermons delivered by Huineng from a high seat in the lecture hall (the “platform” alluded to in the title) of Dafan Temple, this text remains the only Chinese Buddhist discourse to be accorded sutra (Sanskrit: “scriptural”) status. The earliest extant copy of this sutra, found in a cache of writings discovered in the Dunhuang (Tun-huang) caves in northwestern China, dates to around 850 but it is corrupt and full of errors – probably the result of being copied from an earlier version by a semiliterate scribe. The first section of the text names Fahai, a student of Huineng’s, as transcribing the sermon at the behest of the district governor. Elsewhere the text names Fahai as one of the Master’s ten disciples and “chief monk” of the community. However, Fahai does not appear anywhere else in Chan literature and his exact identity remains unknown. Some scholars suggest the sutra was actually written by a later Chan monk from a different school (possibly the Niutou or “Ox-head” school) around the year 780.

While most scholars do not put much stock in either the Platform Sutra or the other sources on Huineng’s life, we can still use them to piece together something of a biography for him. It seems his family name was Lu and his father had been a minor official who was banished to the provinces where he died when his son was only three. His mother took him to southern China and raised him in extreme poverty. Huineng worked throughout his childhood to support his family by cutting wood. One day when he was a young man, he overheard a man reciting a phrase from the Diamond Sutra and at once he experienced an initial awakening. With his mother’s permission he left home and devoted himself to religious life.

Huineng spent his next years wandering, ending up with a Buddhist nun who was devoted to the Nirvana Sutra. After reciting passages from it one day she asked him to take a turn reading it aloud only to find that he was illiterate. Incredulous, she asked how he intended to learn Buddha’s truth if he could not read the sutras. The youth replied that the nature of Buddha does not depend on words and letters so what need was there to read texts? Amazed at his insight, she suggested he take up monastic life. At this point he declined, but went on to train under a meditation master.

After three years of meditating in a mountain cave, Huineng went to Dongshan (East Mountain) monastery in Hubei, where he met Master Hongren, the “Fifth Patriarch.” Glaring at this supplicant, Hongren asked where he was from and why he was there. Huineng answered simply that he was from the south and had come to learn the dharma (Buddhist doctrine) from him. Hongren retorted that as a southerner, Huineng was a mere “barbarian,” adding, “How could you become Buddha?” Unfazed by the insult, Huineng replied, “Although my ‘barbarian’ body and yours differ, what difference is there in our buddha-nature?” Realizing at once the potential of this coarse youth, Hongren resolved to test him further. He took him in but assigned him to the threshing room, where he labored for nine months, treading the mill to separate the rice grains from their husks.

The most famous incident in Huineng’s story concerns a dharma contest. One day Hongren challenged his charges to each write a verse (gatha) distilling their understanding of their “original natures.” He promised to read them and award his robe (a symbol of dharma transmission; some versions of the story include Hongren’s begging bowl) and the title “Sixth Patriarch” to the student demonstrating true realization. The task quickly devolved onto the shoulders of the head monk, Shenxiu, who, it was assumed, would be the Master’s likely successor. Shenxiu, however, was full of doubt and spent a tortured night considering his options. Finally he stole out and wrote his verse anonymously on the wall of the new dharma hall:

The body is the bodhi tree.
The heart-mind is like a mirror.
Moment by moment wipe and polish it,
Not allowing dust to collect. (section 6)

A straightforward articulation of the necessity of diligent practice, Shenxiu hoped this verse would show the Master that his students had at least some understanding.

The next morning Hongren read the verse and praised it before the community. He burned incense before it and ordered them all to recite it before calling Shenxiu for an interview. In private he commended Shenxiu for his insight, stating that the verse showed he had reached the “gates of wisdom” but had yet to enter. He then suggested Shenxiu take a few more days to compose another verse worthy of being awarded the robe.

Meanwhile, Huineng was still working in the threshing room when a novice wandered by reciting Shenxiu’s verse. Immediately Huineng realized the author of the verse lacked full understanding. Venturing out to the dharma hall, he got someone to write his reply:

Bodhi originally has no tree.
The clear and bright mirror also has no support.
Buddha-nature is constantly purifying and clearing.
Where could there be dust? (section 8)

Very soon word of this new verse spread and eventually the news reached Hongren. The Master came to read it and immediately recognized it as the work of Huineng and that this unknown prodigy was truly enlightened. However, he knew that passing his robe to an uncouth peasant would upset the monastic hierarchy. Therefore he publicly dismissed it as “not complete understanding.” Later, under cover of darkness, Hongren summoned Huineng for a secret audience in which he gave him further teachings. Passing on his robe, the Master admonished him to flee for his life, predicting, however, that eventually he would transmit the teachings. With that, Huineng fled south. After some months, Huineng was traced to a mountain by a band of pursuers intent on killing him and stealing the robe. Most of the pursuers turned back after climbing only halfway but one, Huiming (a former general) reached him on the summit. There, rather than slay the young master, he received the teaching and became enlightened. Thus being recognized as a true Chan Master, Huineng dispatched his new disciple to the north to spread the dharma and convert the populace.

One of the most colorful episodes in Huineng lore concerns his confrontation with a dragon that lived in a pond in front of Baolin temple. The dragon was particularly large and fierce, emerging regularly from the watery depths to create havoc and instill fear in the populace. Fearlessly, the Master taunted the beast for its weakness at only being unable to appear in a large as opposed to smaller form. At once the dragon disappeared only to re-emerge in small form and so show the monk his powers. Unimpressed, the Master challenged the monster to show its courage by entering his bowl. When it did so, the Master quickly scooped the dragon up, took him into the Buddha Hall, and preached dharma to it until it shed its body and departed.

Much as with other great religious figures, so the stories of Huineng’s death are particularly dramatic. The Platform Sutra gives a confused account that may combine several different versions. In essence, however, it records that as he neared his death, the Master called his disciples for a final teaching in the form of a “dharma verse.” All the disciples broke into tears over the imminent departure of their beloved teacher except for one, Shenhui, whom the Master praised for having attained the status of awakening. Chiding the others for the foolishness of their tears, Huineng told them, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet. All of you recite it, and if you understand the meaning, you will be the same as I. If you practice with it, you will not lose the essence of the teaching.” (section 48) After this final lesson (during which he outlined the Chan lineage back to the Buddha) Huineng died at the stroke of midnight on August 28, 713. Other traditions, however, have Huineng dying in deep meditation after finishing his last meal. His passing was marked by all manner of cosmic signs: a strange perfume pervading the temple for days, mysterious bright lights, a miraculous rainbow in the sky etc. The Platform Sutra says, “Mountains crumbled, the earth trembled, and the forest trees turned white. The sun and moon ceased to shine and the wind and clouds lost their colors.” (section 54) An inscription by the poet Wang Wei (d. 759) adds “the birds and monkeys cried in anguish.”

Several posthumous stories of Huineng attest to the powerful spell he cast on later generations. Some decades after his passing the emperor sent an envoy to ask for his robe and bowl so that the court might pay them homage. These were sent back with great ceremony a few years later by the succeeding emperor, who purportedly dreamt Huineng asked that they be returned. Later, in 816, Huineng was awarded the official title “Dhyana Master Dajian” (Great Mirror). To this day there is a mummy reputed to be Huineng in the Nanhua monastery located in Caoxi. For centuries it was the focus of intense devotion, and at times was brought to the nearby city of Shanzhou to promote prosperity or ward off plagues and droughts. The mummy was also threatened several times and at least one time was nearly decapitated by rival monks seeking to gain power through possession of the Sixth Patriarch’s head.

3. Historical Issues and Mythic Elements

Historical complexities aside, however, it is the mythic dimensions of Huineng’s story that most excite the imagination. Certainly the traditional account is replete with symbolism and allusion. As a boy Huineng is the quintessential simpleton (cf. the Daoist notion of pu, “simplicity” or “the uncarved block” spoken of in Daode jing 15, 19, 28, 32, 37, 57), an illiterate peasant who, pure and unspoiled by the sophistication of his more educated fellows, serves as the perfect vessel for receiving the sacred wisdom that, in turn, flows through him to posterity. Aside from the allusions to Daode jing just noted, Huineng epitomizes the ideal found in Daode jing 70, “The sage goes about with a coarse cloth on top yet carries jade in his bosom.” We find similar themes in stories of other Buddhist figures (for example, Dao’an, 312-385) as well as the Prophet Muhammad. The tradition of Huineng’s being orphaned and cared for by his mother echoes the biography of Mencius (ca. 385-312 BCE), one of the most revered and mystical of Confucian sages.

Huineng’s potential is recognized by the truly wise (for example, Hongren) but he must first be tested to prove his worth. His assignment to hard labor for nine months in seclusion suggests a type of spiritual gestation. Moreover, Huineng’s attaining official recognition under cover of darkness, symbolized in the passing on of Bodhidharma’s robe and bowl (sacred relics imbued with the Patriarch’s charisma), underscores the drama of this moment and the immense value of his precious wisdom. The tradition that these were buried with him indicates something else of importance: Huineng’s successors would no longer rely on India; Chan would henceforth be a homegrown Chinese tradition. Huineng’s turning down the imperial summons recalls the similar story involving Zhuangzi wherein the Daoist sage prefers to live as a turtle, “dragging his tail in the mud” (Zhuangzi, chapter 17). Finally, the accounts of Huineng’s death clearly echo the earthly passing (parinirvana) of Sakyamuni Buddha. Symbolically, Chan tradition, by drawing such a wide assortment of sacred figures into Huineng’s own story, has effectively absorbed these holy personages’ collective mana. As such, Chan is then empowered to project this “new” sacred aura down through its own lineage.

We can also understand the traditional story of Huineng’s life as an example of the apparently universal “Hero Myth.” He starts off as an unpromising youth living in obscurity who embarks on a great quest. Along the way he is aided by various helpers (the anonymous man who recited the Diamond Sutra, the nun devoted to the Nirvana Sutra, his first meditation teacher). After various adventures he meets a true mentor, the Wise Old Man (Hongren), who recognizes his worth and proceeds to train and test him until he is ready. Then the Wise Old Man passes on the secret knowledge he will need to face all obstacles. The climactic story of Huineng’s flight, pursuit, confrontation on mountain top, and his victory all fit in broad outline the structure of such tales the world over. His encounter with the dragon, of course, is the stereotypical battle with the monster (cf. St. George and the Dragon, Beowulf and Grendel) through which the Hero saves society from the threat of evil and chaos, while his refusal of imperial status demonstrates his humility and desire to avoid self-glorification. In this light, the master’s death marks his apotheosis and rise to divine status, for which he is revered by later generations.

When assessing the life of Huineng and his place in Chan lore, it is vital to bear in mind the centrality of lineage in Chinese culture. Lineage is a primary marker of group identity and solidarity, as well as social recognition. Chan, like other Chinese religious/philosophical traditions, is organized as a system of lineages in which teachings are passed down from Master (Patriarch) to disciple, much as family heritage passes down from father to son. The concern for lineage is most evident in sections 49-51 of the Platform Sutra, where Huineng traces the transmission of his teachings back through various masters to Bodhidharma. In Huineng’s Chan genealogy, Bodhidharma, in turn, received the teachings via a series of Indian masters going back to Sakyamuni. Such an impressive pedigree no doubt brought much prestige to those within the Chan line. The importance of lineage continued through the succeeding generations and was carried over when Chan went to Japan. To this day, Chan teachers trace their lineage back to Huineng. Essentially, Huineng has become the Primary Ancestor of the Chan line, receiving the reverence and devotion typical of ancestral cults throughout East Asia. Metaphorically speaking, Huineng is Chan, and remains so even today.

Such critical analysis of the Platform Sutra and the body of lore surrounding Huineng is not intended to dismiss Chan tradition (particularly in regards to the matter of lineage) as fraudulent. Rather, it helps us understand the concerns of early Chan and the vital role that a charismatic hero such as Huineng plays in rhetorically establishing a distinctive Chan identity. For an analogy we can look to the way in which the great Song scholar Zhu Xi (1130-1200) constructs a lineage for his school of Neo-Confucianism, with Confucius taking the place of Huineng and Master Zhu serving as the Confucian version of Shenhui.

4. Central Teachings

Although Huineng’s mythic biography is fascinating, the Platform Sutra mainly consists of an extended series of dharma talks offering what is at times some rather cryptic advice on Chan cultivation. Like most sermons, the Sutra is not a systematic presentation of defined doctrines and arguments but is an address to the faithful, exhorting them to see into their “original nature” and awaken here and now. Huineng explicitly says that his teachings do not originate with him but are, “handed down from the sages of the past” (section 12). Nonetheless, Huineng does introduce several important ideas and initiates the peculiar style of teaching that comes to be enshrined in later Chan tradition. These teachings tend to overlap and interlock with each other, thereby suggesting the unity-cum-diversity that is one of the hallmarks of Chan thought.

a. Major Themes

i. Original/Inherent Enlightenment (ben jue)

The teaching of “inherent” or “original” enlightenment is a major theme in Huineng’s sermon, and the theoretical basis for most of what he says regarding practice. Its roots go back to Indian teachings concerning the tathagata-garbha (“womb/embryo of Buddha”). Although a complex notion, essentially this teaching comes down to a positive articulation of basic Buddhist views on emptiness (shunyata) and the thoroughly interrelated nature of existence. According to tathagata-garbha teachings, although all beings are mired in ignorance and suffering, our true natures are always pure and luminous – defilements are merely adventitious. Awakening occurs when we pierce through the defilements and allow our original purity to shine forth. While at first glance, the assertion of a seemingly permanent “nature” would seem to contradict the fundamental Buddhist doctrine of anatman (“no [permanent] self”), in fact it does not. The tathagata-garbha is not a substantive essence but an indication of the innate positive tendency towards awakening that is always directly at hand.

Tathagata-garbha teachings had strong appeal for the Chinese, most likely due to their resonance with Confucian ideas of “propriety” (yi, the appropriate manner of acting in a given situation) and humanity’s innate “goodness,” as well as Daoist views of the Way (dao), in which each thing uniquely contributes to the all-encompassing system of the cosmos. These notions also dovetail with the traditional Chinese concern with one’s “nature” (xing, the inborn organic pattern guiding a thing’s development). Together such ideas sketch out a distinctive worldview of dynamic, interactive relationships that unfold in the natural course of things. In this perspective, one can obstruct one’s inherent tendencies or open conscientiously into a more free and responsive way of engagement. In general, the latter is the truer, more proper (or “natural”) way of being. Chinese Buddhists speak of this potential for realization as one’s “Buddha-nature” (fo xing). For Chinese Buddhists, awakening is the natural result of activating or “seeing into” this innate but hidden potential and manifesting it here and now.

Nearly everything Huineng says is predicated on the “Buddha-nature.” We see this clearly in his youthful exchanges with both the nameless Buddhist nun and Master Hongren. Huineng drives this point home in a number of places, often quite explicitly. As he proclaims, “Since Buddha is made by your own nature, do not look for him outside your body. If you are deluded in your own nature, Buddha is then a sentient being; if you are awakened in your own natures, sentient beings are then Buddhas.” (section 35) In this understanding of Buddhahood, one may have an initial awakening (Japanese satori) but this is only a hurried glimpse, yet it provides a vague understanding that spurs one on further – something we clearly see in Huineng’s own life with his first awakening at hearing a passage from the Diamond Sutra.

By rhetorically taking his stand on this inherent enlightenment, Huineng challenges his audience to understand this truth and realize their original natures where they are at this very moment. This is something they can and must do: “Despite heterodox views, passions, ignorance, and delusions, in your own physical bodies you have in yourselves the attributes of inherent enlightenment, so that with correct views you can be saved.” (section 21) It is on this basis that he speaks of such things as the unity of meditation (dhyana) and wisdom (prajna), and the “samadhi of oneness. By realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” one naturally moves beyond habitual “selfish” actions and joining with things in an appropriate and compassionate way.

ii. Non-duality

Another important theme that Huineng preaches concerns the fundamentally “non-dual” nature of existence. This, too, is prone to be misunderstood. Huineng never espouses a mushy notion that “All is One” so much as challenge the assumption that a person stands apart from her/his immediate situation. His target is the self-conscious sense of separation that tends to arise out of deliberative thinking and living. Thus, his focus is not so much theoretical as practical; one must not get caught up in speculative thought but realize (make real) Buddha, one’s true nature, and act accordingly. This fundamental unity comes through in his famous dharma verse through which he won Hongren’s robe. By countering Shenxiu’s verse and its assumptions of duality, Huineng graphically tells us that we must not think of our minds as something distinct that “we” must polish to reflect truth. Rather, we are truth, immediately and directly.

The vision Huineng seeks to impart is one of integrity within our larger context. It is an evocation of wholeness, interrelatedness and participation rather than separation and distinction. One of Huineng’s most provocative presentations of this idea comes in his discussion of meditation. For Huineng, meditation is not a separate “thing” from wisdom, nor do you attain the latter by way of the former. As he says, “Never under any circumstances say mistakenly that meditation and wisdom are different; they are a unity, not two things. Meditation itself is the substance of wisdom; wisdom itself is the function of meditation” (section 13). Later, the Patriarch explains their relationship through the analogy of a lamp and its light: just as the lamp and its illuminating are essentially one, so meditation and wisdom are one.

Huineng also challenges assumptions of separation by advocating the “samadhi of oneness,” or concentrated attention to the present situation: “The samadhi of oneness is straightforward mind at all times, walking, staying, sitting, and lying.” This constitutes an intriguing practice of mindful, meditative action performed with attentive detachment. There are obvious echoes between this practice and the Daoist notion of wei wuwei (“acting without acting”) as well as path of karma yoga outlined by Krishna in the Bhagavad-Gita, and Chan communities to this day seek to instill such an approach to life throughout their daily regimen.

This fundamental unity of existence that one manifests by realizing one’s “Buddha-nature” also informs Huineng’s view of the Pure Land (the “Western Paradise”) which, following the Vimalakirti Sutra (where the Buddha shows his disciples that this world is the Pure Land for those with Pure Mind), he refuses to allow us to conceive the Pure Land as something separate from our current existence. It is, rather, the straightforward mind of the “samadhi of oneness.” In attaining this state of true purity, one finds no obstructions. Or, as Huineng puts it, “If inside and outside are clear, this will be no different from the Western Land” (section 35).

iii. No-thought (wu nian)

Huineng speaks from the standpoint of Ultimate Truth (the inherent “Buddha-nature”) the non-dual reality lying beyond our everyday unenlightened experience of separation and division. To awaken to this Truth, Huineng emphasizes “non-clinging” to any verbal teachings, which only present obstacles to True Awakening. Instead, Huineng stresses the perspective of “no-thought” (wu nian), an open, non-conceptual state of mind that allows one to experience reality directly, as it truly is. As he states, “No thought is not to think even when involved in thought. . . To be unstained in all environments is called no-thought. If on the basis of your own thoughts you separate from environment, then, in regard to things, thoughts are not produced. If you stop thinking of the myriad things, and cast aside all thoughts, as soon as one instant of thought is cut off, you will be reborn in another realm.” (section 13)

Note that Huineng explicitly says “no-thought” is not a state of insentiency, nor is it a way of valorizing irrational, “thoughtless” behavior. Rather, “no-thought” is a highly attentive yet unentangled way of being — seemingly the only genuine freedom available. Those who act from the perspective of “no-thought” respond compassionately in all situations, untouched by suffering, much the same way the Mahayana scriptures speak of bodhisattvas (enlightened beings who selflessly seek to aid others) who “course in the Perfection of Wisdom.”

iv. Sudden Awakening (dun wu)

Few ideas are so closely associated with Huineng’s Chan than “sudden awakening” (dun wu). Rooted in earlier Buddhist and Daoist teachings, it primarily referred to statements of truth a sage made in relationship to specific audiences. Those that were direct and profound were given to those ready for such a “sudden” dose of reality whereas those that were more indirect and metaphorical were provided for those who needed to be led “gradually.” The difference, thus, lies in those who receive the teachings rather than the actual content of the teachings. Some are, as it were, closer to their “Buddha-nature.” According to later Chan tradition, Huineng advocated the (superior) way of “sudden awakening” in contrast to Shenxiu, whose dharma verse clearly points to the (inferior) way of “gradual awakening.”

This polemical distinction, however, does not capture Huineng’s full meaning. The term dun, typically translated as “sudden,” might better be rendered as “poised” or “ready” for some great undertaking Those who experience such “sudden awakening” are those who are “keen” and “fast,” ready to awaken in action, poised to break through to fuller, wise and compassionate living. By contrast, those who are “dull” are “slow,” not quite as prepared or attentive to respond in so wise a fashion. Equally as important, moreover, is Huineng’s insistence that from the standpoint of the “Buddha-nature,” there is no “sudden” or “gradual.” Thus he notes, “The dharma itself is the same, but in seeing it there is a slow way and a fast way. Seen slowly, it is the gradual; seen fast it is the sudden [teaching]. Dharma is without sudden or gradual, but some people are keen and others dull; hence the names ‘sudden’ and ‘gradual.’” (section 39)

v. The Centrality of Practice

In many respects the necessity of practice may be the single most important refrain in Huineng’s sermons. Huineng repeatedly emphasizes that Chan life, awakening, is not attained through study or careful deliberation but live action. One of the best instances comes immediately after he explains what seated meditation (zuochan; Japanese zazen) is: “Good friends, see for yourselves the purity of your own natures, practice and accomplish for yourselves. Your own nature is the Dharmakaya [“Body of the Teaching,” the Ultimate Truth] and self-practice is the practice of Buddha; by self-accomplishment you may achieve the Buddha Way for yourselves.” (section 19)

To achieve Buddhahood one must be Buddha, that which, paradoxically, one always already is. Such awakened living cannot be adequately explained through words so much as demonstrated and acted upon. In this sense, one learns it directly by conforming to an already established pattern, internalizing it, and then acting this out in any given situation. An analogy might be learning to play a musical instrument or another activity such as riding a bicycle. Chan practice is Chan doing, something that can only be learned through careful imitation of a living example – one’s Master. It is this type of first-hand learning to which Bodhidharma refers in his famous verse: “A special transmission outside the scriptures; not dependent on words and letters.”

Ironically, despite his constant injunctions to wise action, Huineng provides little detail on the specifics of practice. As a result, scholars are unsure what sorts of actual practices were taught in early Chan communities. This silence on specifics, however, turned out to be a point in Huineng’s favor, as his injunctions could readily be applied to a wide variety of Chan styles through the ages.

b. Teaching Style

Huineng’s presentation in the Platform Sutra pioneered Chan’s distinct teaching style that makes use of paradox and cryptic statements aimed at jolting students out of their habitual discursive reasoning. By no means, of course, is Huineng the inventor of such discourse (it is very common in Buddhist and Daoist texts) but in the Platform Sutra Huineng uses it with uncanny skill. As such, it warrants close examination.

One of the most significant features of Huineng’s discourse is its overwhelmingly dialogical character. Although it has its share of lectures, this “sermon” is more often a series of exchanges between Huineng and various interlocutors. Such a literary form calls for one to shift perspective back and forth. Like normal conversation, so a dialogue also tends to lead one beyond the immediate horizon, inviting listeners (and readers) to come along. Dialogue is a common form in Western philosophy (most notably in Plato’s dialogues) yet there is also ample precedent in both Buddhist and Chinese literature. The Perfection of Wisdom Sutras, the primary scriptures of Mahayana Buddhism, are all extended dialogues between the Buddha and his disciples, while most of the Analects and the Zhuangzi are dialogues as well. The dialogue is a powerful rhetorical form, dramatic and challenging, one that demands a response from its audience.

One of the more common rhetorical forms in Buddhism is paradox, and Huineng certainly makes use of this in his teaching. Thus, for instance, he admonishes his students, “Do not depart from deceptions and errors; for they of themselves are the nature of True Reality” (section 27). Later when on the point of death, he takes his closest disciples to task for their ignorance by saying, “All of you sit down. I shall give you a verse, the verse of the true-false moving-quiet.” (section 48) There is something very tricky in such sayings, as they are seemingly contradictory if not absurd. The point of a paradox, of course, is that such absurdity is only apparent for the paradox masks a higher truth that we must divine ourselves. As such, paradox is a highly suggestive form of rhetoric, one that presents us with a basic tension, leaving it for us to resolve.

Huineng also engages in a great deal of polemics in the Platform Sutra. For example, he continually contrasts the “wise” with the “deluded.” He also draws a sharp contrast between his teachings and those of the “Northern school” (secs. 37, 39, 48-49), criticizes a student whose “practice” consists of only reciting the Lotus Sutra (sec. 42), and even converts a “spy” who seems to have come to discredit him (secs. 40-41). While a polemical style may have negative connotations it also serves several rhetorical purposes. To begin, it sets the Master and his audience apart from others, thereby emphasizing that this teaching is different or special. It also underscores the challenging nature of the teaching, and no doubt directly counters various preconceived ideas in the audience. Indeed, it may even put his disciples and audience on the defensive, thus setting them up psychologically for a deeper breakthrough.

All in all, Huineng’s teaching style is quite challenging. At times it is highly provocative, even maddening. He does not lay his subjects out neatly so that his audience can absorb what he says with ease but jars his listeners to elicit a reaction from them. His words, thus, are inherently unstable and elusive, pouring forth quixotically. They resist final definition and closure, similar to Zhuangzi’s “goblet words” (zhi yan, cf. Zhuangzi chapter 27) or what the fifth century Buddhist thinker Sengzhao terms “wild words” (kuan yan, cf. his essay “Panruo Wuzhi”). Such stylistic considerations, in the end, suggest that the ultimate message of Huineng’s sermon may not be so much what he says as how he says it and how we take up his words in our response.

5. Influences

As noted above, Huineng himself claims that nothing in his teachings originates with him, much as Confucius does in Analects 15.28. Clearly, what he iterates in the Platform Sutra derives from earlier works and there are many times when he makes explicit references to other texts, notably the Diamond, Vimalakirti, and Lotus Sutras. In addition, we should also mention the Nirvana Sutra, a text promoting the universality of the “Buddha-nature” that had a profound influence on Chinese Buddhism as a whole. The influences, however, go far beyond this short list. Huineng demonstrates knowledge of the great body of Prajna-paramita (Perfection of Wisdom) literature (of which the Diamond Sutra is one rather late example), as well as the techniques of the Madhyamika school – notably in the negation of set positions, dialectic play between “conventional” and “Ultimate” truth, and the constant challenge to any attempts at a final articulation of Buddhist truth. In addition, at certain points he reveals a basic familiarity with Pure Land doctrine (sec. 35) and some rather technical aspects of Abhidharma and Yogacara philosophy (sec. 45)

Moreover, Huineng’s teachings and style of presentation also owe a great deal to indigenous Chinese sources. This is most obvious when it comes to Daoism, as Huineng’s character and actions so often epitomize teachings found in both the Daode jing and the Zhuangzi. As for Confucian tradition, Huineng makes an obvious bow to Confucius in presenting himself as a transmitter, while his adherence to the positive power of “Buddha nature” owes at least something to the Mencian idea of “inherent goodness” of human nature, a perennial theme in Chinese philosophy that finds one of its most popular articulations in the Zhongyong (“Doctrine of the Mean”). Other scholars have even suggested that portions of the Platform Sutra may have been compiled under the influence of the Yijing.

The fact that Huineng quotes passages from such a large body of works and that scholars can so-easily discern other literary influences and allusions constitutes further proof that the tradition of Huineng’s illiteracy should not be taken literally. In the Platform Sutra Huineng proves rather erudite, if not bookish. His familiarity with so much of his Buddhist and Chinese heritage challenges stereotypes of Chan as denigrating and even ignoring written texts. Indeed, scholars of Buddhism often point out the ironic fact that Chan, so often known for its dismissal of texts, has the largest body of written work of any East Asian Buddhist tradition. Furthermore, many great Chan masters (for example, Dogen, 1200-1253) were brilliant scholars and original thinkers. This paradoxical aspect of Chan, rather than being the product of centuries of institutionalization as some might claim, seems to have been there from the very beginning.

6. Critical Issues

Although the Platform Sutra is most unusual for a “philosophical” text, both in terms of style and content it raises a number of issues that are of particular philosophic import.

a. The Role of Reason and Rationality

Chan has a reputation for irrationality, allegedly insisting that practitioners cut off thinking entirely. There is some basis for such views, and in Chan history we do find examples where this seems to have been encouraged, as, for example, in the case of the Baotang school of Chan that developed in Sichuan during eighth century. Huineng and most Chan masters, however, do not advocate a disorderly or irrational lifestyle. Their concern, instead, seems to be on the predominance of ratio (deliberative, analytic thinking) and the discursive reasoning that severs aspects of reality into discrete bits, usually from an egocentric standpoint. From a Chan perspective, this mode of understanding is the result of a highly artificial process that cuts one off from full participation in one’s immediate context and inevitably leads to suffering. Such an approach cannot be countered with rational, objective arguments because such reasoning is itself a product of such a mode of understanding. By breaking the grip of such processes on humanity, Huineng and his later followers seek to free us for a fuller, more natural life, and hence a truer life.

Much of the difficulty surrounding this subject stems from Chan’s distinctive rhetorical style, of which Huineng is a true master. In particular the notion of “no-thought” seems to suggest a sort of mindless, purely instinctual response or perhaps even unconsciousness. Certainly, “no-thought” is not rational in the sense of bare objectivity. In fact, as we have seen, “no-thought” is not this at all but more like an attitude of carefully attentiveness to the situation at hand. If “no-thought” is lacking in anything it would be the self-consciousness that typically arises out of the dualism inherent in subject-object thinking. Most assuredly “no-thought” should not be equated with becoming insentient, that is, an “object” among others.

Is there a place for reason in all this? Not in the ordinary sense. However, Chan would seem to be less “irrational” than “a rational,” although such labels themselves are designations arising within discursive reasoning. In the end, it may be helpful to view Huineng as espousing a type of “philosophy as propaganda,” much like Nagarjuna or the later Wittgenstein. The aim is not to argue but to change one’s way of thinking in favor of a more immediate and direct way of being.

b. Sudden vs. Gradual?

Much has been made of this notion in Chan scholarship and, indeed, Chan tradition often presents the as a conflict of “Northern Chan Gradualism” and “Southern Chan Subitism” – an alleged conflict from which the latter emerged victorious. In reality it is not really so simple, but the contrast points to an instable dynamic that lies at the heart of Buddhism and perhaps all spiritual practice. If “sudden awakening” refers to an instantaneous experience of enlightenment at which point nothing more needs to be done, then why did someone like Huineng continue to sit in meditation through his later years and exhort his students to do the same even after his death (section 53)?

In fact, what Huineng says about the contrast between “sudden” and “gradual” is anything but clear: “Good friends, in the dharma there is no sudden or gradual, but among people some are keen and others dull. The deluded recommend the gradual method, the enlightened practice the sudden teaching. . . Once enlightened, there is from the outset no distinction between these two methods; those who are not enlightened with for long kalpas be caught in the cycle of transmigration” (section 16). In part it appears that the distinction between “sudden” and “gradual” is a provisional one made from the unawakened standpoint that applies to Chan practitioners rather than the actual event of awakening itself. Yet can one move from delusion to enlightenment, from gradual to sudden? It also seems that the difference between “sudden” and “gradual” cannot refer to a temporal distinction, for even a “sudden awakening” certainly cannot be attained easily or without much practice; Huineng had several “sudden awakenings” but devoted himself to a lifetime of Chan practice.

Later Chan thinkers such as Zongmi (a.k.a. Guifeng, 780-841) were deeply concerned about these notions and sought to clarify them by speaking of “sudden awakening followed by gradual cultivation.” While intriguing, such a solution essentially erases any ultimate meaning to the sudden/gradual distinction. It also implies that claims to “sudden awakening” by Huineng and his followers line were rhetorical rather than genuine.

c. The Role of Text (wen) in Life

The reputation of Chan as eschewing textual study has long been a source of controversy and great appeal. We can see this even in the “Chan motto” attributed to Bodhidharma in which the dharma is said to be a “separate transmission outside the scriptures, not relying on words and letters.” There can be no arguing that Chan presents a basic distrust of scholasticism that seems to have characterized the Chinese doctrinal schools such as Tiantai and Huayan. But does this mean that texts have no place? This would hardly seem to be warranted given what we find in the Platform Sutra. In the autobiographical portions of the Sutra Huineng has his initial awakening from hearing a text (the Diamond Sutra), demonstrates his worth through his own “dharma verse,” and received official dharma transmission through verbal teachings from Hongren. Moreover, Huineng’s sermon is full of instances in which he unfolds the various meanings in a number of Buddhist texts. In addition, there are several passages in which Huineng draws attention to the text of his sermon itself, stating “If others are able to encounter the Platform Sutra, it will be as if they received the teaching personally from me” (section 47). The text goes on to note that Huineng’s closest disciples received his teaching, made copies of the Platform Sutra and entrusted them to later generations, all of whom were led through it to see into their own true natures.

An important clue for our understanding can be found when Huineng is preparing to give his “death verse.” Before launching into his final teaching he tells his disciples, “if you understand its meaning, you will be the same as I” (section 48). Like Sakyamuni before his passing, Huineng promises that that the master will remain with his students in the form of his teachings. These teachings, compiled in textual form, will have the power to lead hearers and readers to realization of their True natures once they grasp the teachings’ true import. In this reading, the Master’s role is open up the teachings via his own words (or actions) and so manifest their meaning; the crucial point is that these are transmitted by the Master and taken up by the students – a process that can only happen “outside the scriptures” themselves. There is an interesting parallel here to the view of the Neo-Confucian master Zhu Xi, who, in outlining the regimen of study for his disciples, emphasizes the importance of texts as a coming into the very presence of the Sages themselves.

The conclusion seems to be that Huineng does not denigrate texts per se, for they were instrumental in his own awakening and play a central role in his sermons. Instead, he (and later Chan tradition) attacks the tendency to treat them objectively, as material to be mastered rather than dharma gates leading to awakening. Ego, cutting off from full involvement in the world. Taking texts truly as “scripture,” however, is another matter. The words of dharma are Buddha in that they allow us to perceive truth. In this view, then, those passages in the Platform Sutra calling attention to the text itself emphasize its way of connecting one with Huineng’s wisdom offered for our awakening. What we see then is that through Huineng, Chan celebrates the centrality of text, but as “live word” internalized and acted upon rather than mere marks on the page. Such an existential engagement, however, is not typically found in the modern study of philosophy and so raises questions about what “philosophy” may actually be.

d. The Relation of Action (praxis) and Knowledge (theoria)

The centrality of practice is a major refrain in Huineng’s discourse. Despite his often-cryptic comments, the Master shares the decidedly practical focus that runs through much of Chinese philosophic culture. Time and time again, Huineng exhorts us to a life of Chan action and practice, a life of Buddhahood, rather than quietistic withdrawal. Although clearly there is some sort of “theory” informing Huineng (a sinified version of tathagatha-garbha teachings), this never takes precedence over practical application. In fact, Huineng (and Chan in general) refuses to distinguish between these two concepts, arguing essentially that true knowing is practical action. Thus, from this perspective nothing can be “true in theory” if it is not borne out in practice.

The priority of praxis is underscored by the fact that Chan is often regarded first and foremost as a “practice school.” In contrast to the doctrinal concerns of the Tiantai and Huayan, Chan emphasizes practices such as “no-thought” while maintaining that getting tangled up in mistaken ideas inevitably leads one astray. Since we are already Buddha, we must realize this through Buddha living. Only then are we awakened to the truth of our original (Buddha) nature.

There are some interesting analogies to Huineng’s perspective that provide much food for thought. Socrates, for example, famously argues that “to know the good is to do the good,” implying that true understanding is always attested in actual life. In a different vein, there is also Martin Heidegger’s existential analysis of dasein in which he focuses on our unreflective “being-in-the-world” as demonstrating a prior unthematized Understanding, that is, our actual (as opposed to theoretical) knowledge of things. Perhaps the most obvious analogy, however, can be found in the work of Wang Yangming (Wang Shouren, 1472-1529). Among his teachings, Wang maintained that knowing and acting formed an essential original unity that people often separate through their own selfish desires. In fact, Wang explained to one of his greatest disciples, “There have never been people who know but do not act. Those who are supposed to know but do not act simply do not know.”

e. The Centrality of Ritual (Li)

This matter has received little attention until recently but is an outgrowth of the general Chinese focus on practice. We have already seen that in the Platform Sutra Huineng constantly preaches to his charges to act upon his teachings, putting them into practice. This preaching, of course, is itself a type of Chan practice and, in fact, occurs within a ritual context and in a temple setting. Giving and listening to a “dharma talk” are both highly ritualized activities that follow their own specified rules. Furthermore, Huineng repeatedly enjoins his followers to chant certain vows aloud and to take various types of precepts. Thus the entire discourse is pervaded by a strong sense of ritual, or li. There is a strong, albeit implicit message here that Huineng is calling for participation in specific activities from all those in his audience, that is, all who hear or read the Platform Sutra.

Adherence to li, of course, has been a primary focus of Chinese culture from the very earliest times, and philosophical discussion of li plays a central role in Chinese thought since at least the time of Confucius. Moreover, li by their very nature are a form of highly regulated activity that require repeated engagement to learn. One learns the li by doing the li. Huineng and the text of the Platform Sutra thus underscore the highly ritualized nature of Chan life, a fact that several scholars have noted and which provides yet another strong contrast to popular (mis)understandings of Chan. Rather than being an incitement to egocentric spontaneity (which would result in utter chaos, and hence more delusion and suffering), the “sudden awakening” espoused by Huineng can only occur within a ritual context in which all parties are actively engaged. Those involved are not “doing their own thing” but participating in a shared activity in which all energies are marshaled in concert. It is just for this reason that Huineng stresses the “samadhi of oneness” and Chan monastic training involves meditation training not just during periods of actual physical sitting but throughout all daily activities.

7. Impact on Later Buddhist and Chinese Philosophical Traditions

Huineng’s impact on Chan is without parallel. Not only did he articulate the major themes that came to dominate Chan discourse and practice, he provided the model of the ideal Master. By the late eighth century, two main branches of Chan existed: the “Northern” and “Southern” schools. Claiming to have studied under Huineng, Shenhui (684-758) launched an attack on the legitimacy of “Northern” Chan, which enjoyed imperial patronage during the Tang dynasty (618-907) under the leadership of Master Shenxiu (ca. 606-706) and his heir, Puji (651-739). Alleging that his teacher was the true recipient of dharma transmission and ridiculing the latter’s “gradualist” approach to awakening, Shenhui insisted that Huineng was the real Sixth Patriarch and claimed the title of Seventh Patriarch for himself. Shenhui’s claims carried the day and by the ninth century, the “Southern” school with its teaching of “sudden awakening” was accepted as the official line. Ironically, both the “Northern” and “Southern” schools eventually died out as direct lineages. It was only later that, having survived the imperial persecutions of 841-845, other Chan schools reasserted their connection(s) to Huineng and so enshrined the tale of unilinear dharma transmission.

The Platform Sutra became wildly popular in China, perhaps because of its paradoxical “Daoist” air, and numerous copies circulated. The traditional version, printed some five hundred years after the oldest version, is almost twice the size of the original due to later additions and expansions. Huineng’s idiosyncratic way of discussing the sutras, less of a strict exegesis and more a performance of their message, a practice known as tichang (Japanese teisho) set the standard for a Chan “dharma talk.” Stories of Huineng are scattered throughout the various gong’an (Japanese koan) collections. Perhaps the most famous of these allegedly comes from Huineng’s confrontation with Huiming, the fierce former general who came to kill him on the mountaintop. As the Huiming approached, the Master asked, “Not thinking of good, not thinking of evil, just at this moment, what is our original face before your mother and father were born?” Huiming at once became enlightened. This koan is still one of the first given to beginning students in Japanese Zen monasteries.

By inaugurating a powerful new approach to the dharma, however, Huineng had impact far beyond Buddhism and Chan. Philosophically, the strongest effect was on Neo-Confucianism, a major response of Confucian tradition to the challenges offered by Buddhism, particularly Chan. Each of the “Five Great Masters” (Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai, Cheng Yi, Cheng Hao, Zhu Xi) studied Chan at some point in their youth, and the records of their discussions with students as well as the anecdotes concerning their lives (collected in such works as Reflections on Things at Hand) strongly resemble later Chan collections such as the Wumen guan (The Gateless Gate). Chan influence on Wang Yangming is so great as to scarcely need comment.

As for Daoism, the most obvious impact Chan had was on the formation of the Quanzhen (“Complete Perfection”) school, a monastic sect that originated in the twelfth century. The Quanzhen sect shows blatant Chan influence, from its code of regulations, meditation techniques, and even the layout of its monastic compounds. The school’s founder, Wang Chongyang (1112-1170), with his cryptic teaching style and insistence on diligent practice at all times, could even be one of Huineng’s disciples.

The portrait of Huineng emerging from Chan tradition and the Platform Sutra in particular is quite compelling. The Master is portrayed as brilliant despite (or because of) his humble beginnings and takes on a truly heroic stature through his trials and eventual triumph. In his statements, Huineng comes across as immensely charismatic. He is by turns insightful, iconoclastic and humorous. Throughout his discourse he challenges his audience to leave behind intellectual preconceptions while undercutting all attempts to grasp his meaning by rational means. Ironically, during this lengthy verbal discourse he proclaims, “the practice of self-awakening does not lie in verbal arguments.” (section 38) This despite offering long harangues against Chan practitioners who have “false views.” Huineng, thus, is the archetypal Chan Master, a model for all later Chan practitioners. We can even see traces of Huineng in the character of Yoda, the great Jedi master from the Star Wars film series. At one point in Episode V: The Empire Strikes Back, Yoda famously tells his disciple Luke Skywalker, “Do, or do not — there is no ‘try’!” — a line that could be straight from the Platform Sutra. Truly, Huineng lives on.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Dumoulin, Heinrich. Zen Buddhism: A History. Vol. 1, India and China. New York: Macmillan, 1988.
    • The first in a nearly exhaustive two-volume treatment of the history of Chan/Zen Buddhism (the second volume deals exclusively with Japan). Accessible, detailed, interesting, this is a fine scholarly overview that both beginners and experts will find useful.
  • Faure, Bernard. The Rhetoric of Immediacy: A Cultural Critique of Chan/Zen Buddhism. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1995.
  • Faure, Bernard. The Will to Orthodoxy: A Critical Genealogy of Northern Chan Buddhism. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • Along with Faure’s Ch’an Insights and Oversights (1993), these two works exemplify the detailed, technical studies of Chan/Zen that have emerged during the past two decades. Faure draws heavily on Postmodern figures (Foucault, Derrida) in his powerful, wide-ranging yet insightful critical “unmasking” of traditional understandings of Chan and Zen.
  • Hershock, Peter D. Chan Buddhism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2005.
    • Part of the “Dimensions of Asian Spirituality” series, this may be the finest one volume overview of Chan/Zen available in English. Hershock skillfully steers a “middle way” between critical-historical scholarship and insight into the spiritual meaning of Chan/Zen teachings and practice. An admitted practicing Buddhist for over 20 years, Hershock fleshes out his “Zen Bones” with profiles of Huineng as well as other Chan masters (Bodhidharma, Mazu, and Linji). In the end he presents Chan/Zen as a vital practice that has the potential to help us shed our ego boundaries and open ourselves to our fellow human beings.
  • Hershock, Peter D. Liberating Intimacy: Enlightenment and Social Virtuosity in Ch’an Buddhism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
    • Hershock’s first book on Chan, presenting a unique and insightful philosophical take stressing Chan as a tradition of practice in the world. As the title suggests, Hershock maintains that Chan is a way towards achieving “liberating intimacy” with other sentient beings. A masterful refutation of charges that Chan/Zen is mere self-indulgent “navel gazing” or that it encourages antinomian or immoral behavior.
  • Jorgenson, John. Inventing Hui-neng, the Sixth Patriarch: Hagiography and Biography in Early Ch’an. Leiden: E. J. Brill Academic Publishing, 2005.
    • A recent critical analysis of the Huineng legend and the saga of Early Chan. The author uses the life of Confucius as the model on which Huineng’s biography is based. Very good at showing the influence of Confucianism, politics etc. on early Chan. The cover photo of Huineng’s alleged “mummy” alone is startling.
  • McRae, John R. The Northern School and the Formation of Early Ch’an Buddhism. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1986.
    • A major scholarly work drawing heavily on critical Japanese scholarship. McRae was one of the first to truly take on the traditional Chan/Zen story of the “Northern” versus “Southern” school.
  • Price, A.F., and Wong Mou-lam, trans. The Diamond Sutra and the Sutra of Hui-Neng. Boston: Shambhala Publications, Inc., 1990.
    • One of the special “Shambhala Dragon Editions” series, this work presents two of the most important texts in early Chan, and does so from a Chan perspective. While not scholarly by any means (there are very few notes), they definitely capture the iconoclastic spirit of Chan. As if to underscore this, a famous 13th century black ink painting of Huineng tearing up a sutra graces its cover. Wong’s translation of the Platform Sutra was the first ever done into English (in the 1930’s), and for that reason alone it is significant. It includes some episodes not in the Dunhuang version translated by Yampolsky (see below).
  • Suzuki, Daisetz Teitaro. The Zen Doctrine of No-mind: the Significance of the Sutra of Hui-Neng (Wei-Lang). York Beach, ME: Weiser Books, 1972.
    • Originally published in 1969, this is a posthumous work by one of the foremost (and controversial) popularizers of Zen in the West. While perhaps marked by a sort of “weisho quality,” this book demonstrates Suzuki’s awareness of critical scholarship on Chan/Zen tradition and a real understanding of many of the issues involved in Huineng’s “biography” and Zen teachings. Although not a roshi himself, Suzuki was never as much of an “outsider” to the Zen establishment as some of his critics have made him out to be. His personal experience with Zen training sharpened Suzuki’s insights and his comparisons with Christianity are thought provoking at the very least.
  • Yampolsky, Philip B., trans., The Platform Sutra of the Sixth Patriarch (New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • Still the definitive English translation, based upon the Dunhuang manuscript. All quotations in the above are taken from Yampolsky’s translation. Heavily annotated, it includes a lengthy introduction (over 100 pages), glossary, and a critical edition of the Chinese text at the very end. A must read for anyone seeking to understand Chan tradition and its most famous Patriarch.

Author Information

John M. Thompson
Email: john.thompson@cnu.edu
Christopher Newport University
U. S. A.

Gorgias (483—375 B.C.E.)

GorgiasGorgias was a Sicilian philosopher, orator, and rhetorician. He is considered by many scholars to be one of the founders of sophism, a movement traditionally associated with philosophy, that emphasizes the practical application of rhetoric toward civic and political life. The sophists were itinerant teachers who accepted fees in return for instruction in oratory and rhetoric, and many claimed they could teach anything and its opposite (thesis and antithesis). Another aspect of their method was the ability to make the weaker argument the stronger. The term sophist in classical Greek was a general appellation denoting a “wise man.” They were important figures in Greece in the 4th and 5th centuries, and their social success was great. Plato was the first to use the term rhêtorikê, while the sophists termed their “art” logos . Nevertheless, Gorgias is commonly associated with the development of rhetoric in classical Greece. The democratic process in Athens supplied the need for instruction in both rhetoric and philosophy.

Despite efforts by G.W.F Hegel and George Grote toward rehabilitating the reputations of Gorgias and the other sophists in the 19th century, the sophists still had a foul reputation well into the 20th century (as evidenced by the pejorative term “sophistry”). In 1930, French philosopher Jacques Maritain remarked “[s]ophistry is not a system of ideas, but a vicious attitude of the mind;” the sophists “came to consider as the most desirable form of knowledge the art of refuting and disproving by skillful arguments” (32-33). In recent years, however, modernists and post-structuralists have found great value in the philosophy of Gorgias, especially his theories on truth and language.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Philosophy
    1. Ontology & Epistemology
    2. Rhetorical Theory
  3. Critics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Gorgias (483-375 B.C.E.) came to Greece from Leontini in Sicily. Little is known of his life before he arrived in Athens in 427 B.C.E. as a political ambassador seeking military assistance against Syracuse, a city-state in Sicily. He delivered a series of speeches that dazzled the Athenian audiences and won him fame and admiration. Upon completion of his mission, he traveled throughout Greece as a teacher of rhetoric and as an orator, and according to Aristotle, spoke at the Panhellenic festivals (Art of Rhetoric 1414b29). He was a student of Empedocles, and according to Quintilian and others, was the teacher of Isocrates. Plato identifies Meno (Meno 76Aff) among the students of Gorgias, and he may have been one of Aspasia’s instructors as well. Many of the sophists set up schools and charged fees in return for instruction in rhetoric, and Gorgias was no exception. Philostratus (Lives of the Sophists I 9, I) tells us that Gorgias began the practice of extemporaneous oratory, and that he had the boldness to say “‘suggest a subject’ …he was the first to proclaim himself willing to take the chance, showing apparently that he knew everything and would trust the moment to speak on any subject.” He died at the age of 108 at Larissa in Thessaly.

Four works are attributed to Gorgias: On the Nonexistent or On Nature, the Apology of Palamedes, the Encomium on Helen, and the Epitaphios or Athenian Funeral Oration. The original text of On Nature has been lost, and survives only in two different paraphrases, one in Sextus Empiricus’ Against the Professors and another in an anonymous work entitled Melissus, Xenophanes, Gorgias. There are two different manuscripts of Palamedes and Helen (the Cripps and Palatine versions), one slightly different than the other. Legal historians consider the Defense of Palamedes to be an important contribution to dicanic [explanatory] argumentation, and some cultural historians believe the Epitaphios was used as a stylistic and genre source for Plato’s Menexenus (Cosigny 2). Gorgias’ rhyming style is highly poetic, and he viewed the orator as an individual leading a kind of group incantation. He employs metaphor and figurative expressions to illustrate his assertions, and even uses humor as one instrument of refutation. The term macrologia (using more words than necessary in an effort to appear eloquent) is sometimes used to describe his oratorical technique (Kennedy 63).

2. Philosophy

Any student of Gorgias must immediately mark the distinction between his philosophy as expressed by Plato in the dialogue Gorgias (see below) and his philosophy found within the three works: On the Nonexistent, the Apology of Palamedes, and the Encomium on Helen.

a. Ontology & Epistemology

Nowhere is Gorgias’ sophistical love of paradox more evident than in the short treatise On the Nonexistent or On Nature. The subject of this work is ontological (concerning nature of being), but it also deals with language and epistemology (the study of the nature and limitations of knowledge). In addition to this, it can be understood as an exercise in sophistical rhetoric; Gorgias tackles an argument that is seemingly impossible to refute, namely that, after considering our world, we must come to the conclusion that “things exist.” His powerful argument to the contrary proves his abilities as a master of oratory, and some believe the text was used as an advertisement of his credentials.

Gorgias begins his argument by presenting a logical contradiction, “if the nonexistent exists, it will both exist and not exist at the same time” (B3.67) (a violation of the principle of non-contradiction). He then denies that existence (to on) itself exists, for if it exists, it is either eternal or generated. If it is eternal, it has no beginning, and is therefore without limit. If it is without limit, it is “nowhere” (B3.69), and hence does not exist. And if existence is generated, it must come from something, and that something is existence, which is another contradiction. Likewise, nonexistence (to mê on) cannot produce anything (B3.71). The sophist then explains that existence can neither be “one” (hen) or “many” (polla), since if it were one, it would be divisible, and therefore not one. If it were many, it would be a “composite of separate entities” (B3.74) and no longer the thing known as existence.

Gorgias then turns his attention to what is knowable and comprehensible. He remarks, “if things considered [imagined or thought] in the mind are not existent, the existent is not considered” (B3.77), that is to say, existence is incomprehensible. This supposition is backed up by the fact that one can imagine chariots racing in the sea, but that does not make such a thing happen. The operation of the mind (intellection) is fundamentally distinct from what happens in the real world; “the existent is not an object of consideration and is not apprehended” (B3.82). It is helpful to think of apprehension here in Aristotelian terms, as simple apprehension, the first operation of reasoning (logic) in which the intellect “grasps” or “apprehends” something. Simple apprehension happens when the mind first forms a concept of something in the world, and is anterior to judgment.

Finally, Gorgias proclaims that even if existence could be apprehended, “it would be incapable of being conveyed to another” (B3.83). This is because what we reveal to another is not an external substance, but is merely logos (from the Greek verb lego, “to say”–see below). Logos is not “substances and existing things” (B3.84). External reality becomes the revealer of logos (B3.85); while we can know logos, we cannot apprehend things directly. The color white, for instance, goes from a property of a thing, to a mental representation, and the representation is different than the thing itself. In its summation, this nihilistic argument becomes a “trilemma”:

i. Nothing exists
ii. Even if existence exists, it cannot be known
iii. Even if it could be known, it cannot be communicated.

This argument has led some to label Gorgias as either an ontological skeptic or a nihilist (one who believes nothing exists, or that the world is incomprehensible, and that the concept of truth is fictitious). But it can also be interpreted as an assertion that it is logos and logos alone which is the proper object of our inquiries, since it is the only thing we can really know. On Nature is sometimes seen as a refutation of pre-Socratic essentialist philosophy (McComiskey 37).

b. Rhetorical Theory

Most of what we know concerning Gorgias’ views on rhetoric comes from the Encomium. This work can be understood as a sophistical effort to rehabilitate the reputation of Helen of Troy. In it, Gorgias attempts to take the weaker argument and make it the stronger one, by arguing for a position contrary to well-established opinion: in this case, the opinion that Helen was to blame for the Trojan War. Gorgias argues that Helen succumbed either to (a) physical force (Paris’ abduction), (b) love (eros), or (c) verbal persuasion (logos), and in any instance, she cannot be blamed for her actions. According to Gorgias, logos is a powerful force that can be used nefariously to convince people to do things against their own interests. It can take the form of poetry (metrical language), divine incantations, or oratory. Logos is described as a “powerful lord” (B11.8) and “[t]he effect of speech upon the condition of the soul is comparable to the power of drugs over the nurture of bodies” (B11.14). This should be contrasted with the view of Isocrates that logos is a “chief” or “commander” (Nicoles 5-9). The difference here is subtle, but Gorgias’ dynastic concept of logos clearly turns it into a despotic overlord, while Isocrates’ “commander” is a leader with delegated authority, an individual who fights along side his troops.

Examples of persuasive speech, according to Gorgias, are the “conflicts among the philosophers’ arguments in which the swiftness of demonstration and judgment make the belief in any opinion changeable” (B11.13). This is similar to the assertion of Sextus Empiricus that equally convincing arguments can be formed against, or in favor of, any subject. Gorgias may have believed in a relative notion of truth that was contingent upon a particular kairos (an opportune moment or “opening”), that is to say, truth can only be found within a given moment. He seems to reject the idea of truth as a philosophically universal principle, and thus comes into conflict with Plato and Aristotle. Nevertheless, the rhetor (orator) is ethically obligated to avoid deception, and it is “the duty of the same man both to declare what he should rightly and to refute what has been spoken falsely” (B11.2). Ultimately, Gorgias’ opinion concerning truth is difficult to ascertain, but from his writings, we can conclude that he was more concerned with rhetorical argument than the truth of any given proposition or assertion.

In the epideictic speech Defense of Palamedes, Gorgias uses a mythical narrator (Palamedes) to further illustrate his rhetorical technique and philosophy. In the Odyssey, Palamedes was responsible for revealing Odysseus’ “madness” as a fiction, an act for which the latter never forgave him. Ultimately, Palamedes was executed for treason, after Odysseus accused him of conspiring with the Trojans. Gorgias focuses on the invention of arguments (topoi) necessary to exonerate Palamedes within the setting of a fictional trial, all of which depend upon probability. Palamedes could not have committed treason with a foreign power since he speaks no language other than Greek (B11a.6-7), and no Greek desires social power among barbarians (B11a.13). In the second example, we see that topoi “embody the values of the community, in the sense that they comprise what the community considers important” (Cosigny 84). A fundamental difference between the topoi found within Aristotle’s Art of Rhetoric and Gorgias’ topoi is that Aristotle’s are “acontextual, while Gorgias places his in the narrative context of the Palamedes myth” (McComiskey 49). Therefore, there is a direct relationship between kairos and invention.

Gorgias rejects the use of pathos (emotional appeal) in his Defense, with the assertion that “among you, who are the foremost of the Greeks …there is no need to persuade such ones as you with the aid of friends and sorrowful prayers and lamentations” (B11a.33). He prefers to use ethos (ethical appeal, or arguments from character) and logos, as his instruments of persuasion.

3. Critics

Gorgias’ most famous critic is Plato. In the dialogue Gorgias, Plato (through his mentor Socrates) expresses his contempt for sophistical rhetoric; all rhetoric is “a phantom of a branch of statesmanship (463d) …a kind of flattery …that is contemptible,” because its aim is simply pleasure rather than the welfare of the public. Nor can rhetoric be considered an art (technê), since it is irrational (465a). The end result of rhetoric is a cosmetic alteration of language that conceals truth and falsity (465b). Furthermore, rhetoric is “designed to produce conviction, but not educate people, about matters of right or wrong (455a). The character of Gorgias in the dialogue is forced to admit that his “art” deals with opinion (doxa) rather than knowledge (epistemê); that its intention is to persuade rather than to instruct, and that rhetoric deals with language without regard to content. Gorgias is portrayed as a man with an ambivalent attitude towards truth, a relativist, who boldly asserts that it does not matter if one truly has knowledge of any given subject, only that he is perceived by others to have knowledge, and that “[r]hetoric is the only area of expertise you need to learn. You can ignore all the rest and still get the better of the professionals!” (459c).

There are a number of explanations for Plato’s antipathy towards sophistic rhetoric. The first is simply philosophical; Plato was not a relativist, nor did he believe rhetoric had a pedagogical value. But there is also a political element to be considered. Bruce McComiskey points out that Plato believed in an “oligarchic government” for Athens, while many of the sophists “favored the Athenian Democracy the way it was” (20). It is important to point out that during Gorgias’ lifetime, both Leontini and Athens were democratic city states and a loose alliance existed between the two. On a more practical level, the Greek city states also served as a market for those who would sell instruction in rhetoric.

Aristotle dismisses Gorgias as a “frigid” stylist who indulges in excessive use of compound words such as “begging-poet-flatterers” and “foresworn and well-sworn” (Art of Rhetoric 1405b34). He also faults Gorgias for overly poetic language (1406b4), and we can see examples of this in Gorgias’ description of logos as a great dynast or lord (B11.8) and as a “drug” (B11.14). The sophist compares orators to “frogs croaking in water”(B3.30), and philosophers to the “suitors of Penelope” (B3.29).

Despite efforts by G.W.F Hegel and George Grote toward rehabilitating the reputations of Gorgias and the other sophists in the 19th century, the sophists still had a foul reputation well into the 20th century (as evidenced by the pejorative term “sophistry”). In 1930, French philosopher Jacques Maritain remarked “[s]ophistry is not a system of ideas, but a vicious attitude of the mind;” the sophists “came to consider as the most desirable form of knowledge the art of refuting and disproving by skillful arguments” (32-33). In recent years, however, modernists and post-structuralists have found great value in the philosophy of Gorgias, especially his theories on truth and language.

4. References and Further Reading

Note: the citations above regarding Gorgias’ statements follow the alpha-numeric system used by Sprague (see below) in the text The Older Sophists (B3=On Non-Being, B11=Encomium on Helen, B11a=Defense of Palamedes).

  • Aristotle. The Art of Rhetoric. Trans. John Henry Freese. London: WM Heinemann, 1967.
  • Barrett, Harold. The Sophists: Rhetoric, Democracy, and Plato’s Idea of Sophistry. Novata: Chandler & Sharp, 1987.
  • Consigny, Scott. Gorgias: Sophist and Artist. Columbia: University of South Carolina, 2001.
  • Freeman, Kathleen. Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers. Cambridge: Harvard, 1948.
  • Gorgias. Encomium of Helen. Trans. Douglas MacDowell. Glasgow: Bristol Classics, 1982.
  • Isocrates. Isocrates. 3 vols. Trans. George Norlin and LaRue Van Hook. Cambridge: Harvard, 1968.
  • Jarratt, Susan. “The First Sophists and the Uses of History.” Rhetoric Review 6 (1987): 67-77.
  • Jarratt, Susan C. Rereading the Sophists: Classical Rhetoric Refigured . Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois University Press, 1991.
  • Kennedy, George. The Art of Persuasion in Greece. Princeton N.J.: Princeton University, 1963.
  • Kerferd, G.B. “The First Greek Sophists.” Classical Review 64 (1950): 8-10.
  • Marias, Julian. History of Philosophy. New York: Dover, 1967.
  • Maritain, Jacques. Introduction to Philosophy. Westminster MD: Christian Classics, 1991.
  • McComiskey, Bruce. Gorgias and the New Sophistic Rhetoric. Carbondale: Southern Illinois, 2002.
  • Plato. Gorgias. Trans. Robin Waterford. Oxford: Oxford, 1994.
  • Poulakos, John. Sophistical Rhetoric in Classical Greece. Columbia: University Of South Carolina, 1995.
  • Schiappa, Edward. “Sophistic Rhetoric: Oasis or Mirage?” Rhetoric Review 10 (1991):5-18.
  • Sprague, Rosamund Kent, ed. The Older Sophists. Columbia: University of South Carolina, 1972.

Author Information

C. Francis Higgins
Email: colin@louisiana.edu
University of Louisiana Lafayette
U. S. A.

Fazang (Fa-tsang, 643—712 C.E.)

The Buddhist ideologue Fazang (Fa-tsang) stands as one of the foremost figures of medieval Chinese Buddhism. He lived at the very pinnacle of Chinese Buddhism among towering figures such as the legendary pilgrim and Yogacara (Faxiang) master Xuanzang (602-664), the Chan patriarch Shenxiu (d. 706) and the great chronicler Daoxuan (596-667). According to Song dynasty biographer Zanning, he was “mysterious and upright, by nature surpassingly clever and sagacious.” For the better part of his life, he worked in close proximity with the highest echelons of imperial power, deeply engaged in matters of court and country. For four decades, under a series of emperors, he served as a lecturer, a translator, a rhetorician, a propagandist, and a miracleworker. Tirelessly, he lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, translated Buddhist sutras from Sanskrit and Khotanese (a Middle Iranian language once spoken in what is now China’s Xinjiang province) into Chinese, and wrote meticulously crafted commentaries interpreting Buddhist scripture in a manner that served to exalt his imperial patron’s status. Shortly after his death, the emperor Ruizong (r. 684-690, 710-712) praised him effusively: “The late monk Fazang inherited his virtuous karma from the Heavens and his open intelligence accorded with principle. With his eloquence and outstanding understanding, he had his mind interfused with penetrating enlightenment.” He would become known as the third patriarch and systematizer of the Flower Garland (Huayan or Hua-yen) school of Buddhism.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Thought
    1. Shunyata
    2. Bodhicitta
    3. Indra’s Net
    4. The Golden Lion
  3. Works
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Secondary Sources
    2. Primary Sources

1. Biography

Fazang was a native of Sogdiana (in Chinese, Sute). This is an Iranian civilization that encompassed territories now incorporated into the modern states of Uzbekistan and Tajikistan in Central Asia. As a youth, he embraced Buddhism with fervent devotion; at sixteen, he burned off one of his fingers as an offering to the Buddha before the Aśokan reliquary in the famous Famen Temple in the Tang dynasty capital of Chang’an. Thereafter, he became a recluse on nearby Mount Taibai, where he encountered masters of the Flower Garland (Avatamsaka) Sutra. Returning to Chang’an to attend to his ailing parents, he encountered Zhiyan (602-668) and became his student and disciple. Fazang was constantly called upon to explicate the profound wonders contained in the Flower Garland Sutra, lecturing to clergy and rulers more than thirty times.

Like many eminent Buddhists, a mystical aura has grown around Fazang in subsequent hagiography. One must investigate with a careful and critical eye the many miracles and legends that surround his person. Some of the purported miracles were closely associated with his oratory prowess. In 689, when he delivered his lecture on the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a piece of auspicious ice was discovered in which, it is said, an image of “twinned pagodas” appeared. When Śiksānanda and he were translating the Flower Garland Sutra in Luoyang, a hundred-petaled lotus flower blossomed in front of the translation hall. After lectures in 692 and 696, light allegedly issued from Fazang’s mouth, prompting the congregated faithful to marvel. On other occasions, following his lectures, it is said that flowers fell from the heavens and five-colored clouds accumulated in the skies.

Fazang appears to have been a practitioner of esoteric Buddhism, which many East Asian rulers believed commanded magical powers. In 697, the throne requested that he use Buddhist scriptural magic to help defeat the Khitan, a proto-Mongolian ethnic group that once dominated what is now Manchuria. Fazang performed a ritual cleansing, changed clothes, set an eleven-faced image of the bodhisattva (an enlightened being who selflessly seeks to aid others) Guanyin (Kuan-yin) on a ritual platform, and worked his magic. Heavenly drums echoed, the image of Guanyin appeared on high, surveying the countless divine troops who materialized to combat the raiders, inspiring the Zhou forces and plunging the Khitan into despair. This triumph prompted the empress Wu Zhao to exclaim, “This is the blessed aegis of Buddha force!” and change the reign era name to Shengong (“Divine Merit”).

He was also renowned as a conjurer, capable of summoning weather. On multiple occasions, his prayers and rites brought timely rain to alleviate drought. In 687, at the empress’ behest, he prayed for rain, fasting for seven days, until the skies fortuitously opened and drenched the parched ground. Again, in 696, his prayers proved effective in bringing salubrious rain to afflicted Yongzhou. In 702, Fazang invited another monk to pray at Wuzhen Temple in Lantian, which had no spring. After three dawns of reciting sutras, a freshet suddenly jetted forth at Maitreya Pavilion, bringing vernal bounty to the surrounding lands. Under the emperor Zhongzong, when drought struck Chang’an, Fazang prayed and performed Buddhist rites for seven days, finally bringing a downpour. The following year his prayers for rain were successful once again. Under the emperor Ruizong, he relieved drought and snowless winter, his sincere prayers brought down a blizzard.

In spite of his impressive monastic, scholastic, and thaumaturgical credentials, Fazang was no detached ascetic who speculated on matters recondite and metaphysical. Under Wu Zhao (a.k.a. Empress Wu or Wu Zetian, 624-705, r. 690-705), the only female emperor in Chinese history, the Buddhist clergy was politicized as never before. Contending against a Confucian tradition that stridently opposed her assumption of power, Wu Zhao naturally sought validation for her sovereignty in Buddhism. She styled herself in Buddhist terms as a cakravartin (a universal wheel-turning monarch) and a living bodhisattva. A brilliant orator, lecturer, ideologue, rhetorician and translator, Fazang was one of many Buddhist ideologues who helped sanction her sovereignty. He differed from the vast majority of her other Buddhist supporters in that he was an independent-minded and profound thinker who lectured to Wu Zhao, rather than mustering rhetoric for her. The remarkable duration and depth of their mutual commitment also stands out. For better than three decades, beginning when he preached the Flower Garland Sutra on behalf of her recently deceased mother, he applied his abundant talents toward enhancing Wu Zhao’s reputation as a Buddhist ruler.

At a pivotal juncture of Wu Zhao’s political ascent, as part of a grand ceremony early in 689 that anticipated the inauguration of her Zhou dynasty by a single year, she ordered Fazang to convene a dharma assembly and, from an elevated seat, expound upon the Flower Garland Sutra to thousands of Buddhist monks and nuns congregated for the event. When Fazang delivered a lecture at Buddha’s Prophecy Temple in Luoyang in 700 (shortly after the completion of his new translation of the Flower Garland Sutra), the ground of the lecture hall and temple purportedly shook. Rather than interpreting this earthquake in Confucian fashion, as an inauspicious disharmony of the elements, Wu Zhao understood it as a wondrous event, praising Fazang:

Because he has extended the knowledge of the subtle and profound; disseminated wisdom on the mysterious and abstruse, on the first day of translation, I dreamed that sweet dew descended as an auspicious sign. On the morning of the lecture I felt the earth tremor, a miraculous sign. This, then, was the footfall of the Future Buddha, Maitreya, using the mandala as a lucky icon.

This marriage of ideology and power did not end happily. In Wu Zhao’s turn toward Daoist expiatory rites and longevity potions during her final years, Fazang felt a shift in his patron’s imperial favor. In early 705, Fazang transported the sacred finger-bone of the Buddha from Famen Temple to Luoyang, where Wu Zhao placed him in charge of the relic veneration ceremony, which she believed might ameliorate her declining health. In this official capacity, which provided him access to her person and to the Forbidden City, Fazang worked in tandem with conspirators from the court and betrayed his longstanding patron Wu Zhao, supporting the coup that removed her in 705. A political opportunist, he continued to promote Flower Garland Buddhism serving under emperors Zhongzong (r. 684, 705-710), Ruizong, and Xuanzong (r. 712-756). Curiously, his treachery, to no small extent, saved Buddhism from being identified as a rogue ideology used to validate one whom the Confucian establishment styled an illegitimate female usurper.

Fazang’s successful promotion and propagation of Flower Garland Buddhism under successive rulers played an important role in the subsequent spread, development and Sinification of the school. Over a period of three decades, Fazang played a leading role in these cooperative efforts among the corps of Indian, Khotanese, Sogdian, Korean and Chinese writing translations and commentaries on Buddhist sutras. In Fazang’s epistolary correspondence with Korean Flower Garland monk Ŭisang, another disciple of his master Zhiyan, it is apparent that he attempted to propagate a worldwide state without barriers, an infinite realm linked by the Mahayana Buddhist faith. Fazang also taught another Korean monk, Shimsang, who helped transmit Chinese Flower Garland Buddhism to Japan. Ultimately, these contacts helped propagate Flower Garland Buddhism, linking it to a wider pan-Asian network

2. Thought

a. Shunyata

At the very heart of Flower Garland Buddhism is the idea of what is known in Sanskrit as shunyata (“emptiness”): universal interconnectedness, all-inclusiveness, intercausality and interpenetration. Fazang did a great deal to elevate Flower Garland Buddhism over rival schools, acknowledging other Buddhist schools and sutras, but championing the Flower Garland Sutra as the central teaching of the Buddha. As the Buddha’s first sermon upon attaining enlightenment, the nearly incomprehensible Flower Garland Sutra was invested with a profundity and wisdom unequalled in the Buddha’s subsequent works. In this effort, Fazang gathered and classified the rather unsystematic and wide-ranging Buddhist teachings into five categories in order of ascending profundity and power. In ascending order: Hinayana, Initial Mahayana, Final Mahayana, Sudden Teaching of the One Vehicle (proto-Zen), and, at the pinnacle, the Comprehensive Teaching of the One Vehicle—in essence, the Flower Garland Sutra. The sense of universality allowed the Flower Garland School to be compatible with other sects, effectively encompassing their doctrine, while maintaining the overarching primacy of the Flower Garland teachings.

b. Bodhicitta

This doctrine of interdependence is also reflected in Fazang’s thoughts on bodhicitta (mental dedication to helping all sentient beings and attaining enlightenment). Following the logic that each element pervades all that exists and itself contains all other elements in the phenomenal world, “In practicing the virtues, when one is perfected, all are perfected,” he writes, “and when one first arouses the thought of enlightenment one also becomes perfectly enlightened” (trans. Wright). Fazang’s emphasis on the omniversal generative power of the tathagatagarbha, the “womb of Buddhahood,” while not unique, subsequently developed into an important concept in the East Asian Mahayana Buddhist tradition.

So that others might better comprehend the profound doctrine of the Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang used the metaphor of the Ten Mysteries (Ten Mysterious Gates) to explicate the interconnectedness and inter-causality in the Flower Garland universe. These Ten Mysteries illustrate how seemingly contradictory pairs—the hidden and the manifest, truth and falsehood, the infinite and the infinitesimal, the general and the specific–mutually complement each other and coexist without obstruction. Indra’s net (see below) is one of the Ten Mysteries.

Fazang’s ideas of an interconnected omniverse extended easily and effectively from the metaphysical realm to the political arena. Indeed, it allowed Wu Zhao to serve as the alpha link in a cosmic concatenation. Stanley Weinstein has commented “Seeing herself as a universal monarch, she must have been attracted by the Flower Garland school with its well-ordered universe presided over by Vairocana Buddha, whose every act was reflected in countless worlds.” This integrated and totalistic vision of the cosmos was “analogous to the highly centralized imperial state that she ruled.” This ideology allowed Wu Zhao to portray herself as an absolute sovereign, all-pervasive and omnipresent. This central idea of the boundless reach of the Buddha’s power and compassion, nicely paralleled and supported the idea of the infinite compass of the ruler’s authority and benevolence. Fazang’s creative presentation and flair for theater (see below), both enhanced the great aesthetic, intellectual and philosophical appeal of his ideas and made them more comprehensible. In Wu Zhao, he found a potential cakravartin to propagate the Buddhist faith; in Fazang’s profound thought, she, in turn, discovered powerful ideological justification for her authority.

c. Indra’s Net

When Fazang first lectured on the Flower Garland Sutra, the principles he expounded upon were so abstruse that the listeners were utterly dumbstruck. Therefore, to render the sutra comprehensible to his imperial patrons and to the masses of Buddhist faithful, he used metaphors such as Indra’s Net of Jewels and the Golden Lion. In the former, “In each of the jewels, the images of all the other jewels are reflected…the images multiply infinitely, and all these multiple images are bright and clear within a single jewel.” This concatenation, this mutual linking and inter-penetration, illustrates harmonious interconnectedness of everything. Here, causal sky net objects can not be conceived of independently: the nature of each object is defined by its place with relation to all other objects. He also devised a Hall of Mirrors to illustrate the workings of Indra’s Net and the power of the Buddha by arranging ten mirrors (corresponding with the Ten Mysterious Gates), eight in an octagon, one above and one below, with a statue of the Buddha set in the middle, the focal point of origin and return. When he lit a torch to illumine the centerpiece, an endless web of reflected light crisscrossed, creating an infinite series of images within images, each containing the entire Buddha. This demonstration made manifest the meaning of the inexhaustible interconnectedness of the universe, hence the infinite power of the Buddha.

d. The Golden Lion

Fazang’s most famous device of performative metaphor was a lion made of gold. The lion represents the cosmos, parts of the lion the various phenomena of the universe, while the gold represented emptiness. The lion had a mane, teeth, claws and eyes: parts that seemed distinct and unrelated. And yet the essential substance of the entire lion was the same–gold. Within each hair, paradoxically, there are infinite lions. The differences are all superficial. Such is the nature of the integrated, interconnected Flower Garland universe. After demonstrating this principle to Wu Zhao using the sculpture of a lion at the imperial palace gate around 700 (sources differ), Fazang wrote a one-chapter Essay on the Golden Lion.

In his Treatise on the Five Teachings, a house is used as a metaphor for the universe. The complex interplay between joists, uprights, roof, tenons and mortises—the sum total of structural relationships between all parts–is contained in a single rafter. The nature of the infinite can be seen in the infinitesimal. The role of the rafter–or any other component–helps one understand the interdependence of all sentient beings. Certainly, Fazang’s flair for the theatrical and his ability to convey the message to his patrons through such brilliant demonstrations, helped successfully propagate Flower Garland Buddhism.

3. Works

Much of Fazang’s energy was devoted to exegetical work on and demonstrations of the Flower Garland Sutra. He produced more than sixty original works, commentaries on a wide variety of Buddhist texts, and meditation manuals, and participated in many Buddhist translation projects. Collectively, Fazang’s works and translations must be looked at not only in terms of their metaphysical and ideological merit, but as political rhetoric consciously geared toward promoting the Flower Garland school and exalting the sovereignty of his imperial sponsors. Fazang’s Treatise on the Five Teachings detailed a hierarchy of Buddhist sects, placing, of course, Flower Garland at the apex and clarifying common ideological ground.

Fazang was a propagandist. His Huayanjing zhuanji, a commentary he wrote between 690 and 693, helped provide legitimacy for Wu Zhao’s claim to be a cakravartin. Making reference to her titles as “Sage Mother” and “Divine Sovereign,” Fazang remarked, “Both sage and divine, she makes the Six Supernatural Penetrations act without stopping; infinitely good and infinitely beautiful, she displays the Ten Goodnesses beyond all limits.”

For Wu Zhao, retranslating and reinterpreting the Flower Garland Sutra was an ongoing, high-priority political activity. Fazang played a pivotal role in this effort. The Flower Garland Sutra was at the heart of a deep-rooted and longstanding Khotanese tradition of Buddhist kingship, with a Chinese lineage going from ruler Shi Hu of the Eastern Jin in the 4th century to Liang Wudi to Sui Wendi and finally to Wu Zhao. She sent emissaries to Khotan to seek the Sanskrit version of the Flower Garland Sutra. In 679, the Indian monk Divākara presented newly recovered Sanskrit sutras at Gaozong’s court. In 684, with Divākara, Fazang worked on a translation of the Flower Garland Sutra at Western Taiyuan Temple. As preparatory work for the compilation of the new Flower Garland Sutra, Fazang compared these new texts to extant translations, noting disparities and incorporating omissions. Between 695 and 699, she recruited Khotanese monks such as Śiksānanda and Devaprajña to work in tandem with Fazang, completing a new, improved Flower Garland Sutra that was eighty chapters instead of sixty. This new Flower Garland Sutra superseded the version completed in the 680s and helped confirm Wu Zhao’s identification as a cakravartin and a bodhisattva.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Secondary Sources

  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 1963.
  • Pages 406–424 include a brief survey of Flower Garland school thought and a full translation of the “Golden Lion Essay.”
  • Chen, Jinhua. Monks and Monarchs, Kinship and Kingship: Tanqian in Sui Buddhism and Politics. Italian School of East Asian Studies Essays Series, vol. 3. Kyoto: Scuola Italiana di Studi sull’Asia Orientale, 2002.
  • Chen, Jinhua. “More Than a Philosopher: Fazang (643-712) as a Politician and Miracle-worker.” History of Religions 42.4 (May 2003): 320-358.
  • Cook, Francis. Hua-yen Buddhism: The Jewel Net of Indra. Penn State University Press, 1977.
  • DeBary, Wm. Th., et al, eds. Sources of Chinese Tradition, Vol I., 2nd ed. Columbia University Press, 1999.
  • Pp. 471-476 includes sections from the Flower Garland Sutra such as “The Tower of Vairocana” and “Indra’s Net.”
  • Fang, Litian. Huayan jin shizi zhang jiaoshi, Zhongguo Fojiao dianji xuankan. Zhonghua, 1996.
  • Forte, Antonino. A Jewel in Indra’s Net: The Letter Sent by Fazang in China to Ŭisang in Korea. Italian School of East Asian Studies Occasional Papers 8. Kyoto, 2000.
  • Forte, Antonino. Mingtang and Buddhist Utopias in the History of the Astronomical Clock: The Tower, the Statue and the Armillary Sphere Constructed by Empress Wu. Rome, 1988. See pp. 121-122.
  • Forte, Antonino. Political Propaganda and Ideology in China at the End of the Seventh Century. Naples, 1977.
  • Fox, Alan. “Fazang.” Great Thinkers of the Eastern World, ed. Ian P. McGreal (HarperCollins, 1995), 99-103.
  • Gu, Zhengmei. “Wu Zetian de Huayan jing: Fowang chuantong yu fowang xingxiang.” Guoxue yanjiu 7 (2000): 279-321.
  • Liu, Ming-Wood. “The Harmonious Universe of Fa-tsang and Leibniz.” Philosophy East and West 32 (1982): 61-76.
  • Rothschild, Norman H. Sub-chapter “Fazang” in “Rhetoric, Ritual and Support Constituencies in the Political Authority of Wu Zhao, Woman Emperor of China.” Ph.D. dissertation, Brown University, 2003.
  • Weinstein, Stanley. “Imperial Patronage in T’ang Buddhism.” Perspectives on the T’ang, eds. Arthur F. Wright and Denis C. Pritchett (Yale University Press, 1973), 265-306.
  • Weinstein, Stanley. Buddhism in T’ang China. Cambridge University Press, 1987.
  • Wright, Dale. “The ‘Thought of Enlightenment’ In Fa-tsang’s Hua-yen Buddhism.” The Eastern Buddhist (Fall 2001): 97-106.

b. Primary Sources

  • Ch’oe Ch’iwŏn (Cui Zhiyuan), Da Tang Jianfusi gu shu fanjing dade Fazang heshang zhuan, (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2054).
    • Biography.
  • Daoxuan, Xu Gaoseng zhuan (Biographies of Eminent Monks), Taisho Triptika, vol. 50, no. 2060.
    • Biography.
  • Fazang, Dasheng qixinlun yiji, Taisho Tripitika vol. 44, no. 1846.
  • Fazang, Fanwang jing pusa jieben shu, Taisho Tripitika vol. 40, no. 1813.
    • Commentary on Brahmajala sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing tanxuan ji (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 35, no. 1733).
    • Commentary on the profundities of the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayan jing wenyi gangmu, Taisho Tripitika, vol 35, no. 1734.
    • Explicates the ten mysterious gates (Ten Mysteries) from the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing zhigui (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 45, no. 1871).
    • Commentary on the Flower Garland Sutra.
  • Fazang, Huayanjing zhuanji (Taisho Tripitika, vol. 51, no. 2073).
    • Propaganda supporting Wu Zhao’s sovereignty written between 690 and 693.
  • Fazang, Huayan Wujiao zhang (Treatise of the Five Teachings), Taisho Tripitika, vol. 45, no, 1866.
    • Central work that classifies Buddhist teachings and situates the Flower Garland Sutra at the apex.
  • Fazang, Jin shizi zhang, (Essay on the Golden Lion), Taisho Tripitika vol. 45, no. 1881.
  • Yan Chaoyin, “Da Tang Jianfusi gu dade Kangzang fashi zhi bei,” Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2054.
    • Funerary epitaph.
  • Zanning, Song Gaoseng zhuan, Taisho Tripitika, vol. 50, no. 2061.
  • Zhipan, Fozu tongji, Taisho Tripitika vol. 49, no. 2035.
    • Biography is fascicle 29 of this Southern Song dynasty (1127-1279) work.

Author Information

Norman Harry Rothschild
Email: hrothsch@unf.edu
University of North Florida
U. S. A.

Epistemic Closure Principles

Epistemic closure principles state that the members of an epistemic set (such as propositions known by me) bear a given relation (such as known deductive entailment) only to other members of that epistemic set.  The principle of the closure of knowledge under known logical entailment is that one knows everything that one knows to be logically entailed by something else one knows.  For instance, if I know grass is green, and I know that grass is green deductively entails that grass is green or the sky is blue, then I know that grass is green or the sky is blue.  Epistemic closure principles are employed in philosophy in myriad ways, but some theorists reject such principles, and they remain controversial.

Some people see closure principles as capturing the idea that we can add to our store of knowledge by accepting propositions entailed by what we know; others claim that this is a misunderstanding, and that closure principles are silent as to how a piece of knowledge is, or can be, acquired.  For instance, the proposition I have a driver’s license issued by the state of North Carolina entails that North Carolina is not a mere figment of my imagination.  According to the principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment, if I know the former claim, and I know the entailment, I know the latter claim.  Some insist, however, that this must be distinguished from the (possibly) false claim that I could come to know the latter on the basis of my knowing the former, since my basis for knowing the former involves presupposing the latter (by taking my sense experience and memory at more or less face value, for instance).

Closure principles are employed in both skeptical and anti-skeptical arguments.  The skeptic points out that if one knows an ordinary common sense proposition (such as that one has hands) to be true, and knows that this proposition entails the falsity of a skeptical hypothesis (such as that one is a handless brain in a vat, all of whose experiences are hallucinatory), one could know the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis, in virtue of knowledge being closed under known entailment.  Since one cannot know the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis (or so the skeptic maintains), one also must not know the truth of the common sense claim that one has hands.  Alternatively, the anti-skeptic might insist that we do know the truth of the common sense proposition, and hence, in virtue of the closure principle, we can know that the skeptical hypothesis is false.  Although the closure principle is sometimes used by anti-skeptics, some view the rejection of closure as the key to refuting the skeptic.

Table of Contents

  1. The Closure of Knowledge under Known Entailment
    1. The Closure of Knowledge Under Entailment
    2. The Closure of Knowledge Under Known Entailment
    3. Justification, Single-Premise and Multiple-Premise Closure
  2. Philosophical Uses of the Closure Principle
  3. Externalist Accounts of Knowledge and the Rejection of Closure
    1. Epistemic Externalism and Internalism
    2. Nozick’s Tracking Account of Knowledge and the Failure of Closure
    3. Dretske’s Externalist Account of Knowledge and Closure Failure
    4. “Abominable Conjunctions”
    5. Alternative Anti-Skeptical Strategies Need Not Reject Closure
    6. Some Skeptical Arguments do not Employ Closure
  4. Dogmatism and the Rejection of Closure
  5. The McKinsey Paradox, Closure, and Transmission Failure
    1. The McKinsey Paradox
    2. Davies, Wright, and the Closure/Transmission Distinction
  6. Ordinary Propositions, Lottery Propositions, and Closure
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. The Closure of Knowledge under Known Entailment

a. The Closure of Knowledge Under Entailment

A set is closed under a particular relation if all the members of the set bear the relation only to other members of the set. The set of true propositions is closed under entailment because true propositions entail only other truths. Since false propositions sometimes entail truths, false propositions are not closed under entailment. Epistemic closure principles state that members of an epistemic set (such as my justified beliefs) are closed under a given relation (which may be a non-epistemic relation, like entailment, or an epistemic one, such as known entailment).

A simple closure principle is the principle that knowledge is closed under entailment:

If a subject S knows that p, and p entails q, then S knows that q.

Less schematically, this says that if one knows one thing to be true and the known claim logically entails a second thing, then one knows the second thing to be true. This principle has obvious counter-examples. A complicated theorem of logic is entailed by anything (and hence by any proposition one knows), but one may not realize this and may thus fail to believe (or even grasp) the theorem. Since one must at least believe a proposition in order to know that it is true, we see that one may fail to know something entailed by something else that one knows. Additionally, even if a proposition is entailed by something one knows, if one comes to believe the proposition through some epistemically unjustified process, one will fail to know the proposition (since one’s belief of it will be unjustified). For instance, if one knows that one will start a new job today and then comes to believe that one will either start a new job today or meet a handsome stranger based on the testimony of her astrologist, then perhaps she will fail to know the truth of the entailed disjunction.

b. The Closure of Knowledge Under Known Entailment

It is more plausible that knowledge is closed under known entailment:

If S knows that p, and knows that p entails q, then S knows that q.

As stated, however, the principle seems vulnerable to counter-examples similar to the ones just discussed. The subject might fail to put his knowledge that p together with knowledge that p entails q and thus fail to infer q at all. One might know that she has ten fingers and that if she has ten fingers then the number of her fingers is not prime, but simply not bother to go on to deduce and form the belief that her number of fingers is not prime. Alternatively, although the subject could have come to believe q by inferring it correctly from something else that she knows (since she is aware of the entailment), she instead might have come to believe q through some other, epistemically unjustified, process.

How can we capture the idea that one can add to one’s store of knowledge by recognizing and assenting to what is entailed by what one already knows? This formulation seems suitably qualified:

If S knows that p, and comes to believe that q by correctly deducing it from her belief that p, then S knows that q.

Less formally, if I know one thing, correctly deduce another thing from it, and come to believe this second thing by so deducing it, then I know the second thing to be true. This principle eliminates counterexamples in which the subject fails to believe the entailed claim (and thus fails to know it) or comes to believe the entailed claim for bad reasons (and thus fails to know the claim). (Henceforth, uses in this article of the phrase “the principle of closure of knowledge under known entailment” should be regarded as referring to this preferred formulation of the principle).

So much is built into the antecedent of this principle that it might now seem trivial but, as we shall see, it has been disputed on various grounds.

c. Justification, Single-Premise and Multiple-Premise Closure

We would seem to have similar grounds for supposing that justified belief is closed under known entailment. One is epistemically justified in believing whatever one correctly deduces from one’s justified beliefs. This captures the idea that one way to add to one’s store of justified beliefs is to believe things entailed by your justified beliefs. When one reasons validly, the justification that one has for the premises carries over to the conclusion.

The mere fact that justification is (ordinarily taken to be) one of the necessary conditions for knowledge does not strictly entail that justification is closed under the same operations (such as known entailment) that knowledge is closed under. As Steven Hales (1995) has pointed out, to argue in this manner is to commit the fallacy of division: to infer from the fact that a whole thing has a particular quality, that each of its components must have this quality as well. For instance, it does not follow from the fact that the glee club is loud that each, or even any, of the individual singers in the glee club is loud. Knowledge might be closed under known entailment even if justified belief is not, if all the counterexamples to the closure of justification were examples in which the justified belief was missing at least one of the necessary conditions for knowledge. There seems to be no particular reason to believe that this is the case, however. (See Brueckner 2004 for more on this point).

The closure principles discussed thus far are instances of single premise closure. For instance, one’s knowledge that a given particular premise is true, when combined with a correct deduction from that premise of a conclusion, seems to guarantee that one knows the conclusion. There are also multiple premise closure principles. Here is an example:

If S knows that p and knows that q, and S comes to believe r by correctly deducing it from p and q, then S knows that r.

That is, if I know two things to be true and can deduce a third thing from the first two, then I know the third thing to be true. There is good reason to be dubious of multiple premise closure principles of justification, such as

If S is justified in believing that p and justified in believing that q, and S correctly deduces r from p and q, then S is justified in believing that r.

Lottery examples reveal the difficulty. Given that there are a million lottery tickets and that exactly one of them must win, it is plausible (though not obvious) that for any particular lottery ticket, I am justified in believing that it will lose. So I am justified in believing that ticket one will lose, that ticket two will lose, and so forth, for every ticket. But if I know that there are a million tickets, and I am justified in believing each of a million claims to the effect that ticket n will lose and I can correctly deduce from these claims that no ticket will win, then by closure I would be justified in concluding that no ticket will win, which by hypothesis is false. Justified belief is fallible, in that one can be justified in believing something even if there is a chance that one is mistaken; conjoin enough of the right sort of justified but fallible beliefs and the resulting conjunction will be unlikely to be true, and thus unjustified.

If knowledge, like justified belief, is fallible (say, only 99.9% certainty is required), then multiple premise closure principles for knowledge will fail as well. One could be sufficiently certain for knowledge about each of a thousand claims (“I will not die today”; “I will not die tomorrow”; …; “I will not die exactly 569 days from today”; etc.), but not sufficiently certain of the conjunction of these claims (“I will not die on any of the next thousand days”) in order to know it, even though it is jointly entailed by those thousand known claims (and thus true). The fallibility of knowledge is far more controversial than the fallibility of justified belief, however.

Similarly, closure might be thought to hold for different types of knowledge, such as a priori knowledge (i.e. knowledge not gotten through sense experience, to oversimplify a bit). If one knows a priori that p, and knows a priori that p entails q, then one knows a priori that q. Intuitively, it seems that if one knows the premises of an argument a priori and is able to validly deduce a conclusion from those premises, one would know the conclusion a priori as well. This last point is on weaker ground, however, as discussed in Section 5b.

2. Philosophical Uses of the Closure Principle

The closure principle, now qualified to handle the straightforward counterexamples, has been employed in skeptical and anti-skeptical arguments, in support of a dogmatic refusal pay attention to evidence that counts against what one knows, to generate a paradox about self-knowledge, and for many other philosophical ends.  These uses are described in brief in this section, and in greater detail in later sections.

The skeptic may argue as follows:

  1. I do not know that I am not a handless, artificially stimulated brain in a vat.
  2. I do know that I have hands entails I am not a handless, artificially stimulated, brain in a vat.
  3. If I know one thing, and I know that it entails a second thing, then I also know the second thing. (Closure)
  4. Thus, I do not know that I have hands. (From 2 and 3, if I knew I had hands I would know that I am not a brain in a vat, in contradiction with 1).

If one really knew the ordinary common sense claim to be true, one could deduce the falsity of the skeptical claim from it and come to know that the skeptical claim is false (by closure). The fact that one cannot know that the skeptical claim is false (as per the first premise) demonstrates that one does not in fact know that the common sense proposition is true either. (See also Contemporary Skepticism).

But one person’s modus tollens (the inference from if p then q and not-q to the conclusion not-p) is another person’s modus ponens (the inference from if p then q and p to the conclusion q), as we can see from an anti-skeptical argument of the sort associated with G.E. Moore. (See Moore 1959).

  1. I know that I have hands.
  2. I know that I have hands entails I am not a handless, artificially stimulated, brain in a vat.
  3. If I know one thing, and I know that it entails a second thing, then I also know the second thing. (Closure)
  4. Thus, I know that I am not a handless, artificially stimulated brain in a vat.

From the fact that one knows that she has hands and this is incompatible with a skeptical hypothesis under which her hands are illusory, one can infer, and thus come to know (if closure is correct), the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis.

The closure principle can be used even in defense of a dogmatic rejection of any recalcitrant evidence that counts against something that one takes oneself to know. The argument runs as follows (adapted from Harman 1973):

  1. I know my car is parked in Lot A. (Assume)
  2. I know that if my car is parked in Lot A, and there is evidence that my car is not parked in Lot A (say, testimony that the car has been towed), then the evidence is misleading. (Analytic, since evidence against a truth must be misleading)
  3. Thus, I know that any evidence that my car is not parked in Lot A is misleading. (Closure)
  4. I know that there is evidence that my car is not parked in Lot A. (Assume)
  5. Thus, I know that this evidence (testimony that my car was towed) is misleading. (Closure)
  6. If a piece of evidence is known by me to be misleading, then I ought to disregard it. (Analytic)
  7. Thus, I ought to disregard any evidence that my car is not parked in Lot A. (From 5 and 6)

This result seems paradoxical, however, as most would claim that it is epistemically irresponsible to ignore all the evidence against what one takes oneself to know, simply because it is evidence against what one takes oneself to know. It is plausible (though hardly obvious) that one takes oneself to know each thing that one believes (considered individually). If this is conjoined with the argument above, it entails that one ought to ignore any evidence against what one believes. This seems to be an even more ill-considered policy.

The closure principle also figures prominently in a paradox about self-knowledge and knowledge of the external world. It is now widely accepted that some thought contents are individuated externally. That is, there are some thought contents that one could not have unless one was in an environment or linguistic community that is a certain way. On this view, one could not think the thought that water is wet were one not in an environment with water, or at least with some causal connection to water. Given content externalism, it seems we may argue as follows (the argument is due to McKinsey 1991):

  1. I know that I have mental property M (say, the thought that water is wet). (Assume privileged access to one’s own thoughts)
  2. I know that if I have mental property M (the thought that water is wet), then I meet external conditions E (say, living in an environment containing water). (Externalism with respect to content)
  3. If I know one thing, and I know that it entails a second thing, then I know the second thing. (The principle of the closure of knowledge under known entailment).
  4. Thus, I know that I meet external conditions E (namely, that I live in environs containing water). (From 1, 2 and 3)

The conclusion follows from an application of the closure principle, but what makes this paradoxical is that it appears that the knowledge that is attributed in the premises depends on reflection alone (introspection plus a priori reasoning), whereas the knowledge attributed in the conclusion is empirical. If the premises are correct, and closure holds, I can know an empirical fact by reflection alone (since I know it on the basis of premises than can be known by reflection alone). Something seems to have gone wrong and it is unclear which premise, if any, is the culprit.

Closure principles figure in another philosophical puzzle about knowledge of “ordinary propositions”, those we ordinarily take ourselves to know, and “lottery propositions,” those that, although extremely likely, we do not ordinarily take ourselves to know. Suppose that one is struggling to get by on a pensioner’s income. It seems plausible to say that one knows one will not be able to afford a mansion on the French Riviera this year. However, that one will not be able to afford the mansion this year entails that one will not win the lottery. By the closure principle, since one knows that one will not be able to afford the mansion, and knows that this entails that one will not win the lottery, one must know that one will not win the lottery. However, very few are inclined at accept that one knows one will not win the lottery. After all, there’s a chance one could win.

3. Externalist Accounts of Knowledge and the Rejection of Closure

a. Epistemic Externalism and Internalism

To determine whether someone is epistemically justified in believing something, one must do so from a particular point of view. One may consider the point of the view of the agent who holds the belief or of someone who possesses all the relevant information (which may be unavailable to the agent). To oversimplify, those who consider only the subject’s perspective when evaluating the subject’s epistemic justification are epistemic internalists, and those who adopt the point of view of one with all the relevant information are epistemic externalists. An account of epistemic justification is internalist if it requires that all the elements necessary for an agent’s belief to be epistemically justified are cognitively accessible to the agent; that is, these elements (say, evidence or reasons) must be internal to the agent’s perspective. Externalist theories of justification, on the other hand, allow that some of the elements necessary for epistemic justification (such as a belief’s being produced by a process that makes it objectively likely to be true) may be cognitively inaccessible to the agent and external to the agent’s perspective.

There are so many varieties of internalism and externalism that further generalization is perilous. Considering the theories’ respective treatments of the problem of induction illustrates the basic difference between them. Hume famously argued that although we rely on inductive inferences, we have access to no non-question begging justification for doing so, as our only grounds for thinking that induction will continue to be reliable is that it always has been reliable. This is an inductive justification of the belief that induction is epistemically justified. If Hume is right, then a typical internalist will concede that beliefs based on inductive reasoning are not epistemically justified. An externalist, however, might insist that such beliefs are justified, provided that inductive reasoning as a matter of fact is a process that reliably produces mostly true beliefs, whether the agent who reasons inductively has access to that fact or not. On the other hand, an epistemic internalist might rate the beliefs of a brain in a vat or a victim of Cartesian evil demon deception as epistemically justified, provided that they were formed in a way that seems reasonable from the point of the view of the agent (the brain in a vat), such as through the careful consideration of evidence (evidence, albeit, that is misleading). The epistemic externalist, however, likely would rate such an agent’s beliefs as unjustified, on the basis of evidence not accessible to the agent, such as that the belief-forming processes she relies on make her beliefs extremely likely to be false.

For the most part, internalist accounts of knowledge are those that appeal to an internalist conception of epistemic justification and externalist accounts of knowledge employ an externalist conception of justification. (Alternatively, one may be an internalist about justification and an externalist about knowledge, by rejecting the view that epistemic justification is one of the requirements for knowledge.) Perhaps the greatest challenge to closure principles for knowledge comes from externalist theories of knowledge, notably those of Robert Nozick and Fred Dretske.

b. Nozick’s Tracking Account of Knowledge and the Failure of Closure

It strikes many that some version of the closure principle must be true. The idea that no version of the principle is true is, according to one noted epistemologist, “one of the least plausible ideas to come down the philosophical pike in recent years.” (Feldman 1995) Nevertheless, philosophers have argued against the epistemic closure principle on many different grounds. One serious challenge to closure arose from those who proposed the “tracking” analysis of knowledge (notably Nozick 1981). According to the tracking theory, to know that p is to track the truth of p. That is, one’s true belief that p is knowledge if and only if the following two conditions hold: if p were not the case, one would not believe that p, and if p were the case, one would believe that p. For one’s belief that p to be knowledge, one’s belief must be sensitive to the truth or falsity of p; that sensitivity is captured by the two subjunctive conditions above. One knows that Albany is the capital of New York only if one would not believe it if it were false, and would believe it if it were true. (See also Robert Nozick’s epistemology).

This is an externalist theory of knowledge because whether or not an agent satisfies the subjunctive conditions for knowledge may not be cognitively accessible to the agent. To evaluate an agent’s belief, with respect to whether it meets those conditions, it may be necessary to adopt the point of view of someone with information not accessible to the agent.

Let’s illustrate this with an example similar to Nozick’s own (1981, 207). Let p be the belief that one is sitting in a chair in Jerusalem. Let q be the belief that one’s brain is not floating in a tank on Alpha Centauri, being artificially stimulated so as to make one believe one is sitting in a chair in Jerusalem. Suppose one has a true belief that p. In the “closest” counterfactual situations (to employ the terminology of one account of truth-conditions for subjunctives) in which p is false (say, one is standing in Jerusalem, or one is sitting in Tel Aviv), one will not believe p. In close counterfactual situations in which one is sitting in Jerusalem, one does believe that p. One’s belief of p tracks the truth of p and thus counts as knowledge.

Suppose, on the other hand, that one has a true belief that q. If one’s belief that q were false, however (and one really was in this predicament on Alpha Centauri), one would still believe (falsely) that one was not in Alpha Centauri (q). One’s belief that q, while actually true, does not track the truth of q (being held when q is true but not when q is false). Hence, the belief that q does not count as knowledge.

How does this relate to the closure of knowledge? The proposition that one is sitting in Jerusalem (p) entails that one’s brain is not floating in a tank in Alpha Centauri, being stimulated so as to make one think that one is sitting in Jerusalem (q). We may suppose that one can correctly deduce q from p. Even so, since one’s belief that p tracks the truth of p and counts as knowledge and one’s belief that q does not do so, knowledge fails to be closed under known entailment. One may know that p, and know that p entails q (and come to believe the latter by correctly deducing it from the former), and yet fail to know that q.

Nozick’s account has at least two virtues. One is that the tracking analysis of knowledge is plausible. The other is that the rejection of closure allows us to reconcile the following two claims, both of which seem plausible but had seemed incompatible: (1) we do know many common sense propositions, such as that I have hands, and (2) we do not know that skeptical hypotheses, such as that I am a handless, artificially stimulated brain in a vat, are false. One desideratum of a theory of knowledge is that it refutes skepticism while accounting for the plausibility and persuasiveness of the skeptic’s case against common sense knowledge claims. Both the skeptic and the Moorean anti-skeptic come up short here. The skeptic must deny our common sense knowledge claims and the Moorean must maintain that we can know the falsity of skeptical hypotheses. As long as we accept the closure principle, whether we are skeptics or anti-skeptics, we cannot maintain both that we know common sense propositions and that we do not know that the skeptical hypotheses are false, since we know that the common sense propositions entail the falsity of the skeptical propositions. Knowledge of the truth of the common sense claims would, if knowledge is closed under known entailment, guarantee our knowledge that skeptical hypotheses are false. Citing our failure to know that skeptical hypotheses are false, the skeptic applies modus tollens and infers that we must not know the common sense propositions. The rejection of closure blocks this move by the skeptic.

This is not to say that there are not plausible counterexamples to the tracking account of knowledge. I may know my mother is not the assassin since she was with me when the assassination took place. But counterfactually, if she were the assassin, I would still believe she was not, since after all I couldn’t believe such a thing of my mother. My belief that my mother is not the assassin fails to track the truth, since I would have believed it even if it were false, but it seems quite plausible that I do know she’s not the assassin, as my evidence for her innocence is quite overwhelming – my mother cannot be in two places at once. Tracking accounts like Nozick’s, which do not make reference to the reasons the agent has for the belief in question, seem vulnerable to such counterexamples.

c. Dretske’s Externalist Account of Knowledge and Closure Failure

Dretske’s account of knowledge is as follows: one’s true belief that p on the basis of reason R is knowledge that p if only if (i) one’s belief that p is based on R and (ii) R would not hold if p were false. Less formally, we may put this as follows: one knows a given claim to be true only if one has a reason to believe that it is true, and one would not have this reason to believe it if it were not true. (See Dretske 1971). This is an externalist account because whether an agent meets conditions (i) and (ii) above may be inaccessible to the agent. One could believe a claim on the basis of a particular reason without being able to explain one’s reliance on that reason, and without knowing whether one would still have the reason if the claim were false. For instance, one might believe that one’s toes are curled on the basis of proprioceptive evidence (evidence that one would not have if one’s toes were not curled), without one having any idea what proprioception is, what sort of evidence one has for the claim that one’s toes are curled, or whether one would have such evidence even if one’s toes were uncurled.

Let’s illustrate Dretske’s account with his famous zebra example (Dretske 1970). Suppose one is in front of the zebra display at the zoo. One believes that one is seeing zebras on the basis of perceptual evidence. Furthermore, in the closest possible worlds in which one is not seeing zebras (where the display is of camels or tigers), one would not have that perceptual evidence. Consequently, one knows that one is now seeing zebras, on the basis of the perceptual evidence one is having. Consider, however, the belief that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised by zoo staff to resemble zebras. Whatever one’s reason for believing this claim (say, that it is just very unlikely that the zoo would deceive people in that fashion), one would still have this reason even if the belief were false (and one was seeing mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras). Hence, one would not know that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised to resemble zebras.

As with Nozick’s account, this provides a counterexample to the closure of knowledge. One can know that one is now seeing zebras, one can correctly deduce from this that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised to resemble zebras, and yet fail to know that one is not now seeing mules cleverly disguised to resemble zebras. Furthermore, Dretske’s account better handles the counterexample to Nozick’s theory. One believes (truly) that one’s mother is not the assassin, on the grounds that one was with one’s mother at the time the assassination happened (and that mother cannot be in two places at once) and one would not have this reason to think mother innocent if she were indeed the assassin. Thus, one knows that one’s mother is not the assassin, since the evidence is absolutely conclusive, despite the fact that if one’s mother were the assassin, one would still believe that she wasn’t, on the basis of a different, bad reason.

Even Dretske’s account is plausibly vulnerable to counterexample. Suppose that one believes correctly at noon on Tuesday that Jones is chair of one’s department, on the basis of the typical sort of evidence (say, recollection of Jones being installed in the position, the department’s website listing Jones as chair, and so forth). Suppose that at five minutes past noon on Tuesday, Jones is suddenly struck dead by a bolt of lightning (and is consequently no longer chair). Did one know at noon, five minutes prior to the death, that Jones was the chair? Since one would have had that same set of reasons to believe at noon that Jones was chair even in the closest possible worlds in which he was not chair at noon (that is, worlds in which he’d been struck dead by lightning five minutes before noon), one does not actually know at noon that Jones is the chair. Those who find this verdict implausible (that is, those who think one does know on the basis of the typical evidence that Jones is the chair, right up until the moment that Jones suddenly is struck dead and stops being the chair), may find Dretske’s account of knowledge wanting. (The example is adapted from Brueckner and Fiocco 2002).

Further justification of Dretske’s for denying closure is that there are other sentential operators that are not closed under known entailment and behave in many respects like the knowledge operator. (See Dretske 1970). Dretske defines a sentential operator O to be fully penetrating when O(p) is closed under known entailment. That is, O is penetrating if and only if: O(p) entails O(q) if p is known to entail q. “It is true that” is a penetrating operator, since, if p is known to entail q, “it is true that p” must entail “it is true that q”. “It is surprising that” is non-penetrating; although it is surprising that tomatoes are growing on the apple tree, it is not surprising that something is growing on the apple tree. Some operators are semi-penetrating. An operator is semi-penetrating when it penetrates only to a certain subset of a given proposition’s entailments.

For instance, “R is an explanatory reason for” seems to be a semi-penetrating operator. Within a range of cases, if p is known to entail q, then R is an explanatory reason for p entails R is an explanatory reason for q. A reason that explains why Bill and Harold are invited to every party necessarily is a reason why Harold is invited to every party. Similarly, “knows that” seems to penetrate through similar entailments; if one knows that Bill and Harold are invited to every party, then one knows that Harold is invited to every party.

However, “R is an explanatory reason for my painting the walls green” need not entail “R is an explanatory reason for my painting the walls.” Depending on the context, a reason that explains why I painted my walls green may be a reason why I did something entailed by my painting the walls green, such as my not painting the walls red, but may not be a reason why I did something else entailed by my painting the walls green, such as my not wallpapering the walls green. The emphasis is crucial. A reason to paint the walls green is a reason not to paint them red, but may not be a reason to paint rather than wallpaper. A reason to paint the walls green may be a reason not to paint the floor green, but it might be neutral as to the color. Consideration of ordinary demands for reasons shows that emphasis, or other contextual factors, determines a certain range of reasons to be relevant and a certain range irrelevant. The same reason will not suffice to explain each of the following: “I bought tomatoes,” “I bought tomatoes” and “I bought tomatoes”, even though these three sentences entail and are entailed by exactly the same claims, since they are logically equivalent. Dretske says that no fact is an island and that various contextual factors will determine, for each operator, its relevant alternatives (i.e. the negations of the consequents to which the operator penetrates). (See also Contextualism in Epistemology, Chapter 3, on Dretske and the denial of closure).

d. “Abominable Conjunctions”

On the other hand, some philosophers view the closure principle as so obviously true that, rather than reject it to accommodate a given theory of knowledge, they would reject the account of knowledge in order to keep closure. Dretske’s account of knowledge has been much discussed in the philosophical literature. One consequence of this rejection of closure in favor of his account that hardly seems felicitous is that one could truly say, “I know that that animal is a zebra and I know that zebras are not mules, but I don’t know that that animal is not a cleverly disguised mule.” Or, “I know I have hands, and I know that if I have hands I am not handless, but I don’t know that I am not a handless brain in a vat.” Worse yet, “I know it is not a mule, but I don’t know it’s not a cleverly disguised mule.” These claims (“abominable conjunctions,” according to DeRose 1995) sound at best paradoxical and at worst absurd. This seems to point to the extreme plausibility of some form or another of the closure principle.

Dretske (2005a, 17-18) agrees that such statements sound absurd, but maintains that they are true. They may violate conventional conversational expectations and they may be met with incomprehension, but they are not self-contradictory. “Empty” and “flat” are often taken to be absolute concepts (since to be empty is to not contain anything at all and to be flat is to have no bumps), but also context-relative, in that whether a particular item counts as a thing or a bump depends on the context. It sounds a bit strange to say that the warehouse is empty, but has lots of dust, gas molecules, and empty crates in it. The utterance may violate conversational rules, but the utterance might, despite all that, be true, if the concepts of emptiness and flatness are as described. So too with the abominable conjunctions if the attendant conception of knowledge is correct. Philosophers may always appeal to Gricean conversational implicatures to blunt the objection that their view entails absurd claims. Truth and conversational propriety are not one and the same. (Paul Grice is the philosopher most closely associated with the view that communication is guided by various conversational maxims and that some utterances are conversationally inappropriate, even if true, because they invite misunderstanding. For instance, the utterance “Mary insulted her boss and she was fired,” is true even if Mary did not insult her boss until after she was fired, but it would be an inappropriate remark in most contexts, since the listener naturally would conclude that the insult preceded the dismissal. For more on this, see Grice 1989).

John Hawthorne (2005: 30-31) makes two points in reply. First, he says, it is unclear what sort of Gricean mechanism could make it true but conversationally inappropriate to utter “S knew that p and correctly deduced q from p, but did not know that q.” Second, an appeal of this sort can at best explain why we do not utter certain true propositions, but not why we actually believe their negations. Even if it is true that one’s wife is his best friend, it would be inappropriate for him to introduce her to someone as his best friend. But the conversational mechanism at play here could hardly be an explanation for why he believed that his wife was not his best friend (even though she was). Why, if the denial of closure is true but conversationally infelicitous, do so many not only not deny closure in conversations but in fact believe that the closure principle is true?

One might reply that many people, even philosophers, are apt in some situations to mistake what is conversationally appropriate for what is true (as with conditional claims that have false antecedents), so an explanation of why a true claim violates conversational norms might well explain why people believe the negation of the claim.

e. Alternative Anti-Skeptical Strategies Need Not Reject Closure

There are alternative strategies for refuting skepticism that seem to have many of the virtues of the tracking account of knowledge, but do not entail the falsity of closure principles. Contextualism, for example, says that knowledge attributions are sensitive to context, in that a subject S might know a proposition p relative to one context, but simultaneously fail to know that p relative to another context. The contextual factors to which knowledge attributions are taken to be sensitive include things like whether a particular doubt has been raised or acknowledged and the importance of the belief being correct.

In an ordinary context, where skeptical scenarios have not been raised, the standards for knowledge are quite low, but, in contexts in which skeptical doubts have been raised, such as an epistemology class, standards for knowledge have been raised to levels that typically cannot be met. One might know relative to the everyday context that she has hands, but fail to know this relative to the skeptic’s context, because a skeptical scenario has been raised and she cannot rule it out.

Or a true belief with a certain level of justification might count as knowledge as long as it is not terribly important that the belief be correct, but would no longer be knowledge if the stakes were raised. One might know that the bank will be open on Saturday after confirming that the bank has Saturday hours, even if one has not checked whether the bank has changed its hours in the past two weeks, as long as no great harm will befall one if it turns out one is wrong. But if financial ruin will befall one were a check not deposited before Monday, then one’s justification might need to be stronger before it would be correct to say that one knows the bank is open Saturday.

The contextualist then can reconcile the intuitions that it is sometimes correct to attribute to someone knowledge of everyday common sense propositions, despite her inability to rule out skeptical propositions, and that we are sometimes correct in refusing to attribute knowledge of the falsity of a skeptical scenario when the subject is unable to rule out such scenarios. But the contextualist can do this while accepting at least some version of closure. The contextualist says that epistemic closure holds within an epistemic context, but fails inter-contextually. For instance, in the everyday, low epistemic standards context, one knows that one has hands and anything that one can correctly deduce from this claim, such as that one is not a handless being deceived into thinking that one has hands. In the context with much higher epistemic standards, one knows neither that one is not a handless, artificially stimulated brain in a vat, nor (by an application of the closure of knowledge under known entailment) that one has hands. Closure will fail only when it extends across contexts. For instance, if one were to cite one’s knowledge that one has hands (in the ordinary context) as grounds for saying in the heightened context that one knows that the brain in a vat hypothesis is false (as the Moorean might), one would illegitimately apply the closure principle. The skeptic’s citing one’s failure to know the falsity of the skeptical hypothesis (in the heightened context) as entailing that one does not know the common sense proposition (in the ordinary context) would be a similar misuse of the closure principle.

If a theory of knowledge is independently plausible and can answer the skeptic without denying closure, then, everything else being equal, we ought to be reluctant to reject closure just so that we can accept the tracking account of knowledge. Contextualism, of course, is plagued with problems of its own. One such problem is as follows: since whether one knows a claim or not depends on how stringent the epistemic standards are in the context and the standards can be raised by a particular doubt occurring to someone in the context, contextualism seems to imply that it is easier to know things if one spends time with the stupid or incurious or if one is stupid or incurious.

The plausibility of the denial of closure may well depend not only on whether it is a way to avoid skepticism, but on whether it is the only way to do so. (Dretske does insist that the only plausible way to refute skepticism is by denying closure. See his 2005a and 2005b for a defense of this claim, trenchant criticisms of the contextualist theory, and responses to criticisms of the tracking theory.)

f. Some Skeptical Arguments do not Employ Closure

One of the strengths claimed for the tracking account of knowledge is that it blocks the standard skeptical argument, since it involves the rejection of closure. Not all skeptical arguments employ closure principles, however, so it is unclear how much anti-skeptical value would accrue from denying closure. Underdetermination arguments might be the best skeptical arguments and they do not depend (at least explicitly) on closure.

Underdetermination is a relation that holds between two or more theories, when the theories are incompatible, but empirically equivalent. Underdetermination skeptical arguments rely crucially on the premise that if two theories are incompatible but compatible with all the available (and perhaps possible) data, we cannot know that one is true and the other false. Compare, for example, the thesis that I have hands, which I perceive through sense perception, and the thesis that I am a handless brain in a vat, artificially stimulated so as to have misleading sense perceptions. These theses are incompatible, but they are empirically equivalent. Whichever thesis were true, I would have the same sort of experiences. Suppose we adopt the following principle: if two incompatible theses both entail (or predict) the same observational data, then that observational data does not support (or justify belief of) one of the theses over the other. With this principle and the premise that the two theses are incompatible but observationally equivalent, we can deduce that our apparent perception of our hands does not justify us in believing that we have hands.

The argument is greatly oversimplified, but the outline of the skeptical argument from underdetermination now ought to be clear. The argument does not explicitly employ any closure premise, so the rejection of closure would seem not to undermine the argument in any straightforward way. One could always argue that the appeal of the argument from underdetermination implicitly relies on the closure principle or that the argument from underdetermination is objectionable on other grounds. Skeptical arguments from underdetermination, however, seem as plausible as other skeptical arguments and their plausibility seems not to depend on the plausibility of any of the closure principles.

Infinite regress arguments for skepticism also do not straightforwardly appeal to closure. A regress argument that no belief is epistemically justified (and hence than no belief counts as knowledge) runs as follows. We assume that all justification is inferential. That is, every justified belief is justified by appeal to some other justified belief. The basis for this claim might be the nature of argumentation. One is justified in believing a conclusion if one is justified in believing the premises that support the conclusion. If the conclusion is one of the premises, then the argument is question-begging, or circular, and not rationally persuasive. But if every justified belief can be justified only be inferring it from some further justified belief and there cannot be an infinite regress of justified beliefs, then it must be that no beliefs are justified. (A foundationalist about justification, on the other hand, while agreeing that an infinite regress of justified beliefs is impossible, insists that there are justified beliefs, and hence that some beliefs are justified non-inferentially, or in other words, that some justified beliefs are basic or foundational). The claim that no justified belief is self-justifying does not entail any closure principle of justification or knowledge, so the argument seems to be independent of closure and thus not vulnerable to arguments against closure principles. (See also Ancient Skepticism).

The proponent of the tracking account of knowledge need not answer all forms of the skeptical argument with the same tools, so even if some skeptical arguments do not depend on the closure principle, the tracking analysis might provide the resources for countering the skeptical arguments from underdetermination or regress.

4. Dogmatism and the Rejection of Closure

At least one philosopher (Audi 1988, 76-8; 1991, 77-84) has claimed that the justification of dogmatism, adapted from Harman (see section 2 of this article), is a reductio ad absurdum of the epistemic closure principle. If closure allows one to infer, and thus know, that any evidence against something one knows must be misleading and may be ignored, then closure must be rejected.

Audi’s example is of a man who adds up a series of numbers and thereby knows the sum of the numbers. But the man’s wife (whom he considers to be a better mathematician) says that he has added the numbers incorrectly and gotten the wrong sum. If the man knows that the sum is n, and knows that his wife says the sum is not n, then by closure he knows that his wife is wrong. (This is so, as “the sum is n and my wife says the sum in not n” entails that “my wife is wrong;” one knows the former claim and knows it entails the latter, so one knows the latter). Since he knows his wife is wrong, there is no need to recalculate the sum. (Similar examples appear in Dretske 1970 and Thalberg 1974). If one believes something only when one takes oneself to know it, as is plausible, then by this reasoning one has reason to dismiss any evidence against something that one believes.

Denying the closure principle to avoid the odd dogmatic conclusion has some initial appeal, but there are alternative solutions that do not require us to reject such a compelling principle. And, as Feldman says (1995, 493), there is a general reason not to resolve the paradox by denying closure. To say, “Yes, I know that p is true, and that p entails q, but I draw the line at q,” seems irrational. To refuse to accept what you know to be the consequences of your beliefs, he says, is to be “patently unreasonable.” Not only is it infelicitous to deny closure, but the dogmatist argument may be blocked without doing so.

For instance, one could take the dogmatism argument to be a reductio ad absurdum of the anti-skeptical position. This is the tack taken by Peter Unger (1975). If we deny that one could know that p (say, that the sum of the numbers is n), then even if we accept closure, we have no reason to suppose that one could know that all evidence against p was misleading.

Alternatively, Roy Sorensen (Sorensen 1988) argues that given that one knows that p, the conditional “If E is evidence against p, then E is misleading” is a junk conditional, in that although it may be known to be true, this knowledge cannot be expanded under modus ponens. That is to say, if “if p then q” is a junk conditional, the conditional can be known to be true, but it could not be the case that simultaneously the conditional is known and that knowledge of the antecedent p would justify one in believing the consequent q. Some conditionals are known to be true on the basis of the extreme unlikelihood of the antecedent, but are such that if one acquired evidence that supports the antecedent, one would not be justified in inferring the consequent because the probability of the antecedent is inversely proportional to the probability of the conditional. That is, if one were to learn that the antecedent of the conditional was true, one would no longer have reason to accept (and would no longer know) the conditional. “If this is a Cuban cigar, then I’m a monkey’s uncle!” is an example of such a conditional. This conditional can be known to be true, in virtue of the antecedent being known to be false, but if one were to find evidence that this is indeed a Cuban cigar, one should not infer that he is a monkey’s uncle. Rather, one should conclude that perhaps one did not know the conditional to be true after all, since one has evidence that its antecedent was true and its consequent false. In short, if a conditional is a junk conditional one cannot come to know the consequent q in virtue of one’s knowing the antecedent p and the conditional if p then q, because one’s knowledge of the conditional depends on the falsity of the antecedent.

Given that one knows that r (say, that one’s car is in parking lot A), one knows that the conditional “if there is any evidence against r, however strong, then it must be misleading” is true. Part of one’s basis for knowing that r might be that one has reason to believe that there is no strong evidence against r. But if one were to learn of strong evidence against r, such as testimony that one’s car had been towed, one ought, at least in some cases, to consider the possibility that one does not in fact know that r, rather than simply inferring that the testimony is misleading. Learning the truth of the antecedent – that there is strong evidence against r – may undermine the justification for believing the conditional itself, thus making the conditional resistant to modus ponens. Knowledge of the conditional depends on one’s knowing that the antecedent is false. Finding evidence in favor of the antecedent – even if in fact it is misleading – may weaken one’s justification for the conditional, such that one no longer knows the conditional to be true.

This blocking of the dogmatist argument does not involve denying closure, though. The reason the modus ponens inference fails to go through is because the conditional is a “junk” conditional; one can know the conditional to be true only if one does not know the antecedent to be true, and the closure principle applies only if one simultaneously knows both the conditional and its antecedent to be true.

Another explanation that does not require the denial of closure is due to Michael Veber (Veber 2004). He says that even if the dogmatist argument is sound, the principle “If a piece of evidence E is known by S to be misleading, S ought to disregard it,” ought not to be endorsed on grounds of human fallibility. We are frequently enough wrong in taking ourselves to know what we in fact do not know that following such a principle would lead one to disregard evidence that is not misleading. There is nothing wrong with the principle, provided it is correctly applied; but due to the difficulty or impossibility of correctly applying it, adopting such a policy is contraindicated.

5. The McKinsey Paradox, Closure, and Transmission Failure

a. The McKinsey Paradox

Michael McKinsey (1991) discovered a paradox about content externalism that has prompted some reconsideration of how knowledge is transmitted through deductive reasoning.

Content externalism (or anti-individualism) is, to greatly oversimplify, the thesis that we are only able to have thoughts with certain contents because we inhabit environments of certain sorts. (Putnam 1975 and Burge 1979 are the most notable defenses of this view). Molecule-for-molecule duplicates could differ in their contents due to differences in their environments. According to the externalist, my twin on Twin Earth might be an exact duplicate of me, but if Twin Earth contains a different but similar light metal used to make baseball bats, cans, and so forth instead of aluminum, then even if the denizens of Twin Earth call this metal “aluminum,” their thoughts are not thoughts about aluminum. This view is a repudiation of the Cartesian view of the mental, according to which the contents of our thoughts are what they are independent of the surrounding world.

Externalism has been defended and criticized on many different grounds, but the debate about externalism has pivoted largely on its implications for the thesis that we have privileged access to the contents of our own thoughts. How does one know that she is now thinking that some cans are made from aluminum, rather than the thought that some cans are made from twaluminum (as we may call it), which is what she would be thinking if she lived on Twin Earth? Incompatibilists about externalism and privileged access point out that the two thoughts are introspectively indiscriminable if externalism is true and argue that one could only know which of these thoughts one is now thinking through empirical investigation of one’s environment.

Compatibilists about externalism and self-knowledge often argue that if a subject has a mental state with a particular content (say, a belief that some cans are made of aluminum) in virtue of that subject bearing a certain relation to an external state of affairs (say, aluminum, rather than twaluminum, being present in one’s environs), then any mental state the subject has about that particular mental state of his, like his belief that he believes some cans are made of aluminum, will also stand in a similar relation to the same external state of affairs (aluminum, rather than twaluminum, being present). Hence, this second-order mental state (i.e. a mental state about a mental state) will involve the same content as the first-order belief (say, that some cans are made of aluminum). In short, one will believe that he believes cans are made of aluminum only if one in fact does believe that cans are made of aluminum, since both of these states bear a causal relation to aluminum, rather than twaluminum. (See Burge 1988 and Heil 1988). Whatever makes it the case that S thinks that p (instead of q) will also make it the case that S thinks I am thinking that p (instead of I am thinking that q). Coupled with a reliabilist theory of knowledge, these second-order beliefs count as knowledge since they cannot go wrong and the thesis of privileged access is reconciled with externalism.

Enter McKinsey’s Paradox. We assume that we know content externalism to be true and that it is compatible with a suitably robust thesis of privileged access to thought contents. We may now reason as follows:

  1. I know that I am in mental state M (say, the state of believing that water is wet). (Privileged Access)
  2. I know that if I am in mental state M, then I meet external conditions E (say, living in an environment that contains water). (Content Externalism, known through philosophical reflection)
  3. If I know one thing and I know that it entails a second thing, then I know the second thing. (Closure of knowledge under known entailment)
  4. Thus, I know that I meet external conditions E. (From 1-3)

The knowledge attributed in the premises is a priori in the broad sense that includes knowledge gotten through introspection and/or philosophical reflection. That knowledge is not gained via empirical investigation of the external world. The conclusion follows by an application of the closure principle. What is paradoxical is that, given closure, it seems that one can know the truth of an empirical claim about the external world (say, that one’s environment contains water or that it contains aluminum rather than twaluminum) simply by inferring it from truths known by reflection or introspection. This argument bolsters the incompatibilist’s case: since it is only by investigation of the world that one can know that one meets a particular set of external conditions and since the premises (including closure) entail that this fact can be known on the basis of knowledge not dependent on investigation of the world, either the privileged access premise or the externalist thesis must be false (provided that the closure principle is correct).

b. Davies, Wright, and the Closure/Transmission Distinction

There are many responses to this argument. Some reject externalism, some (like McKinsey) deny privileged access, and some compatibilists (Brueckner 1992) argue that even if externalism is known to be true, nothing as specific as the second premise of the argument could be known a priori. But perhaps the most influential attempt to solve the paradox is due to Martin Davies (1998) and Crispin Wright (2000). They argue that even though arguments like McKinsey’s are valid and their premises are known to be true, this knowledge is not transmitted across the entailment to the conclusion. At first blush, it seems like Davies and Wright are rejecting closure, which is certainly one way to deal with the paradox. Davies and Wright accept closure, though, and only reject a related but stronger epistemological principle that says that knowledge is transmitted over known entailment.

Davies and Wright are distinguishing between the closure of knowledge under known entailment and what they take to be a common misreading of it. The closure principle says that if one knows that p and knows that p entails q, then one knows that q, but the principle is silent on what one’s basis or justification for q is and does not claim that the basis for q is the knowledge that p and that p entails q. The principle of the transmission of knowledge under known entailment, however, states that if one knows that p, and knows that p entails q, then one knows q on that basis – what enables one to know that p and that p entails q also enables one to know that q. Davies and Wright accept the closure principle but deny the transmission principle, arguing that it fails when the inference from p to q is, although valid, not cogent. Here cogency is understood as an argument’s aptness for producing rational conviction.

One way an argument could be valid but fail to be cogent is that the justification for the premises presupposes the truth of the conclusion. If I reason from the premise that I have a drivers license issued by the state of North Carolina (based on visual inspection of my license and memory of having obtained it at the North Carolina Department of Motor Vehicles) to the conclusion that there exists an external world, including North Carolina, outside my mind, it is plausible that my justification for the premise (taking sense experience and memory at face value) presupposes the truth of the conclusion. If this is so, then it seems that the premise could not be my basis for knowing the conclusion. Anyone in doubt about the conclusion would not accept the premise, so although the premise entails the conclusion, the premise could not provide the basis for rational conviction that the conclusion is true. Such an argument is valid, but not cogent. It would not be a counterexample to closure, for anyone who knows the premise and the entailment also must know the conclusion, but it is a counterexample to the transmission principle, since the conclusion would not be known on the basis of the knowledge of the premise.

According to Davies and Wright, the McKinsey argument is valid but not cogent because knowledge of the conclusion is presupposed in one’s supposed introspective knowledge of the premises. Thus, it is a counterexample to transmission, but poses no threat to closure. The non-empirical access to the externally individuated thought contents is conditional on the assumption that certain external conditions obtain (such as that one’s environs include aluminum rather than twaluminum), which can only be confirmed empirically. Thus one may not reason from the non-empirical knowledge claimed in the premises to non-empirical knowledge of an empirical truth that enjoys presuppositional status with regard to the premises. That one has a thought about water may entail that one bears a causal relation to water in one’s environment (if externalism is correct) and one may know the former and the entailment only if one knows the latter, but one may not cogently reason from the premise to the conclusion, since the inference begs the question. Anyone who doubts the conclusion of the McKinsey argument in the first place would not (or at least should not — the presuppositions of our premises are not always recognized as such) be moved to accept the premises that entail it.

Consider then the following principle about a priori knowledge:

(APK) If a subject knows something a priori and correctly deduces (a priori) from it a second thing, then the subject knows a priori the second claim.

We can describe this principle in two equivalent ways. It is the principle of closure of a priori knowledge under correct a priori deduction and, alternatively, it is a specific instance of the principle of transmission of knowledge under known entailment, since it claims that the a priori basis for knowledge of the premise transmits to the conclusion, allowing it to be known a priori as well. If Davies and Wright are correct, the principle is false because counterexamples may be found in deductions that are valid but not cogent.

Davies and Wright apply this distinction between transmission and closure to Moore’s anti-skeptical argument as well. Although it is true that the negation of the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis is entailed by an ordinary proposition, such as that I have hands, the existence of the external world is presupposed in the justification for that premise and, therefore, may not be justifiably inferred from that premise. Moore’s argument is not cogent, so it is a counterexample to transmission, which we have reason to reject anyhow, and not a counterexample to closure (or so Davies and Wright argue).

This is plausibly another sort of conditional that is not expandable by modus ponens. Unlike the junk conditionals, which cannot be expanded because the conditional can be known to be true only when the antecedent of the conditional is not known to be true, conditionals in which the justification for the antecedent presupposes justification for the consequent – we may call them conditionals of presupposition – cannot be expanded because the relevant modus ponens inference would not be cogent. The inference would be question-begging.

The distinction that Davies and Wright argue for also applies to closure principles for justified belief. If they are correct, then justified belief could be closed under known entailment even if justification is not necessarily transmitted across known entailment. The counterexamples to the transmission principle for knowledge would also function as counterexamples for the transmissibility of justified belief.

Some have argued that the Davies-Wright line of argument fails to solve the McKinsey paradox. Whether they are right is beyond the scope of this entry. But the distinction Davies and Wright have drawn between transmission and closure is an important one. That if one knows that p and has validly deduced q from p, one must know that q, tells us nothing about one’s basis for q. Although quite often it can and will, in some instances knowledge of p cannot provide the basis for knowledge of q, even though p entails q, because the justification for p presupposes q. One knows that q (on some independent basis), so there is no counterexample to closure, but q will not be known on the basis of p, so the transmission principle is false.

Clarifying the closure principle as a principle about the distribution of knowledge across known entailment, rather than as a principle about the transmission or acquisition of knowledge, divorces the closure principle, to some extent, from the initial intuitive support for it, which is the idea that we can add to our store of knowledge (or justified belief) by accepting what we know to be entailed by propositions we know (or justifiably believe). On this understanding of closure, knowledge and justified belief are distributed across known entailment even when drawing the inference in question could not add to one’s store of knowledge or justified belief.

6. Ordinary Propositions, Lottery Propositions, and Closure

The closure principle also figures in a paradox about our knowledge of “ordinary propositions” and “lottery propositions.” Ordinary propositions are those that we ordinarily suppose ourselves to know. Lottery propositions are those with a high likelihood of being true, but which we are ordinarily disinclined to say that we know. Suppose that one lives on a fixed income and struggles to make ends meet. It seems that one knows one will not be able to afford a mansion on the French Riviera this year. One’s not being able to afford the mansion this year entails that one will not win the big lottery this year. By the closure principle, since one knows that one will not be able to afford the mansion and one knows that one’s not being able to afford the mansion entails that one will not win the lottery, one must know that one will not win the lottery. Most, however, are disinclined to say that one could know that one will not win the lottery. There’s always a chance, after all (provided that one buys a ticket).

This phenomenon is widespread. Ordinarily, one who keeps up with politics could be said to know that Dick Cheney is the U.S. Vice-President. That Cheney is the Vice-President entails that Cheney did not die of a heart attack thirty seconds ago. But it seems that one does not know that Cheney did not die of a heart attack in the last thirty seconds. How could one know such a thing? (The coining of the term “lottery proposition” and the discovery that this phenomenon is widespread, is due to Jonathan Vogel).

The apparently inconsistent triad is (i) one knows the ordinary proposition, (ii) one fails to know the lottery proposition, and (iii) closure. One may eliminate the inconsistency by denying closure on the sort of grounds that Dretske and Nozick cite. Plausibly, one’s belief of so-called ordinary propositions tracks the truth, while one’s belief of lottery propositions does not. If Cheney were not Vice-President, one would not believe he was, but had Cheney died in the past thirty seconds, one still would believe he was Vice-President.

One might bite the skeptical bullet and insist that one really does not know that Cheney is Vice-President. One of a more anti-skeptical bent might maintain that one can really know the lottery propositions, such as that Cheney did not die in the last thirty seconds. Such a resolution has considerable costs, but denying closure is not among them.

Alternatively, one might argue for a contextualist handling of the problem that does not require the denial of closure or biting the skeptical or anti-skeptical bullet.

7. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Audi, Robert (1988), Belief, Justification and Knowledge, Belmont: Wadsworth.
    • Argues against closure to avoid dogmatic conclusion.
  • Audi, Robert (1991), “Justification, Deductive Closure and Reasons to Believe,” Dialogue, 30: 77-84.
    • Argues against closure to avoid dogmatic conclusion.
  • Brueckner, Anthony (1992), “What an Anti-Individualist Knows A Priori,” Analysis 52: 111-118.
    • Solution to the McKinsey paradox that does not deny closure.
  • Brueckner, Anthony (2004), “Strategies for Refuting Closure,” Analysis 64: 333-35.
    • Reply to Warfield 2004 and Hales 1995.
  • Brueckner, Anthony; Fiocco, M. Oreste (2002), “Williamson’s Anti-Luminosity Argument,” Philosophical Studies, 110: 285-293.
    • Contains putative counterexample to Dretskean account of knowledge.
  • Burge, Tyler (1979), “Individualism and the Mental,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 4: 73-122.
    • Seminal defense of content externalism (or anti-individualism).
  • Burge, Tyler (1988), “Individualism and Self-Knowledge,” The Journal of Philosophy, 85: 649-663.
    • Influential reconciliation of content externalism and the privileged access theses.
  • Davies, Martin (1998), “Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant,” in C. MacDonald, B. Smith and C. J. G. Wright (eds.), 321-361.
    • Argues that McKinsey paradox is a counterexample to transmission, not closure.
  • Dretske, Fred (1970), “Epistemic Operators,” The Journal of Philosophy, 67: 1007-1023.
    • Seminal paper arguing against the closure of knowledge.
  • Dretske, Fred (1971), “Conclusive Reasons,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 49: 1-22.
    • Contains Dretske’s account of knowledge.
  • Dretske, Fred (2005a), “The Case against Closure,” in Steup and Sosa (eds.), 13-26.
    • Argues that denying closure is only way to avoid skepticism.
  • Dretske, Fred (2005b), “Reply to Hawthorne,” in Steup and Sosa (eds.), 43-46.
    • Reply to Hawthorne 2005.
  • Feldman, Richard (1995), “In Defence of Closure,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 45: 487-494.
    • Defends closure against Audi’s arguments (Audi 1988, 1991).
  • Grice, Paul (1989), Studies in the Ways of Words, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Classic treatment of pragmatic/semantic distinction, and conversational maxims and implicatures. Relevant to discussion of the tracking theory of knowledge’s “abominable conjunctions.”
  • Gunderson, Keith (ed.) (1975), Language, Mind and Knowledge, Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, volume VII, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
    • Contains seminal Putnam 1975 article.
  • Hales, Steven (1995), “Epistemic Closure Principles,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 33: 185-201.
    • Produces counterexamples to many different formulations of the closure principle, but points out that one cannot refute closure for knowledge by showing that some necessary condition for knowledge fails to be closed.
  • Harman, Gilbert (1973), Thought, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Employs closure principle in formulating dogmatic argument.
  • Hawthorne, John (2004), Knowledge and Lotteries, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Argues for quasi-contextualist solution to problem of lottery propositions, and defends closure.
  • Hawthorne, John (2005), “The Case for Closure,” in Steup and Sosa (eds.), 26-43.
    • Defends closure against Dretske’s 2005a arguments.
  • Heil, John (1988), “Privileged Access,” Mind 97: 238-251.
    • Influential reconciliation of content externalism and privileged access theses.
  • MacDonald, Cynthia; Smith, Barry; Wright, Crispin (1998), Knowing Our Own Minds: Essays on Self-Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Contains the Davies 1998 article.
  • McKinsey, Michael (1991), “Anti-Individualism and Privileged Access,” Analysis 51: 9-16.
    • Formulation of the McKinsey paradox.
  • Moore, G.E. (1959), Philosophical Papers, London: George Allen and Unwin, Ltd.
    • Contains seminal anti-skeptical essays, such as “Proof of an External World,” and “A Defence of Common Sense.”
  • Nozick, Robert (1981), Philosophical Explanations, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • Influential tracking account of knowledge and consequent denial of closure.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1975), “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’,” in K. Gunderson (ed.), 131-193.
    • Seminal work defending content externalism.
  • Roth, Michael (ed.) (1990), Doubting: Contemporary Perspectives on Skepticism, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
    • Contains Vogel 1990.
  • Sorensen, Roy (1988), “Dogmatism, Junk Knowledge and Conditionals,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 38: 433-454.
    • Solves dogmatism puzzle without denying closure.
  • Steup, Matthias, and Sosa, Ernest, (eds.) (2005), Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, Malden MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Contains Dretske-Hawthorne exchange on closure.
  • Thalberg, Irving (1974), “Is Justification Transmissible Through Deduction?” Philosophical Studies 25: 347-356.
    • Argues for counterexample to closure in dogmatism examples.
  • Unger, Peter (1975), Ignorance: A Case for Scepticism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Retains closure but offers skeptical resolution of the dogmatism puzzle.
  • Veber, Michael (2004), “What do you do with Misleading Evidence?” The Philosophical Quarterly 54: 557-569.
    • Reply to Sorensen (1988) and alternative solution to dogmatism puzzle.
  • Vogel, Jonathan (1990), “Are There Counterexamples to the Closure Principle?” in M. Roth (ed.).
    • Influential discussion of closure and lottery propositions.
  • Wright, Crispin (2000), “Cogency and Question-Begging: Some reflections of McKinsey’s Paradox and Putnam’s Proof,” Philosophical Issues 10: 140-163.
    • On the distinction between closure and transmission, and McKinsey’s paradox.

b. Further Reading

  • Brueckner, Anthony (1985), “Transmission for Knowledge not Established,” The Philosophical Quarterly 35: 193-95.
    • Reply to Forbes 1984.
  • Brueckner, Anthony (2000), “Klein on Closure and Skepticism,” Philosophical Studies 98: 139-151.
    • Reply to Klein 1995.
  • DeRose, Keith (1995), “Solving the Skeptical Problem,” Philosophical Review 104: 1-52.
    • Influential defense of contextualist epistemology.
  • Forbes, Graeme (1984), “Nozick on Scepticism,” The Philosophical Quarterly 34: 43-52.
    • Argues that Nozick’s denial of closure cannot adequately handle cases of inferential knowledge.
  • Goldman, Alvin (1976), “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge,” Journal of Philosophy 73: 771-791.
    • Defends reliabilist account of knowledge that denies closure, and contains a helpful discussion of the notion of a relevant alternative.
  • Klein, Peter (1981), Certainty: A Refutation of Skepticism, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
    • Argues that defense of knowledge closure assumes internalism about justification, so the skeptic who uses the principle begs the question against the externalist anti-skeptic.
  • Klein, Peter (1995), “Skepticism and Closure: Why the Evil Genius Argument Fails,” Philosophical Topics 23: 213-236.
    • Offers a defense of closure for justification, which, whether the defense succeeds or fails, he says refutes the skeptic.
  • Luper (-Foy), Steven, (1987), “The Causal Indicator Analysis of Knowledge,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 47: 563-587.
    • Argues for a tracking account of knowledge that retains closure.
  • Pritchard, Duncan (2002), “McKinsey Paradoxes, Radical Scepticism, and the Transmission of Knowledge Across Known Entailments,” Synthese 130: 279-302.
    • Reply to Martin and Davies on Transmission and McKinsey paradox.
  • Salmon, Nathan (1989), “Illogical Belief,” Philosophical Perspectives 3: 243-285.
    • Argues that his Millian account of names and belief produces counterexamples to closure principles of justification and knowledge.
  • Silins, Nicholas (2005), “Transmission Failure Failure,” Philosophical Studies 126: 71-102.
    • Argues against the Davies-Wright line on transmission failure.
  • Sosa, Ernest (1999), “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore,” Philosophical Perspectives 13: 141-152.
    • Adjustment of the tracking account of knowledge that allows it to sustain closure.
  • Stine, Gail (1971), “Dretske on Knowing the Logical Consequences,” Journal of Philosophy 68: 296-299.
    • Reply to Dretske 1970.
  • Warfield, Ted (2004), “When Epistemic Closure Does and Does not Fail: a Lesson from the History of Epistemology,” Analysis 64: 35-41.
    • Points out that one cannot refute closure for knowledge by showing that some necessary condition for knowledge fails to be closed.

Author Information

John M. Collins
Email: collinsjo@ecu.edu
East Carolina University
U. S. A.

Open Theism

Open Theism is the thesis that, because God loves us and desires that we freely choose to reciprocate His love, He has made His knowledge of, and plans for, the future conditional upon our actions. Though omniscient, God does not know what we will freely do in the future. Though omnipotent, He has chosen to invite us to freely collaborate with Him in governing and developing His creation, thereby also allowing us the freedom to thwart His hopes for us. God desires that each of us freely enter into a loving and dynamic personal relationship with Him, and He has therefore left it open to us to choose for or against His will.

While Open Theists affirm that God knows all the truths that can be known, they claim that there simply are not yet truths about what will occur in the “open,” undetermined future. Alternatively, there are such contingent truths, but these truths cannot be known by anyone, including God.

Even though God is all-powerful, allowing Him to do everything that can be done, He cannot create round squares or make 2 +2 = 5 or do anything that is logically impossible. Omniscience is understood in a similar manner. God is all-knowing and can know all that can be known, but He cannot know the contingent future, since that too, is impossible. God knows all the possible ways the world might go at any point in time, but He does not know the one way the world will go, so long as some part of what will happen in the future is contingent. So, Open Theists oppose the claim of the sixteenth century Jesuit theologian, Luis de Molina, that God has “middle knowledge.”

Open Theists believe that Scripture teaches that God wanted to give us the freedom to choose to love or reject Him. In order for each of us to genuinely have a choice for which we are morally responsible, we must have the ability to do otherwise than we do. This is the distinctive necessary condition of what has come to be called libertarian freedom. God may intervene in the created world at any time, and He may determine that we act in ways of His choosing. But He cannot both respect our libertarian freedom and guarantee that we will do specific things freely. Thus, Open Theists believe that God has created a world in which He takes the risk that many of us will reject Him and act in ways opposed to Him, in order to give us the opportunity to freely choose to love and obey Him.

Table of Contents

  1. History of Open Theism
  2. The Biblical Witness
  3. Philosophical Considerations
  4. Theological Implications
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. For Open Theism
    2. Against Open Theism
    3. Multiple Views

1. History of Open Theism

Open Theism has been a significant topic in philosophy of religion and in evangelical Christian circles since the 1994 publication of The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God by Clark Pinnock, Richard Rice, John Sanders, William Hasker, and David Basinger. Philosophers of religion such as A. N. Prior, J. R. Lucas, Peter Geach, Richard Swinburne, and Richard Purtill had advocated Open Theism in their writings prior to this date, though not under that name, and Rice had published a work initially entitled The Openness of God in 1980. (It was later republished as God’s Foreknowledge and Man’s Free Will.) But the 1994 book’s attempt to systematically explicate the relational view of God that its authors labeled the open view clearly marks the beginning of increased discussion and debate over Open Theism’s tenets.

Since the publication of The Openness of God, there has been significant debate about not only the philosophical and theological merits of Open Theism, but also its orthodoxy. In 2003, The Evangelical Theological Society considered whether to remove Clark Pinnock and John Sanders from its membership for implicitly disavowing the inerrancy of Scripture in their writings by suggesting that some Biblical passages traditionally understood to be prophecies have remained and may continue to remain unfulfilled. While Pinnock agreed to revise the most objectionable passage in his book Most Moved Mover, Sanders continued to maintain that God does not infallibly predict or prophesy what will contingently occur in the future, and he maintained that Biblical passages may initially appear to predicate divine foreknowledge and/or unconditional prophecies by God of what will contingently occur but these passages must be interpreted differently (more below). The charges against Pinnock and Sanders were not sustained, but this was just barely the case for Sanders.

Proponents of Open Theism allow that their view is at odds with the great majority of the Christian tradition in rejecting both meticulous providence and divine foreknowledge of what will contingently occur. However, they argue that the tradition, guided by neo-Platonic philosophy in its formation, had difficulty reconciling beliefs about the implications of God’s perfection with the Biblical witness to a God that cares deeply about His people and how they respond to Him. Many of the early Church Fathers affirmed elements of the Open Theists’ relational view of God, in tension with their beliefs in divine impossibility. Then Saint Augustine, whose Confessions tell us that his faith partially resulted from a careful study of neo-Platonism, forcefully argued for an emphasis on God’s perfection and otherness from His creation that precluded genuine responsiveness on God’s part to our actions. The (Western) Christian tradition subsequently became largely identified with an Augustinian understanding of providence. The early Church Fathers’ idea that God’s foreknowledge is conditioned by human actions did not receive significant consideration again until Jacob Arminius in the sixteenth century and John Wesley in the eighteenth. And it is only recently, in light of philosophical considerations of the nature of freedom, that the full reciprocal relationality of Open Theism has been affirmed, with its concordant denial that God knows what will contingently occur.

Open Theists suggest that when the testimony of Scripture is considered together with philosophical reflection on the conditions necessary for free and morally responsible action, the view that results is theirs. An emphasis on God’s conditioned relationship to His creation is clearly present in the early Church, in the Eastern Church, and in developments during and in response to the Protestant Reformation. This emphasis is largely absent from the theology of the Middle Ages, but the giants of theology from Augustine to Aquinas were clearly attempting to understand God and His relationship to the world in light of the best secular philosophy available to them. While Open Theists acknowledge that their view is in important respects at odds with the Christian tradition, they also maintain that their view is not as dissonant from that tradition as might be thought; it is just that the emphasis on God as a perfect being who does not change in any respect, which is neither clearly taught by Scripture nor obviously compatible with God’s loving relationality, must be rethought.

2. The Biblical Witness

Open Theists suggest that there is a strong Biblical case to be made for affirming a God who respects our moral responsibility while inviting us into a loving relationship with Him. They argue that the most plausible reading of the Bible reveals a personal God who genuinely interacts with human persons and accepts that His desires and projects are dependent on that interaction. As discussed below, Open Theists read the Bible as showing that God desires to be in relationship with the people He has created, that He sometimes changes His mind as a result of dialogue with His people, and that He seeks to accomplish His goals for the world in concert with human agents. They also point to passages that attribute to God the learning of information as evidence that God’s knowledge is not settled, and does not include foreknowledge of the occurrence of contingent events.

Critics of Open Theism offer alternative interpretations of the passages frequently cited by Open Theists, and bring forward their own proof texts that the Biblical God is one whose sovereignty over creation includes exhaustive foreknowledge and ultimate control over each and every aspect of His creation. In any consideration of how well Open Theism accords with the teachings of Scripture, it is important to note that one’s philosophical understandings of freedom and moral responsibility necessarily inform one’s hermeneutic. One cannot fully appreciate the Biblical cases made for or against Open Theism without also appreciating the philosophical considerations to be considered in the subsequent section. Open Theism is most plausible if the dignity and responsibility of an agent require the freedom to do otherwise; if this is so, then texts that attribute responsibility to persons seem to clearly require that God does not also determine the humans’ actions. If foreknowledge is also incompatible with the ability to do otherwise, then neither can God know what we will do. But if our responsibility is consistent with either or both of divine foreknowledge and God’s sovereign determination, then the force of these passages is not nearly as great, and there is no need to seek a more nuanced reading of passages that on their face seem to attribute to God unconditioned knowledge of contingent events in the future.

Open Theists argue that the God revealed in the Bible clearly desires to be in relationship with the people He has created. From the beginning, we have been created in God’s image and given responsibility to care for His creation (Gen. 1:26). God’s relationship to His creation is clear throughout the narrative of the Old Testament. Both Abraham and Moses, among others, speak, and indeed argue, directly with God. Abraham questions God about how His promises will be fulfilled (Gen. 15), and prevails upon Him to spare Sodom if only ten righteous people can be found living there (Gen. 18). Immediately after Abraham shows himself faithful to God by his willingness to obey God even to the point of sacrificing his son Isaac, God states that it is because of Abraham’s obedience that He will maintain His promise to bless Abraham and his descendants (Gen. 22:15-18). Abraham questions God, dialogues with God, affects God’s decisions, and his actions of obedience are credited by God as at least partly responsible for Him fulfilling the promise of blessings that He has revealed to Abraham. Moses speaks with God, and because He lacks confidence to speak to his fellow Israelites, God appoints Aaron to speak for Him (Ex. 4: 1-18). God reveals His law to Moses, and when the Israelites turn their backs on their Deliverer, Moses reminds God of His promises and asks Him to relent from His anger and spare His people (Ex. 32: 9-14). It is clear throughout the Pentateuch that God speaks to chosen leaders of His chosen people, and that He not only commands them, but also listens to their concerns, often adjusting His original plans in light of His dialogue with them.

In both the Old and New Testaments, God presents Himself as working with human agents, and as being disappointed in His hopes for them, rather than as compelling them to act in prescribed ways. This is clear throughout the narrative of Israel, and in passages such as Is. 65:1-2, in which the Lord bemoans the stubbornness of those who will not call on Him, despite His many revelations to them. The Bible teaches us that we can thwart God’s desire that we freely return His love. This is suggested by passages such as Mark 6:5-6, in which we are told that Jesus could not perform many miracles in his hometown because of the lack of faith of its people, and it is explicit in Luke 7:30, in which we are told that the Pharisees rejected God’s purpose. God asks us to follow and obey Him; He does not compel obedience. Nor should every calamitous event be assumed to be divine punishment for disobedience (Job, Lk. 13:1-5, Jn. 9:1-3).

The above passages suggest that God desires to be in relationship with His created people in a manner that respects their freedom to respond to Him in various ways, and that He is genuinely responsive to our concerns. There are also passages in Scripture that more directly suggest that the future is open, and that not even God has foreknowledge of what will contingently happen. Genesis 22:12 records God as stating, “Now I know that you fear God, because you have not withheld from me your son, your only son.” The emphasis on “now” knowing “because” of Abraham’s action clearly points to this being a genuine test of Abraham’s faith, where even God could not be sure of Abraham’s response to the test. Jeremiah 3:7 and 19-20 quote God as saying that He thought Israel would return to faith in Him, but that she had not. Mark 6:6 emphasizes Jesus’ amazement at the lack of faith of those in His hometown, a reaction that only makes sense if He had had an expectation of greater faith. These passages suggest that God can genuinely learn new information.

Of course, the above is meant only to be suggestive of the kinds of considerations that Open Theists emphasize in reading the Bible. These several texts are among those that suggest that God desires to be in a relationship that respects our freedom to respond to God in a variety of ways, and that He has thus left the future open to determination through our actions, at least in part. But critics of Open Theism interpret the same data differently. For instance, Classical Theists may suggest that an incarnational theology’s emphasis on the revelation of God in Christ is misguided if it does not give sufficient weight to the idea that God veiled His glory in becoming human (see Jn. 17:5). And they cite other texts that are arguably more suggestive of the traditional view of God as providentially in control of all that happens, such as Isaiah 40-48, Romans 9, and Ephesians 1:11.

Any reading of the Bible must seek a consistent hermeneutic, and must acknowledge that certain texts must be given readings that are not initially obvious. “Prophetic” texts are read by Open Theists as either decrees of what God has decided to do, conditional predictions about what will happen if certain conditions (such as repentance) are not met, or forecasts based upon God’s exhaustive knowledge of the past and present. None of these interpretations require God to have exhaustive foreknowledge of future events, but responsible readers of the Bible may well disagree about the plausibility of these interpretations as applied to specific passages. Open Theists also argue that plausible readings that accord with Open Theism can be given of “pancausality” texts such as those alluded to in the previous paragraph, and that this is preferable to dismissing as merely anthropomorphic the overwhelming sense of the Bible that God is in dynamic relationship with His creation.

3. Philosophical Considerations

Many theologians in the Christian tradition have maintained both that we are free to choose how we act, and that God foresees our choices. Many lay Christians likewise think that this is the obvious way to reconcile our freedom with God’s omniscience. So long as God does not pre-determine that we act in the ways that we do, but only “sees” what we do, what is the problem? Why does Open Theism insist that the future is open in such a way that God’s foreknowledge of contingent events must be denied?

There are two primary ways of understanding the nature of human freedom. The “compatibilist” view of freedom is that so long as one is acting in a manner that accords with one’s desires or can be otherwise identified with one’s character, one acts freely. Our freedom is compatible with our actions being determined, so long as we are acting in the way we want. We are free so long as were we to desire otherwise, we could act otherwise, and this is so even if we could not desire otherwise. If this is the right view of our freedom, then God might predetermine all of our actions while they are yet free, so long as they are consistent with our character.

The alternative account of the nature of freedom is “libertarian.” This account maintains that unless one is genuinely able to do otherwise than one does, one is not free. So, if one’s character is formed in such a way that one will certainly act in a particular way, and if one has no control over one’s character, then one is not really free, since one cannot act in a manner otherwise than one does. Importantly, one may remain morally responsible for one’s action if one’s character has become thus through one’s earlier free decisions. (Alternatively, one might be said to be free in a derivative sense if one’s character was freely chosen in the past.) If as a result of our sinful nature we cannot choose to do good, then we are not genuinely free to do otherwise than sin. We must really be able to either accept God’s invitation to love Him or to reject it, if we are free with respect to this choice. And if we are not and have never been libertarianly free with respect to this choice , then we are not morally responsible for our choice of whether or not to love God.

Open Theists affirm a libertarian view of freedom. From almost the beginning of Western philosophy, philosophers have been concerned with whether such freedom is compatible with prior truths about what one will do. Aristotle famously argued in his De Interpretatione (book 9) that prior truth is incompatible with future contingency. His argument there may be represented as follows:

  1. It is true that it will be white.
  2. If it is true that it will be white, then it has always been true that it will be white.
  3. If it has always been true that it will be white, then it is impossible that it will not be white.
  4. If it is impossible that it will not be white, then it is necessary that it will be white.
  5. It is necessary that it will be white.

An obvious implication of this argument is that if it is now true that one will act in a particular way, then it is necessary that one will act thusly. But it is not immediately clear why one should accept premise 3. Why should one think that something’s always having been the case entails the impossibility of its ever being otherwise?

One plausible reason for thinking this is based on the idea that one cannot change the past. If a proposition was once true, can one now act in such a way that it is no longer true? If not, then the prior truth of a proposition about what one will do seems enough to rule out one’s doing otherwise, and thus rule out one’s being libertarianly free with respect to that action. The same type of consideration applies to God’s prior knowledge of what one will do. Consider the following argument given by William Hasker in The Openness of God:

  1. It is now true that Clarence will have a cheese omelet for breakfast tomorrow. (Premise)
  2. It is impossible that God should at any time believe what is false, or fail to believe anything that is true. (Premise: divine omniscience)
  3. God has always believed that Clarence will have a cheese omelet tomorrow. (From 1, 2)
  4. If God has always believed a certain thing, it is not in anyone’s power to bring it about that God has not always believed that thing. (Premise: the unalterability of the past)
  5. Therefore, it is not in Clarence’s power to bring it about that God has not always believed that he would have a cheese omelet for breakfast. (From 3, 4)
  6. It is not possible for it to be true both that God has always believed that Clarence would have a cheese omelet for breakfast, and that he does not in fact have one. (from 2)
  7. Therefore, it is not in Clarence’s power to refrain from having a cheese omelet for breakfast tomorrow. (From 5, 6) So Clarence’s eating the omelet tomorrow is not an act of free choice. (From the definition of free will.)

If premise 4 is true and if we have libertarian freedom, then it is not possible for God to know what we will freely do before we do it.

Whether one finds Open Theism plausible largely depends on whether one finds the intuition underlying premise 4 plausible. Philosophers have debated whether all of the past is comprised of “hard” facts fixed in this way, or whether there are “soft” facts that might be conditional upon our future actions. Proponents of the compatibility of human libertarian freedom with divine foreknowledge have argued that facts about God’s prior knowledge of our future actions are conditional on our subsequent choices. To use Clarence as an example, were he to choose to have a bagel tomorrow, it always would have been true that God knew that he would so choose, rather than that he would choose to eat an omelet. Since there is no reason to think that Clarence’s choice is determined by prior causes, divine or otherwise, one may affirm that he is free to have an omelet or not even while maintaining that God knows he will have an omelet. Clarence has what has been termed “counterfactual power” over the past: the power to act in such a way that were he to so act, the past always would have been different than it in fact is. Proponents of counterfactual power over the past can thus agree that Clarence does not have the power to change, or alter, the past, since were he to eat a bagel, it never would have been true that he would eat an omelet tomorrow.

Philosophers have not come to an agreement over whether one might have counterfactual power over the past, or whether the past is instead fixed in a manner that rules out this power. On this topic, basic intuitions about freedom and the fixity of the past differ from person to person, and largely determine how they view the compatibility of divine foreknowledge with human freedom, and thus how they view the plausibility of Open Theism.

It is important to note that even if foreknowledge and freedom are compatible, it is not clear that simple foreknowledge — foreknowledge that is not based on middle knowledge (see below) — could be of any aid to God in providentially ordering His creation. If God knows what will actually happen, He cannot also use this information to arrange for something else to happen, for then the contents of what He “knows” would not comprise knowledge. Foreknowledge is of the actual occurrence of future events; once the occurrence of these events is known, it is “too late” to prevent them (or to bring them about). Doing so is incompatible with their occurrence being infallibly known by God. Simple foreknowledge, if God has it, allows Him to know what will occur without having to wait for the future occurrence of events, as He must for contingent events according to Open Theism. But His knowledge is no less conditioned by the occurrence of the events; He has no greater control over their occurrence based on foreknowledge than He does if Open Theism is true.

Once it is realized that simple foreknowledge does not offer any providential advantage to God, one may wonder what reason there is to affirm it, aside from an assumption that it is more perfect for God to have such knowledge than not. One might think that foreknowledge would provide an explanation for the accuracy of prophecy. But it does not. If God has “at once” complete foreknowledge of all that happens, He “sees” what will happen including whether or not He instructs persons to prophesy that events will happen. Given knowledge of what will occur, God is not free to do otherwise than He foresees He will do. Perhaps God could “look” at a little bit of the future at a time, make decisions about how He will react to the events He foresees, and then “look” a little further to see how His creation reacts to these actions. But this would offer no greater help for predicting future events. Suppose that God foresees the course of the world until the end of 1935. Could He then decide to warn persons on January 1st of 1936 that the holocaust is about to occur? Not in any infallible way. For assuming that the holocaust was still avoidable in 1935, and assuming that God has not yet “looked” beyond 1935, He does not yet know what will occur in the next ten years. He can decide to make probably accurate but possibly mistaken predictions on January 1, 1936, based on the tendencies present at that point, but this is no more than He can do given Open Theism.

Simple foreknowledge has no utility for God’s providential governance of the world, nor can it ground infallible predictions of future events. (It should also be reiterated that Open Theists believe that there are less instances of such predictions in the Bible than is thought by those who affirm a traditional meticulous view of providence.) If one wants to affirm that we have libertarian freedom and still maintain a traditional view of providence according to which God directs the course of the world rather than merely witnessing how it unfolds, then affirming foreknowledge is not enough.

The most plausible view of how human libertarian freedom might be compatible with a traditional view of providence, and thus the greatest competitor to Open Theism, is a view called “Molinism,” named after a sixteenth century Jesuit theologian, Luis de Molina. Molina predicated “middle knowledge” to God and explained God’s providential determination of what will occur in terms of this knowledge. Middle knowledge is knowledge that lies between (in an explanatory sense, not a temporal sense) God’s “natural” knowledge of all the possible ways the world might go and His “free” knowledge of the one way the world will go based upon His creative decree. Natural knowledge is pre-volitional knowledge of necessary truths, including all the possibilities for creation. Free knowledge is post-volitional knowledge of contingent truths, including all future contingent truths. And middle knowledge is pre-volitional knowledge of contingent subjunctive conditional truths of the form: if such and such were the case, then so and so would be the case. God’s middle knowledge includes all the facts about how the world would go given various antecedent conditions. These facts, because they are known before God wills anything, are outside of His control.

Through middle knowledge, God might have known that were he to place Adam and Eve in the Garden of Eden in just the way He did, then they would sin by eating of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil. And He might have known that if they did this and He subsequently kicked them out of the garden, events would unfold in a certain way. God’s middle knowledge would include all the true subjunctive conditionals about how the persons He might create would act in the various circumstances He might place them. These subjunctive conditionals have come to be called “counterfactuals of creaturely freedom.” Based on this exhaustive middle knowledge, God would have known how events would unfold given any creative action He might decide to perform. And on the assumption that libertarian freedom is consistent with knowledge of how one would act in various circumstances, our freedom would remain intact. Molinism promises to uphold both our libertarian freedom and God’s ability to providentially decide exactly what occurs in His creation.

There are two primary objections to Molinism that Open Theists have advanced. If the argument that foreknowledge is incompatible with libertarian freedom is valid, then a similar argument can be made against the compatibility of middle knowledge with libertarian freedom. If it has always been true and known by God that I would act in such and such a way if I were in such and such circumstances, then do I have the power to bring it about that this fact has never been true, or never been known by God? Do I have counterfactual power over this past truth and God’s past knowledge of it? I must, in order to be libertarianly free. The same intuitions about the fixity of the past are brought into play. The other objection to Molinism given by Open Theists, termed the “grounding objection,” is based on the status of the counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. These are truths that, though contingent, are not under God’s control. God “finds Himself” faced with these truths, similarly to the manner in which He “finds Himself” faced with the fact that 2+2=4. But why are certain subjunctives true and certain ones not? The grounding objection is that there seems to be no reason that some particular counterfactuals of creaturely freedom are true rather than others. There is no ground for their truth or falsity. If one believes that all truths, or all contingent truths, must have some underlying ground or “truth-maker,” then one will reject the idea that there are counterfactuals of creaturely freedom available to God prior to creation.

The most important philosophical argument for Open Theism is based on the idea that God’s foreknowledge of one’s actions is incompatible with those actions being free because one does not have the power to bring it about that God has never known something that He does in fact know. But it is important to note that foreknowledge alone is of no help to God in providentially directing the course of His creation. The real competitor to Open Theism as an account of God’s providence is Molinism. Open Theists object to Molinism because they view as implausible the counterfactual power over the past that Molinism requires, and because they believe that there are insufficient grounds for the contingent truth of the counterfactuals of creaturely freedom that Molinists believe God knows via His middle knowledge.

4. Theological Implications

In considering any theology, it is important not only to evaluate the Scriptural and philosophical arguments for and against the view, but also to consider how it might be incorporated into one’s lived faith. So, this article ends with a consideration of the practical implications of Open Theism – for how one views evil, for prayer, and for how one understands the responsibility for salvation.

The traditional view of divine providence holds that each and every event occurs according to God’s will. The implication that the most horrendous evils are thus intended by God has troubled many persons. One of the advantages of Open Theism (and any other view that denies meticulous providence) is that the responsibility for evil is much more clearly removed from God and placed upon our free choices. Because God desires that we freely choose to love Him, he has given us the freedom to reject Him as well, and our acts of rejection take all kinds of horrible forms. The responsibility for the evil that we freely perform is fundamentally ours. While God gave us the ability to do evil things, He does not in any sense intend that we do them. Rather, He grieves with and comforts the victims of our sins.

If God’s will for the world is inviolable, then we must have faith that each instance of evil serves some greater good that God has purposed. On the other hand, if much of the evil in the world is due to our free choices, then there is significant gratuitous evil that serves no further purpose. To those who believe that much of the evil in the world is indeed gratuitous, Open Theism provides an understanding of God’s general project that explains why He allows us to exercise our freedom in ways that sadden Him. He does this because He must do so in order to also allow us the freedom to reciprocate His unfailing love for us.

Not everyone finds this kind of free will defense against the problem of evil comforting. If Open Theism is true, then there is no guarantee that everything will work out as God wants in the end. Open Theists may trust and hope in God’s wisdom and power, but they recognize that there are limitations on what God can effect if we stubbornly refuse to aid Him. Some persons find it easier to have faith in an inscrutable secret will of God that is furthered by the evil we witness. This response to evil also has the advantage of applying to natural evil as well as evil events that result from our actions. While Open Theists may point out that much of the “natural” evil in the world is exacerbated by our poor stewardship of the earth, they must also seek additional explanations for God’s allowance of the devastation and suffering brought about by natural disasters.

Just as one’s views of freedom and of whether the past is fixed in such a way to rule out counterfactual power over it are good predictors of whether one finds Open Theism plausible, one’s reaction to evil is also a reliable indicator of how one thinks of Open Theism. If one cannot imagine that a good and loving God would intend that genocide, torture, rape, and other horrendous evils occur for some inscrutable good, then one is likely to find a free will theodicy, and Open Theism, comforting. If instead one cannot imagine that God would allow us to perform such horrible acts, or allow the massive suffering caused by natural disasters, without there being some very great good that they serve, then one is likely to put one’s faith in the mysterious but certain goodness of God’s meticulous governance of creation.

One of the advantages of Open Theism against any theology that affirms divine foreknowledge or foreordination is that prayer can genuinely influence God’s decisions. Because the future is open and not yet determined, we may pray that God will exercise His influence in ways we desire. We may ask that He will aid ourselves or others. We may easily make sense of James’ assertion that “You do not have, because you do not ask God.” (Ja. 4:2b) In contrast, if God determines the occurrence of each and every event, then He also determines whether and how we pray. On a traditional view of God that affirms His meticulous sovereignty, our prayer is ultimately brought about by God; it cannot persuade God. And even if God merely foreknows our prayers as part of His exhaustive foreknowledge, rather than bringing those prayers about, He also foreknows His response to those prayers, so that there is no greater room for our prayers to influence God’s decisions. Only if the future is open does prayer that God will act in certain ways make sense. Since we often pray in this way, this is an important consideration in favor of Open Theism.

However, proponents of more traditional views of sovereignty can attempt to minimize the purported advantage that Open Theism has for understanding prayer by asking what essential role prayer plays in God’s decision-making, even if Open Theism is true. Since God knows everything about the past and present, and the probabilities of what might occur in the future, can prayer really inform God of anything? He already knows our every thought and desire, and whether our wants are likely to be good for us. Given this, should we think of God as waiting for us to pray to take whatever action seems best for those for whom we pray? Perhaps. It may be that the action of making a request is important – perhaps we do not really understand what it is we would ask, until we bring ourselves to ask it. It also may be that God sometimes grants requests that we make, even though He believes that they are ill-advised, because He believes that we will learn important lessons from pursuing the course of action we desire. Open Theists may respond to the above line of criticism in various ways, but it should be clear that the advantage that Open Theists have for understanding prayer as a means of influencing God is not as great as it initially appears.

The critical questions about how our prayers might influence the actions God chooses to take in the world do not apply in the same way to prayers for divine guidance. Here too, Open Theists have the advantage of a view that allows God to genuinely guide and advise His followers, because the future is not determinate. We may pray that God would guide us in important choices that we must make, trusting in His greater knowledge of the possible and probable effects of these choices. This too is an important kind of prayer that we often exercise, and so the advantage of being able to understand how God might genuinely guide us in response to prayers that He do so is an important benefit of affirming Open Theism. Molinists may say that God chooses to create a world in which He always knows that and how we will pray, in which He knows how He will respond to these prayers, and in which He knows how we will respond to His “guidance.” But assuming that Open Theists are right to deny counterfactual power over the past, God’s responses to prayer given Molinism cannot constitute advice that one may take or not, as it does given Open Theism, precisely because Molinists view the future as determinate and known by God once God has willed His initial creation.

Of course, God’s guidance is limited to His knowledge of how things will probably go if one thing is done rather than another. He cannot know what will happen as a result of our decision so long as the effects of that decision will be influenced by other free decisions. And the further in the future we consider, the less certain that even God can be of what will occur. So while God’s advice about what to do is certainly much better than any other person’s, it is no guarantee that everything will in fact go well. Furthermore, the idea of praying for guidance is most easily understood on a dialogical model, in which we speak with and hear from God. If one does not feel that God usually communicates with us so directly, then it is harder to understand how He might guide us in any precise way. It is important to note that seeking “signs” of God’s will for us is not likely to be particularly reliable if those signs could also be brought about or blocked by other free agents.

In light of the above discussion, we may conclude that Open Theists can understand the efficacy of prayers that God will act in certain ways and prayers for divine guidance in decision-making. In contrast, those who affirm meticulous providence or exhaustive and settled foreknowledge of what will contingently occur plausibly cannot understand this efficacy, since there seems to be no room for our prayers to affect God or for His response to them to affect our decisions, if the decisions of both God and ourselves have always been foreknown, and perhaps foreordained. But we have also seen that what initially seems to be a clear advantage for Open Theism is tempered by questions about how exactly we might influence God, and about how exactly He might communicate His advice to us in response to prayers for guidance.

The final theological implication of Open Theism that requires discussion is the degree to which we have a greater responsibility for our salvation if Open Theism is true. Traditionally, Christians have emphasized that we are constrained by our sinful nature in such a way that we cannot respond favorably to God without additional grace given by Him. If this grace is both necessary and sufficient for a “salvific” faith, then the ultimate cause of whether one is saved or not is God’s giving or withholding of that grace, rather than any “choice” one makes. Open Theism claims that it is essential that the choice for or against God that determines our salvation be genuinely up to us. We must be free to choose to love or reject God, in order for our choice to love Him to be genuine, and giving us that genuine choice is the reason that God has given us libertarian freedom.

To what extent is God’s glory diminished by His giving us a greater role in our salvation, that of genuinely choosing whether or not to follow Him? While some opponents of Open Theism have argued that any attribution to human persons of an ability to determine a necessary condition of salvation impugns God’s sovereignty, it is not at all clear that this is so. If Open Theism is true, we are still dependent on God’s gracious and freely-given invitation to us to love Him and thereby be saved. Open Theists may even affirm a doctrine of sin that predicates to us an inability to respond favorably to God without further enabling grace. But they claim that God has extended this enabling grace to all persons through Jesus Christ and the Holy Spirit. The only thing that we do is decide whether or not to accept the greatest gift imaginable. There is no cause for pride on our part in making the right choice. If we truly appreciate God’s glorious sovereignty, rather than requiring that His sovereignty be understood in particular ways, then the only appropriate response to God’s invitation involves humility.

The debate over whether Open Theism correctly portrays God’s relationship to His creation involves a complicated web of Biblical data, philosophical arguments, and reflection on the practical theological implications of the view. Certain points of contention clearly divide those who might consider Open Theism from those who will not: a belief that libertarian freedom is essential to moral responsibility, a belief that the past is fixed in such a way that we do not have the ability to bring it about that it was always different, and a belief that evil should be attributed to our imperfect human decisions rather than to a secret inscrutable will of God. Of these three beliefs, it is the second that divides Open Theists from Molinists, who also affirm libertarian freedom but attempt to do so in concert with meticulous providence. Even if one affirms all three of these beliefs, however, there remains the hard work of slowly working through a detailed examination of Scripture and reflection on the Christian life. This is the case for any theology, and it is perhaps especially so for a relatively young theology such as Open Theism.

5. References and Further Reading

a. For Open Theism

  • David Basinger, The Case for Freewill Theism: A Philosophical Assessment (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 1996).
    • A brief consideration of freewill theism generally, and open theism specifically, especially as applied to the topics of omniscience, evil, and prayer.
  • Gregory A. Boyd, God of the Possible: A Biblical Introduction to the Open View of God (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2000).
    • A brief and easy to read consideration of the Biblical case for Open Theism.
  • Terence Fretheim, The Suffering of God: An Old Testament Perspective, Overtures to Biblical Theology (Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1984).
    • A study of the use of metaphors in describing God in the Old Testament, and a case for predicating suffering, and thus genuine responsiveness, to God.
  • William Hasker, “Foreknowledge and Necessity,” Faith and Philosophy 2, no. 2 (April 1985), 121-157.
    • An extended argument that foreknowledge is incompatible with libertarian freedom.
  • William Hasker, God, Time and Knowledge, Cornell Studies in the Philosophy of Religion (Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press, 1998).
    • A book length exposition of the philosophical case for Open Theism. Also a good place to start to get a sense of the philosophical debate over the relationship of freedom and divine foreknowledge.
  • William Hasker, Providence, Evil, and the Openness of God, Routledge Studies in the Philosophy of Religion (New York: Routledge, 2004).
    • A consideration of the strengths of Open Theism in comparison with Calvinism, process theism, and Molinism, especially with regard to the problem of evil and the question of divine action within the world.
  • Clark H. Pinnock, Most Moved Mover: A Theology of God’s Openness (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2001).
    • An exposition of Open Theism in terms of the controlling metaphor of God as love that treats in turn: the Scriptural foundations for Open Theism, the development of traditional Christianity influenced by Hellenic philosophy, the philosophical case for Open Theism, and Open Theism’s adequacy to the practical demands of living one’s faith.
  • Clark H. Pinnock, Richard Rice, John Sanders, William Hasker, and David Basinger. The Openness of God: A Biblical Challenge to the Traditional Understanding of God (Downers Grove, Ill.: InterVarsity, 1994).
    • The book that began the extensive debate over Open Theism. A series of five essays that consider Biblical and historical considerations in favor of Open Theism, what a systematic openness theology amounts to, the philosophical case for this view, and its practical implications. An appropriate starting point for anyone interested in learning about Open Theism.
  • Richard Rice, God’s Foreknowledge and Man’s Free Will (Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock Publishers, 2004). Previously published as The Openness of God: The Relationship of Divine Foreknowledge and Human Free Will (Minneapolis: Bethany House, 1980).
    • An early argument for the present-knowledge or open view of God.
  • John Sanders, The God Who Risks: A Theology of Providence (Downers Grove, Ill.: InterVarsity Press, 1998).
    • The best exposition of Open Theism to date, especially with respect to the Biblical case for the view, and in systematically setting out openness theology. Also an excellent source of additional references to texts related to Open Theism.
  • Richard Swinburne, The Coherence of Theism, rev. ed. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).
    • A penetrating philosophical case for understanding theism in a manner that accords with Open Theism’s view, made prior to the widespread use of that term.

b. Against Open Theism

  • William Lane Craig, The Only Wise God: The Compatibility of Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom (Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock Publishers, 2000).
    • An argument for the compatibility of divine foreknowledge and human libertarian freedom based on Molinism’s attribution to God of middle knowledge of subjunctive conditionals about what free agents will do in particular circumstances (counterfactuals of creaturely freedom).
  • Millard Erickson, What does God Know and When does He know it?: The Current Controversy over Divine Foreknowledge (Grand Rapids, MI: Zondervan, 2003).
    • An extended argument against Open Theism that also calls for greater moderation and civility in the debate over the topic.
  • Thomas P. Flint, Divine Providence: The Molinist Account (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1998).
    • The most thorough explication of Molinism, with critiques of both orthodox Thomistic and Open Theistic views of divine providence.
  • John Frame, No Other God: A Response to Open Theism (Phillipsburg, NJ: Presbyterian & Reformed, 2001).
    • A critique of Open Theism based on a Reformed reading of Scripture.
  • Norman L. Geisler and H. Wayne House, The Battle for God: Responding to the Challenge of Neotheism, (Grand Rapids, MI: Kregal Publications, 2001).
    • Calling Open Theism “neotheism,” this work argues that Open Theism is dangerously far from traditional Christianity, and seeks to explicate the orthodox view of God’s attributes.
  • Paul Helm, The Providence of God. Contours of Christian Theology, (Downers Grove: IL: InterVarsity Press, 1994).
    • A systematic explication of God’s providence as risk-free meticulous sovereignty.
  • Beyond the Bounds: Open Theism and the Undermining of Biblical Christianity, edited by John Piper, Justin Taylor, and Paul Helseth (Wheaton, IL: Crossway Books, 2003).
    • A series of essays arguing that Open Theism is unorthodox and not an acceptable form of Christianity.
  • Still Sovereign: Contemporary Perspectives on Election, Foreknowledge, and Grace, edited by Thomas R. Schreiner and Bruce A. Ware (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2000).
    • A series of essays explicating and defending the classical view of divine sovereignty.
  • Bruce A. Ware, God’s Lesser Glory: The Diminished God of Open Theism (Wheaton, Ill: Crossway Books, 2001).
    • An argument, primarily based on his reading of Scripture, that Open Theism is false and its consequences are dire.
  • R. K. McGregor Wright, No Place for Sovereignty: What’s Wrong with Freewill Theism (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 1996).
    • An attempt to show what’s wrong biblically, theologically, and philosophically with freewill theism, both in its contemporary (Open Theism) and historical forms (Arminianism).

c. Multiple Views

  • Predestination and Free Will: Four Views of Divine Sovereignty and Human Freedom, edited by David Basinger and Randall Basinger (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 1986).
    • Essays in favor of foreordination (John Feinberg), foreknowledge (Norman Geisler), God’s self-limited power (Bruce Reichenbach), and God’s self-limited knowledge (Clark Pinnock), with responses by each author to the other essays.
  • Divine Foreknowledge: Four Views, edited by James Beilby and Paul Eddy (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2001).
    • Essays in favor of Open Theism (Gregory Boyd), simple foreknowledge (David Hunt), middle knowledge or Molinism (William Lane Craig), and the Augustinian-Calvinist view (Paul Helm), with responses by each author to the other essays.
  • God and Time: Four Views, edited by Gregory Ganssle (Downer’s Grove, IL: InterVarsity Press, 2001).
    • Essays on divine timeless eternity (Paul Helm), eternity as relative timelessness (Alan Padgett), timelessness and omnitemporality (William Lane Craig), and unqualified divine temporality (Nicholas Wolterstorff), with responses by each author to the other essays.
  • Christopher Hall and John Sanders, Does God Have a Future?: A Debate on Divine Providence, (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Books, 2003).
    • The product of a year’s dialogue via email between Hall, who affirms a classical theism, and Sanders, an Open Theist, about divine providence and foreknowledge.

Author Information

James Rissler
Email: amf@atlantamennonite.org
Oglethorpe University
U. S. A.


bluePhilosophy has long struggled to understand the nature of color. The central role color plays in our lives, in visual experience, in art, as a metaphor for emotions, has made it an obvious candidate for philosophical reflection. Understanding the nature of color, however, has proved a daunting task, despite the numerous fields that contribute to the project. Even knowing how to start can be difficult. Is color to be understood as an objective part of reality, a property of objects with a status similar to shape and size? Or is color more like pain, to be found only in experience and so somehow subjective? Or is color more like what some have said about time–that it seems real until we reflect enough, where we come ultimately to dismiss it as mere illusion? If color is more like shape and size, can we give a scientific account of it? Various strategies exist for this option–taking the color of an object to be just a complicated texture of that object, one that reflects certain wavelengths. Or perhaps color is merely a disposition to cause experiences in us, as salt has a disposition to dissolve. On the other hand, if color is more like pain, and found only in subjective experience, what is the nature of color experience? How, for instance, does an experience of red differ from an experience of blue, or from an experience of pain for that matter? Finally, if color is mere illusion, how do we continue to be so taken in by that illusion and how can something unreal seem so real and important to us?

There are just some of the questions that have been raised about color, ones we will address in this article. Of course, this is only a beginning, for it is not only the scientist or scientifically-inclined philosopher that wonders about color. Accounts of color have been given by anthropologists, artists, philosophers interested in metaphysics, and many others. How their accounts go, and how they all fit together makes for fascinating philosophy. This article will offer an introduction to philosophical issues of color, with an eye to exploring some of the answers that have been offered to some of the puzzles. As always in philosophy, the discussion has to begin somewhere, though it need not ever end.

Table of Contents

  1. Color, Philosophy, and Science
    1. Realism
      1. Non-Reductive Realism
      2. Reductive Realism
        1. Physicalism
        2. Dispositionalism
    1. Subjectivism
      1. Mentalism
      2. Eliminativism
  2. Color and Metaphysics
    1. Color Skepticism
    2. Color and Internal Relations
  3. Is Color Experience Universal?
    1. Linguistic Determinism
    2. Berlin and Kay
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Overviews and General Discussions
    2. Specific Positions

1. Color, Philosophy, and Science

Many contemporary debates about color have their origin in the rise of modern science. The emerging scientific picture of the 16th and 17th centuries demoted color, sound, taste and other aesthetically interesting properties to second-class status, according them the pejorative title of “secondary qualities.” Primary qualities, such as shape, size, motion, and number, in contrast, seemed necessary and sufficient to explain the behavior of physical objects and were thereby countenanced by the new physics as the truly real. From the perspective of physics, secondary qualities such as color were deemed explanatorily idle, and thus at best were said to be present in bodies only as complex structures of primary qualities, and so do not resemble our ideas of them. At worst, color and the like were dismissed as mere illusory appearances. Color would no more be in objects than pain is. Either way, the world was seen as not colored–or at least, if there is color in reality, it bears little resemblance to the color we are so intimately aware of.

With this background, contemporary philosophers face a choice of sorts. Should color be assimilated, on the one hand, to shape and size, and thus accountable in a scientific manner, not requiring appeal to sensory experience? Or, on the other hand, are colors more like sensations of pain, and thus personal, subjective features of experience? These questions trigger different responses, and so determine numerous accounts of the nature of color. Early portions of this article will examine the interplay between common sense and science on the nature of color, with an eye to answering those questions.

But philosophical issues of color are not limited to these debates. Color plays such an important role in our lives, in so many different ways, that it is not surprising that other issues should arise. We will explore some of these as well. Like children then, philosophers are fascinated by color. Unlike children, we have sophisticated concepts and tools at our disposal to help us understand the mysteries of color.

To begin let us ask, “Are physical objects, independently of perceivers’ experiences, colored? Again, were we to discard what is found in experience, would it still be correct to say that objects are colored?”

Realism about color, as understood here, maintains that yes, objects are colored. In particular, Realism holds that objects are colored, regardless of whether anyone is looking at an object, regardless if the color is perceived. In so maintaining that objects are colored, we are saying that the essence of color is to be found in the nature of the objects that are colored, as opposed to being within the minds of perceivers. Subjectivism, on the other hand, holds that it is false to say that objects are colored. But even if objects are not colored, surely there are experiences of color. And in this way we can find a place for color, by including the perceivers and perception of color. Subjectivism gets its name because of the role of the subjects of experience, where color is now to be found. In saying that color exists within subjective experiences of color, however, we need not mean there is something arbitrary or illusory about color. Color could be something that really does exist within perceivers, which can be studied, measured, and explained.

As we articulate these positions more precisely, we will discover that there are various ways to claim that objects are colored, just as there are various ways to understand the claim that there are only experiences of color. Due to limitations of space, we can only hope to introduce the reader to some of the positions and complexities of the debate, and hope that is enough to both satisfy one’s initial curiosity and to also spur one to learn more.

a. Realism

Realism holds that objects are colored. So does common sense. Science, particularly physics, apparently threatens that view. For science tells us, in the first place, that ordinary objects–trees, houses, cars, are themselves just complexes of more basic items (atoms, protons, electrons, quarks, and so forth). And in the second place, these scientific objects are not colored. We thus seem on the verge of paradox as we consider the following two claims.

CS: (Ordinary) objects are colored.
CP: Ordinary objects are bundles of basic scientific objects.
PS: Basic scientific objects are not colored.

(Though CP is clearly relevant to this discussion, it will not be explored further.) What then should we say about CS, the claim that common sense objects are colored, given the hard-to-deny threat posed by PS, the claim that the physicist’s entities are not colored? Several strategies emerge.

i. Non-Reductive Realism

Non-Reductive Realism about color holds there to be no distinction between what are called the primary and secondary qualities of objects. Both types exist in the object just as they present themselves. A red ball looks to have primary qualities (the shape, size, mass, and so forth) and secondary qualities (the color, the smell, the warmth, and so forth) and on this view, the object truly does have both kinds of qualities. The color exists “cheek by jowl” with the shape. Using some technical terms, we might say that on this view, shape and color are both irreducible qualities; they are basic and appear as they really are. In contrast, as we will see, other versions of Realism will deny color exists as such a basic quality. Instead, such views will reduce color to something more basic.

The motivation for Non-Reductive Realism, otherwise known as Primitivism, is clear enough, namely to allow us to take seriously our common sense view of the world, in which color plays an obvious and significant role. But as we have said, the scientific view of reality threatens common sense. On many fronts, science tells us to be suspicious of our everyday, common beliefs. When it comes to color, science typically seeks to explain our experiences of color by invoking scientifically respectable properties, the ones that lend themselves to mathematization, namely the primary qualities. In schematic form, we are said to perceive red, for instance, because of the shape and texture of a given object, which in turn reflects certain wavelengths of light to our eyes, which then send electrical impulses to our brain, resulting in the experience of color. More generally, the thought is that we should attribute to physical objects only those properties necessary and sufficient to explain their physical behavior, and that this can be accomplished by reference solely to the so-called primary qualities (hence their status as “primary”.) Since the property of red, for instance, seems to play no causal role in our experience of red, it should not be included in the list of properties that characterize physical objects. What does the explaining instead is the texture of the object, the wavelengths of light that are reflected, and so forth. Worse still, even if objects were colored in the irreducible, or what we could call the occurrent sense, it is not clear how that would help our perception of red objects. For again, the mechanism used to explain the perception of red makes use only of light, surface texture and the like. Color is left as explanatorily idle and should not be said to be part of the physical world. So goes the threat from science, as we have said.

How might the Non-Reductive Realist reply? One strategy denies that CS and PS are truly incompatible. Each might be argued to be true in their own way, and that therefore no problem arises. Why? Because 1) common sense and physics, and thus CS and PS respectively, operate at different levels of analysis and 2) there is no ultimately right level of analysis, and so, 3) we are not forced to choose between them. Consider another area where we do not feel the need to choose one level of analysis over another. For instance, we accept explanations of people’s behavior by describing their beliefs and desires. Even though we suspect that those beliefs and desires could (eventually) be given a description at the level of brain processes, we do not think we must appeal to that level in order to genuinely describe and explain. So too a level of discourse that speaks of objects’ irreducible properties seems autonomous and respectable, even if there is another level according to which there are not such colors. The autonomy of this level then could withstand the encroaching scientific perspective, allowing us to maintain both, if we like.

Of course, someone who takes science’s dictates to be the ultimate word on what does really exist–that science is the measure of all that is, will not be swayed by these considerations. And for those philosophers, they now must face that conflict between common sense and science. But again there is possibility for reconciliation. This, however, requires a reinterpretation of the claim that objects are colored, one that makes use of the notion of reduction.

ii. Reductive Realism

Since the Modern era, scientifically-inclined philosophers have sought a way to reconcile common sense claims with the philosophic-scientific view that color plays no role in physical explanations, should not be countenanced as basic, and thus is not in the objects in a basic sense. Faced with the inadequacies of Non-Reductive Realism, and with the general sentiment that our ontology should be given by science (or at least not be inconsistent with our best scientific theory), we might seek a scientifically respectable account of red and the like.

The hope has been to give a scientific account of these qualities by showing them to be just complicated physical properties, that is, primary qualities. If we can show how color is really just a combination of say, complex, microphysical properties that characterize the surface of objects, ones that cause certain wavelengths to be reflected, we will have given an account of their nature comparable to what has been done with observable shape, size, weight, texture, motion and the like. Objects can be now said to be colored, where that color now is understood as really just a complex of physical, primary, properties. We will have reduced color to properties and relations that do not include occurrent or basic color.

Our original conflict, then between:

CS: Objects are colored
PS: Basic scientific objects are not colored

disappears as CS is reinterpreted to mean that objects are colored in a reduced, non-occurrent sense. Just as scientists have shown sound to be nothing more than wavelengths in a medium, and shown heat to be kinetic energy, a similar reduction has been proposed for color.

1) Physicalism

How exactly does this reduction go? One broad strategy, known as Physicalism, seeks to reduce color to those physical properties (primary qualities) sufficient to explain why we see objects as colored in the basic, self-presenting, occurrent sense. But saying we can give a reductionist account of color that appeals only to the physical properties of objects and light is far from actually doing it. And there are many obstacles to the actual reduction. Here is why, in part: There are many, many different physical causes which, when they impinge upon our highly sensitive visual system, yield the same experienced color. Consider the color blue, and the many places blue appears. It turns out there are drastically different physical causes for the blue of sapphire; the blue of lapis; that of turquoise; from blue dye to blue in the rainbow; the blue of water compared with the sky; the blue on tv, compared with the blue of a bluish star. In short, identity or even similarity in color of objects does not imply similarity in physical structure of object. (Making matters worse, similarity in physical structure does not even imply similar color appearances. The same reflected range of light, but at different angles of reflection, will make for different colors–this is part of the explanation of the phenomenon of iridescence).

For simplicity, let us ignore the differing physical mechanisms that explain the blue of the sky (dispersal of light), the blue of water (reflection), and the blue of a rainbow (refraction). Instead, just focus on the blue of ordinary objects. Can we give a reductive, physicalist account of this blue, one that allows us to say the object is blue, but in a non-basic way? Here is how one version of Physicalism goes. (We have referred to this as “Reductive Physicalism, but as we are noting now, this is but one of various forms of that approach. We might think of the version about to be discussed as Disjunctive Reductive Physicalism.) A given color is defined by reference to the (micro)physical features that characterize the surfaces of objects; features which are then responsible for reflecting particular wavelengths to perceivers’ eyes. What is a color then? It is that complicated set of primary qualities which characterize the surface of an object. Some surfaces are structured to cause experience of red, some to cause blue, and so forth. The color itself, of an object, is that surface structure, which can be accounted for in physical terms–that is, describable by physics, chemistry and the like.

An immediate problem arises, even for this simplified phenomenon. This is the phenomenon known as metamerism, according to which different combinations of wavelengths (in the same conditions) give rise to identical color experiences. The reason metamers make things difficult is that two objects can have very different surface textures–at the microphysical level–and thus can reflect very different wavelengths to perceivers. But these very different wavelengths can be experienced as the exactly same color. For instance, light that is 100% 577 nm (a nanometer is a billionth of a meter) will appear as pure yellow. But light that is composed of 50% 540 nm and 50% 670 nm will appear qualitatively indistinguishable. Since different physical structures can produce different wavelengths, all of which yield the same color experience, it appears we are left defining color as the structure of an object by saying:

Yellow= microstructure1 OR microstructure2 OR microstructure3 OR…

This is, in other words, a disjunction and yellow looks to be definable as a disjunction only. There is apparently no single physical property of objects, of wavelengths, of reflections of light, and so forth. that all yellow objects have in common–let alone yellow of non-ordinary objects like the sun, after-images, and so forth.

With these scientific facts in hand we approach the matter now as philosophers. What should we say about the reduction of a property, in this case, a color, to a disjunction? Consider various problems raised. First, if the list of conditions that characterize yellow (or any color) is infinite, as it might be, then it hardly seems that we have reduced color. Even were it just a long finite list, as seems equally possible, we also might object to the claim that such disjunctive properties are real properties at all. Most troubling, however, is that there does not seem to be a unifying physical condition which explains why these all are instances of yellow. The only thing that explains why these various physical conditions are yellow is that they cause experiences of yellow. Thus our seemingly perceiver-independent account of color actually seems to require reference to perceivers. For without perceivers of color in the picture, we no way to explain why some physical conditions are yellow and some are not. And that leaves us with the disturbing sense that our list of physical conditions is just a hodgepodge, a gerrymandered set of properties, not a genuine explanatorily useful reduction. And while there are other ways to develop such Physicalism, the problems we have outlined have sufficed to send philosophers looking elsewhere for an account.

2) Dispositionalism

Failing to find a single (micro)property that explains an experience of a certain color, while still hoping to reconcile the claim that objects are colored with the scientific claim that color is not basic, philosophers have hit upon another reductive strategy. John Locke is usually credited here as the originator of this Dispositionalism, as he writes,

“Such qualities, which in truth are nothing in the Objects themselves, but Powers to produce various Sensations in us by their primary qualities, that is, by the Bulk, Figure, Texture, and Motion of their insensible parts, as Colours, Sounds, Tastes, and so forth. These I call secondary qualities.” (Locke, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Bk.II, Chpt. VIII, §10.)

To appreciate this claim, recall that we are still looking for a reductive account of color, but as well, have rejected Physicalist attempts at reduction. With that in mind, we might step back and notice that the Physicalist account of color was given by focusing largely, if not completely, on the object itself, leaving aside our experience of color–what it is like and how it might play a role in understanding color. Perhaps the absence of even a reference to experience is the source of the trouble. For certainly our motivation to understand color itself comes from reflection on our experience of color–especially as we put that alongside an account of reality that tells us to be suspicious of our common sense experiences of the world. Maybe we will do better by approaching the nature of color with a role for the fact that color is an experienced quality. With this in mind, we might develop an account of color that brings out the extent to which the particular nature of color is linked with experiences of color, though the color itself is still said to be a property of objects.

To develop this account, philosophers draw attention to the following true biconditional:

(C): x is red if and only if x appears red under standard conditions.

Red objects, that is, appear red in standard conditions (to normal perceivers), and if an object appears red to a normal perceiver, in normal conditions, then that object is red. What explains this? Here it is claimed that C is true because of a deeper truth about color, namely, that the color of an object just is the disposition of that object to appear red. Let us call this DC, and let it be the Dispositionalist’s definition of color.

(DC): x is red = x is disposed to appear red (to normal perceivers in standard conditions).

Of course, there are also corresponding biconditionals for shapes of objects. Examination of their different status will make clearer the goal and nature of Dispositionalism. Consider then,

(S): x is square iff x appears square under standard conditions (to normal perceivers)

This too is true, but does not entail a parallel treatment of square’s essence. For we will not accept,

(DS): x is square = x is disposed to appear square (to normal perceivers in standard conditions).

The reason we will not move from S to DS is instructive. For when it comes to such properties as being square, we believe that an account of its nature can be given by simple appeal to an objects’ physical properties, without appeal to how it appears to perceivers. We have no temptation to give a dispositionalist account of square for the essence of square. In contrast, color can be thought of as a property of physical objects, but only in a thin sense, namely, the disposition to cause in us certain experiences. Which experience? The appearance of the very color in question.

The merits of this account are numerous. First, we have found a way to keep our common sense claim, CS from above, though with a reinterpretation of CS. Objects are colored, though not in a basic sense. Second, we now also have room to take seriously the dictates of science according to which the basic entities of reality are not colored. What we can say is that if those basic entities are put together in suitable ways, ordinary objects come to have certain powers or dispositions, namely in this case, to cause experience of colors such as red. This makes for another merit. Objects can said to be red, or blue, and so forth, and we can distinguish veridical from non-veridical perceptions of color. One might experience a truly blue object as green, because either the viewing conditions are not standard (for instance, in certain kinds of light), or because something is amiss with the perceiver. In the second case, the perception was not veridical, for there is a way the object really is colored. This allows, in other words, for intersubjective agreement about the colors of objects, and thus keeps color from being purely subjective or relative. Finally, we can say that objects do have their colors even when not being observed, or even when they are in the dark. For even in the dark, objects do have the disposition to appear certain ways, and of course, that is what we are saying color really is. In this way color is said to be real, as we want when considering the matter from common sense. Yet in another sense, color is relative to a perceiver–for an object only has a disposition to appear red–and the experience of red, for instance, does require a perceiver, and an element of subjectivity. The total package then is a nice blend of objective and subjective elements, and for many is just what we should expect from a good explanation of color.

In sum, these features have made Dispositionalism a tempting and popular position. We now explore some objections to this view, leaving it to the reader to decide for themselves whether or not these objections are compelling.

It is often complained against Dispositionalism, for instance, that colors do not look like dispositions. They look like basic, occurrent properties, just like the shapes of objects. How then, it is questioned, could color really be a disposition, if it does not look like one at all? Here we might expect the Dispositionalist to ask us to specify exactly how we would expect a disposition to look in the first place. The Dispositionalist will then argue that once we actually figure out how we would expect color as disposition to appear, we discover that that is just how colors do appear. For example, if color were a disposition to appear red in standard conditions, then in standard conditions, a red object would look red. And is not that just what it does look like?

Perhaps more troubling, however, is that Dispositionalism seems circular. What is red? A disposition to appear a certain way. Which way? To appear as red, of course. Red, then, is a disposition to appear red. If “red” is being used the same way here, then we have explained “red” by reference to “appears red”. That seems straightforwardly circular, and thus problematic. Interestingly, some philosophers have taken this to be a serious problem, while others have suggested it is a harmless and even expected result. After all, they say, we have wanted an account of color that appeals to our experience of it. Thus the only way to explain what red is is to describe our experiences of red. In this case the circularity is not threatening, but simply an indication that our desired account of color required appeal to the experience of color to make sense of it in the first place. That, again, was what made explanation of red different from explanation of shape. On the other hand, circular accounts do not provide much information, and as such we might still wonder what we have really learned about the nature of red, if that is just a disposition to appear red.

Finally, some have worried that if color is a disposition, we are now incapable of explaining why we have experiences of color at all. Consider this parallel. We can taste the saltiness of a pretzel. Why? Because the pretzel was salty. And the salt has a disposition to dissolve and cause experiences of tasting salty. But it is not the disposition to dissolve that is responsible for the taste of salt. It is the non-dispositional properties of salt that both cause it to dissolve and which cause the taste of salt. Again, it is not salt’s dispositions that cause our experiences of salty taste. It is the non-dispositional properties that ground that disposition. In fact, we say that what is essential to salt is whatever properties explain those dispositions, and it is those more basic properties that do the causing. So too it might be said for color. Dispositions do not cause anything, but rather the ground of those dispositions does. Color as a disposition cannot cause a perception of color. Instead, it must be the non-dispositional ground that causes experiences of color. But that means we have located color in the wrong place. Instead of speaking of color as a disposition, it now seems we should be considering the ground of that disposition to be the heart of color. And that might take us away from Dispositionalism and back to Physicalism, with all of its problems. Or maybe not, as some philosophers have sought here a third way.

As noted, these discussions of different kinds of Realism have only skimmed the surface. The broad strategies we have outlined, of course, can and have been developed in quite a number of different ways. Enough has been said, however, to both give a sense of these positions and to show the need some have felt for a completely different approach. We turn to that now, the broad strategy we have designated as Subjectivism.

b. Subjectivism

Recall that conflict between science and common sense over the status of color.

CS: Ordinary objects are colored.
PS: Basic scientific objects are not colored.

Our discussion of Realism has been an extended exploration of this conflict, with focus on preserving the truth of CS and common sense. Let us now cease attempting to reconcile these claims, and simply reject CS as false. Common sense is just wrong, we might claim. Objects are not colored in any sense, reduced or not; and thus we are free to embrace a scientific ontology which does not include color among the basic properties of its basic entities.

Common sense is wrong then, but it certainly does not seem wrong. The world presents itself as colored, afterall, and if it really is not colored, we are owed at least an explanation of how we could have been so wrong. Here is where Subjectivism gets its name and appeal. For while the world itself has no color, there are undeniably experiences of color. And while we will need to give a philosophical account of those experiences, we can say for now that color is subjective in the sense of being perceiver dependent, just as pain is. Objects can be round or square, but they are not colored. Since it does not make sense to say objects have the properties of pain and pleasure, we say that pain and pleasure, instead, are merely types of subjective experience. Those experiences may be caused by physical objects, but the qualities of pain and pleasure are in us, not in the objects. So too we may say for color.

In thus locating color within perceptual experience, we make it perceiver dependent, and thus, in some sense, cease to view color as part of the objective world. How we choose to account for experience itself, however, will give us different versions of Subjectivism.

i. Mentalism

Let us call any position that posits color as a genuine property of subjective, personal experience, a version of Mentalism. The inspiration for this view is René Descartes, who thought that color and other secondary qualities were merely sensations, and as such, mere occurrences within a mental substance. The parallel again with pain is instructive here. Pain and color, then, occur in a substance that is also the locus of thinking. As occurrences in a mental realm, they fall outside the scope of the physical sciences that study material substance.

Contemporary philosophy, however, has had little sympathy for this kind of substance dualism, whereby two distinct types of substances exist side by side. Not only does this mental substance fall outside the scope of the physical sciences, difficult questions about the connection and interaction of these independent substances arise. As we will see next, some have left the letter of mental substance behind, while retaining the spirit in a related, but slightly less problematic metaphysics, one that comes in handy when accounting for the nature of color.

In the earlier parts of the twentieth century, philosophers made much use of a special class of entities dubbed, sense-data. These are a class of particulars, or individuals, which have existence only in minds. They are often held to be private, special objects, of which each person has direct, infallible access to and knowledge of. Knowledge of sense-data in turn allegedly provided foundational knowledge on which all other knowledge rests. As for sense-data themselves, they were introduced to explain the appearance of perceptual qualities when there were in fact no such qualities in the physical objects one is perceiving. In a famous example, one could explain a perception of an elliptical coin, when presented with a coin that is really round, by claiming that the actual object of experience is an elliptically-shaped item (an elliptical sensum), which one experienced directly. Sense-data would be the bearers of properties we take physical objects to have, and so could explain the possibility of perceptual error.

With this metaphysics in hand, color can now be categorized as a property of such sense-data. Though the physical world may lack such properties as color, the world causes each of us to have experiences and present in such experiences would be special, private, mental entities that have the qualities in question. Presented then with an apple that really is not red or sweet, we have experiences of red sensa; sweet sensa, and so forth. We thereby account for the existence of such qualities–having them qualify these subjective, perceiver dependent entities, and we also explain our belief that the world is colored. We think there is color, because in fact there is, though we mistakenly believe the color of sense-data is really to be found in physical objects.

Sense-data themselves, however, have fallen on hard times, especially since the middle of the twentieth century as various philosophers objected both to their nature and the epistemological role they were to play. Though many are now reluctant to speak of sense-data as a class of particulars, some contemporary philosophers have preserved some of the functions of sense-data, and now speak of qualities that characterize our visual field, or perhaps that qualify our mental states or mental events. Color on this understanding is categorized as a “phenomenal property”, maintaining the Cartesian legacy that such properties are mind-dependent and subjective, but in a way that frees them of excessive ontological baggage.

ii. Eliminativism

In opposition to Mentalism, but still within what we have called Subjectivism, lies another popular position, Eliminativism. This view agrees that objects are not colored, but it does not wish to trade the color of objects for color as now an irreducible property of something inner or mental. Instead, it wishes to rob color of any ontological significance at all. We can still speak of our experiencing color, of course, but we are not to understand this as claiming that color does really exist, only now as a property of mental substance or of sense-data or of our visual field. Color experiences themselves, we could say, are to be reduced to non-color properties, just as Reductive Physicalism sought to reduce the color of objects to non-colored properties and relations. For Eliminativism the reduction of color experiences is to be to properties and facts about our visual processing systems, facts about the behavior of rods and cones, about transmission of information along neural pathways and the like. (We will explore some of the details below in our discussion of the universality of color experience.) In the end, nothing, anywhere, answers to our common sense description or account of color. That type of property just does not exist.

Put positively, Eliminativism can be understood as follows. Our experience of a seemingly colored world is the result of a systematic error. Simply put, we take features found in our visual experience and project them upon the world, mistakenly believing that color is “out there”–when in fact color is but subjective response to an achromatic reality. This Projectivism about color does not deny that this is an important projection, or that it might help us navigate the world more easily, or that we can continue to speak of the world as colored, but it does point out the fundamental error nevertheless. An analogy might help, and in fact much recent philosophy has involved discussion of the aptness of the following analogy.

In ordinary moral discourse, we are inclined to speak of an action as moral or immoral, right or wrong. We seem in these cases to be claiming that a particular act has (or lacks) a special, moral property or nature. Taken literally, though, such predication would commit us to the existence of rather strange properties, that is, rightness and/or wrongness, ones that are not easily described or explained. Wanting to avoid commitment to those properties, some have suggested a similar projectivist account. In this case, certain actions create in us feelings of pleasure or pain, approval or disapproval. We project these attitudes upon the world, taking the world to really have such properties, when in fact they are nothing but subjective responses. (Talk of “projection” in the psychoanalytic sense is another helpful parallel, where again, something “inner” is mistakenly claimed to be found “outside” us.)

Such Projectivism, as one way of developing Eliminativism, clears the road for a fully scientific account not only of objects, but now of perceivers as well. In particular, only properties that can do genuine explanatory work will be included, and color will be sorted into the group of properties that contribute nothing to our understanding of causal relations between objects and perceivers. There is a downside, however. Besides indicting common sense as systematically wrong, we are bound to be left with a nagging feeling that a most treasured property has completely disappeared. This has provoked some to reply along the following lines: “We started with a belief that objects are colored. Having reduced physical objects to items with only primary qualities, we were left to relocate color and similar qualities within perceivers. Now, however, we have made perceivers and their experiences also bereft of secondary qualities. Without color in the picture at all, we fail to explain how we thought there was color in the first place. How can we explain the appearance of color, our experience of color, now that color is nowhere to be found?”

This question might lead one to rethink the steps that led to this puzzling conclusion, and to raise the possibility that a mistake was made along the way. If so, where exactly did we go wrong, and what would be a better route? If not, how exactly then do we come to believe there is color, if it appears nowhere in our account of reality and perceivers? These difficult questions explain why philosophers continue to debate this interplay between what common sense says about color and what science would have us believe.

2. Color and Metaphysics

One should not conclude that the only philosophical questions about color involve science. The remaining portions of this article offer introduction to other important and exciting issues. In particular, we turn to some questions of metaphysics, and then turn to ones about the universality of color experience, questions that get at the heart of the nature of color from other perspectives.

To begin, consider how much energy we have devoted to explaining the color of objects. Is the color of an object a basic property, a disposition, a combination of micro-primary qualities? Let us pause, however, and ask about color itself. What exactly is color in the first place? What is the essence of this quality that is capable of being a property of objects, or a property of sensations, and so forth? (We can also ask, of course, “What is a quality? And what is the difference between qualities that are colors and those that are sounds?) Focusing our attention on a specific color seems to make things even harder. Consider the questions, “What is the essence of red?” “What is the difference between red and blue”? How do we even go about answering them? Let us explore some attempts.

a. Color Skepticism

Faced with such as question as, “What is the essence of red?” one might respond by pointing to something red, or by looking for a metaphor, claiming that red is like a trumpet sound. The first does not tell us much though–in fact, pointing at a red ball does not suffice to even indicate the redness as opposed to the round shape. Similarly, though metaphors might help convey something about the experience of red, they tell us little about the nature of redness. Can we do better? Can we actually articulate the nature of individual colors? Can we even say what colors in general are, in a rich, philosophically satisfying manner?

One possible source of the apparent difficulty is that we tend to think that the red we experience is something essentially private and subjective. We are drawn to a picture whereby the essence of red, or blue, or yellow for that matter, is given in sense-experience, where the experience itself is something ineffable. Just as it is hard, if not impossible, to articulate what a pain feels like, we may think that the qualitative difference between blue and red is similarly inexpressible. Let “color skepticism” be the view that the essence of color is ineffable, and let us explore the merits of such skepticism.

One source of the supposed ineffability of color, as we have seen, lies in the belief that color’s nature is revealed only in private experience. The language of color, and language as a whole, however, is public in the sense of both being suitable for reporting public events and learnable by appeal to public objects. How then could the allegedly private, subjective nature of color be reconciled with the public, intersubjective nature of language? Color skepticism gains a foothold here, for it seems it cannot. As a result, we are tempted to conclude that our experiences of color are akin to pain in being private, personal and ineffable. No surprise that many have been led to wonder whether the qualitative experience they associate with, say, red, is the same for each person, or instead, whether it is possible that what I experience as red, you experience as green, though we both use the same public word, “red”. Such color skepticism leads to this familiar problem, the Inverted Spectrum. At its worst, we imagine that all of our color experiences might be systematically different from another’s, though we all use “red” to refer to the color of firetrucks, “yellow” for the color of bananas, and so forth. In this case, each of us is trapped within our minds, forever cut-off from truly sharing our experiences of things that matter dearly to us.

How we might extricate ourselves from this depressing, solipsistic trap? One route is to rethink our starting point, namely that there is nothing more to say about red than pointing to red objects or reverting to metaphor. As an alternative, some have sought to articulate the metaphysical nature of color in a surprising direction–by understanding the intrinsic features of individual colors as a product of their relations to other colors. These relations are known as “internal relations” and to them we turn.

b. Color and Internal Relations

First we need to distinguish such internal relations from so-called external relations. External relations are ones in which the relation plays no role in making the relata the relata that they are. For instance, my glass of water is externally related to the table. The relation, “being on top of” is external in that it is not part of the nature or essence of the glass or table to be in that relation. Were the glass and table to cease to being so related neither will undergo a change in their nature. They will not cease to be the things they are. The relata here are external to each other in the sense of not depending on each, or the relation, for their identity.

In contrast we have internal relations. For internal relations, the relations are essential to the being and nature of the related items. Without that particular relation, an entity would not be the thing that it is. To say that colors are internally related to colors would mean that the natures of individual colors depend on the relations those colors have to other colors, to other members the color-array. Orange is related to red and yellow in a particular, unique way, for instance. That relation therefore helps make orange the color it is–that relation as well as the other ones that orange bears to other colors. No other color has those particular relations, and thus no other color is orange. Put differently, orange would cease to be orange were it to not have that relational structure to other colors. (Another example is numbers. Seven would not be the number it is, for instance, were it not between 6 and 8.)

To speak then of a particular color requires reference to its relational place within a color array. What is the nature of the relation between colors? Most abstractly, it is that relation which includes only colors. More specifically, we might say that it is the betweenness relation colors bear to one another. Orange, for instance, is between yellow and red, while green is between blue and yellow, and so forth. Such betweenness relations capture the essence of color. Taken as a whole, these complex betweenness relations can be modeled, allowing us to understand the logical structure of the entire color array. And though many models have been proposed, one particularly illuminating one captures these betweenness relations by modeling color’s structure on that of a double cone. (We can even now speak of the difference between different types of qualities by talking about their different spatial models–color is nicely modeled on a double cone, sound perhaps by a spiral staircase, with each octave recognized as another turn on the staircase.)

The following diagram helps illustrate the structure of color, making use of the HSL (hue, saturation, lightness) model. We can even use it to spell out in some detail a claim about a particular color’s nature and its betweenness relations.

Relying as we have on internal relations might seem paradoxical. On the one hand, each color has its proper place within the color array because of the particular color it is. On the other a color is the particular color it is because of that place within the color array. This suggests colors have their intrinsic properties because of their relations–as opposed to saying they have the relations they do because of their intrinsic property. But what could be plainer than saying red is what it is because of its intrinsic properties? The intrinsic nature of color, we might object, is prior to any of its relations and it is that essence we should try to articulate. Have not we forgotten this important point? Have not we ignored the intrinsic nature of color, and thus what is most important about color in the first place? In reply, it is acknowledged that this account of internal relations does appeal to the relations a color has to other colors in order to individuate it. But, crucially, that does not make the relations conceptually or ontologically prior to colors’ intrinsic properties. For to make sense of the particular relations a color has we have to return to the relata, the color itself. A color has the particular relations it does because of the color it is, just as we want to say. The difference is that on this story, the relata and the relation are intimately and necessarily involved. The relationship and dependence goes in both directions. We are talking about internal relations here, after all. As such, the relata and the relation figure as essential elements. Both balance each other, making both important, but neither prior. That is what is so special about internal relations. In conclusion, we can now say that we have still paid proper respect to the intrinsic nature color.

With this account in place, perhaps we finally have an answer to the color skeptic. We now have something, in fact a lot, to say about each color. True, we need to speak of other colors to explain what a single color is, but we have gone well beyond mere pointing or metaphor. We say what a color is by talking about how it relates to other colors, about its color relationships, its intrinsic properties that make for those relations, and those relations that make for those properties. If that is not good enough to satisfy our skeptic, we might begin to wonder whether the skeptic is willing to be convinced.

3. Is Color Experience Universal?

A final issue we will discuss in this article concerns the universality of color experience. We have already seen one threat to the notion that we all experience color the same way, namely the possibility of an inverted spectrum. A deeper threat comes from another direction, this time borne from wondering about the connection between language and perception. An important theme in the background of this threat lies in the rise and development of a view according to which our perceptual experience is mediated by our language. This has been an important strand in post-WWII philosophy, and as such draws on various themes that fall far outside the scope of this article. We can gain enough of an appreciation of the issue by considering for starters a relatively uncontroversial sense in which our familiarity with a concept influences what we see. To use a well-worn example, a physicist looking at a technical apparatus in a lab sees, in some sense, something different that what the layperson sees and experiences. In this way, different concepts can play some role in what is seen. We move from this innocuous example to tougher ones when we wonder whether different cultures that have completely different languages experience the same world. Or, instead, do the different linguistic resources they bring to experience give them experiences of quite different worlds? It is not hard to be swayed to a perspective from which we see such different languages as yielding very different worlds of experience. Now take these general questions and apply them to experiences of color. Would speakers of languages that have different color terms see the world differently, see different colors?

a. Linguistic Determinism

A particularly strong version of the view that language influences perception was advanced by the anthropologists, Whorf and Sapir. On their view, language plays such an essential role in perception that cultures that use different language can be said to inhabit quite different worlds. What we all see, what we take ourselves to touch, to conceive as real, is a function of language. Vary the language and you change the world experienced. Dubbed the thesis of Linguistic Determinism, this view clearly has interesting implication for color experience once it is realized that there is great diversity in color language across cultures. There are well-documented languages that have only 2 color terms, or three, or only four, and so forth.

What then would Linguistic Determinism have us expect for people who speak a language with only three color terms, for instance? Presumably, if that thesis of determinism is correct, those people would experience only three colors. We would expect these people to simply not be aware of the colors we have terms for; they would fail to make the color discriminations we make, and they would organize their color field in very different ways than we do. This hypothesis was put to the test in the 1960’s by the researchers, Berlin and Kay. Compiling data from a great number of languages, their results seem to contradict the Whorf-Sapir thesis and open a whole range of questions and interesting debates

b. Berlin and Kay

To help appreciate the significance of their findings, we need to distinguish a color’s “foci” from its “boundary.” When presented with an array of color samples (such as ones found at a paint store) we can ask how many of those samples are properly called by a certain color. We could ask, that is, how many of these samples are appropriately called “red”, and where do we draw the line between samples that are red and those that are not? To answer these questions is to speak of the red’s boundary. We might also ask about what is the best sample or paradigmatic sample of red. This is to ask about red’s foci, or more generally, to look for focal samples.

Berlin and Kay found, quite interestingly, that though there are differences across cultures of color boundaries for shared color terms, there was significant consensus on what counted as a focal color–even across languages with very different numbers of color terms. So, in a culture that had only three basic color words, say ones for “white”, “black”, and “red”, people in that culture would point to the same samples as the foci for each of these colors as people with 11 basic color terms, such as English speakers. What they consider as truly red, or white, or black, would be nearly the same samples that we do, though we carve up the world with many different color terms. On the face of it, this suggests something quite other than Whorf-Sapir would have us expect. Something besides color vocabulary seems to be at work in our experience of color. Why else would we all gravitate to the same samples, when for some what is red would presumably include many more colors than us? After all, with only three terms to cover the whole range of color, many more things would have to be called “white” or “black” or “red” in this example. Why would certain samples stand out, even when so many other things are conceived and experienced as red?

In addition, Berlin and Kay found that languages exhibit great similarities on which color terms they have; and great similarities in the relationships between differing numbers of color terms. The following graph summarizes their results, where movement from left to right indicates what color terms would be added as a language increases its number of terms.

Here we see that if a language has two color terms, the terms are “white” and “black”. If a language has a third term, it is “red”; if more than three, then either “green” or “yellow”; and next the other “green” or “yellow” term; and so on. This suggests, as they interpreted it, a development suitably conceived as evolutionary. Thus if a language evolves from two colors to three, the one it will add will be “red”, then “green or “yellow”, and so forth.

What is the philosophical significance of these findings, if true? Simply put, they again suggest that there is something other than language that determines what colors are seen. Berlin and Kay conclude that there are universal, non-trivial constraints on color terms. Color experience is not simply a function of a language’s terms and arbitrary conventions. Instead, there seems something about how the world is that causes different speakers to experience certain colors as best samples, to develop terms for “red” before terms for “brown”, for privileging “white” and “black” over “pink”, and so forth.

If not language, what would explain these findings? One answer comes from facts about the biology of color perception, facts about how our visual system processes certain kinds of electromagnetic radiation, that is, light. (These are the very facts our previously discussed “color-eliminativist” might offer to show that there really is no such thing as color, that is, might make use of to reduce color experience to facts, properties, and relations that make no mention of color at all. Thus what follows can be called upon to serve two functions–explain similarity of color experience across language, and also be used by a color eliminativist to reduce away color. Importantly, these issues are logically independent, and a solution to one problem need have no bearing on the truth of the other.)

Here is a quick summary of the proposed biological account. Our visual system includes rods and cones. Cones are responsible for color vision and do so with three different types of cones. Two of these cones operate according to what is known as opponent-processing. For these two types of cones, they each have two cells, one which has its rate of firing increase when hit by a certain range of light and decrease when another range of light hits it, and a second cell that operates just the opposite way. For example, there is a cell that maximizes its output when hit by light around 610 nm and is at its lowest output around 500 nm. It sits alongside another cell that works just the opposite–its maximum is around 500 nm and its lowest is at 610 nm. (Call these our Y+B- and Y-B+ cells, respectively.) Thus when the cone with this cell package is hit by that 610 nm light, there will be a pure, highly stimulated response as the Y+B- cell will be at its highest, and the Y-B+ cell will be at its quietist. 610 nm happens to be the range of light we call yellow; and thus when this cone is hit by that light, it will give its purest, most intense output of energy. Yellow will be experienced, in other words, in a pure, intense manner. But when the received light is at around 440 nm, this Y+B- cell is at its lowest output, but its partner, the Y-B+ cell, is at its highest output. Blue then also can appear as a particularly strong, pure color. Other places where we get these pure peaks of cell stimulation occur at 520 nm and 660 nm–the very ranges that correspond to green and red respectively. Here we can speak of our R-G+ and R+G- cells. (White and black have their own cells, but these do not work in opposition to each other, so both the black cell and the white cell can be activated at the same time, yielding experiences of different shades of gray.)

This all suggest that any person with a normal operating visual system is going to experience certain ranges of light with intense neural stimulation which happen to correspond to the four basic colors: yellow, red, blue, and green (yes, green is a primary color when it considering our visual system.) And it also explains why no one seems to experience reddish greens–for when the “red” cell is active, the “green” cell is not. We can only have one or the other, and not both. Further, these facts might be able to explain why different speakers in different languages hone in on the same color samples–because for everyone these samples trigger the same intense cell stimulation. Our shared judgments about focal colors, as well as why all people gravitate towards certain colors in a similar order, now seem explainable. And the explanation goes beyond what language creates, contrary to Whorf-Sapir.

To be sure, there are many questions left–such as why it is that red always is the first color to appear in languages after “white” and “black” even though other colors trigger similarly intense responses. So too have Berlin/Kay’s results been subjected to many criticisms and objections, from the philosophical to the methodological. What emerges then is a fascinating debate the ranges across numerous disciplines. In a way, that seems most proper and fitting. For color appeals to all who can see it, and it makes sense to suppose that we are still drawn to color, whatever our intellectual interests, just as we have been since we were kids.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Overviews and General Discussions

  • Berlin, B., & Kay, P. (1999). Basic color terms : their universality and evolution. Stanford, Calif: Center for the Study of Language and Information.
    • The landmark book that summarizes their cross-cultural findings of color terms, boundaries, and foci.
  • Byrne, A., & Hilbert, D. R. (1997). Readings on color. Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press.
    • This two volume set contains a wide range of important article on various issues on color. Volume 1 is on the philosophy of color, and the second volume on the science. Besides containing numerous landmark articles, there is a detailed bibliography and glossary of terms. A must have set for those wishing to explore the various debates in more detail.
  • Kay, P., McDaniel, C. “The Linguistic Significance of the Meaning of Basic Color Terms”. Language, vol. 54, 1978, pp.610-46.
    • Provides a biological based explanation for the anthropological findings in Berlin/Kay.
  • Harrison, Bernard. (1973). Form and Content. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • An extended discussion of what we have called “color skepticism”, with a detailed account of color as a system of internal relations. Covers many issues in a careful, interesting manner.
  • Wittgenstein, L., & Anscombe, G. E. M. (1978). Remarks on colour. Oxford [Eng.]: B. Blackwell.
    • An interesting, but difficult, examination of a number of puzzles about color. Hard going but shows a brilliant mind struggling to make sense of difficult problems about color.

b. Specific Positions

  • Armstrong, D. M. (1987) “Smart and the secondary qualities.” In Metaphysics and Morality: Essays in Honour of J. J. C. Smart, ed. P. Pettit, R. Sylvan, and J. Norman. Oxford: Blackwell. Reprinted as chapter 3 of Readings on Color, vol. 1.)
    • Classic statement of Physicalism.
  • Cornman, J. “Can Eddington’s `two tables’ be identical?”. Australasian Journal of Philosophy vol 52, 1974. pp. 22-38.
    • A defender of Non-Reductive Realism.
  • Hardin, C. L. (1988). Color for Philosophers: Unweaving the Rainbow. Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co.
    • Written by a philosopher who knows lots of the science of color perception, this book provides an excellent introduction to debates over the scientific status of color, and provides an extended argument for what we have called Color Eliminativism.
  • Jackson, F., and R. Pargetter. “An objectivist’s guide to subjectivism about colour.” Revue Internationale de Philosophie. vol. 41. 1987. pp.127-41. (Reprinted as chapter 6 of Readings on Color, vol. 1.)
    • An alternative to Physicalism about color.
  • Johnston, M. “How to speak of the colors”. Philosophical Studies, vol. 68, 2 1992. pp. 21-63.
    • Extended defense of Dispositionalism.
  • McDowell, J. “Values and Secondary Qualities”, in Ted Honderich, ed., (1985) Morality and Objectivity. Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Discusses the pros and cons of a Projectivist strategy that compares secondary qualities and moral properties.
  • Peacocke, C. “Colour concepts and colour experience”. Synthese vol. 58, 1984. pp. 365-82. (Reprinted as chapter 5 of Readings on Color, vol. 1.)
    • Another version of Dispositionalism.
  • Sellars, W. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man” in Science, Perception and Reality. (1991) Ridgview Publishing Company.
    • A difficult but interesting argument against Eliminativism, in favor of a different version of Subjectivism.
  • Shoemaker, S. “Phenomenal character.” Noûs. vol. 28, 1994. pp. 21-38. (Reprinted as chapter 12 of Readings on Color, vol. 1.)
    • From a defender of what we have called Phenomenal Subjectivism.

Author Information

Eric M. Rubenstein
Email: erubenst@iup.edu
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Personal Identity

What does being the person that you are, from one day to the next, necessarily consist in? This is the question of personal identity, and it is literally a question of life and death, as the correct answer to it determines which types of changes a person can undergo without ceasing to exist. Personal identity theory is the philosophical confrontation with the most ultimate questions of our own existence: who are we, and is there a life after death? In distinguishing those changes in a person that constitute survival from those changes in a person that constitute death, a criterion of personal identity through time is given. Such a criterion specifies, insofar as that is possible, the necessary and sufficient conditions for the survival of persons.

One popular criterion, associated with Plato, Descartes and a number of world religions, is that persons are immaterial souls or pure egos. On this view, persons have bodies only contingently, not necessarily; so they can live after bodily death. Even though this so-called Simple View satisfies certain religious or spiritual predilections, it faces metaphysical and epistemological obstacles, as we shall see.

Another intuitively appealing view, championed by John Locke, holds that personal identity is a matter of psychological continuity. According to this view, in order for a person X to survive a particular adventure, it is necessary and sufficient that there exists, at a time after the adventure, a person Y who psychologically evolved out of X. This idea is typically cashed out in terms of overlapping chains of direct psychological connections, as those causal and cognitive connections between beliefs, desires, intentions, experiential memories, character traits, and so forth. This Lockean view is well suited for thought experiments conducted from first-person points of view, such as body swaps or tele-transportation, but it, too, faces obstacles. For example, on this view, it appears to be possible for two future persons to be psychologically continuous with a presently existing person. Can one really become two? In response to this problem, some commentators have suggested that, although our beliefs, memories, and intentions are of utmost importance to us, they are not necessary for our identity, our persistence through time.

A third criterion of personal identity is that we are our bodies, that is to say, that personal identity is constituted by some brute physical relation between, for example, different bodies or different life-sustaining systems at different times. Although this view is still somewhat unpopular, developments about personal identity theory in the 1990s promise an ideological change, as versions of the so-called somatic criterion, associated with Eric Olson and Paul Snowdon, attract a continuously growing number of adherents.

The aim of this article is to (1) add precision to the problem of personal identity, (2) state a number of theories of personal identity and give arguments for and against them, (3) formulate “the paradox of identity,” which proposes to show that posing the persistence question, in conjunction with a number of plausible assumptions, leads to a contradiction, and (4) explain how Derek Parfit’s theory of persons attempts to answer this paradox.

Table of Contents

  1. Understanding the Problem of Personal Identity
    1. Criteria and the Identity Relation
    2. Personhood
  2. Theories of Personal Identity
    1. The Simple View
    2. Reductionism (1): General Features
    3. Reductionism (2): Psychological Approaches
    4. Quasi-Psychology
    5. Reductionism (3): Physiological Approaches
  3. The Paradox of Personal Identity
    1. Fission
    2. The Paradox
  4. Parfit and the Unimportance of Personal Identity
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Understanding the Problem of Personal Identity

The persistence question, the question of what personal identity over time consists in, is literally a question of life and death: answers to it determine, insofar as that is possible, the conditions under which we survive, or cease to exist in the course of, certain adventures. These adventures do not have to be theoretically as fancy as the cases, to be discussed later, of human fission or brain swaps: a theory of personal identity tells us whether we can live through the acquisition of complex cognitive capacities in our development from fetus to person, or whether we have survived car accidents if we find ourselves in a persistent vegetative state. Furthermore, theories of personal identity have ethical and metaphysical implications of considerable magnitude: in conjunction with certain normative premises they may support the justification or condemnation of infanticide or euthanasia, or they could prove or falsify certain aspects of our religious outlook, in deciding the questions of how and whether we can be resurrected and whether we are possessors of souls whose existence conditions are identical with ours. It is not surprising, therefore, that most great philosophers have attempted to solve the problem of personal identity, or have committed themselves to metaphysical systems that have substantial implications with regards to the problem, and that most religious belief systems give explicit answers to the persistence question. Neither is it surprising that virtually everybody holds a pre-theoretical theory of personal identity, if only in the sense of having beliefs about afterlives and the meaning of death. The task of solving the metaphysical problem of personal identity essentially involves answering the question of how the phenomenon or principle in virtue of which “entities like us” persist through time is to be specified, under the widely but not universally accepted premises that there is such a phenomenon or principle and that it can be specified. We are concerned, in other words, with the truth-makers of personal identity statements: what makes it true that our statement that an entity X at time t1 and an entity Y at time t2 are identical, if X and Y are entities like us?

a. Criteria and the Identity Relation

Answers to the persistence question often provide a criterion of personal identity. A criterion is a set of non-trivial necessary and sufficient conditions that determines, insofar as that is possible, whether distinct temporally indexed person-stages are stages of one and the same continuant person. (A temporally indexed person-stage is a slice of a continuant person that extends in three spatial dimensions but has no temporal extension.) To say that C is a necessary condition for E is to say that if E is the case, then C is the case as well, and to say that C is a sufficient condition for E is to say that if C is the case, then E is the case as well. Consequently, to specify such a criterion is to give an account of what personal identity necessarily consists in.

Let us distinguish between numerical identity and qualitative identity (exact similarity): X and Y are numerically identical iff X and Y are one thing rather than two, while X and Y are qualitatively identical iff, for the set of non-relational properties F1…Fn of X, Y only possesses F1…Fn. (A property may be called “non-relational” if its being borne by a substance is independent of the relations in which property or substance stand to other properties or substances.) Personal identity is an instance of the relation of numerical identity; investigations into the nature of the former, therefore, must respect the formal properties that govern the latter. The concept of identity is uniquely defined by (a) the logical laws of congruence: if X is identical with Y, then all non-relational properties borne by X are borne by Y, or formally “∀(x, y)[(x = y) → (Fx = Fy)]; and (b) reflexivity: every X is identical with itself, or formally “∀x(x = x). (Note that congruence and reflexivity entail that identity is symmetric, “∀(x, y)[(x = y) → (y = x)], and transitive, “∀(x, y, z)[((x = y) & (y = z)) → (x = z)]). [Note: ∀(xy) is an abbreviation of (∀x)(y).]

Grasp of the notion of numerical identity, to be sure, is essential to our ability to distinguish between the events of picking out one thing more often than once and picking out more than one thing. Although exact similarity is, by congruence, a necessary condition for synchronic personal identity, it is neither necessary nor sufficient for diachronic personal identity, that is to say, the persistence of a person over time: two person-slices at different times could be qualitatively identical slices of different people or qualitatively distinct slices of the same person. This is not to say, however, that it is ruled out that lack of similarity over time may obliterate numerical personal identity: depending on what personal identity consists in, certain qualitative changes in a person’s psychology or physiology may kill the person. The question a criterion of personal identity answers is: what kind of changes does a person survive?

This gives a distinctive sense to the claim that a criterion of personal identity is to be constitutive, not merely evidential: in order for a relation R to be constitutive for personal identity, it must be the case that, necessarily, if some past or future Y stands in an R-relation to X, then X is identical with Y. Hence, many elements of our successful everyday reidentification practices, such as physical appearance, fingerprints, or signatures, are inadequate if considered as constituting ingredients of personal identity relations: for example, if the man in the crowd is wearing a Yankees jacket, this might be sufficient evidence for you to conclude that he is your friend Larry. However, wearing a Yankees jacket is not what it is for Larry to persist through time: neither did Larry come into existence when he wore the jacket for the first time nor does he die when he takes it off.

Does the logic of the concept of identity impose further restraints on the concept of personal identity? Some commentators believe that identity is an intrinsic relation, that is, that if two person-stages at different times are stages of one and the same person, that will be true only in virtue of the intrinsic relation between these two stages (cf. Noonan 1989; Wiggins 2001). Others hold identity to be necessarily determinate, that is, that it is necessarily false that sometimes there is no answer to the question of whether X is identical with Y. These commentators typically reason as follows: suppose that it is indeterminate that X is identical with Y. Since it is determinate that X is identical with X, under the assumption that congruence and predicate logic apply, X must be determinately identical with Y. Therefore, by modus tollens, if X is not determinately identical with Y, X is not identical with Y (cf. Evans 1985; Wiggins 2001). Consequently, the question does in fact have an answer, and the claim that identity is indeterminate is self-contradictory. This conclusion is strengthened, in the case of personal identity, by the widely shared intuition that even if the identity of some objects might be indeterminate, this could not be true of the identity of persons: one cannot, it seems, be a bit dead and a bit alive in the same way in which one cannot be a bit pregnant. As it turns out, however, there may be good reasons to deny both the intrinsicness and the determinacy of personal identity (cf. 3.a.; 3.b.).

b. Personhood

While the formal properties of the concept of identity are necessary constraints on our discussion, the truth of our identity judgments is subject to material conditions of correctness, which these formal properties cannot provide. These material conditions must be supplied by the nature of the relata judged to stand in an identity relation. The obvious suggestion is that, given that we are dealing with personal identity, these relata are person-stages located at different times. This proposal, however, violates the requirement that the persistence question ought to specify its relata without presupposing an answer: should we choose to accept a definition in the vicinity of Locke’s characterization of a person as a “thinking, intelligent being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places” (1689, II.xxvii.9), then those criteria of personal identity that sanction the identity of a person at one time with a non-person at another time are categorically ruled out. Fetuses, infants, or human beings in a persistent vegetative state, for example, plainly do not fulfill the criteria envisaged by Locke. As a result, since these beings do not possess cognitive capacities, if they do at all, that qualitatively attain those of thinking beings, couching the persistence question in terms of persons entails that none of us has ever been a fetus or infant or ever will be a human vegetable (Olson 1997a; Mackie 1999). To be sure, these initially baffling claims could be true. However, since these are clearly substantial questions about our persistence, we should not consider ourselves justified to settle the matter by definition. Consequently, we should prefer vagueness over chauvinism and pose the persistence question in terms of the wider notion of human being, postponing the question of whether and in what sense the notions of person and human being ought to be distinguished: for any person X and any human being Y at different times t1 and t2, if X at t1 is numerically identical with Y at t2, what makes this claim necessarily true?

2. Theories of Personal Identity

In order to discover what your pre-philosophical attitude towards this question is, ask yourself the following: what does a supernatural being have to do in order to resurrect you after you die? Collect a few possible answers and ask yourself whether the resulting being, the freshly created being that is now a candidate for being identical with you before you died, is in fact you. For example, do you believe that

  1. …the supernatural being could have given you a body which bears no physical continuity or causal relation to the one you possessed before your death, or that it could have resurrected you, in some sense or other, as a bodiless being?
  2. …it could have given a new form or content to your psychology, that is, that it is not necessary or sufficient for the “resurrected you” to remember your actions or experiences and that there do not have to be any causal connections between the actions and experiences of you before you died and the”resurrected you”?
  3. …the question of whether or not the resulting person is you depends on the existence, in the resurrected person, of something that one might call “a soul”?

If you believe any of these options, then you must also believe, respectively, that

  1. …a physiological criterion of personal identity is false.
  2. …a psychological criterion of personal identity is false.
  3. …the Simple View of personal identity is true.

Let us discuss these theories of personal identity in more detail.

a. The Simple View

Some commentators believe that there are no informative, non-trivial persistence conditions for people, that is, that personal persistence is an ultimate and unanalyzable fact (cf. Chisholm 1976; Lowe 1996; Merricks 1998; Shoemaker & Swinburne 1984). While psychological and physiological continuities are evidential criteria, these do not constitute necessary and/or sufficient conditions for personal identity. We must distinguish between two versions of this view. One version is that personal identity is non-reductive and wholly non-informative, denying that personal identity follows from anything other than itself. This makes the label Identity Mysticism (“IM“) most appropriate (cf. Zimmerman 1998):

IM: X at t1 is identical to Y at t2 iff X at t1 is identical to Y at t2,

Identity Mysticism plays only an indirect role in contemporary personal identity theory. Although it may be poorly understood, due to limitations of space this article will disregard the view. IM is to be distinguished from a more popular version of the simple view, according to which personal identity relations are weakly reductive (WR) and in independence non-informative (INI):

WR-INI: X at t1 is identical to Y at t2 iff there is some fact F1 about X at t1, and some fact F2 about Y at t2, and F1 and F2 are irreducible to facts about the subjects’ psychology or physiology, and X at t1 is identical with Y at t2 in virtue of the fact that the propositions stating F1 and F2 differ only insofar as that “X” and “t1” occur in the former where “Y” and “t2” occur in the latter.

WR-INI is weakly reductive in the sense that, while the identity relation in question can be reduced to a further domain, the further domain itself typically exhibits elements of non-reducibility and/or resistance to full physical explanation. In their most prominent variants, these elements are due to references to souls, Cartesian Egos or other spiritual or immaterial substances and/or properties. Initially the idea underlying this claim may appear prejudicial; ultimately it is based on a number of widespread but not universally accepted beliefs about the naturalness of the world and the nature, validity and theoretical implications of physicalism. According to this general stance, either both psychological and physiological continuity relations are fully reducible to a domain in which physical explanations are couched, perhaps in terms of the basic elements of a final and unified theory of physics, or they belong themselves to such a domain.

WR-INI may entail IM but does not so necessarily: it is conceivable that personal identity relations consist in something which is itself neither identical with nor reducible to a spiritual substance nor identical with nor reducible to aggregates or parts of psychologies and physiologies. In fact, Descartes’ own view that personal identity is determined by “vital union” relations between pure Egos and bodies, with the persistence of the Ego being regarded as sufficient for the persistence of the person but the person not being wholly identifiable with the Ego, could be a weakly reductive view of persons. It is merely weakly reductive, however, because the identity of the phenomenon that specifies the necessary and sufficient conditions for personal identity does not itself follow from anything other than itself. While a weakly reductive criterion of personal identity relations is explicable in terms of the identities of phenomena other than persons, the identities of these phenomena themselves are not explicable in other terms: their identity may be, as we would suppose “soul identity” to be, “strict and philosophical”, and not merely “loose and popular” (Butler 1736).

Nowadays, the Simple View is disparaged as a theory only maintained by thinkers whose religious or spiritual commitments outweigh the reasons that speak against their views on personal identity. This is due to the fact that it is assumed that a theory of personal identity cannot be weakly reductive without involving appeal to discredited spiritual substances or committing itself either to the acknowledgment of yet unrecognized physical entities or to an Identity Mysticism on the level of persons. As a consequence, many philosophers think that the problems that infiltrate dualism and Cartesian theories of the soul, such as the alleged impossibilities to circumscribe the ontological status of souls and to explain how a soul can interact with a body, render the Simple View equally problematic. Although the options mentioned are exceedingly difficult to defend, why should they have to be regarded as the only options available to the Simple Theorist? Arguably, many respectable philosophical ideologies, such as conceptualism or Neo-Kantianism, may issue in theories of personal identity along Simple lines without appeal to Cartesian Egos. (Note, however, that these ideologies, with regards to the problem of the persistence of people, may also be, and in fact have been, construed along physiological or psychological lines). This suggests that we do not only need a better understanding, and above all more promising articulations, of the Simple View, but also a new taxonomy of theories of personal identity: the traditional division of theories into Simple, Psychological and Physical, even if maintained here by the author of this entry, may not be the best way of viewing the matter.

b. Reductionism (1): General Features

Modern day personal identity theory takes place mainly within reductionist assumptions, concentrating on the relative merits of different criteria of identity and related methodological questions. Reductionist theories of personal identity share the contention that…

Reduction: Facts about personal identity stand in an adequate reduction-relation to sets of sub-personal facts SF1 SFn about psychological and/or physiological continuities in such a way as to issue in biconditionals of the form “X at t1 is identical to Y at t2 iff X at t1 and Y at t2 stand in a continuity-relation fully describable by SFx.”

Thus, any given set of sub-personal facts will impose demands, in forms of necessary and sufficient conditions, upon the kinds of adventures a subject can survive in persisting from t1 to t2. The sets of necessary and sufficient conditions determined by these sets of sub-personal facts constitute the various criteria of personal identity. It must be noted that the biconditionals in question need not to be understood in such a way as that circularity is an objection to them: provided that concepts other than “person” feature in the analysans, these biconditionals, by exhibiting connections with collateral and independently intelligible concepts, may be genuinely elucidatory even if the concept to be analyzed features on both sides of the equation (cf. McDowell 1997; Wittgenstein 1922, 3.263).

Only when the concepts “person” and “personal identity” become the target of what may be referred to as an authentic reduction circularities become vicious. The need for the distinction between authentic and inauthentic reductions arises due to an equivocation that ought not to confuse the present discussion: reductionisms in personal identity theory often take forms, if regarded for example as sets of supervenience claims, that are deemed, in other areas of analytic philosophy, as distinctively non-reductionist. Let us speak of authentic reductions if the ontological status of members of the reduced category is, in a way to be made precise, diminished in favor of the allegedly “more fundamental” existence-status of members of the reducing category. The question of whether an authentic reductionism about persons must claim that it is not only able to give a criterion of personal identity without presupposing personal identity but also that facts about persons are describable without using the concept “person” is a matter of current controversy (cf. Behrendt 2003; Cassam 1989; 1992; Johnston 1997; McDowell 1997; Parfit 1984; 1999; forthcoming; cf. also 2.d.).

In a search for the necessary and sufficient conditions for the sustenance of personal identity relations between subjects, which type of continuity-relations could SF describe? There are two main contenders, physiological continuity-relations and psychological continuity-relations, which will be discussed in turn.

c. Reductionism (2): Psychological Approaches

Psychological Criteria of personal identity hold that psychological continuity relations, that is, overlapping chains of direct psychological connections, as those causal and cognitive connections between beliefs, desires, intentions, experiential memories, character traits and so forth, constitute personal identity (cf. Locke 1689, II.xxvii.9-29; Parfit 1971a; 1984; Perry 1972; Shoemaker 1970; Shoemaker & Swinburne 1984).

Two apparently physiological theories of personal identity are at bottom psychological, namely (i) the Brain Criterion, which holds that the spatiotemporal continuity of a single functioning brain constitutes personal identity; and (ii) the Physical Criterion, which holds that, necessarily, the spatiotemporal continuity of that which sustains the continuous psychological life of a human being over time, which is, contingently, a sufficient part of the brain that must remain in order to be the brain of a living person, constitutes personal identity (cf. Nagel 1971). These approaches are at bottom psychological because they single out, as the constituting factors of personal identity, the psychological continuity of the subject. Consider a test case. Imagine there to be a tribe of beings who are in all respects like human beings, except for the fact that their brains and livers have swapped bodily functions: their brains regulate, synthesize, store, secrete, transform, and break down many different substances in the body, while their livers are responsible for their cognitive capacities, basic integrated postural and locomotor movement sequences, perception, instincts, emotions, thinking, and other integrative activities. Imagine the brain criterion to be true for human beings. Would we have sufficient reason to believe the brain criterion to be true for members of the tribe in question as well, if we were aware of all facts about their physiologies? No, precisely because the brain criterion is true for human beings, a liver criterion would have to be true for members of this tribe. There is nothing special about the 1.3 kilograms of grey mass that we carry around in our skulls, except for the fact that this mass is the seat of our cognitive capacities.

We can further distinguish between three versions of the psychological criterion: the Narrow version demands psychological continuity to be caused “normally,” the Wide version permits any reliable cause, and the Widest version allows any cause to be sufficient to secure psychological continuity (cf. Parfit 1984). The Narrow version, we may note, is logically equivalent to the Physical Criterion.

One might think that brain criterion and physical criterion, to varying degrees, combine the best of both worlds: both acknowledge the vital function psychological continuity plays in our identity judgments while at the same time admitting of the importance of physiological instantiation. In fact, however, the opposite is the case: the appeal to physiology introduces an unacceptable element of contingency into the answers to the persistence question envisaged by defenders of these criteria. A criterion of personal identity tells us what our persistence necessarily consists in, which means that it must be able to deliver a verdict in possible scenarios that is consistent with its verdicts in ordinary cases. One scenario that has been widely debated is the following:


At t1, X enters a teletransporter, which, before destroying X, creates an exact blueprint of X’s physical and psychological states. The information is sent to a replicator device on Mars, which at t2 creates a qualitatively identical duplicate, Y (cf. Parfit 1984). Our alleged intuition: since Y at t2 shares with X at t1 all memories, character traits, and other psychological characteristics, X and Y are identical. Alleged conclusion: should teletransportation be reliable, all proposed criteria but the Wide and Widest versions of the Psychological Criterion are false.

Should teletransportation be unreliable, all criteria of personal identity but the Widest version of the Psychological Criterion are false. Consequently, should appeal to such scenarios as Teletransportation be acceptable and should the intuition above be widely shared, the brain criterion and physical criterion are false.

d. Quasi-Psychology

Many people regard the idea that our persistence is intrinsically related to our psychology as obvious. The problem of cashing out this conviction in theoretical terms, however, is notoriously difficult. Psychological continuity relations are to be understood in terms of overlapping chains of direct psychological connections, that is, those causal and cognitive connections between beliefs, desires, intentions, experiential memories, character traits and so forth. This statement avoids two obvious problems.

First, some attempts to cash out personal identity relations in psychological terms appeal exclusively to direct psychological connections. These accounts face the problem that identity is a transitive relation (see 1.a.) while many psychological connections are not. Take memory as an example: suppose that Paul broke the neighbor’s window as a kid, an incident he remembers vividly when he starts working as a primary school teacher in his late 20s. As an old man, Paul remembers his early years as a teacher, but has forgotten ever having broken the neighbor’s window. Assume, for reductio, that personal identity consists in direct memory connections. In that case the kid is identical with the primary school teacher and the primary school teacher is identical with the old man; the old man, however, is not identical with the kid. Since this conclusion violates the transitivity of identity (which states that if an X is identical with a Y, and the Y is identical with a Z, then the X must be identical with the Z), personal identity relations cannot consist in direct memory connections. Appeal to overlapping layers or chains of psychological connections avoids the problem by permitting indirect relations: according to this view, the old man is identical with the kid precisely because they are related to each other by those causal and cognitive relations that connect kid and teacher and teacher and old man.

Second, memory alone is not necessary for personal identity, as lack of memory through periods of sleep or coma do not obliterate one’s survival of these states. Appeal to causal and cognitive connections which relate not only memory but other psychological aspects is sufficient to eradicate the problem. Let us say that we are dealing with psychological connectedness if the relations in question are direct causal or cognitive relations, and that we are dealing with psychological continuity if overlapping layers of psychological connections are appealed to (cf. Parfit 1984).

One of the main problems a psychological approach faces is overcoming an alleged circularity associated with explicating personal identity relations in terms of psychological notions. Consider memory as an example. It seems that if John remembers having repaired the bike, then it is necessarily the case that John repaired the bike: saying that a person remembers having carried out an action which the person did not in fact carry out may be regarded as a misapplication of the verb “to remember.” To be sure, one can remember that an action was carried out by somebody else; it seems to be a matter of necessity, however, that one can only have first-person memories of experiences one had or actions one carried out. Consequently, the objection goes, if memory and other psychological predicates are not impartial with regards to identity judgments, a theory that involves these predicates and that at the same time proposes to explicate such identity judgments is straightforwardly circular: it plainly assumes what it intends to prove.

To make things clearer, consider the case of Teletransportation above: if at t2 Y on Mars remembers having had at t1 X’s experience on earth that the coffee is too hot, then, necessarily, X at t1 is identical with Y at t2. The dialectic of such thought experiments, however, requires that a description of the scenario is possible that does not presuppose the identity of the participants in question. We would wish to say that since X and Y share all psychological features, it is reasonable or intuitive to judge that X and Y are identical, and precisely not that since we describe the case as one in which there is a continuity between X’s and Y’s psychologies, X and Y are necessarily identical. If some psychological predicates presuppose personal identity in this way, an account of personal identity which constitutively appeals to such predicates is viciously circular.

In response, defenders of the psychological approach have created psychological concepts that share with our ordinary psychological predicates all features except presumptions of personal identity: for example, the concept of “quasi-memory” is exactly like ordinary memory apart from the fact that “memory” is judgmental with regards to personal identity whereas “quasi-memory” is not (cf. Shoemaker 1970). While many commentators regard the appeal to quasi-memory, and ultimately “quasi-psychology,” as sufficient to solve the circularity problem, some commentators think that personal concepts infiltrate extensionally articulated psychological concept-systems so deeply that any reductionist programme in personal identity is doomed from the start (cf. Evans 1982; McDowell 1997).

e. Reductionism (3): Physiological Approaches

Opponents of the psychological criterion typically favour a physiological approach. There are at least two of them: (i) the Bodily Criterion holds that the spatiotemporal continuity of a functioning human body constitutes personal identity (cf. Williams 1956-7; 1970; Thompson 1997); and (ii) the Somatic Criterion holds that the spatiotemporal continuity of the metabolic and other life-sustaining organs of a functioning human animal constitutes personal identity (cf. Mackie 1999; Olson 1997a; 1997b; Snowdon 1991; 1995; 1996). It is not obvious that there is a straightforward relation between them, for everything depends on how the notions of “functioning human body” and “life-sustaining organs” are understood. If these notions are understood similarly, the views are (close to) equivalent; the other extreme, even if unlikely to be held, is that the notions are understood differently, to the effect that they are incompatible (if, for example, a functioning human body and its life-sustaining organs could come apart). Physiological approaches have consequences many of us feel uncomfortable with. Consider the following thought experiment:

Body Swap

X’s brain is transplanted into Y’s body. X’s body and Y’s brain are destroyed, the resulting person is Z. Our alleged intuition: since Z shares with X all memories, character traits, and other psychological characteristics, X is identical with Z. Alleged conclusion: the Bodily and the Somatic Criteria are false (cf. Locke 1689, II.xxvii.15; Shoemaker 1963).

Defenders of bodily criterion and somatic criterion typically bite the bullet and argue that it is not the case that X and Y have swapped bodies, but that Y falsely believes to be X, and therefore that Z is identical with Y.

Since the psychological and physiological approaches are mutually exclusive and, we may suppose in the current context, as candidates for an adequate theory of personal identity jointly exhaustive, any objection against the psychological approach is equally an argument for the physiological approach. The initial implausibility of the physiological approach is due to thought experiments that traditionally permeate the personal identity debate and often favour psychological considerations. Defenders of the somatic approach, most notably Olson and Snowdon, have tried to shift the focus to real-life cases in which descriptions along physiological lines look much more promising. Consider:

Human Vegetable

X has at t1 a motor bicycle accident. The being Y that is transported to the hospital is at t2 in a persistent vegetative state. Our alleged intuition: X at t1 is identical with Y at t2. Alleged conclusion: all views which postulate psychological continuity as a necessary condition are false.


Since a fetus does not possess the cognitive capacities necessary to satisfy the demands of the Psychological Criterion, if the latter is true, no person can be identical with a past fetus. Our alleged intuition: Each of us is identical with a past fetus. Alleged conclusion: all views which postulate psychological continuity as a necessary condition are false.

A third problem for the psychological approach is that it implies, supposedly, that we are not human animals (Ayers 1990; Snowdon 1990; Olson 1997a; 2002a). The argument is simple:

Premise 1: Psychological continuity is neither necessary nor sufficient for the persistence of a human animal.

Premise 2: The psychological approach claims that psychological continuity is necessary and/or sufficient for our persistence.

A: for reductio:The psychological approach is true.

B: from 2, A: Psychological continuity is necessary and/or sufficient for our persistence.

Premise 3: Psychological continuity cannot at the same time be (i) necessary and/or sufficient for a thing’s persistence and (ii) neither necessary nor sufficient for the same thing’s persistence.

C: from 1, B, 3: None of us is identical with a human animal.

Premise 2 is implied by the psychological approach. The thought experiments that support premise 1 have already been given: since the human animal each of us is has been a fetus and could end up as a human vegetable, the thought experiments Fetus and Human Vegetable above demonstrate that psychological continuity is not necessary for human animal identity. A variant of Body Swap shows that psychological continuity is not sufficient for human animal identity. Suppose X’s brain to be transplanted into Y’s skull and X’s body and Y’s brain are destroyed. Suppose further that the resulting being Z is psychologically continuous with X. In this case, it does not seem to be the case that the surgeons transplant the human animal X from one head to another. Rather, it seems, the human animal Y receives a new organ, namely a brain. Consequently, psychological continuity is not sufficient for human animal identity and premise 1 holds. Premise 3 seems to be obvious, because its being false would entail that one and the same being can outlive itself, which is absurd. The defender of the physiological approach now argues that

Premise 4: We are human animals.

C: from B, 4: The psychological approach is false.

Premise 5: Physiological and psychological answers to the persistence question are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive.

Conclusion: The physiological approach is true.

It may be argued that premise 4 is not a matter of metaphysics but of biological classification. The underlying problem, however, is that it seems undeniable that there is a human animal located where each of us is. If this human animal has persistence conditions different from those that determine our persistence, then there must be two things wherever each of us is located. This conclusion raises important questions and problems a psychological approach must address.

3. The Paradox of Personal Identity

One of the most influential thought experiments in recent personal identity theory is the case of fission.

a. Fission


X’s brain is removed from X’s body and X’s body is destroyed. X’s brain’s corpus callosum, the bundle of fibres responsible for retaining the capacity of information-transfer between the two brain hemispheres, is severed, leaving two (potentially) equipollent brain hemispheres. The single lower brain is divided and each hemisphere is transplanted into one of two qualitatively identical bodies of the fission outcomes Y1 and Y2. Our alleged intuition: since both Y1 and Y2 share with X all psychological characteristics, both are candidates for being identical with X: either, in the absence of the other, would have been identical with X. Alleged conclusion: either, on pain of violating the transitivity of identity, the Psychological Criterion is false or the question of whether two person-stages X at t1 and Y1 at t2 are temporal parts of the same person depends on facts concerning not only X and Y1 but also, in this case, Y2. In the latter case, a “closest continuer” clause and/or a “no-branching” proviso must complement a psychological continuity analysis (For a development of this case, see Nozick 1981; Parfit 1984; and Wiggins 1967).

Fission scenarios emphasise the difficulty of deciding whether a thought experiment is acceptable or not. They assume the possibility of commissurotomy or brain bisection, that is, the perforation of the corpus callosum, and hemispherectomy, that is, the surgical removal of the cerebral cortex of one brain hemisphere. Commissurotomy was used in epilepsy treatment in the 50’s (cf. Nagel 1971) and hemispherectomies too have been performed in the past. However, fission cases additionally assume the possibility, in some sense or other, of dividing the subcortical regions, and in particular the single lower brain. This is not physically possible without damaging the upper brain functions (cf. Parfit 1984). Many commentators regard fission to be an acceptable challenge to theories of personal identity. Wilkes disagrees: she thinks that our ignorance about what actually happens in these cases jeopardises the theoretical relevance of fission scenarios (cf. 1988). The question of whether or not physically impossible but logically possible scenarios are acceptable remains to be answered.

Should fission be an acceptable scenario, it presents problems for the the psychological approach in particular. The fission outcomes Y1 and Y2 are both psychologically continuous with X. According to the psychological approach, therefore, they are both identical with X. By congruence, however, they are not identical with each other: Y1 and Y2 share many properties, but even at the very time the fission operation is completed differ with regards to others, such as spatio-temporal location. Consequently, fission cases seem to show that the psychological approach entails that a thing could be identical with two non-identical things, which of course violates the transitivity of identity. Some commentators have attempted to save the psychological approach by appeal to the so-called “multiple occupancy view,” that is, the claim that, despite appearances, X was two people, namely Y1 and Y2, all along (cf. Lewis 1976; Noonan 1989; Perry 1972). Combined with a four-dimensionalist or temporal part ontology, this view is not as absurd as it initially seems, but it is certainly controversial.

Others have acknowledged, as a consequence of fission scenarios, that psychological continuity is not sufficient for personal identity. These commentators typically complement their psychological theory with a non-branching proviso and/or a closest continuer clause. The former states that even though X would survive as Y1 or Y2 if the other did not exist, given that the other does exist, X ceases to exist. This proviso avoids the problem of violating the transitivity of identity. It is hard to believe, however, because it entails that I can kill you without you ever noticing: if I knock you unconscious, transplant one of your brain hemispheres into a different body, and drop you off at home before you wake up, then, if the transplant is successful and the psychological approach with non-branching proviso is true, you are dead. We could avoid this problem by adding a closest-continuer or best candidate clause, stating roughly that the best candidate for survival in a fission scenario, that is, the fission outcome which bears the most or the most important resemblances to the original person X, is identical with X. One of the problems with this suggestion is that it assumes that personal identity is an extrinsic relation. It thereby violates another important principle, namely the so-called “only X and Y rule,” which states, roughly, that if two person-stages at different times are stages of one and the same person, that will be true only in virtue of the intrinsic relation between these two stages (cf. Noonan 1989; Wiggins 2001). While this principle is not necessarily sacrosanct, it is desirable to avoid violating it.

b. The Paradox

The upshot of the preceding discussion is that we find ourselves in a perplexing situation. Let the underlying assumption be that there is a criterion of personal identity. The starting point of the debate has been that

Premise 1: A criterion of personal identity captures all those aspects of our existence that are necessary and sufficient for our persistence.

Premise 2: Our persistence is determinate.

A: from 1, 2: A criterion of personal identity determines for every possible past event e0 and future event e2, within the boundaries of an adequate delineation of the modality in question, whether a person X at t1 is identical with the being that has participated in e0 and the being that will participated in e2.

Premise 3: Personal identity relations are factual: criteria of personal identity are determined neither by conventions, norms, or other social or personal preferences, however basic, nor by analytic matters about the meaning of concepts. Their truth is, literally, a matter of life and death.

B: from A, 3: There is a factual relation R between a person X at t1 and a being Y at t0/t2 which, for every possible scenario, determines whether X at t1 is identical with Y at t0/t2.

Now, if we agree with the tentative conclusion that there is, at present, no satisfactory simple view of personal identity, then we assent to the claims that

Premise 4: IM and WRINI are, with respect to a specification of the necessary and sufficient conditions for personal identity, inadequate.

Premise 5: The distinction between IM and WRINI on the one hand and the reductionist views sketched in I.A.4 on the other is exclusive.

C: from 4, 5: The only feasible candidates for R are relations of physiological and/or psychological continuity.

Since B demands that R holds for every possible scenario, within the limits of an adequate delineation of the modality in question, a criterion of personal identity must deliver compatible judgments on the thought experiments sketched above. However, since these thought experiments deliver conflicting intuitions about which criterion is true, it cannot be the case that more than one such criterion is true. From this it follows that

Premise 6: Physiological and psychological criteria of personal identity are incompatible, that is, R cannot be a conjunction of physiological and psychological relations as well as issuing in determinate and compatible solutions to each thought experiment.

Now, if we are also prepared to accept the

Big Assumption: A criterion of identity must accept all alleged conclusions of the thought experiments sketched in I.A.5

then we must conclude that

D: from B, 6A: Neither physiological nor psychological continuity is both necessary and sufficient for personal identity.

The problem with D is that, in conjunction with premises 2, 4, and 5, it reduces the underlying assumption that there can be an informative criterion of personal identity ad absurdum. This argument may be referred to as the Paradox of Personal Identity.

One should refrain from drawing precipitate conclusions from its defining characteristic as a paradox, that is, the fact that denying any of its premises leads to a conclusion that either violates our intuitions or, in the case of 4, 5, and C, commits one to a philosophically disreputable stance. Rather, the Paradox should be regarded as the starting point of any discussion of personal identity, in the sense that taking a stand on its individual premises bestows the various criteria of personal identity with their distinctive features. However, given that the paradox obliges us, in one way or other, to revise our pre-philosophical beliefs, a theory of personal identity should aim at meeting what will be referred to as the Adequacy Constraint AC on theories of personal identity, which demands that

AC: We ought to sanction a substantial revision of our pre-philosophical views of our metaphysical nature only on the conditions that (i) we receive an explanation of the unreliability of our intuiting faculties that in this domain outweighs our grounds for, and in other domains is compatible with, believing in their reliability; (ii) we receive an approximate demarcation of the extents to which we have to abandon our pre-philosophical beliefs and to which we can and we cannot have knowledge about ourselves.

How is the Paradox to be resolved? A, B, C, and D are deductions, and premise 1 is plausible on independent grounds. If identity is determinate, then premise 1 is true. Consequently, those arguments that deny the possibility of vague objects and indeterminate identity, in addition to our intuition that our own identity must be determinate, work in favor of 1. Note that, should personal identity be indeterminate, we might still be able to give a criterion of personal identity, even though such a criterion would then fall short of giving full necessary and sufficient conditions, since in some imaginary case it does not apply.

The denial of premise 3 seems to entail that we have, in a deep sense, an influence on whether we survive a given adventure, namely by possessing a particular normative, experiential, or attitudinal background. This contention may contradict our intuitions more than any thought experiment could. Since we assumed premises 4 and 5, only premises 2 and 6 and the Big Assumption remain. Could one deny premise 6? Given that the determinacy and factuality premises are accepted, It is hard to believe that we could: if a hybrid view were determinately true, a human being could die twice, once when her psychological and once when her physiological capacities cease to function. As a result, most commentators accept 6 but choose to accept a particular criterion in the vicinity of either side of the psychology-physiology divide. This implies that the Big Assumption must either not entail D or be rejected, which can be argued, always assuming that AC is being met, in three ways:

(a) One could define “adequacy of modality” in such a way as to exclude precisely those thought experiments which are problematic for a given criterion. There are two problems with this proposal: first, it is difficult to see how such a definition of adequacy of modality could not be ad hoc. And secondly, the suggestion is insufficient, for some thought experiments circumscribing physically possible scenarios, such as Human Vegetable, trigger incompatible intuitions as well. While some commentators think that Y is identical with X despite X’s loss of cognitive capacities, others regard Y as a living grave stone, nurtured merely for sentimental reasons, in commemoration of the deceased X.

(b) One could deny premise 2 instead, arguing that if personal identity is indeterminate, then our preferred criterion of personal identity does not have to deliver verdicts in all thought-experimental scenarios. This move has the further benefit that we do not have to quarrel with the alleged conclusion of another thought experiment, the combined spectrum:

Combined Spectrum

A spectrum of possible cases is imagined: at the near end, the normal case, X at t1 is fully psychologically and physiologically continuous with Y at t2, while at the far end X at t1 is neither psychologically nor physiologically continuous with Y at t2. In the intermediate cases, X at t1 is approximately halfway psychologically and physiologically continuous with Y at t2. Our alleged intuition: towards the near end of the spectrum X at t1 is identical with Y at t2 and towards the far end of the spectrum X at t1 is not identical with Y at t2. There could not even in principle be evidence for the existence of a sharp borderline between the cases in which X at t1is and the cases in which X at t1is not identical with Y at t2. Hence, it is implausible to believe that such a borderline exists. Alleged conclusion: personal identity is indeterminate.

Epistemicists like Timothy Williamson (cf. 1994) deny that we should render it implausible that there is such a sharp borderline merely because we are necessarily ignorant of its existence. Vagueness, according to epistemicism, consists precisely in our necessary ignorance of such sharp boundaries. The other problem is that even if personal identity is indeterminate, the claim cannot by itself establish one criterion over others: in order to do so, it would have to exclude those thought experiments that challenge opposing criteria while leaving untouched those that supposedly establish the preferred criterion. It is doubtful, however, that the indeterminacy of personal identity can be exploited selectively, for physiological and psychological continuity relations are equally indeterminate in a particular range of cases (cf. Parfit 1984). Furthermore, in those cases in which they are not, for example Body Swap, Human Vegetable, and Fetus, appeal to indeterminacy does little to remove the contradictory intuitions that these cases trigger. Consequently, unless one holds that personal identity is categorically indeterminate whenever the physiological and psychological features of a human being come apart, appeal to indeterminacy cannot establish the rejection of the Big Assumption in such a way as to avoid the Paradox’s conclusion.

(c) The most common strategy is to bite the bullet and some or other allegedly absurd conclusion of the thought experiments. The defender of the Psychological Criterion must hold that we are not identical with a past fetus or infant, and that we will not have survived if fallen into a persistent vegetative state. Defenders of a Physiological Criterion, on the other hand, must commit to the consequence that if X’s head is grafted onto Y’s body, then the resulting person is Y and not X, even though this person shares all psychological features with X before the operation.

The problem with this strategy is that, if accepted, we seem to be unable to decide on a criterion of personal identity on the basis of intuitions at all, on pain of unjustifiably favoring one’s own over other people’s intuitions. On the assumption that we are unable to hierarchically structure these conflicting intuitions, we have a classical stand-off: there are two sides to the coin of personal identity and appeal to intuition plainly underdetermines preferring one side over the other. The problem is that human beings are organic material objects, the persistence of which is determined by these objects’ following a continuous trajectory between space-time points. The further question of whether or not human beings are essentially organic material objects depends on the question of whether psychological properties render human beings to be sufficiently dissimilar from such objects so as to “deserve” their own identity criterion. The fear underlying the Paradox of Personal Identity, then, is that there may be no metaphysical fact to the matter as to whether the antecedently specifiable differences between human beings and other organic or inorganic material objects count as sufficient in order for us to have persistence conditions different from these objects. It does not seem as if any possible thought experiment, irrespectively of how unequivocal our intuitions about it, could redeem this fear. Personal identity theorists, therefore, ought to offer a more comprehensive account of the ontological status of persons and their relation to the constituents that make them up.

4. Parfit and the Unimportance of Personal Identity

Derek Parfit proposes a theory of the ontological status of persons, which promises to answer the problem of fission and the paradox of personal identity. While this article cannot do justice to the complexities of Parfit’s theory, which has been the focal point of debate since 1970, it is worth mentioning its main features.

Although Parfit affirms the existence of persons, their special ontological status as non-separately-existing substances can be expressed by the claim that persons do not have to be listed separately on an inventory of what exists. In particular, persons themselves are distinct from their bodies and psychologies, but the existence of a person consists in nothing over and above the existence of a brain and body and the occurrence of an interrelated series of mental and physical events. These are the foundational claims of Parfit’s constitutive reductionism. Consider an analogy: Cellini’s Venus is made of bronze. Although the lump of bronze and the statue itself surely exist, these objects have different persistence conditions: if melted down, Venus ceases to exist while the lump of bronze does not. Therefore, they are not identical; rather, so the suggestion, the lump of bronze constitutes the statue. The same is true of persons, who are constituted by, but not identical with, a physiology, a psychology, and the occurrence of an interrelated series of causal and cognitive relations.

Now, how does this relate to the fission case? We must first note that Parfit believes (i) that our persistence consists in physical and/or psychological continuity; (ii) that personal identity is indeterminate in some cases, that is, that sometimes there is no right-or-wrong answer to the question of whether somebody has ceased to exist in the course of a certain adventure (see 3.b.); (iii) that what prudentially matters in survival is psychological continuity; (iv) that personal identity relations must respect the remaining formal properties of identity. This means that in the fission case Y1 and Y2 cannot be identical with X because the transitivity of identity is violated: therefore, X dies in the fission case. It further means, however, that X has two Parfitian survivors, Y1 and Y2, which is, according to Parfit, as good (or even better) than being identical with Y1 and/or Y2. This is the upshot of Parfit’s claim that what prudentially matters is psychological continuity: for all we should care, from a purely rational point of view, it is good enough for us to be psychologically continuous with one or more future persons and consequently it would be irrational for us to prefer our own continued existence to death by fission. Generally, according to Parfit, psychological continuity with any reliable cause matters in survival, and since personal identity does not consist merely in psychological continuity with any reliable cause, personal identity is not what matters in survival.

5. References and Further Reading


  • Bermúdez, Jos‚ Luis; Marcel, Anthony & Eilan, Naomi eds. (1995), The Body and the Self (Cambridge, MA & London: The MIT Press)
  • Blakemore, Colin & Greenfield, Susan eds. (1987), Mindwaves (Oxford: Blackwell)
  • Charles, David & Lennon, Kathleen eds. (1992), Reduction, Explanation, and Realism (Oxford: Clarendon)
  • Cockburn, David ed. (1991), Human Beings, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, Vol. 29 (Cambridge University Press)
  • Dancy, Jonathan ed. (1997), Reading Parfit (Oxford: Blackwell)
  • Davies, Martin & Stone, Tony eds. (1995), Folk Psychology: The Theory of Mind Debate (Oxford: Blackwell)
  • Harris, Henry ed. (1995), Identity (Oxford: Clarendon)
  • Lovibond, Sabina & Williams, Stephen G. eds. (1996), Essays for David Wiggins: Identity, Truth, and Value (Oxford: Blackwell)
  • Macdonald, Graham F. ed. (1979), Perception and Identity: Essays Presented to A. J. Ayer, with His Replies (Ithaca, New York: Cornell University Press)
  • Martin, Raymond & Barresi, John eds. (2003), Personal Identity (Oxford: Blackwell)
  • Perry, John ed. (1975), Personal Identity (Berkeley & Los Angeles, CA: University of California Press)
  • Rorty, Amelie O. ed. (1976), The Identities of Persons (Berkeley & Los Angeles, CA: University of California Press)


  • Ayers, Michael (1991), Locke: Epistemology and Ontology, 2 vols. (London & New York: Routledge)
  • Baker, Lynne Rudder (1997), “Why Constitution Is Not Identity,” The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 94, No. 12, 599-621
  • Baillie, James (1993), “Recent Work on Personal Identity,” Philosophical Books, Vol. 34, No. 4, 193-206
  • Behrendt, Kathy (2003), “The New Neo-Kantian and Reductionist Debate,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly Vol. 84, No. 4, 331-50
  • Blackburn, Simon W. (1984), “Has Kant Refuted Parfit?,” in Dancy ed. (1997), pp. 180-201
  • Butler, Joseph (1736), “Of Personal Identity,” First Dissertation to The Analogy of Religion (reprinted in Perry ed. (1975), pp. 99-105)
  • Campbell, John (1992), “The First Person: The Reductionist View of the Self,” in Charles & Lennon eds. (1992), pp. 381-419
  • Cassam, Quassim (1989), “Kant and Reductionism,” Review of Metaphysics, Vol. 43, No. 1, 72-106
  • Cassam, Quassim (1992), “Reductionism and First-Person Thinking,” in Charles & Lennon eds. (1992), pp. 361-80
  • Cassam, Quassim (1993), “Parfit on Persons,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Vol. 93, 17-37
  • Cassam, Quassim (1997), Self and World (Oxford University Press)
  • Chisholm, Roderick M. (1976), Person and Object (Chicago & La Salle, IL: Open Court)
  • Crane, Tim (2001), Elements of Mind (Oxford University Press)
  • Doepke, Frederick C. (1996), The Kinds of Things: A Theory of Personal Identity Based on Transcendental Argument (Chicago & La Salle, IL: Open Court)
  • Evans, Gareth M. (1982), The Varieties of Reference, ed. John McDowell (New York: Oxford University Press)
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  • Garrett, Brian (1998), Personal Identity and Self-Consciousness (London: Routledge)
  • Geach, Peter (1967), “Identity,” Review of Metaphysics, Vol. 21, No.1 (reprinted in his (1972), Logic Matters (Oxford: Blackwell), pp. 238-47)
  • Gordon, Robert M. (1995), “Folk Psychology as Simulation,” in Davies & Stone eds. (1995), pp. 59-73
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  • Hirsch, Eli (1991), “Divided Minds,” The Philosophical Review, Vol. 100, No. 1, 3-30
  • Hume, David (1739), A Treatise on Human Nature, ed. Norton, David F. & Norton, Mary J. (Oxford University Press)
  • Johnston, Mark (1992), “Constitution Is Not Identity,” Mind, Vol. 101, No. 401, 89-105
  • Johnston, Mark (1997), “Human Concerns Without Superlative Selves,” in Dancy ed. (1997), pp. 149-79
  • Locke, John (1689), An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. Woolhouse, Roger (London: Penguin, 1997)
  • Lowe, E. Jonathan (1991), “Real Selves: Persons as Substantial Kinds,” in Cockburn ed. (1991), pp. 87-108
  • Lowe, E. Jonathan (1996), Subjects of Experience (Cambridge University Press)
  • Martin, Raymond (1998), Self-Concern: An Experiential Approach to What Matters in Survival (Cambridge University Press)
  • McDowell, John (1997), “Reductionism and the First Person,” in Dancy ed. (1997), pp. 230-50
  • Merricks, Trenton (1998), “There Are No Criteria of Identity Over Time,” No–s, Vol. 32, No.1, 106-124
  • Moore, Adrian W. (1997), Points of View (Oxford: Clarendon)
  • Nagel, Thomas (1971), “Brain Bisection and the Unity of Consciousness,” Synthese, Vol. 22, 396-413
  • Nagel, Thomas (1986), The View From Nowhere (Oxford: Clarendon)
  • Noonan, Harold W. (1989), Personal Identity (London: Routledge)
  • Noonan, Harold (1993), “Constitution Is Identity,” Mind, Vol. 102, No. 405, 133-46
  • Nozick, Robert (1981), Philosophical Explanations (Oxford: Clarendon)
  • Olson, Eric T. (1997a), The Human Animal: Personal Identity Without Psychology (Oxford University Press)
  • Olson, Eric T. (1997b), “Relativism and Persistence,” Philosophical Studies, Vol. 88, No. 2, 141-62
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1971a), “Personal Identity,” The Philosophical Review, Vol. 80, No. 1, 3-27
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1971b), On “The Importance of Self-Identity”,” The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 68, No. 20, 683-90
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1976), “Lewis, Perry, and What Matters,” in Rorty ed. (1976), pp. 91-107
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1982), “Personal Identity and Rationality,” Synthese, Vol. 53, 227-41
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1984), Reasons and Persons (Oxford University Press; revised reprint, Oxford: Clarendon, 1987)
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1986), “Comments,” Ethics, Vol. 96, No. 4, 832-872
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1987), “Divided Minds and the Nature of Persons,” in Blakemore & Greenfield eds. (1987), pp. 19-26
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1995), “The Unimportance of Identity,” in Harris ed. (1995), pp. 13-45 (reprinted in Martin & Barresi eds. (2003), pp. 292-318)
  • Parfit, Derek A. (1999), “Experiences, Subjects, and Conceptual Schemes,” Philosophical Topics, Vol. 26, Nos. 1-2, 217-70
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  • Shoemaker, Sydney (1999), “Self, Body, and Coincidence,” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 73, 287-306
  • Shoemaker, Sidney & Swinburne, Richard (1984), Personal Identity (Oxford: Blackwell)
  • Snowdon, Paul F. (1991), “Personal Identity and Brain Transplants,” in Cockburn ed. (1991), pp. 109-26
  • Snowdon, Paul F (1995), “Persons, Animals, and Bodies,” in Bermúdez, Marcel & Eilan eds. (1995), pp. 71-86
  • Snowdon, Paul F (1996), “Persons and Personal Identity,” in Lovibond & Williams (1996), pp. 33-48
  • Strawson, Peter F. (1959), Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysic (London & New York: Methuen)
  • Strawson, Galen (1999), “Self, Body, and Experience,” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 73, 307-32
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  • Thompson, Judith J. (1997), “People and Their Bodies,” in Dancy ed. (1997), pp. 202-29
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  • Wiggins, David R. P. (2001), Sameness and Substance Renewed (Oxford University Press)
  • Wilkes, Kathleen V. (1988), Real People: Personal Identity Without Thought Experiments (Oxford: Clarendon)
  • Williams, Bernard A. O. (1956-7), “Personal Identity and Individuation,” Proceedings to the Aristotelian Society, Vol. 57, 229-52 (my references are to reprint in Williams (1973), pp. 1-18)
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  • Williams, Bernard A. O. (1973), Problems of the Self: Philosophical Papers 1956-1972 (Cambridge University Press)
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  • Williamson, Timothy (1994), Vagueness (London & New York: Routledge)
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Author Information

Carsten Korfmacher
Email: C.Korfmacher.99 (at) cantab.net
Linacre College, Oxford University
United Kingdom

Supervenience and Determination

The term “supervenience” gained prominence in the twentieth century when it was suggested that moral properties supervene on natural properties and that our mental characteristics supervene on our physical characteristics such as the properties of our nervous system. The term can be defined as follows. For two sets of properties, A (the supervenient set) and B (the subvenient set or supervenience base), A supervenes on B just in case there can be no difference in A without a difference in B. Turning this principle on its head gives us the converse concept of determination: B determines A just in case sameness with respect to B implies sameness with respect to A. Supervenience and determination are simply two sides of the same coin.

From the basic definition initially presented, supervenience might seem a fairly innocuous principle, yet it has led a somewhat murky and controversial existence: some love it; some hate it. It was, for example, described by John Post as an “accordion word: indefinitely stretchable” (1984, p. 163). It has certainly been pulled about throughout its history, but it does have its limits. Indeed, others view it as too limited to be of any philosophical worth whatsoever. This article charts the history of the concept of supervenience, discusses the current panoply of definitions, and reviews some of the more tractable portions of the contemporary debate. The primary aim is to gain a feel for the basic concept without getting bogged down with the more formal and abstruse aspects of supervenience. The aim of this first section is to get to grips with the core idea of supervenience, and see some of the contexts in which it has been and might be used.

Table of Contents

  1. Getting to Grips with Supervenience
  2. The Recent History of Supervenience
  3. The Unlovely Proliferation of Formulations
  4. Supervenience and Causation
  5. Reduction, Emergence, and Multiple Realization
  6. Adding Mystery to Mystery?
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Getting to Grips with Supervenience

As David Lewis puts it, “We have supervenience when there could be no difference of one sort without differences of another sort” (1986, p. 14). For example: no difference in an individual’s mental characteristics without some difference in physical characteristics; no difference in a computer’s program without a difference in the computer’s circuitry; no difference in the economy without some difference in the behavior of its underlying economic agents; no difference in the temperature of a gas without some difference in the behavior of the molecules forming it, and so on. But notice that there can be differences in the neurons, circuitry, agents, and molecules without a difference in mental, computational, economic, and thermal properties.

The idea in each of the above cases is that some property A (or family of properties) is “determined” by some other properties B that do not themselves possess the property A, and that do not reduce to B (though this is a controversial point, as we shall see): individual neurons don’t possess mental characteristics; circuits don’t possess computational properties; individual agents don’t possess economic properties; and individual molecules don’t have temperatures. The intent is to avoid the stronger relations (such as identity or definability) between the types of property, generally because it often isn’t clear how there could be such strong relations holding them together. Part of the reason for this, and one prime motivation for supervenience, is that mental, computational, economic, and thermodynamic characteristics are “multiply realizable:: the same properties might be realized by very different underlying physical configurations or stuff. However, it needs to be strong enough to support a kind of non-symmetric dependence between two levels of property, such that a “lower” level determines a “higher” level. This feature may give rise to the notion of “levels of dependence” and, in certain cases, “hierarchical organization”: the mental is at a higher “level,” is higher up the hierarchy, from the physical; the economy is at a higher level than the economic agents, and so on.

This hierarchy of levels charts out a progression of ontological dependence too: without the physical stuff of neurons, circuits, people, and molecules (or something like them), the higher level states would not exist at all. This feature thus makes supervenience a useful tool in analyzing relations between the subject matter of distinct theoretical disciplines, such as the relation between physics and biology. It is, more generally useful in analyzing relations between things that are connected (correlated) in a way that doesn’t suggest reduction or identity. However, note that levels are not a generic feature of supervenience. Consider the case of the relationship between the length of the sides of a square and the area of the square. There is, in both directions, no difference in one without a difference in the other, and once the sides (respectively, area) are fixed the area (respectively, length) is fixed. So we have a clear case of supervenience. But this is a symmetric case, and so the notion of a level of dependence or hierarchy makes no sense; it only makes sense when the relation is asymmetric, and these make for the most philosophically interesting cases.

But, before we get bogged down with such details, what is the basic idea of supervenience? It is perhaps best understood by means of a colorful example. To this end, let us begin by adapting a simple story presented by Paul Teller (1983). Teller asks us to imagine a bunch of watches churned out of an assembly line in the same state, so that they are functionally and qualitatively (at least, in terms of their intrinsic properties) identical—clearly the watches will register the same time. The properties having to do with the physical makeup of the watches—their structure and composition, and so on—give us our B set of properties (the subvenient set). The supervenient A set has to do with the time-keeping properties of the watches—for example, whether they enable their owners to get into work on time, and so on. In this case, as Teller points out, the A properties of some particular watch will be the same as any other watch from the assembly line since they have the same physical makeup (B properties), and that is all that counts towards the A properties in this story. Being a good timekeeper supervenes on the physical makeup of the timekeeping device: one could not alter the time-keeping properties of the watches without altering their underlying structural and compositional properties. Moreover, any two devices that share their physical makeup will either both be good or both be bad timekeepers. That is to say, the physical make-up of a watch determines its time-keeping properties.

Though this captures much of the basic idea as encapsulated in our opening definition (which we can abbreviate to “no A-difference without a B-difference”), it misses one very crucial detail: modal impact. Supervenience is not intended to be a contingent “matter of actual fact” claim concerning two sets of properties that happen to be correlated at some particular time or place. Rather, it is intended to cover any situation involving A and B, covering any time, place, and world—though there will be natural restrictions concerning which worlds are to be included here (for example, logically possible [so that all logically coherent, non-contradictory worlds are considered], nomologically possible [so that all worlds permitted by the laws of physics are considered], and metaphysically possible [considering a class of worlds somewhere between the logically possible and the nomologically possible ones]). Different restrictions give different strengths. In our example, we should have to extend our story to include all possible watches that are indistinguishable in terms of their B-properties, including those inhabiting distinct worlds (from alien worlds and Twin-Earths, perhaps to worlds with different laws of physics). This additional modal aspect results in a profusion of distinct formulations that aim to adequately capture the fundamental notion of supervenience. Further proliferation results from the question of what are to be the objects that have the properties that enter into the supervenience/determination relation. Supervenience is, then, clearly far from innocuous!

2. The Recent History of Supervenience

Jaegwon Kim (1993, p. 131) notes that the term “supervenience” was in currency as far back as 1594. In its vernacular sense it means to “[come upon] a given event as something additional and extraneous (perhaps as something unexpected)” (ibid, p.132). However, the concept of Supervenience, as a philosophical term of art, is generally acknowledged to be traceable to G.E. Moore’s work on value theory, and from thence to R.M. Hare’s work on meta-ethics in which the term ‘supervenience’ was introduced into the philosophical literature. There it stifled for some time, before being unearthed by Davidson who applied it to the ‘mental-physical’ relationship. Let us review some central points from this historical development.

In “The Conception of Intrinsic Value” Moore writes that:

…if a given thing possesses any kind of intrinsic value in a certain degree, then not only must that same thing possess it, under all circumstances, in the same degree, but also anything exactly like it, must, under all circumstances, possess it in exactly the same degree. … it is not possible that of two exactly similar things one should possess it and the other not, or that one should possess it in one degree, and the other in a different one.

(Moore 1922, p. 261)

This sentiment is virtually parroted by Hare, this time specifically utilizing the term “supervenience” to describe the relation between certain natural (non-moral, physical) and moral properties, giving us ‘moral supervenience’:

…let us take that characteristic of “good” which has been called its supervenience. Suppose that we say ‘St. Francis was a good man.’ It is logically impossible to say this and to maintain at the same time that there might have been another man placed exactly in the same circumstances as St. Francis, and who behaved in exactly the same way, but who differed from St. Francis in this respect only, that he was not a good man.

(Hare 1952, p. 145)

Before we continue with the historical matters, let us briefly pause to consider what this means. Again, let’s give a simple example. Imagine we draw up a pair of catalogues of the properties of two people Saint Francis and Faint Srancis. The properties of Saint Francis are, say, kindness, bravery, niceness, neighborliness, and goodness. Faint Srancis’ properties differ from Saint Francis only in that the last property, goodness, is missing from his catalogue. Suppose, instead, that he has the property “badness” in its place. Now, according to the moral supervenience thesis espoused by Hare, this is simply not a genuinely possible state of affairs. All of the other properties, minus goodness, serve to fix or determine the property of goodness. It is just not possible that there be two such individuals differing in this way (whether they occupy the same world or not). Therefore, in possessing all of Saint Francis’ properties up to, but not including goodness, Faint Srancis must also thereby possess the property of goodness too. This is what is meant in saying that the property of goodness supervenes on a family of natural properties not including goodness. (Note that this matches Stalnaker’s, 1996, p. 87, preferred definition of supervenience: “To say that the A-properties or facts are supervenient on the B-properties or facts is to say that the A-facts are, in a sense, redundant, since they are already implicitly specified when one has specified all the B-facts.”) Let us now return to the historical path of the concept.

As Kim and others have pointed out, it seems that both some version of the concept and the term ‘supervenience’ were in operation before Moore’s and Hare’s usage in the context of the British Emergentist School. The emergentist’s understanding of supervenience, being more in line with the vernacular sense, does not match the current understanding as well as Moore’s and Hare’s. See McLaughlin 1992 for an excellent analysis. Indeed, supervenience, as a concept, most likely has much earlier roots than this, and one can readily find examples (or approximations, at least) littered throughout the history of philosophy. Leibniz’s theory of space and time might be one such example, with spatial and temporal properties supervenient on non-spatial and non-temporal events. Hume’s theory of causation might be another example, with cause and effect supervening on sequences of events that do not have causal properties. However, for the purposes of a cleaner exposition we will stick with the orthodox historical trajectory of supervenience. Not many philosophers initially picked up on Hare’s use of supervenience, but new life was breathed into it when Donald Davidson (1970) utilized it to provide some of the support for his anomalous monism. For example, in an oft-quoted passage he writes:

Although the position I describe denies there are psychophysical laws, it is consistent with the view that mental characteristics are in some sense dependent, or supervenient, on physical characteristics. Such supervenience might be taken to mean that there cannot be two events alike in all physical respects but differing in some mental respect, or that an object cannot alter in some mental respect without altering in some physical respect.

(Davidson 1970, p.214)

Davidson uses this supervenience relation to defend a non-reductive, but nonetheless non-dualist, position with regard to the way in which the mental stands to the physical (that is, psychophysical supervenience). Though the mental is certainly dependent upon the physical, in the sense that the physical determines the mental, it cannot be reduced to it since there are no psychophysical laws while there are, of course, physical laws:

[P]sychological characteristics cannot be reduced to the others, nevertheless they may be (and I think are) strongly dependent on them. Indeed, there is a sense in which the physical characteristics of an event (or object or state) determine the psychological characteristics…

(Davidson 1973, p. 716)

Once it entered the mainstream literature via Davidson, other philosophers (Jaegwon Kim in particular) began to focus on supervenience as an object of study in its own right—the 1984 Spindel conference saw the beginnings of much of this new direction (see Horgan (ed.), 1984—required reading for those wishing to gain a deeper appreciation of the foundations of supervenience). This trend shows no signs of letting up, though there is certainly some increased negativity about the concept’s usefulness and significance. A large part of the perceived problem with supervenience is that there is no unique, agreed-upon formulation of it. Instead there are many distinct formulations. However, this might not be such a bad thing; different jobs may require different tools. It is entirely possible that the fortunes of supervenience will reverse with the coming of age of the so-called “science of complexity,” for this involves direct consideration of the relationship between levels in hierarchies whereby a higher level is generated by the level below—it also involves many of the “special sciences.” Supervenience might thus provide the required conceptual framework to make sense of this feature of complex systems. It has, for example, been endorsed by Elliot Sober (1993) as the best way of understanding the biological concept of “fitness,” the idea being that fitness is something exhibited by very different species and individuals in relation to very different environments.

3. The Unlovely Proliferation of Formulations

We come now to the “embarrassment of riches” issue concerning the formulation of supervenience—the problem of there appearing to be too many possible formulations. David Lewis refers to this as an “unlovely proliferation” (1986, p.14). The proliferation arises simply in trying to pin down what is meant by supervenience in a precise way. The core idea that a formulation needs to capture is that fixing some one set of properties fixes some other property (or properties). The first distinction we meet is that between weak and strong supervenience. These can be stated simply enough in plain English as follows:

[Weak-SV]: For any possible world w, B-duplicates in w are A-duplicates in w.

[Strong-SV]: For any possible worlds w and w*, B-duplicates (x and y) in w and w* respectively are A-duplicates in w and w* respectively.

So, for example, according to Weak-SV, if we (perhaps here on our ‘plain vanilla’ Earth) managed to create a Star-Trek style replication machine and proceeded to replicate the physical makeup of a person P, generating a copy Prep, then P and Prep would share their mental characteristics too: “same worldly” physical duplicates are also mental duplicates. To understand Strong-SV we simply imagine that some Twin-Earthlings (in another possible world) got hold of an exact blueprint of P and are sufficiently advanced to be able to create a physical replica. Once again P and Prep are mental duplicates since they are physical duplicates. (By simply setting w = w*, and assuming the same types of worlds, we see that Strong-SV implies Weak-SV, but not vice versa.)

The difference between Weak and Strong supervenience, then, simply boils down to their respective modal strengths. One world is quantified over in the former, with objects compared within a world, while all worlds (subject to some restriction) are quantified over in the latter, with objects compared across worlds. For this reason Jackson (1998, p. 9) refers to these types as “intra-world” and “inter-world” supervenience respectively. Clearly the weak formulation cannot support basic counterfactuals of the form “if there were some B-duplicate of some object, then it would be an A-duplicate too.” Without this ability, Weak-SV is pretty much useless, for some dependency might be purely accidental. For example, it is perfectly consistent with Weak-SV that there be a world physically identical to ours yet with no conscious beings. (Though, of course, if one wants to describe such possibly accidental relations then Weak-SV might indeed be the right tool for the job.) Note also that Weak-SV does not tell us that a certain group of B-properties makes one morally good, or a piece beautiful, or a piece of matter alive. All Weak-SV tells us is that B-twins are A-twins; it does not tell us whether B-twins are one way or the other morally speaking, for example, just that whatever goes for on goes for the other. Hence, it fails to accomplish the task we set it: namely, to encode a notion of dependence and determination. Strong-SV gets around this problem of course, but it has its own problems. Suppose that there are two individuals, Fred and Ted, inhabiting worlds w and w* respectively. Let Fred and Ted be “almost” B-duplicates, differing only in one single trivial B-property, suppose one is wearing aftershave and the other is not. Then it follows from Strong-SV that Fred could be conscious but Ted not, all because he didn’t remember to put aftershave on!

There are alternative “modal operator” [MO] versions of the weak and strong formulations of supervenience. Again in “plain” English, these are:

[MO-Weak-SV]: Necessarily, if anything has property F in A, then there is some property G in B such that the thing has G, and whatever has G has F.

[MO-Strong-SV]: Necessarily, if anything has property F in A, then there is some property G in B such that the thing has G, and necessarily whatever has G has F.

The only difference between strong and weak here is that the strong formulation features an additional necessity operator. What these definitions amount to is this: Weak supervenience holds at any world (given restrictions on the class of worlds), and once that world is selected one compares B-duplicates, in that world, and sees whether they are A-duplicates, if weak supervenience is true then they will be. Strong supervenience holds at any world (again, given restrictions on the allowable worlds), and once a world is selected it follows that at any world accessible from that world, objects in the initially selected and the accessed world that are B-duplicates, will be A-duplicates—hence, one can compare cross-world cases. The modal operator versions capture something that the possible worlds formulations miss, namely that possession of a supervenient property demands that a subvenient one be had as well. So, in the possible worlds formulation, two things can be B-duplicates by not possessing any B-properties (that is, if they exactly zero B-properties)! Not so in the modal operator versions.

Another distinction concerns that between Weak-SV and Strong-SV, taken as a pair, and Global supervenience, which we can write as:

[Global-SV]: Possible worlds w and w* that are B-duplicates are also A-duplicates.

Thus, whereas Weak-SV and Strong-SV concern the properties of individual objects (within a world and potentially across worlds respectively), Global-SV concerns whole possible worlds and the pattern of properties distributed over them. One might wish for such a formulation to capture certain philosophical theses, such as physicalism (roughly: fixing the physical facts fixes everything), Humean supervenience (roughly: everything is fixed by the spatiotemporal distribution of local intrinsic properties), or determinism (roughly: everything to the future is fixed by the present, and perhaps past, facts), which involve worlds (or ‘world segments’) taken as individual objects. In each formulation, though, we can distinguish between cases with differing modal force by quantifying over different types of possible world (that is, by imposing different accessibility relations on the set of worlds). An accessibility relation is just a binary relation RMod (w, w*) holding between pairs of worlds, w and w*, so that RMod (w, w*) is true whenever w* satisfies the same M-laws (of physics, logic, and so forth) as w. If you’re only bothered about relations satisfying our laws of physics, then you will only want to consider the nomologically possible worlds, in which case RNom (w, w*) whenever w* follows the same physical laws as w. If you want to go beyond our laws, then quantification over the metaphysically possible worlds is more appropriate (one needs to ‘expand’ the accessibility relation).

There is some confusion in spelling out what is meant in saying that worlds are B-duplicates. Does it mean that the worlds may differ in other ways, so long as they do not differ with respect to B-properties? For example, might we consider two worlds B-duplicates where one world, but not the other, has ghosts (with C-properties)? If they are B-duplicates, and B-properties account for all there is, and the worlds contain the same individuals, then what distinguishes such worlds? These issues can cause problems when one tries to put supervenience to work. Moreover, Global-SV faces a similar problem to that mentioned with regard to Strong-SV. So long as two worlds are not B-duplicates they can differ in any way you like with respect to their A-properties. For example, if one single atom is out of place, then this could mean that one world has conscious beings and the other world only has zombies!

A further distinction is to be made between “single domain supervenience” and “multiple domain supervenience.” The difference here concerns whether we wish to consider the A- and B-properties associated to the same or to different things respectively. In the latter, multiple domain case, one would look at those cases where there cannot be A-differences in one thing without a B-difference in some other distinct thing. Thus, weak and strong are clearly single domain formulations. The multiple domain account has several applications: for example, in the case of the problem of material composition (for example, the way a statue stands to the lump of clay that out of which it is composed), those who believe that the statue and the clay literally coincide (share their spatial boundaries at a time, if not for all time, and indeed these divergent histories is what makes them different—they can also differ in their modal properties, so that they satisfy different counterfactuals) will want to say that the statue supervenes on the clay. But since these are two different things, according to the coincidence advocate, w will need a multiple domain account. For the same reasons, those who view societies, or other similar structures, as separate objects, autonomous from the individuals from which they are composed, will need a multiple domain account if they wish to say that social properties supervene on the properties of the underlying individuals. (One can also formulate “local” or “regional” supervenience, which restrict the supervenience relation to a spacetime region within a world, rather than some concrete object within a world. Again, this splits into weak and strong versions.)

There is something of a cottage industry devoted to spelling out the various entailment relations between the various formulations. We saw that Strong-SV implies Weak-SV, and it looks like Strong-SV implies Global-SV too. However, the converse is trickier: given a certain understanding of the properties involved, they become equivalent. However, equivalence is ruled out by a simple counterexample (due to Petrie): Suppose we have two worlds w and w*, each with two properties A = {S}| and B= {P}, and two individuals x and y (and no more) in world w, and x* and y* (and no more) in world w*. The world w is characterized by the following distribution of properties over its individuals: Px, Sx, Py, ~Sy. While world w* is characterized by the distribution: Px*, ~Sx*, ~Py*, and ~Sy*. Clearly, strong supervenience is ruled out by this model since x and x* are B-duplicates but not A-duplicates. But this isn’t incompatible with global supervenience because the worlds are not B-duplicates, so A-duplication is irrelevant. The fact that this model is consistent with global supervenience yet inconsistent with strong supervenience is enough, says Petrie, to show that they are not equivalent. There are objections to this argument, but we shan’t go in to these matters here. Let us instead turn to some controversial issues that arise in contemporary debates.

4. Supervenience and Causation

Supervenient properties are often those to which we wish to attach causal powers. For example, mental effects from mental causes and even physical effects from mental causes. If one thinks of an old love it may cause one to feel sad, or have some other emotion. It may cause one to cry. But the mental supervenes on the physical, which means that the physical fixes the mental. So both mental causes and mental effects are supervenient on some physical conditions. But then the mental cause is irrelevant here since the physical conditions are sufficient to bring about the effect. At best, the mental effect is over-determined by the mental and physical causes. At worst, it leads to epiphenomenalism about mental properties. Presumably the ground of the supervenience relation will be relevant here.

If the supervenient properties are understood as emergent, then it is possible that some “global” properties, to do with a whole system, can causally effect other things, and its parts (the supervenience base). For example, a group of agents can interact to generate an economy, but the economy has properties of its own (prices, interest rates, and such like); these will be able to influence how the agents behave. In other words, there is the possibility of a ‘feedback loop’ from global to local. Such a possibility would appear not to be available in the case of a “mereological” grounding of a supervenience relation, according to which the whole is just identified with the sum of its parts. In the former case, the whole is supposed to be some how more than the sum of its parts (due to the non-linear nature of the interactions between the parts). But, nonetheless, in both cases, once we fix the subvenient properties, we fix the supervenient ones too. However, there are very problematic causal issues involved in the case with a feedback loop where we would appear to have “downward causation” so that the supervenient properties constrain and even modify the subvenient ones. The existence of a “preferred direction” to the relation seems to have been lost in such cases. This is an interesting topic in need of much further work, but we cannot pursue it further here.

5. Reduction, Emergence, and Multiple Realization

Reductionism is as old as philosophy itself. The ancient Greek cosmologists each defended what appear to be reductive theories according to which everything that exists is made up of some single fundamental element or a group of such elements. Most apt here is the version of atomism given to us by Leuccipus and Democritus according to which all things, including secondary qualities, souls, and thoughts, were reduced to atoms moving in the void. But there are some things that, it seems, are not easily reducible. Take Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony. How does one reduce this? To a sound structure (that is, a sequence of sounds)? If so, then many different sound structures can realize it, on CDs, Vinyl, a badly tuned piano, and so on. This piece of music is, then, multiply realizable (there is a many-to-one relationship between the subvenient realizations and the supervenient property). We might also consider some “higher order” properties of musical works, say “being a grand piece of music.” This property too is multiply realizable: there are many ways to be a grand piece of music. This seems to rule out reduction, at least to a unique sound structure. But, and here we return to Hare’s example, if there are two indistinguishable realizations, then if one is a grand work of music, the other cannot fail to be. The grandeur is determined by the sound structure—we are, of course, assuming that grandeur is a property intrinsic to a work, otherwise one and the same sound structure could be both grand and not grand.

This multiple realizability lies at the core of supervenience’s job, namely, to describe a dependency weaker than identity and reduction. The idea is, that fixing the physical properties of the work of music (the tones, durations, intensities, and so on) suffices to fix any and all aesthetic properties the piece might have. But then the idea of emergence amounts to the claim that these aesthetic properties (and similar higher-level properties) are not reducible to the physical ones, they are something “novel” arising from the physical organization. (The distinction between physical and non-physical properties here amounts to both the fact that the latter type can be had by many objects with different natures and constitutions, and the fact that the former type obey the laws of, possibly complete, physics. However, nothing said here hinges on this distinction, one might as well say that aesthetic properties are physical too, since they occupy the world. Thus, this is just a way of speaking to label a curious fact, namely that some properties seem not to be reducible to what are standardly taken to be unproblematic ‘physical’ properties, such as mass, charge, spin, and so on.) Dualism and epiphenomenalism are avoided (1) because the physical facts are needed to fix the emergent facts and (2) because the emergent properties are supposed to be causally efficacious: the beauty of the Adagio from Mahler’s Fifth Symphony can cause a person to cry; it isn’t the durations, intensities, and pitch of sounds that is causally responsible—though one might conceivably take a hard line here and argue that it is precisely the physical (subvenient) properties that cause the tears. (Though it must be understood that causation is far from simple in these contexts, as we saw in the previous section.)

In an early and pioneering work on supervenience and determination, in the context of a defense and formulation of physicalism, Hellman and Thompson were concerned with separating out supervenience from reduction. Physicalism can be understood simply as follows: When God made the World, did he just have to fix the facts regarding the elementary particles and the forces (the B-properties) and all the rest (the A-properties: colors, qualia, aesthetic properties, moral properties, and so forth) followed from that, or did he have to then attach all the rest? A physicalist will answer Yes to the former question. Supervenience, or rather determination, is supposed to support the affirmative answer, for it says precisely that the B-properties determine the A-properties. Hellman and Thompson wanted to show that supervenience is neutral in respect of reduction between supervenient and subvenient levels of properties.

Why might we wish to defend the view that supervenience is non-reductive? One reason, as we have seen, is to capture a notion of ontological dependence—say of the mind on physical brain states or processes—without eliminating the mind, or identifying the mind with the brain states. The problem with such a view is that prima facie it appears to let in ‘unphysical’ properties, that either amount to dualism or epiphenomenalism. There is certainly a problem in making ontological sense of supervenient properties, but one needn’t espouse either dualism or epiphenomenalism if one is committed to a supervenience thesis. For all that is being said is that fixing some one set of facts fixes some others. However, there is an argument that attempts to demonstrate that supervenience is reductive. Let us consider this argument, and then present one against reduction.

The argument is given in Kim’s “Supervenience and Nomological Incommensurables”. In capsule form, it goes as follows: Suppose we have two sets of properties, P (for physical) and S (for special, as in special science). Let s be a property in S and let pn be the list of properties contained in P. Define qn to be the set of maximally conjunctive properties that can be built from pn (where the maximally conjunctive condition means that for each pi, either pi or its negation is a conjunct of qn). If S is supervenient on P then any pair of objects that share some qi must both possess s or both lack s. Now, let D be the disjunction of all of those qi such that if an object has qi then it has s too. However, this implies that possession of an S property is equivalent to possession of a P property. In other words, for all x’s, s has x if and only if D has x (in shorthand: x , s(x) iff D(x)). This, of course, is tantamount to a reduction of S to P, for the claim is that every higher level, supervenient, property is coextensive with some Boolean complex of lower level, subvenient, properties, say a long (possibly infinite) disjunction of properties. Thus, any two objects with the supervenient property A must possess the very same subvenient property B, but B is a very complex property that will involve an exhaustive list of the ways that A could be had by any object.

Hellmann and Thompson’s strategy is to disallow infinite conjunctions and disjunctions of properties, thereby blocking the route to the infinitely complex properties that Kim’s argument let in, and therefore blocking the route to reduction. However, while an outright ban on such properties may be otherwise well motivated, it is too ad hoc in this case. A more promising approach to stop Kim’s argument is to simply not allow that the kind of Boolean operations that Kim utilizes to generate new properties result in genuine properties. One might apply this strategy either to negations of properties, disjunctive properties, conjunctive properties, or some combination of these (see McLaughlin’s article “Varieties of Supervenience”).

In his “Reduction of Mind” Lewis speaks of supervenience as a reductive principle, going somewhat against the philosophical grain. As a build up he writes:

I hold, as an a priori principle, that every contingent truth must be made true, somehow, by the pattern of coinstantiation of fundamental properties and relations [that is, occurring all together]. The whole truth about the world, including the mental part of the world, supervenes on this pattern. If two possible worlds were exactly isomorphic in their patterns of coinstantiation of fundamental properties and relations, they would thereby be exactly alike simpliciter.

(Lewis 1994, p.292)

Lewis adds to this that all the fundamental properties and relations are physical, so that a materialist thesis is generated from the supervenience—the position amounts, more or less, to a statement of his “Humean Supervenience;” the claim that “All there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of fact…And that is all” (1986, p.ix-x) so that “truth supervenes on being” (1994b, p.225). But how can supervenience be reductive? Lewis gives the following example:

Imagine a grid of a million tiny spots – pixels – each of which can be made light or dark. When some are light and some are dark, they form a picture, replete with interesting gestalt properties. The case evokes reductionist comments. Yes, the picture really does exist. Yes, it really does have those gestalt properties. However, the picture and the properties reduce to the arrangement of light and dark pixels. They are nothing over and above the pixels. They make nothing true that is not made true already by the pixels. They could go unmentioned in an inventory of what there is without thereby rendering that inventory incomplete. And so on.

(Lewis 1994, p. 294)

Such comments Lewis happily endorses: “The picture reduces to the pixels. And that is because the picture supervenes on the pixels” (loc. cit.). Lewis’ position here stems from the fact that the supervenience relation is (in this case, at least) non-symmetric and relates large to small—though it isn’t at all obvious that this is sufficient for reduction.

However, there is a way for the anti-reductionist to respond here, and this response ties in to much of the contemporary debate regarding supervenience (and emergence). The response is known as the “multiple realizability” objection, and was first used by Jerry Fodor (1974) in the context of the debate concerning the non-reducibility of special science to lower-level science (ultimately, physics). The argument, in a nutshell, is that properties associated to a ‘special science’ (for example, psychology) can be realized by a multitude of heterogeneous lower-level properties or states. Let us see how this works by focusing on a simplified example given by Putnam (1975).

We are asked to consider a board that has a round hole in it of 5 inches in diameter, and a square peg that is 5 inches on each of its sides. Clearly the peg will not go into the hole. The question we are faced with is why the peg does not go through. Obviously, says Putnam, the respective size and shape of the peg and hole give us the answer. These properties, size and shape, Putnam refers to as “macroproperties”, as contrasted with the “microproperties,” of the peg and board, namely the positions, momenta, charge, and so forth, of the atoms composing them. Clearly the shape and size of the peg and the board supervene on the microproperties. Do these microproperties provide an answer to the above question? Putnam says not, because the details at that level are irrelevant to why the peg did not penetrate the board: the microproperties could have been very different, in fact, and the result would have been the same. What are we to conclude from this? That the “peg/board/hole”-level features (the macroproperties) are autonomous, so that they cannot be reduced to lower-level features (the microproperties). This is, more or less, just multiple realizability again, but here it keys in to an interesting aspect of that concept. It tells us that what is explainable using supervenient features is not always explainable using the associated subvenient features. Here one can make connections traditional issues with philosophy of science.

There are dissenting voices to Putnam’s thesis, but we shall not go any further into the ins and outs of the debate here since it quickly becomes dense and complex. Suffice it to say that supervenience is still “live” in many philosophical debates and will no doubt continue to remain so for some time to come.

6. Adding Mystery to Mystery?

Supervenience is something of a halfway house. It is called upon by some to ground a view according to which certain properties that we think of as “unphysical” are not definable in terms of, or reducible to physical properties and yet are nonetheless connected in some way. It is supposed to somehow avoid the mystery of how physical matters can have a determinative role to play in unphysical properties, without those unphysical properties causing a problem in being materialistically un-kosher. For others, supervenience is a reductive principle, a matter of how the world is and must be.

Many philosophers have complained about the (in)significance of supervenience. Stephen Schiffer suggests that the invocation of supervenience simply moves the explanatory task back a step. How, he asks,

could being told that non-natural moral properties stood in the supervenience relation to physical properties make them any more palatable? On the contrary, invoking a special primitive metaphysical relation of supervenience to explain how non-natural moral properties were related to physical properties was just to add mystery to mystery, to cover one obscurantist move with another.

(Schiffer 1987, p.153-4)

Much recent work has been devoted to decrying the philosophical utility of specific formulations of supervenience, the general idea, or proving equivalences between them. All of the formulations we have seen do no more than to chart certain correlations between properties. They do not tell us anything about dependency or determination between the properties, in the sense of, say, a causal relation. Supervenience directs us to search for the underlying reasons for the correlation—it might not always be there. In the case of the special sciences it isn’t clear that an “underlying reason” is to be found. Kim (1987, p. 167), for example, believes that supervenience is not a “deep” metaphysical relation, but instead is a superficial relation that points to some other ‘deeper’ relation that might explain the superficial pattern of dependency—though more recently Kim has shifted to a reductive view of the relation (see Kim, 2005, for a clear account). In this sense, supervenience is a useful concept, for it can function as a filter on types of relations, letting through those of a certain type. Once we have identified a dependence relation, we can then delve deeper to see what might account for it: causation, mereology, definition, emergence, and so forth. In this sense there is no question of supervenience being an explanatory device, so there is no mystery here; but it can nonetheless be used in the search for explanations.

Supervenience has many useful applications too, in making other areas of philosophy clearer and more navigable. For example, the internalism/externalism distinction concerning mental content [very roughly, externalism is the view that mental content depends on things outside of the mind as well as inside; internalism denies this—saying that only what’s inside matters] can be cast into the endorsement and denial respectively of the following supervenience thesis: the content of a mental state (that is, what it is about) supervenes on certain neurobiological properties (narrow content). On the other hand, the externalist, as can be discerned from the rough characterization above, believes that there is more to content than this: the world plays a role too. One can clarify the distinction between internal and external relations too: an internal relation is one that supervenes on the intrinsic properties of its relata (for example, being heavier than), while this is not true in the case of external relations (for example, being 2 miles away from); it does not matter what something is like for it satisfy this latter relation, but it does for the former. We have seen too that it allows for a definition of physicalism and helps with the puzzle of material coincidence. Surely, if by a concept’s work shall you know it, supervenience deserves the central place that it has found in the philosophers’ toolbox.

7. References and Further Reading

For a more technical and detailed presentation of the concept of supervenience, see McLaughlin and Bennett’s article in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

  • Beckermann, A., Flohr, H., & Kim, J., (eds.). Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1992.
  • Davidson, D. 1970. “Mental Events.” In D. Davidson (ed.), Essays on Actions and Events, 1980: 207-225.
  • Davidson, D. “The Material Mind.” In P. Suppes (ed.), Logic, Methodology and the Philosophy of Science. North-Holland. Reprinted in Essays on Action and Events (Oxford University Press, 1980).
  • Fodor, J. “Special Sciences, or the Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis.” Synthese, 1974, 28: 97-115.
  • Hare, R.M. The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1952.
  • Hellman, G. & Thompson, F. “Physicalism, Ontology, Determination, and Reduction,” The Journal of Philosophy, 1975, 72: 551-64.
  • Horgan, T. “From Supervenience to Superdupervenience: Meeting the Demands of a Material World.” Mind, 1993, 102: 555-86.
  • Horgan, T. (ed.) Southern Journal of Philosophy 22: The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement. Supervenience, 1984.
  • Jackson, F. From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Kim, J. Supervenience, or Something Near Enough. Princeton University Press, 2005.
  • Kim, J. Supervenience and Mind. Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Kim, J. “Concepts of Supervenience.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 1984, 45, 2: 153-176.
  • Kim, J. “Supervenience as a Philosophical Concept.” Reprinted in J. Kim, Supervenience and Mind, 1993 (1990): 131-160.
  • Kim, J. “’Strong’ and ‘Global’ Supervenience Revisited.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 1987, 48, 2: 315-326.
  • Lewis, D.K. The Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.
  • Lewis, D. K. “Reduction of Mind.” In D. Lewis (ed.), Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology. Cambridge University Press, 1999 (1994): 291-324.
  • McLaughlin, B. & Bennett, K. “Supervenience.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2005 Edition), edited by Edward N. Zalta.
  • McLaughlin, B.P. “The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism.” In A. Beckermann et al. (eds.), Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism. Walter de Gruyter, 1992: 49-93.
  • McLaughlin, B.P. “Varieties of Supervenience.” In E. Savellos & U. Yalcin (eds.), Supervenience: New Essays. Cambridge University Press, 1995: 16-59.
  • Moore, G.E. Philosophical Studies. London: Routledge, 1922.
  • Paull, C.P. & Sider, T.R. 1992. “In Defense of Global Supervenience,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 32, 1992: 830-45.
  • Post, J. F. “Comment on Teller.” In Horgan (ed.), The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement. Supervenience, 1984: 163-167.
  • Putnam, H. “Philosophy and our Mental Life.” In Mind, Language, and Reality. Cambridge University Press, 1975.
  • E. Savellos & U. Yalcin (eds.), Supervenience: New Essays. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Schiffer, S. Remnants of Meaning. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1987.
  • Sober, E. The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus. University of Chicago Press, 1993.
  • Stalnaker, R. “Varieties of Supervenience.” Philosophical Perspectives 10, 1996: 221-241.
  • Teller, P. “A Poor Man’s Guide to Supervenience and Determination.” In Horgan (ed.), The Spindel Conference 1983 Supplement. Supervenience, 1984: 137-50.

Author Information

Dean Rickles
Email: drickles@ucalgary.ca
University of Calgary

Cognitive Relativism

Cognitive relativism asserts the relativity of truth. Because of the close connections between the concept of truth and concepts such as knowledge, rationality, and justification, cognitive relativism is often taken to encompass, or imply, the relativity of these other notions also. Thus, epistemological relativism, which asserts the relativity of knowledge, may be understood as a version of cognitive relativism, or at least as entailed by it.

This kind of relativism can take different forms depending on the nature of the standpoint or framework to which truth is relativized. If truth is relativized to the individual subject, for instance, the result is a form of subjectivism. If the standpoint is an entire culture, the result is some form of cultural relativism. Other possible frameworks include languages, historical periods, and conceptual schemes. These frameworks do not exclude one another, of course, and in the positions developed by thinkers such as Thomas Kuhn and Michel Foucault (both generally regarded as holding relativistic views of truth) they are presented as interwoven.

Cognitive relativism is not so widely held as moral relativism. Moral relativism is the view that moral judgments (those employing concepts like good, bad, right or wrong) should only be assessed relative to a particular, limited standpoint (usually that of a specific culture). This doctrine became a commonplace for many growing up in modernized societies in the second half of the twentieth century and is virtually the default position encountered among undergraduates by countless philosophy instructors today. One major reason for its popularity is the importance attached by so many thinkers to the distinction between facts and values. Factual judgments are generally thought to be objective and provable; value judgments, by contrast, are commonly held to express subjective attitudes and to be unprovable, rather like judgments of taste.

Gradually, however, cognitive relativism has gained in credibility as the sharp logical dichotomy between facts ands values has been increasingly questioned. Instead of a dichotomy, many now argue for a spectrum of judgments with a greater or lesser evaluative component to them. Moreover, these components themselves may not be seen as radically different; they may, for instance, simply reflect the degree to which a judgment is controversial within a particular community, with what we call factual judgments being the least disputed. From this point of view, cognitive relativism is broader and more fundamental than moral relativism, for it asserts that the truth value of all judgments, not just moral ones, is relative.

Table of Contents

  1. Ancient relativism
  2. The emergence of relativism in modern times
  3. The definition of relativism
  4. Arguments for relativism
  5. Objections to relativism
    1. Relativism is Self-Refuting
    2. Relativism has Pernicious Consequences
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Ancient relativism

In Western philosophy, relativism first appears as a philosophical outlook associated with the Sophists in fifth century Greece. Cosmopolitan and skeptically inclined, these traveling intellectuals were struck by the variations in law, mores, practices and beliefs found in different communities. They drew the conclusion that much of what is commonly regarded as natural is in fact a matter of convention. There is thus no objectively right way to worship the gods or organize society, any more than there is an objectively correct way to dress or to prepare food. The main critical thrust of this way of thinking was directed against traditional moral and political values, but the relativity of truth itself seems to be implicated in Protagoras’ famous assertion that “man is the measure of all things–of things that are, that they are, and of things that are not, that they are not.” The fact that the sophists taught rhetoric, and in stressing the value of persuasion appeared indifferent to questions of truth, reinforced this attitude.

The first great critic of relativism was Plato. In the Theatetus, he links Protagorean relativism to the view that knowledge should be identified with sense perception, and also to the Heracleitean doctrine that reality is in a continual state of flux. Plato’s criticisms of Protagoras’ position prefigures arguments advanced against relativism by its critics ever since. One objection he raises is that relativism collapses the distinction between truth and falsity; for if each individual is really the “measure” of what is, then everyone would be infallible, which is absurd. The implausibility of the Protagorean thesis is especially obvious, Plato argues, when we consider two people making incompatible predictions about the future. Events will prove that one of them, at least, was not a good measure of what is true. His other main objection is that relativism is self-refuting. If Protagoras is right, then whatever a person thinks is true, is true. But in that case, Protagoras must concede that those who think relativism is false are correct. So if Protagorean relativism is true, it must also be false.

Although skepticism about the possibility of knowledge became part of the mainstream of ancient philosophy, relativism did not. Socrates and Plato may be willing to concede that human understanding, in this life at least, is very limited, but they do not doubt the existence of an ideal vantage point from which the objective truth about the world could be known. Also, Aristotle appears fairly confident that such a vantage point is accessible to human reason properly employed.

2. The emergence of relativism in modern times

Between Aristotle and Kant there are no major Western philosophers who one could plausibly describe as cognitive relativists. Montaigne and Hume certainly stressed the importance of custom in shaping peoples’ beliefs, especially on moral matters; but this led them towards skepticism rather than relativism. The door to modern relativism was unlocked by Kant’s claim in the Critique of Pure Reason that the only world we can know or talk about meaningfully is one that has been shaped by the human mind. On Kant’s view, the concept of “objective reality” is employed speculatively and hence illegitimately if it is taken to refer to reality as it is independent of our experience of it. This obviously has implications for the traditional notion of objective truth. The judgments we call true are true for us and of our world; but to claim they are true in the sense of describing an independently existing reality is to go beyond what we can meaningfully or justifiably assert.

Kant is not generally considered a relativist since he held that the forms our mind imposes on the world are common to all human beings. Truths like the truths of geometry or the statement that every event is caused are thus universally accepted and constitute a priori knowledge. The forms we impose on experience also give the world a certain necessary character that is independent of our beliefs and wishes. For instance, causes must precede their effect, and time can only flow in one direction. In this sense, the forms confer objectivity on the world we experience, and our well-founded judgments about that world can be called objectively true. Later thinkers, however, took Kant’s ideas further down the road toward fully-fledged relativism. Hegel, while upholding a concept of “absolute knowledge”, allows every stage that human consciousness has passed through in the historical development of civilization to express an outlook that is true in a partial way. Marx highlights the influence of the mode of production along with class and economic interests in shaping the way people understand their world; and although he appears to recognize the epistemic authority of science in some areas, he rejects the idea of a neutral standpoint from which to adjudicate between different views of social reality. Nietzsche is explicitly relativistic about both moral values and truth, preferring to evaluate claims according to what sort of will to power the claims express rather than according to their objective truth-value.

In the twentieth century, a relativistic view of truth can be found in or inferred from the work of many major philosophers, including James, Dewey, Wittgenstein, Quine, Kuhn, Gadamer, Foucault, Rorty, and most of those commonly labeled “postmodernists”. Numerous others, including some who regard themselves as staunch opponents of relativism, have been accused of harbouring relativistic tendencies. There is thus a general consensus that modern philosophy has shifted in a relativistic direction. Even fierce critics of relativism like Allan Bloom (author of The Closing of the American Mind) concede this. Indeed, it is this trend, along with its trickle down effect on the outlook of rising generations, that occasions lamentations such as his.

3. The definition of relativism

There is no general agreed upon definition of cognitive relativism. Here is how it has been described by a few major theorists:

  • “Reason is whatever the norms of the local culture believe it to be”. (Hilary Putnam, Realism and Reason: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3 (Cambridge, 1983), p. 235.)
  • “The choice between competing theories is arbitrary, since there is no such thing as objective truth.” (Karl Popper, The Open Society and its Enemies, Vol. II (London, 1963), p. 369f.)
  • “There is no unique truth, no unique objective reality” (Ernest Gellner, Relativism and the Social Sciences (Cambridge, 1985), p. 84.)
  • “There is no substantive overarching framework in which radically different and alternative schemes are commensurable” (Richard Bernstein, Beyond Objectivism and Relativism (Philadelphia, 1985), pp. 11-12.)
  • “There is nothing to be said about either truth or rationality apart from descriptions of the familiar procedures of justification which a given society—ours—uses in one area of enquiry” (Richard Rorty, Objectivity, Relativism and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1 (Cambridge, 1991), p. 23.)

Without doubt, this lack of consensus about exactly what relativism asserts is one reason for the unsatisfactory character of much of the debate about its coherence and plausibility. Another reason is that very few philosophers are willing to apply the label “relativist” to themselves. Even Richard Rorty, who is widely regarded as one of the most articulate defenders of relativism, prefers to describe himself as a “pragmatist”, an “ironist” and an “ethnocentrist”.

Nevertheless, a reasonable definition of relativism may be constructed: one that describes the fundamental outlook of thinkers like Rorty, Kuhn, or Foucault while raising the hackles of their critics in the right way.

Cognitive relativism consists of two claims:

(1) The truth-value of any statement is always relative to some particular standpoint;

(2) No standpoint is metaphysically privileged over all others.

The first of these claims asserts the relativity of truth, obviously an essential element in this form of relativism. Oddly, though, this is not the most controversial part of the doctrine. After all, even committed realists might be willing to conceive of objective truth as equivalent to “true from a God’s eye point of view” or “true from the standpoint of the cosmos”. It is this second claim, the denial of any metaphysically privileged standpoint, that most provokes relativism’s critics. A brief look at the role of this thesis in the thought of three leading relativists–Kuhn, Rorty, and Foucault—will help reveal why it should be so controversial.

In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn argues that science progresses by means of what he calls paradigm shifts. A paradigm theory is an overarching theory like Dalton’s atomic theory or the theory of evolution. These provide the background conceptual scheme within which what Kuhn calls “normal science” occurs. On Kuhn’s account, a paradigm shift such as that by which Copernican astronomy displaced the Ptoemeic view of the universe should not be thought of as a shift between two different ways of looking at an independent reality. Rather, theory and observation are so intertwined that the shift amounts to a change in the reality the scientists inhabit. Consequently, there is no independent standpoint from which a paradigm shift can be judged to take us closer to a true picture of the way things really are. Kuhn likens debates over paradigms to political controversies, saying that “as in political revolutions, so in paradigm choice—there is no standard higher than the assent of the relevant community.” (p. 110)

Richard Rorty extends what Kuhn says about science to every other sphere of culture, particularly politics. The traditional view–call it Platonist, absolutist, objectivist or realist–is that when we do something like abolish slavery we move closer to an independent ideal and we bring our way of thinking closer to the One Right Way, the way dictated by reason or by our essential human nature. Rorty thinks this sort of thinking has been valuable in the past; but in more recent times it has become constraining rather than liberating. He therefore urges us to see intellectual and cultural progress as simply consisting in our exchanging one vocabulary for another. Descriptions of human beings that view them as entitled to equal rights before the law, and descriptions of the solar system that views it as heliocentric are both preferable to the descriptions they replaced; but not because they are closer to the truth. In both cases, we should prefer the newer descriptions on pragmatic grounds; they better enable us to achieve our purposes.

Michel Foucault’s relativism is similar to Kuhn’s in being based on and justified by historical researches. The domain of his studies is different, however. In works like Madness and Civilization, The Order of Things, and Discipline and Punish, Foucault tries to show how what we call “reason”, “science”, “knowledge” and “truth” are socially constituted and shaped by political forces. He argues that in order to pass muster as “scientific” or as “rational”, a discourse must satisfy certain conditions, and these conditions are socially and historically relative, reflecting the needs and interests of existing power structures. This relativity is more obvious in the case of classifications based on distinctions such as normal-perverted, natural-unnatural, rational-insane, or healthy-sick. But Foucault suggests that it applies also to other, more epistemologically central distinctions such as scientific-unscientific, knowledge-error, and true-false. The ideal of a neutral standpoint transcending epochs and interests is thus a chimera.

4. Arguments for relativism

Relativism is the radical offspring of non-realism, which is itself descended from the idealism of Berkeley and Kant. Non-realism holds that we cannot meaningfully talk about they way things are independent of our experience of them: to use Michael Dummett’s formulation, what makes a statement true is not independent of our procedures for deciding it is true. The main argument in favour of non-realism is essentially negative: it avoids the difficulties endemic to metaphysical realism (a.k.a. “objectivism” or “absolutism”).

Realists hold that our judgments are true when they accurately describe or correspond to a reality that exists independently of our perceptions, conceptions, theories or desires. On this view, a true statement such as “water contains oxygen” describes a fact about this independent reality. It rests on a scientific model that may be said to “carve nature at the joints”. But an obvious question arises: how can we determine that our judgments are true in this sense? The obvious answer is that we test them by making experiments and observations. I say it will snow today, and I test this by watching the sky. I say water contains oxygen and I confirm this by showing that one of the elements separated out by electrolysis supports combustion. When our assertions are decisively confuted by experience, we conclude that they are false—i.e. they describe a state of affairs that does not obtain.

Relativists accept that this is how we normally conceive of truth and falsity—in ordinary usage, the word “true” means something like “corresponds to the facts”–and as an account of our everyday epistemic procedures it is unobjectionable. But they argue that it loses coherence if it is elevated to the metaphysical level. For what is really happening, even when we are confirming the most mundane belief about the empirical world, is that we are satisfying ourselves that this belief coheres with our other beliefs. We confirm that the sea is salty by tasting it or by conducting a chemical analysis of seawater. But these procedures only confirm our belief about sea water in the sense of showing it to be compatible with or even entailed by a host of other beliefs: for instance, that the sample we are examining is typical; that nothing else tastes quite like salt; that our sensory faculties are trustworthy on this occasion; that salt tastes roughly the same at different times. What we can never do, argue relativists and other non-realists, is check the degree of correspondence between our judgments and reality as it is independent of our experience of it. To do this we would have to take a “sideways on” view of the cognitive relation between subject and object. But this is impossible since any vantage point we adopt will necessarily be that of the subject. For the same reason, we cannot compare our overall conceptual scheme or theoretical model of reality with reality as it is “in itself.”

The driving idea behind empiricism and the upshot of Kant’s critique of speculative metaphysics is thus that concepts must be tied to experience if they are to have legitimate employment in science or philosophy. Relativists argue that the metaphysical realist’s concept of truth fails this test, for it takes the notion of “correspondence with reality” out of its everyday employment, where it is genuinely useful, and tries to press it into metaphysical service, where it is neither useful nor legitimate. So even if, in its normal usage, “truth” means something like correspondence with reality, the ultimate criterion of truth turns out to be coherence with other beliefs. To put it another way: our philosophical conception of truth cannot simply be an expanded version of our commonsense notion of truth as correspondence. And this implies that truth must always be relative to some belief system, to some particular epistemic standpoint. This is the first of the two theses identified above as constituting the doctrinal kernel of relativism. Numerous philosophers have affirmed it. Yet many of these have sought to avoid relativism by rejecting the second thesis—that no standpoint is metaphysically privileged over all others.

This second thesis is what gives relativism its bad name. Critics commonly reduce it to the claim that any point of view is as good as any other and then attack it with some variation of Plato’s arguments against Protagoras. But virtually no well-known philosophers actually hold that all standpoints are of equal worth. Richard Rorty, for instance, who is widely regarded as a relativist, dismisses that position as “silly.” (Richard Rorty, Objectivism, Relativism, and Truth, p. 89). Rorty, Kuhn and most other relativists accept that one can have cogent reasons for preferring one standpoint to another; the preferred point of view may, for instance, exhibit greater logical consistency or greater predictive power than other available perspectives. But they argue that such reasons cannot confer any special metaphysical status on the standpoint in question. They cannot, for instance, show it to be the one favoured by God, or dictated by Reason, or most in accord with human nature.

Relativists typically justify this conclusion along the following lines. Any proof of a standpoint’s superiority must rest on premises that express fundamental assumptions and basic values. For instance, arguments for the superiority of the standpoint of modern science over that of religion will presuppose the value of consistency, of solving theoretical puzzles, and of being able to manipulate one’s environment. A person who defends the literal truth of the bible but shares these values is likely to be persuaded fairly quickly by these arguments. But a person who holds that truth appears to humans as paradoxical, and who values tradition and religious faith over experimental evidence and predictive power will not be persuaded. An argument can only be convincing to one who accepts its premises. Some premises, though, like those just mentioned, are so fundamental that they are not usually argued for at all. Rather, they are constitutive of a particular outlook.

The relativists’ thesis is not that one cannot support standpoints with arguments; it is that in the end all such arguments must be circular since they inevitably rest on premises that are themselves part of the standpoint. Critics will here point out that there is a difference between denying that the superiority of one standpoint over all others can be proved and denying that such a standpoint exists. In reply, relativists are likely to claim that this distinction is an abstract one that no consistent empiricist or pragmatist would make. To insist that one standpoint is objectively superior to all others, they argue, even though there is no way of proving this, is dogmatic and pointless; to claim that one’s own standpoint enjoys this unique but undemonstrable superiority is dogmatic and implausible.

A critic might also object that what relativists call “cogent” reasons for preferring one standpoint to another are not epistemically relevant: that is, they do not provide grounds for thinking that the standpoint generates or ensures beliefs that are objectively true. But this is clearly a point most relativists would be willing to concede. The notion of objective truth referred to here is not a concept for which they have a use, preferring instead something like William James’ conception of truth as “what is good in the way of belief.”

5. Objections to relativism

Critics of relativism are legion, but the objections leveled against it are usually of two kinds, both pioneered by Plato in his critique of Protagoras. One line of attack tries to show that relativism is incoherent because it is self-refuting. The other common objection is that relativism, if taken seriously, would have bad practical consequences. Let us consider both of these in turn.

a. Relativism is Self-Refuting

A doctrine is self-refuting if its truth implies its falsehood. Relativism asserts that the truth-value of a statement is always relative to some particular standpoint. This implies that the same statement can be both true and false. The qualification that the statement is true relative to standpoint A but false relative to standpoint B may save relativism from the charge of embracing gross contradictions. But it still clearly implies that relativism itself is false, at least relative to some standpoints. One might say that it is just as much false as it is true, in which case there seems to be no good reason to prefer relativism to alternative positions such as realism.

One possible response to this objection would be to modify the theory and hold that all truths are relative except for the truth that all truths are relative. On this view, the relativist thesis enjoys a unique status, being true in some non-relativistic sense. This position may be coherent, but it is rather implausible. It is hard to see what could justify granting the thesis of relativism this exceptional status. A more plausible option is for relativists to concede that their view is false relative to at least some non-relativistic theoretical frameworks but to deny that this admission is damaging. Relativism, they can claim, is simply in the same situation as any other theory. The theory of evolution is true from the perspective of modern science and false from the perspective of Christian fundamentalism. Relativists deny that one of these perspectives is demonstrably better than the other. But this does not mean that they cannot affirm the scientific perspective, and do so for cogent reasons. In the same way, they can acknowledge that relativism is false from the standpoint of metaphysical realism; but they can do this without inconsistency or incoherence since they are not metaphysical realists, and they have reasons for preferring relativism to realism.

A variation on the charge that relativism is self-refuting is the argument that it is somehow self-refuting for relativists to assert or to argue for their position. This line of attack has been pressed forcefully by Hilary Putnam and others. Putnam’s argument is that ordinary rational discourse presupposes a non-relativistic notion of truth. Jûrgen Habermas offers a similar sort of argument in his critique of postmodernists like Foucault and Derrida, claiming that a commitment to truth, like a commitment to sincerity, is a necessary condition of successful communication.

Relativists, however, are likely to remain skeptical about these alleged presuppositions and implicit commitments. It may be true that when we engage in rational discourse we implicitly commit ourselves to the truth of what we are saying. But it is not at all obvious that we implicitly commit ourselves to a non-relativistic conception of truth. And even if this were the case, it is not clear why this supposed presupposition of everyday communication should be accorded so much respect and made the basis for a philosophical account of truth. Our everyday notions of space and time may also be non-relativistic, but we do not demand that physicists’ theories of space and time conform to our pre-scientific ideas.

b. Relativism has Pernicious Consequences

This criticism also was first ventured by Plato and continues to be endorsed by many. Cognitive relativism is thought to undermine our commitment to improving our ways of thinking rather as moral relativism is thought to undermine our belief in the possibility of moral progress. Several reasons have been given to support this anxiety. To some, the fact that relativism countenances the possibility of multiple true but incompatible points of view entails a kind of epistemic nihilism. If creationism and the theory of evolution, Ptolemaic and Copernican astronomy, astrology and modern psychology are all equally true, then what purpose is served by developing new scientific theories? All views are of equal value, so why not just rest content with whatever happens to be “true for us”?

Against this, relativists can offer two responses. First, truth is not the only epistemic value. We can also prefer theories on the basis of such values as coherence with our other beliefs, predictive power, and practical fruitfulness. Second, by endorsing relativism one does not lose the right to judge beliefs according to their truth or falsity. Modern relativists will believe that the earth orbits the sun and that Copernicus’ discovery represented scientific progress over earlier astronomy. But their philosophical account of the status of these beliefs will be relativistic. The Copernican theory is true and its acceptance represents progress according to the values and concerns that constitute the modern scientific standpoint—a standpoint shared by both relativists and non-relativists. The difference between them is that the relativists do not believe this standpoint can be proved superior to others except by arguments that are essentially circular and question-begging.

Hillary Putnam presses a slightly different version of the above objection. Relativism, he argues, tries to “naturalize” the concept of reason. What he means is that relativists try to discuss questions of truth, knowledge, and rationality in a thoroughly descriptive, non-normative way. Like social scientists afraid of allowing value-judgments to creep into their work, they take a detached stance and simply report the epistemic customs and practices of different cultures, eschewing any impulse to endorse or criticize them. And this amounts, in Putnam’s words, to “mental suicide”. For, while particular norms of rationality will be entrenched within a particular culture, reason has an inalienable critical or transcendent function which can be used to criticize existing epistemic norms. Relativism can thus be accused of encouraging a certain kind of intellectual passivity.

Relativists have also been accused of embracing determinism, and certainly thinkers like Nietzsche and Foucault sometimes invite this charge. The epistemic norms of a culture or a period are taken to be shaped by non-rational forces such as class interests, technology, or the will to power of a group or individual. And what people then come to believe is seen as a function of these norms. For example, Foucault suggests that the classification of homosexuality as a disease results from employing a certain kind of theoretical framework, one that posits a sharp distinction between the natural and the unnatural and correlates the former with the healthy, the latter with the sick. And this framework becomes established because it serves certain interests. So truth is identified with what is believed to be true, and what is believed to be true is determined by larger social forces operating within a culture or historical epoch.

This deterministic tendency, like the attempt to naturalize reason, is held by critics to entail, or at least encourage, a renunciation of the longstanding project of using reason to criticize existing norms, beliefs, and practices in order to furnish ourselves with better ones. Relativism is thus associated with the counter-Enlightenment aspects of postmodernism. But association is not the same thing as logical entailment. It may well be true that some relativists are drawn towards determinism or feel they must eschew value judgments. But it is not clear that these tendencies must be part of a relativistic outlook. Other relativists will argue that the connection between relativism and determinism, say, is historical and contingent rather than logical and necessary. In their view, one can consistently endorse a relativistic view of truth while still being committed to the relative superiority of some views over others, to the value of critical reflection, and to the possibility of using reason as an instrument of scientific and social progress.

6. Conclusion

Cognitive relativism continues to be an important but controversial position that one encounters in contemporary debates about the nature of truth, knowledge, rationality, and science. These debates can sometimes be confusing because people neither agree about exactly what relativism affirms, nor about whose views should be described as a relativistic.

Critics of relativism sometimes seem to assume that relativists are denying that they believe—or denying themselves the right to believe—obvious truths. But the more sophisticated relativists do not deny that statements like “the earth is round” are true. They just favour a certain philosophical account of what is involved and implied when we describe such statements as “true”. The situation here is reminiscent of the debate between idealists and some of their materialist critics. The critics charge idealists like Berkeley with holding that our sense perceptions are illusions, and they think they can refute this doctrine by doing things like kicking stones. But the idealists do not see themselves as holding or implying any such view. They just think that the materialist explanation of our sense-experiences is philosophically problematic; so they offer what they take to be a more coherent alternative.

On the other hand, relativism is sometimes advanced quite crudely. Then, instead of being a philosophical view about the status of our beliefs and the limitations on how we might support these beliefs, it becomes an excuse for accepting uncritically one’s own culture’s assumptions and epistemic norms; or it serves to rationalize intellectual apathy or slackness masquerading as tolerance of diverse opinions. Just as idealists still have to negotiate what we normally call the material world, so relativists have to make decisions about whether particular claims are true or false. Their philosophical relativism may incline them towards being more open-minded and tolerant than dyed-in-the-wool absolutists and objectivists. But they cannot avoid adopting specific standpoints, choosing between theories, and endorsing particular beliefs and values. At bottom, the debate over relativism is about whether it is possible for relativists to make these commitments consistently and sincerely.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Bernstein, Richard J. Beyond Objectivism and Relativism. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 1985.
  • Davidson, Donald. “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association (1974), 5-20.
  • Field, Hartry. “Realism and Relativism.” Journal of Philosophy 79 (1982): 553-557.
  • Forster, Paul D. “What Is at Stake Between Putnam and Rorty?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LII, No. 3 (1992): 585-603.
  • Foucault, Michel. Power/Knowledge: Selected Interviews and Other Writings. Edited by Colin Gordon. Translated by Colin Gordon, Leo Marshall, John Mepham, and Kate Soper. New York: Pantheon Books, 1980.
  • Foucault, Michel. The Foucault Reader. Edited by Paul Rabinow. New York: Pantheon Books, 1984
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method. Second revised edition. Translated and revised by J. Weinsheimer and D. G. Marshall. New York: Crossroad, 1989.
  • Gellner, E.. Relativism and the Social Sciences. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.
  • Geertz, Clifford. The Interpretation of Cultures. New York: Basic Books, 1973.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Ways of Worldmaking. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1978.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. The Theory of Communicative Action, vol. 1, Reason and the Rationalization of Society. Translated by Thomas McCarthy. Boston: Beacon Press, 1984.
  • Habermas, Jürgen. The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity. Translated by Frederick Lawrence. Cambridge, Mass.: M.I.T. Press, 1987.
  • Hollis, Martin and Lukes, Steven (eds). Rationality and Relativism. Cambridge, Mass.: The M.I.T. Press, 1982.
  • Jackson Ronald Lee. “Cultural Imperialism or Benign Relativism? A Putnam-Rorty Debate.” International Philosophical Quarterly XXVIII, No. 4, Issue 112 (1988).
  • Jarvie, I. C. Rationality and Relativism: In search of a philosophy and history of anthropology. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1984.
  • Johnson Jeffery L. “Making Noises in Counterpoint or Chorus: Putnam’s Rejection of Relativism.” Erkenntnis 34 (1991): 323-345.
  • Kelly, Michael, ed. Critique and Power: Recasting the Foucault/Habermas Debate. Cambridge, Mass.: M.I.T. Press, 1994.
  • Krausz, Michael, and Meiland, Jack W., eds. Relativism: Cognitive and Moral. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982.
  • Krausz, Michael. Relativism: Conflicts and confrontations. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989.
  • Kuhn Thomas S. The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, 2nd Edition. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1970.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. “Relativism, Power, and Philosophy.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association. Newark, Delaware: APA (1985): 5-22.
  • Plato, Theaetetus. Translated by M. J. Levett, revised by Myles Burnyeay. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990.
  • Preston, John. “On Some Objections to Relativism.” Ratio 5, No. 1 (1992): 57-73.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Reason, Truth and History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Realism and Reason: Philoosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Putnam, Hilary. The Many Faces of Realism. La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1987.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman. Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.
  • Rorty, Richard. Consequences of Pragmatism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, irony, and solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, relativism, and truth: Philosophical papers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Scheffler, Israel. Science and Subjectivity. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill, 1967.
  • Solomon Miriam. “On Putnam’s argument for the inconsistency of relativism.” The Southern Journal of Philosophy XXVIII, No. 2 (1990): 213-220.
  • Throop, William M. “Relativism and Error: Putnam’s Lessons for the Relativist.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 49 (1989): 675-678.
  • Westacott, Emrys. “Relativism, Truth, and Implicit Commitments.” International Studies in Philosophy 32:2 (2000(: 95-126.
  • Whorf, Benjamin Lee. Language, Thought and Reality. Cambridge, Mass.: M.I.T. Press, 1956.
  • Winch, Peter. The Idea of a Social Science and its Relation to Philosophy. London: Routeldge & Kegan Paul, 1958.
  • Wilson, Bryan. Rationality. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1970.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Philosophical Investigations. Translated by G. E. M. Anscombe. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1953.

Author Information

Emrys Westacott
Email: westacott@alfred.edu
Alfred University
U. S. A.

Moral Realism

The moral realist contends that there are moral facts, so moral realism is a thesis in ontology, the study of what is. The ontological category “moral facts” includes both the descriptive moral judgment that is allegedly true of an individual, such as, “Sam is morally good,” and the descriptive moral judgment that is allegedly true for all individuals such as, “Lying for personal gain is wrong.” A signature of the latter type of moral fact is that it not only describes an enduring condition of the world but also proscribes what ought to be the case (or what ought not to be the case) in terms of an individual’s behavior.

The traditional areas of disagreement between the realist camp and the antirealist camp are cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truth, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity. The long and recalcitrant history of the realism/antirealism debate records that the focal point of the debate has been shaped and reshaped over centuries, with a third way, namely, Quasi-realism, attracting more recent attention. Quasi-realism debunks the positions of both realism and antirealism.

On the one hand, considering cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truth, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity as specifying the sufficient conditions for moral realism ignores the quasi-realist way. On the other hand, defining moral realism in a way that accommodates quasi-realism concedes too much: unlike the moral realist, the quasi-realist denies that moral facts are explanatory. Consequently, one can view quasi-realism as the contemporary heir of antirealism.

Table of Contents

  1. The Realism/Antirealism Debate
    1. Cognitivism
      1. Descriptivism
      2. Mackie’s Error Theory
      3. Waller’s Megaethical Level
    2. Truth in Moral Judgments
      1. An Analogy
      2. Skorupski’s Irrealist Cognitivism
      3. The Correspondence Theory Requires Realism, Not Vice Versa
    3. Literal Moral Truth?
    4. Moral Knowledge
    5. Moral Objectivity
  2. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and the EI thesis
    1. An Analogy: Quasi-Realism about Derogatory Judgments
    2. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and Explanationist Moral Realism
  3. Moral Realism after Quasi-Realism
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Realism/Antirealism Debate

If there are moral facts, how can we know them? For a realist, moral facts are as certain as mathematical facts. Moral facts and mathematical facts are abstract entities, and as such, are different in kind from natural facts. One cannot literally display moral facts as one could display, say, a plant. One can display a token of the type, for example one can write “lying for personal gain is wrong” or one can write an equation; however, one cannot observe moral and mathematical facts in quite the same way as one can observe, with the aid of a microscope, clorophyll in a leaf. Such limitations of experience do not stop realists and antirealists from disagreeing on virtually every aspect of the moral practices that seem to presuppose the existence of moral facts. The list of contested areas includes moral language, moral truth, moral knowledge, moral objectivity, moral psychology, and so on. These areas are not discrete but intermingle.

The moral realist may argue for the view that there are moral facts as follows:

(1) Moral sentences are sometimes true.

(2) A sentence is true only if the truth-making relation holds between it and the thing that makes it true.

(3) Thus, true moral sentences are true only because there holds the truth-making relation between them and the things that make them true.


(4) The things that make some moral sentences true must exist.

It is a short inference from the existence of the things that make some moral sentences true to the existence of moral facts.

The moral antirealist can respond to the argument by denying any of the three premises. The antirealist could be a non-descriptivist in rejecting premise (1): no moral sentences are true for they do not describe how the world is; or, she may reject a version of the correspondence theory of truth by denying premise (2): she may argue that a sentence can be true even if there holds no truth-making relation between it and the thing that makes it true. For instance, she may be a proponent of the coherence theory of truth, which holds that a sentence can be true only when there is a truth making relation between it and other sentences relevant to it. Or, she may even reject as illegitimate the inference from “things that make some moral sentences true” to the “existence of moral facts.”

In the past, many antirealists were noncognitivists, holding that moral judgments are not cognitive states like ordinary beliefs: that is, antirealists hold that unlike beliefs, the essential function or aim of moral judgments is not to represent the world accurately. (A non-descriptivist claim is that cognitivism —more specifically descriptivism— is necessary, but not sufficient for moral realism, as will be shown presently.) Moral judgments are, according to the noncognitivist, mental states of some other kind: they are emotions, desires, or intentions of the sort that are expressed by commands or prescriptions.

If moral judgments are expressed by commands or prescriptions, then there cannot be literal moral truths. (Cf. Wright 1993. He argues that the focal discussion in the realist/antirealist debate should be about the acceptable theories of truth.) If there are no literal moral truths, then no moral judgments may be cited as evidence for knowing how the world is. Moral knowledge can no longer be considered as descriptive or propositional; or, no one is justified in believing certain things about the world in making moral judgments. This illustrates how the noncognitivist analysis of moral judgments can be escalated into the antirealist rejection of (those good names that we take for granted when we participate in moral practices such as) “moral truths” and “moral knowledge.” The antirealist’s noncognitivism threatens moral objectivity as well. Objectivity is to be found within the world. If moral judgments are not about accurately describing the world —for example, if moral judgments are about us —then moral objectivity will not be found within the world. If moral objectivity is to be found within us, then it is not the same objectivity with which we began, or, so had been the old antirealist’s way.

a. Cognitivism

If it is noncognitivism that provides the antirealist a way of rejecting moral truth, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity, the denial of noncognitivism (that is, cognitivism) must be necessary for the realist to properly claim them. Cognitivism is the view that moral judgments are cognitive states just like ordinary beliefs. It is part of their function to describe the world accurately. The realist argument that stems from cognitivism — as we saw from the above argument— is oftentimes guided by the apparent difficulties that the noncognitivist analysis of moral judgments faces. For instance, there is the famous Frege-Geach problem, namely, the noncognitivist difficulty of rendering emotive, prescriptive or projective meaning for embedded moral judgments.

Geach (1965) uses the “the Frege point,” according to which “a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition,” to establish that no noncognitivist (“the anti-descriptive theorist”) analysis of moral sentences and utterances can be adequate.

Consider a simple moral sentence: “Setting a kitten on fire is wrong.” Suppose that the simple sentence means, “Boo to setting a kitten on fire!” The Frege point dictates that the antecedent of “if setting a kitten on fire is wrong, then getting one’s friends to help setting a kitten on fire is also wrong” must mean the same as the simple sentence. But this cannot be because the antecedent of the conditional makes no such assertions while the simple moral sentence does. In other words, the noncognitivist analysis of moral sentences cannot be given to the conditional sentences with the embedded simple moral sentence. The problem can be generally applied to cases of other compound sentences such as “It is wrong to set a kitten on fire, or it is not.” Even if the noncognitivist analysis of the simple sentence were correct, compound sentences within which a simple moral sentence is embedded should be given an analysis independently of the noncognitivist analysis of it. This seems unacceptable to many. For the following argument is valid: “It is wrong to set a kitten on fire, or it is not; it is not ‘not wrong’; hence, it is wrong to set a kitten on fire.” If the argument is valid, then the conclusion must mean the same as one of the disjuncts of its first premise. The argument would be otherwise invalid because of an equivocation, and the noncognitivist seems to be forced to say that the argument is invalid.

The Frege-Geach problem demonstrates the noncognitivists’ requirement of adequately rendering emotive, prescriptive, expressive, or projective meaning of those moral sentences that are embedded within compound moral sentences. (For more on the Frege-Geach problem, see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics. See also Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992: 151-52.)

The cognitivist understanding of moral judgments is at the center of moral realism. For the cognitivist, moral judgments are mental states; moral judgments are of the same kind as ordinary beliefs, that is, cognitive states. But how are we to know this? One manageable way is to focus on what we intend to do when we make moral judgments, and also on how we express them. Moral judgments are intended to be accurate descriptions of the world, and statements express moral judgments (as opposed to command or prescription) just as statements express ordinary beliefs. That is, statements express moral language. The statements that express moral judgments are either true or false just as the statements that express ordinary beliefs are. Moral truths occur when our signs match the world.

Language allows us to communicate with one another, typically using sentences and utterances. A large part of language involves, among many other things, influencing others and us. Normative language, in contrast with descriptive language, includes moral language (that is, moral language is part of evaluative or normative language). It is even more important not to be swayed by moral language because moral reality grips us. It is bad that others try to deceive us, but it is worse that we deceive ourselves into accepting moral facts simply because of the language that we use. That is, moral language — if it is not to describe the world —must not be mistaken as descriptive. Moral language binds us in a certain manner, and the manner in which it binds us is important.

i. Descriptivism

Moral language and descriptive language share the same syntactic structure. “Sam is good” predicates a kind of goodness to Sam just as “Sam is four-legged” predicates having four legs to her. “Being good” as in “being good is being able to bear one’s own scrutiny” and “having four legs” as in “having for legs is not required of being a dog” are both noun-like phrases. Again, to say, “If Sam is good, then she will be able to bear her own scrutiny,” illustrates that moral predication could be embedded to form a compound sentence just as descriptive predication could. We use both parts of language with an equal ease. Almost all of us are proficient in using moral language. Most of us understand what others express with it; and, we are expected to have understood what moral language means. Few people would apply the term “morally permissible” to an apparent case of wanton cruelty. Furthermore, moral language is governed by the same fundamental rules of logic as descriptive language. For instance, one and the same action cannot be good and bad at the same time. (The philosophical rejection of moral facts remains popular, although this focal reliance on the logico-linguistic aspect of the moral practices is no longer fashionable. See Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992, especially p. 123.)

From this, must we then infer that there are entities like “moral goodness” and “obligation” to which moral language refers in the world? Are the three characteristics of structural similarity between moral and descriptive languages, the equal ease with which we employ them, and the logical interplay between them good enough reasons for thinking that there are moral facts? Is it not possible that our ways of influencing others and ourselves are exactly where syntax and semantics of our language betray us and, consequently, that moral language suffers from a lack of referents analogous to terms such as “nothing,” the “present king of France,” do?

Either moral language describes (or, it is intended to describe accurately) the world or it does not. According to descriptivists, moral language describes the world. The descriptivist position has been thought as the mark of moral realism, while the non-descriptivist position as that of antirealism. This is captured as follows:

(C1) S is a moral realist if and only if S is a moral descriptivist.

So while one may hold that there are no moral facts, according to C1, one may not at the same time hold that moral language describes or is intended to describe the world. Again, one may not hold both that there are moral facts but that our languages about them do not describe the world. For if C1 were true, being a moral realist and being a descriptivist about moral language are logically equivalent. So any non-descriptivist realism and any descriptivist antirealism would show that C1 is false. The possibilities will be discussed shortly in §2 and §3. Descriptivism and, hence, the truth-aptness of moral language. is discussed in more detail in what follows. (Ignored for the moment is what Blackburn calls “quietism” according to which “at some particular point the debate is not a real one, and that we are only offered, for instance, metaphors and images from which we can profit as we please” 1984, 146. One may claim quietism to be present in pretty much any important and interesting philosophical dispute, like “primary versus secondary, fact versus value, description versus expression, or of any other significant kind” 1998, 157. Quietism about whether moral language describes the world, if true, would render the traditional realism/antirealism debate over descriptivism as a dispute over no difference where there is nothing more than “the celebration of the seamless web of language” 1998, 157.)

Descriptivism in meta-ethics is a cognitivist view, according to which moral language describes (or, is intended to describe) the world. (Cf. Horgan and Timmons 2000, 124. This rough definition, according to them, falls under the dogma of the “[mistaken] semantic assumption: All genuinely cognitive content is descriptive content.” Conflating descriptivism with cognitivism is, according to them, “a largely unquestioned dogma.”) An inevitable corollary of descriptivism is that moral language is apt to truth evaluation; that is, statements express moral judgments that are either true or false. We may say alternatively that moral sentences express propositions without affecting the result of the discussion. As Nicholas Sturgeon puts it, “moral [sentences] typically express [statements] capable of truth and falsity” (1986, 116). Strictly speaking, then, descriptivism says little about, and remains neutral with respect to, the two views in moral epistemology: there are moral statements that are known to be true. Descriptivism does not tell us whether there is any moral statement known to be true. Nor does it tell us anything about the things by virtue of which moral statements are true when they are true. (Cf. Skorupski 1999. He thinks that descriptivism in conjunction without a substantial theory of truth is no descriptivism at all. There is just a terminological difference, and the descriptivism in conjunction with a substantial theory of truth will be discussed in section 2.)

The moral descriptivist believes that moral statements express moral judgments, and that they are either true or false. If every sentence that is capable of truth-value describes the world, then so does every moral statement. Moral language describes the world because every truth-apt sentence describes, or is intended to describe the world. The non-descriptivist denies that. The non-descriptivist believes that moral statements do not express moral judgments. Rather, the non-descriptivist believes that moral judgments are expressed by commands or prescriptions. Neither commands nor prescriptions are truth-apt, and as a result they typically are not meant to describe the world. Moral language does not describe the world, according to the non-descriptivist. That is, it represents our wishes, preferences, emotions, and so on, but it represents nothing over and above them. Figure 1 illustrates the disagreement between the descriptivist and the non-descriptivist. (Definite antirealist positions are marked with the dotted boxes in the figures that follow. An oval box will mark definite realist positions. See figure 5.)

Figure 1

Non-descriptivists disagree about exactly what moral language accomplishes, while they are unanimous about what it does not. G. E. Moore’s open question argument supports emotivism, a non-descriptivism contrary to his intention in the beginning of the 20th century. A. J. Ayer and C. L. Stevenson argue that moral judgments express feelings of approval or disapproval, or that making moral judgments is equivalent to emoting in reference to behaviors of others and ours. (See Ayer 1952 and Stevenson 1937, 1944, and 1963.) Stevenson says that, “Mr. G. E. Moore’s familiar objection about the open question is chiefly pertinent in this regard. No matter what set of scientifically knowable properties a thing may have (says Moore, in effect), you will find, on careful introspection, that it is an open question to ask whether anything having these properties is good,” (1937, 18). R. M. Hare’s universal prescriptivism, according to which “‘ought’-judgments are prescriptive like plain imperatives, but differ from them in being universalizable” (1991, 457) emphasizes that moral language facilitates ways of prescribing actions for all of us. The norm-expressivism of Allen Gibbard has renewed arguments for non-descriptivism recently. Rejecting emotivism, Gibbard,1990, holds that moral judgments are concerned about rational-to-have or justified moral sentiments, not just about feelings or preferences one has. Apparently, he holds that some moral feelings can be called rational-to-have or justified. It is when “one’s acceptance of norms that permit the feeling” (Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton: 1992, 150-51) is expressed, a feeling may be called rational-to-have. So while moral judgments (and moral language) are expressive of what we accept as norms, namely, a state of mind, they are not about describing the world, namely, non-descriptivism about moral judgment and language. Blackburn’s projectivism seems difficult to classify one way or another especially when it is considered in conjunction with his quasi-realism (Blackburn: 1984, 1993, and 1998). Moral language according to the projectivist lets us spin our own story onto the world. Non-descriptivists agree, nonetheless, that moral language is the tool of choice when we are panting for help, recommending a course of actions, passing judgments on what others do, and so on, but it is never the tool for describing the world.

The views discussed above can be illustrated with an example. Consider the moral sentence, “Petal ought to avoid eating too much.” The utterance of the sentence expresses the speaker’s judgment about Petal and perhaps about her tendency to the excessive consumption of food. The cognitivist holds that the speaker’s judgment is of the same kind as ordinary beliefs, that is the cognitivist holds that the speaker’s moral judgment is a cognitive state. Beliefs are representations of how things are, namely, possible states of affairs; and, language typically expresses beliefs. According to the cognitivist, then, the moral sentence that expresses the moral judgment represents a possible state of affairs. We may say that the descriptivist maintains that the moral sentence describes what ought to be the case about Petal and her tendency toward food. Petal could be instantiating the property of the “oughtness” of avoiding the excessive consumption of food, although this is not the only cognitivist way of maintaining her descriptivism about moral language. Just as the morning star refers to Venus, the linguistic item “ought to avoid eating too much” may refer to a moral property. It might even be maintained that there obtains the referential relation between moral expressions and the things in the world that they are supposed to pick out.

Noncognitivists hold that the speaker’s judgment in saying, “Petal ought to avoid eating too much,” is not of the same kind as cognitive states. Some noncognitivists go further and deny that the moral sentence represents a possible state of affairs. That is, some noncognitivists are non-descriptivists as well. The non-descriptivists maintain that the surface structure of moral language—and the logical interplay it displays within our use of it—is not a good guide in understanding what moral language does for us (and what we intend to do with it). The word “nothing” picks out no object whatsoever, although it serves as a grammatical subject; the definite description the “present King of France” refers to no one, although its article “the” indicates a unique satisfier of the description, and so on. These are familiar cases (of our language betraying us ontologically). So, part of the non-descriptivist claim is that moral language ontologically manipulates us just as “nothing” and the “present king of France” do. The merit of the view according to which there lurks a deeper structure (or meaning) to our moral language must be judged on how successful the non-descriptivist construal of the sentence about Petal is.

The non-descriptivist construal of “Petal ought to avoid eating too much” varies. Emotivism construes it as the way of emoting the speaker’s disapproval of Petal’s excessive consumption of food, or the way of informing Petal of her feeling. The expressivist construes it as the speaker’s way of expressing her preference with regard to Petal’s eating habit. The prescriptivist construes it as the way of commanding Petal to not eat excessively. The norm-expressivist construes it as the way of expressing the speaker’s non-acceptance of the norms that allow such a consumption of food. Perhaps the projectivist would construe the statement about Petal as a way of “objectifying” the speaker’s disapproval. However, all reject that there is a dyadic relationship of reference or correspondence, between the moral sentence and how the world is. The dyadic relation has all but been reduced to the monothetic relation of showing/manifesting the speaker’s psychological state. (The truth of this does not entail that people do not believe in moral principles. A. J. Ayer says that “[t]o say…that these moral judgments are merely expressive of certain feelings, feelings of approval or disapproval, is an over simplification” 1954, 238.) Figure 2 diagrams the non-descriptivist positions.

Figure 2

The contrast between descriptivism and non-descriptivism seems inapt for Gilbert Harman’s relativism because his relativism is a definite moral antirealist position. He rejects the objective status of moral facts. (See his 1977, 1986, and 2000; see also Harman and Thomson 1996 in which an interesting discussion of reasons both for and against moral objectivity is presented.) The relativist maintains that there are some ethical questions that can be correctly answered with “yes” for one, and “no” for another. Her claim implies nothing concerning for what moral language is meant. Error theorists maintain that moral judgments systematically err by positing moral facts. (For instance, Mackie says that “[t]he assertion that there are objective values or intrinsically prescriptive entities or features of some kind, which ordinary moral judgments presuppose is, I hold it not meaningless but false” 1977, 40.) That is, moral language aims to get the world right, but it always misses the mark. Mackie’s error theory in this respect occupies an important niche between the sides of the descriptivism divide and the sides of the moral realism divide. Figure 3 incorporates projectivism, relativism, and error theories, into figures 1 and 2.

Figure 3

The ontological ramification of accepting descriptivism (or, cognitivism) is not inevitably moral realism. Figure 3 indicates that descriptivism is not sufficient for moral realism. Mackie’s error theory is discussed in §2 in establishing the insufficiency. Blackburn’s projectivism, and John Skorupski’s “irrealist cognitivism” will be very briefly discussed as well. Descriptivism is nonetheless necessary for moral realism. The necessity is argued in §3 when Bruce Waller’s “megaethical level” is considered and rejected. That is, a conjunct of C1 will be shown to be false while the other conjunct of C1 will be shown to be true, thereby making the conjunction C1 false; more specifically, it will be shown that “if S is a moral descriptivist, thenS is a moral realist” is false and it will be shown that “S is a moral realist only if S is a moral descriptivist” is true.

ii. Mackie’s Error Theory

Is it true that S is a moral realist if and only if S is a descriptivist? That is, is C1 true? Any coherent descriptivist antirealism would establish that C1 is false. Another way that C1 could be shown to be false is to establish the possibility of non-descriptivist realism. The insufficiency of descriptivism will be established in this section. The realist territory, as it were, will not be properly marked by descriptivism.

Consider Mackie’s remark that:

The assertion that there are objective values or intrinsically prescriptive entities or features of some kind, which ordinary moral judgments presuppose is, I hold it not meaningless but false (1977, 40).

Moral judgments are false, or so the above-quoted passage reads. But why are they all false? It is because there are no entities to which moral language refers. Moral language purports to describe things that are not there. According to Mackie, it is a (perpetual) error to suppose that there are moral entities, thus, the name “error theory.” Mackie’s error theory is a prima facie descriptivist antirealist position: it maintains that there are no moral facts. In addition he accepts that moral judgments are meant to describe the world. Is this combination of moral antirealism and descriptivism plausible? Blackburn certainly thinks that it is not.

Blackburn, whose own view seems to be indeterminate between descriptivism and non-descriptivism, thinks that Mackie’s error theory is inconsistent. This is partly because of the apparent difficulty in attributing a pervasive systematic error to our making moral judgments. As Blackburn puts it, “[T]he puzzle is why, in the light of the error theory, Mackie did not at least indicate how a shmoral vocabulary [that is, a moral vocabulary cleansed of its ontological error] would look, and why he did not himself go on only to shmoralize, not to moralize.” According to Blackburn, this is so seriously puzzling that Mackie’s failure to shmoralize “in itself suggests that no error can be incorporated in mere use of those concepts” (1985, 2).

To try avoiding the pervasive and systematic error should appear reasonable to those who were aware of it. But Mackie seemed “quite happy to go on to express a large number of straightforward moral views [namely, to moralize rather than to shmoralize]” (Blackburn 1985, 1).

Does Blackburn’s charge establish that Mackie’s antirealism and descriptivism combination is inconsistent? No, it does not. What Blackburn demands of Mackie is the consistent deployment of his meta-ethical view in his moral practice. But to lead a moral life strictly according to one’s meta-ethical view requires heroic efforts. Try imagining an error theorist deploying his meta-ethical views when it comes to the existence of an external world! She cannot help but conduct her business as if it is no error in thinking that there exists a world external to her. It is impossible for her to show that it is an error to believe in the existence of such a world. More generally, the second-order beliefs on the first-order moral practices are rarely made explicit. Everyday moral practices (within which Mackie continues to moralize) are not a translucent showcase for meta-ethical views. So, Blackburn fails to establish that descriptivist antirealism is inconsistent. That is, Blackburn should expect no explicit display of Mackie’s error-theoretic commitments.

Blackburn’s projectivism may qualify for the descriptivist antirealism. (Blackburn’s descriptivism will be discussed in §2 of section 1.2 in more detail.) Moral language has content, according to Blackburn, but the content is not determined by the world. The content of moral language is determined rather by what “the mind [expresses as] a reaction by ‘spreading itself on the world’” (Blackburn 1984, 75). That moral language has content suggests that part of its function is to accurately describe the world. At the same time, Blackburn’s projectivism is an antirealist position because he maintains that the content is somehow “written” by us.

There are other recent theories that result from explicit attempts at combining descriptivism and antirealism. Hatzimoysis says “a minimalist conception of truth fits the bill of antirealist cognitivism in ethics.” (See for example, Hatzimoysis 1997, 448.) Skorupski’s “irrealist cognitivism” is one such theory. He argues for it by denying “all content is factual content” (1999, 438).

The fact that moral language expresses cognitive states, that is, that moral language has descriptive content, according to Skorupski does not guarantee the existence of moral facts; nor does it justify belief in the existence of moral facts. (Cf. Horgan and Timmons 2000. They distinguish three different kinds of content: declarative, cognitive, and descriptive.) Skorupski says that “normative claims are truth-apt contents of cognition…but their truth is not a matter of correspondence or representation” (1999, 436). The truth-apt fragment of language is truth-apt because of its descriptive content. So the first conjunct of Skorupski’s remark is descriptivist. But when moral language is true (or false), it is so not because it corresponds to the world: there is nothing that answers to moral language. That is, Skorupski rejects the existence of moral facts, and his position is hence antirealism.

Is Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism consistent? Descriptivism by no means entails the correspondence theory of truth, and Skorupski’s antirealism is based solely on his denial of the correspondence theory of truth. Irrealist cognitivism is hence consistent.

Mackie’s error theory, Blackburn’s projectivism, and Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism are instances of descriptivist antirealism. We may then conclude that moral descriptivism is not sufficient for moral realism. But is it a necessary condition for moral realism? If it is, then we may hope to mark the proper realist territory by adding additional necessary conditions. (My emphasis on consistency of maintaining both descriptivism and antirealism is not meant to suggest that a descriptivism/non-descriptivism debate as represented by, say, the Frege-Geach problem which claims that embedded moral language appears to have descriptive contents rather than emotive, prescriptive or projective content, is not as important and relevant to the realism/antirealism debate. See Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992, especially pp. 151-152.) The necessity of descriptivism for realism will be discussed in the following section. Another conjunct of C1, “S is a moral realist only if Sis a descriptivist” will be examined.

iii. Waller’s Megaethical Level

Few philosophers take the noncognitivist realist position seriously. For instance, Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988, 9-14) dismisses it quickly as inconsistent. But noncognitivist realism is certainly a logical possibility. In this section, we shall examine Waller’s arguments for its tenability.

Waller’s noncognitivism is attenuated: moral judgments are not cognitive states when no fundamental common values are in place. He says “noncognitivism insists that when fundamental value conflicts arise and basic value questions are posed, then the disputes and values are noncognitive” (1994, 63). Statements only express moral judgments when an assumed set of common fundamental values is present. Waller’s remark that “such independent moral conversion is evidence in favor of moral realism and against noncognitivism” sounds inconsistent with the label of his theory “noncognitivist moral realism.” (See his 1992, 129.) Waller’s remark makes it seem as if moral realism and noncognitivism are contradictory to each other. Waller’s strategy is to distinguish the “megaethical” level from the level where there are uncontested fundamental values. This allows Waller to maintain that at one level “the moral facts are internally real,” but at another level, namely, the megaethical level, “[the moral facts] are ideal” (1994, 67). Waller’s divide-and-conquer strategy entitles him to either cognitivist moral realism at the level of assumed values, or noncognitivist antirealism at the megaethical level. So Waller’s “noncognitivist realism” fails as a noncognitivist realist position. We may then conclude that cognitivism (or, descriptivism) is necessary for moral realism. Cognitivism, the view that moral judgments are cognitive states like ordinary beliefs (with its two corollaries, namely, descriptivism and their truth-aptness), could facilitate the realist/antirealist debate, but cognitivism alone is not sufficient in facilitating the discussion, not solely in its terms anyway.

The necessity of cognitivism for realism may lead us to expect that specifying additional necessary conditions for realism could mark the proper realist territory. Cognitivism combined with some substantial theory of truth is taken up next.

b. Truth in Moral Judgments

Moral statements express judgments, and for some, moral statements describe the world. But moral realism is not present everywhere cognitivism (or, descriptivism) is present. That is, cognitivism and descriptivism, which had once crystallized the realism/antirealism debate, no longer do so. Crispin Wright’s recommendation that “moral anti-realists, for instance, should grant that moral judgments are apt for truth and falsity” (1993, 65) illuminates more recent discussions of the subject. Mackie’s error theory (1977), Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism (1999), and perhaps Blackburn’s projectivism (for example, 1984) illustrate, as we saw earlier, the possibility of consistently combining cognitivism with antirealism.

An error theorist maintains her antirealism by insisting that moral judgments involve a pervasive error. No moral judgments are true, according to the error theorist, although they are truth-apt because they purport to describe the world. Moral realists part company with the error theorists over truth in moral judgments: some moral judgments are true. Still, this is not sufficient for moral realism. The projectivist functioning as a quasi-realist and Skorupski should be able to claim that some moral judgments are true. Moral truths can be literal or figurative; and, they can be the matter of correspondence or coherence (coherence with other already held beliefs stands in here for the range of “modified characteristics” of truth). Figure 4 illustrates this point:

Figure 4

Deflationist theorists of truth reject that the truth-predicate “is true” adds to the meaning of linguistic items. For instance, “snow is white” and “‘snow is white’ is true,” mean, according to them, the same. Deflationist theories include F. P. Ramsey’s redundancy theory of truth (or, the prosentential theory of truth) and Paul Horwich’s more recent minimalism. Inflationist (substantive or robust) theorists of truth, in contrast with deflationists, maintain that truth is a real and important linguistic item. Inflationist theories include the correspondence theory of truth, the coherence theory of truth, and the so-called pragmatic theory of truth. Inflationists disagree not only about the nature of the property of truth, but also disagree about the bearers of the property truth.

i. An Analogy

Consider the judgment, “Suffering from lack of food is bad.” The judgment is usually expressed with the statement “suffering from lack of food is bad.” Call it a “B-statement.” Sometimes, we find it necessary to express it with “it is true that suffering from lack of food is bad.” Call it a “T-statement.” (To complete it, there are “F-statements” like “it is false that suffering from lack of food is bad.”) We use T-statements to emphasize partiality toward “being true to the world.” However, regardless of what motivates us to use T-statements, the explicit ascription of truth in T-statements commands our attention. Does the T-statement add anything extra to the B-statement? If so, what is it that the T-statement says over and above the B-statement?

There are two broad ways to answer the question: deflationism and various forms of substantial theory (or what we called above “inflationist theory”). Substantial theorists deny that the B-statement and the T-statement are exactly the same while the deflationist maintains that the difference is merely stylistic. If the deflationist has her way, then it is obvious that antirealists could have truth in moral judgments. (David Brink argues against the coherentist theory of truth with respect to moral constructivism. See Brink 1989, 106-7 and 114; see Tenenbaum, 1996, for the deflationist approach.) Antirealist moral truths would seem irrelevant in marking the realist territory. If some form of substantial theory is true, then the T-statement adds something to what the B-statements say. Here are two alternatives.

Letting a coherence theory of truth stand in for the range of “modified theories” (namely, the inflationist theories of truth that are different from the correspondence theory of truth), and the “B-proposition” for what the B-statement describes about the world, the T-statement adds that:

(1) The B-proposition corresponds to an actual state of affairs.

(2) The B-proposition belongs to a maximally coherent system of belief.

It is worth noting also that even the non-descriptivist may say that the T-statement adds to the B-statement, insofar as the B-statement expresses something other than the B-proposition. The non-descriptivist has two alternatives as well.

The T-statement adds that (letting a coherence theory of truth stand in for the range of “modified theories,” and the “B-feeling-proposition” stand in for the range of non-descriptivism, for example, the speaker dislikes suffering from lack of food):

(3) The B-feeling-proposition corresponds to an actual state of affairs.

(4) The B-feeling-proposition belongs to a maximally coherent system of belief. We may say that the T-statement specifies truth conditions for the B-proposition or for the B-feeling-proposition. It could be objected that the non-descriptivist must deny that there are truth-conditions for moral language. Nonetheless, she need not object to moral language describing something about the world figuratively.

If option (1) were true, then there would have to be an actual state of affairs that makes the B-statement true. That is, there must be a truth-maker for the statement, “suffering from lack of food is bad,” and the truth-maker is the fact that suffering from lack of food is bad. But no other alternatives require the existence of the fact for them to be true.

If one ignores deflationism, truth in moral judgments gives rise to exactly four alternative theories of truth. Realists cannot embrace options (3) and (4) because, as we saw, non-descriptivism is sufficient for moral antirealism. The remaining option (2), although it is a viable option for the realist, falls short of guaranteeing that there are moral facts. In other words, moral realists must find other ways to establish the existence of moral facts, even if option (2) allows a way of maintaining moral truths for the realists. Modified theories, for example, the coherence theory of truth are simply silent about whether there are B-facts. That is, option (2) could be maintained even if there were no B-facts such as suffering from lack of food is bad. Thus, the most direct option for realists in marking her territory from the above list of alternatives is (1). It appears then that the correspondence truth in moral judgments properly marks the realist territory. This is captured in C2:

(C2) S is a moral realist if and only if S is a descriptivist; S believes that moral judgments express truth, and S believes that the moral judgments are true when they correspond to the world.

Is C2 true? No, it is not. For the antirealist may choose to deny that moral judgments literally describe the world. This is how Skorupski earns his antirealist title.

ii. Skorupski’s Irrealist Cognitivism

If C2 were true, then there could not be any cognitivist antirealist who believes that some moral judgments are true, and who also holds that moral truth is a matter of correspondence to the world. However, Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism qualifies as one such position.

Skorupski maintains that moral judgments have truth-apt contents, but he denies that the contents of moral judgments are factual. Skorupski remarks “[normative language’s] truth is not a matter of correspondence or representation” (1999, 436). This remark may suggest that Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism is a variant of option (2) above about what the T-statement adds to the B-statement. Nonetheless, there is an extension of Skorupski’s theory that would consistently allow it to fall within option (1). This extension of Skorupski’s theory would be a cognitivist antirealist position, combined with a correspondence theory of truth.

Moral statements express moral judgments, and as such, moral statements can be either true or false. What makes moral statements true when they are true? Skorupski’s remark above rejects that correspondence to the world is the truth-making relation. As was mentioned, this rejection could indicate that Skorupski holds a modified theory of truth or a deflationist theory. Perhaps he does, but it is not explicit. What is explicit is Skorupski’s denial that moral judgments have factual contents. How is it possible that some moral judgments are true if moral judgments are not factual? One way to answer it—and to extend Skorupski’s irrealism—is to maintain that moral judgments are not literal. Moral judgments are still expressed by moral statements, but what moral statements describe are not moral states of affairs. Moral statements express states of affairs of the world other than moral ones. In this way, moral statements can be true by corresponding to the world, once moral statements are recognized as describing, for example, a psychological aspect of the world.

Consider the statement “Santa Claus came early last year.” Call it the S-statement. (The “S-statement,” “T-statement,” “S-proposition,” “S-feeling-proposition,” and cognates are used as “B-Statement”, “T-Statement,” “B-proposition”, “B-feeling-proposition” and its cognates are above.) Does the S-statement describe the world as it was last year? Surely, it does. It reports either that (1) there was at least one person whose image fits the description of Santa, or that (2) there was the giver of toys around Christmas. It reports also that the person in either case came earlier than other years. Children are delighted by Santa’s early appearance in primarily the sense of (2). And they wonder, “Will Santa come early this year as well?” Similarly, children reason, “If Santa comes early, I will have an early Christmas present.” Of course, very few us of are Santa realists, although most of us are cognitivists about the S-statement in either sense.

How are adults able to maintain both cognitivism about the S-statement (more specifically descriptivism about it) and antirealism about Santa facts in the sense of S-statement (1)? Adults acknowledge the existence of surrogate toy-givers, while denying that the S-statement expresses the S-proposition in the sense of (1), namely, adults deny that there was at least one person whose image fits the description of Santa. Instead, adults believe that the S-statement expresses the S-feeling-proposition, or something equivalent to it. This is how one maintains antirealist cognitivism about Santa judgments.

There are many garden-variety Santa judgments. Santa judgments are expressed by Santa-statements, but no Santa-statements express the S-proposition. The S-statement does not involve the state of affairs in which there is the person whose name is Santa Claus. Nonetheless, the S-statement could be either true or false. Suppose that it is true, that Santa did come early last year, but suppose that we are also not realists about Santa Claus. We know better than those who are perplexed by the existence of people who fit perfectly the descriptions of Santa. We know that the S-statement does not say anything about a person named Santa Claus. For most, the S-statement is never about Santa, but rather it is about, for example, the toy-givers, the state of one’s national economy, and so on. That is, we deny that the S-statement expresses the S-proposition, however, this rejection does not force us to adopt deflationism or a modified theory of truth. The S-statement could express something true when it corresponds with the world as long as it expresses something other than the S-proposition. For instance, the S-statement expresses something true if the S-statement expresses the fact that the state of the national economy was good last year, and if the state of the national economy last year was actually good: in this case the S-statement expresses something true when it correctly reports the economy of last year. There is no inconsistency.

Analogously, moral statements express moral judgments. Insofar as moral statements are understood as expressing psychological facts about the world, moral statements can be true or false. Some “moral” statements are true in this way. Furthermore, they are true because they correspond to the world. Even if this is not Skorupski’s theory, it is an extension of his theory that instantiates cognitivist antirealism, combined with a correspondence theory of truth. This shows that C2 is false.

iii. The Correspondence Theory Requires Realism, Not Vice Versa

Our previous discussion of Skorupski’s cognitivist irrealism gives no details about the correspondence theory of truth it employs. It might be objected that such lack makes it impossible to judge whether or not Skorupski’s theory, or an extension of it, constitutes a counterexample to C2. But the “correspondence theory” is ambiguous between the general conception of truth that appeals to correspondence as the truth-making relation, and the very detailed analysis of truth that satisfactorily specifies the notion of truth in terms of the correspondence relation. As the general conception, the correspondence theory of truth is insufficient for moral realism. Antirealists are entitled to the correspondent truth of moral judgments insofar as moral judgments are understood “figuratively.” For as the general conception, the correspondence theory of truth imposes “for any proposition , it is true that just in case there is a way things could be such that anyone who believed, doubted, etc. that would believe, doubt, etc. that things were that way, and things are that way” (Wright 1999, 218). Apparently, the conception “offers little more than a long-hand version of the correspondence platitude,” and it “certainly carries no direct implications for the realism debate in its modern conception” because “there is so far no commitment to any specific general conception of the kind of relations that may be involved in truth, or of the nature of the non-propositional items in their fields” (Wright 1999, 223-24). On the other hand, as analysis, the correspondence theory perhaps is too strong for realism. The latter point will not be discussed further as our purpose here is to establish the non-sufficiency and the non-necessity of the correspondence theory of truth for moral realism. It seems reasonable to suppose that Skorupski’s irrealist cognitivism, or an extension of it, constitutes a counterexample to C2 as the general conception of correspondence theory of truth.

To sum up, consider the following five claims:

  1. The correspondence theory of truth is false or implausible.
  2. The correspondence theory of truth requires the truth of realism.
  3. The correspondence theory of truth is not required for realism (and no particular theory of truth is).
  4. “The correspondence theory of truth in conjunction with cognitivism” is not sufficient for realism.
  5. “The correspondence theory of truth in conjunction with cognitivism and the correspondence (truth) of moral judgments” is not sufficient for realism.

The discussion of Skorupski’s (extended) antirealism aims at establishing claim (5), but since (5) implies (4) there is no need for independently establishing claim (4). Claim (1) is apparently bold, controversial, and not required for our purpose. Claim (2) seems false: an error theorist like Mackie is a moral antirealist, however, he may adopt a correspondence theory of truth and not contradict his particular brand of moral antirealism. Furthermore, claim (2) is not required for our purpose either. To properly mark the realist territory, we need not determine if the correspondence theory of truth— whether one considers it to be general theory or analysis—requires realism. Finally, claim (3) seems at least OK, and it is relevant to our goal. The T-statement discussed above, namely the T-statement that “‘Santa came early last year’ belongs to a maximally coherent system of beliefs,” shows that realists, moral or otherwise, are not forced to accept the correspondence theory of truth. That said, if moral realists opt for moral truths of the non-correspondence kind, then they would have to find other ways of establishing the existence of moral facts.

c. Literal Moral Truth?

In the previous section, it is proposed that one need not be a moral realist if she is a cognitivist that believes moral judgments express moral truths and that the truths they express are truths because of a correspondence between the judgments and facts in the world. The argument might attract the following response: such an antirealist position appears possible simply because it involves denying that there are any literal truths in moral discourse; even if cognitivism and moral truths that are obtained by employing a revisionary theory of meaning are considered to not be adequate for moral realism, then cognitivism and moral truths that are obtained on a literal understanding of moral language should be considered adequate for moral realism. This section offers replies to such a potential response.

Consider again the Santa statement, “Santa Claus came early last year.” An antirealist may construe it as saying

The national economy last year was good, and the economic boom was manifested by consumer confidence.

Consequently, the antirealist can say that because the S-statement expresses the S-feeling-proposition about the national economy and consumer confidence, nothing prevents the antirealist from adopting a correspondence conception of truth. Children, of course, insist that the S-statement is literal, that is, it expresses the S-proposition, “Santa Claus came early last year.” If the S-statement were to be taken literally, no antirealist could hold both that there are some Santa truths and that those Santa truths are matters of correspondence to the world. Santa antirealists cannot acknowledge any Santa fact if such an acknowledgement presupposes the existence of Santa, the person. The S-statement obviously express something other than the S-proposition, but is it the same with moral judgments and statements?

The preceding discussion signals a shift in the realist/antirealist debate. The literal meaning of moral language now comes to the fore of the discussion. We seem to have run a full circle. The non-descriptivist and the non-cognitivist point out that moral language may manipulate us ontologically because it misleads us into thinking that moral statements describe the world: obviously, the Santa statement cannot be taken literally. Even if it is unreasonable to insist on the literal interpretation of the S-statement, the same cannot be maintained with an equal confidence about moral statements. It is not obvious that moral language must not be taken literally. We are certain that there is no such living person as Santa Claus: that is why we can be certain that the S-statement cannot be taken literally. Nonetheless, with respect to moral statements, the existence of moral facts is exactly the issue. As a result, we cannot be as certain about moral language as we are about the S-statement that it must not be taken literally.

Granted, one of the most deeply rooted realist and antirealist disagreements has been whether moral language expresses things literally. Should moral language be taken literally or in some revisionist fashion? Skorupski, an antirealist cognitivist, must maintain that moral language describes the world, yet it does not do so literally. For instance, it expresses our ways of influencing others and ourselves. Realists, on the other hand, must maintain that moral language describes the world, and it does so literally. Moral language comes with shades of normativity, but that does not entail that moral language cannot be taken literally. Instead, the logico-linguistic considerations prove that moral language is no different from ordinary declarative statements that express ordinary beliefs. How are we to decide between the two? Does “species-ism is as (morally) bad as racism” express whatever it expresses literally? Is it even feasible to apply literalism, in the first place, to the realist/antirealist debate?

Surely, it is difficult to decide between the two above-mentioned alternatives. Language allows many things for us. For example, people sometimes disagree about whether an utterance expresses a genuine question or whether it expresses an assertion (in the form of a rhetorical question). This indicates that it can be difficult to know when a statement is to be taken literally and when it is not. If literalism were to carry any weight for the realism/antirealism debate, then there should be some independent way of telling when a statement is to be taken literally. That is, literalism about moral language requires an independent footing. Furthermore, it is very difficult to imagine that the long and recalcitrant history of the realist/antirealist debate has been just about the literal meaning of moral language. We presumably understand what moral statements express, if only in a rudimentary fashion. The disagreement about literalism may help explain why moral realists and antirealists often seem to talk past each other. Nevertheless, attributing different meaning to moral terms fails to further our inquiry. At any rate, it does not seem feasible to make literalism a criterion for moral realism, especially when the difficulty associated with literalism about moral language is considered.

d. Moral Knowledge

Some moral judgments are literally true, but some truths are not known. It is sometimes thought that we get moral facts right, while others get them totally wrong. Is there any merit to such a claim? Does one ever know a certain moral judgments to be true? (Joel Kupperman asks, for instance, “[i]f there is some set of moral truths, or approximately correct moral beliefs, independent of our feelings, attitudes, or opinions, then how can we ever know that we have found or arrived at them?” 1988, 33.) We get some moral facts right sometimes, according to the realist. That is, we succeed in knowing certain moral judgments to be true. Moral realism implies some sort of literal success theory, and so moral knowledge is implied by it. Or, moral realism entails at least the possibility of such knowledge.

Moral realists hold that we can have justified true moral beliefs, or that we can have warranted moral beliefs, according to some post-Gettier theories of knowledge. (See, for instance, Alvin Plantinga’s discussion of “warrant.”; See Gettier, 1963, and Plantinga, 1993a and 1993b). Some moral antirealists deny this. For example, Mackie’s error theory insists that no moral judgments are known to be true because the moral statements that express them always describe the world falsely. It is impossible to know something false as true! Moral skeptics hold that no moral judgments are justified or warranted. The epistemic success claim at once provokes epistemological questions: under what conditions are we ever justified or warranted in holding moral beliefs? And, how can we truly say that we have correct moral facts?

In answer, some moral realists have adopted a coherentist theory of justification, while others have opted for foundationalism and intuitionism. For instance, David Brink adopts coherentism in defense of a naturalist version of moral realism. (See especially Brink 1989, 122-43.) Naturalistic epistemology also deserves a serious consideration. (Cf. Consider Jaegwon Kim’s worry of losing normativity. See Kim, 1988, and Quine, 1986.) Some theories of justification are able to accommodate moral knowledge more easily than others. A causal theory of knowledge and justification, for instance, is ill suited for the task. Alvin Goldman’s reliabilism may not be the best-suited theory for it either. (See Goldman, 1978, and 1986.) But it seems obvious that the belief that moral knowledge is possible can be maintained even with these externalist theories of justification. Consider, for instance, a version of reliabilism: S is justified in holding “that p” iff pis the result of a reliable cognitive process. One can be justified in holding that Doctor Evil is no good if the judgment results from a reliable cognitive process, say, for example, the cognitive process that results in Austin Powers being good.

The possibility of moral knowledge does not entail moral realism, even though moral realism entails moral knowledge. As was shown above, there is nothing to stop the moral antirealist from claiming moral knowledge once she helps herself to cognitivism, moral truths, and some theory of justification. On the other hand, moral realists need not be shy about adopting an externalist epistemology either. A naturalistic realist would hope that moral knowledge is on a par with empirical knowledge. The realist may even agree that the paradigm justification for empirical knowledge is perceptual and is thus causal. The moral realist would have to reject causal reductionism, according to which the causal power of the supervening facts is entirely reducible to that of base facts. Moral judgments are true just in case they correctly report the supervening facts that depend on the non-moral base facts.

e. Moral Objectivity

Moral realists maintain that some literal moral truths are known, or that we are justified in holding them. Moral judgments are true just in case they correctly report the supervening facts that depend on the non-moral base facts. But are moral facts—the supposed truth-makers of moral judgments—objective? It could be the case that no ethical judgments are true independently of the desires or emotions that we happen to have, or, there could be different yet valid answers to the same ethical question as ethical relativists insist. Neither subjectivists nor relativists are obliged to deny that there is literal moral knowledge. Of course, according to them, moral truths imply truths about human psychology. Moral realists must maintain that moral truths —and hence moral knowledge—do not depend on facts about our desires and emotions for their truth. For instance, W. D. Falk analyzes the good as “a dispositional property of things as ideally assessed, a power to evoke favor by way of an ideal assessment” (Piker 1995, 102). Having objective literal moral knowledge seems to be sufficient for moral realism because no moral antirealists would acknowledge the possibility of such knowledge. Figure 5 summarizes the results of the discussion from 1.1-1.5.

Figure 5

We finally arrive at the definite moral realist position, which is marked by the oval box above. The combination of cognitivism, descriptivism, success theory, literalism, and objectivism seems sufficient for moral realism. Nonetheless, there are a couple of reasons why the moral realist territory is better marked by the explanationist consideration. This consideration leads to explanationist moral realism according to which there must be moral facts because they are essential in our understanding of the world. Literalism faces uncertainty if one considers what moral sentences mean, a consideration that is not ideal for the realism/antirealism debate. Despite these categories, the advent of quasi-realism signals the new antirealist way. A quasi-realist can claim that cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truths, moral knowledge, and even moral objectivity, are within the antirealist camp.

2. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and the EI thesis

Quasi-realists such as R. M. Hare, Gilbert Harman, and Simon Blackburn promise to set people free from the unduly rigid ontology of moral realism, namely, the existence of moral facts. Quasi-realism would allow people to enjoy the traditional realist comforts such as moral truths, moral knowledge, and moral objectivity, without the realists’ baggage of commitments, theoretical burdens, and practical costs, or so they contend. It all sounds too good to be true, but such a possibility seems exciting: why insist on the existence of moral facts if all aspects of our moral practices, especially the realist-sounding ones, could be understood without the fact-multiplying realist ontology? Of course, the real question is this: is there anything significant that will be lost in our understanding of our moral practices if we were to settle for quasi-realism? A definite “yes” to the question has to be given, and we shall see why in this section.

The possibility that the quasi-realist extends to people is that quasi-realism poses no serious threat to the moral realist position. However, this quasi-realist contention— that by siding with quasi-realism nothing significant will be lost in our understanding of our moral practices—is simply mistaken. The quasi-realist loses some of the best explanations of events, states of affairs, and phenomena within the world: the quasi-realist must reject folk moral explanations. This is so, it will be argued, because the quasi-realist cannot accommodate folk moral explanations without reducing them to naturalistic explanations.

a. An Analogy: Quasi-Realism about Derogatory Judgments

Blackburn discusses derogatory judgments in his attempt to show how the quasi-realist allows for realist comforts. The quasi-realistic understanding of these judgments, according to Blackburn, allows for antirealist cognitivism about derogatory judgments, derogatory descriptivism, derogatory truth, derogatory knowledge, and even derogatory objectivity. The same may be said of the quasi-realistic understanding of moral judgments: for example, the quasi-realist might be entitled to cognitivism when it comes to moral judgments, descriptivism when it comes to moral language, moral truth, moral knowledge, and the quasi-realist perhaps may even be entitled to moral objectivity. Analogously to the quasi-realism about derogatory judgments, Blackburn claims that quasi-realists are entitled to all these, without being committed to the existence of moral facts as part of the supposed fabric of the world.

Blackburn’s derogatory judgments argument goes something like this: “Kraut” is an inherently derogatory expression. The judgment “Franz is a Kraut” is a cognitive state just like ordinary non-derogatory beliefs. It consists partly of the judgment that Franz is German. The sentence or utterance “Franz is a Kraut” expresses a statement that describes how the world is. The Franz sentence expresses something true, namely, that Franz is a German insofar as it expresses nothing further about him. But the Franz sentence expresses more than just his nationality. It also expresses that Germans, including Franz, are fit objects of derision. We may call this additional part the “derogatory judgment” of the Franz sentence. The Franz sentence expresses something false because, according to Blackburn, the part that expresses the derogatory judgment is false. No one is a fit object of derision solely because of his nationality. Consequently, the Franz statement describes the world falsely.

What makes the Franz statement false? What makes the Franz statement false is twofold: 1) no one is a fit object of derision solely because of his nationality, so, the statement is false because it has failed to refer to anything; and 2) there is no person in the world toward whom it is appropriate to have the derogatory attitude and/or intention that is expressed by way of the Franz statement. The quasi-realist may maintain that the truth or falsity of the Franz statement is to be determined by the existence or non-existence of the person toward whom it is appropriate to have such an attitude. Since there is no such person, the Franz statement is false. That is to say, the speaker of the Franz sentence speaks falsely because she reports a state of affairs as actual that is non-actual, namely she is falsely reporting that it is appropriate to have derogatory attitudes toward some people solely because of their nationality, although she may be correctly identifying Franz’s nationality as German. Truth or falsity in derogatory judgments may be found in the way that they correspond or do not correspond to the world.

Analogously, quasi-realists may earn the right to maintain cognitivism when it comes to moral judgments, descriptivism, moral truths, moral knowledge, moral objectivity, and so on. For the quasi-realist, the inner workings of moral language are such that they afford such realist-sounding expressions like moral truths without ever accepting the realist ontology.

b. Quasi-Realism, Antirealism, and Explanationist Moral Realism

The quasi-realist paints a rosy philosophical picture in which one can enjoy realist-sounding luxuries while not multiplying entities beyond necessity. Nonetheless, the nagging question remains: is it not better to have a real thing than to have a quasi-real thing, especially when the theoretical price is right? We must challenge the quasi-realist’s entitlement to be regarded as the contemporary heir of moral antirealism, and examine her reasons for thinking that quasi-realism is true. It is ethical relativism that wins Harman antirealist entitlements. Blackburn earns his spurs through projectivism that eventually allows for the ontological parsimony. But why do quasi-realists think their particular brand of antirealism is true? Both Harman and Blackburn give a surprisingly unanimous explanation. They call it the explanatory inadequacy thesis of the moral and it addresses the comparative explanatory inferiority of moral facts, the total lack of explanatory power of moral facts, or explanatory reductionism.

For instance, according to Blackburn, projectivism must be true because “we need to explain the ban on mixed worlds, and the argument goes that antirealism [projectivism] does this better than realism” (1984, 184). Harman thinks that ethical relativism—the view that “there is no single true morality”—must be true because it is a “reasonable inference from the most plausible explanation of moral diversity” (Harman and Thomson 1996, 8). Harman’s reason is a version of the explanatory inadequacy of moral facts thesis. It is the inadequacy thesis that entitles the quasi-realist to the antirealist parsimony. To mark the moral realist territory in such a way that implies the irrelevance view (the view that the explanatory inadequacy of moral facts does not constitute evidence against moral realism) ignores the fact that it is primarily the inadequacy thesis that entitles the quasi-realist to anti-realism. The explanatory power of moral facts is the only realist doctrine that is immune from quasi-realist debunking.

It is puzzling for the quasi-realist to advance the explanatory inadequacy thesis since she has ample room for accommodating folk moral explanations. She only needs to appeal to the putative moral facts as though they are real. The “as though” attitude does a yeoman’s work. It gives her the right to use notions such as bivalence, moral truth, moral knowledge, and so on. It seems rather arbitrary to stop at accommodating moral explanations. The quasi-realist’s dismissive attitude toward moral explanations is the quasi-realist’s qualification as an antirealist.

3. Moral Realism after Quasi-Realism

Such quasi-delicacies like quasi-moral-truths, quasi-moral-knowledge, or quasi-moral-objectivity allow for contemporary antirealist ways, but moral realists surely cannot rest content with them. Moral realists must find a way for not only rejecting the quasi-realist’s debunking of the disagreements between the traditional realist and the antirealist, but also a way for establishing “real” moral comforts. A couple of ways moral realists do this is by asserting the existence of objective literal moral truths and explanationist moral realism.

Figure 5 indicates an inflated way of establishing the realist’s ontological thesis, namely, that there are moral facts. On this inflated moral realism, the realist view turns out to be a jumble of 4 major theories in philosophy: cognitivism, descriptivism, literalism, and success theory. (The correspondence theory of truth is neither necessary nor sufficient for moral realism as we saw above.) Although the existence of objective literal moral truths may show that the aforementioned theories are jointly sufficient for moral realism, it ignores the quasi-realist’s ways of saying the realist-sounding things (the quasi-realist’s way in masquerading as moral realists, if you will). A less inflated way of marking the realist territory would be advisable, should there be such a way. This is because quasi-realists insist that they are as much entitled to cognitivism, descriptivism, moral truth, moral knowledge and even moral objectivity as moral realists. Their insistence effectively thwarts realist attempts at marking their territory by relying on the traditional disagreement between realists and antirealists mapped in figure 5.

Explanationist moral realism has been suggested as a way of blocking the alleged quasi-realist masquerade. It focuses on the significance of having moral explanations. The explanationist moral realist holds that moral facts genuinely explain events and states of affairs in the world. In a rough and ready way, the explanationist realist maintains that there are moral facts because they explain non-moral events. However, her claim is debated even within the realist camp. Some moral realists consider that explanatory adequacy (or, inadequacy for that matter) is irrelevant in establishing the truth of moral realism; and, it is no easy task to show that moral facts are genuinely explanatory (or, that the quasi-realist’s accommodation of moral explanations is not as robust as she claims it to be). Nonetheless, since explanationist moral realism is much simpler than the inflated moral realism of figure 5, explanationist moral realism demands the realist’s close attention.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William P. 1996. A Realist Conception of Truth. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Ayer, A. J. 1952. Language, Truth, and Logic. New York: Dover Publications.
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1981. “Rule Following and Moral Realism,” In Holtzman and Leich (1981).
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1984. Spreading the Word: Groundings in the Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1993. Essays in Quasi-Realism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon. 1998. Ruling Passions: A Theory of Practical Reasoning. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blackburn, Simon, and Keith Simmons, eds. 1999. Truth. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brink, David O. 1989. Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Darwall, Stephen, Allan Gibbard, and Peter Railton. 1992. Toward Fin de siècle Ethics: Some Trends. The Philosophical Review, 101 (1):115-89.
  • Dodd, Julian. 2002. “Recent Work on Truth,” Philosophical Books, 43:279-91.
  • Fine, Kit. 2001. “The Question of Realism,” Philosopher’s Imprint 1, (1):1-30.
  • Geach, Peter. 1965. “Assertion,” The Philosophical Review, 74:449-465.
  • Gettier, E. L. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis, 23 (6).
  • Gibbard, Allan. 1990. Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1978. “A Causal Theory of Knowing,” in Essays on Knowledge and Justification, edited by G. S. Pappas and M. Swain. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1986. “What is Justified Belief?” in Empirical Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology, edited by P. K. Moser: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
  • Hare, R. M. 1952. The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1977. The Nature of Morality. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1986. “Moral Explanations of Natural Facts—Can Moral Claims Be Tested Against Moral Reality?” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, XXIV (Supplement):57-68.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 2000. Explaining Value and Other Essays in Moral Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Harman, Gilbert, and Judith Jarvis Thomson. 1996. Moral Relativism and Moral Objectivity. Cambridge: Blackwell.
  • Hatzimoysis, Anthony. 1997. “Minimalism about Truth and Ethical Cognitivism,” in Analyomen, 2, Volume III: Philosophy of Mind, Practical Philosophy, Miscellanea, edited by G. Meggle. de-Gruyter: Hawthorne.
  • Horgan, Terence, and Mark Timmons. 2000. “Nondescriptivist Cognitivism: Framework for a New Metaethic,” Philosophical Papers, 29:121-153.
  • Horwich, Paul. 1998. Truth. 2nd ed. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kim, Jaegwon. 1988. What is “Naturalized Epistemology?” Philosophical Perspectives 2 (Epistemology):381-405.
  • Kupperman, Joel J. 1988. “Ethical Fallibility,” Ratio 1:33-46.
  • Lynch, Michael P. 1997. “Critical Study: Minimal Realism or Realistic Minimalism?” The Philosophical Quarterly 47 (189):512-518.
  • Piker, Andrew. 1995. “W. D. Falk’s Alternative to Moral Realism and Anti-Realism,” Auslegung 20 (2):100-105.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993a. Warrant: the Current Debate. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993b. Warrant and Proper Function. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. O. 1986. “Epistemology Naturalized,” in Empirical Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology, edited by P. K. Moser: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey. 1988. “The Many Moral Realisms,” in Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Skorupski, John. 1999. “Irrealist Cognitivism,” Ratio XII:436-459.
  • Stevenson, C. L. 1937. “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms,” Mind 46:14-31.
  • Stevenson, C. L. 1944. Ethics and Language. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Stevenson, C. L. 1963. Facts and Values. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas L. 1986. “Harman on Moral Explanations of Natural Facts,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy XXIV (Supplement):69-78.
  • Tenenbaum, Sergio. 1996. “Realists without a Cause: Deflationary Theories of Truth and Ethical Realism,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 26 (4):561-90.
  • Waller, Bruce N. 1994. “Noncognitivist Moral Realism,” Philosophia 24 (1-2):57-75.
  • Wedgwood, Ralph.  2007. Nature of Normativity, Oxford University Press.
  • Wright, Crispin. 1992. Truth and Objectivity. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Wright, Crispin.1993. “Realism: The Contemporary Debate: Whither Now?” in Reality, Representation and Projection, edited by J. Haldane and C. Wright. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wright, Crispin.1999. “Truth: A Traditional Debate Reviewed,” in Blackburn and Simmons (1999).

Author Information

Shin Kim
Email: skim@hufs.ac.kr
Hankuk University of Foreign Studies

Thomas Aquinas: Moral Philosophy

aquinasThe moral philosophy of St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) involves a merger of at least two apparently disparate traditions: Aristotelian eudaimonism and Christian theology. On the one hand, Aquinas follows Aristotle in thinking that an act is good or bad depending on whether it contributes to or deters us from our proper human end—the telos or final goal at which all human actions aim. That telos is eudaimonia, or happiness, where “happiness” is understood in terms of completion, perfection, or well-being. Achieving happiness, however, requires a range of intellectual and moral virtues that enable us to understand the nature of happiness and motivate us to seek it in a reliable and consistent way.

On the other hand, Aquinas believes that we can never achieve complete or final happiness in this life. For him, final happiness consists in beatitude, or supernatural union with God. Such an end lies far beyond what we through our natural human capacities can attain. For this reason, we not only need the virtues, we also need God to transform our nature—to perfect or “deify” it—so that we might be suited to participate in divine beatitude. Moreover, Aquinas believes that we inherited a propensity to sin from our first parent, Adam. While our nature is not wholly corrupted by sin, it is nevertheless diminished by sin’s stain, as evidenced by the fact that our wills are at enmity with God’s. Thus we need God’s help in order to restore the good of our nature and bring us into conformity with his will. To this end, God imbues us with his grace which comes in the form of divinely instantiated virtues and gifts.

This article first considers Aquinas’s metaethical views. Those views provide a good context for understanding his unique synthesis of Christian teaching and Aristotelian philosophy. Also, his meta-ethical views provide an ideal background for understanding other features of his moral philosophy such as the nature of human action, virtue, natural law, and the ultimate end of human beings. While contemporary moral philosophers tend to address these subjects as discrete topics of study, Aquinas’s treatment of them yields a bracing, comprehensive view of the moral life. This article presents these subjects in a way that illuminates their interconnected roles.

Table of Contents

  1. Metaethics
  2. The Nature of Human Action
  3. The Cardinal Virtues
    1. Prudence
    2. Temperance
    3. Courage
    4. Justice
  4. Natural Law
  5. Charity and Beatitude
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Metaethics

Aquinas’s metaethical views are indebted to the writings of several Christian thinkers, particularly Augustine’s Confessions, Boethius’s De hebdomadibus, and perhaps Anselm’s Monologium. Due to the constraints of space, the present section will only consider Augustine’s influence on Aquinas’s views.

According to Augustine, “things that exist are good” (Confessions VII.12). This claim is meant to express a basic metaphysical idea, namely, that if something exists, then it necessarily has some degree of goodness. Augustine’s argument for this claim is as follows. We can divide existing things into two categories: incorruptible things and corruptible things, with the latter being inferior to the former. If something is incorruptible, then by definition it cannot be made worse; that is, it cannot lose whatever goodness it may have. On the other hand, if something is corruptible, then it can be made worse. Notice that a thing’s being corruptible presupposes having goodness. Otherwise, it would not have any goodness it could lose. While this argument may be sufficient to show that corruptible things necessarily have goodness, Augustine uses it to identify a problem with the view that something can exist even if it has no goodness at all. For if something has no goodness, then it cannot lose goodness and must therefore be incorruptible. And since incorruptibility is better than corruptibility, it looks as if something lacking goodness is better than its corruptible counterpart, which has goodness. Clearly, this is incoherent. Augustine writes: “What can be more monstrous than to maintain that by losing all [its] goodness [something can] become better” (Ibid.)? Yet this is precisely the implication of claiming that something with no goodness whatsoever can exist. According to Augustine, the only remedy for this problem is to deny the existence of things that have no goodness. If something exists, then it must necessarily have goodness.

Echoing the general thrust of Augustine’s argument, Aquinas claims that “Goodness and being are really the same.” (Summa Theologiae [hereafter ST] Ia 5.1). The term “being” here is roughly equivalent to what is actual or existing. Thus what Aquinas means to convey is that something is good insofar as it actual. By contrast, evil has no actuality in its own right. It would be a mistake, then, to speak of evil as an actual “thing,” if by “thing” we mean an existing being or quality. For evil is a deprivation of what is actual, like blindness or sickness. For this reason, Aquinas says that something is evil “inasmuch as it is deprived of some particular good that pertains to its due or proper perfection” (QDM 1.1 ad 1; ST Ia 48.2 passim). Again, Augustine’s influence is clear. For him, something is evil insofar as its existence is diminished or corrupted in some way. If something had no goodness whatsoever, it would lack all goods, even the good of existence itself. Augustine says, “if something where deprived of all goodness, it would be altogether nothing; therefore as long as something is, it is good” (Confessions,VII.12).

Aquinas’s meta-ethics is also indebted to an Aristotelian view of living things. Following Aristotle, Aquinas says that living things are composites of matter and substantial form. By “substantial form” he means a principle that organizes matter into a discrete substance equipped with certain powers or “potentialities.” On this view, a thing’s substantial form constitutes the nature a thing has; it is the metaphysical aspect in virtue of which a substance is the kind of thing it is and has the species-defining powers it has (ST Ia 76.1; Cf. Ia 5.5; IaIIae 85.4). Aquinas goes on to argue that all substances seek their own perfection (ST Ia 6.1). That is, they all seek as their final end a fully realized state of existence or actuality. Yet a substance cannot achieve that final end without exercising the powers it has in virtue of its substantial form. As Scott MacDonald explains: “The end, completion, or perfection of a natural substance is its having fully actualized its specifying capacity [or power], its actually performing the activity for which its form or nature provides the capacity” (MacDonald, 1991a: 5). In other words, a substance achieves its perfection through the proper exercise of its species-defining powers. And because Aquinas thinks that existence and goodness have the same referent, it appears that the proper exercise of those powers also contributes to that substance’s goodness. For “since the state or activity that constitutes a substance’s full actuality is that substance’s end and an end is good, that state or activity constitutes the substance’s good.” (Ibid.).

Aquinas considers a fairly straightforward objection to this view: “Goodness can be more or less. But being cannot be more or less. Therefore goodness differs from being” (ST Ia 5.1 obj. 3). In other words, goodness is a relative property. Some people are morally better than other people. Some horses are more developed and better trained than other horses. Some organs are healthier and function better than other organs. In each case, the goodness things have will not be identical in terms of quantity. On the other hand, being (understood in terms of being actual or existing) is not varied in this way. Something either exists or it doesn’t. This crucial difference seems to prove that being and goodness cannot be the same. In addressing this worry, Aquinas concedes that there is a kind of existence, or being, that is all-or-nothing. He calls this “substantial being,” or being simply. Something has substantial being as long as it is actual or exists (ST Ia 5.1 ad 1). We might also claim that every thing that has substantial being also has substantial goodness. That is, something is good insofar it exists or has being.

On the other hand, members of the same species can enjoy different grades of maturity or completeness. As Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump explain, something may be “a more or less fully developed actualized specimen” (Kretzmann and Stump, 1988: 292). For example, a healthy adult dog is more developed—that is, more actualized—than a puppy, whose fledgling state prevents it from participating in those activities characteristic of more mature dogs (e.g., reproduction, nurturing their young, etc.). The actuality referred to here is what Aquinas calls relative being. He says: “by its substantial being, everything is said to have being simply; but by any further actuality it is said to have being relatively” (STIa 5.1 ad 1). The idea of “relative being” refers to the quality that accrues when a living thing exercises its species-defining capacities and, in turn, becomes a more perfect. Again, by “more perfect” Aquinas simply means “more actual.” For “anything whatever is perfect to the extent that it is in actuality, since potentiality without actuality is imperfect” (ST IaIIae 3.2). And just as a thing’s relative being is a matter of degree, so there is a kind of goodness—“relative goodness”—that corresponds to the degree of actuality a thing has. For “goodness [in the current sense] is spoken of as more or less according to a thing’s superadded actuality”—the kind of actuality that goes beyond a thing’s mere substantial being (STIa 5.1 ad 3; ST IaIIae 18.1; SCG III 3, 4).

The forgoing analysis provides the conceptual background for understanding the nature of human goodness. As we have seen, something is good to the extent that its species-defining powers are properly actualized. For Aquinas, the species-defining characteristic of human beings is reason. And since something achieves goodness by exercising its species-defining powers, it follows that reason’s proper exercise will result in human goodness. Kretzmann and Stump put the point this way: “human goodness, like any goodness appropriate to one’s species, is acquired by performing instances of the operations specific to its species, which in the case of humanity is the rational employment of rational powers” (Kretzmann and Stump, 1988: 287). In short, human goodness ultimately consists in the proper exercise of a person’s rational capacities. This analysis of human goodness serves to guide our evaluation of human actions. Whether an action is good (or bad) depends on whether it is commensurate with (or contrary to) our nature as rational beings. In this way, the real difference between good and bad actions is a difference in relation to reason (ST IaIIae 18.5).

2. The Nature of Human Action

According to Aquinas’s metaethics, human goodness depends on performing acts that are in accord with our human nature. But what sort of acts are those? In other words, what feature or features serve to distinguish human acts from acts of a different kind? Here we must go beyond the simple claim that an action is human just insofar as it is rational. For while this claim is no doubt true, the nature of rationality itself needs explanation. This section seeks to explore more fully just what rationality or reason consists in according to Aquinas. Only then can we understand the nature of human action and the end at which such action aims.

Aquinas provides the most comprehensive treatment of this subject in the second part of the Summa theologiae. There, he explains that reason is comprised of two powers: one cognitive, the other appetitive. The cognitive power is the intellect, which enables us to know and understand. The intellect also enables us to apprehend the goodness a thing has. The appetitive power of reason is called the will. Aquinas describes the will as a native desire for the understood good. That is, it is an appetite that is responsive to the intellect’s estimations of what is good or choiceworthy (ST Ia 82.1; QDV 3.22.12). On this view, all acts of will are dependent on antecedent acts of intellect; the intellect must supply the will with the object to which the latter inclines. In turn, that object moves the will as a final cause “because the good understood is the object of the will, and moves it as an end” (ST Ia 82.4).

From the abbreviated account of intellect and will provided thus far, it may appear that the intellect necessitates the will’s acts by its own evaluative portrayals of goodness. Yet Aquinas insists that no single account of the good can necessitate the will’s movement. Most goods do not have a necessary connection to happiness. That is, we do not need them in order to be happy; thus the will does not incline to them of necessity (ST Ia 82.2). But what of those goods that do have a necessary connection to happiness? What about the goodness of God or those virtues that lead us to God “in whom alone true happiness consists” (Ibid.)? According to Aquinas, the will does not incline necessarily to these goods, either. For in this life we cannot see God in all his goodness, and thus the connection between God, virtue, final happiness will always appear opaque. Aquinas writes: “until through the certitude of the Divine Vision the necessity of such connection be shown, the will does not adhere to God of necessity, nor to those things which are of God” (Ibid.).

In this life, then, our intellectual limitations prevent us from apprehending what is good simpliciter. Instead, we are presented with competing goods between which we must choose (ST Ia 82.2 ad 1). Some goods provide immediate gratification but no long-term fulfillment. Other goods may precipitate hardship but eventually make us better people. Indeed, sometimes we must exercise considerable effort in ignoring superficial or petty pleasures while attending to more difficult yet enduring goods. To employ Aquinas’s parlance, the will must exercise efficient causality on the intellect by instructing it to consider some goods rather than others (ST Ia 82.4). This happens whenever we, through our own determination, direct our attention away from certain desirable objects and toward those we think are more choiceworthy. Of course, our character will often govern the goods we desire and ultimately choose. Even so, Aquinas does not think that our character wholly determines our choices, as evidenced by the fact that we sometimes make decisions that are contrary to our established habits. This is actually fortunate for us, for it suggests that even people disposed toward evil can manage to make good choices and perhaps begin to correct their more hardened and inordinate inclinations.

Now we are prepared to answer the question posed at the beginning of this section: what actions are those we can designate as human? The answer is this: human actions are those over which one has voluntary control (ST IaIIae 1.1). Unlike non-rational animals, human beings choose their actions according to a reasoned account of what they think is good. Seen this way, human actions are not products of deterministic causal forces. They are products of our own free judgment (liberum arbitrium), the exercise of which is a function of both intellect and will (ST Ia 83.3). When discussing what it is that makes an action “human,” then, Aquinas has in mind those capacities whereby one judges and chooses what is good. For it is through one’s ability to deliberate and judge in this way that one exercises mastery over one’s actions (ST IaIIae 1.1).

So far, we’ve established that human actions are actions that are governed by a reasoned consideration of what is good. Aquinas also thinks that the good in question functions as an end—the object for the sake of which the agent acts. “For the object of the will is the end and the good” (Ibid.). There are two worries that emerge here, both of which can be resolved rather quickly. First, it seems we do not always act for the sake of an end. Many actions we perform are not products of our own deliberation and voluntary judgment (like nervous twitches, coughs, or unconscious tapping of the foot). Yet Aquinas points out that acts of this sort are not properly human acts “since they do not proceed from the deliberation of the reason” (Ibid., ad 3). In order for an act to count as a human act, it must be a product of the agent’s reasoned consideration about what is good. Second, it appears that Aquinas is mistaken when he says that the ends for the sake of which we act are good. Clearly, many things we pursue in life are not good. Aquinas does not deny this. He agrees that cognitive errors and excessive passion can distort our moral views and, in turn, incline us to choose the wrong things. Aquinas’s point, however, is that our actions are done for the sake of what we believe (rightly or wrongly) to be good. Whether the ends we pursue are in fact good is a separate question—one to which we will return below.

Aquinas does not simply wish to defend the claim that human acts are for the sake of some good. Following Augustine, he insists that our actions are for the sake of a final good—a last end which we desire for its own sake and for the sake of which everything else is chosen (ST Ia 1.6 sed contra ). If there was no such end, we would have a hard time explaining why anyone chooses to do anything at all. The reason for this is as follows. Aquinas argues that for every action or series of actions there must be something that is first in “order of intention” (ST Ia 1.4). In other words, there must be some end or good that is intrinsically desirable and serves the will’s final cause. According to this view, such a good is a catalyst for desire and is therefore necessary in order for us to act for the sake of what we desire. MacDonald writes, “one can explain [a given action] only by appealing to some end or good that is itself capable of moving the will—that is, by appealing to an end that is viewed desirable in itself” (MacDonald, 1991b: 44). Were you to remove the intrinsically desirable end, then you would remove the very principle that motivates us to act in the first place (ST IaIIae 1.4). This account also helps explain why we cannot postulate an “indefinite series of ends” when explaining human actions (Ibid.). For the existence of an indefinite series of ends would mean that there is no intrinsically desirable good for the sake of which we act. In the absence of any such good, we would not desire anything and thus never have the necessary motivation to act (Ibid.). So there must be a last end or final good that we desire for its own sake.

This last claim still does not capture what Aquinas ultimately wishes to show, namely, that there is a singleend for the sake of which all of us act (ST IaIIae 1.5). To put the matter as starkly as possible, Aquinas wants to argue that every human act of every human being is for the sake of a single end that is the same for everyone (ST IaIIae 1.5-7). The previous argument did not require us to think that the final end for which we act is the same for everyone. Nor did it show that the end at which every human being aims consists in a specific, solitary good (as opposed to a constellation of goods). What, exactly, is this last end at which we aim? As we saw in the preceding section, all of us seek after our own perfection (ST Ia 1.6). We do so by performing actions we think will—directly or indirectly—contribute to or facilitate a life that is more complete or fulfilling than it would be otherwise. In other words, the last end—the end or good that we desire for its own sake—is happiness, whereby “happiness” Aquinas means the sort of perfection or fulfillment just described.

Admittedly, this claim is fairly abstract and uncontroversial. After all, Aquinas does not say whathappiness consists in–the thing in which it is realized. He simply wishes to show that there is something everyone desires and pursues, namely, ultimate fulfillment. He says, “everyone desires the fulfillment of their perfection, and it is precisely this fulfillment in which the last end consists” (ST IaIIae 1.7; emphasis mine). So construed, the idea of the last end is, as MacDonald explains, a “formal concept…of the complete and perfect good, that which completely satisfies desire” (MacDonald, 1991b: 61). But while everyone acts for the sake of such an end abstractly conceived, Aquinas recognizes that there is considerable disagreement over what it is in which happiness consists (ST IaIIae 1.7). So there is a difference between the idea of the last end (an idea for the sake of which everyone acts) and the specific object in which the last end is thought to consist (Ibid.). Some people think that the last end consists in the acquisition of external goods, like riches, power, or fame (ST IaIIae 2.1-4). Others think it consists in goods of the body, like comeliness or physical pleasure (ST IaIIae 2.5 and 6). And still others think that happiness consists in acquiring goods of the soul such as knowledge, virtue, and friendship (ST IaIIae 2.7). But as laudable as some of these good are (particularly those of the latter category), they are all beset with unique deficiencies that preclude them from providing the kind of complete fulfillment characteristic of final happiness.

What is it, then, in which our last end really consists or is realized? For Aquinas, the last end of happiness can only consist in that which is perfectly good, which is God. Because God is perfect goodness, he is the only one capable of fulfilling our heart’s deepest longing and facilitating the perfection at which we aim. Thus he says that human beings “attain their last end by knowing and loving God” (ST IaIIae 1.8). Aquinas refers to this last end—the state in which perfect happiness consists—as the beatific vision. The beatific vision is a supernatural union with God, the enjoyment of which surpasses the satisfaction afforded by those goods people sometimes associate with the last end. But if perfect happiness consists in the beatific vision, then why do people fail to seek it? Actually, all people do seek it—at least in some sense. As we have already noted, all of us desire our own perfection, which is synonymous with final happiness. Unfortunately, many of our actions are informed by mistaken views of what happiness really consists in. These views may be the result of some intellectual or cognitive error (say if one’s views are the result of ignorance or ill-informed deliberation). But more than likely, our mistaken views will be the result of certain appetitive excesses that corrupt our understanding of what is really good. For this reason, good actions require excellences—or virtues—of both mind and appetite. The next section seeks to explain more fully what those virtues are and why we need them.

3. The Cardinal Virtues

Aquinas offers several definitions of virtue. According to one very general account, a virtue is a habit that “disposes an agent to perform its proper operation or movement” (DVC 1; ST IaIIae 49.1). Because we know that reason is the proper operation of human beings, it follows that a virtue is a habit that disposes us to reason well. This account is too broad for our present purposes. While all virtues contribute in some way to our rational perfection, not every virtue disposes us to live morally good lives. Some virtues are strictly intellectual perfections, such as the ability to grasp universals or the causes underlying the world’s origin and operation. For the purposes of this essay, our concern will be with those virtues that are related to moral decision and action. That is, we will consider those virtues which Aquinas (following Augustine) describes as “good [qualities] of mind whereby we live righteously” (ST IaIIae 55.4).

A cursory glance at the second part of the Summa Theologiae would reveal a host of virtues that are indicative of human goodness. But there are essentially four virtues from which Aquinas’s more extensive list flows. These virtues are prudence, justice, temperance, and courage (ST IaIIae 61.2). Aquinas refers to these virtues as the “cardinal” virtues. They are the principle habits on which the rest of the virtues hinge (cardo) (Rickaby, 2003). To put the matter another way, each cardinal virtue refers to a general type of rectitude that has various specifications. For example, the virtue of prudence (which we will consider in more detail shortly) denotes a “certain rectitude of discretion in any actions or matters whatever” (ST IaIIae 61.4; 61.3). Any virtue the point of which is to promote discretion with respect to action will be considered a part of prudence. Similarly, temperance concerns the moderation of passion, and thus will include any virtue that seeks to restrain those desires of a more or less insatiable sort (Ibid.).

Moreover, Aquinas thinks the cardinal virtues provide general templates for the most salient forms of moral activity: commanding action (prudence); giving to those what is due (justice); curbing the passions (temperance); and strengthening the passions against fear (courage) (IaIIae 61.3). A more detailed sketch of these virtues follows (although I will address them in an order that is different from the one Aquinas provides).

a. Prudence

In order to act well, we need to make good judgments about how we should behave. This is precisely the sort of habit associated with prudence, which Aquinas defines as “wisdom concerning human affairs” (STIIaIIae 47.2 ad 1) or “right reason with respect to action” (ST IIaIIae 47.4). In order to make good moral judgments, a twofold knowledge is required: one must know (1) the general moral principles that guide actions and (2) the particular circumstances in which a decision is required. For “actions are about singular matters: and so it is necessary for the prudent man to know both the universal principles of reason, and the singulars about which actions are concerned” (ST IIaIIae 47.3; Cf. STIaIIae 18.3). This passage may appear to suggest that prudence involves a fairly simple and straightforward process of applying moral rules to specific situations. But this is somewhat misleading since the activity of prudence involves a fairly developed ability to evaluate situations themselves. As Thomas Hibbs explains: “prudence involves not simply the subordination of particulars to appropriate universals, but the appraisal of concrete, contingent circumstances” (Hibbs, 2001: 92). From this perspective, good decisions will always be responsive to what our situation requires. Thus we cannot simply consult a list of moral prescriptions in determining what we should do. We must also “grasp what is pertinent and to assess what ought to be done in complex circumstances” (Ibid., 98).

According to Aquinas, then, the virtue of prudence is a kind of intellectual aptitude that enables us to make judgments that are consonant with (and indeed ordered to) our proper end (ST IaIIae 57.5). Note here that prudence does not establish the end at which we aim. Our end is the human good, which is predetermined by our rational nature (ST IIaIIae 47.6). Nor does prudence desire that end; for whether we desire our proper end depends on whether we have the rights sorts of appetitive inclinations (as we shall see below). According to Aquinas, prudence illuminates for us the course of action deemed most appropriate for achieving our antecedently established telos. It does this through three acts: (1) counsel, whereby we inquire about the available means of achieving the end; (2) judgment, whereby we determine the proper means for achieving the end; and finally (3) command, whereby we apply that judgment (ST IIaIIae 47.8). While we need a range of appetitive excellences in order to make good choices, we also need certain intellectual excellences as well. That is, we must be able to deliberate and choose well with respect to what is ultimately good for us.

As a cardinal virtue, prudence functions as a principal virtue on which a variety of other excellences hinge. Those excellences include: memory, intelligence, docility, shrewdness, reason, foresight, circumspection, and caution (ST IIaIIae 49.1-8).  Without these excellences, we may commit a number of cognitive errors that may prevent us from acting in a morally appropriate way. For example, we may reject the guidance of good counsel; make decisions precipitously; or act thoughtlessly by failing “to judge rightly through contempt or neglect of those things on which a right judgment depends” (ST IIaIIae 53.4). We may also act for the sake of goods that are contrary to our nature. This invariably happens when the passions cloud our judgment and make deficient objects of satisfaction look more choiceworthy than they really are. In order to make reliable judgments about what is really good, our passions need some measure of restraint so that they do not corrupt good judgment. In short, prudence depends on virtues of the appetite, and it is to these virtues we now turn.

b. Temperance

Temperance has a twofold meaning. In a general sense, the term denotes a kind of moderation common to every moral virtue (ST IIaIIae 141.2). In its more restricted sense, temperance concerns the moderation of physical pleasures, especially those associated with eating, drinking, and sex (ST IIaIIae 141.4). We display a common propensity to sacrifice our well-being for the sake of these transient goods. Thus we need some virtue that serves to restrain what Aquinas calls “concupiscible passion” –the appetite whereby we desire what is pleasing and avoid what is harmful (ST Ia 82.2). Temperance is that virtue, as it denotes a restrained desire for physical gratification (ST IIaIIae 141.2, 3).

Aquinas does not think that temperance eradicates our desire for bodily pleasure. Nor does he think that temperance is a matter of desiring physical pleasure less. Such a description suggests that physical gratification is an innately deficient type of enjoyment. Yet Aquinas denies this. Physical pleasure, he says, is the result of the body’s natural operations (ST IIaIIae 141.4). According to Aquinas, the purpose of temperance is to refine the way we enjoy bodily pleasures. Specifically, it creates in the agent a proper sense of moderation with respect to what is pleasurable. For a person can more easily subordinate herself to reason when her passions are not excessive or deficient. On this view, bodily enjoyment can in fact be an integral part of a rational life. For the moderated enjoyment of bodily pleasure safeguards the good of reason and actually facilitates a more enduring kind of satisfaction. Thus Aquinas insists that “sensible and bodily goods … are not in opposition to reason, but are subject to it as instruments which reason employs in order to attain its proper end” (ST IIaIIae 141.3).

Like prudence, temperance is a cardinal virtue. There are a host of subsidiary virtues that fall under temperance because they serve to modify the most insatiable human passions. For example, chastity,sobriety and abstinence—which denote a retrenchment of sex, drink, and food, respectively—are (predictably) all parts of temperance. Yet there are other virtues associated with temperance that may strike the reader as surprising. For example, Aquinas argues that humility is a part of temperance. Humility aims to restrain the immoderate desire for what one cannot achieve. While humility is not concerned with tempering the appetites associated with touch, it nevertheless consists in a kind of restraint and thus bears a formal resemblance to temperance. He says: “whatever virtues restrain or suppress, and the actions which moderate the impetuosity of the passions, are considered parts of temperance” (ST IIaIIae 161.4). Thus Aquinas also thinks meeknessclemency, and studiousness are parts of temperance. They, too, restrain certain appetitive drives: specifically anger, the desire to punish, and the desire to pursue vain curiosities, respectively.

c. Courage

Temperance and its subsidiary virtues restrain the strong appetite, such as the sexual appetite But courage and its subsidiary virtues modify what Aquinas calls the irascible appetite. By “irascible appetite” Aquinas means the desire for that which is difficult to attain or avoid (ST IaIIae 23.1). Occasionally, the difficulty in achieving or avoiding certain objects can give rise to various degrees of fear and, in turn, discourage us from adhering to reason’s instruction. In these cases we may refuse to endure the pain or discomfort required for achieving our proper human good. Note here that fear is not innately contrary to reason. After all, there are some things that we should fear, like an untimely death or a bad reputation. Only when fear prevents us from facing what we ought to endure does it become inimical to reason (ST IIaIIae 125.1). In these cases, we need a virtue that moderates those appetites that prevent from undertaking more daunting tasks. According to Aquinas, courage is that virtue.

We need courage to restrain our fears so that we might endure harrowing circumstances. Yet courage not only mollifies our fears, it also combats the unreasonable zeal to overcome them. An excessive desire to face fearful circumstances constitutes a kind of recklessness that can easily hasten one’s demise. Thus we need courage in order to both curb excessive fear and modify unreasonable daring (ST IIaIIae 123.3). Without courage, we will be either governed by irrational fear or a recklessness that eschews good counsel, making us vulnerable to harm unnecessarily.

Like prudence and temperance, courage is a cardinal virtue. Those with courage will also have a considerable degree of endurance. For one must be able to “stand immovable in the midst of dangers,” especially those dangers that threaten bodily harm and death (ST IIaIIae 123.6). Lack of endurance will no doubt undermine one’s ability to bear life’s travails. The courageous person must also be confident (which is closely aligned with magnanimity). For he will not only have to endure pain and suffering, he must aggressively confront the obstacles that stand in the way of achieving his proper good. His success in confronting those obstacles requires that he exercise a “strength of hope” which arises from a confidence in his own strength, the strength of others, or the promises of God. Such hope enables him to confront threats and challenges without reservation (ST IIaIIae 129.6). The courageous person will also display magnificence, that is, a sense of nobility with respect to the importance of his endeavors. Quoting Tully, Aquinas underscores the value of what the courageous person seeks to attain by executing his actions with a “greatness of purpose” (ST IIaIIae 128.1). Finally, the courageous person will havepatience and perseverance. That is, he will not be broken by stress or sorrow, nor will he be wearied or discouraged due to the exigencies of his endeavors (Ibid.).

d. Justice

The virtues we have considered thus far concern our own state. The virtue of justice, however, governs our relationships with others (ST IIaIIae 57.1). Specifically, it denotes a sustained or constant willingness to extend to each person what he or she deserves (ST IIaIIae 58.1). Beyond this, Aquinas’s account of justice exhibits considerable breadth, complexity, and admits of various distinctions. Constraints of space, however, force me to mention only two sets of distinctions: (1) legal (or general) and particular justice, and (2) commutative and distributive justice.

The purpose of legal justice is to govern our actions according to the common good (ST IIaIIae 58.6). Construed this way, justice is a general virtue which concerns not individual benefits but community welfare. According to Aquinas, everyone who is a member of a community stands to that community as a part to a whole (ST IIaIIae 58.5). Whatever affects the part also affects the whole. And so whatever is good (or harmful) for oneself will also be good (or harmful) for the community of which one is a part. For this reason, we should expect the good community to enact laws that will govern its members in ways that are beneficial to everyone. This focus—the welfare of the community—is what falls under the purview of legal justice.

A clarification is in order. Aquinas acknowledges that legal justice does not appear to be altogether different from the virtues we previously considered. After all, courage, temperance, and prudence are just as likely to contribute to others’ welfare as legal justice. Yet these virtues differ logically from legal justice because they have specific objects of their own (ST IIaIIae 58.6). Whereas legal justice concerns the common good, prudence concerns commanding action, temperance concerns curbing concupiscent passion, and courage concerns strengthening irascible passion against fear. To put the matter as baldly as possible, the purpose of the other virtues is to make us good people; making us good citizens is the end at which legal justice aims (Ibid., sed contra). Of course, it would be a mistake to conclude from this account that the other virtues have nothing to do with the common good. Failure to moderate our baser appetites not only forestalls the development of personal virtue but leads to acts which are contrary to others’ well being. For example, restraining impetuous sexual appetite is the province of temperance. But as Thomas Williams insightfully points out, “sexuality [also] has implications for the common good.” For “there are precepts of justice that regulate our sex lives: fornication and adultery are violations not only of chastity but also of justice” (Williams, 2005: xvii). Thus Aquinas insists that temperance can do more than just modify our sexual drives. So long as it is shaped or informed by legal justice, temperance can direct us to preserve the common good in our actions (ST IIaIIae 58.6). We can say the same for prudence and courage. Legal justice must govern all acts of virtue to ensure that they achieve their end in a way that is commensurate with the good of others.

Now, we cannot fulfill the demands of justice only by considering what legal (or general) justice requires. We also need particular justice—the virtue which governs our interactions with individual citizens. Unlike general justice, particular justice directs us not to the good of the community but to the good of individual neighbors, colleagues, and other people with whom we interact regularly. Initially, it may appear as if particular justice is a superfluous virtue. As one objection to Aquinas’s view states, “general justice directs man sufficiently in all his relations with other men. Therefore there is no need for a particular justice” (ST IIaIIae 58.7 obj. 1). Aquinas agrees that general justice can direct us to the good of others, but only indirectly (ST IIaIIae 58.7 ad 1). It does this by providing us with very general precepts (do not steal, do not murder, etc) the point of which is to help us preserve the common good in our actions. Yet no situation requiring justice is the same, and thus our considerations of what is just must extend beyond what these general precepts dictate. We must be mindful of individual needs and judicious when applying these precepts. This is why Aquinas insists that the proximate concern of particular justice cannot be the common good but the good of individuals (Ibid.). In fulfilling its purpose, however, particular justice is a means of preserving community welfare.

Following Aristotle, Aquinas identifies two species of particular justice that deserve attention:commutative and distributive justice. Both seek to preserve equality between persons by giving to each person what is due. Yet Aquinas notes that there are “different kinds of due,” and this fact necessitates the current distinction (ST IIaIIae 61.1 ad 5; ST IIaIIae 61.2 ad 2). Commutative justice concerns the “mutual dealings” between individual citizens (ST IIaIIae 61.1). Specifically, it seeks to ensure that those who are buying and selling conduct their business fairly (In NE V.928). In this context “what is due” is a kind of equality whereby “one person should pay back to the other just so much as he has become richer out of that which belonged to the other” (ST IIaIIae 61.2). In other words, the value of a product should be equal to what one pays for that product. Similarly, a person should be paid an amount that is comparable to the value of what he sells. In short, the kind of equality commutative justice seeks to preserve is a matter of quantity (Ibid; In NE V.950).

Distributive justice concerns the way in which collective goods and responsibilities “are [fairly] apportioned among people who stand in a social community” (In NE V.927). Yet with respect to distributive justice, what a person receives is not a matter of equal quantity but “due proportion” (STIIaIIae 61.2). After all, it would be unjust if “laborers are paid equal wages for doing an unequal amount of work, or are paid unequal wages for doing an equal amount of work” (In NE V 4.935). Aquinas also thinks that a person of higher social station will require a greater proportion of goods (ST IIaIIae 61.2). In matters of distributive justice, then, “what is due” will be relative to what one deserves (or needs, since Aquinas also thinks that there is a moral obligation to provide for the poor) depending on his efforts or station in life.

This brief account of justice may seem like a stale precursor to more modern accounts of justice, particularly those that depict justice in terms of equality and economic fairness. Yet a brief survey of the virtues that hinge on justice reveals an account that is richer than the foregoing paragraphs may suggest. For Aquinas, justice is principally about our relations to others, and so he thinks that “all the virtues that are directed to another person may by reason of this common aspect be annexed to justice” (ST IIaIIae 80.1). The virtues Aquinas has in mind here are not simply those that regulate our relationships with other human beings, but with God. Thus he insists that religion is a virtue that falls under justice, since it involves offering God his due honor (Ibid; ST IIaIIae 81.1). The same can be said for piety andobservance, since they seek to render to God service and deference, respectively. Other virtues annexed to justice include truthfulness, since the just person will always present himself to others without pretext or falsehood; gratitude, which involves an appreciation for others’ kindness; and revenge, whereby we respond to or defend ourselves against others’ injurious actions (Ibid.). Finally, Aquinas includes bothliberality and friendship as parts of justice. The former is a virtue whereby we benefit others by giving or sharing with them the goods we possess (ST IIaIIae 117.1, 2, and 5). The latter involves treating those who live among us well (ST IIaIIae 114.2).

4. Natural Law

Aquinas is often described as a natural law theorist. While natural law is a significant aspect of his moral philosophy, it is a subject of considerable dispute and misunderstanding. Of course, this is not the place to adjudicate competing interpretations of Aquinas’s view. Yet recent philosophers have noted that too many expositors distort Aquinas’s view by treating it independently of his metaethics and his theory of virtue (see for example MacIntyre, 1990: 133-135; Hibbs, 2001: 94). While a detailed analysis of natural law and its varying interpretations would require a separate study, the present article hopes to sketch Aquinas’s view in a way that is sensitive to other aspects of his thought.

What is the natural law? We might attempt to answer this question by considering both the meaning of the term “law” as well as the law’s origin. On Aquinas’s view, a law is “a rule or measure of human acts, whereby a person is induced to act or is restrained from acting” (ST IaIIae 90.1). Elsewhere, he describes a law as a “dictate of practical reason emanating from a ruler” (ST IaIIae 91.1). At a very general level, then, a law is a precept that serves as a guide to and measure of human action. Thus whether an action is good will depend on whether it conforms to or abides by the relevant law. Here we should recall from an earlier section that, for Aquinas, a human action is good or bad depending on whether it conforms to reason. In other words, reason is the measure by which we evaluate human acts. Thus Aquinas thinks that the laws that govern human action are expressive of reason itself (ST IaIIae 90.1).

Now we will address the law’s origin. According to Aquinas, every law is ultimately derived from what he calls the eternal law (ST IaIIae 93.3). The “eternal law” refers to God’s providential ordering of all created things to their proper end. We participate in that divine order in virtue of the fact that God creates in us both a desire for and an ability to discern what is good (he calls this ability the “light of natural reason”). According to Aquinas, “it is this participation in the eternal law by the rational creature that is called the natural law” (ST IaIIae 91.2; Cf. 93.6). On this view, natural law is but an extension of the eternal law. For by it God ordains us to final happiness by implanting in us both a general knowledge of and inclination for goodness. Note here that the natural law is not an external source of authority. Nor is it a general deontic norm from which more specific precepts are inferred (McInerny, 1993: 211-212; Hibbs, 1988: 61-62). As Aquinas understands it, the natural law is a fundamental principle that is weaved into the fabric of our nature. As such, it illuminates and gives us a desire for those goods that facilitate the kind of flourishing proper to human beings (ST IaIIae 94.3). This point deserves further discussion.

According to Aquinas, human beings have an innate habit whereby they reason according to what he calls “first principles.” First principles are fundamental to all inquiry. They include things like the principle of non-contradiction and law of excluded middle. These principles are indemonstrable in the sense that we do not acquire them from some prior demonstration. To put the matter another way, they are not facts at which we arrive by means of argument or reasoning. They are the principles from which all reasoning proceeds. And while we do not derive them from some prior set of facts, a moment’s reflection would show that they nevertheless provide the conditions for intelligible inquiry. In short, human reasoning does not establish the truth of first principles, it depends on them.

The natural law functions in a way that is analogous to the aforementioned principles. According to Aquinas, all human actions are governed by a general principle or precept that is foundational to and necessary for all practical reasoning: good is to be done and evil is to be avoided. This principle is not something we can ignore or defy. Rather, it is an expression of how practical thought and action proceed in creatures such as ourselves. Whenever we deliberate about how we should act, we do so by virtue of a natural inclination to pursue (or avoid) those goods (or evils) that contribute to (or deter us from) our perfection as human beings. The goods for which we have a natural inclination include life, the procreation and education of offspring, knowledge, and a civil social order (ST IaIIae 94.2). Whether there are additional goods that are emblematic of the natural law will depend on whether they in fact contribute to our rational perfection.

caveat is in order. While we naturally desire goods that facilitate our perfection, excessive passion, unreasonable fear, and self-interest can distort the way we construe those goods (ST IaIIae 94.6). For example, sexual pleasure is a natural good. Yet excessive passion can corrupt our understanding of what sex’s role ought to be in our lives and lead us to pursue short-term sexual pleasure at the expense of more enduring goods. Also, self-protection is a good to which we naturally incline. Yet unreasonable fear may deter us from acting for the sake of goods that trump personal safety. Poor upbringing and the prejudices of society can further undermine a proper view of what human fulfillment consists in. Whether we can make competent judgments about what will contribute to our proper fulfillment depends on whether we have the requisite intellectual and moral virtues. Without those virtues, our intellectual and moral deficiencies will forestall our rational perfection and the attainment of our final end.

5. Charity and Beatitude

The teleological framework that circumscribes Aquinas’s moral philosophy has been evident throughout this essay. Indeed, Aquinas takes Aristotle’s eudaimonism to be amenable to his own theological purposes. Not only does Aquinas agree that human beings seek their own happiness, he agrees that the virtues are necessary for achieving it. Yet there are important differences between Aquinas’s depiction of final happiness and Aristotle’s. While Aquinas thinks that moral perfection is synonymous with achieving our final end, he construes that end in terms of beatitude, or supernatural union with God (ST IIaIIae 17.7; 23.3; 23.7). In keeping with Christian teaching, he also acknowledges that we cannot achieve beatitude solely by means of our own virtuous efforts. Aquinas’s argument for this claim is as follows: the happiness to which we incline is of two sorts—incomplete happiness and complete happiness. Incomplete happiness is a state we achieve by means of our natural human aptitudes. Through them, we can cultivatesome measure of virtue and, in turn, be happier than we would be otherwise. Perfect or complete happiness, however, lies beyond what we are able to achieve on our own. Thus Aquinas insists that “it is necessary for man to receive from God some additional [habits], whereby he may be directed to supernatural happiness” (ST IaIIae 62.1). According to Aquinas, the habits to which he refers here are “infused” or theological virtues. They are given to us graciously by God and direct us to our “final and perfect good” in the same way that the moral virtues direct us to a kind of happiness made possible by the exercise of our natural capacities (ST IaIIae 62.3).

The theological virtues that facilitate perfect happiness are those listed by St. Paul in the second letter to the Corinthians: faith, hope, and charity. Faith is the virtue whereby we assent to the truth of supernaturally revealed principles (Aquinas calls them “articles of faith”). These articles are contained (at least implicitly) in Scripture and serve as the basis of sacred doctrine. The kind of assent Aquinas has in mind here is not a matter of the intellect alone. It also involves the will. For the will is naturally drawn to God’s goodness and commands the intellect to assent to those articles wherein that goodness is described (Stump, 1991: 188; Jenkins, 1997: 190). Thus Aquinas describes the assent of faith as “an act of intellect which assents to the divine truth at the command of the will, [which is] moved by God’s grace” (STIIaIIae 2.9). Hope is the virtue whereby we trust God in obtaining final happiness. But because God is the one in whom final happiness consists (and not simply the one who assists us in achieving it), we must look to God as the good we desire to obtain (ST IIaIIae 17.6 ad 3). Finally, charity is the virtue whereby we love God for his own sake. He amplifies this idea when he (echoing Augustine) says that charity is an appetitive state whereby our appetites are uniformly ordered to God (STIIaIIae 23.3 sed contra). We should also note here that Aquinas thinks that love of neighbor is included in the love of God. For our neighbor is the natural image of God; thus we cannot love God unless we also love our neighbor (STIIaIIae 25.1 and 44.7).

The virtue of charity is especially relevant to Aquinas’s moral philosophy. As we just discussed, our efforts to be virtuous may contribute to our general betterment, but they alone cannot bring us to final happiness (although they can aid us in this regard, as we will see shortly). In fact, Aquinas thinks that the moral virtues remain incomplete and imperfect so long as they fail to direct us to God (ST IaIIae 65.2; ST IIaIIae 23.7). Charity, on the other hand, rectifies our fallen wills; that is, it perfects our deficient inclinations by orienting them toward God as the proper source of our fulfillment.

Moreover, charity affords a supernatural benefit—or gift—that the cardinal virtues could never provide. That benefit is the gift of wisdom. The gift of wisdom should not be confused with the intellectual virtue of the same name. The virtue of wisdom is an intellectual excellence whereby one grasps the fundamental causes of the world’s origin and operation (ST IIaIIae 45.1; SCG I.1.1). Knowledge of those causes may include knowledge of God, who is the highest cause of things. Yet the virtue of wisdom cannot disclose some of the more important aspects of God’s character. By contrast, the gift of wisdom enables us to see that God is the “sovereign good, which is the last end…” (ST IIaIIae 45.1 ad 1). Those who are wise (in the second sense) have a more comprehensive grasp of God’s goodness and can therefore judge and govern human actions according to divine principles (ST IIaIIae 45.3). Understood this way, the gift of wisdom consists not only in a theoretical grasp of divine things, but it also provides one with the normative guidance necessary for ordering one’s life according to Goodness itself (Ibid.).

Charity, then, inclines one to love God, whose goodness is perfect, unchanging, and eternal. Those who seek happiness in God will be more fulfilled than if they sought happiness in some lesser, transient good. That is, they will experience spiritual joy (ST IIaIIae 28.1). They will also experience supernaturalconcord in the sense that their wills will be in harmony with God’s (ST IIaIIae 29.1). What makes this account especially interesting for our purposes is that it provides us with a more explicit understanding of the sort of fulfillment in which beatitude consists.

What connection, if any, is there between the infused virtue of charity and the moral virtues we’ve previously discussed? This is an important question. Constraints of space, however, permit us to highlight only two such connections. First, charity transforms the virtues themselves. To employ Aquinas’s parlance, charity provides the form of the virtues (ST IIaIIae 23.8). It does this by determining the end at which the virtues aim. For, “in morals, the form of an act is taken chiefly from the end” (Ibid.). Under the auspices of charity, the moral virtues still have the task of moderating our appetites. The purpose for which they do so, however, is for the sake of God. For if, as Aristotle insists “virtue is the disposition of a perfect thing to that which is best,” then even the moral virtues must in some way direct us to supernatural happiness (ST IIaIIae 23.7). The second connection is a natural extension of the first, and it helps explain why—even with charity—we need the moral virtues. According to Aquinas, it is possible for those who love God to sin against charity, especially when moved by desires or fears of an inordinate nature (ST IIaIIae 24.12.ad,2). For this reason we must practice those virtues that curtail sinful inclinations and enable us to yield to charity more easily (ST IaIIae 65.3 ad 1 and 2). In conjunction with charity, the moral virtues actually aid in our journey to final happiness and thus play an important role in our redemption.

This last point nicely reflects the way Aquinas weds Christian moral theology and Aristotelian philosophy. More generally, it exemplifies the way in which Aquinas took faith and reason to be perfectly compatible. Of course, the extent to which Aquinas was faithful to Aristotle in his grand synthesis is a subject that must be left for others to address. This matter aside, it is clear that Aquinas’s endeavor has left us with one of the richer and more enduring accounts of the moral life that philosophy has to offer.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Questiones de vertitate (QDV). 1954. Trans. Robert W. Mulligan, S.J. Henry Regnery Company.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa contra gentiles (SCG), vol. I. 1975. Trans. Anton Pegis. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa contra gentiles (SCG), vol. III. 1975. Trans. Vernon Bourke. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Summa theologiae (ST ). 1981. Trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province. Westminster: Christian Classics.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Commentary on Aristotle’s Nichomachean Ethics (In NE). 1993. Trans. C. I. Litzinger, O. P. Notre Dame, IN: Dumb Ox Books.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Questiones de malo (QDM). 1995. Trans. John A. Oesterle and Jean T. Oesterle. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Thomas Aquinas, St. Disputed Questions on the Virtues. 2005. Trans. E.M. Atkins. Eds. E.M. Atkins and Thomas Williams. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Augustine. Confessions. 1993. Trans. F.J. Sheed. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.




b. Secondary Sources

  • Ackrill, J. 1980. “Aristotle on Eudaimonia.” In Essays on Aristotle’s Ethics, ed. Amelie Oksenberg Rorty. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980. Pp. 15-34.
  • Ashmore, Robert B. Jr. 1975. “Aquinas and Ethical Naturalism.” The New Scholasticism 49: 76-86.
  • Brock, Stephen. 1998. Action and Conduct: Thomas Aquinas and the Theory of Action. T & T Clark International.
  • Bourke, Vernon. 1974. “Is Aquinas a Natural Law Theorist?” The Monist 58, No. 1: 52-66.
  • Finnis, John. 1980. Natural Law and Natural Rights. Oxford University Press.
  • Finnis, John. 1998. Aquinas: Moral, Political, and Legal Theory. Oxford University Press.
  • Floyd, Shawn. 1999. “Aquinas on Temperance.” The Modern Schoolman LXXVII: 35-48.
  • Floyd, Shawn. 2004. “How to Cure Self-Deception: An Augustinian Remedy.” Logos: A Journal of Catholic Thought and Culture. 7: 60-86.
  • Gallagher, David. 1991. “Thomas Aquinas on Will as Rational Appetite.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 29: 559-584.
  • Hall, Pamela. 1999. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Hibbs, Thomas. 1988. “Against a Cartesian Reading of Intellectus in Aquinas,” The Modern Schoolman LXVI: 55-69.
  • Hibbs, Thomas. 2001. Virtue’s Splendor: Wisdom, Prudence, and the Human Good. New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Jenkins, John. 1997. Knowledge and Faith in Thomas Aquinas. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Liska, Anthony. 1996. Aquinas’ Theory of Natural Law: An Analytic Reconstruction. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kenny, Anthony. 1998. “Aquinas on Aristotelian Happiness,” in Aquinas’ Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann, eds. Scott MacDonald and Eleonore Stump. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Pp. 15-27.
  • Kretzmann, Norman and Eleonore Stump. 1988. “Being and Goodness,” in Divine and Human Action: Essays in the Metaphysics of Theism, ed. Thomas Morris. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Pp. 281-312. (My understanding of Aquinas’s metaethics has benefited greatly from this paper).
  • Kynondyk-DeYoung, Rebecca. 2002. “Power Made Perfect in Weakness: Aquinas’s Transformation of the Virtue of Courage.” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11: 147-180.
  • Kynondyk-DeYoung, Rebecca. 2004. “Resistance to the Demands of Love: Aquinas on Acedia,” The Thomist 68: 173-204.
  • MacDonald, Scott. 1990. “Egoistic Rationalism: Aquinas’s Basis for Christian Morality.” In Christian Theism and the Problems of Philosophy, ed. Michael Beaty. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press. Pp. 327-356.
  • MacDonald, Scott. 1991a. “Introduction: The Relation Between Being and Goodness,” in Being and Goodness: The Concept of the Good in Metaphysics and Philosophical Theology, ed. Scott MacDonald. Ithaca: Cornell University Press. Pp. 1-28.
  • MacDonald, Scott. 1991b. “Ultimate Ends and Practical Reasoning: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Moral Psychology and Anscombe’s Fallacy,” The Philosophical Review C: 31-65.
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump, eds. 1998. Aquinas’ Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann, eds. Scott MacDonald and Eleonore Stump. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1981. After Virtue. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1991. Three Rival Versions of Moral Inquiry: Encyclopedia, Genealogy, and Tradition. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1999. Dependent Rational Animals: Why Human Beings Need the Virtues. Open Court Publishing.
  • McClusky, Colleen. 2000. “Happiness and Freedom in Aquinas’s Theory of Action,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9: 69-90.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1993. “Ethics.” In The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas, eds. Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Pp. 196-216.
  • McInerny, Ralph. 1997. Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas. Washington D.C. Catholic University of America Press.
  • Murphy, Mark. 2001. Natural Law and Practical Rationality. Cambridge University Press.
  • Murphy, Mark. 2002. “The Natural Law Tradition in Ethics”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2002 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
  • Nelson, Daniel Mark. 1994. Virtue and Natural Law in Thomas Aquinas and the Implications for Modern Ethics. Pennsylvania State University Press.
  • Pieper, Josef. 1966. The Four Cardinal Virtues. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Pasnau, Robert. 2002. Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa theologiae Ia 75-89. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Porter, Jean. 1989. “De Ordine Caritiatis: Charity, Friendship, and Justice in Thomas Aquinas’ Summa Theologiae.” The Thomist 53: 197-213.
  • Porter, Jean. 1990. The Recovery of Virtue: The Relevance of Aquinas for Christian Ethics. Louisville: Westminster, John Knox.
  • Rickaby, John. 2003. “Cardinal Virtues,” Catholic Encyclopedia (2003 Online Edition).
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1991. “Aquinas on Faith and Goodness,” in MacDonald 1991a. Pp. 179-207.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 1998. “Wisdom: Will, Belief, and Moral Goodness,” in MacDonald and Stump. Pp. 28-62.
  • Stump, Eleonore. 2003. Aquinas. New York: Routledge.
  • Westberg, Daniel. 1994. Right Practical Reason: Aristotle, Action, and Prudence in Aquinas. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Thomas. 2005. “Introduction,” in Disputed Questions on the Virtues. Trans. E.M. Atkins. Eds. E.M. Atkins and Thomas Williams. Pp. ix-xxx.

Author Information

Shawn Floyd
Email: sfloyd@malone.edu
Malone College
U. S. A.

The Phenomenological Reduction

There is an experience in which it is possible for us to come to the world with no knowledge or preconceptions in hand; it is the experience of astonishment. The “knowing” we have in this experience stands in stark contrast to the “knowing” we have in our everyday lives, where we come to the world with theory and “knowledge” in hand, our minds already made up before we ever engage the world. However, in the experience of astonishment, our everyday “knowing,” when compared to the “knowing” that we experience in astonishment, is shown up as a pale epistemological imposter and is reduced to mere opinion by comparison.

The phenomenological reduction is at once a description and prescription of a technique that allows one to voluntarily sustain the awakening force of astonishment so that conceptual cognition can be carried throughout intentional analysis, thus bringing the “knowing” of astonishment into our everyday experience. It is by virtue of the “knowing” perspective generated by the proper performance of the phenomenological reduction that phenomenology claims to offer such a radical standpoint on the world phenomenon; indeed, it claims to offer a perspective that is so radical, it becomes the standard of rigor whereby every other perspective is judged and by which they are grounded. In what follows there will be close attention paid to correctly understanding the rigorous nature of the phenomenological reduction, the epistemological problem that spawned it, how that problem is solved by the phenomenological reduction, and the truly radical nature of the technique itself.

In other words, the phenomenological reduction is properly understood as a regimen designed to transform a philosopher into a phenomenologist by virtue of the attainment of a certain perspective on the world phenomenon. The path to the attainment of this perspective is a species of meditation, requiring rigorous, persistent effort and is no mere mental exercise. It is a species of meditation because, unlike ordinary meditation, which involves only the mind, this more radical form requires the participation of the entire individual and initially brings about a radical transformation of the individual performing it similar to a religious conversion. Husserl discovered the need for such a regimen once it became clear to him that the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rested was compromised by the very framework of science itself and the psychological assumptions of the scientist; the phenomenological reduction is the technique whereby the phenomenologist puts him or herself in a position to provide adequately rigorous grounds for scientific or any other kind of inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Background of the Phenomenological Reduction
    1. Husserl’s Early Works
    2. Husserl’s Later Works
  3. The Epistemological Problem the Phenomenological Reduction Aims to Solve
  4. The Analysis That Disclosed the Need for the Reduction
    1. The Self-Refutation of the Sciences
    2. The Reduction Prefigured
  5. The Structure, Nature and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction
    1. The Structure of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. The Two Moments of the Phenomenological Reduction
        1. The Epoché
        2. The Reduction Proper
    2. The Nature of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. Self-Meditation Radicalized
      2. Radical, Rigorous, and Transformative
    3. The Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. Self-Meditation
  6. How the Reduction Solves the Epistemological Problem
    1. The Problem of Constitution
    2. The Reduction and the Theme of Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The phenomenological reduction is the meditative practice described by Edmund Husserl, the founder of phenomenology, whereby one, as a phenomenologist, is able to liberate oneself from the captivation in which one is held by all that one accepts as being the case. According to Husserl, once one is liberated from this captivation-in-an-acceptedness, one is able to view the world as a world of essences, free from any contamination that presuppositions of conceptual framework or psyche might contribute. Many have variously misunderstood the practice of the phenomenological reduction, not in the sense that what they are doing is wrong, but in the sense that they do not take what they do far enough; this article will acquaint the reader with the extent to which Husserl and Fink’s original account intended the performance of the reduction to be taken.

The procedure of the phenomenological reduction emerges in Husserl’s thought as a necessary requirement of the solution he proposed to a problem that he, himself, had raised with respect to the adequacy of the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rests. Thus, if we are ever to achieve an appropriate level of appreciation for the procedure of the phenomenological reduction, we must begin by acquainting ourselves with the role that Husserl sees it playing in his overall project of giving the sciences an adequate epistemological foundation. This problem of the foundation of scientific inquiry spans Husserl’s entire career from his early to later work; we see its beginning arguments in Logical Investigations, one of his earlier works, and we also see it playing a prominent role later in his career as it dominates one of his latest works, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Accordingly, this article will take as themes for its major divisions: 1) the historical background of the phenomenological reduction, 2) Husserl’s analysis of the foundation of scientific inquiry that demonstrates a need for the phenomenological reduction, and 3) The Structure, Nature, and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction.

The section on the historical background of the phenomenological reduction will serve to show that this procedure does not arrive as “a bolt out of the blue,” as it were; rather, it appears as the logically required solution to a specific problem. The problem that it addresses is the problem of the adequacy of the foundations of scientific inquiry. To illustrate Husserl’s misgivings with the foundations of scientific inquiry, consider the logical relationship between the axioms of geometry and its theorems and proofs. The point of doing proofs in geometry is to show that each theorem of geometry is adequately grounded in the axioms, that which is taken as being “given” in geometry. In scientific inquiry, what scientists take as being given is the natural world and the things in that world; consequently, those things and the world itself are never questioned but taken to be the logical bedrock upon which the subsequent scientific investigations are based. In other words, scientists take the world to be their axioms; and it is this axiomatic status that Husserl throws into question when he shows that the results of scientific investigation are a function of both the architectonics of scientific hypotheses and the psychological coloring of the investigating scientist. For this reason, Husserl says that if we are ever to be able to access the pure world so that it can act as a proper foundation, we must strip away both of these qualifications and return to the “things themselves” [die Sache selbst]. That is, we must return to the world as it is before it is contaminated by either the categories of scientific inquiry or the psychological assumptions of the scientist. The phenomenological reduction is the technique whereby this stripping away occurs; and the technique itself has two moments: the first Husserl names epoché, using the Greek term for abstention, and the second is referred to as the reduction proper, an inquiring back into consciousness.

2. Historical Background of the Phenomenological Reduction

a. Husserl’s Early Works

Since the main burden of this article lies in the specific area of the phenomenological reduction, it is not necessary to go into great detail regarding Husserl’s early work beyond noting that it dealt almost exclusively with mathematics and logic; and that it is the ground out of which his later thought grew. In his Philosophy of Arithmetic (1891), Husserl questions the psychological origin of basic arithmetical concepts such as unity, multiplicity, and number; a project that he pursues later into the Prolegomena to the Logical Investigations. In the former work, Husserl gives us an analysis of the origin of the authentic concept of number, i.e., number to be conceived intuitionally. It is here that Husserl pays special attention to the question of the foundation of abstraction for the basic arithmetical concepts. Thus, we find that Husserl’s early efforts at providing a subjective complement to objective logic led him to investigate the general a priori of correlation of cognition, of the sense of cognition and the object of cognition, and led him also to conceive an absolute science designed as a universal analysis of constitution in which the origins of objectivity in transcendental subjectivity are elucidated.

A crucial element of Husserl’s early work in the Philosophy of Arithmetic is his critique of psychologism; it is this critique that is continued in his Logical Investigations and which sets the stage for the emancipation of the formal-logical objects and laws from psychological determinations, as was the then-current view. However, this liberation was not Husserl’s ultimate goal, but merely the preparatory work for understanding the connection between pure logic and concrete (psychical, or rather phenomenological) processes of thinking, between ideal conditions of cognition and temporally individuated acts of thinking.

b. Husserl’s Later Works

It is owing to this goal that Husserl’s later work moves quickly away from the strictly logical and mathematical character of his early work and takes on the more transcendental character of his later work. Thus, the trend of Husserl’s thought moves from his critique of the psychologistic account of mathematical and logical objects to transcendental subjectivity by means of his persistent questioning of the foundation of knowledge. It is important to note that his questioning of the foundation of knowledge is not the same as the quest for certainty that characterizes much of modernist thought—to which some philosophers believe Husserl’s American contemporary, John Dewey in his The Quest for Certainty, presented successful objections. Rather, Husserl’s quest was not for certainty but for the founding of the conditions for the possibility of knowledge. That is, he was not searching for an answer to the question: How do we know the tree is in the quad? He was seeking an answer to the question: How does it come about that consciousness can make contact with the tree in the quad? This is what was meant above when mention was made that Husserl’s ultimate goal was to understand the connection between pure logic and concrete processes of thinking.

In his dogged pursuit of an answer to this question, Husserl is pushed from the then current psychological theory to the object; from the object back to consciousness, and finally all the way back to transcendental consciousness and the emergence of the “ultimate question of phenomenology” regarding the phenomenology of phenomenology. It is this question of the phenomenology of phenomenology that dominates the inquiry into the nature of the phenomenological reduction that we find in Sixth Cartesian Meditation and in the articles that Eugen Fink wrote around 1933 and 1934 in his attempt to further explain the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl. However, what we need is a more finely tuned elucidation of the epistemological problem that was the initial impetus driving Husserl’s early efforts.

3. The Epistemological Problem the Phenomenological Reduction Aims to Solve

The prevailing epistemology in Husserl’s time was a neo-Kantian position; indeed, it was owing to the criticism brought against phenomenology by this cadre of philosophers that Eugen Fink was constrained to publish his very important article, “The Phenomenological Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Contemporary Criticism” in the journal, Kant-Studien; Fink uses the locution “contemporary criticism” in his title as a euphemism for “neo-Kantians.” Roughly put, the Kantian epistemological model is one that strives to ameliorate the stark contrast between the position Descartes put forward and the one brought about by the criticism of his position in the writings of Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, to name a few; that is, Kant’s position is one that seeks an irenic modulation between the rationalists and the empiricists. Kant’s epistemology, however conciliatory toward each camp, still leaned heavily on certain aspects of Descartes’ thought; notably, the distinction between consciousness and object (mind and body), albeit in Kant’s terms this distinction was taken up as a distinction between a noumenal world and a phenomenal world—a difference that Kant bridged by means of the categories. The categories themselves were arrived at by asking the question: what would have to be the case in order for our experience of the world to be as it is? This question is commonly referred to as the question determining the conditions for the possibility of experience and more specifically as the Transcendental Deduction.

Husserl’s epistemological insight is that there is no such distinction between consciousness and object, as had been assumed by Descartes and subsequently taken up in a slightly different form by Kant. In Husserl’s thought, the terms “noesis” and “noema” do not so much identify distinct items set over against each other (e.g. consciousness and object) as much as they provide a linguistic vehicle to speak about the interpenetration of each by the other as aspects of a more inclusive whole, the Life-world—understood in its broadest sense. A key point made by Fink in his article for the neo-Kantians is that when we think of the world, it is always a world already containing us thinking it; this fact is overlooked by the Kantian picture of the world; a picture which assumes a perspective that is neither consciousness nor world but which sets each over against the other. For Kant, this imagined perspective is what gives us access to the distinction between the noumenal and phenomenal worlds; ironically, it is also this perspective that makes the transcendental deduction necessary, since the distinction between noumenal and phenomenal is a state of affairs to which we do not have direct access and must, of necessity, deduce it.

Husserl constructs his epistemological position by first noticing the very obvious fact that all consciousness is consciousness of something; and it is this insight that establishes the relationship between the noesis and noema. If knowledge is ever to be established at all, it must be established in consciousness; the epistemological problem, then, for Husserl is to describe consciousness, since without consciousness, no knowledge is possible. Or, to put a more Kantian spin on it, consciousness itself is the condition for the possibility of knowledge. Furthermore, since we are always already in a world, the first task of epistemology is to properly and accurately describe what is already the case; and we can do this only if we begin with a thorough examination of consciousness itself and carry that examination all the way back to the “I” in the “I Am.” Husserl speaks of going “back” [ruckfrage] because we must begin where we are; and where we are includes a sense of self whose identity is temporarily seated in the sedimented layers of consciousness built up through our temporal experiences. Hence, if we are to encounter the “I” we must dig back down through those layers or we must continually present ourselves with the question: who is “I”? as we consider the great variety of things with which we have identified. This questioning back is the method of the phenomenological reduction and aims to lay bare the “I”—the condition for the possibility of knowledge.

It is important to keep in mind that Husserl’s phenomenology did not arise out of the questioning of an assumption in the same way that much of the history of thought has progressed; rather, it was developed, as so many discoveries are, pursuant to a particular experience, namely, the experience of the world and self that one has if one determinedly seeks to experience the “I”; and, Hume notwithstanding, such an experience is possible.

4. The Analysis That Disclosed the Need for the Reduction

Although it is generally conceded that Husserl’s thought underwent a significant transformation from his early interests in logic and mathematics, as indicated in his “On the Concept of Number” and his Philosophy of Arithmetic, to his later transcendental interests, as indicated by The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, the actual “turning point” is not so generally accepted. This is due, in part, to the fact that Husserl’s work can be viewed developmentally both according to the chronological appearance of his work and according to its systematic connections. Thus, the “development” of his thought can be seen either in terms of his published work, i.e., chronologically, or in terms of key systematic methodological concepts. Viewed chronologically, Bernet, Kern, and Marbach (Bernet, 1989) put the beginning of the split around 1915-1917, the last years Husserl spent at Göttingen, but is only clearly seen in the early years of Husserl’s teaching at Freiburg (around 1917-1921) (p.1); but considered systematically, they say that the partition relates to the consistent extension of the research program of phenomenological philosophy towards a genetic-explanatory phenomenology as a supplement to the hitherto carried-out static-descriptive phenomenology (p.1). The terms “static,” “genetic,” and “generative” phenomenology refer to aspects of phenomenology that come into play after the reduction has been performed; however, they articulate distinctions that must be kept clearly in mind when evaluating phenomenological analyses.

In the early phases of his thinking, Husserl was concerned chiefly with the phenomenological-descriptive analysis of specific types of experiences and their correlates as well as with describing general structures of consciousness; he also aimed at the foundation and elaboration of the corresponding methodology (phenomenological reflection, reduction, and eidetics) (p.1). Similarly in the later phases of his thought, there is the attempt by means of genetic phenomenology to elucidate the concrete unification of experiencing in the personal ego and in the transcendental community of egos, or monads, as well as in the constitution of the correlative surrounding worlds and of the one world common to all (p.2).

For the purposes of tracing the development of the phenomenological reduction, I take the relevant period of the transformation of Husserl’s thought from early to late to be between 1900 and 1913; the two volumes of Logical Investigations were published in 1900 and 1901 but it wasn’t until the appearance of The Idea of Phenomenology in 1907 that many of the characteristic themes of phenomenology were explicitly articulated. This little volume was soon followed by the publication of “Philosophy as Rigorous Science” in 1911; and that by the publication of Ideas I in 1913, where the most explicit treatment, up to that time, of the main phenomenological themes is given.

a. The Self-Refutation of the Sciences

In order to grasp the full import of the move that Husserl makes to phenomenology, we must understand the arguments that motivate that move; and we get a glimpse of those arguments in his “Philosophy as Rigorous Science” published in 1911. In that article, Husserl’s chief aim is epistemological and expresses itself first as a critique of the natural sciences and psychology and then as an adumbration of a technique that later, in 1913 with the publication of Ideen I, would be termed the “epoché ” or the “reduction.”

Husserl begins his critique of the natural sciences by noting certain absurdities that become evident when such naturalism is adopted in an effort to “naturalize” consciousness and reason; these absurdities are both theoretical and practical. Husserl says that when “the formal-logical principles, the so-called ‘laws of thought,’ are interpreted by naturalism as natural laws of thinking,” there occurs a kind of “inevitable” absurdity owing to an inherent inconsistency involved in the naturalist position. His claim in this article alludes to the more fully formed argument from volume 1 of his Logical Investigations (Husserl, 1970), which will be summarized here.

The natural sciences are empirical sciences and, as such, deal only with empirical facts. Thus, when the formal-logical principles are subsumed under the “laws of Nature” as “laws of thought,” this makes the “law of thought” just one among many of the empirical laws of nature. However, Husserl notes that “the only way in which a natural law can be established and justified, is by induction from the singular facts of experience” (p.99). Furthermore, induction does not establish the holding of the law, “only the greater or lesser probability of its holding; the probability, and not the law, is justified by insight” (p.99). This means that logical laws must, without exception, rank as mere probabilities; yet, as he then notes, “nothing, however, seems plainer than that the laws of ‘pure logic’ all have a priori validity” (p.99). That is to say, the laws of ‘pure logic’ are established and justified, not by induction, but by apodictic inner evidence; insight justifies their truth itself. Thus, as Husserl remarks in “Philosophy as a Rigorous Science” (1965) that “naturalism refutes itself” (p.80). It is this theoretical absurdity that leads to a similar absurdity in practice.

The absurdity in practice, says Husserl, becomes apparent when we notice that the naturalist is “dominated by the purpose of making scientifically known whatever is genuine truth, the genuinely beautiful and good; he wants to know how to determine what is its universal essence and the method by which it is to be obtained in the particular case” (pp.80-81). Thus, the naturalist believes that through natural science and through a philosophy based on the same science the goal has been attained; but, says Husserl, the naturalist is going on presuppositions; indeed, to the extent that he theorizes at all, it is just to that extent “that he objectively sets up values to which value judgments are to correspond, and likewise in setting up any practical rules according to which each one is to be guided in his willing and in his conduct” (p.81). It is this state of affairs that drives Husserl to the observation that the naturalist is “idealist and objectivist in the way he acts”; since both of these cannot be true at the same time, the naturalist is involved in an absurdity (p.80).

Husserl claims that the natural scientist is not outwardly aware of these absurdities owing to the fact that he “naturalizes reason” and, on this account, is blinded by prejudice. He adds, “One who sees only empirical science will not be particularly disturbed by absurd consequences that cannot be proved empirically to contradict facts of nature” (pp.81-82). This is not to say that Husserl is arguing against science as such, to the contrary, he says that there is “in all modern life no more powerfully, more irresistibly progressing idea than that of science” and that “with regard to its legitimate aims, it is all-embracing. Looked upon in its ideal perfection, it would be reason itself, which could have no other authority equal or superior to itself” (p.82). The problem is that naturalism, which wanted to establish philosophy both on a basis of strict science and as a strict science, appears completely discredited along with its method. To this point in the argument, Husserl has simply shown that the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rests is self-contradictory and fails to offer adequate grounding. So, if the natural scientist cannot provide us with a “rigorous science” then what is needed and to whom can we look?

b. The Reduction Prefigured

Husserl’s idea is that the problems belonging to the domain of a “strict science,” namely, theoretical, axiological, and practical problems, give us a clue themselves as to the method required for their solution. He says, “through a clarification of the problems and through penetration into their pure sense, the methods adequate to these problems, because demanded by their very essence, must impose themselves on us” (p.83). It is for this reason that the refutation of naturalism based on its consequences that he just finished accomplishes very little for him, what is important is the principiant critique of the foundations of naturalism; and by this he means that he wants to direct a critical analysis at the philosophy that believes “it has definitely attained the rank of an exact science” (p.84). So what Husserl will be putting to the test is the relative strength of the term “exact” when it is used in this context. It is not the case that Husserl thinks that a science of nature does not produce important results; he thinks it does. The problem, as Husserl sees it, is that a science of nature is inadequate if it is not ultimately grounded in a strictly scientific philosophy. Husserl is not criticizing the results of science (the structural design and dignity of the house that science built) but only the foundation upon which those results rest.

With respect to the foundation, Husserl says that all natural science is naïve in regard to its point of departure because the nature that it investigates “is for it simply there.” In other words, the things that natural science investigates are its foundation because they mark the point of departure for natural science. These things are simply taken for granted uncritically as being there and “it is the aim of natural science to know these unquestioned data in an objectively valid, strictly scientific manner” (p.85). The same holds true for psychology in its domain of consciousness. It is the task of psychology “to explore this psychic element scientifically within the psychophysical nexus of nature, to determine it in an objectively valid way, to discover the laws according to which it develops and changes, comes into being and disappears” (p.86). Even where psychology, as an empirical science, concerns itself with determinations of bare events of consciousness and not with dependencies that are psychophysical, “those events are thought of, nevertheless, as belonging to nature, that is, as belonging to human or brute consciousnesses that for their part have an unquestioned and co-apprehended connection with human and brute organisms” (p.86). Thus, he states that “every psychological judgment involves the existential positing of physical nature, whether expressly or not” (p.86).

This uncritical acceptance is also reflected in the naïveté that characterizes natural science since at every place in its procedure it accepts nature as given and relies upon it when it performs experiments. Thus, ultimately, every method of experiential science leads back precisely to experience. But isolated experience is of no worth to science; rather, “it is in the methodical disposition and connection of experiences, in the interplay of experience and thought which has its rigid logical laws, that valid experience is distinguished from invalid, that each experience is accorded its level of validity, and that objectively valid knowledge as such, knowledge of nature, is worked out” (p.87). Although this critique of experience is satisfactory, says Husserl, as long as we remain within natural science and think according to its point of view, a completely different critique of experience is still possible and indispensable. It is a critique that places in question all experience as such as well as the sort of thinking proper to empirical science (p.87).

For Husserl, this is a critique that raises questions such as: “how can experience as consciousness give or contact an object? How can experiences be mutually legitimated or corrected by means of each other, and not merely replace each other or confirm each other subjectively? How can the play of a consciousness whose logic is empirical make objectively valid statements, valid for things that are in and for themselves? Why are the playing rules, so to speak, of consciousness not irrelevant for things?” It is by means of these questions that Husserl hopes to highlight his major concern of how it is that natural science can be comprehensible in every case, “to the extent that it pretends at every step to posit and to know a nature that is in itself—in itself in opposition to the subjective flow of consciousness” (p.88). He says that these questions become riddles as soon as reflection upon them becomes serious and that epistemology has been the traditional discipline to which these questions were referred, but epistemology has not answered the call in a manner “scientifically clear, unanimous, and decisive.”

To Husserl, this all points to the absurdity of a theory of knowledge that is based on any psychological theory of knowledge. He punctuates this claim by noting that if certain riddles are inherent, in principle, to natural science, then “it is self-evident that the solution of these riddles according to premises and conclusions in principle transcends natural science.” He adds that “to expect from natural science itself the solution of any one of the problems inherent in it as such—thus inhering through and through, from beginning to end—or even merely to suppose that it could contribute to the solution of such a problem any premises whatsoever, is to be involved in a vicious circle” (pp.88-89).

With this being the case, it becomes clear to Husserl that every scientific, as well as every pre-scientific, application of nature “must in principle remain excluded in a theory of knowledge that is to retain its univocal sense. So, too, must all expressions that imply thetic existential positings of things in the framework of space, time, causality, etc. This obviously applies also to all existential positings with regard to the empirical being of the investigator, of his psychical faculties, and the like” (p.89). It is here, in this passage, that we see the formal beginnings of what will later be termed the “epoché ” and “reduction” in Ideen I.

Husserl is advocating a theory of knowledge that will investigate the problems of the relationship between consciousness and being in a way that excludes, not only the “thetic existential positings of things in the framework of space, time, causality, etc.,” but also the “existential positings” and “psychical faculties” of the investigator. In other words, he wants to separate the subject matter he is investigating from both the theoretical framework of science and the coloring with which any investigator might qualify it. But to do so, knowledge theory can have before its eyes “only being as the correlate of consciousness: as perceived, remembered, expected, represented pictorially, imagined, identified, distinguished, believed, opined, evaluated, etc.” And for Husserl, this means that the investigation must be directed “toward a scientific essential knowledge of consciousness, toward that which consciousness itself ‘is’ according to its essence in all its distinguishable forms” (p.89). Husserl also notes that the investigation must also be directed toward “what consciousness ‘means,’ as well as toward the different ways in which—in accord with the essence of the aforementioned forms—it intends the objective, now clearly, now obscurely, now by presenting or by presentifying, now symbolically or pictorially, now simply, now mediated in thought, now in this or that mode of attention, and so in countless other forms, and how ultimately it ‘demonstrates’ the objective as that which is ‘validly,’ ‘really’” (p.89).

To summarize, what Husserl wants to do is to provide an unshakable ground for science, so as to make it “rigorous” and “exact.” He dismisses the efforts of both science and psychology to provide such a ground owing to the fact that the “riddles” inherent in each necessarily put the solution outside of their reach. He also notes that the traditional discipline of epistemology has failed to do this and suggests that what is needed is an investigation that is directed toward “a scientific essential knowledge of consciousness, toward that which consciousness itself ‘is’ according to its essence in all its distinguishable forms.” Furthermore, this can only be done if we separate the matter in question from the qualifications imposed on it by either the theoretical framework of science or the existential “positings” of the investigator. In other words, we must return to the matters in question, as they are themselves; and the procedure whereby this is accomplished is phenomenology, specifically, the phenomenological reduction.

5. The Structure, Nature and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction

a. The Structure of the Phenomenological Reduction

i. The Two Moments of the Phenomenological Reduction

What actually occurs when one undertakes to perform the reduction can be discerned by giving careful attention to the things Husserl and Fink have said about it; but let me first address some terminological concerns regarding two key concepts. In Sixth Cartesian Meditation (Fink, 1995), Fink tells us “epoché and the action of the reduction proper are the two internal basic moments of the phenomenological reduction, mutually required and mutually conditioned” (p.41). This passage alerts us to the fact that the lo